# Logic and Information

*First published Mon Feb 3, 2014*

The explicit inclusion of the notion of *information* as
object of logical study is a rather recent development, when one
compares with notions such as proof, truth, consequence, or algorithm,
which are also central to logical practice. It was by the beginning of
the present century that a sizable body of existing technical and
philosophical work (with precursors that can be traced back to the
1930s) coalesced into the new emerging fields of logic and philosophy
of information. This entry is mainly about the logic. It surveys major
logical approaches to the notion of information, according to three
complementary stances: information-as-range,
information-as-correlation, and information-as-code.

The core intuition leading
the Information-as-range stance is that an
informational state may be characterised by the range of possibilities
or configurations that are compatible with the information available
at the moment. Acquiring new information corresponds to shrinking that
range, thus reducing uncertainty about the actual configuration of
affairs. With this understanding, the setting of possible-world
semantics for epistemic modal logics proves adequate for the study of
various semantic aspects of information. A prominent theme here
is *information update*, which many times occurs in *social
settings* due to *interaction between agents* according to
a variety of *epistemic actions*.

The Information-as-correlation stance
focuses on information flow as it is licensed within structured
systems formed by parts that are systematically correlated. For
example: the number of rings of a tree trunk can give you information
about the time when the tree was born in virtue of certain
regularities of nature that ‘connect’ the past and present
of trees. The central themes of this stance include the *aboutness,
situatedness, and accessibility of information in structured
information environments*.

The key concern of the third
stance, Information-as-code, is
the *syntax-like structure* of information pieces
(their *encoding*) and the *inference and computation
processes* that are licensed by virtue (among other things) of
that structure. A most natural logical setting to study these
informational aspects is proof theory. Some *substructural
logics*, in particular relevant logic and some linear logics, have
been given in recent times interpretations as logics that capture
relevant aspects of the information-as-code stance.

The three stances are by no means incompatible, but they are not necessarily reducible to each other either. This will be expanded on later in the entry, and some further topics of research will be illustrated, but for a preview of how the three stances can live together, take the case of a structured information system composed of several parts. First, the correlations between the parts naturally allow for ‘information flow’ in the sense of the information-as-correlation stance. Second, they also give raise to local ranges of possibilities, since the local information available at one part will be compatible with just a certain range of global states of the system. Third, the combinatorial, syntax-like, proof-theoretical aspects of information can be brought to this setting in various ways. One of them is treating the correlational flow of information as a sort of combinatorial system by which local information states are combined in syntactic-like ways fitting a particular interpretation of relevance logic. Or one could explicitly add code-structure to the modelling, for example by assigning local deductive calculi to either the components or the local states of the system.

- 1. Semantic Information as Range
- 2. Information as Correlation: Situation Theory
- 3. Information as Code
- 4. Connections Between the Approaches
- 5. Special topics
- 6. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Semantic Information as Range

The understanding of semantic information as range has its origins
in Bar-Hillel and Carnap's theory of semantic information, Bar-Hillel
and Carnap (1952). It is here that the *inverse range
principle* is given its first articulation with regard to the
informational content of a proposition. The inverse range principle
states that the more information carried by a proposition, the less
likely it is that the proposition is true. Similarly, the more likely
the truth of a proposition, the less information it carries.

The likelihood of the truth of a proposition connects with semantic information as range via a possible worlds semantics. For any contingent proposition, it will be supported by some possibilities (those where it is true) and not supported by others (those where it is false). Hence a proposition will be supported by a range of possibilities, an “information range”. Now suppose that there is a probability distribution across the space of possibilities, and for the sake of simplicity suppose that the distribution is uniform. In this case, the more worlds that support a proposition, the likelier the propositions truth, and, via the inverse relationship principle, the less information it carries. Although information as range has its origins in quantitative information theory, its role in contemporary qualitative logics of information cannot be overstated.

Consider the following example due to Johan van Benthem (2011). A waiter in a cafe receives t he order for your table—an espresso and a soda. When the waiter arrives at your table, he asks “For whom is the soda?”. After your telling him that the soda is for you and his giving you your soda, the waiter does not need to ask about the espresso, he can just give it to your cafe-partner. This is because the information gained by the waiter from your telling him that you ordered the soda allows him to eliminate certain open possibilities from the total range of possibilities such that only one is left—your friend ordered the espresso.

Logics of information distinguish regularly between *hard
information* and *soft information*. Hard information
is *factive*, and unrevisable. Hard information is often taken
to be the object of *knowledge*. In contrast to hard
information, soft information is *non-necessarily-factive*,
hence revisable in the presence of new information. Soft information,
in virtue of its revisability, corresponds very closely to the
information that falls inside the scope of belief as opposed to
knowledge. The terms knowledge and belief are conventional, but on the
context of information flow, the hard/soft information reading is
convenient on account of it bringing the informational phenomena to
the foreground. Although both hard and soft information are important
for our epistemic and doxastic success, in this section we will
concentrate mainly on logics of hard information flow.

In section 1.1 we will see both how it is
that classic epistemic logics exemplify the flow of hard information
within the information as range
framework. In section 1.2 we will
extend our exposition from logics of hard information-gain to logics
of the actions that facilitate the gain of such hard information,
dynamic epistemic logics. At the end of Section 1.2, we will expound
the important phenomenon of *private information*, before
examining how it is that information as range is captured in
various *quantitative frameworks*.

### 1.1 Epistemic logic

In this section we will explore how it is that the elimination of
possibilities corresponding to information-gain is the starting point
for research on logics of knowledge and belief that fall under the
heading of *epistemic logics*. We will begin with classic
single-agent epistemic logic, before exploring multi-agent epistemic
logics. In both cases, since we will be concentrating on logics of
knowledge as opposed to logics of belief, the information-gained will
be hard information.

Consider the waiter example in more detail. Before receiving the
hard information that the soda is for you, the waiter's knowledge-base
is modelled by a pair of worlds (hereafter *information
states*) *x* and *y* such that in *x* you ordered
the soda and your friend the espresso, and in *y* you ordered the
espresso and your friend the soda. After receiving the hard
information that the soda is for you, *y* is eliminated from the
waiter's knowledge-base, leaving only *x*. As such, the reduction
of the range of possibilities corresponds to an information-gain for
the waiter.

Although epistemic logic was conceived traditionally as a logic
of *knowledge*, one natural interpretation of the formalism is
in terms of a logic modelling the handling of hard semantic
information, an approach given contemporary expression in Hintikka
(2007). That this corresponds to an understanding of semantic
information as range is most easily appreciated by noting that an
agent's knowledge-base is represented by an accessibility relation
ranging across information-states (possible worlds). Consider the
truth condition for *agent* α *knows that* φ,
written *K*_{α}φ:

- (1)
*x*⊩*K*_{α}φ iff for all*y*s.t. (such that)*R*_{α}*x**y*,*y*⊩ φ

The accessibility relation *R* is an equivalence relation
connecting *x* to all information states *y* such
that *y* is indistinguishable from *x*, *given*
α*'s hard information at that state* *x*. So,
if *x* was the waiter's information state before being informed
that you ordered the soda, *y* would have included the
information that you ordered the espresso, as each option was as good
as the other until the waiter was informed otherwise. There is an
implicit assumption at work here—that some state *z* say,
where you ordered both the soda and the espresso, is not in the
waiter's information-range. That is, the waiter knows that *z* is
not a possibility. Once informed however, the information states
supporting your ordering the espresso are eliminated from the range of
information corresponding to the waiter's knowledge.

Basic modal logic extends propositional formulas with modal
operators such as *K*, where **K** is the set of
all Kripke Models then we have the following axioms:

- (A1)
K⊩K_{α}φ ∧K_{α}(φ → ψ) →K_{α}ψ- (A2)
K⊩ φ ⇒ ⊩K_{α}φ

(A1) states that hard information is closed under (known)
implications. Since the first conjunct states that all states
accessible by α are φ states, α possesses the hard
information that φ, hence α also possesses the hard
information that ψ. (A2) states that if φ holds in the set of
all models, then α possesses the hard information that φ. In
other words, (A2) states that all tautologies are true and
unrevisable, and (A1) states that α knows the logical
consequences of all propositions that α knows (be they
tautologies or otherwise). That is, the axioms state that the agent is
logical omniscient, or an *ideal reasoner*, a property of
agents that we will return to in detail in the sections
below.^{[1]}

The formalism above is basic single-agent epistemic logic. But
reasoning and information flow are very often *multi-agent
affairs*. Consider again the waiter example above. Importantly,
the waiter is only able to execute the relevant reasoning procedure
corresponding to a restriction of the range of information
states *on account of* your announcement to him with regard to
the espresso. That is, it was the verbal interaction between several
agents that facilitated the information flow that enabled the logical
reasoning to be undertaken.

