Knowledge by Acquaintance vs. Description

First published Mon Jan 19, 2004; substantive revision Wed Jun 12, 2019

The terminology is most clearly associated with Bertrand Russell, but the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description is arguably a critical component of classical or traditional versions of foundationalism. Let us say that one has inferential or nonfoundational knowledge that p when one’s knowledge that p depends on one’s knowledge of some other proposition(s) from which one can legitimately infer p; and one has foundational or noninferential knowledge that p when one’s knowledge that p does not depend on any other knowledge one has in this way. According to foundationalism regarding knowledge, we have some foundational knowledge, and any nonfoundational or inferential knowledge that we have depends, ultimately, on this foundational knowledge. What distinguishes classical foundationalism (or at least a prominent version of classical foundationalism) about knowledge is the insistence that all foundational knowledge is knowledge by acquaintance.

Historically, the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description is made between two kinds of knowledge. However, after a brief discussion of Russell’s presentation of the distinction, we follow the contemporary literature in focusing more on the role of acquaintance in securing justified or rational belief. (See the entry on epistemology for more on the relation between knowledge and justification.) This is important both because doing so can illuminate the role that acquaintance plays in securing knowledge (which arguably requires justified belief) and because we may be interested in its role as a source of justification even when we fall short of knowledge. Let us say that one has an inferentially justified belief that p when one’s belief that p depends for its justification on justified belief in some other proposition(s) from which one can legitimately infer p; and one has a foundationally or noninferentially justified belief that p when one’s belief that p is justified but does not depend on any other beliefs for its justification. According to foundationalism regarding justification, we have some foundationally justified beliefs, and all other justified beliefs must depend for their justification on foundationally justified beliefs. Classical versions of foundationalism about justification hold that foundational beliefs are justified by acquaintance. (See the entry on foundationalist theories of epistemic justification for more on foundationalism.) As we shall see, proponents of classical foundationalism typically ascribe other important philosophical roles to acquaintance.

1. The Distinction

To get clear on the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description, let us briefly examine how its originator, Bertrand Russell, characterized it (see Russell 1910–11 and 1912: Ch. 5). First, what is meant by “acquaintance” and “description”?

We shall say that we have acquaintance with anything of which we are directly aware, without the intermediary of any process of inference or any knowledge of truths. (Russell 1912: 78)

I say that I am acquainted with an object when I have a direct cognitive relation to that object, i.e., when I am directly aware of the object itself. When I speak of a cognitive relation here, I do not mean the sort of relation which constitutes judgment, but the sort which constitutes presentation. In fact, I think the relation of subject and object which I call acquaintance is simply the converse of the relation of object and subject which constitutes presentation. That is, to say that S has acquaintance with O is essentially the same thing as to say that O is presented to S. (Russell 1910/11: 108)

Russell thus characterizes acquaintance as a relation of direct awareness, a relation in which, as Russell and some others have put it, something is “presented” or simply “given” to the subject (see e.g., Lewis 1929 and 1946; Moser 1989: 80ff.; Fales 1996.) Various positions can accept some sort of distinction between direct and indirect “awareness”: roughly, an awareness of X is indirect if it depends on awareness of something else, and direct otherwise. But this characterization of the distinction leaves open what counts as direct awareness.

What distinguishes acquaintance is, minimally, the following two closely related features. First, it is a nonjudgmental and nonconceptual form of awareness. Judgments, thoughts and concepts are essentially intentional or representational in nature, i.e., they are about or represent other things. Acquaintance with something does not consist in forming any judgment or thought about it, or in having any concept or representation of it. (In the second passage above Russell does characterize it as a special “cognitive” relation, but one must immediately wonder what this means given that he explicitly denies that it is judgmental in nature.) Second, it is a form of awareness constituting a real, genuine relation, a relation that cannot obtain without its relata (the things or items related). One cannot be acquainted with something that does not exist. Acquaintance is thus like the relation of kicking or throwing, for one cannot kick or throw without there being something that is kicked or thrown—something that is the object of the kicking or throwing. (Of course, these are not forms of awareness!) In contrast, judgments and concepts may represent or be about things that don’t exist. Philosophers sometimes refer to this second feature by saying that acquaintance is “infallible”. However, this term is most often used to refer to a property of beliefs: roughly, a belief is infallible if it is immune to error or is guaranteed to be true. Given the first feature above, being acquainted with something is not to be understood in terms of having a belief or judgment about it, not even an infallible one.

By a “description” Russell means any phrase of the form “a so-and-so” (an “ambiguous” or “indefinite” description) or “the so-and-so” (a “definite” description), though he focuses on the latter in his discussion of knowledge by description. Russell’s definition of knowledge by description builds naturally on this: To know some thing or object by a definite description is to know that it is the so-and-so or that the so-and-so exists, i.e., that there is exactly one object that is so-and-so (Russell 1912: 82–3). On Russell’s view, proper nouns, and most common words, are really disguised descriptions (1912: 84–5). We might claim to know who Jack the Ripper was, that he was a vicious human being, and so on, but we can only think of and know the individual about whom the claim is made through a description of that individual—Jack the Ripper is that person (whoever he was) who committed certain atrocities in London in 1888. We have no “first hand” knowledge of the person about whom our judgment is made—we don’t even have “first hand” knowledge that only one individual committed the murders or, for that matter, that the murders took place. Put another way, we are not directly acquainted with either the crimes or the perpetrator of those crimes since he is long dead and we have surely never met him.

Talk of descriptions naturally suggests the use of language, and as we have just seen, Russell himself often characterizes descriptions in linguistic terms, e.g., as phrases having such-and-such a form. However, for Russell, description does not essentially involve the use of words or phrases of a language; it involves the use or application of concepts. To know something “by description” does not require the use of language or linguistic terms, but it does require the use or application of concepts.

The example of Jack the Ripper just given, and many of Russell’s examples, are at best misleading. They trade on that commonplace distinction between things we know “first hand” and things we have only heard about or read about—the things that have been described to us.

But our commonsense way of making the distinction soon goes by the wayside. Most philosophers wedded to some notion of acquaintance end up rejecting the idea that we have acquaintance even with bread-box sized objects, immediately before us, under ideal conditions of perception. The test to determine with what we are acquainted is often reminiscent of the method Descartes recommended for finding secure foundations of knowledge—the method of doubt (see Russell 1912: 74; Price 1932: 3). If you are considering whether you are acquainted with something, ask yourself whether you can conceive of being in this very state when the putative object does not exist. If you can, you should reject the suggestion that you are directly acquainted with the item in question. Based on possibilities of error about physical objects from illusion, hallucination and dreams, it seemed to most that we could rule out acquaintance with physical objects, future events, other minds, and facts that involve any of these as constituents. Consider, for example, physical objects. It seems that the evidence that my experiences give me right now for supposing that there is a computer before me is perfectly consistent with the hypothesis that I am now having a vivid dream or a vivid hallucination. If this is right, then the experiential evidence I possess cannot be the computer or any of its constituents. Neither the computer, nor any of its constituents, need be present in that vivid dream or hallucination. Even when our evidence for the presence of physical objects seems as good as we can get, then, we are not acquainted with physical objects or their constituents. (However, some have recently defended the view that we can be acquainted with physical objects in perception. See, for example, Johnston 2004.) Traditionally, acquaintance theorists have taken the most promising candidates for entities with which we can be acquainted to be conscious states of mind (e.g., an experience of pain, a sensation of red) and their properties (e.g., painfulness, redness). Russell and many other acquaintance theorists also take themselves to be acquainted with facts, i.e., with something’s having some property—at least mental facts (e.g., my being in pain, my desiring food, my experiencing red).

What about the possibility of acquaintance with ourselves? Can an individual be directly acquainted with him or herself? Russell takes the question of whether we are ever acquainted with the self to be a difficult one. He says that acquaintance with the self is “hard to disentangle from other things,” but tentatively concludes that “it is probable, though not certain, that we have acquaintance with Self” (1912: 78–81.) However, he later denies that we have acquaintance with the self (see Russell 1914: part III). In a recent paper, Duncan (2015) uses the method of doubt, or something very much like it, to argue that we are acquainted with ourselves.

Let us now return to the primary question of this section: how should we understand the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description? When philosophers speak of knowledge they typically mean to be discussing knowledge of truths or propositional knowledge, knowledge that involves a belief or judgment in some true claim or proposition. As introduced by Russell, the distinction sometimes seems to be that between noninferential or foundational knowledge on the one hand, and inferential or nonfoundational knowledge on the other. Roughly, one has nonfoundational or inferential knowledge that p when one’s knowledge that p depends on one’s knowledge of some other proposition(s) from which one can legitimately infer p; and one has foundational or noninfrential knowledge that p when one’s knowledge that p does not depend on any other knowledge one has. Knowledge by acquaintance is foundational knowledge because it depends on one’s acquaintance with the object itself, or with properties of or facts about the object, and not on any further knowledge of truths. Knowledge by description, in contrast, always depends on some further knowledge of truths for support; as Russell puts it, knowledge by description “always involves…some knowledge of truths as its source and ground” (1912: 72–3, emphasis added).

