Law and Ideology

First published Mon Oct 22, 2001; substantive revision Tue Apr 23, 2019

If law is a system of enforceable rules governing social relations and legislated by a political system, it might seem obvious that law is connected to ideology. Ideology refers, in a general sense, to a system of political ideas, and law and politics seem inextricably intertwined. Just as ideologies are dotted across the political spectrum, so too are legal systems. Thus we speak of both legal systems and ideologies as liberal, fascist, communist, and so on, and most people probably assume that a law is the legal expression of a political ideology. One would expect the practice and activity of law to be shaped by people’s political beliefs, so law might seem to emanate from ideology in a straightforward and uncontroversial way.

However, the connection between law and ideology is both complex and contentious. This is because of the diversity of definitions of ideology, and the various ways in which ideology might be related to law. Moreover, whilst the observation about law’s link with ideology might seem a sociological commonplace, the link between law and ideology is more often made in a critical spirit, in order to impugn law.

At issue is an understanding of ideology as a source of manipulation. Law as ideology directs its subjects in ways that are not transparent to the subjects themselves; law, on this view, cloaks power. The ideal of law, in contrast, involves a set of institutions that regulate or restrain power with reference to norms of justice. Thus the presence of the ideological in law must, in some sense, compromise law’s integrity. Not only is the view of law as ideology at odds with a lot of mainstream thinking about law, it seems difficult to reconcile with the central philosophical positions on the nature of law, e.g. a positivist conception of law as a set of formal rules, or a natural law conception where law is identified with moral principles.

1. Liberal Concepts of Ideology

What is ideology? The term was likely coined by the French thinker Claude Destutt de Tracy at the turn of the nineteenth century, in his study of the Enlightenment. For De Tracy, ideology was the science of ideas and their origins. Ideology understands ideas to issue, not haphazardly from mind or consciousness, but as the result of forces in the material environment that shape what people think. De Tracy believed his view of ideology could be put to progressive political purposes, since understanding the source of ideas might enable efforts on behalf of human progress (see Steger 2007, 24–32).

Ideology today is generally taken to mean not a science of ideas, but the ideas themselves, and moreover ideas of a particular kind. Ideologies are ideas whose purpose is not epistemic, but political. Thus an ideology exists to confirm a certain political viewpoint, serve the interests of certain people, or to perform a functional role in relation to social, economic, political and legal institutions. Daniel Bell (1960) dubbed ideology ‘an action-oriented system of beliefs,’ and the fact that ideology is action-oriented indicates its role is not to render reality transparent, but to motivate people to do or not do certain things. Such a role may involve a process of justification that requires the obfuscation of reality. Nonetheless, Bell and other liberal sociologists do not assume any particular relation between ideology and the status quo; some ideologies serve the status quo, others call for its reform or overthrow.

On this view, ideology can shape law, but a variety of ideologies might be vying for legal mastery; there is no necessary connection between law and a particular ideology. Law need not be understood as compromised, since law being ideological might just refer to the institutions of popular sovereignty, where public policy reflects citizens’ principles and beliefs; ideology would in that case just be a shorthand way of referring to the views of citizens that are legitimately instantiated in the laws of the land. Nonetheless, Bell argued that a postwar consensus on capitalism and liberal democracy might spell the ‘end of ideology.’

2. Radical Concepts of Ideology

A more critical understanding of law’s relation to ideology, and the role and purposes that ideology serves, is found in the writings of Karl Marx and Friedrich Engels. Like De Tracy, Marx and Engels contend that ideas are shaped by the material world, but as historical materialists they understand the material to consist of relations of production that undergo change and development. Moreover, for Marx and Engels, it is the exploitative and alienating features of capitalist economic relations that prompt ideas they dub ‘ideology.’ Ideology only arises where there are social conditions such as those produced by private property that are vulnerable to criticism and protest; ideology exists to protect these social conditions from attack by those who are disadvantaged by them. Capitalist ideologies give an inverted explanation for market relations, for example, so that human beings perceive their actions as the consequence of economic factors, rather than the other way around, and moreover, thereby understand the market to be natural and inevitable. Members of the Frankfurt School such as Jürgen Habermas drew on the Marxist idea of ideology as a distortion of reality to point to its role in communication, wherein interlocutors find that power relations prevent the open, uncoerced articulation of beliefs and values.