It is at this point that multi-agent epistemic logic raises new
questions regarding the information in a group. “Everybody
in *G* possesses the hard information that φ”
(where *G* is any group of agents from a finite set of
agents *G**) written
as *E*_{G}φ. *E*_{G} is
defined for each *G* ⊆ *G*^{∗} in the
following manner:

- (2)
*E*_{G}φ =∧α∈*G**K*_{α}φ

This form of group knowledge is importantly different
from *common knowledge* (Lewis 1969; Fagin et al. 1995). Common
knowledge is the condition of the group where *everybody knows that
everybody knows that everybody knows … that* φ. In
other words, common knowledge concerns the hard information that each
agent in the group possesses about the hard information possessed by
the other members of the group. That everybody in *G* possesses
the hard information that φ does not imply that φ is common
knowledge. With group knowledge each agent in the group may possess
the same hard information (hence achieving group knowledge) without
necessarily possessing hard information about the hard information
possessed by the other agents in the group. As noted by van Ditmarsh,
van der Hoek, and Kooi (2008: 30), “the number of iterations of
the *E*-operator makes a real difference in
practice”. *C*_{G}φ—the common
knowledge *that* φ for members of *G*, is defined as
follows:

- (3)
*C*_{G}φ =∞

∧*n*=0*E**n**G*φ

To appreciate the difference between *E* and *C*,
consider the following “spy example” (originally Barwise
(1988) with the envelope details due to Johan van Benthem.

There are a group of competing spies at a formal dinner. All of them are tasked with the mission of acquiring some secret information from inside the restaurant. Furthermore, it is common knowledge amongst them that they want the information. Given this much, compare the following:

- Each spy knows that the information is in an envelope on one of the other tables, but they don't know that the other spies know this (i.e., it is not common knowledge).
- It is common knowledge amongst the spies that the information is in the envelope.

Very obviously, the two scenarios will elicit very different types of behaviour from the spies. The first would be relatively subtle, the latter dramatically less so. See Vanderschraaf and Sillari (2009) for further details.

### 1.2 Dynamic epistemic logic, information change

As noted above, the waiter example from the beginning of this section is as much about information-gain via announcements as it is about information structures. In this section, we will outline logics of actions that result in information increase.

Hard information flow can be facilitated by more than one
epistemic action. Two canonical examples are *announcements*
and *observations*. When “announcement” is
restricted to *true and public announcement*, its result on the
receiving agent's knowledge-base is similar to that of an observation
(on the assumption that the agent believes the content of the
announcement). The public announcement that φ will restrict the
model of the agent's knowledge-base to the information states where
φ is true, hence “announce φ” is *an epistemic
state transformer* in the sense that it transforms the epistemic
states of the agents in the group, (van Ditmarsh, van der Hoek, and
Kooi 2008:
74).^{[2]}

Dynamic epistemic logics extend the language of epistemic logics
with dynamic operators. In particular, *public announcement
logic* (PAL) extends the language of epistemic logics with the
dynamic announcement operator [φ], where [φ]ψ is read
“after announcement φ, it is the case that ψ”. The
key *reduction axioms* of PAL are as follows:

(RA1) [φ] piff φ → p(wherepis atomic)(RA2) [φ]¬φ iff φ →¬[φ]ψ (RA3) [φ](ψ ∧ χ) iff [φ]ψ ∧ [φ]χ (RA4) [φ][ψ]χ iff [φ ∧ [φ]ψ]χ (RA5) [φ] K_{α}ψiff φ → K_{α}(φ → [φ]ψ)

RA1–RA5 capture the properties of the announcement operator
by connecting what is true before the announcement with what is true
after the announcement. The axioms are named ‘reduction’
axioms because the left-to-right hand direction reduces either the
number of announcement operators or the complexity of the formulas
within their scope. For an in depth discussion see Pacuit (2011). RA1
states that announcements are truthful. RA5 specifies the
epistemic-state-transforming properties of the announcement
operator. It states that α knows that ψ after the
announcement that φ *iff* φ implies that α knows
that ψ will be true after φ is announced in all
φ-states. The “after φ is announced” condition is
there to account for the fact that ψ might change its truth-value
after the announcement. The interaction between the dynamic
announcement operator and the knowledge operator is described
completely by RA5 (see van Benthem, van Eijck, and Kooi 2006).

Just as adding the *common knowledge* operator *C* to
multi-agent epistemic logic extends the expressive capabilities of
multi-agent epistemic logic, adding *C* to PAL results in the
more expressive *public announcement logic with common
knowledge*, (PAC). The exact relationship between public
announcements and common knowledge is captured by the *announcement
and common knowledge rule* of the logic PAC as the following:

- (4)
- From χ → [φ]ψ and (χ ∧ φ) →
*E*_{G}χ, infer χ → [φ]*C*_{G}ψ.

Again, PAC is the dynamic logic of hard information. The epistemic
logics dealing with *soft information* fall within the scope
of *belief revision theory* (van Benthem 2004; Segerberg
1998). Variants of PAL that model soft information augment their
models with plausibility-orderings on information-states (Baltag and
Smets 2008). These orderings are known as *preferential models*
in non-monotonic logic and belief-revision theory. The logics can be
made dynamic in virtue of the orderings changing in the face of new
information (which is the mark of soft information as opposed to hard
information). Such plausibility-orderings may be modelled
qualitatively via partial orders etc., or modelled quantitatively via
probability-measures. Such quantitative measures provide a connection
to a broader family of quantitative approaches to semantic information
that we will examine.

** Private information**. Private information
is an equally important aspect of our social interaction. Consider
scenarios where the announcing agent is aware of the private
communication whilst other members of the group are not, such as
emails in Bcc. Consider also scenarios where the sending agent
is

*not*aware of the private communication, such as a surveillance operation. The system of

*dynamic epistemic logic*(DEL) models events that turn on private (and public) information by modelling the agents' information concerning the events

*taking place*in a given communicative scenario (see Baltag et al. 2008; van Ditmarsh et al. 2008; and Pacuit 2011).

Importantly, modal information theory approach to multi-agent information flow is the subject of a great amount of research. The semantics is not always carried out in relational terms (i.e., with Kripke Frames) but is done often algebraically (see Blackburn et al. 2001 for details of the algebraic approach to modal logic). For more details on algebraic as well as type-theoretic approaches, see the subsection on algebraic and other approaches to modal information theory in the supplementary document Abstract Approaches to Information Structure.

### 1.3 Quantitative Approaches

Quantitative approaches to *information as range* also have
their origins in the inverse relationship principle. To
restate—the motivation being that the less likely the truth of a
proposition as expressed in a logical language with respect to a
particular domain, the greater the amount of information encoded by
the relevant formula. This is in contrast to the information measures
in the *mathematical theory of communication* (Shannon 1950)
where such measures are gotten via an inverse relationship on the
expectation of the receiver *R* of the receipt of a signal from
some source *S*.

Another important aspect of the theory of classical semantic
information, is that it is an entirely *static* theory—it
is concerned with the semantic informational content and measure of
particular formulas, and not with information *flow* in any way
at all.

The formal details of semantic information theory turn on the
probability calculus. These details may be left aside here, as the
obvious conceptual point is that logical truths have a
truth-likelihood of 1, and therefore an information measure of
0. Bar-Hillel and Carnap did not take this to mean that logical
truths, or deductions, were without information yield, only that their
theory of semantic information was not designed to capture such a
property. They coined the term *psychological information* for
the property involved. See Floridi (2013) for further details.

A quantitative attempt at specifying the information yield of
deductions was undertaken by Jaakko Hintikka with his theory
of *surface information* and *depth information*
(Hintikka 1970, 1973). The theory of surface and depth information
extends Bar-Hillel and Carnap's theory of semantic information from
the monadic predicate calculus all the way up to the full polyadic
predicate calculus. This itself is a considerable achievement, but
although technically astounding, a serious restriction of this
approach is that it is only a fragment of the deductions carried out
within full first-order logic that yield a non-zero information
measure. The rest of the deductions in the full polyadic predicate
calculus, as well as all of those in the monadic predicate calculus
and propositional calculus, measure 0, (see Sequoiah-Grayson
2008).

