Locke’s Political Philosophy
John Locke (1632–1704) is among the most influential political philosophers of the modern period. In the Two Treatises of Government, he defended the claim that men are by nature free and equal against claims that God had made all people naturally subject to a monarch. He argued that people have rights, such as the right to life, liberty, and property, that have a foundation independent of the laws of any particular society. Locke used the claim that men are naturally free and equal as part of the justification for understanding legitimate political government as the result of a social contract where people in the state of nature conditionally transfer some of their rights to the government in order to better ensure the stable, comfortable enjoyment of their lives, liberty, and property. Since governments exist by the consent of the people in order to protect the rights of the people and promote the public good, governments that fail to do so can be resisted and replaced with new governments. Locke is thus also important for his defense of the right of revolution. Locke also defends the principle of majority rule and the separation of legislative and executive powers. In the Letter Concerning Toleration, Locke denied that coercion should be used to bring people to (what the ruler believes is) the true religion and also denied that churches should have any coercive power over their members. Locke elaborated on these themes in his later political writings, such as the Second Letter on Toleration and Third Letter on Toleration.
For a more general introduction to Locke’s history and background, the argument of the Two Treatises, and the Letter Concerning Toleration, see Section 1, Section 4, and Section 5, respectively, of the main entry on John Locke in this encyclopedia. The present entry focuses on seven central concepts in Locke’s political philosophy.
- 1. Natural Law and Natural Right
- 2. State of Nature
- 3. Property
- 4. Consent, Political Obligation, and the Ends of Government
- 5. Locke and Punishment
- 6. Separation of Powers and the Dissolution of Government
- 7. Toleration
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- Related Entries
Perhaps the most central concept in Locke’s political philosophy is his theory of natural law and natural rights. The natural law concept existed long before Locke as a way of expressing the idea that there were certain moral truths that applied to all people, regardless of the particular place where they lived or the agreements they had made. The most important early contrast was between laws that were by nature, and thus generally applicable, and those that were conventional and operated only in those places where the particular convention had been established. This distinction is sometimes formulated as the difference between natural law and positive law.
Natural law is also distinct from divine law in that the latter, in the Christian tradition, normally referred to those laws that God had directly revealed through prophets and other inspired writers. Natural law can be discovered by reason alone and applies to all people, while divine law can be discovered only through God’s special revelation and applies only to those to whom it is revealed and who God specifically indicates are to be bound. Thus some seventeenth-century commentators, Locke included, held that not all of the 10 commandments, much less the rest of the Old Testament law, were binding on all people. The 10 commandments begin “Hear O Israel” and thus are only binding on the people to whom they were addressed (Works 6:37). As we will see below, even though Locke thought natural law could be known apart from special revelation, he saw no contradiction in God playing a part in the argument, so long as the relevant aspects of God’s character could be discovered by reason alone. In Locke’s theory, divine law and natural law are consistent and can overlap in content, but they are not coextensive. Thus there is no problem for Locke if the Bible commands a moral code that is stricter than the one that can be derived from natural law, but there is a real problem if the Bible teaches what is contrary to natural law. In practice, Locke avoided this problem because consistency with natural law was one of the criteria he used when deciding the proper interpretation of Biblical passages.
In the century before Locke, the language of natural rights also gained prominence through the writings of such thinkers as Grotius, Hobbes, and Pufendorf. Whereas natural law emphasized duties, natural rights normally emphasized privileges or claims to which an individual was entitled. There is considerable disagreement as to how these factors are to be understood in relation to each other in Locke’s theory. Leo Strauss, and many of his followers, take rights to be paramount, going so far as to portray Locke’s position as essentially similar to that of Hobbes. They point out that Locke defended a hedonist theory of human motivation (Essay 2.20) and claim that he must agree with Hobbes about the essentially self-interested nature of human beings. Locke, they claim, recognizes natural law obligations only in those situations where our own preservation is not in conflict, further emphasizing that our right to preserve ourselves trumps any duties we may have.
On the other end of the spectrum, more scholars have adopted the view of Dunn, Tully, and Ashcraft that it is natural law, not natural rights, that is primary. They hold that when Locke emphasized the right to life, liberty, and property he was primarily making a point about the duties we have toward other people: duties not to kill, enslave, or steal. Most scholars also argue that Locke recognized a general duty to assist with the preservation of mankind, including a duty of charity to those who have no other way to procure their subsistence (Two Treatises 1.42). These scholars regard duties as primary in Locke because rights exist to ensure that we are able to fulfill our duties. Simmons takes a position similar to the latter group, but claims that rights are not just the flip side of duties in Locke, nor merely a means to performing our duties. Instead, rights and duties are equally fundamental because Locke believes in a “robust zone of indifference” in which rights protect our ability to make choices. While these choices cannot violate natural law, they are not a mere means to fulfilling natural law either. Brian Tienrey questions whether one needs to prioritize natural law or natural right since both typically function as corollaries. He argues that modern natural rights theories are a development from medieval conceptions of natural law that included permissions to act or not act in certain ways.
There have been some attempts to find a compromise between these positions. Michael Zuckert’s version of the Straussian position acknowledges more differences between Hobbes and Locke. Zuckert still questions the sincerity of Locke’s theism, but thinks that Locke does develop a position that grounds property rights in the fact that human beings own themselves, something Hobbes denied. Adam Seagrave has gone a step further. He argues that the contradiction between Locke’s claim that human beings are owned by God and that human beings own themselves is only apparent. Based on passages from Locke’s other writings (especially the Essay Concnerning Human Understanding) In the passages about divine ownership, Locke is speaking about humanity as a whole, while in the passages about self-ownership he is taking about individual human beings with the capacity for property ownership. God created human beings who are capable of having property rights with respect to one another on the basis of owning their labor. Both of them emphasize differences between Locke’s use of natural rights and the earlier tradition of natural law.