This seems to be a natural and relatively straightforward way of drawing the distinction. However, there may seem to be a problem with this way of drawing the distinction, at least as an interpretation of Russell, for he denies that knowledge by acquaintance is knowledge of truths:

Knowledge of things, when it is of the kind we call knowledge by acquaintance, is essentially simpler than any knowledge of truths, and logically independent of knowledge of truths, though it would be rash to assume that human beings ever, in fact, have acquaintance with things without at the same time knowing some truth about them. (Russell 1912: 72)

We have already seen that for Russell acquaintance is nonjudgmental or nonpropositional; to be acquainted with something is to be aware of it in a way that does not essentially involve being aware that it is so-and-so. Russell seems to be extending this to knowledge by acquaintance: it is knowledge of something, and logically independent of knowledge that something is so-and-so. Nor is this usage of the term ‘knowledge’ and its cognates strange: we do indeed talk about knowing people and cities. This might suggest that we should draw the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description not as one between foundational and nonfoundational knowledge of truths, but as one between knowledge of truths and knowledge of something other than truths. Indeed, as we have seen, Russell at one point defines knowledge of something by description simply as knowledge that it is so-and-so, not foundational knowledge that it is so-and-so (1912: 84–5). But then, what more than acquaintance is involved in knowledge by acquaintance? It is difficult to find an answer from Russell.

It is tempting to suppose that Russell equivocates between the relation of acquaintance and the special kind of knowledge of truth (foundational knowledge) whose sole source is acquaintance. That we ordinarily talk about knowing things and people might encourage this equivocation. Moreover, perhaps the fact that acquaintance is a form of awareness of the most direct, most secure kind, and is fundamental to all knowledge of truths, led Russell to think it deserves to be called “knowledge” of the thing in question. The issue here is largely terminological. In order to guard against confusing acquaintance on the one hand with foundational knowledge of truths acquired by acquaintance on the other, and facilitate an examination of the relation between them, we should be more careful than Russell and restrict knowledge by acquaintance to foundational knowledge of truths. By contrast, one can have acquaintance with items that are not truths, items that cannot be said to be true or false. Knowledge by description, on the other hand, is nonfoundational knowledge of truths; it “always involves…some knowledge of truths as its source and ground” (Russell 1912: 72–3). We adopt this usage in what follows.

For classical foundationalists like Russell, all knowledge of truths ultimately depends on foundational knowledge of truths acquired by acquaintance. But how exactly does acquaintance contribute to this knowledge of truths? If acquaintance is nothing like a judgment or belief, and if the items with which we are acquainted are themselves neither true nor false, how do we get any knowledge of truths out of acquaintance? We turn to this question in section 3.

First, however, let us briefly discuss contemporary views regarding the nature and objects of acquaintance.

2. Contemporary Views on Acquaintance

We said above that what distinguishes the classical, Russellian notion of acquaintance is, minimally, that (i) it is a non-intentional form of awareness: acquaintance with something does not consist in forming any judgment or thought about it, or applying any concepts to it; and (ii) it is real relation requiring the existence of its relata; one cannot be acquainted with some thing, property or fact that does not exist. Let us use the label “acquaintance theory” broadly to stand for any view, in the philosophy of mind or epistemology, in which acquaintance so understood plays a central role. There has been a resurgence of interest in acquaintance theory in the last 25 years or so. Contemporary proponents include BonJour (2001, 2003), Chalmers (2010), Fales (1996), Fumerton (1995, 2001, 2016), Gertler (2001, 2011, 2012), Hasan (2011, 2013), McGrew (1995, 1999), Moser (1989), Stoutenburg (forthcoming), and Taylor (2013). As we shall see, some of these philosophers depart from Russell in significant ways. However, like him, they are all committed to the existence and philosophical significance of a direct, nonjudgmental form of awareness (indeed, many of them call it “acquaintance”) and this warrants treating them all as “acquaintance theorists.” Most of them also explicitly endorse classical foundationalism: like Russell, they hold that all knowledge or justified belief ultimately depends on a foundation of knowledge or justified belief acquired by acquaintance. There are consistent ways to accept acquaintance theory without accepting classical foundationalism. For example, some might agree that we do have some knowledge by acquaintance and appeal to such knowledge in the dualism debate in the philosophy of mind (see the entry on qualia: the knowledge argument), without endorsing the claim that all knowledge or justified belief must depend, ultimately, on acquaintance. However, unless otherwise indicated, we use “acquaintance theory” and “classical foundationalism” interchangeably.

Acquaintance is typically taken to be simple and thus indefinable. The philosophers for whom acquaintance plays a critical philosophical role are usually unapologetic about their inability to define the concept (e.g., Fumerton 1995: 76–7). They will quite plausibly argue that analysis requires conceptual “atoms”—simple ideas out of which other ideas are built. The concept of acquaintance, for them, is arguably the most fundamental concept on which all epistemology, and perhaps all philosophy of mind, is built. Still, one philosopher’s conceptual atom is another’s complete mystery, and unless one can convince oneself that one understands what acquaintance is, one will not be able to understand views that invoke it.

To be sure, one can use metaphors of one sort or another to explain the concept, but the metaphors are as likely to be misleading as helpful. The pain one feels, one might say, is “before” the mind. There is nothing “between” one and the pain one feels. But these are spatial metaphors and the relation between one’s self and that with which one is acquainted is not really all that much like a spatial relation. Even if there is no object between a chair and a table, the space between them is composed of other spaces, and in virtue of this we can compare different spaces or distances quantitatively; in contrast, acquaintance with something is not composed of further relations, and so different relations of acquaintance cannot be compared quantitatively in a parallel way. One can add that acquaintance is a non-intentional or nonjudgmental form of awareness, and that one cannot be aware of something in this way without its existing, but the concept of awareness remains unanalyzed, and these conditions merely assert that, and shed no light on why, acquaintance has these features.

If the usual view is correct and acquaintance is simple and unanalyzable, nevertheless, perhaps one can point to it by describing it in some revealing way that is unique to it. Unfortunately, the attempt at pointing involves controversial presuppositions. But imagine the following sort of familiar case. One is in pain but as one engages in an interesting conversation, one doesn’t notice the pain for a while. After the conversation ends, one is again aware of the pain. There are two possibilities. One is that the pain temporarily ceased. The other is that the pain continued, but that the subject was temporarily unaware of it. On the supposition that the latter makes sense, acquaintance is that relation the subject had to pain before the conversation, the relation that ceased during the conversation, and that began again shortly thereafter.

The acquaintance theory is controversial, the idea that some things can simply be “given” to the subject has often been denounced as a “myth” (Sellars 1963), and those committed to acquaintance disagree about its nature and its objects. All this may seem to be a source of embarrassment for the acquaintance theorist, for how could doubts and disagreements arise regarding what is supposed to be immediately and transparently present to consciousness? But there is no need for embarrassment. For the proponent of acquaintance or the given, the lesson of these doubts and disagreements is that from the fact that something is given it does not follow that everything about the nature of the given or its epistemic role is itself given; “profound puzzles can arise, and legitimately demand solution, even in connection with that which is indubitable” (Fales 1996: 2). (For some elaboration on the acquaintance theorist’s response to the existence of such doubts and disagreements, see the concluding remarks.)

Some acquaintance theorists seem to disagree about the nature of acquaintance. Fumerton regards acquaintance as a sui generis relation; it “cannot be informatively subsumed under a genus, and…cannot be analyzed into any less problematic concepts” (1995: 76). It is an irreducible relation that can hold between a self and some object, state, property, or fact. Like Fumerton and other acquaintance theorists, BonJour agrees that there is a form of awareness that is nonjudgmental and that is “infallible” in the sense that it requires the existence of its object; and like other classical foundationalists, he takes all justified beliefs (or at least all justified empirical beliefs) to depend, ultimately, on this form of awareness. Unlike Fumerton however, BonJour (2003) takes this awareness to be a “built-in” or intrinsic to conscious or experiential states. On this view, awareness is not a relation between the self and something else, but is an intrinsic feature of the mental state itself, though one that is still relational in the sense that it is directed at something; and what one is aware of is just the specific character or content of that state of awareness. So, while Fumerton takes the fundamental awareness or acquaintance to be a relation, BonJour takes it to be an intrinsic feature of all experiences or conscious states. Awareness or acquaintance is perhaps most naturally thought of as a relation between a self and something else: we typically talk of people, animals, persons, selves, minds, etc. being aware of things, states, properties, or facts. However, a view that regards the most fundamental sort of awareness as an intrinsic property of certain mental states might still be able to make sense of such talk: to say that I am directly aware of X is just to say that I am in a state with “built-in” awareness of X.