Thus ideology, far from being a science, as De Tracy contends, or any set of action-oriented beliefs as Bell puts it, is rather inherently conservative, quietist, and epistemically unreliable. Ideology conserves by camouflaging flawed social conditions, giving an illusory account of their rationale or function, in order to legitimate and win acceptance of them. Indeed, on this view of the ideological role of law, in a just society there would be no need for a mystifying account of reality, and thus no need for law. The concept of law as ideology is thus central to the Marxist view that law will wither away with the full flowering of communism (Sypnowich 1990, ch. 1).

The negative view of ideology taken by Marxists might suggest a crude conception where legal ideology is a tool cynically wielded by the powerful to ensure submission by the powerless. However, it offends the “conception of right,” if “a code of law is the blunt, unmitigated, unadulterated expression of the domination of a class” (Engels, letter to C. Schmidt, October 27, 1890). And because ideology such as law takes a formal and normative form, the powerful are in its grips too, persuaded by an account of the inevitable and just order from which they profit. Moreover, ideology is no mere fiction; it is produced by real social conditions and reflects them. Ideology thus must succeed in constituting a consensus about capitalism, and it must do so by giving expression to capitalism’s recognizable features. Equality before the law, for example, is both elicited by, and reflects, the reality of capitalist economic relations, even if it is an equality that is formal and incomplete. Consent will not be forthcoming if legal ideology bears no relation whatsoever to the social conditions it seeks to justify. The idea that ideology inverts reality is important here. In his camera obscura metaphor in The German Ideology, Marx contends that reality appears upside down in ideology, much like the photographic process provides an inverted image. The inverted image is telling; it is a recognisable depiction of reality, even if it is at the same time a distorted one ((Marx and Engels [TGI], 25). Karl Mannheim (1936) elaborated further on the idea of the complex relation between reality and ideology by pointing to the human need for ideology. Ideologies are neither true nor false but are a set of socially conditioned ideas that provide a truth that people, both the advantaged and the disadvantaged, want to hear.

In the 1920s, American jurisprudence came under the influence of another version of the critical view of ideology and law. The school of legal realism abandoned Marx’s specifically historical materialist explanation, but took up the idea that social forces outside the law are central in determining what the law is (see Cohen 1935, 818–21). Realists opposed traditional ‘formalist’ accounts of adjudication, where judges are understood to rely on uniquely and distinctively legal materials in rendering their judgments. Instead, the realists contended that law is inherently indeterminate, and thus judicial decisions must be explained by factors outside the law. Ideology emerges as one kind of realist explanation, where judicial decisions are the effect of political ideas, be they of the judge, the legal profession more generally, societal elites, or majority public opinion. The realists aligned their critique of law with a progressive politics. The inevitable influence of factors external to the law meant that social and political changes augured by the emerging welfare state were no threat to the purity of law. Indeed, the expanding regulative power of the administrative state would make it more likely that the influences on the law were now those of popular sovereignty and social justice, rather than the more nefarious influences of the past.

The view that law is a reflection of ideology was taken up again in the 1970s and 80s, with the emergence of the Critical Legal Studies movement. Critical Legal Studies was a radical school of thought shaped by a number of influences: the Marxist and realist traditions; the philosophical perspective of ‘deconstruction;’ and the politics of issues such as feminism, environmentalism and anti-racism. The movement takes up the realist idea that law is fundamentally indeterminate, and echoes Marxist views about how the interests of the powerful shape law. Exponents offer some astute observations about the ways in which law is taught and practiced in order to give the misleading impression of law’s certainty and legitimacy. Particular legal doctrines are targeted for papering over the inconsistent and arbitrary features of legal decision-making; the rule of law, for example, is criticized for a naïve view of the form of law as unaffected by law’s content and the social context in which law operates. The indeterminacy of law can produce a variety of results; Duncan Kennedy, for example, points out the surprising ways in which the ideology of formal legal reasoning can remedy injustice, even if ideology often disables such remedies as well (Kennedy 1976). Thus the ideology view can now be taken to reflect a consensus among radicals of all stripes on the role of law as a dissembling force to safeguard the unjust relations of the status quo.