Another point of contestation has to do with the extent to which Locke thought natural law could, in fact, be known by reason. Both Strauss and Peter Laslett, though very different in their interpretations of Locke generally, see Locke’s theory of natural law as filled with contradictions. In the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke defends a theory of moral knowledge that negates the possibility of innate ideas (Essay Book 1) and claims that morality is capable of demonstration in the same way that Mathematics is (Essay 3.11.16, 4.3.18–20). Yet nowhere in any of his works does Locke make a full deduction of natural law from first premises. More than that, Locke at times seems to appeal to innate ideas in the Second Treatise (2.11), and in The Reasonableness of Christianity (Works 7:139) he admits that no one has ever worked out all of natural law from reason alone. Strauss infers from this that the contradictions exist to show the attentive reader that Locke does not really believe in natural law at all. Laslett, more conservatively, simply says that Locke the philosopher and Locke the political writer should be kept very separate.
Many scholars reject this position. Yolton, Colman, Ashcraft, Grant, Simmons, Tuckness and others all argue that there is nothing strictly inconsistent in Locke’s admission in The Reasonableness of Christianity. That no one has deduced all of natural law from first principles does not mean that none of it has been deduced. The supposedly contradictory passages in the Two Treatises are far from decisive. While it is true that Locke does not provide a deduction in the Essay, it is not clear that he was trying to. Section 4.10.1–19 of that work seems more concerned to show how reasoning with moral terms is possible, not to actually provide a full account of natural law. Nonetheless, it must be admitted that Locke did not treat the topic of natural law as systematically as one might like. Attempts to work out his theory in more detail with respect to its ground and its content must try to reconstruct it from scattered passages in many different texts.
To understand Locke’s position on the ground of natural law it must be situated within a larger debate in natural law theory that predates Locke, the so-called “voluntarism-intellectualism,” or “voluntarist-rationalist” debate. At its simplest, the voluntarist declares that right and wrong are determined by God’s will and that we are obliged to obey the will of God simply because it is the will of God. Unless these positions are maintained, the voluntarist argues, God becomes superfluous to morality since both the content and the binding force of morality can be explained without reference to God. The intellectualist replies that this understanding makes morality arbitrary and fails to explain why we have an obligation to obey God.
With respect to the grounds and content of natural law, Locke is not completely clear. On the one hand, there are many instances where he makes statements that sound voluntarist to the effect that law requires a law giver with authority (Essay 1.3.6, 4.10.7). Locke also repeatedly insists in the Essays on the Law of Nature that created beings have an obligation to obey their creator (ELN 6). On the other hand there are statements that seem to imply an external moral standard to which God must conform (Two Treatises 2.195; Works 7:6). Locke clearly wants to avoid the implication that the content of natural law is arbitrary. Several solutions have been proposed. One solution suggested by Herzog makes Locke an intellectualist by grounding our obligation to obey God on a prior duty of gratitude that exists independent of God. A second option, suggested by Simmons, is simply to take Locke as a voluntarist since that is where the preponderance of his statements point. A third option, suggested by Tuckness (and implied by Grant), is to treat the question of voluntarism as having two different parts, grounds and content. On this view, Locke was indeed a voluntarist with respect to the question “why should we obey the law of nature?” Locke thought that reason, apart from the will of a superior, could only be advisory. With respect to content, divine reason and human reason must be sufficiently analogous that human beings can reason about what God likely wills. Locke takes it for granted that since God created us with reason in order to follow God’s will, human reason and divine reason are sufficiently similar that natural law will not seem arbitrary to us.
Those interested in the contemporary relevance of Locke’s political theory must confront its theological aspects. Straussians make Locke’s theory relevant by claiming that the theological dimensions of his thought are primarily rhetorical; they are “cover” to keep him from being persecuted by the religious authorities of his day. Others, such as Dunn, take Locke to be of only limited relevance to contemporary politics precisely because so many of his arguments depend on religious assumptions that are no longer widely shared. More recently a number of authors, such as Simmons and Vernon, have tried to separate the foundations of Locke’s argument from other aspects of it. Simmons, for example, argues that Locke’s thought is over-determined, containing both religious and secular arguments. He claims that for Locke the fundamental law of nature is that “as much as possible mankind is to be preserved” (Two Treatises 135). At times, he claims, Locke presents this principle in rule-consequentialist terms: it is the principle we use to determine the more specific rights and duties that all have. At other times, Locke hints at a more Kantian justification that emphasizes the impropriety of treating our equals as if they were mere means to our ends. Waldron, in his most recent work on Locke, explores the opposite claim: that Locke’s theology actually provides a more solid basis for his premise of political equality than do contemporary secular approaches that tend to simply assert equality.
With respect to the specific content of natural law, Locke never provides a comprehensive statement of what it requires. In the Two Treatises, Locke frequently states that the fundamental law of nature is that as much as possible mankind is to be preserved. Simmons argues that in Two Treatises 2.6 Locke presents 1) a duty to preserve one’s self, 2) a duty to preserve others when self-preservation does not conflict, 3) a duty not to take away the life of another, and 4) a duty not to act in a way that “tends to destroy” others. Libertarian interpreters of Locke tend to downplay duties of type 1 and 2. Locke presents a more extensive list in his earlier, and unpublished in his lifetime, Essays on the Law of Nature. Interestingly, Locke here includes praise and honor of the deity as required by natural law as well as what we might call good character qualities.
Locke’s concept of the state of nature has been interpreted by commentators in a variety of ways. At first glance it seems quite simple. Locke writes “want [lack] of a common judge, with authority, puts all persons in a state of nature” and again, “Men living according to reason, without a common superior on earth, to judge between them, is properly the state of nature.” (Two Treatises 2.19) Many commentators have taken this as Locke’s definition, concluding that the state of nature exists wherever there is no legitimate political authority able to judge disputes and where people live according to the law of reason. On this account the state of nature is distinct from political society, where a legitimate government exists, and from a state of war where men fail to abide by the law of reason.