BonJour’s view is similar to the view that conscious states are self-representational in that the awareness of some content or feature of the state is itself part of that state, but it is important not to overstate the similarity. For BonJour, conscious states are in a sense, as Chisholm might put it, self-presenting, but they are not self-representing. BonJour denies that direct awareness of something is intentional or representational, or that it essentially involves a thought about or representation of it. Again, like all acquaintance theorists, he takes the sort of awareness underlying all foundationally justified belief to be unmediated by any belief or representation, and to guarantee the existence of its object: one cannot be directly aware of something that does not exist.

BonJour’s view of acquaintance seems to explain why, as proponents of the acquaintance approach tend to hold, one cannot be acquainted with external world objects or external world facts (BonJour 2001: 31). If acquaintance is a “built-in” feature of conscious states in virtue of which one can be aware only of intrinsic features of that very state, then on the plausible assumption that ordinary physical objects and their intrinsic features are not intrinsic features of mental states, one cannot have acquaintance with such objects or their features. On the other hand, Fumerton’s relational view of acquaintance, like the traditional Russellian view, seems to allow for the possibility of acquaintance with abstract entities such as universals, which some acquaintance theorists appeal to in order to make sense of the possibility of thought and a priori knowledge (see section 4). There is room for more work here in investigating the nature of acquaintance and its implications.

It’s also worth noting that although talk of acquaintance often brings sense-datum theory to mind, there is nothing about the commitment to acquaintance itself that entails such a commitment. According to sense datum theory, whenever one has a sensory experience as of some object having some property F, there is some object present that has the property F. For example, if I have a sensory experience as of a green triangle, then there is something present that is green and triangular. And since I could have this sensory experience even while hallucinating (at least according to sense datum theorists), this object that is green and triangular is not a physical object. In contrast to the sense datum theorist who treats the sensed property F as a feature of some object of which the subject is aware, the adverbialist or advocate of the theory of appearing treats it as a way of sensing or experiencing. To dance a waltz is not to do something or perform some act, viz., dancing, that takes something else, a waltz, as its object, but is rather a way or manner of dancing—dancing waltzily; similarly, to experience or have an appearance of green is not to have an act of awareness that takes a green object as its target, but is rather a way of experiencing or being appeared to—“experiencing greenly”, or “being appeared to greenly.” The acquaintance approach is compatible with adverbialism regarding sense experience; one might be acquainted with experiential states, and with one’s experiencing greenly, as opposed to being acquainted with some green object, and with its being green. (See, for example, Fumerton 1985: 94–5; McGrew 1995: 93–4; and Chalmers 2010: 291.) Alternatively, some acquaintance theorists take perceptual or sensory experience to involve acquaintance with universals, and hope thereby to avoid problems with both the sense datum theory and the adverbial theory. For an interesting defense of this view, see Forrest (2005). (For more on sense datum theory and adverbialism, see the entry on the problem of perception.)

As we have seen, the familiar experience of temporarily failing to notice one’s pain while engrossed in conversation serves as a potential illustration of acquaintance. In at least some such cases, the pain does not disappear entirely, even though one no longer notices it. Some may be inclined to deny that one can have a pain without being in some way aware or conscious of the pain. (BonJour 2003 seems to hold this view. See also, Chalmers 2010: 291.) But it does seem that the sort of case Fumerton describes is a genuinely possible, indeed frequent, occurrence, and that the act of noticing one’s pain is not a mere predication of one concept to another (e.g., predication of the concept pain to the concept present experience), but an act of fixing one’s mental gaze, so to speak, on some particular feature or aspect of one’s experience. A relation of acquaintance seems to provide just what is needed here: if acquaintance is a relation that one can stand in to one’s experience or to some feature of the experience, that would account for the possibility of having an experience of something, like a pain or some other sensation, temporarily failing to notice it, and then noticing it again. Can BonJour’s account handle such cases as well? BonJour does qualify the awareness required for justification in a particular way that may help him to make sense of such cases. I can be conscious of or directly aware of a great many features simultaneously, but can attend to only a few features at any one time. For BonJour, attention is not entirely separate from the built-in awareness, but is “built upon it via what might be described as a selective focus” (2003: 192). So, while I cannot be in pain without being conscious of or aware of the pain, I can be in pain without attending specifically or selectively to the pain. Gertler (2001) presents an account of the justification of introspective beliefs that takes attention as a primitive, direct awareness. Though the connection to acquaintance is not explicit there, in more recent work Gertler defends the same view as an “acquaintance approach” to introspective knowledge, so called because it is inspired by Russell’s theory of acquaintance (2011, 2012). She seems to regard demonstrative attention (the sort of attention that makes possible introspective judgments with demonstrative content, e.g., “I am experiencing this property”) as made possible by acquaintance (2012). Taylor (2013) discusses a number of phenomenological and theoretical advantages to identifying acquaintance with attentive awareness.

To summarize, there is a great deal of agreement among philosophers who adopt the acquaintance approach: they all take there to be an epistemically fundamental awareness that is unmediated and nonconceptual, a form of awareness that secures the existence of its object. There seems to be some disagreement regarding the nature of acquaintance, e.g., whether it is fundamentally a relation between the self and the target of awareness, or an intrinsic, “built-in” aspect or feature of some mental states; and whether it consists in attention. There may also be some disagreement regarding the possible objects or targets of acquaintance. And, as we shall see below, there is also some disagreement regarding the proper analysis of noninferential knowledge or justified belief, and how acquaintance figures in that analysis.

3. Acquaintance and Noninferential Knowledge

Foundationalism regarding justification is often motivated by some version of the regress argument. (Foundationalism regarding knowledge can be motivated by a parallel version of the regress argument, put in terms of knowledge rather than justification.) The argument goes roughly as follows. By definition, any belief B that is an instance of nonfoundational or inferential justification must depend on some inference or inferential relation to other beliefs. It seems that this dependence on other beliefs must take one of four forms: (i) the belief depends inferentially on other beliefs, and the latter beliefs on yet other beliefs, to infinity; (ii) the inference eventually loops back to belief B, so that B depends on itself for its justification; (iii) the belief ultimately depends on other beliefs that are not themselves justified; or (iv) the belief ultimately depends on a foundationally justified belief: a belief that is justified but that does not depend on other beliefs for its justification. The foundationalist argues that each of the alternatives to (iv) is seriously problematic: (i) An infinite regress is vicious, and even if it isn’t, this is no help for finite minds like our own. (ii) Circular reasoning is vicious; one cannot depend, even in part, on a belief that p in order to justify believing that p. (iii) One cannot generate justification by relying on unjustified beliefs (“garbage in, garbage out!”). So that leaves (iv): if any of our beliefs are justified, then they must either be foundationally justified or depend, ultimately, on foundational beliefs for their justification.

Some worry that (iv) is no better, and possibly worse, than the alternatives: how could a belief be justified, or be an instance of knowledge, without depending on other beliefs? The acquaintance theorists seems to have an answer: acquaintance with facts is designed to end the potentially vicious regress of justification. But how exactly do we get noninferential knowledge or justified belief out of acquaintance? An acquaintance theorist who accepts the correspondence theory of truth can provide a relatively straightforward answer. On what is surely the classical conception of truth, truth consists in correspondence between the truth bearer (the proposition, thought, or belief) and the representation-independent fact to which that truth bearer corresponds (see the entry on the correspondence theory of truth). The question of what constitute the primary bearers of truth value is a matter of enormous controversy. Suppose, though, for this discussion that it is a thought that is the primary bearer of truth value (sentences are derivatively true or false when they express thoughts that are true or false).

On a simple version of this view (perhaps too simple to have any contemporary proponents, but an instructive place to start), we have noninferential or foundational knowledge that P if and only if we have the thought that P while we are directly acquainted with the fact that P—i.e., a truth-maker of the thought that P. So if I am the kind of being who has the conceptual sophistication to form thoughts, and I have the thought that I am in pain while I am acquainted with the fact that I am in pain, I have the most secure and basic sort of knowledge of truth.

We said earlier that acquaintance is not itself judgmental or propositional, and so does not have truth value—it is a form of awareness of something, not awareness that something is so-and-so. However, this leaves open the possibility that the object or target of acquaintance—that with which one is acquainted—be propositional or have truth value. If I am acquainted with the proposition or thought that I am in pain then I am acquainted with something that has truth value, even though acquaintance itself is not to be understood as propositional in nature. The simple view we are considering might hold that one has foundational knowledge that one is in pain if, in addition to being acquainted with one’s being in pain, one is also acquainted with the thought or proposition that one is in pain.

