David Lewis’s Metaphysics

First published Tue Jan 5, 2010; substantive revision Thu Jun 24, 2021

David Lewis produced a body of philosophical writing that, in four books and scores of articles, spanned every major philosophical area, with perhaps the greatest concentration in metaphysics, philosophy of language, philosophical logic, and philosophy of mind. Despite this astonishing variety, a newcomer to Lewis’s philosophy would be best advised to begin with his metaphysics (especially: 1986a, 1986e, 1999). There are several reasons. First, the majority of Lewis’s work either concerns, or substantially overlaps, topics in metaphysics. Second, the metaphysical positions Lewis stakes out are strikingly original and powerfully argued. Third, there is a coherence and systematicity to this work that makes it a particularly appropriate object for study, in that one sees trademark Lewisian philosophical maneuvers clearly on display. (Indeed, if one wished to learn how to do philosophy in a Lewisian style, the most efficient way to do so would be to study his work in metaphysics.) Finally, and perhaps most interestingly, Lewis’s metaphysics exerted a profound regulating influence on the rest of his philosophy: if some otherwise attractive position on some philosophical problem could not be made to square with his overall metaphysical outlook, then it would have to be abandoned.

I should forestall one possible misunderstanding. You might think that, given what I’ve just said, the way Lewis would recommend doing philosophy is as follows: First you figure out what your basic metaphysical commitments should be; then you turn your attention to various broad but non-foundational philosophical subject matters (personal identity, mental content, the nature of knowledge, theory of value, etc.), and work out the consequences in each of these arenas of your fundamental metaphysical posits. Nothing could be further from Lewis’s preferred methodology. (Well, maybe relying on divine revelation would be further….) What he in fact recommends is a holistic approach: we start with the total body of claims we are inclined to believe—whether on the basis of “common sense” (an oft-invoked category, for Lewis) or of science—and try our best to systematize it in accordance with standards of theoretical goodness that are themselves endorsed by common sense and/or science (and so are themselves, to some extent, also up for grabs). A substantial portion of Lewis’s overall body of philosophical work can thus be seen as an extended—and breathtakingly ambitious—attempt at achieving total reflective equilibrium. Here is an especially succinct description of this approach:

One comes to philosophy already endowed with a stock of opinions. It is not the business of philosophy either to undermine or to justify these preexisting opinions, to any great extent, but only to try to discover ways of expanding them into an orderly system. (1973b, p. 88)

Still, while Lewis’s method of philosophical inquiry is certainly not “bottom-up”, in my opinion it is best to present the results of that inquiry in a bottom-up fashion. That is what this essay, and ones to follow, will attempt to do. I will divide the terrain into four parts: Lewis’s fundamental ontology; his theory of metaphysical modality; his “applied” metaphysics (covering such topics as laws of nature, counterfactuals, causation, identity through time, and the mind); and Lewisian methodology in metaphysics. I’ll explain these distinctions shortly, but be advised that the present essay will almost exclusively address the first of these four topics. Other aspects of Lewis’s thought are covered in the general entry on David Lewis.

1. Lewisian metaphysics: an overview

On a traditional conception, metaphysics aims to answer, in a suitably abstract and fully general manner, two questions:

  1. What is there?
  2. What is it (that is, whatever it is that there is) like?

Lewis fully endorses this conception: for him, metaphysicians are not in the business merely of analyzing our “conceptual scheme” (except insofar as doing so is an effective method for finding answers to metaphysical questions), nor need they pay any heed to the perennial philosophical calls for the abolition of their subject. They are, rather, engaged in an unproblematically factual inquiry into the nature of reality—one whose recognizable epistemological pitfalls provide no grounds for doubting its legitimacy:

Once the menu of well-worked-out theories is before us, philosophy is a matter of opinion. Is that to say that there is no truth to be had? Or that the truth is of our own making, and different ones of us can make it differently? Not at all! If you say flatly that there is no god, and I say that there are countless gods but none of them are our worldmates, then it may be that neither of us is making any mistake of method. We may each be bringing our opinions to equilibrium in the most careful possible way, taking account of all the arguments, distinctions, and counterexamples. But one of us, at least, is making a mistake of fact. Which one is wrong depends on what there is. (Lewis 1983a, p. xi)

We can begin to get a handle on Lewis’s audacious and comprehensive answers to our two overarching questions by distinguishing three components to his metaphysical program:

First, he offers an account of what the fundamental ontological structure of the world is. Is, and must be—although as we’ll see, that qualification turns out to be in a certain sense trivial. This account of fundamental ontology of course presupposes that the word “fundamental” means something, and in particular manages to cleanly distinguish a certain central core of one’s ontological commitments from the rest. Suppose these commitments take the form of views about what entities (or “particulars”) there are, and what properties and relations they stand in. Then we can distinguish two questions. Are some entities more fundamental than others—with, perhaps, an elite group of entities being the most fundamental? Are some properties/relations more fundamental than others—again, with, perhaps, an elite group being the most fundamental? You might find a “yes” answer to both questions attractive. (E.g., chairs exist, but they are not fundamental-level entities—though perhaps quarks are. Likewise, some chairs have the property of being made of oak; but this is not a fundamental-level property—though perhaps the property of having such-and-such electric charge is.) As for Lewis’s own views, with respect to the second question they are fairly unambiguous: He is quite clear that a proper ontology must include not just particulars but also properties and relations (see especially 1983b); he is equally clear that it is a perfectly objective and determinate matter which of these properties/relations are more fundamental (or, in his terminology, more “natural”) than others (ibid.); he is officially agnostic about whether some properties/relations are most fundamental, or perfectly natural (1986f). His views on the first question are, to my eyes at least, more difficult to discern—but for reasons that, in the final analysis, probably do not matter. See the

Supplement on Fundamental Entities

What’s more, to a very great extent he takes it that the route to a proper theory of fundamental ontology is by way of a priori philosophical inquiry. (An important qualification will be noted shortly.)