Simmons presents an important challenge to this view. Simmons points out that the above statement is worded as a sufficient rather than necessary condition. Two individuals might be able, in the state of nature, to authorize a third to settle disputes between them without leaving the state of nature, since the third party would not have, for example, the power to legislate for the public good. Simmons also claims that other interpretations often fail to account for the fact that there are some people who live in states with legitimate governments who are nonetheless in the state of nature: visiting aliens (2.9), children below the age of majority (2.15, 118), and those with a “defect” of reason (2.60). He claims that the state of nature is a relational concept describing a particular set of moral relations that exist between particular people, rather than a description of a particular geographical territory. The state of nature is just the way of describing the moral rights and responsibilities that exist between people who have not consented to the adjudication of their disputes by the same legitimate government. The groups just mentioned either have not or cannot give consent, so they remain in the state of nature. Thus A may be in the state of nature with respect to B, but not with C.
Simmons’ account stands in sharp contrast to that of Strauss. According to Strauss, Locke presents the state of nature as a factual description of what the earliest society is like, an account that when read closely reveals Locke’s departure from Christian teachings. State of nature theories, he and his followers argue, are contrary to the Biblical account in Genesis and evidence that Locke’s teaching is similar to that of Hobbes. As noted above, on the Straussian account Locke’s apparently Christian statements are only a façade designed to conceal his essentially anti-Christian views. According to Simmons, since the state of nature is a moral account, it is compatible with a wide variety of social accounts without contradiction. If we know only that a group of people are in a state of nature, we know only the rights and responsibilities they have toward one another; we know nothing about whether they are rich or poor, peaceful or warlike.
A complementary interpretation is made by John Dunn with respect to the relationship between Locke’s state of nature and his Christian beliefs. Dunn claimed that Locke’s state of nature is less an exercise in historical anthropology than a theological reflection on the condition of man. On Dunn’s interpretation, Locke’s state of nature thinking is an expression of his theological position, that man exists in a world created by God for God’s purposes but that governments are created by men in order to further those purposes.
Locke’s theory of the state of nature will thus be tied closely to his theory of natural law, since the latter defines the rights of persons and their status as free and equal persons. The stronger the grounds for accepting Locke’s characterization of people as free, equal, and independent, the more helpful the state of nature becomes as a device for representing people. Still, it is important to remember that none of these interpretations claims that Locke’s state of nature is only a thought experiment, in the way Kant and Rawls are normally thought to use the concept. Locke did not respond to the argument “where have there ever been people in such a state” by saying it did not matter since it was only a thought experiment. Instead, he argued that there are and have been people in the state of nature. (Two Treatises 2.14) It seems important to him that at least some governments have actually been formed in the way he suggests. How much it matters whether they have been or not will be discussed below under the topic of consent, since the central question is whether a good government can be legitimate even if it does not have the actual consent of the people who live under it; hypothetical contract and actual contract theories will tend to answer this question differently.
Locke’s treatment of property is generally thought to be among his most important contributions in political thought, but it is also one of the aspects of his thought that has been most heavily criticized. There are important debates over what exactly Locke was trying to accomplish with his theory. One interpretation, advanced by C.B. Macpherson, sees Locke as a defender of unrestricted capitalist accumulation. On Macpherson’s interpretation, Locke is thought to have set three restrictions on the accumulation of property in the state of nature: 1) one may only appropriate as much as one can use before it spoils (Two Treatises 2.31), 2) one must leave “enough and as good” for others (the sufficiency restriction) (2.27), and 3) one may (supposedly) only appropriate property through one’s own labor (2.27). Macpherson claims that as the argument progresses, each of these restrictions is transcended. The spoilage restriction ceases to be a meaningful restriction with the invention of money because value can be stored in a medium that does not decay (2.46–47). The sufficiency restriction is transcended because the creation of private property so increases productivity that even those who no longer have the opportunity to acquire land will have more opportunity to acquire what is necessary for life (2.37). According to Macpherson’s view, the “enough and as good” requirement is itself merely a derivative of a prior principle guaranteeing the opportunity to acquire, through labor, the necessities of life. The third restriction, Macpherson argues, was not one Locke actually held at all. Though Locke appears to suggest that one can only have property in what one has personally labored on when he makes labor the source of property rights, Locke clearly recognized that even in the state of nature, “the Turfs my Servant has cut” (2.28) can become my property. Locke, according to Macpherson, thus clearly recognized that labor can be alienated. As one would guess, Macpherson is critical of the “possessive individualism” that Locke’s theory of property represents. He argues that its coherence depends upon the assumption of differential rationality between capitalists and wage-laborers and on the division of society into distinct classes. Because Locke was bound by these constraints, we are to understand him as including only property owners as voting members of society.
Macpherson’s understanding of Locke has been criticized from several different directions. Alan Ryan argued that since property for Locke includes life and liberty as well as estate (Two Treatises 2.87), even those without land could still be members of political society. The dispute between the two would then turn on whether Locke was using property in the more expansive sense in some of the crucial passages. James Tully attacked Macpherson’s interpretation by pointing out that the First Treatise specifically includes a duty of charity toward those who have no other means of subsistence (1.42). While this duty is consistent with requiring the poor to work for low wages, it does undermine the claim that those who have wealth have no social duties to others.
Tully also argued for a fundamental reinterpretation of Locke’s theory. Previous accounts had focused on the claim that since persons own their own labor, when they mix their labor with that which is unowned it becomes their property. Robert Nozick criticized this argument with his famous example of mixing tomato juice one rightfully owns with the sea. When we mix what we own with what we do not, why should we think we gain property instead of losing it? On Tully’s account, focus on the mixing metaphor misses Locke’s emphasis on what he calls the “workmanship model.” Locke believed that makers have property rights with respect to what they make just as God has property rights with respect to human beings because he is their maker. Human beings are created in the image of God and share with God, though to a much lesser extent, the ability to shape and mold the physical environment in accordance with a rational pattern or plan. Waldron has criticized this interpretation on the grounds that it would make the rights of human makers absolute in the same way that God’s right over his creation is absolute. Sreenivasan has defended Tully’s argument against Waldron’s response by claiming a distinction between creating and making. Only creating generates an absolute property right, and only God can create, but making is analogous to creating and creates an analogous, though weaker, right.