This view of how we get from acquaintance to noninferential knowledge or justified belief is problematic, however. First, the account seems too weak, for acquaintance with a fact that corresponds to a thought is not sufficient for justification, let alone knowledge. Suppose that I am aware of the fact of there being a decagon in my visual field. Suppose that I also believe that there is a decagon in my visual field, but my belief is little more than a lucky guess, or that I only believe this because I think there always is a decagon in my visual field. Intuitively, the belief is not justified. Second, the account seems too strong, for the requirement that one’s thought correspond to reality rules out the possibility of false noninferentially justified belief. The resulting infallibilism regarding foundational belief is a prima facie implausible requirement, and arguably has radically skeptical consequences. This second problem will be taken up later, in section 6.

Contemporary acquaintance theorists have defended more sophisticated versions of the view. In response to the first problem, the acquaintance theorist can agree that in order to be justified it is not enough that the subject be acquainted with a fact that happens to correspond to what is believed. It will be useful to divide the responses into two broad camps, introduced in the next two sub-sections: those that require, in addition to acquaintance with some fact, some sort of awareness of the correspondence between the thought and what it is about (or perhaps awareness of some other epistemically relevant relation—see the end of section 6), and those that require that the beliefs involve demonstrative or phenomenal concepts.

3.1 Awareness of Correspondence

Why is acquaintance with a fact that corresponds to one’s thought not sufficient for justification? Consider the example mentioned above. I can be directly aware of there being a decagon in my visual field, believe that there is a decagon in my visual field, and yet I might fail to be justified if I believe this not because I am unaware of there being a decagon in my visual field, but because my belief was little more than a guess, or because I believe (without justification) that there are always decagons in my visual field. This might suggest that the acquaintance theorist need only add some condition to the effect that the subject must believe that p because she is aware of a corresponding fact. Most acquaintance theorists will not be entirely happy with this suggestion. Acquaintance theorists are paradigm internalists about justification: they typically accept the internalist thesis that one can be justified in believing that p only if one has a reason or evidence in favor of p’s truth, something in virtue of which the truth of p is not a mere accident from his or her perspective; externalists deny this thesis (see the entry on internalist vs. externalist conceptions of epistemic justification). Acquaintance theorists are therefore likely to insist that awareness of the fact that p cannot provide justification for believing that p unless the subject is in some way also aware of the relevance of that fact to the truth of p. This awareness of the relevance of some fact to the truth of p might be accepted as part of the epistemic basing relation, and for this reason necessary for “doxastic justification”: in order for S to be justified in believing that p on the basis of some ground or evidence e, S must be aware of the relevance of e to p’s truth, and believe that p directly because of this awareness. Alternatively, the awareness of the relevance of some fact to the truth of p might be taken as a condition for even “propositional justification”: in order for S to have or possess noninferential justification for believing that p (even if S does not believe that p, or does not properly base the belief on that justification), S must not only be acquainted with some fact that is relevant to the truth of p, but must also be aware, in some way, of the relevance of that fact to the truth of p. Moser (1989: 141–5) seems to endorse a view of the former sort, while Fumerton (1995) endorses the latter. (While the distinction between propositional and doxastic justification is important, to simplify discussion, we do not distinguish carefully between these below.)

According to Fumerton, a belief that p is noninferentially justified if and only if the subject is acquainted with the thought that p, acquainted with a corresponding fact, and acquainted with the correspondence between the thought that p and that corresponding fact. (Fumerton qualifies the analysis to accommodate false noninferentially justified beliefs, but let us ignore this for the moment.) Suppose that I am acquainted with my having a headache, acquainted with the thought that I have a headache, and acquainted with the correspondence between the thought that I have a headache and my having a headache. When this happens, everything constitutive of the thought’s being true is there directly before my mind. Epistemically speaking, it doesn’t get any better than this.

BonJour’s account of noninferentially justified belief similarly requires not only direct awareness of some fact, but also a “direct recognition” of the “fit” between that fact and the conceptual description embodied in the belief (BonJour 2003: 73–4). Both Fumerton and BonJour thus require some sort of awareness or grasp of the correspondence between a thought and what it is about. However, while Fumerton’s acquaintance with correspondence is acquaintance with a fact and not a judgment that a proposition is true, BonJour seems to understand the “recognition” of fit or correspondence as judgmental or propositional—something like a judgment to the effect that the conceptual description embodied in the belief fits or correctly describes one’s experience. This naturally leads to the question, must this judgment of fit itself be justified? And if so, what justifies it? BonJour insists (2003: 65 and 193) that while the judgment of fit requires justification, its justification depends on one’s direct awareness of the propositional content believed and a direct awareness of the relevant experiential feature, and that there is no need for any further awareness, judgmental or otherwise. This response seems problematic, however, for we now have at least one sort of belief or judgment, the higher-order judgment of fit itself, that is noninferentially justified without there being any awareness or recognition that its propositional content fits the facts. If a judgment of fit is required for the first-order belief, shouldn’t the same be required for the judgment of fit itself? But if it is required then we are off on a regress of judgments of fit, with no foundation in sight. This suggests, in line with Fumerton’s view, that if some awareness of fit or correspondence is required, then it must at the most fundamental level be a nonconceptual and nonpropositional awareness of fit or correspondence.

3.2 Demonstrative Concepts and Phenomenal Concepts

Not all acquaintance theorists require acquaintance with the correspondence (or some other epistemically relevant relation) between some thought or proposition and a distinct fact for one to have knowledge by acquaintance. Rather than require a further act of awareness, some acquaintance theorists add constraints to the nature of the foundational belief or the manner in which it is formed so that acquaintance with some mental state or mental feature provides part of the content of the belief itself, and does so in such a way as to guarantee the truth of the belief. For example, according to McGrew (1995, 1999), for any object of acquaintance or direct awareness, it is possible to form a belief in which a demonstrative concept refers directly to it. By virtue of my acquaintance with a painful experience, I believe directly of it that it exists, or that the property (painfulness) is instantiated. We could express the belief roughly by saying “I am experiencing this” (McGrew 1995, 1999), or “this is instantiated (in me, now)” (Gertler 2012). For this kind of belief (unlike most other beliefs regarding contingent facts), to genuinely understand or grasp the content of the belief is to grasp its truth.

It is important to see how this is different from the standard view of demonstrative concepts. On the standard view, a demonstrative concept is something like an indexical (see the entry on indexicals). Consider indexical concepts like I, here, and now. The reference of these concepts is fixed by the context, by the speaker or thinker’s identity, location, and time. On the standard view, the content of a token indexical concept is constituted by or essentially tied to the actual referent, much as the content of the concept water is constituted by or essentially tied to the actual referent in the environment (at least according to content-externalism about natural-kind concepts). The standard view of demonstratives is similar. The actual referent of a token demonstrative concept is taken to constitute or be essential to its content, but unlike the indexical concepts just discussed, the reference of a demonstrative is not fixed automatically by the speaker’s identity, location and time; something else is needed to fix the reference. Different views of the reference-fixing factor have been proposed, with the main suggestions being that reference is fixed by one or more of the following: a demonstration, understood as an act of pointing or gesturing or some similar behavior; an intention to point or refer to an object of a certain kind, or an object satisfying some description; or some appropriate causal or spatial relation (e.g., between the agent’s pointing or utterance and some item in the environment). What is important for our purposes is that none of these views take the reference-fixing to be done purely by acquaintance or direct awareness. On McGrew’s view, the reference is fixed by direct awareness, and not by acts of pointing or gesturing, by the subject’s intentions to refer to a certain sort of thing, or by causal relations.

McGrew is not alone in holding that experiential or phenomenal features can, by virtue of our direct awareness of them, constitute the content of a special class of concepts. Gertler (2001, 2011, 2012), Chalmers (2003, 2010), and Nida-Rümelin (2004) defend views very much in the same spirit. Gertler (2001) distinguishes between ordinary demonstratives, which typically involve an intention to pick out an entity that satisfies some description, and a pure demonstrative, which picks out its referent solely by a fundamental act of attention or acquaintance. Chalmers (2003, 2010) defends a similar view according to which some noninferential beliefs are justified by virtue of involving a “direct phenomenal concept,” a concept whose content is constituted by a phenomenal quality with which one is acquainted. The view is supported by considering Frank Jackson’s (1982) hypothetical case of Mary, who has learned all of the physical facts about color but has never had a visual experience in color until one day she experiences red. Jackson argues there that Mary thereby learns some new information; she acquires some new knowledge. And since Mary already knows all the physical facts about color, this new item of knowledge must, Jackson argues, be of a non-physical fact. Chalmers (2010) and Nida-Rümelin (2004) argue that it is difficult to make sense of the epistemic progress of subjects like Jackson’s Mary unless we accept that there is a core phenomenal concept whose content is constituted by an underlying phenomenal or experiential quality with which the subject is acquainted. Chalmers (2004) relies on the acquaintance approach to phenomenal concepts to defend the knowledge argument for dualism—i.e., the claim that Mary acquires new knowledge, and that this must be knowledge of a non-physical fact. (He notes (2003: 227) that demonstratives are naturally used to express direct phenomenal concepts (e.g., “I am experiencing this quality”), and that there may be a sense in which a direct phenomenal concept is a “demonstrative” concept, but he avoids such a label at least in part because of the danger of confusing direct phenomenal concepts with demonstrative ones as usually understood.) It is worth noting that, in contrast, some philosophers appeal to knowledge by acquaintance to make sense of Mary’s new knowledge in order to oppose, rather than to support, the success of the knowledge argument for a dualistic conclusion (e.g., Conee 1994 and Balog 2012).