Second, he offers an account of modality, his famous “realism” about possible worlds. Lewis, like many philosophers, takes talk of possibility and necessity to be best explicated as disguised quantification over possible worlds (and possible inhabitants thereof), and he was endlessly ingenious at showing how to use the resources provided by a theory of “possibilia” to produce analyses of a host of modal locutions. But his realism about possible worlds consists in much more than inclusion of such entities into his ontology; indeed, it would probably be better to call Lewis a “reductionist” about modality—reductionist in a way that distinguishes him from virtually every other philosopher of modality. For a typical believer in possible worlds will, if asked to explain what they are, give an account that uses modal notions at some crucial point. Perhaps she will say that possible worlds are maximal consistent sets of sentences (in some appropriate language); or perhaps she will say that they are certain kinds of maximal properties that reality as a whole could have instantiated. Lewis says no such thing: he offers a characterization of possible worlds—and thus of modality generally—in explicitly non-modal terms. This complete subordination of the modal to the non-modal gives his philosophy of modality a quite radical character, and also sheds light on some of his seemingly independent views about the modalities involved in such concepts as causation, law of nature, and chance. (For example, Lewis rejects philosophical accounts of laws of nature that rely on any primitive modal notions.)

Third, Lewis offers an account of how facts about everything else reduce to the sorts of facts laid out in his accounts of fundamental ontology and modality. (Note that given the remarks in the last paragraph, these reductions ultimately rest on facts about fundamental ontology alone; no unanalyzed modal notions are involved in them.) Better: he offers an assortment of distinctive approaches for constructing such reductions, of which there are many examples but no single, canonical exposition. At this point I wish to make just three observations about these strategies. First, they can be seen to be directed at providing answers to a distinctively metaphysical kind of question, of the form, “What is it for such-and-such a fact to obtain?” Examples will pin down the idea:

  • Question: What is it for an object to persist through time? Lewis’s answer: It is for that object to be constituted by three-dimensional, instantaneous time-slices that exist at different times. (Lewis 1988)
  • Question: What is it for an object to have a certain property essentially? Lewis’s answer: It is for every one of that object’s counterparts in other possible worlds to have that property. (Lewis 1968)
  • Question: What is an event? Lewis’s answer: It is a certain kind of property of spacetime regions. (Lewis 1986d)
  • Question: What is it for one event to be a cause of another? Lewis’s (preliminary) answer: It is for the second event to counterfactually depend on the first, in the sense that had the first not occurred, the second would not have.[1] (Lewis 1973a, 1986b)
  • Question: What is an explanation of some event? Lewis’s answer: It is a quantity of information about that event’s causes. (Lewis 1986c)

And so on. It is this kind of question—albeit not always phrased in this way, and accompanied by definite views about what constitutes a philosophically appropriate answer—that animate what we might call Lewis’s “applied metaphysics”: the application of his basic positions in ontology and modality to a range of perennial metaphysical topics. Note that the reductionist character of his approach comes out when we pursue the obvious follow-up questions: For example, what is it for one event to counterfactually depend on another? Roughly, it is for the closest possible world in which the second does not occur to be a world in which the first does not occur. What is it for one world to be closer to actuality than another? We’ll skip the answer for now—but rest assured that it and the answers to subsequent follow-up questions are designed to hang together in such a way as to collectively display how facts about what causes what ultimately reduce to facts about fundamental ontology. And so it goes, for personal identity, free will, the mind, knowledge, ethics, laws of nature, you name it.

The second observation is that it remains far from clear whether we can dispense with the notion of “reduce to” (or “determined by”, “fixed by”, etc.) in favor of some philosophically more sanitized alternative; see the

Supplement on Reduction

The third observation I wish to make at this point is that Lewis is strongly motivated by a desire for theoretical economy—both with respect to ontology and with respect to ideology. His quest for ontological economy shows up in the austerity of the kinds of fundamental entities he admits into his ontology (he neither shows, nor cares to show, any economy with respect to their number). His quest for ideological economy shows up in several places, but perhaps most notably in his utter rejection of any unanalyzed modal notions, and—something that hasn’t been mentioned yet—in his attempted reduction of set theory to mereology and plural quantification.

Let’s take a somewhat closer look, now, at Lewis’s account of fundamental ontology.

2. Fundamental ontology: A simplified version

It will be useful to start with a view that is almost Lewis’s—almost, but not quite, as it is more opinionated than he would be comfortable with. Stating the view takes but a few lines; providing the needed commentary will take longer. Thus, Almost-Lewis says the following:

The only fundamental entities that are particulars are spacetime points.

What these particulars are like is given by what perfectly natural monadic properties they instantiate, and what perfectly natural relations they stand in to one another.

And that’s it. That is, the facts about what fundamental particulars there are, and what perfectly natural properties and relations they instantiate, determine all other facts, even modal facts. Almost-Lewis (and Lewis) believes, of course, in other particulars besides spacetime points; it’s just that these particulars are not fundamental: what it is for them to exist is to be explained, somehow, in terms of facts about the fundamental entities. (See the

Supplement on Fundamental Entities

for some qualifications about Lewis’s position.)