Another controversial aspect of Tully’s interpretation of Locke is his interpretation of the sufficiency condition and its implications. On his analysis, the sufficiency argument is crucial for Locke’s argument to be plausible. Since Locke begins with the assumption that the world is owned by all, individual property is only justified if it can be shown that no one is made worse off by the appropriation. In conditions where the good taken is not scarce, where there is much water or land available, an individual’s taking some portion of it does no harm to others. Where this condition is not met, those who are denied access to the good do have a legitimate objection to appropriation. According to Tully, Locke realized that as soon as land became scarce, previous rights acquired by labor no longer held since “enough and as good” was no longer available for others. Once land became scarce, property could only be legitimated by the creation of political society.
Waldron claims that, contrary to Macpherson, Tully, and others, Locke did not recognize a sufficiency condition at all. He notes that, strictly speaking, Locke makes sufficiency a sufficient rather than necessary condition when he says that labor generates a title to property “at least where there is enough, and as good left in common for others” (Two Treatises 2.27). Waldron takes Locke to be making a descriptive statement, not a normative one, about the condition that happens to have initially existed. Waldron also argues that in the text “enough and as good” is not presented as a restriction and is not grouped with other restrictions. Waldron thinks that the condition would lead Locke to the absurd conclusion that in circumstances of scarcity everyone must starve to death since no one would be able to obtain universal consent and any appropriation would make others worse off.
One of the strongest defenses of Tully’s position is presented by Sreenivasan. He argues that Locke’s repetitious use of “enough and as good” indicates that the phrase is doing some real work in the argument. In particular, it is the only way Locke can be thought to have provided some solution to the fact that the consent of all is needed to justify appropriation in the state of nature. If others are not harmed, they have no grounds to object and can be thought to consent, whereas if they are harmed, it is implausible to think of them as consenting. Sreenivasan does depart from Tully in some important respects. He takes “enough and as good” to mean “enough and as good opportunity for securing one’s preservation,” not “enough and as good of the same commodity (such as land).” This has the advantage of making Locke’s account of property less radical since it does not claim that Locke thought the point of his theory was to show that all original property rights were invalid at the point where political communities were created. The disadvantage of this interpretation, as Sreenivasan admits, is that it saddles Locke with a flawed argument. Those who merely have the opportunity to labor for others at subsistence wages no longer have the liberty that individuals had before scarcity to benefit from the full surplus of value they create. Moreover poor laborers no longer enjoy equality of access to the materials from which products can be made. Sreenivasan thinks that Locke’s theory is thus unable to solve the problem of how individuals can obtain individual property rights in what is initially owned by all people without consent.
Simmons presents a still different synthesis. He sides with Waldron and against Tully and Sreenivasan in rejecting the workmanship model. He claims that the references to “making” in chapter five of the Two Treatises are not making in the right sense of the word for the workmanship model to be correct. Locke thinks we have property in our own persons even though we do not make or create ourselves. Simmons claims that while Locke did believe that God had rights as creator, human beings have a different limited right as trustees, not as makers. Simmons bases this in part on his reading of two distinct arguments he takes Locke to make: the first justifies property based on God’s will and basic human needs, the second based on “mixing” labor. According to the former argument, at least some property rights can be justified by showing that a scheme allowing appropriation of property without consent has beneficial consequences for the preservation of mankind. This argument is overdetermined, according to Simmons, in that it can be interpreted either theologically or as a simple rule-consequentialist argument. With respect to the latter argument, Simmons takes labor not to be a substance that is literally “mixed” but rather as a purposive activity aimed at satisfying needs and conveniences of life. Like Sreenivasan, Simmons sees this as flowing from a prior right of people to secure their subsistence, but Simmons also adds a prior right to self-government. Labor can generate claims to private property because private property makes individuals more independent and able to direct their own actions. Simmons thinks Locke’s argument is ultimately flawed because he underestimated the extent to which wage labor would make the poor dependent on the rich, undermining self-government. He also joins the chorus of those who find Locke’s appeal to consent to the introduction of money inadequate to justify the very unequal property holdings that now exist.
Some authors have suggested that Locke may have had an additional concern in mind in writing the chapter on property. Tully (1993) and Barbara Arneil point out that Locke was interested in and involved in the affairs of the American colonies and that Locke’s theory of labor led to the convenient conclusion that the labor of Native Americans generated property rights only over the animals they caught, not the land on which they hunted which Locke regarded as vacant and available for the taking. Armitage even argues that there is evidence that Locke was actively involved in revising the Fundamental Constitutions of Carolina at the same time he was drafting the chapter on property for the Second Treatise. Mark Goldie, however, cautions that we should not miss the fact that political events in England were still Locke’s primary focus in writing the the Second Treatise.
A final question concerns the status of those property rights acquired in the state of nature after civil society has come into being. It seems clear that at the very least Locke allows taxation to take place by the consent of the majority rather than requiring unanimous consent (2.140). Nozick takes Locke to be a libertarian, with the government having no right to take property to use for the common good without the consent of the property owner. On his interpretation, the majority may only tax at the rate needed to allow the government to successfully protect property rights. At the other extreme, Tully thinks that, by the time government is formed, land is already scarce and so the initial holdings of the state of nature are no longer valid and thus are no constraint on governmental action. Waldron’s view is in between these, acknowledging that property rights are among the rights from the state of nature that continue to constrain the government, but seeing the legislature as having the power to interpret what natural law requires in this matter in a fairly substantial way.
The most direct reading of Locke’s political philosophy finds the concept of consent playing a central role. His analysis begins with individuals in a state of nature where they are not subject to a common legitimate authority with the power to legislate or adjudicate disputes. From this natural state of freedom and independence, Locke stresses individual consent as the mechanism by which political societies are created and individuals join those societies. While there are of course some general obligations and rights that all people have from the law of nature, special obligations come about only when we voluntarily undertake them. Locke clearly states that one can only become a full member of society by an act of express consent (Two Treatises 2.122). The literature on Locke’s theory of consent tends to focus on how Locke does or does not successfully answer the following objection: few people have actually consented to their governments so no, or almost no, governments are actually legitimate. This conclusion is problematic since it is clearly contrary to Locke’s intention.