McGrew endorses classical foundationalism, taking all our empirical knowledge to rest on a foundation of knowledge that is had by acquaintance or direct awareness, and in particular on demonstrative beliefs. While Chalmers and Gertler seem somewhat sympathetic to classical foundationalism, they have been concerned primarily to defend the claim that at least some introspective beliefs or beliefs regarding one’s own phenomenal states constitute the most secure sort of empirical, noninferential knowledge or justified belief, and that these beliefs owe their privileged epistemic status to acquaintance. Thus, Gertler (2012) endorses the acquaintance approach for a limited class of introspective judgments, and leaves it open whether there could be other sources of noninferential justification.

Some worry that the demonstrative strategy yields beliefs with very little content (Sosa 2003b). If, however, we keep in mind that the content of the belief is secured by the subject’s direct awareness of the phenomenal features themselves then it is unclear why the content can’t be as rich as the features attended to. A more serious worry in the vicinity is that, insofar as a demonstrative concept is only possessed by the subject for as long as the particular experience or property instance is given or presented, we have no account of how concepts that the subject can possess over time as experiences change can be applied directly to experience. Even if purely demonstrative beliefs have an important role to play at the foundations, many classical foundationalists will want to allow that some concepts that we already possess can be compared directly to experience to yield foundational knowledge. Unless some foundational beliefs involve such enduring concepts, concepts whose connections to other concepts we have had the opportunity to grasp, it will be difficult to see how these foundations could support various other beliefs that are intuitively justified. To accommodate such foundations, Chalmers (2003) suggests that subjects might retain knowledge of what an experience is like even after the experience is long gone, by acquiring what he calls a standing phenomenal concept. Standing phenomenal concepts are still very much like direct phenomenal concepts in that the content is essentially tied to phenomenal properties. While Chalmers does not say exactly what determines the content of such concepts, he finds it

plausible that their content is determined by some combination of (1) non-sensory phenomenal states of a cognitive sort, which bear a relevant relation to the original phenomenal quality in question—e.g., a faint Humean phenomenal ‘idea’ that is relevantly related to the original ‘impression’; (2) dispositions to have such states; and (3) dispositions to recognize instances of the phenomenal quality in question. (2003: 239)

4. Acquaintance, Thought, and A Priori Knowledge

So far we have been talking primarily about the role of acquaintance in securing a special kind of knowledge. There is, however, another crucial role acquaintance has been thought to play. For philosophers like Russell, acquaintance secures not only the objects of knowledge but the objects of thought itself; it explains not only how knowledge is possible, but also how thought is possible. This is so not just for a special class of thoughts about experiences or experiential qualities as some hold (see section 3.2, on demonstrative and phenomenal concepts), but for thought in general. The idea actually goes back to the empiricists who claimed that all simple ideas have their source in experience. When refined the suggestion probably amounted to the view that all simple ideas are derived from objects or properties with which we are acquainted or of which we are directly aware. On Russell’s version of the view, whenever you form a thought, the components of that thought are items with which you are acquainted:

Every proposition which we can understand must be composed wholly of constituents with which we are acquainted. (1912: Ch. 5)

You can, to be sure, think of Jack the Ripper, but the thought when analyzed is broken down into constituents each of which is something we can apprehend directly. The name “Jack the Ripper” gets reduced to a description embedded in a quantified statement. The thought that Jack the Ripper is vicious just is the thought that there exists one and only one individual who has certain properties—e.g., who is the most famous 19th Century murdererand who also has the property of being vicious. Russell has always struggled with the question of how to view our understanding of the quantifier—expressions of quantity such as ‘a’ or ‘the’—but it is clear that he believed that we have the capacity to entertain in thought (directly) the properties (universals) picked out by predicate expressions. If having a thought essentially involves acquaintance with universals, then it ceases to be a mystery how thought can represent the world, since the world partly consists in instances or exemplifications of universals; and if a thought involves acquaintance with universals that happen to be instantiated or exemplified by some object of acquaintance, then it makes sense that one can, at least in some cases, directly compare and become acquainted with the correspondence or fit between the two.

The acquaintance theorist is in a position to offer a different gloss on the traditional distinction between a priori knowledge of necessary truth and a posteriori or empirical knowledge of contingent truth. On the classical acquaintance theory, knowledge of both truths has the same source—acquaintance with facts. The distinction lies with the objects of acquaintance. When I am acquainted with my being in pain, that can give me knowledge of the contingent truth that I’m in pain. When I am acquainted with the property of being red, the property of being yellow and the relation of being darker than holding between them, that can give me knowledge of the necessary truth that red is darker than yellow. When I am acquainted with being triangular and being trilateral and the relation of inclusion holding between them, that can give me knowledge of the necessary truth that triangles are trilateral. When I am acquainted with being a circle, and having corners, and the relation of exclusion between them, that can give me knowledge of the necessary truth that circles have no corners. For similar views of the nature of thought and the a priori, see Bealer (1982: Ch. 8, especially 187–90) and BonJour (1998: Ch. 6).

5. Acquaintance and Inferential Knowledge

An acquaintance theorist aiming to provide a general account of knowledge owes us an account not only of noninferential knowledge, but also of inferential knowledge. How can we get at least reasonable or justified belief when we are not directly acquainted with the truth makers of those beliefs, the facts that make the beliefs true? Again, we stress that the question we are concerned with here is not how we can get knowledge of truths in contrast to knowledge of something other than a truth. We have already suggested that knowledge by acquaintance should be thought of as knowledge of a truth made possible by acquaintance with the truth maker. The question, rather, concerns how we can get knowledge of a truth when we are not acquainted with the truth maker. For the classical acquaintance theorist, that question, in turn, reduces to the question of how we can acquire knowledge through inference.

There are at least two possible answers the acquaintance theorist might give. A view we might call inferential externalism suggests that to acquire inferential knowledge that Q by inferring Q from P it is enough that P makes highly probable Q. The relation of making probable, itself, can be interpreted in many different ways. A detailed discussion of interpretations of probability would take us too far afield, so let us be content with a few very brief remarks (see the entry on interpretations of probability). One might try to understand probability in terms of frequency. Roughly the idea is that P makes Q probable when P and Q form a pair of propositions of a certain kind, where usually when the first member of a pair of propositions of that sort is true then so is the second. Alternatively, some philosophers would follow Keynes (1921) and argue that there are relations of making probable that hold between propositions analogous (in some ways) to the relation of entailment that holds between propositions. On this view, when P makes probable Q, it is a necessary truth that P makes probable Q (though that necessary truth is perfectly consistent with the fact that the conjunction of P and X might not make probable Q).

Most classical foundationalists at least implicitly rejected the idea that the mere obtaining of a probability relation between one’s noninferential evidence that P and the proposition Q one infers from that evidence is sufficient to acquire inferential justification or inferential knowledge. Rather, they insisted, one must be aware of or have access to the probabilistic connection that obtains between one’s premises and one’s conclusion. Direct acquaintance with facts was proposed to end a potentially vicious regress of justification (see section 3), but now the regress looms again in connection with knowledge of probabilistic connections. How can one get knowledge of probabilistic connections between premises and conclusions? If one infers the existence of the probabilistic connections from the truth of some other different proposition F, then one not only needs justification for believing F, but, one needs justification for believing that F does indeed make probable that the probabilistic connection holds! The problem here is essentially the one that has been pointed out by Lewis Carroll (1895), though he applied the problem to deductive inference. BonJour (2005) cites this problem as a reason for taking a direct, nonpropositional grasp of logical relations as crucial to inferential justification, at least for deductive inferences; similarly, Fumerton (2015) argues that, to halt the regress, the internalist should require a direct awareness of relations of making probable between propositions. But are we aware of such relations? The problem seems hopeless if one understands probability in terms of frequency, for we do not seem to have any direct access to such complex, contingent facts as the ratio that one proposition is true relative to another (logically independent) one. That seems to be the sort of thing one can only know by extensive observation, data gathering, or empirical research, and the question of how we know that some observation makes probable our judgment of probability arises all over again. But if one can convince oneself that there are real logical relations of making probable holding between propositions, then perhaps the acquaintance theorist can secure the required knowledge of those connections once again through acquaintance. Ramsey (1926) famously objected that we do not seem to perceive such relations of making probable, but Hasan (2017) argues that these objections are weak, and that there are good reasons to think we can be directly aware of such relations. This version of the acquaintance theory relies critically on the fundamental concept of acquaintance in understanding both noninferential and inferential knowledge. Noninferential knowledge is secured by direct acquaintance with truth makers. Inferential knowledge is secured by direct acquaintance with logical and probabilistic connections between known propositions and other propositions.

