Korean Confucianism

First published Wed Nov 24, 2021

Koreans have been key players in Asian intellectual history and have historically been great propagators of intercultural adaptation. The “Three Teachings” of China, in the form of Buddhism, Confucianism, and Daoism (sometimes written “Taoism”), had all made their way into Korea by the fifth century CE, blending with the pre-existing institutions and culture there. Korean Confucians had used Confucian ideas, especially those advocating hierarchy and moral leadership, to bolster a powerful state bureaucracy in order to provide society with a rigidly structured and organised modus vivendi. In this context, philosophical thought was linked with action, and with concrete implications for oneself, one’s family, and one’s state (indeed, the world). Confucians, who were not particularly concerned with the spiritual life of individuals, sought an organised pathway to create an ethical and socially guiding discourse. Inevitably, confrontations arose between different groups, and intellectually, they gave rise to a series of philosophical debates that have shaped Korean Confucianism, especially during its phase of maturation during the Chosŏn dynasty (1392–1910), when its recalibrated form, Neo-Confucianism, displaced Buddhism as a rival intellectual and philosophical system.

The sections below will trace the main ideas and themes of Korean Confucianism, with in depth examinations of several philosophical debates and key philosophical ideas, while underscoring one of the more salient features of Korean Confucianism, sagehood, which has potential for our lives now in the twenty-first century.

1. Initial Observations

The tradition that is known as Confucianism in the West is known as Yuhak in Korean (儒學; C. Ruxue) [the study of the “Ru” scholars], or Yugyo 儒敎, C. Rujiao) [the teachings of the scholars]. Korean Confucians have contributed greatly to complex metaphysical discussions relating to the moral psychology of Confucian philosophy and its teachings. The goal of such teachings is to become a sage (聖人, C. Shengren, K. Sŏngin), and this is a salient feature of Korean Confucianism, referring to someone who studies, and who morally transforms themselves through concerted effort. In this sense, one’s moral cultivation, known in the Confucian texts as “self-cultivation” (修己, C. xiuji, K. sugi), meant that humans should depend on themselves and their own inherent abilities to solve their own problems (social and personal), ruling out the need for help from gods or deities. This becomes evident when we read the Korean philosophical texts on sagehood discussed below.

The classical texts of Confucianism, which were later edited and probably re-organised by Confucius himself, are known as the Five Classics (五經, C. Wujing, K. Ogyŏng):

  • Yijing (易經) [Classic of Changes],
  • Shujing (書經) [Classic of History],
  • Shijing (詩經) [Classic of Poetry],
  • Liji (禮記) [Records of Rites], and
  • Chunqiu (春秋) [Spring and Autumn Annals].

Later, a new body of work would be grouped into a new set of texts collectively known as The Four Books (四書, C. Sishu, K. Sasŏ), by the great Southern Song dynasty (1126–1271) scholar Zhu Xi (1130–1200):

  • Lunyu (論語) [The Analects],
  • Daxue (大學) [The Great Learning],
  • Zhongyong (中庸) [The Doctrine of the Mean], and
  • Mengzi (孟子) [The Mencius].
  • (The Daxue and Zhongyong were originally separate chapters in the Liji—Record of Rites. See also Other Internet Resources for more information.)

Zhu, a harsh critique of Buddhism, synthesised the later metaphysical developments of Confucianism, known as Neo-Confucianism, and his ideas shaped the trajectory of Korean Neo-Confucianism. Additionally, his commentaries on the Four Books (and his re-organisation and re-wording in some cases) were considered “orthodox”, while other interpretations were considered heterodox. Meanwhile, Korean Confucians clearly debated received ideas differently than Confucian scholars in China, and this gives the Korean contribution to Confucianism even greater significance.

One’s social obligations calibrated through a distinct set of relationships has been extremely important for Koreans, in the past as well as in the present. The “Five Cardinal Relationships” (五倫, C. wulun, K. oryun) of Confucianism, where each relationship was related to a particular virtue, are emphasised in Mencius:

between father and son there should be affection; between ruler and minister there should be righteousness; between husband and wife there should be attention to their separate functions; between old and young there should be proper order; and between friends there should be faithfulness. (3A:4; translated SB-Chan: 69–70)

In the Korean Confucian tradition, social position and age have important implications for maintaining social hierarchies, and women were particularly disadvantaged through interpretations of these relationships, expected always to be subordinate to men: fathers, husbands and sons (see Cawley 2018). Adhering to these clearly delineated relationships was associated with a well-functioning “harmonious” society, whereby harmony was achieved through fulfilling one’s specific role. Nevertheless, the “superior” person in these relationships should be a morally and socially responsible individual, especially the king, who also has obligations to the population he governs, a theme that is recurrent in the literature on “Sage Learning” (聖學, C. shengxue, K. sŏnghak), that shapes and defines Korean Neo-Confucianism. The other relationship, emphasised much more in Korea than in China, is the idea of filial piety (孝, C. xiao, K. hyo). Hyo remains one of the defining features of Korean Confucianism, where respect for one’s parents and elders is still emphasised. The eldest male is the most respected person in the family, which also highlights the gender bias that Confucianism has facilitated on the peninsula, something that is contentious today in a Korea that is heavily debating this gender imbalance, gaining traction thanks to the #MeToo movement.

Ritual propriety (禮, C. li, K. ye), or the use of rituals a mechanism for ordering society, is something still prevalent in rituals related towards ancestors, known as chesa (祭祀, C. jisi) in Korea, which are still conducted by many Korean families. They, however, further reinforce other social norms related to patrilineality and the place of privilege for the eldest son, while preventing women from performing these rituals. Naoaki Hiraishi (2003: 187) underscores the important function of rituals in society, noting their refining influence, and how they have

the advantage of inculcating people with social norms rather than […] social ordering with criminal law and other physical punishment.

The refining nature of moral education is another important feature of Korean Confucianism, something scholars asserted and accentuated, and even the king was indoctrinated with formal Confucian training with lectures on conformist Confucian morality (see Sohn 2000: ch. 1). Korean Confucians agreed with the Mencian tradition of education, shaped by the view of “human nature” (性, C. xing, K. sŏng) as something inherently good, whereby education was a vehicle to refine and promote one’s virtuous nature. In relation to Korean Confucianism, it is not an understatement to say that Mencius’ ideas became responsible for a great deal of Chosŏn’s metaphysical stimulation and recalibration, while also ultimately leading to its philosophical debates.

2. Neo-Confucian Metaphysical Recalibration

2.1 Principle, Human Nature, and Material Force

Earlier Confucian scholars lacked a sophisticated metaphysical and cosmological basis for their ethical codes, and so were motivated to “offer a cosmology that could compete with the Buddhists” (Creel 1971: 205). This would eventually lead to the development of Neo-Confucianism, which had already permeated Korea by the end of the Koryŏ dynasty (918–1392), when discussions on human nature (K. sŏng) were starting to be discussed in great detail. The Chinese scholar Han Yu (768–824) initiated the resurgence of interest in Confucianism, especially the ideas of Mencius, evident in An Inquiry on Human Nature, while at the same time rejecting Buddhism. These ideas that would make their way into Korean diatribes against Buddhism, also propelling them towards debates about human nature (SB-Chan: 452–455; SB-BB: 583–585). One of Han Yu’s disciples, Li Ao (died ca. 844), also wrote on Mencian ideas in Returning to the Nature, focusing on how to become a sage: a theme that would be developed by Koreans to a much more sophisticated degree during the Chosŏn dynasty (see Fung 1937 [1983: 413–415]). However, his writings are indebted to Buddhist ideas about the recovery of one’s inherent good nature or Buddha Nature (佛性, C. foxing, K. bulsŏng), influential at that time, although he reorients them to advocate Confucian sagehood, especially important for Korean Confucianism.