Locke’s most obvious solution to this problem is his doctrine of tacit consent. Simply by walking along the highways of a country a person gives tacit consent to the government and agrees to obey it while living in its territory. This, Locke thinks, explains why resident aliens have an obligation to obey the laws of the state where they reside, though only while they live there. Inheriting property creates an even stronger bond, since the original owner of the property permanently put the property under the jurisdiction of the commonwealth. Children, when they accept the property of their parents, consent to the jurisdiction of the commonwealth over that property (Two Treatises 2.120). There is debate over whether the inheritance of property should be regarded as tacit or express consent. On one interpretation, by accepting the property, Locke thinks a person becomes a full member of society, which implies that he must regard this as an act of express consent. Grant suggests that Locke’s ideal would have been an explicit mechanism of society whereupon adults would give express consent and this would be a precondition of inheriting property. On the other interpretation, Locke recognized that people inheriting property did not in the process of doing so make any explicit declaration about their political obligation.
However this debate is resolved, there will be in any current or previously existing society many people who have never given express consent, and thus some version of tacit consent seems needed to explain how governments could still be legitimate. Simmons finds it difficult to see how merely walking on a street or inheriting land can be thought of as an example of a “deliberate, voluntary alienating of rights” (69). It is one thing, he argues, for a person to consent by actions rather than words; it is quite another to claim a person has consented without being aware that they have done so. To require a person to leave behind all of their property and emigrate in order to avoid giving tacit consent is to create a situation where continued residence is not a free and voluntary choice. Simmons’ approach is to agree with Locke that real consent is necessary for political obligation but disagree about whether most people in fact have given that kind of consent. Simmons claims that Locke’s arguments push toward “philosophical anarchism,” the position that most people do not have a moral obligation to obey the government, even though Locke himself would not have made this claim.
Hannah Pitkin takes a very different approach. She claims that the logic of Locke’s argument makes consent far less important in practice than it might appear. Tacit consent is indeed a watering down of the concept of consent, but Locke can do this because the basic content of what governments are to be like is set by natural law and not by consent. If consent were truly foundational in Locke’s scheme, we would discover the legitimate powers of any given government by finding out what contract the original founders signed. Pitkin, however, thinks that for Locke the form and powers of government are determined by natural law. What really matters, therefore, is not previous acts of consent but the quality of the present government, whether it corresponds to what natural law requires. Locke does not think, for example, that walking the streets or inheriting property in a tyrannical regime means we have consented to that regime. It is thus the quality of the government, not acts of actual consent, that determine whether a government is legitimate. Simmons objects to this interpretation, saying that it fails to account for the many places where Locke does indeed say a person acquires political obligations only by his own consent.
John Dunn takes a still different approach. He claims that it is anachronistic to read into Locke a modern conception of what counts as “consent.” While modern theories do insist that consent is truly consent only if it is deliberate and voluntary, Locke’s concept of consent was far more broad. For Locke, it was enough that people be “not unwilling.” Voluntary acquiescence, on Dunn’s interpretation, is all that is needed. As evidence Dunn can point to the fact that many of the instances of consent Locke uses, such as “consenting” to the use of money, make more sense on this broad interpretation. Simmons objects that this ignores the instances where Locke does talk about consent as a deliberate choice and that, in any case, it would only make Locke consistent at the price of making him unconvincing.
Recent scholarship has continued to probe these issues. Davis closely examines Locke’s terminology and argues that we must distinguish between political society and legitimate government. Only those who have expressly consented are members of political society, while the government exercises legitimate authority over various types of people who have not so consented. The government is supreme in some respects, but there is no sovereign. Van der Vossen makes a related argument, claiming that the initial consent of property owners is not the mechanism by which governments come to rule over a particular territory. Rather, Locke thinks that people (probably fathers initially) simply begin exercising political authority and people tacitly consent. This is sufficient to justify a state in ruling over those people and treaties between governments fix the territorial borders. Hoff goes still further, arguing that we need not even think of specific acts of tacit consent (such as deciding not to emigrate). Instead, consent is implied if the government itself functions in ways that show it is answerable to the people.
A related question has to do with the extent of our obligation once consent has been given. The interpretive school influenced by Strauss emphasizes the primacy of preservation. Since the duties of natural law apply only when our preservation is not threatened (2.6), then our obligations cease in cases where our preservation is directly threatened. This has important implications if we consider a soldier who is being sent on a mission where death is extremely likely. Grant points out that Locke believes a soldier who deserts from such a mission (Two Treatises 2.139) is justly sentenced to death. Grant takes Locke to be claiming not only that desertion laws are legitimate in the sense that they can be blamelessly enforced (something Hobbes would grant) but that they also imply a moral obligation on the part of the soldier to give up his life for the common good (something Hobbes would deny). According to Grant, Locke thinks that our acts of consent can in fact extend to cases where living up to our commitments will risk our lives. The decision to enter political society is a permanent one for precisely this reason: the society will have to be defended and if people can revoke their consent to help protect it when attacked, the act of consent made when entering political society would be pointless since the political community would fail at the very point where it is most needed. People make a calculated decision when they enter society, and the risk of dying in combat is part of that calculation. Grant also thinks Locke recognizes a duty based on reciprocity since others risk their lives as well.
Most of these approaches focus on Locke’s doctrine of consent as a solution to the problem of political obligation. A different approach asks what role consent plays in determining, here and now, the legitimate ends that governments can pursue. One part of this debate is captured by the debate between Seliger and Kendall, the former viewing Locke as a constitutionalist and the latter viewing him as giving almost untrammeled power to majorities. On the former interpretation, a constitution is created by the consent of the people as part of the creation of the commonwealth. On the latter interpretation, the people create a legislature which rules by majority vote. A third view, advanced by Tuckness, holds that Locke was flexible at this point and gave people considerable flexibility in constitutional drafting.