6. Fallible Noninferentially Justified Beliefs

An acquaintance theory of justification that requires acquaintance with a proposition’s truth maker in order for the subject to be justified in believing the proposition may seem to require too much. The requirement rules out the possibility of false noninferentially justified belief, and the problem is that there seem to be plausible examples of such beliefs. Suppose that I am experiencing what seems to be a marginal or border-line case of pain, and that I believe it is an experience of pain. But suppose that, as it turns out, my belief is false; the experience is not a pain but, say, a painless itch. Prima facie, it is plausible that the belief has some degree (perhaps not very much) of justification, the same or very close to the degree of justification I might have in the “good” case in which I correctly believe that I am experiencing pain on the basis of an experience of marginal pain. Other cases might involve mistaking hot and cold, mistaking shades of phenomenal color, mistaking the number of speckles in a region of one’s visual field, and mistaking the content of one’s own thoughts. Moreover, even when we restrict our attention to true noninferentially justified beliefs, it seems plausible that the degree of justification can vary, and we need some way of accounting for this. Suppose, for example, that I really am experiencing a marginal case of pain. It is plausible to think that my belief that I am experiencing pain, while true, is not as justified as the belief would be if I were in searing pain.

McGrew (1995, 1999) argues that a kind of certainty or infallibility (in his terms, “incorrigibility”) is a necessary feature of empirical foundational beliefs: a belief that P is empirically foundational only if being justified in believing that P guarantees its truth. He defends the view that such foundations are available and that they are adequate to yield knowledge of the external world. Other classical foundationalists want to allow for the possibility of false foundational beliefs. (See Fumerton 1995: 77; BonJour 2003: 73–74; and Fales 1996: 174–80. For a critique of acquaintance theorists’ attempts to accommodate fallibility at the foundations, see Huemer 2007, Poston 2010, and Tucker 2016. For replies to some of these critiques, see Fumerton 2010 and 2016, Hasan 2013, and Stoutenburg (forthcoming). Stoutenburg nevertheless motivates infalliblism, and provides an account of how propositions that moderate foundationalists regard as basic derive their justification from infallibly known propositions.)

Intuitively, we may want to allow that one be justified to some degree if the fact with which one is actually acquainted corresponds to a proposition that is very similar to the proposition believed (Fumerton 1995: 77). This might suggest the following principle:

  1. If one is directly aware of x’s being F, and F is sufficiently similar to G, then one thereby has at least some defeasible justification for believing that x is G.

One apparent problem with this suggestion is that the satisfaction of the antecedent does not seem to give the subject a reason to think the belief is true. The problem is clear if we assume, as acquaintance theorists generally do, that a belief can be justified for a subject only if the proposition believed is made probable by the subject’s evidence, or by that with which the subject is acquainted. The mere fact that I experience one of these shades fails to make probable, indeed, rules out, that I experience the other, and so gives me no justification for believing that I experience the other. Here’s a second attempt:

  1. If one is directly aware of x’s being F, but it seems to oneself that x is G or one is inclined to believe that x is G, then one thereby has at least some defeasible justification for believing that x is G.

The problem with this suggestion is that acquaintance or direct awareness doesn’t seem to be doing the crucial epistemic work. If the principle is true, why not hold some version of “phenomenal conservativism” in epistemology, the position that a propositional awareness—a seeming that x is G or an inclination to believe that x is G—is a source of defeasible justification for believing that x is G? If so, then the acquaintance or direct awareness requirement should be dropped from (2) and there would still be the justification. Here is perhaps a more promising strategy:

  1. If one is directly aware of x’s being F, and x’s being F makes it probable for one that it is G, then one thereby has at least some defeasible justification for believing that x is G.

We get different versions of the acquaintance approach to fallible beliefs depending on what is required for something to “make probable for one”. Acquaintance theorists with strong internalist inclinations are likely to insist that awareness of the fact that p cannot justify one in believing that p unless the subject is in some way also aware of the fact’s making it probable that p.

Reflection on some examples suggests the following problem with this principle. An experience’s being a mere itch does not make it probable that it is a pain, for its being a mere itch rules out its being a pain; and an experience’s being indeterminately either an itch or a pain does not make it probable that it is a pain, for it might just as probably be an itch. Or suppose that I am directly aware of a phenomenally red patch in my visual field, and on the basis of this I form the false belief that it is, say, pink; or that I am directly aware of a determinate shade red1, but I form the false belief that the patch is red2. Again, principle (3) does not apply: something’s being red cannot make it probable that it is pink, for there are many other shades of red; something’s being red1 cannot make it probable that it is red2, for being one determinate shade rules out being the other. (See Huemer 2007 for an argument against (2) and (3) along these lines, though one that employs some different examples.)

The problem, however, might not be with principle (3) itself but with the sorts of features focused on (see Hasan 2013: section 3). There may be other features involved in such apparent cases of fallible foundational justification that do make probable the proposition believed. For example, consider the following principle, which is a specific version of (3):

  1. If one is directly aware of some feature’s seeming to be G (or of one’s being inclined to believe that it is G), and its seeming to be G makes it probable for one that it is G, then one thereby has at least some defeasible justification for believing that it is G.

Tucker (2016) presents a dilemma for this proposal: Either the relevant making probable relation is contingent, or it is necessary. If it is contingent, then the justification will be inferential, and so the principle can’t account for misleading noninferential justification. If it is necessary, then (like (2)), the principle has too much in common with phenomenal conservatism to be attractive from the point of view of classical foundationalism. A plausible reply would grasp the second horn: Unlike (2), this does not threaten to collapse to conservatism, since it still requires acquaintance with something epistemically relevant to the target proposition—acquaintance with a probability maker (and perhaps also, for those with strong internalist inclinations, acquaintance with the relation of making probable). If the view still has something in common with phenomenal conservatism, that might be a point in its favor: it can help capture what the phenomenal conservatism seems to get right without accepting it.

Moser (1989) seems to accept a view along these lines, though he would put the fundamental principle in explanatory terms, roughly as follows:

  1. If one is directly aware of x’s being F, and y’s being G is the best explanation for one of x’s being F, then one thereby has at least some defeasible justification for believing that y is G.

So, for example, if one is directly aware of the appearance of a blue book, and such an appearance is best explained for one by the presence of an actual blue book, then one has some justification for believing that a blue book is present. For Moser, physical object appearances may be given even though physical objects cannot, and these appearances may justify beliefs about physical objects without requiring beliefs about appearances. Though Moser does not discuss this explicitly, perhaps beliefs regarding our own experiences can be justified in a similar way. If an appearance of pain can be given to me despite the fact that I am not in pain, and the appearance makes probable or is best explained by the fact that I am actually experiencing pain, then perhaps I have some justification for believing that I am in pain. Moser thus aims to defend a form of foundationalism that is classical in its commitment to acquaintance or the given, and yet “moderate” not only in holding that some noninferentially justified beliefs can be false, but also that some external world beliefs can be noninferentially justified. A great deal depends, of course, on whether a plausible account of these seemings or appearances can be given, and whether a strong enough case can be made for the claim that the truth of the relevant propositions do best explain the appearances (see Moser 1989: 158–165, for a defense of the latter for external-world beliefs).

Others who accept something along the lines of (3) or (4) seem to focus on different features. According to Fales (1996: 175), while something’s being given to one is not a matter of degree, the “transparency” of the given is a matter of degree, and can itself be given. When one is thinking that some given experience or item x is G, and one is directly aware of the uncertain or not-fully-transparent character of one’s awareness, this can make it merely probable for one that x is G. Fumerton (2016: 242) appeals to the controversial idea that correspondence can come in degrees. For example, one can be aware of a shade of color that is closer to the orange part of the color continuum but still corresponds relatively well to the thought that it is red; as the correspondence gets weaker, the justification one has for the belief also gets weaker.