The obvious inverse situation with the theory of classical
semantic information is that logical contradictions, having a
truth-likelihood of 0, will deliver a maximal information measure of
1. Referred to in the literature as the *Bar-Hillel-Carnap Semantic
Paradox*, the most developed quantitative approach to addressing
it is the theory of *strongly semantic information* (Floridi
2004). The conceptual motivation behind strongly semantic information
is that for a statement to yield information, it must help us to
narrow down the set of possible worlds. That is, it must assist us in
the search for the actual world, so to speak (Sequoiah-Grayson
2007). Such a *contingency requirement on informativeness* is
violated by both logical truths and logical contradictions, both of
which measure 0 on the theory of strongly semantic information. See
Floridi (2013) for further details.

## 2. Information as Correlation: Situation Theory

In general, the correlational take on information looks
at *structured information environments* and how information
flow is enabled within them by virtue of the systematic ways in which
their parts are connected. An equally important theme in this view is
the *aboutness of information*: the pattern of pixels that
appear on the screen of a computer gives information (not necessarily
complete) *about* the sequence of keys that were pressed by the
person who is typing a document, and even a partial snapshot of the
clear starred sky your friend is looking at now will give you
information *about* his possible locations on Earth at this
moment. These are typical examples involving structured environments
in which a part can carry information *about* another one. The
focus on structured environments and the aboutness of information goes
also hand in hand with a third main topic of this approach, namely
the *situatedness of information*, that is, its dependency on
the particular setting on which an informational signal occurs. Take
the starry sky as an example again: the same pattern of stars, at
different moments in time and locations in space will in general
convey different information about the location of your friend.

Historically, the first paradigmatic setting of correlated information was studied by Shannon (1948). He considered a communication system formed by two information sites, a source and a receiver, which are connected via a noisy channel. Shannon's concern was purely quantitative. He gave conclusive and extremely useful answers to questions having to do with how to construct communication codes to be used in the source and receiver sites so that the effectiveness of communication can be maximised (in terms of bits of information that can be transmitted) while minimizing the possibility of errors caused by channel noise.

The logical approach to information as correlation builds on
Shannon's ideas but is naturally concerned with the qualitative
aspects of information flow that were highlighted above and that
Shannon's theory does not address, such as: *what*
information *about* a ‘remote’ site (remote in
terms of space, time, perspective, etc.) can be drawn out of
information that is directly available at a ‘proximal’
site? This leads to non-standard forms of inference that involve
several situations at the same time and stress the *aboutness*
of information.

*Situation theory* (Barwise and Perry 1983; Devlin 1991) is
the major logical framework so far that has made these ideas its
starting point for an analysis of information. Its origin and some of
its central insights can be found in the project of naturalization of
mind and the possibility of knowledge initiated by Fred Dretske
(1981), which soon influenced the inception of situation semantics in
the context of natural language (see Kratzer 2011).

Technically, there are two kinds of developments in situation theory:

- Set-theoretic and model-theoretic frameworks based on detailed ontologies suitable for modelling informational phenomena in concrete applications.
- A mathematical theory of information flow as enabled by lawful
*channels*that connect parts of a whole. This theory takes a more abstract view on information as correlation applicable (in principle) to all sorts of systems that can be decomposed in interrelated parts.

The next three subsections survey some of the basic notions about the sites of information in situation theory (situations), the basic notion of information flow based on correlations between situations, and finally the mathematical theory of classifications and channels mentioned in (b).

### 2.1 Situations and Supporting Information

The ontologies in (a) span a wide spectrum of entities. They are
are meant to reflect the way in which an agent carves up a
system. Here “a system” can be the world, or a part or
aspect of it, and the agent (or kind of agent) can be an animal
species, a device, a theorist, etc. The list of basic entities
includes individuals, relations (which come with roles attached to
them), temporal and spacial locations, and various other
things. Distinctive among them are the *situations*
and *infons*.

Roughly speaking, situations are highly structured parts of a
system, such as a class session, a scene as seen from a certain
perspective, a war, etc. Situations are the basic supporters of
information. Infons, on the other hand, are the informational issues
that situations may or may not support. The simplest kind of
informational issue is whether some entities *a*_{1},
…, *a*_{n} stand (do not stand) in a
relation *R* when playing the roles *r*_{1},
…, *r*_{n}, respectively. Such basic infon
is usually denoted as

⟨⟨R,r_{1}:a_{1}, …,r_{n}:a_{n},i⟩⟩.

where *i* is 1 or 0, according to whether the issue is
positive or negative.

Infons are not intrinsic bearers of truth, they are not claims
either. They are simply informational issues that may or may not be
supported by particular situations. We'll
write *s* ⊧ σ to mean that
the situation *s* supports the infon σ. As an example, a
successful transaction whereby Mary bought a piece of cheese in the
local market is a situation that supports the infon

σ = ⟨⟨bought,what:cheese,who:Mary, 1⟩⟩.

This situation does *not* support the infon

⟨⟨bought,what:cheese,who:Mary, 0⟩⟩

because Mary did buy cheese. Nor does the situation support the infon

⟨⟨landed,who:Armstrong,where:Moon, 1⟩⟩,

because Armstrong is not part of the situation in question at all.

The discrimination or individuation of a situation by an agent
does not entail that the agent has full information about it: when we
wonder whether the local market is open, we have individuated a
situation about which we actually *lack* some information. See
Textor (2012) for a detailed discussion on the nature of
situation-like entities and their relation with other ontological
categories such as the possible worlds used in modal logic.

Besides individuals, relations, locations, situations and basic
infons, there are usually various kinds of parametric and abstract
entities. For example, there is a mechanism of *type
abstraction*. According to it, if *y* is a parameter for
situations, then

T_{y}= [y∣y⊧ ⟨⟨bought,what:cheese,who:x, 1⟩⟩]

is the type of situations where somebody buys cheese. There will be some basic types in an ontology, and many other types obtained via abstraction, as just described.

The collection of ontology entities also include propositions and constraints. They are key in the formulation of the basic principles of information content in situation theory, to be introduced next.

### 2.2 Information flow and constraints

The following are typical statements about “information flow” as studied in situation theory:

- [
E1]- The fact that the dot in the radar screen is moving upward indicates that flight A123 is moving northward.
- [
E2]- The presence of footprints of pattern
Pin Zhucheng indicates that a dinosaur lived in the region millions of years ago.

The general scheme has the form

- [
IC]Thats:Tindicates thatp.

where *s* : *T* is notation for “*s* is of
type *T* ”. The idea is that it is concrete parts of the
world that act as carriers of information (the concrete dot in the
radar or the footprints in Zhucheng), and that they do so by virtue of
being of a certain type (the dot moving upward or the footprints
showing a certain pattern). What each of these concrete instances
indicates is a fact about another correlated part of the world. For
the issues to be discussed below it will suffice to consider cases
where the indicated fact—that is *p* in the formulation
of **[IC]**—is of the form *s*′
: *T* ′, as in the radar example.

The conditions needed to verify informational signalling in the
sense of [**IC**] rely on the existence of
law-like *constraints* such as natural laws, necessary laws
such as those of math, or conventions thanks to which (in part) one
situation may serve as carrier of information about another
one. Constraints specify the *correlations* that exist between
situations of various types, in the following sense: if two
types *T* and *T* ′ are subject to the
constraint *T* ⇒ *T* ′, then for every
situation *s* of type *T* there is a relevantly connected
situation *s*′ of type *T* ′. In the radar
example, the relevant correlation would be captured by the
constraint GoingUpward
⇒ GoingNorth, which says that each
situation where a radar point moves upward is connected with another
situation where a plane is moving to the north. It is the existence of
this constraint that allows a particular situation where the dot moves
to indicate something about the connected plane situation.

With this background, the verification principle for information signalling in situation theory can be formulated as follows

[IS Verification]s:Tindicates thats′ :T′ ifT⇒T′ andsisrelevantly connectedtos′.

The relation ⇒ is transitive. This ensures that Dretske's Xerox principle holds in this account of information transfer, that is, there can be no loss of semantic information through information transfer chains.

[Xerox Principle]: Ifs_{1}:T_{1}indicates thats_{2}:T_{2}ands_{2}:T_{2}indicates thats_{3}:T_{3}, thens_{1}:T_{1}indicates thats_{3}:T_{3}.

The **[IS Verification]** principle deals with
information that *in principle* could be acquired by an
agent. The access to some of this information will be blocked, for
example, if the agent is oblivious to the correlation that exists
between two kinds of situations. In addition, most correlations are
not absolute, they admit exceptions. Thus, for the signalling
described in **[E1]** to be really informational, the
extra *condition* that the radar system is working properly
must be met. Conditional versions of the **[IS
Verification]** principle may be used to insist that the
carrier situation must meet certain background conditions. The
inability of an agent to keep track of changes on these background
conditions may lead to errors. So, if the radar is broken, the dot on
the screen may end up moving upward while the plane is moving
south. Unless the air controller is able to recognise the problem,
that is, unless she realises that the background conditions have
changed, she may end up giving absurd instructions to the pilot. Now,
instructions are tied to actions. For a treatment of actions from the
situation-theoretical view, we refer the reader to Israel and Perry
(1991).