A second part of the debate focuses on ends rather than institutions. Locke states in the Two Treatises that the power of the Government is limited to the public good. It is a power that hath “no other end but preservation” and therefore cannot justify killing, enslaving, or plundering the citizens. (2.135). Libertarians like Nozick read this as stating that governments exist only to protect people from infringements on their rights. An alternate interpretation, advanced in different ways by Tuckness, draws attention to the fact that in the following sentences the formulation of natural law that Locke focuses on is a positive one, that “as much as possible” mankind is to be preserved. On this second reading, government is limited to fulfilling the purposes of natural law, but these include positive goals as well as negative rights. On this view, the power to promote the common good extends to actions designed to increase population, improve the military, strengthen the economy and infrastructure, and so on, provided these steps are indirectly useful to the goal of preserving the society. This would explain why Locke, in the Letter, describes government promotion of “arms, riches, and multitude of citizens” as the proper remedy for the danger of foreign attack (Works 6: 42)
John Locke defined political power as “a Right of making Laws with Penalties of Death, and consequently all less Penalties” (Two Treatises 2.3). Locke’s theory of punishment is thus central to his view of politics and part of what he considered innovative about his political philosophy. But he also referred to his account of punishment as a “very strange doctrine” (2.9), presumably because it ran against the assumption that only political sovereigns could punish. Locke believed that punishment requires that there be a law, and since the state of nature has the law of nature to govern it, it is permissible to describe one individual as “punishing” another in that state. Locke’s rationale is that since the fundamental law of nature is that mankind be preserved and since that law would “be in vain” with no human power to enforce it, it must therefore be legitimate for individuals to punish each other even before government exists. In arguing this, Locke was disagreeing with Samuel Pufendorf. Samuel Pufendorf had argued strongly that the concept of punishment made no sense apart from an established positive legal structure.
Locke realized that the crucial objection to allowing people to act as judges with power to punish in the state of nature was that such people would end up being judges in their own cases. Locke readily admitted that this was a serious inconvenience and a primary reason for leaving the state of nature (Two Treatises 2.13). Locke insisted on this point because it helped explain the transition into civil society. Locke thought that in the state of nature men had a liberty to engage in “innocent delights” (actions that are not a violation of any applicable laws), to seek their own preservation within the limits of natural law, and to punish violations of natural law. The power to seek one’s preservation is limited in civil society by the law and the power to punish is transferred to the government. (128–130). The power to punish in the state of nature is thus the foundation for the right of governments to use coercive force.
The situation becomes more complex, however, if we look at the principles which are to guide punishment. Rationales for punishment are often divided into those that are forward-looking and backward-looking. Forward-looking rationales include deterring crime, protecting society from dangerous persons, and rehabilitation of criminals. Backward-looking rationales normally focus on retribution, inflicting on the criminal harm comparable to the crime. Locke may seem to conflate these two rationales in passages like the following:
And thus in the State of Nature, one Man comes by a Power over another; but yet no Absolute or Arbitrary Power, to use a Criminal when he has got him in his hands, according to the passionate heats, or boundless extravagancy of his own Will, but only to retribute to him, so far as calm reason and conscience dictates, what is proportionate to his Transgression, which is so much as may serve for Reparation and Restraint. For these two are the only reasons, why one Man may lawfully do harm to another, which is that [which] we call punishment. (Two Treatises 2.8)
Locke talks both of retribution and of punishing only for reparation and restraint. Simmons argues that this is evidence that Locke is combining both rationales for punishment in his theory. A survey of other seventeenth-century natural rights justifications for punishment, however, indicates that it was common to use words like “retribute” in theories that reject what we would today call retributive punishment. In the passage quoted above, Locke is saying that the proper amount of punishment is the amount that will provide restitution to injured parties, protect the public, and deter future crime. Locke’s attitude toward punishment in his other writings on toleration, education, and religion consistently follows this path toward justifying punishment on grounds other than retribution. Tuckness claims that Locke’s emphasis on restitution is interesting because restitution is backward looking in a sense (it seeks to restore an earlier state of affairs) but also forward looking in that it provides tangible benefits to those who receive the restitution. There is a link here between Locke’s understanding of natural punishment and his understanding of legitimate state punishment. Even in the state of nature, a primary justification for punishment is that it helps further the positive goal of preserving human life and human property. The emphasis on deterrence, public safety, and restitution in punishments administered by the government mirrors this emphasis.
A second puzzle regarding punishment is the permissibility of punishing internationally. Locke describes international relations as a state of nature, and so in principle, states should have the same power to punish breaches of the natural law in the international community that individuals have in the state of nature. This would legitimize, for example, punishment of individuals for war crimes or crimes against humanity even in cases where neither the laws of the particular state nor international law authorize punishment. Thus in World War II, even if “crimes of aggression” was not at the time recognized as a crime for which individual punishment was justified, if the actions violated that natural law principle that one should not deprive another of life, liberty, or property, the guilty parties could still be liable to criminal punishment. The most common interpretation has thus been that the power to punish internationally is symmetrical with the power to punish in the state of nature.
Tuckness, however, has argued that there is an asymmetry between the two cases because Locke also talks about states being limited in the goals that they can pursue. Locke often says that the power of the government is to be used for the protection of the rights of its own citizens, not for the rights of all people everywhere (Two Treatises 1.92, 2.88, 2.95, 2.131, 2.147). Locke argues that in the state of nature a person is to use the power to punish to preserve his society, mankind as a whole. After states are formed, however, the power to punish is to be used for the benefit of his own particular society. In the state of nature, a person is not required to risk his life for another (Two Treatises 2.6) and this presumably would also mean a person is not required to punish in the state of nature when attempting to punish would risk the life of the punisher. Locke may therefore be objecting to the idea that soldiers can be compelled to risk their lives for altruistic reasons. In the state of nature, a person could refuse to attempt to punish others if doing so would risk his life and so Locke reasons that individuals may not have consented to allow the state to risk their lives for altruistic punishment of international crimes.