Accommodating fallible foundations complicates some aspects of the traditional view introduced above. First, it no longer seems that Russell and Price’s criterion that is reminiscent of the method of doubt is a very good method for determining what one is acquainted with, for there will be some objects of acquaintance that are susceptible to some degree of doubt. However, the method of doubt might remain useful as a guide to the sort of thing with which one can be acquainted: for any physical object, I can conceive of a case in which any justification I have for believing that it exists is just as it is now, and yet there is no such object, and nothing remotely like it, in my vicinity. Second, we said above that noninferential knowledge is secured by acquaintance with truth makers, while inferential knowledge is secured by acquaintance with logical and probabilistic connections between the propositions known and what one infers from those propositions. One natural way for the acquaintance theorist to accommodate fallible foundations is to say that p is noninferentially justified for one only if one is directly aware of some fact that either makes true or makes probable for one that p; if the subject’s justification for believing that p depends on one’s justification for some other proposition(s) then the justification is inferential.

Those who do find it plausible that they can be directly aware of relations of correspondence between propositions and facts, and who accept some internalist requirement to the effect that one must be aware of the relevance of some fact to the truth of a proposition in order for that proposition to be justified for one, may be inclined to go a bit further and accept the possibility of acquaintance with other logical or probabilistic relations between propositional and nonpropositional items. As we saw above in discussing inferential knowledge, some acquaintance theorists already accept that we can have acquaintance with entailment relations and, more controversially, epistemic probability relations between propositions. If we can be aware of similar relations, at the foundational level, between some propositions and facts with which we are acquainted, this might significantly extend the sorts of foundational beliefs satisfying strong internalist requirements. To give just a few simple examples, suppose that I am directly aware of a red triangle in my visual field, and also aware of a relation of logical exclusion or incompatibility (or, if you like, non-correspondence) between the figure’s being a red triangle and the proposition that it is green, that it is a circle, or that it has five sides. If acquaintance with correspondence is a source of noninferential justification, then perhaps acquaintance with these relations of incompatibility can be a source of noninferential justification for disbelieving these propositions, or for believing their negations—believing that the figure is not green, that it is not a circle, and that it is not five-sided respectively. According to Moser (1989), we can also be directly aware of probabilistic or explanatory relations between propositions and nonpropositional items—e.g., between the proposition that there is a blue book here, and the given appearance of a blue book (though, as already mentioned in section 3.1, he seems to take this as a requirement for doxastic as opposed to propositional justification).

7. Criticisms

Many objections and concerns have been raised against the acquaintance approach. We here discuss three main ones: the Sellarsian Dilemma, Sosa’s problem of the speckled hen, and the threat of skepticism.

7.1 The Sellarsian Dilemma

In developing the view, we have already responded to one of its most common criticisms. As was noted above, it has been argued (most famously by Sellars 1963) that even if there were such a thing as acquaintance with individuals, properties, or facts, that relation wouldn’t give one knowledge of truths. The observation is correct (since acquaintance with something does not amount to a judgment, let alone a true judgment, about it), but it is irrelevant to the more sophisticated view according to which the acquaintance with the relevant fact is only a constituent of the ground of propositional knowledge. As we have seen (section 3), acquaintance theorists typically add conditions that make the fact with which one is acquainted directly relevant to the truth of some thought or belief—e.g., by requiring awareness of the correspondence or fit (or perhaps some other relation) between the thought and the fact, or by requiring that the fact constitute part of the content of the belief.

These sophisticated views also seem capable of handling a closely related, influential objection. Inspired by Sellars, BonJour (1978, 1985) presented the following dilemma for any foundationalist view that takes one’s justification to consist in or depend essentially on some sort of awareness, acquaintance, or apprehension. (See also, Sellars 1963: Part I, 1975; Davidson 1983; McDowell 1994; and Williams 2005.) Is the awareness or acquaintance that is the alleged source of noninferential justification propositional or conceptual? That is, does it involve the acceptance of a proposition or thought, or at least the categorization of some sensory item or the application of some concept to experience? If, on the one hand, the acquaintance or awareness is propositional or conceptual in this way, then while such acts or episodes of awareness seem capable, in principle, of justifying other beliefs, they would surely need to be justified themselves. The episode of awareness would involve something like the acceptance of a proposition, and such an attitude clearly needs justification if it is to justify anything else. But then, the allegedly foundational belief is not foundational after all. If, on the other hand, we can regard direct awareness as nonpropositional and nonconceptual, then while these acts or states of awareness do not require or even admit of justification—for simply being aware of something is a mental state that is clearly neither justified nor unjustified—they also don’t seem capable on their own of providing a reason or justification for propositional items like beliefs. Therefore, the classical foundationalist’s acquaintance or direct awareness cannot serve as a foundational source of knowledge or justified belief.

Most sophisticated versions of classical foundationalism are perhaps best understood as grasping the nonpropositional horn of the dilemma, since acquaintance is a nonpropositional form of awareness. Fumerton (1995: 75) replies that while acquaintance itself is nonpropositional, that does not rule out that propositions or thoughts are objects of acquaintance or constituents of objects of acquaintance, and if one is acquainted with a relation of correspondence between a thought and a fact, that would seem to provide all the justification one could need or want. As we have seen, BonJour (2003) gives a similar reply that appeals to direct awareness of some fact and a direct recognition of the fit between the fact and the proposition believed. He regards this recognition as judgmental or propositional, and that may lead some to push the propositional horn again: we need something further to justify the judgment of fit, and so the regress of justification has not yet come to an end. (For a response, see BonJour 2003: 193. For some critical discussion, see Bergmann 2006: Ch. 2.) McGrew, Chalmers, and others who adopt the demonstrative or phenomenal concept strategy might reply that at least in the case of demonstratively formed beliefs the relevance of the truth maker to the proposition believed is transparent and guaranteed by the manner in which the belief is formed: acquaintance simply picks out some feature of experience and takes it up into the content of a belief or judgment that asserts that the feature exists or is instantiated.

7.2 The Problem of the Speckled Hen

Recently, Sosa (2003a,b), Poston (2007) and Markie (2009) have raised the problem of the speckled hen in objection to the acquaintance theorist’s conception of noninferential justification. The speckled hen presents an appearance of, say, 48 speckles. One is, they assume, directly acquainted with one’s visual field replete with the 48 speckles. Yet unless one has counted the speckles, one is unlikely to have justification for believing that one’s visual field contains the 48 speckles. Even if one guesses correctly the number of speckles in the field, one’s guess hardly counts as a justified belief. Direct acquaintance with truthmakers for one’s belief is, then, clearly not sufficient for noninferential justification.

There are a number of responses available to the acquaintance theorist (see BonJour 2003 and Fumerton 2005). It need not be part of the acquaintance theorist’s view that in being directly acquainted with an experience one is directly acquainted with all aspects of the experience. One might be directly acquainted with the fact that one is being appeared to many-speckledly without being acquainted with the fact that one is appeared to 48-speckledly. Think, for example, about how you can be aware of a car’s having a dark color without being aware of its having a determinate shade. Some may deny that cases like the latter are clearly possible, for is one not aware of the specific shade as well, even if one does not have a term or concept for it? Indeed, as we have seen, some acquaintance theorists hold that one is acquainted with or directly aware of all intrinsic sensory or phenomenal features of one’s experience, including specific shades of color. However, they require in addition that the subject attend to the relevant feature or fact, and so they are still able to distinguish between a selective, attentive awareness and a more minimal consciousness or peripheral awareness. They may attempt in this way to accommodate the intuition that we are conscious of or aware of a great deal more than we attend to or notice, while insisting that this attention or noticing is a nonjudgmental awareness that secures its object—a form of acquaintance in our sense. (See for example, BonJour 2003: 192 and Chalmers 2010: 88, n. 5. See section 2 above for some elaboration.) On this view, one might attend to one’s being appeared to many-speckledly without attending to one’s being appeared to 48-speckledly.

One might also respond that even if one is acquainted with one’s being appeared to 48-speckledly, one might fail either to have the right sort of thought or fail to be directly aware of a correspondence relation holding between this fact and the corresponding thought. It may be that we do not have the simple concepts for such properties, and so cannot compare them directly with the contents of experience. Perhaps, when one thinks of something’s having 48 speckles, one can think of it, as Russell might say, only by description (e.g., that number that is picked out by the numeral ‘48’, or by some other description) such that one’s having the thought does not involve acquaintance with the property of being 48-speckled. A Russellian about the nature of thoughts (see section 4) might say that we cannot be directly aware of the property (universal) of being 48-speckled, and so cannot compare that property directly with what is experienced. Alternatively, some might say that while we have phenomenal concepts for color and perhaps some basic shapes and numbers, we (most of us anyway) lack the phenomenal concept of being 48-speckled (Feldman 2004). On such a view, if my thought that I am appeared to 48-speckledly does not involve such Russellian or phenomenal concepts, but rather involves descriptive or complex contents, then it is no surprise that I am not foundationally justified in believing that I am appeared to 48-speckledly.