Neo-Confucianism can be traced to the writings of “The Five Sages of Song”: Shao Yong (1011–1077), Zhou Dunyi (1017–1073), Zhang Zai (1020–1077), and two brothers, Cheng Hao (1032–1085) and Cheng Yi (1033–1107). However, their main ideas were recognised and appreciated

only later when their various contributions were synthesised by the impressive scholar Zhu Xi (1130–1200),

particularly the ideas of the Cheng brothers (Fairbank & Goldman 1999: 98). Ames and Rosemont (1998: 17) highlight how

Zhu Xi’s commentaries […] became the definitive of the [Neo-Confucian] tradition from the early fourteenth century through the twentieth centuries,

and this influence also extended to Korea, becoming deeply rooted there. Zhu’s compendium on Neo-Confucian thought, Jinsilu (近思錄) [Reflections on Things at Hand], written with Lu Zu-qian (1137–1181), became the handbook on this great philosophical synthesis, and was integral to the Korean development of those ideas. Zhu focused on self-cultivation, a necessary ingredient in Confucian sagehood that became central to Korean’s interpretation of those ideas (Chan 1987: 122–124; Tillman 1992: 114–118).

However, it was Zhu’s adaptation of the Cheng brother’s ideas on Principle (理, C. li, K. i) that governed its reception in Korea (where Principle in italics is used to distinguish this key Neo-Confucian term from Western interpretations of the word). Principle was considered to be an original ideal governing source of all principles of reality in the world, where everything has its own individual principle that is a part of this greater immaterial and universally organising Principle. Cheng Yi even insisted that Principle is one but its manifestations (or sub-principles) are many, while underscoring that it reached its zenith in humans, especially in the human mind, which was endowed with its “good” human nature (SB-Chan: 544). In Korea, Neo-Confucianism is generally referred to as the School of Principle (理學, K. ihak), or School of the Principle and Human Nature (性理學, K. sŏngnihak), highlighting the interest in metaphysics that was examined by the Korean scholars to a whole new microcosmic level (Keum 1980 [2000]; Kang 2003 [2006]).

While Zhu had given primacy to Principle, at the same time he recognised it as intertwined with the material force:

Fundamentally [Principle] and material force cannot be spoken of as prior or posterior. But if we trace their origin, we are obliged to say that [Principle] is prior. (SB-Chan: 634)

This stance was initially adapted by the majority of Neo-Confucian scholars in Korea, and developed by Kwŏn Kŭn (1352–1409), who “had the most sophisticated understanding of Neo-Confucian metaphysics” in the fourteenth century, especially his Diagrammatic Treatises for the Commencement of Learning (入學圖說, K. Iphak tosŏl), which consisted of some

forty diagrams and explanations designed to help beginners grasp the fundamentals of [Human] Nature and Principle Learning. (SB-Lee: 449–450)

These diagrammatic expositions reflect an important dimension of the Korean Neo-Confucian tradition, to use diagrams to explain complex metaphysical ideas and how they related to moral psychology embedded within the mind. Kwŏn wrote that

[Principle] is the fundamental basis of the mind and material force. Therefore, [Principle] precedes Material Force,

which allows him to uphold the idea that human nature is good, because Principle is good, and that what is not good is due to the material force (see Choi M.-H. 1980: 37–38; slightly adapted translation). Furthermore, he was the first Neo-Confucian scholar in Korea to discuss Principle and material force in relation to the human mind linked with the “four beginnings”, and the “seven feelings”: The “four beginnings” are referred to by Mencius (2A:6; see SB-Chan: 65): the feeling [(情, C. qing, K. chŏng)] of commiseration, shame and dislike, deference and compliance, and the feeling of right and wrong, which when developed lead to the cardinal virtues of Confucianism (humanity, righteousness, propriety and wisdom). Humanity (仁, C. ren (sometimes jen), K. in) was seen as the greatest Confucian virtue, often translated as benevolence or kind-heartedness. The “seven feelings” are referred to in the ninth chapter of the Book of Rites: joy, anger, sadness, fear, love, dislike and liking. Kwŏn linked the four beginnings (which were always good) with Principle, and the seven feelings (which could be potentially bad) with the material force, starting a veritable meta-psychological chain reaction that continues until today. These ideas were consolidated in his “Diagram of the Unity and Oneness of Heaven, Human Beings, Mind, and Human Nature” (天人心性合一之圖, K. Ch’ŏnin simsŏng habil-to), and in Kwŏn’s view “Heaven” referred to the working of Principle in all things, including the human mind, and so (wo)man’s mind was linked to the moral Principle of the universe, embodied by the sage (see Halla Kim 2017: 1–23).

Further complicating the intellectual impetus of Korean Confucianism was its reaction to (or rather against) Sinitic Chan meditational developments that shaped the Sŏn school in Korea. Korean Sŏn ideas had arguably reached their maturity in the teachings of the Koryŏ monk Chinul (1158–1210), especially his text On Cultivating the Mind (修心訣, K. Susim kyŏl). Chinul’s approach recognises the mind as the essence (體, K. che) of one’s Buddha Nature, which requires continual practice and cultivation aids to refine its function (用 K. yong), bringing together the important essence-function (che-yong) feature of Korea’s Buddhist tradition, which would deeply influence the Neo-Confucian thought of Chosŏn. The Sŏn practice of seated meditation would also shape Neo-Confucianism’s own mind-focused concept of “quiet-sitting” (靜坐; C. jingzuo, K. chŏngjwa), also known as chŏngjwa chonsim (靜坐存心): to sit quietly and preserve the mind (Palais 1996: 181).

2.2 Neo-Confucianism and Social Transformation

An Hyang (1243–1306) was one of the most important Korean scholars responsible for introducing Neo-Confucian ideas into the Korean peninsula, he “copied [Confucian Classics] by hand, drew (Zhu Xi’s) likeness and brought them back home” (Deuchler 1992: 17). Paek I-jŏng (1247–1323) and other Korean scholars also helped transmit the new philosophy to Korea as they became acquainted with many Chinese Neo-Confucian scholars, including the direct successors of the Cheng-Zhu tradition, who met at the Man’gwŏndang library (the hall of ten thousand scrolls) founded by King Ch’ungsŏn (1308–1313) in the Mongol capital of the Yuan empire (Deuchler 1992: 19). Furthermore, Yi Che-hyŏn (1287–1367) endorsed the printing of The Four Books and believed that a king should indeed be a “sage” and interpreted the relationship between government and Neo-Confucianism as essential. Yi Saek (1328–1396), son of Yi Che-hyŏn, was responsible for the dissemination of the texts in Korea where Neo-Confucian prestige was increasing rapidly, and he was “appointed educational intendant for the Yuan in Korea” (De Bary & Haboush 1985b: 41). Hence, Neo-Confucianism was linked to education and governing the state, while shaped by a moral code of ethics.

These revitalised Confucian ethics would redefine the moral guiding discourse of the emerging Chosŏn dynasty (1392–1910). Chŏng Tojŏn (1342–1398), who helped to validate the new kingship, instigated a rejuvenation of Confucian morality, that would culminate in a renewal of society through the use of propriety, manifest in specific rites (K. ye) (Deuchler 2004: 46). Lee Sang-wha (2005) draws attention to the remodeling of patriarchal patterns of behaviour, validated through the metaphysics of the Yin, or Ŭm in Korean (as weak) and Yang (as strong), linked to the social functions of women (as passive) and men (as active), also inculcated through the study of detailed ritual sourcebooks, especially Zhuzi jiali (朱子家禮) [Zhu Xi’s Family Rites], which linked personal self-discipline with the cultivation of the mind through the rigid application of propriety. In the Korean context, propriety was embodied by four specific rites that were to be put into practice to reorganise society: coming of age (also known as capping), wedding, mourning, and most importantly, ancestral rites (Deuchler 1992: 108–111). In Korea, rites were made a legal requirement and even encoded into the national “Grand Code for State Administration”, known as the Kyŏngguk taejŏn (經國大典), first promulgated in the late fifteenth century. Failure to perform the prescribed rituals could lead to physical punishment, imprisonment, and even death (as would be the case for thousands of Catholics during the nineteenth century). These laws asserted and ingrained a newly prescribed Neo-Confucian cultural order into the social matrix, that suppressed and repressed any challenges to its authority, including Buddhism.