Notice one consequence: If the facts about what fundamental particulars there are, and what perfectly natural properties and relations they instantiate, determine all other facts, then there is no reason to suppose that composite particulars—particulars that have other particulars as proper parts—ever instantiate perfectly natural monadic properties. (Of course, they can perfectly well instantiate the very-but-not-perfectly natural property of having parts that instantiate such-and-such a perfectly natural relation.) Thus, if, for example, my laptop has a mass of 3 kg, that is so only in a slightly derivative sense: the laptop is composed of parts whose masses add up to 3 kg.

As noted, the position of Almost-Lewis is not that of Lewis, and shortly we will need to review the key respect in which, by Lewis’s lights, it overreaches. But first we need to elaborate and clarify the content of Almost-Lewis’s position, by means of some commentary.

Four questions demand attention: What are “perfectly natural” properties and relations? What does it come to to say that the fundamental particulars are spacetime points? What does it come to to say that they are spacetime points? Finally, what is the relationship between the fundamental ontology posited by Almost-Lewis and Lewis’s own celebrated thesis of Humean Supervenience? Let’s consider these topics in turn.

3. Perfectly natural properties and relations

Remember that laying out the foundations of one’s ontology requires two things: to say what, fundamentally, there is; and to say what it is like, presumably by stating some facts about the fundamental entities. But not just any facts matter. For example, it may be true of some of the fundamental entities that they coexist with at least one pig; but saying so does nothing to help articulate the fundamental structure of reality. To do that, Lewis thinks, one needs a distinction among the properties and relations: some are special, in that it is their pattern of instantiation among the fundamental entities that constitutes the fundamental structure of reality—the “joints” along which nature is to be ultimately carved. These special properties and relations are the “perfectly natural” ones.

(There are a variety of other uses to which Lewis puts the notion of “natural” properties, some of which show that what he needs is a distinction that admits of gradations, with the perfectly natural properties at one extreme. See the

Supplement on The Natural/Non-natural Distinction

for an overview.)

It is not enough merely to appeal to such a distinction; for metaphysics to do its job properly, it must also provide an account. Now, one way to proceed would be to provide a theory of what properties and relations are, in which it is stipulated that all such things are to count as “perfectly natural”. On such an approach, while there may well be a property corresponding to the predicate “has mass 5 kg” (for example), there will almost certainly be no property corresponding to the predicate “is green” (let alone that familiar gerrymander, “is grue”). Lewis favors a different approach. Given his commitment to set theory, he already believes in things that, by his lights, deserve to be called the property of being green, and indeed the property of being grue: these are merely certain sets—sets of actual and possible objects. (See the section on Lewis’s modal metaphysics in the entry on David Lewis, and the supplement on The Natural/Non-natural Distinction.) The question for him, then, is how to distinguish among these sets those that are perfectly natural. Here I will present Almost-Lewis as being, almost like Lewis, agnostic as between four broad alternatives. (Almost, because Lewis eventually decided that the first alternative, according to which natural properties and relations are Aristotelian universals, is unworkable; see his 1986f for the reasons.)

  • One could adopt a theory of universals of the kind developed by David Armstrong (1978a,1978b): “…we could call a property [viz., set of actual and possible objects] perfectly natural if its members are all and only those things that share some one universal.” (1999 p. 13)
  • One could treat “natural” as a primitive predicate of sets of actual and possible objects: “…a Nominalist could take it as a primitive fact that some classes of things are perfectly natural properties; others are less-than-perfectly natural to various degrees; and most are not at all natural. Such a Nominalist uses ‘natural’ as a primitive predicate, and offers no analysis of what he means in predicating it of classes.” (1999, p. 14)[2]
  • One could define “natural” in terms of a suitably complex, and primitive, notion of resemblance: “Alternatively, a Nominalist in pursuit of adequacy might prefer to rest with primitive objective resemblance among things. …Then he could undertake to define natural properties in terms of the mutual resemblance of their members and the failure of resemblance between their members and their non-members.” (1999, p. 14)
  • One could adopt an ontology of tropes—roughly, property-instances, entities that occupy a sort of ontological halfway house between particulars and properties. (See Lewis 1986f, Williams 1953, Campbell 1990.)

Returning now to Almost-Lewis’s fundamental ontology, the options seem to be these: It might be that a spacetime point (or sequence of points) instantiates a perfectly natural property (respectively, relation) by instantiating a universal, in the sense of Armstrong. It might be that it has it by having as one part a certain kind of trope, in roughly the sense of Williams. (Whence we must amend slightly, and take these tropes to be the fundamental entities.) It might be that it has it by belonging to a special sort of set of (actual and merely possible) spacetime points—special either on account of the resemblances that unite its members and distinguish them from non-members, or on account of simply being perfectly natural. Regardless of which one chooses, Lewis thinks, one’s theory of natural properties and relations ought to respect four philosophically-motivated constraints:

First, an adequate theory should be minimal, in the sense that it posits just enough perfectly natural properties and relations for their distribution among the fundamental particulars to fully and determinately fix the nature of all of reality: “The guiding idea, roughly, is that the world’s universals should comprise a minimal basis for characterizing the world completely. Universals that do not contribute at all to this end are unwelcome, and so are universals that contribute only redundantly.” (1999, p. 12) It is clear from the surrounding text that Lewis takes this constraint to govern the various alternatives to a universals account of naturalness.[3]

Second, perfectly natural properties and relations are, Lewis thinks, non-modal. What, exactly, this means will need to come in for more discussion. For the moment, we can take it to mean roughly this (though trouble for this characterization quickly arises): the instantiation of a perfectly natural property by one (fundamental) particular, or of a relation by several, places absolutely no constraints of a logical or metaphysical kind on the instantiation of any other perfectly natural property or relation by that or any other particular or particulars.