### 2.3 Distributed information systems and channel theory

The basic notion of information flow sketched in the previous section can be lifted to a more abstract setting in which the supporters of information are not necessarily situations as concrete parts of the world, but rather any entity which, as in the case of situations, can be classified as being of or not of certain types. The mathematical theory of distributed systems (Barwise and Seligman 1997) to be described next takes this abstract approach by studying information transfer within distributed systems in general.

A model of a distributed system in this framework will actually be
a model of a *kind* of distributed system, hence the model of
the radar-airplane system that we will use as a running example here
will actually be a model of radar-airplane *systems* (in
plural). Setting such a model requires describing the architecture of
the system in terms of its parts and the way they are put together
into a whole. Once that is done, one can proceed to see how that
architecture enables the flow of information among its parts.

A part of a system (again, really its kind) is modelled by saying
how particular instances of it are classified according to a given set
of types. In other words, for each part of a system one has
a *classification*

A= ⟨Instances,Types, ⊧⟩,

where ⊧ is a binary relation such
that *a* ⊧ *T* if the
instance *a* is of type *T*. In a simplistic analysis of the
radar example, one could posit at least three classifications, one for
the monitor screen, one for the flying plane, and one for the whole
monitoring system:

Screens = ⟨ Monitor-Screens, Types of Screen Configurations, ⊧_{M}⟩Planes = ⟨ Flying Planes, Types of Flying Planes, ⊧_{P}⟩MonitSit = ⟨ Monitoring Situations, Types of Monitoring Situations, ⊧_{M}⟩

A general version of a ‘part-of’ relation between
classifications is needed in order to model the way parts of a system
are assembled together. Consider the case of the monitoring
systems. That each one of them has a screen as one of its parts means
that there is a function that assigns to each instance of the
classification **MonitSit** an instance
of **Screens**. On the other hand, all the ways in which
a screen can be classified (the types of **Screens**)
intuitively correspond to ways in which the whole screening system
could be classified: if a screen is part of a monitoring system and
the screen is blinking, say, then the whole monitoring situation is
intuitively one of the type ‘its screen is
blinking’. Accordingly, a generalised ‘part-of’
relation between any two arbitrary
classifications **A**, **C** can be modelled
via two functions

f^{ ∧}:Types_{A}→Types_{C}andf^{ ∨}:Instances_{C}→Instances_{A},

the first of which takes every type in **A** to its
counterpart in **C**, and the second of which takes every
instance *c* of **C** to
its **A**-component.^{[3]}

If *f* : **A** → **C** is
shortcut notation for the existence of the two functions above (the
pair *f* of functions is called an *infomorphism*), then
an arbitrary distributed system will consist of various
classifications related by infomorphisms. For our purpose it will
suffice here to consider three
classifications **A**, **B**, **C**
together with two infomorphisms

f:A→Candg:B→C.

So a simple way to model the radar monitoring system would consist of the pair

f:Screens→MonitSitandg:Planes→MonitSit.

The common codomain in these cases (**C** in the
general case and **MonitSit** in the example) works as a
the core of a *channel* that connects two parts of the
system. The core determines the correlations that obtain between the
two parts, thus enabling information flow of the kind discussed
in section 2.2. This is achieved via two
kinds of links. On the one hand, two instances *a*
from **A** and *b* from **B** can be
thought to be connected via the channel if they are components of the
same instance in **C**, so the instances
of **C** act as connections between components. Thus, in
the radar example a particular screen will be connected to a
particular plane if they belong to the same monitoring situation.

On the other hand, suppose that every instance
in **C** verifies some relation between types that happen
to be counterparts of types from **A**
and **B**. Then such relation captures
a *constraint* on how the parts of the system are
correlated. In the radar example, the theory of the core
classification **MonitSit** will include constraints such
as PlainMovingNorth
⇒ DotGoingUp. This regularity of
monitoring situations, which act as connections between radar
screen-shots and planes, reveals a way in which radar screens and
monitored planes correlate with each other. All this affords the
following version of information transfer.

Channel-enabled signalling:Suppose thatf:A→Candg:B→C.Then instance

abeing of typeTinAindicates that instancebis of typeT′ inCifaandbare connected by a instance fromCand the relationf^{ ∧}(T) ⇒g^{∧}(T′) between the counterpart interpreted types is satisfied by all instances ofC.

Now, for each classification **A**, the
collection

L_{A}= {T⇒T′ ∣ every instance ofAof typeTis also of typeT′}

formed by all the *global constraints* of the
classification can be thought of as a logic that is intrinsic
to **A**. Then a distributed system consisting of various
classifications and infomorphisms will have a logic of constraints
attached to each part of
it,^{[4]}
and more sophisticated questions about
information flow within the system can be formulated.

For example, suppose an infomorfism *f* : **A**
→ **C** is part of the distributed system under
study. Then *f* naturally transforms each global
constraint *T* ⇒ *T*′
of *L*_{A} into *f*^{
∧}(*T*) ⇒ *f*^{
∧}(*T*′), which can always be shown to be an
element of *L*_{C}. This means that one
can reason within **A** and then *reliably* draw
conclusions about **C**. On the other hand, it can be
shown that using preimages under *f*^{ ∧} in order to
translate global constraints of **C** does *not*
always guarantee the result to be always a global constraint
of **A**. It is then desirable to identify extra
conditions under which the reliability of the inverse translation can
be guaranteed, or at least improved. In a sense, these questions are
qualitatively close to the concerns Shannon originally had about noise
and reliability.

Another issue one may want to model is reasoning about a system
from the perspective of an agent that has only *partial*
knowledge about the parts of a system. For a running example, think of
a plane controller who has only worked with ACME monitors and knows
nothing about electronics. The logic such an agent might use to reason
about part **A** of a system (actually
part **Screens** in the case of the controller) will in
general consist of some constraints that may not even be global, but
satisfied only by some subset of instances (the ACME monitors). The
agent's logic may be *incomplete* in the sense that it might
miss some of the global constraints of the classification (like the
ones involving inner components of the monitor). The agent's logic may
also be *unsound*, in the sense that there might be instances
out of the awareness of the agent (say monitors of unfamiliar brands)
that falsify some of the agent's constraints (which do hold of all
ACME monitors). As before, when part **A** of a system is
linked to part **C**, one also wants to know whether the
linking infomorphism allows to translate an agent's logic
from **A** while preserving good properties it might have
(such as not having exceptions for its constraints).

For an extensive development of the theory of channels sketched
here, plus several explorations towards applications, see Barwise and
Seligman (1997). See van Benthem (2000) for a study of conditions
under which constraint satisfiability is preserved under
infomorphisms, and Allo (2009) for an application of this framework to
an analysis of the distinction between cognitive *states* and
cognitive *commodities*. Finally, it must be mentioned that the
notion of classification has been around for some years now in the
literature, having being independently studied and introduced under
names such as Chu spaces (Pratt 1999) or Formal Contexts (Ganter and
Wille 1999).

## 3. Information as Code

For information to be computed, it must be handled by the
computational mechanism in question, and for such a handling to take
place, the information must be *encoded*. *Information as
Code* is a stance that takes this encoding-condition very
seriously. The result is the development of fine-grained models of
information flow that turn on the syntactic properties of the encoding
itself.

To see how this is so, consider again cases involving information
flow via observations. Such observations are informative because we
are not omniscient in the normal, God-like sense of the term. We have
to go and observe that the cat is on the mat precisely because we are
not automatically aware of every fact in the universe. Inferences work
in an analogous manner. Deductions are informative for us precisely
because we are not *logically* omniscient. We have to reason
about matters, sometimes at great length, because we are not
automatically aware of the logical consequences of the body of
information that we are reasoning with.

To come full circle—reasoning explicitly with information requires handling it, where in this case such handling is cognitive act. Hence the information in question is encoded in some manner, hence Information as Code underpins the development of fine-grained models of information flow that turn on the syntactic properties of the encoding itself, as well as the properties of the actions that underpin the various information-processing contexts involved.

Such information-processing contexts are not restricted to
explicit acts of inferential reasoning by human agents, but
include *automated reasoning* and *theorem proving*, as
well as machine-based computational procedures in general. Approaches
to modelling the properties of these latter information-processing
scenarios fall under *algorithmic information theory*.