3. Korea’s Neo-Confucian Confrontation with Buddhism

3.1 Early Criticisms of Buddhism

One of the first Confucian texts critical of the Buddhists was that of Paek Munbo (1303–1374), Ch’ŏkpulso (斥佛疏) [In Rejection of Buddhism], which used Shao Yong’s Daoist-inspired cyclical cosmological philosophy to ratiocinate that it was again time for restoration of the “way” of the sage Confucian rulers Yao and Shun (Deuchler 1992: 23). Kang (2003 [2006: 158–164]) outlines the opposition to Buddhism towards the end of the Koryŏ period, especially among Confucian scholars such as Chŏng Mongju (1337–1392) and Chŏng Tojŏn. Chŏng Mongju emphasised the practical “everyday life” of the Confucians who fulfilled social and sexual relations unlike the Buddhists who

part with relatives, denounce the relationship between man and woman […] and revere the search for emptiness and Nirvana. (Kang 2003 [2006: 160–161])

He also was noted for his loyalty to last king of the Koryŏ, which would cost him his life: this was how seriously Confucian philosophers were dedicated to the moral principles they wrote about—ideas they were expected to practice in their lives. It was Chŏng Tojŏn, the “godfather” of early Chosŏn Neo-Confucianism, who had helped General Yi Sŏnggye (1335–1408) to form a military alliance with other powerful Neo-Confucian scholars following Yi’s decision to oust the last Koryŏ king from power in 1388, soon establishing the Chosŏn dynasty. Neo-Confucianism became the guiding socio-political ideology of Chosŏn with Chŏng Tojŏn at the helm as its chief architect, benefiting from military support and royal authority to carry out his grand scheme (E. Chung 1995: 59). From the point of view of intellectual history, Chŏng played a major role in the attempt to discredit and marginalise Buddhism, and Kwŏn Kŭn (quoted in Deuchler 1992: 101 [Sambong-jib: 286]), commented on how Chŏng aspired to make

the elucidation of the Learning of the Way [Neo-Confucianism] and the repulsion of heterodox teachings [i.e., Buddhism] his own responsibility.

Confucian philosophy was then used to undermine Buddhism during this early stage of its development in Korea.

3.2 Chŏng Tojŏn’s Neo-Confucian Critique of Buddhism

Chŏng Tojŏn’s arguments against Buddhism are encapsulated in his final treatise Pulssi Chappyŏn (佛氏雜辨) [Array of Critiques of Mr. Buddha], while his shorter text, Simgiri p’yŏn (心氣理篇) [On Mind, Material Force and Principle], also critiques the Buddhists and Daoists. Both texts have been translated and annotated along with the original Chinese characters by A. Charles Muller (2015) in Korea’s Great Buddhist-Confucian Debate, as well as the rebuttal of Hamhǒ Kihwa (1376–1433), an erudite Confucian trained Buddhist, in his treatise entitled Hyǒnjǒng-non (顯正論) [The Exposition of the Correct].

Chŏng, while investigating the phenomenological issues concerning human nature and their ethical implications, was completely unwilling to acknowledge any conceptual dependence on Buddhist doctrines, while reinforcing the staunch position of Neo-Confucians in Korea to link philosophical principles to one’s social reality (see Muller 2015: introduction). For Confucians, Buddhists had cut themselves off from both social and filial obligations. His ideas, therefore, “provide grounded guidelines for individuals as social beings who faced daily challenges” and this is exemplified by the recent translation of his writings as Seeking Order in a Tumultuous Age (Robinson (trans.) 2016: here 5). These writings reflect the need to help the people, as well as the need to rectify the mind of the ruler, but also the obligation to rectify oneself before trying to rectify others (Robinson (trans.) 2016: 128–129). They also recount the practical reasons behind his philosophical attack of Buddhism:

the bulk of the Finance Commission is spent on Buddhism and deities. There is no greater waste of fiscal resources. (trans. in Robinson 2016: 53)

These are ideas that later scholars might refer to as “practical learning” or Sirhak, often described as a trend that emerged after the Hideyoshi invasions of the late sixteenth century, yet here we have very practical guidance from Chŏng at the start of the Chosŏn dynasty, or rather the beginnings of a practical form of “sage” learning applied to issues directly related to daily life.

Chŏng’s shorter rebuttal of Buddhism, On Mind, Material Force and Principle (Simgiri p’yŏn: 45–53), already highlights this intellectual nexus which dominates Neo-Confucianism in Korea. It introduces the main metaphysical issues that were of great importance in Korea at this time, namely, the mind (心; also referred to in literature as the heart-and-mind), the material force (氣), and of course Principle (理), which he describes as “the inherent virtue of the mind and that through which material force is produced”, and clearly states that “only after there is principle is there material force” (Simgiri p’yŏn: 50). He discusses what he considers to be the misinterpretation and application of ideas in the teachings of the Buddhists and Daoists, vindicating his rebuttal with quotes from the Mencius, the Analects, and the writings of Zhu Xi, as well as the Book of Rites. Chŏng’s arguments culminate in a radical espousal of Confucianism as an exclusivistic discourse, and he lauds the practical and direct social implications of these metaphysical ideas, juxtaposed to Buddhist and Daoist emphasis on emptiness and vacuity, which he considers to be devoid of meaning when related to matters of the mundane world (Simgiri p’yŏn: 53). The philosophical implications of Chŏng’s ideas are related to this-worldly affairs and not speculative spiritual proclivities of other traditions, which he suggests depended on deities who could then reward or punish. Chŏng asserts the need to investigate one’s human nature and the mind for oneself, and not to rely on teachings that call upon spirits to do so, advocating the Confucian practice of preserving what is good in the mind and nourishing the material force to control bodily desires through proper Confucian education (Simgiri p’yŏn: 51). This bifocal approach would become greatly elucidated by later Neo-Confucian philosophers who would advocate an approach to fully develop the humanity (K. in) that our minds were “naturally” endowed with by Principle.

Chŏng’s Pulssi Chappyŏn is translated by Muller (2015) under the title An Array of Critiques of Buddhism. The text lists 19 critiques, which Chŏng systematically treats in turn, including important Buddhist doctrines, such as transmigration and karma. The goal of Confucianism, being firmly focused on this life, was not interested in idle speculation about an afterlife. Initially, Chŏng (Pulssi Chappyŏn: 59–61) sets out to critique the Buddhists interpretations of the mind (K. sim), and human nature (K. sŏng), and criticises the Koryŏ monk Chinul of “nebulous supposition”, lacking “hard facts”, accusing Buddhists of “word play”, while lacking a definitive doctrine. Chŏng explains that the Confucians consider the mind to be made of the material force that “one takes from heaven at birth”, while the mind itself is endowed by one’s human nature through Principle at birth (Pulssi Chappyŏn: 59). He reinforces the “concrete” aspect of the “function” of Confucianism in reality, which the Buddhists consider completely illusory, and refers to Cheng Yi’s dictum,

The study of the Buddhists includes reverence to correct the internal, but does not include justice to straighten the external. (Pulssi Chappyŏn: 63)

Cheng Hao had similarly added that “The Buddhist way of internal and external life is incomplete” (SB-Chan: 538). This Confucian rationale underpins Chŏng’s arguments in his “Critique of the Buddhists’ Abandonment of the Basic Human Relationships” and the “Buddhist Notion of Compassion”, initiating his discourse (Pulssi Chappyŏn: 64–67) on the Confucian virtue of humanity (K. in), which functions through social interactions, manifested through “The Five Relationships”. Furthermore, Chŏng denounces Buddhists for rejecting filial piety, adding that they “regard their most intimate family members like passers-by on the street”, despite having inherited their material force from their parents, illustrating how Neo-Confucians now used metaphysics to validate their moral “reality” (Pulssi Chappyŏn: 66).