Third, they are intrinsic to the particulars that instantiate them—which, all too roughly, means that they characterize what those particulars are like, independently of what any other distinct particular is like. More: The intrinsic nature of any particular is exhausted by what perfectly natural properties it instantiates.[4] This assumption also allows a theory of natural properties and relations to yield, in a fairly simple way, a definition of “perfect duplicate” applicable to any possible objects x and y (not necessarily inhabiting the same possible world): x and y are perfect duplicates iff they share exactly the same perfectly natural properties.[5] A definition of “intrinsic” follows: a property P is intrinsic iff any two duplicates x and y (taken from any possible worlds) either both have P or both fail to have P. Of course, what we really have here is a tight circle that puts on display how the expressions “intrinsic”, “perfect duplicate”, and “perfectly natural” can be interdefined, with the help of the modal notion of metaphysical possibility. (See Lewis 1983c and Langton & Lewis 1998 for discussion of various strategies for breaking out of this circle.)

The fourth constraint is purely negative: it is that it should be left to the empirical sciences to fill in the details about which perfectly natural monadic properties there are (at least, in actuality: philosophy might teach us, or at least give us some reason to believe, that there are, in other possible worlds, so-called “alien” properties, perfectly natural properties not instantiated in the actual world). Not just any empirical science will do: given, in particular, the first of the four theses, it is really the job of fundamental physics to fill in these details. The special sciences get no say.

What about perfectly natural relations? Here matters are less clear. Lewis certainly thinks that spatiotemporal relations are perfectly natural; what is less obvious is whether, by his lights, physics could rationally lead us to reject this claim. For now I will simplify, and have Almost-Lewis add a fifth constraint—one that is in tension at least with the spirit of the fourth, and that the real Lewis certainly rejects. It is this: not only are spatiotemporal relations perfectly natural, they are the only perfectly natural relations. (The only possible ones—though remember that given Lewis’s reductionism about modality, that is an idle addition.)

The picture that emerges is this: Reality consists of a multitude of spacetime points. Each of these stands in spatiotemporal relations to some others (though not to all others). Each instantiates various perfectly natural, non-modal monadic properties. That is all there is; anything putatively “extra”—facts about laws of nature, or about persisting macro-objects, or about causation, or about mentality, or about ethics, or about sets, etc.—must somehow reduce to that stuff. For Almost-Lewis, this picture captures a fundamental truth about the nature of existence. It is roughly right that it is also a necessary truth—a status that would seem to fall out automatically, given Lewis’s reductionist account of modality. The only unfinished philosophical business is to work out the right theory of natural properties and relations, and to work out the details of the reduction for particular cases.

4. Spatiotemporal relations and spacetime points

The foregoing Almost-Lewisian thesis about spatiotemporal relations is too strong to be tenable: we now have reasonably good reasons, drawn from quantum physics, for holding that even in the actual world, there are perfectly natural relations other than the purely spatiotemporal ones. (Roughly: the relations—whatever exactly they amount to—coded up in the quantum mechanical wave-function.) Two points in its defense are, however, worth brief mention: First, seemingly obvious counterexamples—involving such basic physical relations as being more massive than—in fact aren’t counterexamples, since Lewis can deny that they are genuinely fundamental or perfectly natural, on the basis that facts about their obtaining reduce to facts about the distribution of monadic perfectly natural properties. (Still, they will certainly turn out to be very natural.) Second, if we could at least maintain, as a contingent thesis, that the only perfectly natural relations are spatiotemporal ones, then we could plausibly settle an unresolved and deeply vexed question about the content of physicalism (the doctrine, to put it rather too crudely, that all there is to the actual world is physical stuff), as explained in the supplementary document


At any rate, the thesis that spatiotemporal relations are at least among the perfectly natural relations allows us to clarify and simplify Almost-Lewis’s position. Specifically, we can say that all that it comes to to say that the fundamental entities are spacetime points is that they stand in perfectly natural spatiotemporal relations to one another. For more, see the supplementary document on

Spacetime Points

To say that they are spacetime points, finally, is to say that they have no proper parts.

One upshot is that my original statement of Almost-Lewis’s ontology needs an amendment: for it was misleading to say that according to him, the fundamental particulars are spacetime points. That’s true, but it wrongly suggests that he is making a choice of one fundamental kind of particular, distinguished from other possible choices by the essential nature of its members. Not so. It is more accurate to describe his fundamental ontology thus:

  • There are particulars.
  • They are, or are wholly composed of, simples—particulars have no other particulars as proper parts.
  • These simples have various perfectly natural monadic properties.
  • They stand in various spatiotemporal relations to one another.
  • And that is all.

5. Humean Supervenience

Almost-Lewis’s theses about what fundamental ontology comprises, and how all other facts reduce to facts about it, bears a very close relationship to Lewis’s celebrated thesis of Humean Supervenience (hereafter: “HS”). But they are not the same, and the differences are worth keeping track of. Here is a typical statement of HS (slightly stronger, as we’ll see, than the version Lewis officially endorses): No two possible worlds differ with respect to what is true at them, without differing with respect to the geometrical arrangement of their spacetime points, or with respect to which perfectly natural properties are instantiated at those points.[6] (Note that so stated, HS is automatically metaphysically necessary.) Thus, HS is a supervenience claim, logically weaker than Almost-Lewis’s claim of reduction. It is also a claim that—for some good reasons and some bad reasons—Lewis accepts only in a weaker form that is metaphysically contingent. More significantly, it is no part of HS that facts about possible worlds themselves reduce to anything else; whereas both Almost-Lewis and Lewis are explicit in their commitment to this further claim. Having said all this, it will be worth remembering in what follows that Almost-Lewis’s position (which, remember, incorporates Lewis’s modal realism) entails HS. So, any doubts about HS will carry over to Almost-Lewis’s fundamental ontology.