In section 3.1, we will explore a major
approach to modelling the properties of information-processing within
the information as code framework via *categorial information
theory*. In section 3.2, we will
examine the more general approach to modelling information as code of
which categorial information theory is an instance, the modelling of
information as code via *substructural
logics*. In section 3.3 we will lay out the
details of several other notable examples of logics of information
flow motivated by the information as code approach.

### 3.1 Categorial Information Theory

*Categorial information theory* is a theory of fine-grained
information flow whose models are based upon those specified by the
categorial grammars underpinned by the Lambek Calculi, due originally
to Lambek (1958, 1961). The motivation for categorial information
theory is to provide a logical framework for modelling the properties
of the very cognitive procedures that underpin deductive
reasoning.

The conceptual origin of categorial information theory is found in van Benthem (1995: 186):

[I]t turns out that, in particular, the Lambek Calculus itself permits of procedural re-interpretation, and thus, categorial calculi may turn out to describe cognitive procedures just as much as the syntactic or semantic structures which provided their original motivation.

The motivation for categorial information theory is to model the
cognitive procedures constituting deductive reasoning. Consider as an
analogy the following example. You arrive home from IKEA with an
unassembled table that is still flat-packed in its box. Now the
question here is this, do you have your table? Well, there is a sense
in which you do, and a sense in which you do not. You have your table
in the sense that you have all of the pieces required to construct or
generate the table, but this is not to say that you have the table in
the sense that you are able to *use* it. That is, you do not
have the table in any useful form, you have merely pieces of a
table. Indeed, getting these table-pieces into their useful form,
namely a table, may be a long and arduous process…

The analogy between the table-example above and deductive reasoning is this. It is often said that the information encoded by (or “contained in” or “expressed by”) the conclusion of a deductive argument is encoded by the premises. So, when you possess the information encoded by the premises of some instance of deductive reasoning, do you possess the information encoded by the conclusion? Just as with the table-pieces, you do not possess the information encoded by the conclusion in any useful form, not until you have put the “information-pieces” constituting the premises together in the correct manner. To be sure, when you possess the information-pieces encoded by the premises, you possess all of the information required for the construction or generation of the information encoded by the conclusion. As with the table-pieces however, getting the information encoded by the conclusion from the information encoded by the premises may be a long and arduous process. This information-generation via deductive inference may be thought of also as the movement of information from implicit to explicit storage in the mind of the reasoning agent, and it is the cognitive procedures facilitating this storage transfer that motivate categorial information theory.

Categorial information theory is a theory of dynamic information
processing based on the *merge/fusion* (⊗) and *typed
function* (→, ←) operations from categorial grammar. The
conceptual motivation is to understand the information in the mind of
an agent as the agent reasons deductively to be a database in much the
same way as a natural language lexicon is a database, Sequoiah-Grayson
(2013). In this case, a *grammar* will be understood as a set
of processing constraints so imposed as to guarantee information flow,
or well-formed strings as outputs. Recent research on proofs
as *events* from a very similar conceptual starting point may
by found in Stefaneas and Vandoulakis (forthcoming).

Categorial information theory is strongly algebraic in
flavour. Fusion ‘⊗’ corresponds to the binary
composition operator ‘.’, and ‘⊢’ to
the partial order ‘≤’ (see Dunn 1993). The merge and
function operations are related to each other via the
familiar *residuation conditions*:

- (5)
*A*⊗*B*⊢*C*iff*B*⊢*A*→*C*- (6)
- A ⊗
*B*⊢*C*iff*A*⊢*C*←*B*

In general, applications for directional function application will be restricted to algebraic analyses of grammatical structures, where commuted lexical items will result in non-well-formed strings.

Despite its algebraic nature, the operations can be given their
evaluation conditions via “informationalised” Kripke
frames (Kripke 1963, 1965). An information frame (Restall
1994) **F** is a triple ⟨*S*, ⊑,
•⟩. *S* is a set of information
states *x*, *y*, *z*…. ⊑ is a partial
order of informational development/inclusion such that *x*
⊑ *y* is taken to mean that the information carried
by *y* is a development of the information carried by *x*,
and • is an operation for combining information states. In other
words, we have a domain with a combination operation. The operation of
information combination and the partial order of information inclusion
interrelate as follows:

- (7)
- x ⊑
*y*iff*x*•*y*⊑*y*

Reading *x* ⊩ *A* as *state x carries
information of type A*, we have it that:

- (8)
*x*⊩*A*⊗*B*iff for some*y*,*z*, ∈**F**s.t.*y*•*z*⊑*x*,*y*⊩*A*and*z*⊩*B*.- (9)
*x*⊩*A*→*B*iff for all*y*,*z*∈**F**s.t.*x*•*y*⊑*z*, if*y*⊩*A*then*z*⊩*B*.- (10)
*x*⊩*B*←*A*iff for all*y*,*z*∈**F**s.t.*y*•*x*⊑*z*, if*y*⊩*A*then*z*⊩*B*.

At the syntactic level, we read *X* ⊢ *A*
as *processing on X generates information of type A*. In
this case we are understanding ⊢ as an information processing
mechanism as suggested by Wansing (1993: 16), such that ⊢
encodes not just the output of an information processing procedure,
but the properties of the procedure itself. Just what this processing
consists of will depend on the processing constraints that we set up
on our database. These processing constraints will be imposed in order
to guarantee an output from the processing itself, or to put this
another way, in order to preserve information flow. Such processing
constraints are fixed by the presence or absence of
various

*structural rules*, and structural rules are the business of

*substructural logics*.

### 3.2 Substructural logics and information flow

Categorial information theory is precipitated by giving the Lambek
calculi an informational semantics. At a suitable level of
abstraction, the Lambek calculi is seen to be a highly
expressive *substructural logic*. Unsurprisingly, by giving an
informational semantics for substructural logics in general, we get a
hierarchy of logics that exemplify the information as code
approach. This hierarchy is organised by expressive power, with the
expressive power of the logics in question being captured by the
presence of various *structural rules*.

A structural rule is of the following general form:

- (11)
*X*⇐*Y*

We may read (11) as *any information generated by processing
on X is generated by processing on Y also*. Hence
the long-form of (11) is as follows:

- (12)
*X*⊢*A**Y*⊢*A*

Hence *X* is a structured body of information, or “data
structure” as Gabbay (1996: 423) puts it, where the
actual *arrangement* of the information plays a crucial
role. The structural rules will fix the structure of the information
encoded by *X*, and as such impact upon the granularity of the
information being processed.

Consider Weakening, the most familiar of the structural rules (followed by its corresponding frame condition:

- (Weakening)
A⇐A⊗B

x•y⊑z→x⊑z

With Weakening present, we loose track of which pieces of information
were actually used in an inference. This is precisely why it is that
the rejection of Weakening is the mark of relevant logics, where the
preservation of bodies of information relevant to the derivation of
the conclusion is the motivation. By rejecting Weakening, we highlight
a certain type of informational *taxonomy*, in the sense that
we know *which* bodies of information were used. To preserve
more structural detail than simply which bodies of information were
used, we need to consider rejecting further structural rules.

Suppose that we want to record not only which pieces of information were used in an inference, but also how often they were used. In this case we would reject Contraction:

- (Contraction)
A⊗A⇐A

x•x⊑x

Contraction allows the multiple use, without restriction, of a piece of information. So if keeping a record of the “informational cost” of the execution of some information processing is a concern, Contraction will be rejected. The rejection of Contraction is the mark of linear logics, which were designed for modelling just such processing costs (see Troelstra 1992).

If we wish to preserve the *order* of use of pieces of
information, then we will reject the structural rule of
Commutation:

- (Commutation)
A⊗B⇐B⊗A

x•y⊑z→y•x⊑z

Information-order will be of particular concern in temporal settings (consider action-composition) and natural language semantics (Lambek 1958), where non-commuting logics first appeared. Commutation comes also in a more familiar strong form:

- (Commutation (strong))
- (
A⊗B) ⊗D⇐ (A⊗D) ⊗B

∃u(x•z⊑u∧u•y⊑w) → ∃u(x•y⊑u∧u•z⊑w)

The strong form of Commutation results from its combination with
the structural rule of
Association:^{[5]}

- (Association)
A⊗ (B⊗C) ⇐ (A⊗B) ⊗C

∃u(x•y⊑u∧u•z⊑w) → ∃u(y•z⊑u∧x•u⊑w)

Rejecting Association will preserve the precise fine-grained properties of the combination of pieces of information. Non-associative logics were introduced originally to capture the combinatorial properties of language syntax (see Lambek 1961).