As Buddhists could take refuge in the Buddha, thereby rely on something external, the point is excoriated by Chǒng in his critique of Sŏn Buddhists and their teachings (Pulssi Chappyŏn: 72–73), who he insinuates,

took nothingness [空, K. kong; this was the translation of the Sanskrit term Śūnyatā] as their cardinal teaching and abandoned the obligations of society,

contrasting it greatly with the practical “way” of Confucianism, further emphasised in his, “Critique of the Equivalence and Differences between Confucianism and Buddhism” (Pulssi Chappyŏn: 73–77). Chŏng accuses Buddhists of being “masters of glibness, lewdness, trickiness, and evasiveness” (Pulssi Chappyŏn: 77). In contrast, the role of the Confucian “sage” is also acutely heralded as a pragmatic pathway that has use for governing, to plan for the welfare of the people and to “avoid activities that would bring harm to [them]”, ideas that are also emphasised in his practical handbook for governance, Seeking Order in a Tumultuous Age, discussed above (Robinson (trans.) 2016: 81).

Chŏng’s text draws together multiple quotes by renowned Confucian scholars to fuel his arguments and support his overall view that Buddhism had no practical social worth. As Muller (1999: 185) underscores, such ideas were closely linked to the Confucian understanding that “Buddhists regarded existence as illusory and that only mind was real”, hence they “scorned human relationships”, while “only quiet meditative inner cultivation was valued”. The most important retort to this diatribe would come from the monk Hamhǒ Kihwa, who skillfully counter-charges Chŏng’s caustic attack using Confucian ideas and texts, while encouraging a much more inclusivistic, hence less divisive, approach. Kihwa (Hyǒnjǒng-non: 110–111), argued for the “unity of the Three Teachings”, giving a valid piece of advice about what not to do that is useful for us to hear today:

Holding stubbornly onto one’s own opinion while ignoring the positions of others, arbitrarily affirming this and rejecting that.

4. Sage Learning and The Four-Seven Debate

Two of the most preeminent scholars of the first half of the Chosŏn dynasty, Yi Hwang (1501–1570), well known by his pen name T’oegye, and Yi I (1536–1584), known by the pen name Yulgok, are responsible for the deep level of metaphysical debates that would mark Neo-Confucianism in Korea. Both would engage in attempts to analyse the macrocosmic Principle and its microcosmic interactions with material force (K. ki). More importantly, they would initiate an intricate debate about what these interactions meant for our minds and human nature, as actualised through our thoughts and actions, linked with a sense of psychological and social urgency. Korea’s Neo-Confucian scholars propounded a social guiding discourse that is humanistic in essence (drawing on the Confucian in), reflected in how we are linked externally (through conduct) and internally (through thought). Sagehood itself is achieved through learning, or rather, “Sage Learning”, a term underscored by Oh Kangnam (1993: 313) as “one of the essential components, if not the essence, of Korean Confucianism […]”, adding that “Neo-Confucianism’s hallmark was its emphasis on sage-learning”.

Both T’oegye and Yulgok both wrote very specific texts on Sagehood. In 1568, T’oegye wrote Sŏnghak sipto 聖學十圖 (The Ten Diagrams on Sage Learning), and in 1575 Yulgok wrote Sŏnghak chipyo 聖學輯要 (Essentials of the Learning of the Sages). According to Keum Jang-tae (1980 [2000: 40]), author of Confucianism and Korean Thoughts, these texts (the Ten Diagrams and the Essentials) reflect “the two main classical works epitomizing Neo-Confucian learning in the Chosŏn era”. They also embody the development of Korea’s Neo-Confucian tradition. Kim Yung Sik (2017: 25) suggests that

the full understanding of [Zhu’s thought] seems to have come quite late, only after Yi Hwang […] launched an all-out effort to come to grips with the entire scope of the Zhu Xi Learning.

In fact, Japanese Neo-Confucian scholars, such as Yamazaki Ansai (1618–82), considered T’oegye to be “the greatest Confucian in Korea”, even suggesting he was on a par with Zhu Xi himself (Pak 1983: 69).

T’oegye’s Ten Diagrams represents the finest synthesis of this Neo-Confucian thought current in Korea at that time, and it was one of the most reproduced texts of the entire Chosŏn dynasty, overshadowing Yulgok’s text. T’oegye’s text consists of a collection of diagrams by Neo-Confucian scholars from China and Korea, including three by T’oegye himself, that elucidate Zhu Xi’s main teachings, as well as T’oegye’s own synthesis and analysis of them, especially through his focus on the mind (K. sim), though guided by a methodological approach that focuses on Kyŏng (敬). Kyŏng is often translated as seriousness, but T’oegye has reoriented this term’s use, underscoring the mind’s mastery over one’s thoughts and actions, leading Michael Kalton (1985: 212–214) to translate it as “mindfulness”, while Kim Hyoungchan (2018: 27–32) uses the term “reverent mindfulness”. Mindfulness, in this very Confucian re-appropriation of a Buddhist concept, reflects T’oegye’s approach to sagehood: the daily practice of constantly being aware of the mind, controlling its impulses so that good thoughts can lead to good actions.

The first two diagrams reflect the underpinnings of Neo-Confucian ontologico-cosmology:

  1. Zhou Dunyi’s Diagram of the Supreme Ultimate (太極之圖, K. T’aegŭk chido), and
  2. Zhang Zai’s Western Inscription (西銘圖, K. Sŏmyŏngdo)
  3. (see Kalton’s translations online).

They provide us with a clear outline of the interconnected Neo-Confucian vision of a morally interconnected universe. While the first diagram identifies the Supreme Ultimate (T’aegŭk) as Principle, which generates yin and yang, which then materialise through the Five Elements, the second diagram further concretises this organising aspect of the greater originating Principle in the material world, showing its inherent order that inscribes itself hierarchically. Principle is reflected in all things, and therefore used to validate human social relations and the distinctions that exist between ruler and subjects, older and younger for example. The next three diagrams are all concerned with the basic underpinnings of Confucian moral humanistic education: The Diagram of Elementary Learning, the Diagram of the Great Learning, and the Diagram of Rules of the White Deer Hollow Academy, the latter being the rules of Zhu Xi’s own retreat centre for learning. This education embodies Confucian morality which is the basis for understanding more complex issues of the mind and human nature. The Elementary Learning is an original diagram by T’oegye himself based on Zhu Xi’s text of the same name, which was widely studied in Korea in its own right. Meanwhile, the Diagram of the Great Learning was by Kwŏn Kŭn, appearing in his collection of diagrams mentioned above, bolstering the importance of moral education within the Korean Neo-Confucian tradition.

It is the sixth diagram in T’oegye’s collection where we find his view of the “Four-Seven” issue that was first mentioned by Kwŏn Kŭn, but which really addressed the questions: if human nature is completely good—why do people do things that are “not good” and how/why are there negative feelings? Is this due to Principle or the material force? This was a conundrum for Neo-Confucians just as good and evil was for the Scholastics in Europe trying to explain why there was evil if their God was good. Michael Kalton (1985: 119) describes the subsequent debate, outlined below, as “the single most important intellectual controversy of the Yi dynasty”, ultimately related to the different roles of Principle and material force, their interactions and significance in regard to one’s human nature and the mind. T’oegye’s sixth diagram is actually divided into three parts, relating to the saying The Mind Combines and Governs the Nature and the Feelings (心統性情圖) and they describe different but interrelated aspects of the mind:

  1. “the not yet aroused state” (未發, K. mibal), linked to the four beginnings, and pure Principle, and
  2. the seven feelings linked to “the aroused state” (已發, K. ibal) when Principle interacts with the material force.

In this instance, both Principle and material force interpenetrate each other, but this was not T’oegye’s initial interpretation, which had changed due to his “Four-Seven” debate with another scholar.