Locke claims that legitimate government is based on the idea of separation of powers. First and foremost of these is the legislative power. Locke describes the legislative power as supreme (Two Treatises 2.149) in having ultimate authority over “how the force for the commonwealth shall be employed” (2.143). The legislature is still bound by the law of nature and much of what it does is set down laws that further the goals of natural law and specify appropriate punishments for them (2.135). The executive power is then charged with enforcing the law as it is applied in specific cases. Interestingly, Locke’s third power is called the “federative power” and it consists of the right to act internationally according to the law of nature. Since countries are still in the state of nature with respect to each other, they must follow the dictates of natural law and can punish one another for violations of that law in order to protect the rights of their citizens.
The fact that Locke does not mention the judicial power as a separate power becomes clearer if we distinguish powers from institutions. Powers relate to functions. To have a power means that there is a function (such as making the laws or enforcing the laws) that one may legitimately perform. When Locke says that the legislative is supreme over the executive, he is not saying that parliament is supreme over the king. Locke is simply affirming that “what can give laws to another, must needs be superior to him” (Two Treatises 2.150). Moreover, Locke thinks that it is possible for multiple institutions to share the same power; for example, the legislative power in his day was shared by the House of Commons, the House of Lords, and the King. Since all three needed to agree for something to become law, all three are part of the legislative power ( 1.151). He also thinks that the federative power and the executive power are normally placed in the hands of the executive, so it is possible for the same person to exercise more than one power (or function). There is, therefore, no one to one correspondence between powers and institutions.
Locke is not opposed to having distinct institutions called courts, but he does not see interpretation as a distinct function or power. For Locke, legislation is primarily about announcing a general rule stipulating what types of actions should receive what types of punishments. The executive power is the power to make the judgments necessary to apply those rules to specific cases and administer force as directed by the rule (Two Treatises 2.88–89). Both of these actions involve interpretation. Locke states that positive laws “are only so far right, as they are founded on the Law of Nature, by which they are to be regulated and interpreted” (2.12). In other words, the executive must interpret the laws in light of its understanding of natural law. Similarly, legislation involves making the laws of nature more specific and determining how to apply them to particular circumstances ( 2.135) which also calls for interpreting natural law. Locke did not think of interpreting law as a distinct function because he thought it was a part of both the legislative and executive functions (Tuckness 2002a).
If we compare Locke’s formulation of separation of powers to the later ideas of Montesquieu, we see that they are not so different as they may initially appear. Although Montesquieu gives the more well known division of legislative, executive, and judicial, as he explains what he means by these terms he reaffirms the superiority of the legislative power and describes the executive power as having to do with international affairs (Locke’s federative power) and the judicial power as concerned with the domestic execution of the laws (Locke’s executive power). It is more the terminology than the concepts that have changed. Locke considered arresting a person, trying a person, and punishing a person as all part of the function of executing the law rather than as a distinct function.
Locke believed that it was important that the legislative power contain an assembly of elected representatives, but as we have seen the legislative power could contain monarchical and aristocratic elements as well. Locke believed the people had the freedom to created “mixed” constitutions that utilize all of these. For that reason, Locke’s theory of separation of powers does not dictate one particular type of constitution and does not preclude unelected officials from having part of the legislative power. Locke was more concerned that the people have representatives with sufficient power to block attacks on their liberty and attempts to tax them without justification. This is important because Locke also affirms that the community remains the real supreme power throughout. The people retain the right to “remove or alter” the legislative power (Two Treatises 2.149). This can happen for a variety of reasons. The entire society can be dissolved by a successful foreign invasion (2.211), but Locke is more interested in describing the occasions when the people take power back from the government to which they have entrusted it. If the rule of law is ignored, if the representatives of the people are prevented from assembling, if the mechanisms of election are altered without popular consent, or if the people are handed over to a foreign power, then they can take back their original authority and overthrow the government (2.212–17). They can also rebel if the government attempts to take away their rights (2.222). Locke thinks this is justifiable since oppressed people will likely rebel anyway and those who are not oppressed will be unlikely to rebel. Moreover, the threat of possible rebellion makes tyranny less likely to start with (2.224–6). For all these reasons, while there are a variety of legitimate constitutional forms, the delegation of power under any constitution is understood to be conditional.
Locke’s understanding of separation of powers is complicated by the doctrine of prerogative. Prerogative is the right of the executive to act without explicit authorization for a law, or even contrary to the law, in order to better fulfill the laws that seek the preservation of human life. A king might, for example, order that a house be torn down in order to stop a fire from spreading throughout a city (Two Treatises 1.159). Locke defines it more broadly as “the power of doing public good without a rule” (1.167). This poses a challenge to Locke’s doctrine of legislative supremacy. Locke handles this by explaining that the rationale for this power is that general rules cannot cover all possible cases and that inflexible adherence to the rules would be detrimental to the public good and that the legislature is not always in session to render a judgment (2.160). The relationship between the executive and the legislature depends on the specific constitution. If the chief executive has no part in the supreme legislative power, then the legislature could overrule the executive’s decisions based on prerogative when it reconvenes. If, however, the chief executive has a veto, the result would be a stalemate between them. Locke describes a similar stalemate in the case where the chief executive has the power to call parliament and can thus prevent it from meeting by refusing to call it into session. In such a case, Locke says, there is no judge on earth between them as to whether the executive has misused prerogative and both sides have the right to “appeal to heaven” in the same way that the people can appeal to heaven against a tyrannical government (2.168).
The concept of an “appeal to heaven” is an important concept in Locke’s thought. Locke assumes that people, when they leave the state of nature, create a government with some sort of constitution that specifies which entities are entitled to exercise which powers. Locke also assumes that these powers will be used to protect the rights of the people and to promote the public good. In cases where there is a dispute between the people and the government about whether the government is fulfilling its obligations, there is no higher human authority to which one can appeal. The only appeal left, for Locke, is the appeal to God. The “appeal to heaven,” therefore, involves taking up arms against your opponent and letting God judge who is in the right.