In the presence of Commutation, a double implication pair (→, ←) collapses into single implication →. In the presence of all of the structural rules, fusion, ⊗, collapses into Boolean conjunction, ∧. In this case, the residuation conditions outlined in (5) and (6) collapse into a mono-directional function.

The choice of which structural rules to retain obviously depends
on just what informational phenomena is being modelled, so there is a
strong *pluralism* at work. By rejecting Weakening say, we are
speaking of *which* data were relevant to the process, but are
saying nothing about its multiplicity (in which case we would reject
Contraction), its order (in which case we would reject Commutation),
or the actual patterns of use (in which case we would reject
Association). By allowing Association, Commutation, and Contraction,
we have the taxonomy locked down. We might not know the order or
multiplicity of the data that were used, but we do know what types,
and exactly what types, were relevant to the successful
processing. The canonical contemporary exposition of such an
information-based interpretation of propositional relevant logic is
Mares (2004). Such an interpretation allows for an elegant treatment
of the contradictions encoded by relevant logics. By distinguishing
between *truth conditions* and *information conditions*,
we allow for an interpretation of *x*
⊩ *A* ∧ ¬ *A* as * x
carries the information that A and not A*. For an
exploration of the distinction between truth-conditions and
information-conditions within

*quantified*relevant logic, see Mares (2009).

At such a stage, things are still fairly *static*. By
shifting our attention from static bodies of information, to the
manipulation *of* these bodies, we will reject structural rules
beyond Weakening, arriving ultimately at categorial information
theory, as it is encoded by the very weakest substructural
logics. Hence the weaker we go, the more “procedural” the
flavour of the logics involved. From a dynamic/procedural perspective,
linear logics might be thought of as a “half way point”
between static classical logic, and fully procedural categorial
information theory. For a detailed exposition of the relationship
between linear logic and other formal frameworks in the context of
modelling information flow, see Abramsky (2008).

### 3.3 Related Approaches

The information as code approach is a very natural perspective on information flow, hence there are a number of related frameworks that exemplify it.

One such approach to analysing information as code is to carry out such an analysis in terms of the computational complexity of various propositional logics. Such an approach may propose a hierarchy of propositional logics that are all decidable in polynomial time, with this hierarchy being structured by the increasing computational resources required for the proofs in the various logics. D'Agostino and Floridi (2009) carry out just such an analysis, with their central claim being that this hierarchy may be used to represent the increasing levels of informativeness of propositional deductive reasoning.

Gabbay's (1993, 1996) framework of *labelled deductive
systems* exemplifies the information as code approach in manner
very similar to the informationalised substructural logics
of section 3.1. An item of data is given as a
pair of the form *x* : *A*, where *A* is a piece of
declarative information, and *x* is a label
for *A*. *x* is a representation of information that is
needed operate on or alter the information encoded
by *A*. Suppose that we have also the data-pair *y*
: *A* → *B*. We may apply *x* to *y*,
resulting in the data-pair *x* + *y* : *B* In this
case, a database is a configuration of labelled formulas, or
data-pairs (Gabbay 1993: 72). The labels and their corresponding
application operation are organised by an algebra, and the properties
of this algebra will impose constraints on the applications
operation. Different constraints, of “meta-conditions” as
Gabbay calls them (Gabbay 1993: 77), will correspond to different
logics. For example, if we were to ignore the labels, then we would
have classical logic, if we were to accept only the derivations which
used all of the labelled assumptions, then we would have relevance
logic, and if we accepted only the derivations which used the labelled
assumptions exactly once, then we would have linear logic. Labels are
behaving very much like possible worlds here, and the short step from
possible worlds to information states makes it obvious how it is that
the meta-conditions on labels may be captured by structural
rules.

Artemov's (2008) framework of *justification logic* shares
many surface similarities with Gabbay's system of labelled
deduction. The logic is composed of *justification assertions*
of the form *x* : *A*, read as * x is a
justification for A*. Justifications themselves are
evidential bases of varying sorts that will vary depending on the
context. They might be mathematical proofs, sets of causes or
counterfactuals, or something else that fulfils the justificatory
role. What it means for

*x*to justify

*A*is not analysed directly in justification logic. Rather, attempts are made to characterise the justification relation

*x*:

*A*itself, via various operations and their axioms. The application operation, ‘.’ mimics the application operation ‘+’ from labelled deduction, or the fusion ‘⊗’ operation from categorial information theory. In justification logic, the symbol ‘+’ is reserved for the representation of joint evidence. Hence ‘

*x*+

*y*’ is read as ‘

*the joint evidence of*’. Application and join are characterised in justification logic by the following axioms respectively:

*x*and*y*- (13)
*x*: (*A*→*B*) → (*y*:*A*→ (*x*.*y*) :*B*)- (14)
*x*:*A*→ (*x*+*y*) :*A*, and*x*:*A*→ (*y*+*x*) :*A*

The latter axiom characterises the monotonicity of joint evidential bases. Apart from the commutativity of +, the structural properties of the justification operations are currently unexplored, although the potential for such an exploration is exciting. Justification logic is used to analyse notoriously difficult epistemic problems such as the Gettier cases and more. If we take our epistemology to be informationalised, then the constitution of evidential bases as information states places justification logics within the information as code approach in a straightforward manner. For further details, see Artemov and Fitting (2012).

Zalta's work on object theory (Zalta 1983, 1993) provides a different way to analyse informational content—understood as propositional content—and its structure. Motivated by metaphysical considerations, object theory starts by proposing a theory of objects and relations (usually formulated in a second order quantified modal language). This theory can then be used to define and characterise states of affairs, propositions, situations, possible worlds, and other related notions. The resulting picture is one where all these things have internal structure, their algebraic properties are axiomatized, and one can therefore reason about them in a classical proof-theoretical way.

A philosophical point touched by this approach concerns the link
between the propositional content (information) expressed by sentences
and the idea of predication. Relevant to this entry is Zalta's (1993)
development of a version of situation theory that follows this
approach, and where a key element is the usage of two forms of
predication. Briefly, the formula ‘*Px*’ corresponds
to the usual form of predication by exemplification (as in
“Obama is American”), while ‘*xP*’
corresponds to predication via *encoding*. Abstract objects are
then defined to be (essentially) encodings of properties, in
combinations which might not even be made factual. These provisions
enable the existence of information about abstract, possible, or
fictional entities. For details on the tradition to which object
theory belongs see Textor (2012), McGrath (2012), and King
(2012).

## 4. Connections Between the Approaches

While the three approaches discussed above (range, correlations, code) differ in that they emphasise different informational themes, the underlying notion they aim to clarify is the same (information). It is then natural to find that the similarities and synergies between the approaches invite the exploration of ways to combine them. Each one of the next subsections illustrates how one could bring together two out of the three approaches. Section 4.1 exemplifies the interface between the info-as-range and info-as-correlation views. Sections 4.2 and 4.3 do the same with the other two pairs of combinations, namely code and correlations, and code and ranges.

### 4.1 Ranges and correlations

A central intuition in the information-as-range view is the
correspondence that exists between information at hand (where this can
be qualified in various ways) and the range of possibilities which are
compatible with such information. On the other hand, a key feature of
the correlational approach to information is its reliance on a
structured information system formed by components that are
systematically connected. In general, many properties of a structured
system will actually be *local* properties, in that they are
determined by only some of the components (the fact that there is a
dot moving upwards in a radar can be determined only by looking at the
screen, even if this behaviour is correlated with the motion of a
remote plane, which is another component of the system). If one has
access to information pertaining to only a few of the many components
of a system, a natural notion of range of possibilities arises,
consisting of all the possible global configurations of the system
that are compatible with such local information. This subsection
expands on this particular way to link the two approaches, but as it
will be noted at the end, this is not the only one and the search for
other ways lies ahead as an open area of inquiry.

Formally, the link between ranges and correlations described above
may be approached by using a *restricted* product state space
as a model of the architecture of the system (van Benthem and Martinez
2008). The basic structures are *constraint models*, versions
of which have been around in the literature for some years (for
example Fagin et al. 1995 in the study of epistemic logic, and Ghidini
and Giunchiglia 2001 in the study of context dependent
reasoning). Constraint models have the form

ℳ = ⟨Comp,States,C,Pred⟩.

Here, the basic component spaces are indexed by *Comp*, the
states of each component are taken from *States* (with
different components using maybe only a few of the elements
of *States*), and the global states of the system are global
valuations, that is, functions that assign a state to each basic
component *Comp*. Not all such functions are allowed, only
those in *C*. Finally, *Pred* is a labelled family of
predicates (sets of global states).