The “Four-Seven” debate (which was clearly deeply related to Principle and material force) originated from a series of correspondences between T’oegye and Kobong, penname of Ki Taesŭng (1527–1572), and later it was continued on between Yulgok and Ugye, penname of Sŏng Hon (1536–1598). T’oegye originally suggested that the four beginnings and seven feelings had different origins, and this instigated the original debate with Kobong, who did not agree with T’oegye’s dualistic approach: that Principle (i) was the source of the four beginnings, while the material force was the source of the seven feelings. Kobong was more interested in ki’s moral and activating function, and considered i and ki as inseparable, especially when it came to “their presence in actual things” (Kalton 1994: 6). The issue at hand was how could the morally good Principle, manifested to its highest form in (wo)mankind, be corrupt, or led astray, in the sense that people clearly do not always conduct themselves in a kind-hearted manner towards others. Though T’oegye revised his view, he still gave primacy to Principle and maintained that it always initially preceded ki when we act morally, or rather that Principle guided ki, like a rider guiding a horse. Hence, T’oegye upheld the moralistic perfection and integrity of Principle by suggesting that things could be less than perfect, and human behaviour sometimes not good, as a result of the interaction with the material force, which could be affected/corrupted depending on the concrete circumstances of its actualisation in concrete form/action.

For T’oegye Principle had been equated with the Supreme Ultimate, and thus represented the source of the possibility for all existence, whereby the very Principle (or potential) of a thing preceded its actual realisation, which would then interact with ki. In this sense, the potential for life in the universe predated the actualisation of that life. T’oegye suggests something quite idealistic: that Principle leads with what I describe as the “possibility for actualisation”, while its interaction with ki enables the “actualisation of the possibility”. The possibility for actualisation was always “perfect”, but the individual ki, in his opinion, could fluctuate and so does not always “function” to the optimum level of its inherent Principle (or potential). Let us consider this in terms of sexual reproduction to clarify this point: when a man and woman mate (or using other medical techniques), there is the potential that an egg will be fertilised by a sperm, and if so, given that the physical conditions are optimum, a woman will carry a baby to term. However, sometimes there can be biological (material) issues that may prevent the woman from even getting pregnant (due to fertility issues with the man or woman) or from carrying the baby to term. Additionally, the baby may not always develop as healthily as theoretically expected, which is not related to the Principle (i.e., that the fertilisation process itself produces a healthy baby), but rather the actualisation of potential genetic codes that can determine physical and biological outcomes: hence, it is ki that we inherit from our parents, and not their Principle. In relation to the mind, T’oegye referred to the mind of Dao, a pure form, as well as the human mind, where less than perfect thoughts could lead to less than perfect actions. However, one could use mindfulness as a way to guide our inner good nature to reflect the mind of Dao where Principle took control to divert us from desires and negative feelings.

Contrary to T’oegye and Ugye, Yulgok posited that ki was both the activating factor of the seven feelings and four beginnings, and in this sense was less idealistic in relation to Principle. He argued that Principle needed somewhere to settle before it could guide or affect things, and that was ki, the material force. How can we relate this to daily life in some way? The man and woman needed to exist and to mate before the “principle” for fertilisation could take place, which is perhaps a more practical way of looking at things. This then had implications for more important moral matters. Yulgok concluded that while the seven feelings included the four beginnings, the four beginnings did not contain the seven feelings—in order to maintain human nature “innately” good and intact. Bongrae Seok (2019: 24) clarifies that Yulgok (and Kobong, for that matter) did not believe that

the goodness of the Four is a distinct moral property explained exclusively by [i] but a common property shared by the Seven explained by both [i] and qi [ki],

hence, in a sense “smoothening the sharp distinction between the Four and the Seven” as argued by T’oegye and rearticulated by Ugye. Seok (2019: 19) also notes how Ugye interpreted the four beginnings and the seven feelings as separate sets of emotions, with the “seven” having the potential for evil, drawing on T’oegye who clearly viewed Principle as the essence of the mind and ki as the function (on which Principle mounts), again using the interrelationship between essence-function, or che-yong, discussed above in relation to Chinul. For the Korean Neo-Confucians, this only reinforced the need for proper moral education and the incessant need for self-cultivations to guide one from falling prey of the shortcomings of one’s physical, material and environmental existence as it related to the mind and one’s human nature (see E. Chung 1995; Ro 1989; Cawley 2019: 84–89). Though Yulgok was interested in the metaphysical aspects of Neo-Confucianism, Ro Young-Chan (2017: 74) underscores his interest in the practical side of “sagely learning”.

Both T’oegye’s Diagrams and Yulgok’s Essentials advocate pathways towards sagehood and promote the concept of self-cultivation. Both scholars also emphasised the special role of the king who was expected to be a paragon of Confucian morality and humanity (ren), the living embodiment of the ideals of “sagehood”. T’oegye and Yulgok elucidate our place in a morally directed universe, where one is expected to act responsibly towards other members of the family and the larger society, or rather “practice” a social vision of morality in our daily lives. For both scholars, sagehood represented a noble savoir vivre, the goal of which was to benefit others, and this in itself was the key to becoming a sage. T’oegye and Yulgok provide us with archetypes of a sort of East Asian Neo-Confucian “Social Contract”, to draw on Jean Jacques Rousseau’s (1712–1778) major work published in 1762. Both Korean scholars stress the moral and social responsibility of those in power, but also the moral responsibility of individuals to each other as members of an interconnected society—and this is something the world can appreciate now more than ever, as we face a global pandemic in 2020/21, where through socially responsible distancing, we both respect and protect others.

5. The Horak Debate

The “Ho-rak” debate, literally refers to the general “Provincial-Capital” divide among the different sub-factions of the “Noron” (Old Doctrine) Faction, which had been initiated by scholars who had followed the metaphysical stance of Yulgok for the most part. As Kang (2003 [2006: 300]) points out,

The problem was that differences in academic opinions were associated with antagonism between factions or regions.

Therefore, scholars aligned themselves with either T’oegye or Yulgok’s interpretations depending on their factional affiliation, and if one disagreed with the faction in power it could have serious consequences (think Republicans/Democrats in the U.S.). In this instance, like the Four-Seven Debate, it relates to a series of arguments raised in correspondence between two primary scholars of this time, who were tightly aligned with different factions: Han Wŏn-jin (1682–1751) from Ch’ungch’ŏng province and Yi Kan (1677–1727) from Kyŏnggi province where Seoul is located. Seoh (1977:47) notes that both scholars are

particularly important because it was their debate over the definition of nature that precipitated a resurgence of the ki school.

Though Yi Kan underscored the central role of Principle, Han posited the operation of the human mind as dependent on ki—both original ki, and corrupted ki. These ideas were related, not only to the emotions and how they affect the actualised mind (thoughts/actions), but led to other speculative questions:

  1. How should one describe the unaroused mind (mibal), in terms of ki or Principle, or a mixture?
  2. Whether sages and ordinary people have the same nature?, and
  3. Is the nature of human beings and nonhuman animals identical? (Richard Kim 2017: 90; Choi Y. 2011)

Richard Kim (2017: 90) notes that such questions became the debates’ “foundational issue”, thought it also brought up some of issues related to the previous debate, in regard to the effects of the emotions on the mind, and whether minds of sages and normal people were originally the same.