6. Lewis v. Almost-Lewis

Let’s consider now the most salient ways in which Lewis’s own positions about fundamental ontology diverge from those of Almost-Lewis.

First, Lewis takes the lessons quantum physics teaches seriously enough to withhold endorsement of Almost-Lewis’s fifth thesis, that the only perfectly natural relations are spatiotemporal relations.

Second, Lewis is agnostic as to whether, in addition to spacetime points, there might be (in this, or other possible worlds) fundamental entities that are occupants of such points. But agnosticism on this score is probably a bad idea: the proposed possibility is not clearly intelligible, nor it is clear what its motivation could be. For more, see the supplementary document on

Spacetime Points

Third, on a plausible story about what non­-fundamental entities there are, it will turn out that on Almost-Lewis’s view, everything that exists is composed of simples (parts, that themselves have no proper parts). Lewis is also agnostic on this score: he takes it to be at least an epistemic possibility that there is “gunk”: something, every proper part of which itself has a proper part (see for example Lewis 1991). Lewis says relatively little either about the status of this possibility (in particular, is it more than merely epistemic?), or about its potential ramifications for his various positions in metaphysics. To keep things simple, I will discount it for the remainder of this main essay.

Fourth, Lewis holds that his thesis of Humean Supervenience is, at best, only contingently true. Of course, given that he recognizes the (metaphysical) possibility of perfectly natural, non-spatiotemporal relations, he should treat HS as at best contingent. But he advances reasons for doing so of a quite different sort. They are not particularly good reasons, and so we will pass them by; but see the supplementary document on

The Contingency of Humean Supervenience

for discussion.

7. Some criticisms

What, finally, should we make of Lewis’s conception of fundamental ontology? A complicated question; I will limit discussion to just two important worries. Let’s begin by noting the obvious influence of a certain scientifically-informed conception of the world in shaping Lewis’s picture of reality. Lewis himself is quite explicit about this influence:

The picture is inspired by classical physics. Humean Supervenience doesn’t actually say that physics is right about what local qualities there are, but that’s the case to keep in mind. But if we keep physics in mind, we’d better remember that physics isn’t really classical. …The point of defending Humean Supervenience is not to support reactionary physics, but rather to resist philosophical arguments that there are more things in heaven and earth than physics has dreamt of. (1994, p. 474)

But there is a less acknowledged influence of first-order predicate logic—an influence that is not entirely salutary. It is undoubtedly tempting, for philosophers steeped in the use of first-order logic as a clarifying tool, to assume that the proper representation of the ultimate structure of reality must be by means of some (interpreted) first-order language—a language whose various predicates could be taken to express the various fundamental properties and relations that characterize reality at its most basic level. But if we look to physics instead—as we surely ought to—we find that the basic representational tools are variables, that correspond to physical magnitudes. Taking seriously the picture of fundamental ontology suggested by these representations turns out to matter quite a bit: in particular, there are reasons to think that none of the first three theses about natural properties and relations—that they are minimal, non-modal, and intrinsic—is tenable without some modification. This issue—which we will mostly pass over in what follows, except where it matters—is explored in more detail in the supplementary document on

Physical Magnitudes

The second significant source of concern about Lewis’s conception of fundamental ontology is the role—or rather lack thereof—that modal notions have in it. This concern has two aspects. First, one might hold that some, at least, of the fundamental properties and relations that characterize reality have modal aspects that are ontologically basic. Consider mass: one might hold that it is metaphysically impossible for there to be a world containing just two massive particles, accelerating away from each other—and that this impossibility somehow flows from the nature of mass itself.

Second, one might hold that it is one thing to state a thesis concerning what the fundamental structure of reality in fact happens to be; but that it is another, separate matter to state how reality could be. Indeed, most metaphysicians, I suspect, take it to be just blindingly obvious that these are conceptually distinct tasks. Granted that one’s views on what there is, and what it is like, will have ramifications for one’s views on what there could be and what it could be like (most obviously, because things could be the way they are; but there may be more interesting and subtle connections as well); still, the project of laying out the former views does not automatically complete the project of laying out the latter.

Of course there is a sense in which Lewis agrees: he takes it as obvious, after all, that he must supply an account of modality. But the strikingly reductionist character of that account shows that such agreement as there is is mighty thin.

8. Counterpart theory

So far, this entry focused on the general shape of Lewis’s metaphysics. In this section, we turn to one of Lewis’s more specific metaphysical doctrines: counterpart theory. We will begin with an overview of the theory, review its motivation, some applications, and then turn to criticism and objections. In a supplementary document, we review Counterpart-theoretic Semantics for Quantified Modal Logic.

Counterpart theory was originally introduced in Lewis (1968) as a formal theory about possible worlds and their inhabitants, but the label quickly came to be used for a loosely defined approach towards trans-world identity and the interpretation of modal or temporal discourse. For the modal case, the central idea is that a de re modal claim like ‘Joe Biden might be immaterial’ is understood as saying that at some possible world, someone who sufficiently resembles Joe Biden in certain respects—a counterpart of Biden—is immaterial. Accordingly, ‘Biden is necessarily material’ is understood as saying that all of Biden’s counterparts at all worlds are material.

While counterpart theory was Lewis’s invention, it was also a product of its time, the 1960’s, when quantified modal logic was “in the air” and questions about essentialism and the so-called problem of transworld identity gained attention (e.g. Quine 1953, Hintikka 1962).[7] The counterpart-theoretic approach does, however, bear a striking similarity to certain views of Leibniz concerning essential and accidental properties.[8] (See Mondadori (1973) for a counterpart-theoretic interpretation of Leibniz.)