To see how this fits with the information-as-correlation view,
consider again the example of planes being monitored by radars. As
before, each monitoring situation will be modelled as having only two
parts, now indexed by the members of *Comp* =
{*screen*, *plane*}. The actual instances of screening
situations could then correspond to global states, which in this case
with only two components can be thought of as pairs
(*s*, *b*) where *s* is a particular screen
and *b* a particular plane. Hence, global states connect
instances of parts, so representing instances of a whole system. But
then a crucial restriction comes into play, because not all screens
are connected with all planes, only with those belonging to the same
monitoring situation. The set *C* selects only such permissible
pairs, thus playing a role similar to that of a channel
in section 2.3. Finally, *Pred*
classifies global states into types, similar to the classification
relations of section 2.3.

As we said before, some properties of systems are local
properties, with only some of the components of the systems being
relevant in determining whether it holds or not. That a monitoring
situation is one where the plane is moving North depends only on the
plane, not on the screen. In general, if a property is completely
determined by subset of components **x** then, in what
concerns that property, any two global states that agree
on **x** should be indistinguishable. In fact, each
such **x** induces an equivalence relation of local
property determination so that for every two global
states **s**, **t**:

s∼_{x}tif and only if the values ofsandtat each one of the components inxare the same.

In this way one gets not only a conceptual but also a formal link
to the information-as-range approach, because constraint models can
then be used to interpret a basic modal language with atomic formulas
of the form *P*—where *P* is one of the labels of
predicates in *Pred*—and with complex formulas of the form
¬φ, φ ∨ ψ, *U*φ, and
□_{x}φ, where **x**
is a partial tuple of components and *U* is the universal
modality. More concretely, given a constraint model ℳ and a
global state *s*, the crucial satisfaction conditions are given
by:

ℳ, s⊧Pif and only if s∈Pℳ, s⊧Uφif and only if ℳ, t⊧ φ for alltℳ, s⊧ □_{x}φif and only if ℳ, t⊧ φfor allt∼_{x}s

The resulting logic is axiomatised by the fusion
of *S*_{5} modal logics for the universal
modality *U* and each one of the
□_{x} modalities, plus the addition of
axioms of the form *U* φ
→□_{x}φ, and
□_{x}φ
→□_{y}φ whenever
∼_{y} ⊆
∼_{x}.

The information-as-range research agenda includes other topics,
such as agency and the dynamics of information update, which can in
principle be incorporated to the constraint models setting (van
Benthem and Martinez 2008). For example, in the case of agency, to the
architectural structure of a state system captured by a constraint
model one could add epistemic accessibility relations for a group of
agents A, so to obtain *epistemic
constraint models* of the form

ℳ = ⟨Comp,States,C,Pred, {≈_{a}}_{a∈A}⟩.

where ≈_{a} is the equivalence accessibility
relation of agent *a*. Here one could refine the planes and radar
example above by adding some agents, say the controller and the
pilot. By relying only on the controls each agent can see, the
controller will not be able to distinguish states that agree on the
direction of the plane but that differ, say, on the metereological
conditions around the plane. Those states will be related by the
controller's relation in the model, but not by the pilot's
relation. In principle, this merge of modal epistemic models and
constraint models allows one to study, in a single setting, aspects of
both the information-as-range and information-as-correlation points of
view. The corresponding logical language for epistemic constraint
models is the same as for basic constraint models, expanded with
the *K*_{i} modal operators, one per agent. The
logic is the fusion of the constraint logic from above and
a *S*_{5} logic per each agent *a*.

As mentioned earlier, constraint models exploit a particular kind
of link that exists between information-as-correlation and
information-as-range, a link that arises from the locality of
properties in a structured system and yields models (constraint
models) that are formally closer to the ones used in the
information-as-range approach. But other links between the approaches
may be found that come from addressing other kind of questions, and
their resulting formal models may end up being closer to situation
theoretic-ones. For example, one may ask: how could a relation of
epistemic accessibility arise from a setting of epistemic states in
which agents may have *incomplete* information about an
intended range of such states? This is not the case with the epistemic
constraint models described above, where agents have complete
information about what holds true of all the epistemically accessible
worlds. One way to address this question (Barwise 1997) is to consider
a fixed classification *A* the instances of which are the
epistemic states, and with a local logic per agent attached to each
state. For some states these local logic may be incomplete
(see section 2.3), so agents may not
have information about everything that holds true of the intended
range of states. Then, roughly, the states accessible from a given
state *s* and agent *a* will be those whose properties
(types) do not contradict the local logic of *a*
in *s*. With these epistemic relations in place, the expanded
classification *A* can be used to interpret a basic modal
language.

### 4.2 Code and correlations

Logical frameworks that crossover information as code and
information as correlation get their most explicit representation in
work that does just this—model the crossover between the two
frameworks. Restall (1994) and Mares (1996) give independent proofs of
the representability of Barwise's information as correlation
channel-theoretic framework within the information as code approach as
exemplified by substructural logics framework. In this section we will
trace the motivations and the main details of the proof, before
demonstrating the connection with *category theory*.

The basic steps are these—if we understand information channels to be information states of a special sort, namely the sort of information state that carries information of conditional types, then there is an obvious meeting point between information as correlation as exemplified by channel theory, and information as code as exemplified by informationalised substructural logics. The intermediate step is to reveal the connection between channel semantics for conditional types, and the frame semantics for conditionals given by relevance logics.

Starting with the channel theoretic analysis of conditionals, as
noted already, the running motivation behind Barwise's
channel-theoretic framework is that information flow is underpinned by
an information channel. Barwise understood conditionals
as *constraints* in the sense that *A* → *B* is
a constraint from *A* to *B* in the sense of *A*
⇒ *B* from section 2.2 above. In
the information that *A* is combined with the information encoded
by the constraint, then the result or output is the information
that *B*.

The information that *A* and that *B* is carried by the
situations *s*_{1}, *s*_{2}…. and the
information encoded by the constraint is carried by an information
channel *c*. Given this, Barwise's evaluation condition for a
constraint is as follows (the condition is given here in Barwise's
notation from his later work on conditionals, although in earlier
writings such conditions appeared in the notation given
in section 2.2 above):

- (15)
*c*⊧*A*→*B*iff for all*s*_{1},*s*_{2}, if*s*_{1}*c*

↦*s*_{2}and*s*_{1}⊧*A*, then*s*_{2}⊧*B*

*s*_{1} *c*

↦ *s*_{2}
is read as

the information carried by the channel

c, when combined with the information carried by the situations_{1}, results in the information carried by the situations_{2}.

Obviously enough, this is very close in spirit to (9) in the section on information as code above.

As noted above, the intermediate step concerns the ternary
relation *R* from the early semantics for relevance logic. The
semantic clause for the conditional from relevance logic is:

- (16)
*x*⊩*A*→*B*iff for all*y*,*z*∈**F**s.t.*Rxyz*, if*y*⊩*A*then*z*⊩*B*

*Rxyz* is, by itself, simply an abstract mathematical
entity. One way or reading it, the way that became popular in
relevance logic circles, is

Rxyziff the result of combiningxwithyis true atz.

Given that the points of evaluation in relevance logics were
understood originally as impossible situations (since the may be both
inconsistent and incomplete), the main conceptual move was to
understand channels to be special types of situations. The full proofs
may be found in Restall (1994) and Mares (1996), and these demonstrate
that the expressive power of Barwise's system may be captured by the
frame semantics of relevance logic. What it is that such
“combining” of *x* and *y* amounts to depends
on, of course, which structural rules are operating on the frame in
question. As explained in the previous section above, the choice of
which rules to include will depend on the properties of the phenomena
being modelled.

The final step required for locating the meeting point between
information as code and information as correlation is as
follows. Contemporary approaches to relevance and other substructural
logics understand the points of evaluation (impossible situations) to
be information states. There is certainly no constraint on information
that it be complete or consistent, so the expressibility of impossible
situations it not sacrificed. Such an informational reading (Paoli
2002; Restall 2000; Mares 2004) lends itself to multiple applications
of various substructural frameworks, and also does away with the
ontological baggage brought by questions like “what are
impossible situations?” in the “What are possible
worlds?” spirit. An information-state reading of *Rxyz*
will be something like

the result of combining the information carried by

xandygenerates the informations carried byz.

Making this explicit results in *Rxyz* being
written down as *x* • *y* ⊑ *z*, in which
case (15) is, via (16), equivalent to (9).