3. Ideology and the Sources of Law

The well-known debate about the sources of law appears to be radically undercut by a view of law as ideology. The sources debate has usually been posed in terms of the extent to which morality is intrinsic to the definition of law. Natural lawyers argue that what is law must partly depend on moral criteria. Following Thomas Aquinas, the traditional criteria have not strayed far from the teachings of the Roman Catholic Church, but more recent natural law arguments, such as those of Lon Fuller and Ronald Dworkin, have proffered secular standards emanating from the procedural ideals of the rule of law or the constitutionalism of American liberalism. All natural lawyers, however, are agreed that what the law is must be determined, in some sense, by what the law ought to be.

Positivists, in contrast, have argued that what is law is determined only by the institutional facts internal to a legal system, facts that may or may not meet moral standards. Early positivists, such as Thomas Hobbes and John Austin, argued that even the legitimacy of law did not depend on moral criteria; law must be obeyed, however much it falls short of moral ideals. More recent exponents, such as H.L.A. Hart and Joseph Raz, have argued that legal positivism is committed only to the idea that because what is law is a factual question, law’s legitimacy can be determined by moral criteria outside the law that might recommend disobedience. All positivists, however, are agreed that, although law may meet moral criteria, what the law is and what it ought to be should be kept distinct.

The natural law and legal positivist positions are united, however, in the aim to provide a concept of the essence of law. This endeavour supplies them with a common enemy in the view of law as ideology, which finds trying to determine the essence of law as fundamentally misconceived. After all, if law is inevitably shaped by ideas emanating from power relations outside of the law, then it would seem that law has no essence, be it moral or institutional. If law is reduced to ideology, or seen as its mere effect, then legality looks contingent and unprincipled, having no necessary content or definition, no intrinsic character. If law both mirrors and distorts the realities of power, it is power, not principles of legality, which tells us what law is. Thus for most mainstream legal theorists, the ideological is no necessary feature of the law, and law should certainly not be defined according to the radical conception where intrinsic to law is a mystification of reality, or an obfuscation of social relations in order to exact compliance.

The picture is more complicated, however. The Marxist view of law as ideology does, after all, have some affinities with rival views on the sources of law. The Marxist view concedes to the positivist, for example, that law emerges from the practices of society, though the practices are extra-legal – political, economic and social – rather than the practices of institutional facts internal to a legal system. Social forces are ultimately determining of the content and form of a legal system. Indeed, the Marxist Louis Althusser’s idea of ideological state apparatuses (Althusser 1971) has a positivist flavour in its insistence that political reality can be exhaustively described by reference to structures rather than norm-bearing agents. We might expect that the radical exponent of ideology would resist the combination of a positivist-ideology view. The radical would find in the positivist emphasis on institutions a too uncritical attitude to the ideological structures that shape those institutions. But it seems possible that the positivist position could be interpreted to remove any ascribing of legitimacy to the institutions that define law in order to accommodate the critique of the radical ideology position.

As for the natural law position, the Marxist view of law as ideology concedes to the natural lawyer that law is normative. What is ideology, after all, but a set of values and ideals? However, on the Marxist view, the norms are defined in terms of the interests they serve, rather than the justice they embody. Law is normative, but it is certainly not moral, the Marxist insists against the natural lawyer. The critical aspect of the radical ideology view suggests an impasse between the natural lawyer and the ideology position that is more difficult to overcome than in the positivist case.

Of course, natural lawyers and positivists could quite easily find room for the liberal view of ideology as an action-oriented system of beliefs as a supplement to their views about the sources of law, in the sense that ideology is part of the sociological landscape to which their concepts of law apply. Natural law can find popular expression in a society’s ideology, and positivist legal institutions might reflect ideological beliefs.

4. Ideology and the Rule of Law

All this points to another and related tension. This is the tension between the radical ideology view and the concept of the rule of law, the centrepiece of a liberal legal order. At their most basic, the terms the rule of law, due process, procedural justice, legal formality, procedural rationality, justice as regularity, all refer to the idea that law should meet certain procedural requirements so that the individual is enabled to obey it. These requirements center on the principle that the law be general, that it take the form of rules. Law by definition should be directed to more than a particular situation or individual; as Lon Fuller notes, the rule of law also requires that law be relatively certain, clearly expressed, open, prospective and adequately publicised.