The notion of the unaroused mind appears in the Doctrine of the Mean, one of the Four Books:

Before the feelings of pleasure, anger, sorrow and joy are aroused it is called equilibrium (chung [中], centrality, mean). When these feelings are aroused and each and all attain due measure and degree, it is called harmony. (SB-Chan: 98)

Choi Young-jin (2011: 9) describes this as “a state of moderation […] bent neither one way or another […] the state of balance”. This actual state of mind had never been analysed in such minute detail before, nor had it been considered in such detail in relation to the sage, normal humans, and other animals: were they the same, or not, at the microcosmic level of their mind in terms of ki or Principle? Han Wŏn-jin’s essay on the “Explanation of the Original Nature and the Psycho-Physical Nature”, sowed the seeds of the debate. In this essay he suggested that the original nature, even before being aroused in the mind (mibal, as argued by T’oegye), was already interacting with ki, in other words, energised by material force, or as Richard Kim (2017: 92) puts it, Han viewed “gi [ki] as constitutive of the inactivated mind”. For Han, Principle required ki, so ki already had to exist in the mind and this ki had to be originally good or in equilibrium, balanced and unmotivated by desires. Clearly Han was “adhering more strictly to the materialist core of the ki school”, while claiming that “nature is not an abstract [undifferentiated] entity”, and that Principle “is nothing but a law of the dynamics of ki,” in other words, Principle had no concrete existence of any sort (Seoh 1977: 48). He ultimately saw the nature of a human and other animals as different even in their unaroused or mibal state where ki was inactive, and used their different psycho-physical make-up (due to the variant manifestations of material force when activated) as the basis for his thesis. Han ultimately considered the sage to possess a pure form of ki, already balanced and pure even in an unaroused state, unlike other beings (which for him also included women and children) and in this sense he is more hierarchically inclined in his approach, with a more idealistic vision of the sage—something usually linked with proponents of Principle.

Yi Kan advocated the primacy of Principle in all living things, and therefore the immanence of goodness embedded within the Confucian virtues. The idea of the immanence of Principle in all things is also addressed in a more macrocosmic sense in Zhang Zai’s Diagram of the Western Inscription, which appears in T’oegye’s Diagrams, though here again, in the Korean context these ideas are analysed in a more microcosmic manner. Yi asserted that human and nonhuman animals had the potential to manifest the universal “original mind” (本心, K. bonsim). This, according to Yi, was not always manifest by humans because their “physical nature” and, thereby, their psycho-physical preponderances varied: some humans were good, but some acted badly, just as was the case for nonhuman animals. He rather suggested that the apparent differences, were actually nothing other than differences in temperaments due to the turbidity of ki after feelings were aroused, but that the underlying Principle meant that they were morally unified in an unaroused state (R. Kim 2017). This also meant that theoretically, women too, even children, could aspire to be sages because their “original mind”, which was “the foundation of for human morality” was no different from that of a sage, what mattered was that one controlled one’s desires because “sages are those who maintain their moral self”: those who develop themselves to the optimum level of humanity (Lee 2011: 108). As Lee (2011: 111) asserts, Yi

went so far as to say that the original mind-heart [sim] is clearly present in anyone at any time, and the mind-hearts of sages and commoners are alike when aroused.

For Yi, what made one a sage was the fact that they “acted” morally—being aware of what is good but not acting on it at all times was what made one a “common” person.

Seoh (1977: 43) summarises the debate as follows:

Yi Kan equated the nature of man with other creatures and stressed its universality, while Han maintained the uniqueness of the nature of man in contrast with other creatures.

One interesting contribution in regard to this debate, came from one of the few women of the Chosŏn period to write on Neo-Confucianism (hence trained in Classical Chinese), Im Yunjidang (1721–1793). She disagreed with Yulgok’s interpretation of ki, whom her own brothers had agreed with, and instead claimed “that each thing [or species] in the universe possesses a particularised and embodied nature”, while ultimately convinced of the role of “Heaven endowed” Principle (Kim Sungmoon 2017: 190–191). Im also wrote about the moral equality of both sexes, something highlighted by the early Catholics in Korea. Kang Chŏngiltang (1772–1832), another female Confucian scholar from this period, emphasised that human nature is good, as well as the importance of putting Confucian ideals into practice. Her short poem on “Concentrating on Mindfulness” [or reverence] manages to capture with exquisite conciseness the main themes and the ultimate goal of Neo-Confucian learning in Chosŏn, namely, sagehood (Kim Youngmin 2007: 226, slightly altered translation):

Myriad Patterns [principles] originate from Heaven-and-Earth.
One mind unites nature and emotions.
Without concentrating on mindfulness,
How can you manage the long trip to sagehood?

Interestingly, by this stage it is important to note that Catholicism, considered as part of “Western Learning” (西學, K. Sŏhak), had already attracted the interest of some Neo-Confucian scholars, directing them away from an unemotional Principle, towards a belief in an anthropomorphic caring deity.

6. Confucian Reactions to Early Catholicism

6.1 Matteo Ricci and Reactions to Western Theology

The time frame of the Horak debate also coincided with Catholic texts being read by Korean Neo-Confucian philosophers. The most important text from this period was Tianzhu shiyi (天主實義; K. Chŏnju sirŭi) [The True Meaning of the Lord of Heaven], which had a great impact in Korea after being read by scholars there (see Ricci 1985). It was actually written by Matteo Ricci (1552–1610), an Italian Jesuit missionary who had lived for many years (and died) in China. Ricci weaved in the mediaeval Scholastic philosophy of his European tradition into a newly enlarged tapestry including his newly discovered Confucian ideas. He retraced the trajectory of Neo-Confucianism, revealing its Buddhist and Daoist legacy that has been carefully coloured over by Zhu Xi, whose ideas also dictated how Koreans received the Confucian canon, something that clearly irked the Korean scholars. These ideas and messages had serious repercussions in Korea, where, as Seoh Munsang (1977: 46–47) points out, the intellectual milieu had retained Zhu Xi’s orthodoxy where metaphysical speculation was “still a vital force polarising the i and ki schools”.

Yi Sugwang (1563–1628) provides a short analysis of Ricci’s text, which is of value as it is the earliest commentary on the text in Korea. He remarked that Ricci’s God, Tianzhu (pronounced Ch’ŏnju in Korean), had created the world, hence was worshiped and praised, something he criticised as he clearly understood Principle to be behind all things. He incorrectly indicates that Ricci, like Confucians, asserts that human nature is originally good: Ricci had actually suggested that the Confucians had no unanimity of position in this regard, as Mencius had said it was good, but Xunzi regarded it as evil—a point clearly avoided by Korean Neo-Confucian scholars almost entirely (Yi 2000: 61). Yi Ik (1681–1763), who headed one of Chosŏn’s many scholarly factions, the Namin (Southern) faction, in more recent times described as a proponent of Sirhak “practical” thought, also compiled a wide range of encyclopedic texts and wrote commentaries on the Confucian canon too. He engaged more intellectually with Ricci’s ideas in his critique entitled Ch’ŏnju sirŭi-bal (天主實義跋) [Reactions Against Tianzhu zhiyi] (Kim Shin-ja [ed.] 1987: 22–23). Yi Ik, who was also a follower of T’oegye’s metaphysics and wrote treatises on the Four-Seven debate such as Sach’il sinp’yŏ, (四七新編) [New Treaty on the Four-Seven Debate], did not accept that “God” had created the world, and outright rejects the idea that this God had incarnated himself as a man. He also examined the moral teachings of another Jesuit, Diego de Pantoja (1571–1618), and in his commentary on Pantoja’s Qike (七克) [Seven Victories], which described how to overcome the seven deadly sins, he argued that if one removed what was written about God and the devil, the morals could almost be considered Confucian. This reflects the non-theistic orientation of Neo-Confucianism in Korea, but also highlights how Yi was not about to overturn his onto-cosmological inheritance from T’oegye (Yi Ik Sŏngho sasŏl: 343).

Some of Yi’s associate Namin scholars were much more critical of Western ideas in general, especially Sin Hudam (1702–1761) and An Chŏngbok (1712–1783). Sin Hudam was particularly scathing of Catholic teachings in his critique entitled Sŏhak pyŏn (西學辨) [Critique of Western Learning]. There is a sub-stratum of thought at play in Sin’s text, which hopes to dissuade others from believing in Jesus as God, or God in the form of a man who spreads teachings to the poor. This idea would disengage God from the realm of insensitive Neo-Confucian metaphysics and could potentially wreak havoc for the king and society at large if the social hierarchy inscribed universally through Principle were to be rejected.