As long as one has an account of why one of the conditions for noninferential justification fails, one is in a position to respond to the objection.

7.3 The Threat of Skepticism

Although it is not always offered explicitly as an argument, many no doubt reject the acquaintance theorist’s account of both noninferential and inferential knowledge out of fear that the account will inevitably lead to a radical skepticism. If knowledge by acquaintance is restricted to belief in propositions where one’s epistemic situation precludes the possibility of error, critics might well be right in suggesting that we have a tiny body of knowledge secured by direct acquaintance. The rest of what we know or justifiably believe must be secured by inference, and the fear is that we simply don’t have anything like the inferential resources to get from such a narrow base to commonsense beliefs about the world around us. Even if we allow for some fallible foundational beliefs, as many contemporary acquaintance theorists do (see section 6), one might still worry that the class of facts with which we are acquainted do not constitute a very impressive base. How legitimate that fear is depends very much on the analysis of inferential knowledge one accepts. If one requires access to probabilistic or explanatory connections as a condition for inferential knowledge, then unless one can be acquainted with such connections holding between propositions, skepticism does, indeed, loom on the horizon. A number of acquaintance theorists are more optimistic, however, that skepticism regarding the external world can be avoided (see McGrew 1995; Moser 1989; BonJour 2003; and Hasan 2018).

Even should it be true that the classical foundationalist has a view that invites skepticism, it should, perhaps, be an open question as to whether that constitutes a legitimate objection to the view. Classical foundationalists are likely to deny that skeptical implications of a theory of justification generally or automatically discredit it. Even if we don’t have good grounds for many of our beliefs, including beliefs regarding the external world, it may be that we need good grounds to be justified and we do not have them. The skeptical implication may be correct rather than objectionable.

8. Concluding Remarks

Many honestly claim that they are not sure what acquaintance is. If asked what reason they have for thinking that there is such a thing as acquaintance, some acquaintance theorists would reply that they are acquainted with their being acquainted with things, or directly aware of their being directly aware (Russell 1912: Ch. 5; Fumerton 1995: 77). Moser provides a useful analogy:

Compare the parallel situation where one is so absorbed in what is happening on the movie screen that one is completely unaware of one’s watching a movie. (1989: 78)

Becoming aware of one’s watching a movie is analogous to becoming acquainted with one’s being acquainted with pain, or becoming acquainted with one’s being acquainted with a shade of red. However, if the analogy is apt, the opponent might see it as a reason to doubt that the acquaintance relation is really there, for once we reflect on whether we are watching a movie it is almost always easy to determine whether we are, but the opponent has no easy time finding any such relation as acquaintance or direct awareness. Of course, the movie analogy is just that—an analogy. As already discussed in section 2, from the acquaintance theorist’s perspective, such analogies and metaphors are bound to be misleading in some respects. It might be more fruitful to direct one’s attention to it by describing it in some (hopefully) revealing way, as we did in section 2: acquaintance is that relation the subject had to pain before being engrossed in the conversation, the relation that ceased during the conversation, and that began again shortly thereafter.

Many do find it intuitive and prima facie plausible that they are acquainted with or directly aware of at least experiential states and their features, and that this direct awareness is a fundamental source of knowledge. Still, some will claim not to find such a relation. It’s not clear how damaging this is to the proponents of acquaintance. The fact that doubts and disagreements can arise regarding acquaintance or the given should not be too puzzling since not everything about the nature of the given is itself given, and, as Descartes observed long ago, one can easily raise doubts regarding what one can see most clearly and distinctly, at least while one is not attending directly to the appropriate ground or insight. To be clear, this is not to say that those who doubt the existence of acquaintance must not be trying to attend to it, or even that they are somehow unable to find it; it would be more appropriate to say that they don’t realize that it is acquaintance that they have found, or that this realization is fleeting, unstable, or easy to dismiss as merely apparent. Some opponents may actually accept that something like acquaintance exists but doubt that it can provide much, if any, justification for our beliefs; in denying that they have found anything like acquaintance, it may be that they mean only to deny that they have found a relation of acquaintance that can make a significant difference to the epistemic justification of our beliefs.

But what of those who deny that they ever find anything like a relation of acquaintance when they introspect or go looking for it? Shouldn’t such denials raise serious doubts regarding acquaintance? To determine the impact of such denials on the acquaintance theory, it will help to reflect more carefully on how we should understand them. If we understand the opponents as claiming that they are not directly aware of being directly aware of anything, or that they are not acquainted with being acquainted with anything, then they would be presupposing the existence of that which they claim not to find. It seems that we ought, instead, to take them as claiming that they simply do not understand what acquaintance is, or what the acquaintance theorist means by ‘acquaintance,’ even after attempting to follow the acquaintance theorist’s attempts to lead us to grasp or understand it. Dialectically, there seems to be no way for the acquaintance theorist to reject this opposing position without begging the question. However, this does not show that the acquaintance theory is false or unjustified. Objections to the very intelligibility of critical philosophical concepts (concepts of self, universals, causation, free will, matter, etc.) are hardly rare in philosophy, and philosophers do not abandon their positions in the face of such disagreements. The fact of disagreement between philosophers on fundamental matters may lead to difficulties. Disagreement between those who seem to be our intellectual peers or equals may suggest that we should lower our confidence in our own views, perhaps even drastically lower our confidence. But these are not difficulties that only the acquaintance theory confronts. So, to the extent that there is an objection or problem with the fact that some deny that there is such a thing as acquaintance, a similar problem seems to afflict most any other philosophical theory.

The acquaintance theorists are aware that their claim to being acquainted with acquaintance is unlikely to be of much help to those who claim not to understand what acquaintance is, and may point out that there are other, dialectical considerations in favor of their view (see Fumerton 1995: 77; Chalmers 2010: 287; and Taylor 2015). We end by summarizing a number of such considerations. While these considerations are controversial, they suggest that acquaintance theories deserve more serious attention than they have recently received. Most of these have already been covered above. First, acquaintance theorists have defended sophisticated accounts of noninferentially justified belief, and offered responses to classical arguments against the possibility of such beliefs, like the Sellarsian dilemma. Second, a view that accepts the possibility of acquaintance with universals seems able to explain not only how knowledge is possible, but also how thought itself is possible, and how a thought can be about something else. Third, the acquaintance theorist who accepts acquaintance with complex universals is in a position to provide an account of our knowledge of necessary truths. Fourth, those who accept acquaintance with logical or probability relations between propositions can give a unified treatment of foundational and nonfoundational knowledge—a unified treatment of knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description—and are not as vulnerable to the threat of skepticism. Fifth, the sophisticated acquaintance theory seems to accommodate two constraints on epistemic justification that many find intuitive (though not everyone accepts; many accounts end up rejecting one or the other): justification is truth-conducive, since it requires acquaintance with facts that make true (or at least make probable) our beliefs; and justification is internal in the sense that the subject has a secure perspective on the truth, or possesses a kind of assurance of the truth (or probability) via acquaintance with truth-making and probability-making relations.

Opponents of the theory may seek acquaintance with such relations or entities without finding it, or at least, without realizing that it is acquaintance that they have found. While acquaintance theorists are likely to take phenomenological considerations seriously, they may plausibly argue, first, that it is far from obvious that we are not acquainted with such entities as those just mentioned (indeed, many have found it difficult to deny that we can sometimes, in very simple cases at least, just “see” the entailment relation between propositions), and second, that the fact that other philosophers disagree about this does not raise a problem specific to the acquaintance theory. Moreover, the significant theoretical advantages gained may more than compensate for any lack of phenomenological obviousness.

To summarize: Russell’s distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description is arguably best understood as a distinction between foundational knowledge of truths acquired by acquaintance and nonfoundational knowledge of truths that depend, ultimately, on foundational knowledge. Acquaintance is a direct, nonjudgmental and nonconceptual form of awareness that he took to be crucial for both forms of knowledge. Following Russell, some appeal to acquaintance with particular facts to account for the possibility of foundational empirical knowledge; some appeal to acquaintance with universals to account for the possibility of thought itself; some appeal to acquaintance with complex universals to account of the possibility of foundational a priori knowledge; and some appeal to acquaintance with logical and probabilistic relations to account for the possibility of nonfoundational knowledge or “knowledge by description.” Thus, for Russell and many other acquaintance theorists, even “knowledge by description” depends on acquaintance, and in more than one way. Recently, more sophisticated forms of the acquaintance theory have been developed, and responses to central objections offered. Moreover, some philosophers of mind have appealed to acquaintance to either defend, or critique, the knowledge argument for dualism. In light of all this, one can expect the relation of acquaintance and the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description to remain at the center of a number of debates in epistemology and the philosophy of mind.


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Thanks to an anonymous reviewer for very helpful comments on earlier drafts.

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Richard Fumerton

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