8.1 Motivation and applications

Lewis assumed that modal statements in ordinary language can be analysed in terms of quantification over possible worlds and individuals: ‘it is possible that there are talking donkeys’ is analysed as ‘there are possible worlds at which there are talking donkeys’. Lewis’s modal realism promises to turn this into a reductive analysis of modality. Statements about what is or is not the case at some possible world are ultimately reduced to non-modal statements. That there is a world with talking donkeys, for example, means that there is a spatiotemporally isolated aggregate of things that has a genuine talking donkey as part.

A problem now arises for de re statements about what is possible or necessary for a particular individual. Since Joe Biden might have had three arms, there should be a world where he has three arms. But if Biden were part of another world, then that world and our world would have a part in common. Lewis denies that different worlds can share parts. Even if we allowed for overlapping worlds, it is hard to see how the other world could have a three-armed Biden as a part, given that this part is also part of our world, where Biden has two arms (compare Lewis 1986e, 199ff.). So ‘Biden might have had three arms’ is not analysed as stating that there is a world which contains a three-armed Biden as part. Rather, it says that there is a world that contains a three-armed representative or counterpart of Joe Biden.

What makes one object a counterpart of another? According to Lewis, this is a matter of qualitative similarity in certain respects: a counterpart of Biden is an individual that sufficiently resembles the actual Biden in relevant respects, and more so than any other object in its world. Sometimes Lewis drops the second clause (e.g. Lewis 1968, 114–115), and at one point he merely suggests (without explanation) that counterparthood “usually involve[s] similarity” (Lewis 1986e, 8).

The relevant respects of resemblance need not match intuitive judgements of overall similarity (Lewis 1986e, 254f.), and they can be highly extrinsic. For example, they might give high weight to someone’s origin (Lewis 1986e, 244f. and 252), or to a causal connection to an epistemic subject (Lewis 1983e).

Lewis does not think there is a once-and-for all correct answer to which respects of resemblance are relevant. He rejects the idea that things have primitive essences which somehow determine or constrain what is possible for them. Rather, it is ultimately up to us which respects of similarity we prioritize. Often this choice is not fully settled, leaving the counterpart relation vague and context-sensitive (see Lewis 1971, 209–11; Lewis 1973b, 41; Lewis 1983d, 42–3; Lewis 1986e, 251–5; Lewis 2003, 27–8).

For example, Lewis suggests that when we talk about people, we often require the counterparts to have a very similar origin, while allowing for different careers and lifespan. In such a context, we might judge that Biden might have died as an infant. In other contexts, however, we may wonder what would have been the case if Biden had been born to different parents, relaxing the requirement of similar origin (see e.g., Lewis 1973b, 41).

Since the counterpart relation is determined by similarity, everything is its own counterpart. Other than that, Lewis imposes few general restrictions on the counterpart relation. In Lewis (1968), he suggests that nothing can be a counterpart of a different object in the same world, but this assumption is later dropped (Lewis 1986e, 232, fn.22). Unlike strict trans-world identity, counterparthood is not assumed to be transitive, symmetric, or functional. An object can have multiple counterparts at a world, and different objects can have a common counterpart.

Lewis delivered counterpart theory as part of his modal realism, but the core idea can be separated from this background, and even from the assumption of world-bound agents. (See e.g. Stalnaker 1986, Heller 1998, Sider 2002, Wang 2015, Woodward 2017; also Lewis 1986e, 237f. and 259f.) Many philosophers who reject modal realism have come to appreciate counterpart theory because of its explanatory and puzzle-solving power. We will give a few examples.

First, counterpart theory promises to explain the widespread elusiveness and context-dependence of essentialist judgements (Lewis 1983d, 42–3; Lewis 1986e, §4.5; cf. Kaplan 1979, 100–2). Could London have been located in Scotland? Could it have been founded in the 16th century? The answers aren’t obvious. For Lewis, this is not because we have imperfect access to London’s true essence, but simply because we have not settled exactly which other-worldly cities should qualify as counterparts of London. A London counterpart is a city that sufficiently resembles London, but the relevant resemblance criteria are often vague and context-dependent.

Second, counterpart theory might offer an answer to certain puzzles about identity. Is a statue identical to the piece of clay from which it is formed? Is a person identical to their body? Lewis says yes. However, intuitively persons and bodies, or statues and pieces of clay, seem to differ in their modal properties: the piece of clay could survive squashing, the statue could not. According to Lewis, the explanation is that when we refer to an object as a statue, we give more weight to similarity with respect to shape than when we think of the same object as a piece of clay (see Lewis 1971; Lewis 1986e, 252ff.; Lewis 2003, 27–8; and Robinson 1982).

In this context, Lewis suggests that different ways of referring to an object can “evoke” different similarity standards, and thereby different counterpart relations, even within a single context (cf. Lewis 1986e, 258ff; Lewis 2003). This idea also helps to make sense of conditionals like ’If I were you, I’d hate me’, where ‘I’ and ‘me’ in the consequent intuitively pick out different individuals in the imagined person-swapping scenario, both of which somehow represent the speaker (see Lewis 1973b, 43; Kocurek 2018).

Third, counterpart theory might offer an answer to puzzles involving possible fission or time-travel. These might be analysed as scenarios in which an individual has multiple counterparts relative to the same counterpart relation. Lewis intuits that he “might have been twins” (Lewis 1973, 40–1), because the fetus from which he developed might have undergone fission. (See also Schwarz 2014, Karmo 1983.)