This foreboding is much more urgent in the writings of a fellow Namin scholar An Chŏngbok, as his own son-in-law Kwŏn Ilsin (1736–1791) was among the earliest Confucian converts to Catholicism. These were the incentives behind his two critiques of Catholicism: Ch’ŏnhakko (天學考) [Thoughts on Heavenly Learning], and Ch’ŏnhak mundap (天學問答) [Questions and Answers on Heavenly Learning]. An Chŏngbok draws our attention to the importance of the figure of Jesus and his message as the focal point of these young Korean Neo-Confucian scholars who had overturned the onto-cosmology of Principle and ki, which then also had no bearing on one’s human nature and mind. In Ch’ŏnhak mundap, An upholds his traditional Neo-Confucian horizon and suggests that Catholics misused Confucian vocabulary when they discussed sagehood (in relation to Jesus), emphasising that Confucius did not discuss the supernatural and was concerned with this life (Kim Shin-ja [ed.] 1987: 28–29).

These Confucians were all toeing the line of orthodox Confucian morality, which was practical (not mystical), and where the onus for morality was on oneself, inscribed into one’s mind and human nature. For them, humans decided their own moral fate by mastering one’s desires, and neither the devil nor God had any part in this. The “this-worldliness” of the Confucian discourse was something they championed, advocating its benefits for human affairs governed by “mindfulness”, and not by any sort of interference from the spirit world. In this sense they were upholding the agnostic stance of Confucius himself in the Analects:

If we are not yet able to serve man, how can we serve spiritual beings? […] If we do not yet know about life, how can we know about death? (SB-Chan: 36)

6.2 Confucian-Catholics, Tasan and Moral Priorities

The earliest converts to Catholicism were all Confucian-trained scholars from aristocratic (yangban) families. Yi Pyŏk (1754–1786), as well as Yi Sŭnghun (1756–1801), were the leaders of this group who were soon joined by other yangban scholars, such as the two Kwŏn brothers (including the son-in-law of An Chŏngbok), and the three Chŏng brothers. The youngest of the Chŏng brothers, Yagyong (1762–1836), more generally known by his penname Tasan (often written as Dasan), is one of the most widely acclaimed philosophers in Korea’s intellectual history, discussed below. His early Confucian mentor, Yi Pyŏk, wrote the first lengthy outline of Christian doctrine in Korea, Sŏnggyo yoji (聖敎要旨) [The Essence of the Divine Doctrine] in Classical Chinese for his “Confucian” entourage. However, his hymn, Ch’ŏnju konggyŏng-ga (천주공경가) [Hymn in Adoration of God], is considered one of the first hymns written in Han’gŭl, the vernacular script, which was first promulgated in the fifteenth century, though generally associated with women and men from the poorer classes. In fact, so poorly was this simplified script esteemed in elite circles that it was referred to as Ŏnmun (諺文), meaning the vulgar script. But Yi’s hymn was also deeply Confucian, advocating loyalty to the king, emphasising filial piety, and even encouraging adherence to the “Five Relationships”. This Confucian aspect of early Catholicism reflects an interesting transcultural interaction between both traditions, highlighting their moral priorities. Chŏng Yakchŏn (1758–1816) and Chŏng Yakchong (1760–1801), also wrote Catholic texts in Han’gŭl, which also exhort Confucian morality: loyalty to the king, as well as filial piety, tropes already found in Yi’s hymn. In fact, in Chŏng Yakchŏn’s Sipkyemyŏng-ga (십계명가) [Hymn in Praise of the Ten Commandments], he writes that “Among all the things in the world, filial piety is the most important”, which also clarifies the singular importance of filial piety in Korean Confucianism (Ha (ed.) 2000: 334). Chŏng Yakchong wrote a much longer treatise on Catholicism in Han’gŭl, called Chugyo yoji (주교요지) [The Essence of The Lord’s Teachings], obviously directed at a growing audience who were not yangban scholars. In fact, many were women and members of the lower classes, overturning and destabilising entrenched hierarchical Confucian social norms, while at the same time advocating Confucian morality, but supplemented with egalitarian Christian ideas (Cawley 2015).

Tasan, like many others, renounced the religion after witnessing close relations and friends brutally executed, and as a result his authorial control had been clearly compromised through the fear of his own execution, as well as the fact that his wife and children could have been sold as slaves (Cawley 2014b). Some scholars, such as Kim Shin-ja (2006 [2010: 92–102]), comment on the philosophical inclinations in Tasan’s writings, and consider him as having returned to the “original theory of Confucius”, known as Susahak (洙泗學). However, Tasan’s commentaries are full of references to “The Sovereign on High”, Sangje (which is the Korean pronunciation of Shangdi), despite the fact that the Analects never mention this term, not even a single time. It appears only five times in the entire Four Books! This term was used in the Five Classics, as highlighted by Matteo Ricci, and was of great importance to the early Catholics in Korea, who, having read Ricci’s text, considered Sangje to be God. Why might this be important? Seen in this light, Tasan’s interest in “original” Confucianism (Susahak), may have been merely a ploy to detract from his religious affiliation with Catholicism. The Sangje one encounters in Tasan’s writings is a personal, monotheistic, creator deity, and not an impersonal Principle. Indeed, Tasan’s “dis-assembling” of Neo-Confucianism, extracting the Zhu-Cheng influenced metaphysical discourse, and reorienting it towards Sangje, resembles the strategy of Matteo Ricci, though supplemented with a sense of active social morality (see Cawley 2014a). Keum (1980 [2000: 189]) insists that

Catholic Doctrine not only provided a bridge to a new understanding of the universe, it also became a spring-board for the development of his [Tasan’s] Neo-Confucianism,

leading to a creative synthesis, which can also be described as “Post-Confucian” as it moves beyond the metaphysical parameters of Ihak (School of Principle) or Sŏngnihak (School of Nature and Principle). It might even be described as a sort of cryptic “Christo-Confucianology”, whereby Christian motifs inform his discourse on morality, which is guided by an anthropomorphic Sangje (discussed in detail in Cawley 2014b).

In Chungyong kangŭibo (中庸講義補) [Supplement to Lectures on the Doctrine of the Mean], Tasan (Kugyŏk yŏyudang chŏnsŏ: vol. 1: 390) queries the link between the “Diagram of the Supreme Ultimate” (which had provided the foundation for T’oegye’s onto-cosmology) and original Confucian ideas, noting that, “it was written over a thousand years after Confucius”, hence not found in “original” Confucianism at all. In another text, Maengja yoŭi (孟子要義) [The Essentials of The Mencius] Tasan notes that

the circle in this diagram which represents the Supreme Ultimate does not appear anywhere in the [Five] Classics. (Maengja yoŭi: 383)

Tasan, similar to Matteo Ricci, reorients his ideas away from these widely accepted Neo-Confucian metaphysical norms towards an all-seeing Sangje to provide an alternative foundation for his moral framework. It is Sangje who re-stabilises Tasan’s re-conceptualised ontotheological-cosmology, disentangling it from Principle, the Supreme Ultimate, yin and yang, as well as the five elements. It is Sangje who makes Tasan’s philosophy theistic-oriented. In Ch’unch’u kojing (春秋考徵) [Evidential Analysis of the Spring and Summer Annals] written circa 1812, he asks, “Who is Sangje?”, answering that

Sangje is a being that creates, governs and maintains heaven, earth, spirits, humans and all things, but also transcends them. (Ch’unch’u kojing, a283_363a)

Furthermore, this quote echoes the full title of Ricci’s first chapter in the True Meaning of the Lord of Heaven:

A Discussion on the creation of Heaven, Earth, and all things by the Lord of Heaven and on the way he governs and sustains them. (Ricci 1985:65)