The view of law as ideology, even in its radical variants, would not deny the presence of the rule of law in the liberal legal order; indeed, the rule of law is often invoked as a paradigmatic example of legal ideology. This is because, however, the rule of law is interpreted as a device that serves the interests of the powerful; moreover, it is a device that dissembles itself. The rule of law, in its restraint on the exercise of governmental and judicial power, facilitates the aims of those with power of other kinds, particularly economic power. This is not a surprising argument, if one considers how right-wing thinkers like Frederick Hayek (1971, 57–9) have lauded the rule of law for its essential role in buttressing the free market. Left wing and right wing thinkers are agreed, then, on the capitalist function of the rule of law.

For the left-wing theorist of ideology, however, the rule of law also has ideological aspects that mean it serves capitalist purposes in more sinister ways. For in its restraint on political and legal power, the rule of law implies that these public forms of power are the only forms of power that exist, or at least the only ones that matter. Moreover, in assuring the subjects of the law that that law is applied with generality and certainty, the rule of law also implies that formal justice is the only relevant kind of justice; that equality before the law is identical to equality per se.

These claims about the rule of law and ideology are complex and need careful scrutiny. Does the rule of law necessarily involve manipulation on behalf of the capitalist order? Given its formal virtues, and its agnosticism on the content of law, the rule of law seems innocent of charges of a capitalist bias, or a bias of any kind. As Raz puts it, the rule of law’s virtue is like the virtue of a sharp knife; it enables the law to fulfill its function, whatever the function might be (Raz 1979). Moreover, it is hard to see how the rule of law itself is engaged in any project of deception. Generality in the law, for example, does not necessarily entail any particular commitments on how the economy or society should be organized; nor does it propagate falsity or error. Nonetheless, it is true that the proceduralism of the rule of law can be put to ideological purposes, to deflect social criticism and prevent radical change. And if enthusiasts of the rule of law place enough emphasis on procedural justice, this can reduce the likelihood that more substantive conceptions of justice will have success. Historically, societies governed by the rule of law have tended to be structured by capitalist markets, suggesting an affinity between the two sets of institutions. The rule of law can have an ideological effect even if it is not ideological in its essence.

5. Ideology and Justice

The idea that law is ideological is an important contribution to legal scholarship. First, it enables a more critical view of the law and its role, and thereby demystifies a set of vital social institutions. Second, it points to the importance of sociological and political factors in our understanding of the law. Legality is shaped and influenced by non-legal aspects of society, and law, in turn, has an impact on society and social change, not just in the obvious effects of particular judgments, but in the political culture that a legal system helps produce.

The Marxist view of law as ideology risks, however, an unhelpful reductionism. Conceiving of law as ideological above all else in the Marxist sense can promote a crude and erroneous understanding of the relation between power and legality, where law serves only the interests of the powerful and where legal guarantees are mere shams. Moreover, this can license a cynicism about the law that is paradoxically contrary to the emancipatory aims of the radical politics that was the impetus for the critique of law as ideology in the first place. That is, radical critics risk dismissing altogether the possibility of legal resources for remedying injustice.

Furthermore, the cynicism of some ideology views is in fact the fruits of a kind of utopianism about law, for it counters the bleak portrait of legal ideology manipulated on behalf of the powerful with an ideal society without ideology or law, where human beings’ relations to each other and to reality are transparent and conflict-free. The ‘end of ideology’ thesis, advanced by Bell in a triumphalist spirit on behalf of liberal capitalism, but interestingly even more salient in Marxist ideals of communism, might be wrong in its assumption that human beings can transcend ideology. Indeed, the radical concept of ideology ultimately casts doubt on the likelihood that individuals’ beliefs can ever provide an objective account of reality, untainted by distorted and self-justifying processes of inquiry.

How then, can the concept of ideology be deployed in legal scholarship? In fact, the more subtle critiques of ideology grasp the extent to which both liberation and manipulation can be embodied in the law. Recall the nuanced conception of Marx and Engels, where ideology gives an inverted image of reality, but a recognizable image nonetheless. This suggests that the ideals of legality are not a mere charade but are instantiated in the law, if only in a partial and incomplete form. The Marxist historian E.P. Thompson (1975, 265) made this point in his argument for the universal value of the rule of law. Thompson contended that in order for law to function as ideology it must proffer some genuine moral value.

To illustrate, consider how someone’s cruelty might be masked by polite manners; this does not demonstrate that good manners have no worth. Legal ideology, too, might paper over injustice in ways that serve justice nonetheless. A functional argument about ideology, then, must concede the value of the phenomenon that serves ideological aims. Ideology cannot be devoid of emancipatory aspects altogether; if law trumpets justice, equality and freedom, then it must succeed in realizing these ideals, however imperfectly, in order for law to function as ideology. We can thus appreciate legal guarantees of a procedural kind for the genuine protection they offer the subjects of the law, whilst at the same time conceding the quietist politics that proceduralism might engender.