Fourth, counterpart theory offers a way to accept haecceitistic intuitions without subscribing to haecceitism. Lewis assumes that all truths supervene on qualitative truths: no two worlds agree in all qualitative respects, while disagreeing with respect to who plays which roles. A world of two-way eternal recurrence might look like a counterexample: intuitively, we could have lived in any of the epochs of such a world; these seem to be distinct possibilities, but they do not correspond to any qualitative difference. Lewis suggests that the different epochs really do represent different possibilities for us, because we have counterparts in each of them. Here, too, Lewis invokes multiple counterparthood relative to the same counterpart relation. (See Lewis 1986e, 230–5.)

Fifth, the fact that the counterpart relation need not be an equivalence relation has also been used to diffuse certain puzzles. Consider an ordinary bicycle. Intuitively, such an object does not have all its parts essentially: the bike could have had a different chain, for instance. On the other hand, arguably it could not have been composed of entirely different parts. A bike made of entirely different parts would have been a different bike. But this creates a puzzle (see Chisholm 1967, Chandler 1976): if the bike had a different chain, it would still be an ordinary bike that does not have all its parts essentially; it could have had a different saddle (say). Iterating this line of thought, we can create a sequence that leads from the actual bike to a bike composed of entirely different parts. Each possible bike in the sequence could have been the next bike in the sequence. But didn’t we say that it is impossible that my bike is composed of entirely different parts? Counterpart theory offers a natural answer: a counterpart of a counterpart need not be a counterpart (see Lewis 1968, 28f; Lewis 1986e, 243–6; Ramachandran 2020).

So far, we have focused on metaphysical modality. The central idea of counterpart theory has also been applied to other intensional constructions.

For example, Sider (1996, 2001) and Hawley (2001) argue for a temporal application, on which ‘Joe Biden won the election’ is analysed as saying that a past counterpart of Biden won the election. The temporal counterpart relation is here assumed to relate short-lived temporal “stages” (see Schwarz 2014 for an alternative), and is not a matter of qualitative similarity. As in the modal case, this approach has been advertised as solving a range of puzzles, as well as explaining the vagueness and context-dependence of temporal judgements. Williams (2008) considers adopting the same perspective on identity across space.

Several authors (including Lewis) have suggested applying counterpart theory to epistemic modality. Consider the following puzzle from Ninan (2018). A lottery has only two tickets, one blue and one red. The tickets are numbered 1 and 2, but we don’t know which color goes with which number. We know that the blue ticket won, but we don’t know the number of the winning ticket. So, ticket 1 might be the winner, and likewise for ticket 2. Yet even though one of them is the red ticket it doesn’t seem to follow that the red ticket is such that it might be the winner. Ninan suggests that differing counterpart relations are evoked by different ways of picking out the tickets. (See also Lewis 1983e, Stalnaker 1986, Shaw 2015, Rabern 2018, among others.)

An alternative to counterpart theory is to interpret terms for ordinary individuals as denoting (partial) functions from worlds to individuals, or aggregates of individuals at different worlds; a modal predication like ‘Biden might have been three-armed’ is then interpreted as saying that the function assigned to ‘Biden’ has a three-armed value for some world, or that the aggregate assigned to ‘Biden’ has a three-armed part located in some world. A temporal analogue of this view (with aggregates) is Lewis’s preferred account of temporal discourse. In Lewis (1986f, 244) he endorses a similar view for events—but see Bernstein (2014), Kaiserman (2017), and McDonnell (2016) for reasons to prefer a counterpart-theoretic treatment.[9]

The counterpart-theoretic analysis is more flexible insofar as it easily allows for cases of multiple counterparts or asymmetric counterparthood, which are difficult to model with trans-world aggregates. Lewis argues that this added flexibility is more important in the modal case than in the temporal case (Lewis 1971, 209; Lewis 1983d, 40–2; Lewis 1986e, 217–20).

8.2 Reactions and criticisms

Some early criticisms of counterpart theory seem to rest on misunderstandings. For example, Plantinga (1974, 115f.) and Salmon (1981, 232–38) complain that according to Lewis, all things have all their properties essentially, since there is no world in which these very things exist and have different properties. Kripke (1980) similarly complains that according to Lewis, when we say that Humphrey might have won the election, we are “not talking about something that might have happened to Humphrey, but to someone else” (45, fn. 13). In response, Lewis points out that on his view it is indeed Humphrey himself who might have won, in virtue of having a winning counterpart, cf. Lewis (1986e, 194–6, 246; 1983d, 41–2). Properly understood, Lewis’s analysis does not even deny that there are worlds at which Humphrey (himself) won the election. What the analysis denies is only that there are other worlds that contain Humphrey himself as a (winning) part. (See also Hazen 1979, 320–4.)

One possible limitation of Lewis’s account is that his counterpart relation is assumed to be a qualitative similarity relation. Feldman (1971) points out that “I could have been quite unlike what I in fact am” is intuitively true, which seems to require having non-similar counterparts. Lewis responds that there are two similarity relations involved: at the relevant worlds, there is someone who is similar to me in some respect (perhaps with respect to origin), but dissimilar from me in other respects (see Lewis 1983d, 43; Lewis 1986e, 230–235). Heller (2005), Stalnaker (1986), and Fara (2009) offer further considerations against analysing counterparthood in terms of qualitative similarity.