Earlier scholars such as Yun Hyu (1617–1680) and Pak Sedang (1629–1703) had dared to be critical of Zhu Xi’s interpretations of texts and rituals, but Mark Setton (1997: 102–103) notes how Tasan took this to another level, arguing that even his conception of Confucian virtue was “diametrically opposed” to Zhu Xi’s. Setton also notes how Tasan even rejected the introspective aspects of self-cultivation, advocating an outward ethical practice based on our moral priorities. This then is contingent upon free will, a radical idea in Tasan’s work, where good and evil are not aspects of one’s material force, but rather, related to the psychological level, and only exist “in the context of concrete human relations” (Setton 1989: 380). Free will is then the defining feature of the human being because

This ability to make moral choices, and consequently to shape his own moral destiny, places man in an entirely different category from the animals. (1989: 380)

This also shapes Tasan’s other writings that highlight his profound interest in reforming his society: Kyŏngse yup’yo (經世遺表) [Design for Good Government], Mongmin simsǒ (牧民心書) [Admonitions on Governing the People], and Hŭmhŭm sinsǒ (欽欽新書) [Toward a New Jurisprudence]. These three texts are generally considered to embody Tasan’s practical Sirhak ideology, though they too draw on commentaries and examples from Confucian literature. However, Tasan’s writings do not necessarily eulogise Confucianism and its laws, rather, we often find a harsh critique of it, which moves away from metaphysical debates to deal with the actual matters at hand—a society in decay, and poor people suffering from harsh punishments and taxes (see B. Choi (trans.) 2010 [Mongmin simsǒ]). Justice, in Tasan’s writings, becomes a call for moral responsibility, a gesture of “Humane” government actively involved in loving the people, where we can again possibly find Christian undertones.

7. Emergence of Modernisation and Confucian Challenges

The nineteenth century was a time of transformation in East Asia, particularly in Korea, and Confucian scholars were still eager to validate their discourse, even if it meant persecuting rivals: between 1866 and 1871, between 8,000 and 10,000 Catholics, men, women and children were tortured and executed by Confucian authorities. Choi Min-Hong (1980:191–217) notes the re-emergence of philosophers interested in Principle in the nineteenth century, many who had been linked with the Namin faction, hence, proponents of the T’oegye’s metaphysical ideas. This included Ki Chŏngjin (1798–1876) and Yi Hangno (1792–1868), the latter who considered Principle to be the basic substance of the universe, and “something spiritual” (1980: 194). Ki Chŏngjin, who again returned to study the writings of Zhu Xi, also re-engaged with studying sage learning and “researching the Classics”. He regarded Principle as a sort of spiritual Supreme Ultimate, which then produced yin and yang (and the material force)—in other words, Principle preceded ki, and this Principle was reflected differently in men and animals (Choi M.-H. 1980: 196–198). Yi Chin-sang (1818–1885) also considered Principle as preceding ki, but also as that which generated it, therefore, self-cultivation lay in the study of the mind and not in knowing external things due to man’s “Heaven-bestowed cognitive powers” which depended on “transcendental Li [Principle]”. Such idealistic ideas were hardly needed at a time when society was in such a state of disarray, already foreboded in the writings of Tasan.

At the same time, another branch emerged championing ki, such as Ch’oe Han-ki (1803–1879), who was weary of being governed by prejudices. Ch’oe’s work has been re-evaluated in more recent times. Scholars underscore his empiricist philosophy that investigated the role of experience in a methodologically sophisticated manner, reminiscent of John Locke (1632–1704), but used in Ch’oe’s work to undermine the idea of a naturally good mind before learning from accumulated experiences (Park 2004). He was very well acquainted with European science and observes a more practical interest in the material force. One can notice his ontology based on a “One-Dimensional ki theory”, which, in his opinion, was what shaped all things, even preceding all forms, while at the same time “denying the [Zhu Xi’s school’s] world of innate reasoning power” (Choi M.-H. 1980: 205). He was also influenced by the changing times, critical of the class system and the inhumane treatment of the population, issues raised by Tasan earlier in the century.

Park Chong-hong (2004: 396) critiques the trend of the (later-called) Sirhak [Practical] scholars, who “made the mistake of arranging encyclopedic knowledge” and other “trivial matters”, clearly unable to fathom what was coming, and unable to provide Chosŏn with the tools it needed to survive the “modernisation” that would soon be thrust upon the peninsula, leading to Japan’s eventual colonial rule over the peninsula (1910–1945). As the situation on the peninsula disintegrated, Koreans sought alternatives to Confucianism to deal with social issues and inequality. The first of these New Religious Movements (NRMs) was known as Tonghak (東學), or Eastern Learning, to contrast directly with the foreign “Western Learning”, and it attempted to help hopeless poor peasants whose lives were getting progressively worse, especially in the southern regions far from the capital. Tonghak was founded by Ch’oe Che-u (1824–1864), known by his followers as Su-un, and while providing an alternative to Confucianism, it used the name of the “Sovereign on High” (Sangje) from the Confucian Classics to refer to its deity, while also using the Catholic term “Lord of Heaven” (Ch’ŏnju) as well. There were splinter groups formed out of this NRM such as Chŭngsando (more commonly written Jeungsando), and Daesoon Jinrihoe, both worshipping different iterations of Sangje—a monotheistic Korean deity with Confucian origins (see Cawley 2019: ch. 5).

As the end of the Chosŏn dynasty drew nearer, and Korea opened up to Western countries, many Protestant missionaries would enter Korea by the late 1880s to make their mark on its religious culture. This motivated some Confucian scholars to attempt to revitalise Confucianism, emphasising its religious aspects, while others sought to reform Confucianism to counter the attempts by the Japanese government to “Japanize” the peninsula. Interestingly, Keum (1980 [2000: 219]) comments that “It goes without saying that the idea of Confucian Religion was prompted by the Christian concept of a transcendent God”, as well as the idea of “the organisation of a religious community [and] their own religious institutions”. However, this did not really take off, likely due to the elitism associated with Confucianism, and the way it had been responsible for the unfair treatment of people from different classes, and in particular, women, who were increasingly embracing Protestantism, which had facilitated their education in “modern” schools.

Han Hyong-jo (2016) articulates that more recent understandings of Korean Confucianism “has mirrored its chief nemesis, modernity” and outlines three stages:

  1. Denial (1890s–1930s), where Confucianism was blamed for the loss of Korea’s sovereignty;
  2. Excuse (1930s–1980s): Sirhak, whereby “practical” ideas were “fished” out of the tradition as a sort of retrospective consolation had things gone differently;
  3. Rehabilitation (1980s–1997): suggesting that Confucianism is behind of the economic rise of Korea and linked to the emergence of its democracy, despite the fact that Confucians were against industry and labour, and they supported unelected rulers from a royal clan.

Indeed, rulers’ challengers were easily disposed of—even if they should be senior members of their own family—contravening teachings on filial piety. Confucianism has also been linked with a resurgence of “Asian” values, or recalibrated (yet again) to permit a feminist turn, and possibly even found in some of the Juche ideas of North Korea’s state ideology, which commands undisputed loyalty (chung) to its Dear Leader.

Confucianism is currently at a crossroads as it interacts with other traditions in the twenty-first century, nestling between them and insinuating itself throughout them (Min 2016). In a sense, one might look to recovering what Han Hyoung-jo (2016) describes as a lost art of Confucian ihak, a form of cultivation of the mind, whereby reengaging with it might just draw us closer to how it was understood for centuries, and bring us closer to its goal, which is not democracy, but something more noble, sagehood. Han (2016) suggests that this has the potential to cure us from “self-oblivion and self-centredness”, the deficiencies and flaws of our culture today, by helping us to rediscover our innate potential for humane co-existence, irrespective of our political or religious views. Korean Confucianism and its emphasis on sage learning, rather than being outmoded, may be the agnostic moral approach that has the potential to reconnect us to ourselves and each other, at a time when psychological distress is on the rise in all modern “developed” democracies.


See the supplementary document (Figures and their Works) for a list of figures and works discussed in the entry.

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Other Internet Resources

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