The values of legal proceduralism have had considerable influence on political philosophy, particularly liberalism. We saw that in his critique of the welfare state, Hayek contended that law’s procedural rules dictated a laissez-faire economy in which the state is expected only to provide a framework for private initiatives. Left-wing liberals such as Rawls and Dworkin, in contrast, insist that the state properly plays a role in remedying economic disadvantage. Rawls was concerned that citizens enjoy the genuine ‘worth’ or ‘fair value’ of equal political liberties (Rawls 2007, 148–9). Moreover, he also took the view that both liberal democratic socialism and a property-owning democracy were candidates for realizing his principles of justice. Articulating this as an effort to find an ‘alternative to capitalism’ (2001, 135–6), Rawls was picking up on the claim in his political philosophy lectures that Marx’s idea of ‘freely associated producers’ involves a ‘democratic economic plan’ (2007, 372).

Nonetheless, Rawls’s political liberalism does not reject Hayek’s counsel altogether, retaining a preoccupation with keeping the state at bay. In particular, Rawls contends that ‘the basic institutions and public policies of justice’ should be understood as ‘neutral with respect to comprehensive doctrines and their associated conceptions of the good’ (2001, 153n27). Rawls’s ‘neutrality of aim’ (2001, 153n27) reflects what Raz dubbed (1994, 46) an ‘epistemic withdrawal from the fray’ which dictates that the scope of the political be constrained by formal procedures: the decision process of the original position; the tenets of public reason; or political liberalism’s explicit exclusion of considerations about the good life. Indeed, Rawls’s proceduralist ethic became especially prominent in his later work, where the focus on constitutional questions over the remedy of economic disadvantage attracted much critical comment (see Barry 1995; Okin 1993; Williams 1993).

It should be noted that Rawls put much store by ‘the good’ of a well-ordered political society (2001, 198–9) and admitted that perfectionist views about valuable ways of living might play a role in legislative decisions about ‘suitably circumscribed questions’ such as the protection of wildlife habitat (2001, 152n26). However, he retained a traditional view of perfectionism as in principle inegalitarian, involving the idea that ‘some people have special claims because their greater gifts enable them to engage in the higher activities that realise perfectionist values’ (2001, 152). ‘Egalitarian perfectionists’ such as the author of this entry, in contrast, argue it is human flourishing that we should seek to make more equal in our theories of justice. On this, doubtless controversial, view, the concern for impartiality in the law should not be allowed to have ‘imperialistic designs’ on all political questions (Sypnowich 2017, 85–7), so that the community forfeits its responsibility to foster equal human wellbeing.

Nevertheless, concerns about the ideological impact of proceduralism do not call into question the valuable role that the rule of law itself should play, even in the most ambitious egalitarian community. The potential for a dismissive approach to law, perhaps, along with the general decline of the influence of Marxism, accounts for why some recent literature has avoided the term ‘ideology’ and opted instead for terms like ‘discourse’ or ‘narrative’. Such terms also suggest that law should be understood in a political context, but they are less specific about the nature of that context or its impact. This seems a loss. Properly understood, the concept of ideology offers a nuanced and illuminating approach to legality that gives a precise rendering of the relation between law and politics that need not be nihilist or reductionist. After all, a proper understanding of the ideological role of law is compatible with other conceptions of how law is to be defined or understood. This is particularly so if we recognize the improbability of eliminating altogether ideological modes of understanding.

A conception of law as having a moral source, or a source in a system’s institutions, can be independent of a realistic appraisal of law’s ideological function, or the ideological process in which laws are made. Indeed, radical critics of the ‘war on terror’ waged by western governments have pointed to the value of liberal legal ideals such as human rights and the rule of law at the same time as they have noted the ideological purposes to which such ideals are put. Both positivists and natural lawyers, so long as they do not insist that their conceptions of law are exhaustive of law’s reality, can permit the influence of ideology, even in its more radical interpretations. Law can be ideology as well as other moral or institutional phenomena at the same time; indeed, law will probably not succeed as ideology unless it is multi-dimensional in just this way.


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