In Locke’s Letter Concerning Toleration, he develops several lines of arguments that are intended to establish the proper spheres for religion and politics. His central claims are that government should not use force to try to bring people to the true religion and that religious societies are voluntary organizations that have no right to use coercive power over their own members or those outside their group. One recurring line of argument that Locke uses is explicitly religious. Locke argues that neither the example of Jesus nor the teaching of the New Testament gives any indication that force is a proper way to bring people to salvation. He also frequently points out what he takes to be clear evidence of hypocrisy, namely that those who are so quick to persecute others for small differences in worship or doctrine are relatively unconcerned with much more obvious moral sins that pose an even greater threat to their eternal state.
In addition to these and similar religious arguments, Locke gives three reasons that are more philosophical in nature for barring governments from using force to encourage people to adopt religious beliefs (Works 6:10–12). First, he argues that the care of men’s souls has not been committed to the magistrate by either God or the consent of men. This argument resonates with the structure of argument used so often in the Two Treatises to establish the natural freedom and equality of mankind. There is no command in the Bible telling magistrates to bring people to the true faith and people could not consent to such a goal for government because it is not possible for people, at will, to believe what the magistrate tells them to believe. Their beliefs are a function of what they think is true, not what they will. Locke’s second argument is that since the power of the government is only force, while true religion consists of genuine inward persuasion of the mind, force is incapable of bringing people to the true religion. Locke’s third argument is that even if the magistrate could change people’s minds, a situation where everyone accepted the magistrate’s religion would not bring more people to the true religion. Many of the magistrates of the world believe religions that are false.
Locke’s contemporary, Jonas Proast, responded by saying that Locke’s three arguments really amount to just two, that true faith cannot be forced and that we have no more reason to think that we are right than anyone else has. Proast argued that force can be helpful in bringing people to the truth “indirectly, and at a distance.” His idea was that although force cannot directly bring about a change of mind or heart, it can cause people to consider arguments that they would otherwise ignore or prevent them from hearing or reading things that would lead them astray. If force is indirectly useful in bringing people to the true faith, then Locke has not provided a persuasive argument. As for Locke’s argument about the harm of a magistrate whose religion is false using force to promote it, Proast claimed that this was irrelevant since there is a morally relevant difference between affirming that the magistrate may promote the religion he thinks true and affirming that he may promote the religion that actually is true. Proast thought that unless one was a complete skeptic, one must believe that the reasons for one’s own position are objectively better than those for other positions.
Jeremy Waldron, in an influential article, restated the substance of Proast’s objection for a contemporary audience. He argued that, leaving aside Locke’s Christian arguments, his main position was that it was instrumentally irrational, from the perspective of the persecutor, to use force in matters of religion because force acts only on the will and belief is not something that we change at will. Waldron pointed out that this argument blocks only one particular reason for persecution, not all reasons. Thus it would not stop someone who used religious persecution for some end other than religious conversion, such as preserving the peace. Even in cases where persecution does have a religious goal, Waldron agrees with Proast that force may be indirectly effective in changing people’s beliefs. Much of the current discussion about Locke’s contribution to contemporary political philosophy in the area of toleration centers on whether Locke has a good reply to these objections from Proast and Waldron.
Some contemporary commentators try to rescue Locke’s argument by redefining the religious goal that the magistrate is presumed to seek. Susan Mendus, for example, notes that successful brainwashing might cause a person to sincerely utter a set of beliefs, but that those beliefs might still not count as genuine. Beliefs induced by coercion might be similarly problematic. Paul Bou Habib argues that what Locke is really after is sincere inquiry and that Locke thinks inquiry undertaken only because of duress is necessarily insincere. These approaches thus try to save Locke’s argument by showing that force really is incapable of bringing about the desired religious goal.
Other commentators focus on Locke’s first argument about proper authority, and particularly on the idea that authorization must be by consent. David Wootton argues that even if force occasionally works at changing a person’s belief, it does not work often enough to make it rational for persons to consent to the government exercising that power. A person who has good reason to think he will not change his beliefs even when persecuted has good reason to prevent the persecution scenario from ever happening. Richard Vernon argues that we want not only to hold right beliefs, but also to hold them for the right reasons. Since the balance of reasons rather than the balance of force should determine our beliefs, we would not consent to a system in which irrelevant reasons for belief might influence us.
Other commentators focus on the third argument, that the magistrate might be wrong. Here the question is whether Locke’s argument is question begging or not. The two most promising lines of argument are the following. Wootton argues that there are very good reasons, from the standpoint of a given individual, for thinking that governments will be wrong about which religion is true. Governments are motivated by the quest for power, not truth, and are unlikely to be good guides in religious matters. Since there are so many different religions held by rulers, if only one is true then likely my own ruler’s views are not true. Wootton thus takes Locke to be showing that it is irrational, from the perspective of the individual, to consent to government promotion of religion. A different interpretation of the third argument is presented by Tuckness. He argues that the likelihood that the magistrate may be wrong generates a principle of toleration based on what is rational from the perspective of a legislator, not the perspective of an individual citizen. Drawing on Locke’s later writings on toleration, he argues that Locke’s theory of natural law assumes that God, as author of natural law, takes into account the fallibility of those magistrates who will carry out the commands of natural law. If “use force to promote the true religion” were a command of natural law addressed to all magistrates, it would not promote the true religion in practice because so many magistrates wrongly believe that their religion is the true one. Tuckness claims that in Locke’s later writings on toleration he moved away from arguments based on what it is instrumentally rational for an individual to consent to. Instead, he emphasized testing proposed principles based on whether they would still fulfill their goal if universally applied by fallible human beings.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- The Works of John Locke, 1824 edition; several volumes, including the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Two Treatises of Government, all four Letters on Toleration, and his writings on money.
- John Locke’s Political Philosophy, entry by Alexander Moseley, in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy
- John Locke Bibliography, maintained by John Attig (Pennsylvania State University).
- Images of Locke, at the National Portrait Gallery, Great Britain.