Another limitation of Lewis’s original presentation is that it does not allow imposing constraints on the choice of counterparts for different individuals. Suppose we hold that Elizabeth II is essentially the daughter of George VI, and suppose there are worlds at which both Elizabeth and George have multiple counterparts, perhaps in different epochs of eternally recurring time. Some Elizabeth counterpart will then not be the daughter of some George counterpart. By Lewis’s 1968 account, ‘Elizabeth might not have been George’s daughter’ then comes out true, contrary to our supposition. This problem was raised in Hazen (1979). Hazen suggests a revised analysis in terms of sets of counterpart functions. Lewis (1983d, 44–5) instead suggests that we should understand ‘Elizabeth might not have been George’s daughter’ as a de re claim about the pair (or fusion) of Elizabeth and George. Hazen (2012) argues that neither proposal fully avoids the problem.

The most common objection to counterpart theory is probably that it gives rise to a deviant and counter-intuitive modal logic. Lewis (1968) gives translation rules from the language of quantified modal logic to an extensional first-order language. These translation rules invalidate the “necessity of identity” and the “necessity of distinctness”, as well as familiar principles of modal logic such □(A ∧ B) → □A. Conversely, they do validate controversial principles such as the Converse Barcan Formula and the “necessity of existence”. It has also been argued that the rules can’t be extended to a language with a well-behaved ‘actually’ operator.

Whether these are genuine problems is a matter of debate. In fact, authors in mathematical logic have come to appreciate counterpart-theoretic interpretations of modal logic as overcoming certain problems of standard Kripke semantics. There are also ways of reformulating Lewis’s translation rules so as to avoid the supposedly problematic features. See the supplementary document:

Counterpart-theoretic Semantics for Quantified Modal Logic

for further details.

Lewis himself had no interest in preserving traditional principles of modal logic. He always remained skeptical about the prospects of formalising modal discourse with boxes and diamonds. (see e.g. Lewis 1983d, 45; Lewis 1986e, 12–13). He thus rejected the presupposition in these objections, that “the language of boxes and diamonds affords a good regimentation of ordinary modal thought” (Lewis 1986e, 12).


Primary Literature: Works by David Lewis

  • 1966, “An Argument for the Identity Theory”, Journal of Philosophy, 63: 17–25; reprinted with additional material in Lewis 1983a: 99–107.
  • 1968, “Counterpart Theory and Quantified Modal Logic”, Journal of Philosophy, 65: 113–126; reprinted in Lewis 1983a: 26–39.
  • 1970, “How to Define Theoretical Terms”, Journal of Philosophy, 67: 427–446; reprinted in Lewis 1983a: 78–95.
  • 1970 (with Stephanie Lewis), “Holes”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 48: 206–212; reprinted in Lewis 1983a: 3–9.
  • 1971, “Counterparts of Persons and Their Bodies”, Journal of Philosophy, 68: 203–11; reprinted in Lewis 1983a: 47–54.
  • 1973a, “Causation”, Journal of Philosophy, 70: 556–67; reprinted in Lewis 1986a: 159–172.
  • 1973b, Counterfactuals, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • 1979a, “Counterfactual Dependence and Time’s Arrow”, Noûs, 13: 455–476; reprinted with Postscripts in Lewis 1986a: 32–66.
  • 1979b, “Scorekeeping in a Language Game”, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8: 339–359; reprinted in Lewis 1983a: 233–249.
  • 1980, “A Subjectivist’s Guide to Objective Chance”, in Lewis 1986a: 83–113.
  • 1983a, Philosophical Papers, Volume I, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1983b, “New Work for a Theory of Universals”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 61: 343–377; reprinted in Lewis 1999: 8–55.
  • 1983c, “Extrinsic properties”, Philosophical Studies, 44: 197–200; reprinted in Lewis 1999: 111–115.
  • 1983d, “Postscripts to ‘Counterpart Theory and Quantified Modal Logic’” in Lewis 1983a: 39–46.
  • 1983e, “Individuation by Acquaintance and by Stipulation”, The Philosophical Review, 92: 3–32.
  • 1984, “Putnam’s paradox”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 62: 221–236; reprinted in Lewis 1999.
  • 1986a, Philosophical Papers, Volume II, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1986b, “Postscripts to ‘Causation’”, in Lewis 1986a: 172–213.
  • 1986c, “Causal Explanation”, in Lewis 1986a: 214–240.
  • 1986d, “Events”, in Lewis 1986a: 241–269.
  • 1986e, On the Plurality of Worlds, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • 1986f, “Against Structural Universals”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 64: 25–46; reprinted in Lewis 1999.
  • 1988, “Rearrangement of particles: Reply to Lowe”, Analysis, 48: 65–72; reprinted in Lewis 1999.
  • 1991, Parts of Classes, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • 1993, “Many, but Almost One”, in Bacon, Campbell, and Reinhardt 1993: 23–38; reprinted in Lewis 1999: 164–182.
  • 1994, “Humean Supervenience Debugged”, Mind, 103: 473–90.
  • 1997, “Finkish Dispositions”, Philosophical Quarterly, 47: 143–158; reprinted in Lewis 1999: 133–151.
  • 1998, Papers in Philosophical Logic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • 1999, Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • 2001, “Truthmaking and Difference-Making”, Noûs, 35: 602–615.
  • 2003, “Things Qua Truthmakers”, Real Metaphysics: Essays in Honour of DH Mellor, 25–42.
  • 2009, “Ramseyan Humility”, in Conceptual Analysis and Philosophical Naturalism, edited by D. Braddon-Mitchell and R. Nola, 203–22, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.

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Other Internet Resources


Many thanks to Phillip Bricker for extraordinarily acute and helpful comments on an earlier draft of this entry. Also, for his valuable help on the supplement on fundamental entities.

Copyright © 2021 by
Ned Hall <ehall@fas.harvard.edu>
Brian Rabern <brian.rabern@gmail.com>
Wolfgang Schwarz <wo@umsu.de>

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