An important structural rule for the composition operation on information channels, that is, on information states that carry information of conditional types, is that it is associative. What this means is that:

- (17)
*z**x*• (*y*•*v*)

↦*w*=*z*(*x*•*y*) •*v*

↦*w*

Where *z* ⊩ *A* and *w* ⊩ *D*,
this will be the case for all *x*, *y*, *v*
s.t. *x* ⊩ *A* → *B*, *y*
⊩ *B* → *C*, *v* ⊩ *C*
→ *D*. This is just the first step required to demonstrate
that channel theory, and its underlying substructural logic, form
a *category*.

Category theory is an extremely powerful tool in its own
right. For a thorough introduction see Awodey (2006). For more work on
the relationship between various substructural logics and channel
theory, see Restall (1994a, 1997, 2006). Further category-theoretic
work on information flow may be found in Goguen (2004—see Other
Internet Resources). Recent important work on category-theoretic
frameworks for information flow that extend
to *quantifiable/probabilistic* frameworks is due to Seligman
(2009). Perhaps the most in depth treatment of information flow in
category theoretic terms is to be found in the work of Samson
Abramsky, and an excellent overview may be found in his
“Information, Processes, and Games” (2008).

### 4.3 Code and ranges

Logical frameworks that model information as code and range along with information about encoding have been developed by Velázquez-Quesada (2009), Liu (2009), Jago (2006), and others. The key element to all of these approaches is the introduction of some syntactic code to the conceptual architecture of the information as range approach.

Taking Velázquez-Quesada (2009) as a working example, start
with a *modal-access model* *M*
=⟨*S*, *R*, *V*, *Y*, *Z*⟩where
⟨*S*, *R*, *V* ⟩is a Kripke Model, *Y*
is the *access set function* and *Z* is the *rule set
function* s.t. (where *I* is the set of classical
propositional language based on a set of atomic propositions):

*Y*:*W*→ ℘(*I*) assigns a set of formulas of*I*to each*x*∈*S*.*Z*:*W*→ ℘(*R*) assigns a set of rules based on*I*to each*x*∈*S*.

A modal-access model is a member of the class of modal access
models **MA** iff it satisfies truth for formulas and
truth preservation for rules. **MA**_{k}
models are those **MA** models such that *R* is an
equivalence relation.

From here, inference is represented as a modal operation adding
the rule's conclusion to the access set of information states of the
of the agent such that the agent can access both the rule and its
premises. Where *Y*(*x*) is the access set at *x*,
and *Z*(*x*) is the rule set at *x*:

**Inference on knowledge**: Where*M*= ⟨*S*,*R*,*V*,*Y*,*Z*⟩ ∈**MA**_{k}, and σ is a rule,*M*_{k}σ = ⟨*S*,*R*,*V*,*Y*′,*Z*⟩ differs from*M*in*Y*′, given by*Y*′(*x*) :=*Y*(*x*) ∪{conc(σ)} if prem(σ) ⊆*Y*(*x*) and σ ∈*Z*(*x*), and by*Y*′(*x*) :=*Y*(*x*) otherwise.

The dynamic logic for inference on knowledge then incorporates the
ability to represent “*there is a knowledge inference
with* σ *after which* φ *holds* ”
(Velázquez-Quesada 2009). It is in just this sense that such
modal information theoretical approaches model the outputs of
inferential processes, as opposed to the properties of the inferential
processes that generate such outputs (see the section
on *categorial information theory* for models of such dynamic
properties).

Jago (2009) proposes a rather different approach based upon the
elimination of worlds *considered* possible by the agent as the
agent reasons deductively. Such epistemic (doxastic) possibilities
structure an epistemic (doxastic) space under bounded rationality. The
connection with information as code is that the modal space is
individuated syntactically, with the worlds corresponding to possible
results of step-wise rule-governed inferences. The connection with
information as range is that the rules that he agent does or does not
have access to will impact upon the range of discrimination for the
agent. For example, if the agent's epistemic-base contains two worlds,
a ¬φ world and a φ ∨ ψ world say, then can
refine their epistemic base only if they have access to the
disjunctive syllogism rule.

A subtle but important contribution of Jago's is the following:
the modal space in question will contain only those epistemic options
which are not *obviously* impossible. However, what is or is
not obviously impossible will vary from both agent to agent, as well
as for a single agent over time as that agent refines its logical
acumen. This being the case, the modal space in question
has *fuzzy* boundaries.

## 5. Special topics

There is a varied list of special topics pertaining to the logical approach to information. This section briefly illustrates just a couple of them, which are important regardless of the particular stance one takes (information as range, as correlation, as code). The first topic is the issue of informational equivalence: when are two structures in the logical approach one is using indistinguishable in terms of the information they are meant to encode, convey, or carry? The second topic concerns the various ways in which the idea of negative information can be understood conceptually, and properly dealt with formally.

### 5.1 Information Structures and Equivalence

Every logical approach to information comes with its own kind of information structures. Depending on the particular stance and the aspect of information to be stressed, these structures may stand for informational states, structured syntactic representations, pieces of information understood as commodities, or global structures made up from local interrelated informational states or stages. Under which conditions can two informational structures be considered to be informationally equivalent?

Addressing this question brings out the need to have it clear at
which level of granularity one is testing for equivalence. Take for
example the classical extensional notion of logical equivalence. This
is a coarse equivalence, in that informationally different claims such
as 2 *is even* and 2 *is prime* cannot be distinguished,
as their extensions will coincide. Take instead an equivalence given
by identity at the level of representations (say syntactic
equality). This is on the contrary too fine-grained in some cases: to
a bilingual speaker, the information that the shop is closed would be
equally conveyed by a sign saying “Closed” as by a sign
saying “*Geschlossen*”, even if the two words are
different.

An intermediate notion of equivalence that has proved central to
the range, correlational, and code takes on information is the
relation of bisimulation between structures. A bisimulation relation
between two graphs *G* and *H* (where both the arrows and
nodes of the graphs are labelled) is a binary relation *R*
between the nodes of the graphs with the property that whenever a
node *g* of *G* is related to a node *h* of *H*,
then:

*g*and*h*have the same labels, and- For every relation label
*L*and every L-child of*g*′ of*g*, there must be a L-child*h*′ of*h*such that*h*and*h*′ are related by*R*. A similar condition must hold for every*L*-child of*h*.

A simple example would be the relation between the following two
graphs (empty set of labels) that relates the point *x*
with *a* and the point *y* with the
points *b*, *c*, *d*.

x→y

↻a→b→c→d

↻

Bisimulation is a central notion from the information-as-range perspective because the Kripke models of section 1 are precisely labelled graphs. It is a classical result of modal logic that if two states of two models are related by a bisimulation, then the states will satisfy exactly the same modal formulas, and in addition a first order property of states is definable in the basic modal language if and only if the property is preserved under bisimulation.

In the correlational stance, in situation theory, bisimulation turns out to be the right notion in determining whether two infons that might look structurally different actually are the same as pieces of information. For example, the analysis of Liar-like claims leads to infons that are nested in themselves, such as

σ = ⟨⟨True, what : σ, 0⟩⟩.

One can naturally depict the structure of σ as a labelled graph, which will be bisimilar to the graph associated with the apparently different infon

ψ = ⟨⟨True, what :⟨⟨True, what : ψ, 0⟩⟩, 0⟩⟩.

The notion of bisimulation appeared independently in computer science, so it so no surprise that it also shows in issues closest to the information-as-code approach, with its focus on representation and computation. Several versions of bisimulation have been applied to classes of automata to determine when two of them are behaviourally equivalent, and data encodings such as

L=⟨0,L⟩ andL= ⟨0, ⟨0,L⟩⟩,

both of which represent the same object (an infinite list of zeroes) can be identified as such by noticing that the graphs that depict the structure of these two expressions are bisimilar. See Aczel (1988), Barwise and Moss (1996), and Moss (2009) for more information about bisimulation an circularity, connections with modal logic, data structures, and coalgebras.

### 5.2 Negative information

This entry has focused mostly on *positive
information*. Formally speaking, *negative information* is
simply the extension-via-negation of the positive fragment of any
logic built around information-states. Different negation-types will
constrain the behaviour of negative information in various
ways. Informally, negative information may be thought of variously as
what is canonically expressed with sentential negation, process
exclusion (both propositional and sub-propositional) and more. Even
when we restrict ourselves to a single conceptual notion, there may be
vigorous philosophical debate as to which formal construction best
captures the notion in question. In this section, we run though
several formal analyses of negative information, we examine some of
the philosophical debates surrounding the suitability of various
formal constructions with respect to particular applications, and
examine the related topic of failure of information flow in the
situation-theoretic sense, which may give raise to misinformation or
lack of information in particular settings.

Non-constructive intuitionistic negation, is aimed towards accounting for negative information in the context of information flow via observation. For more details on this point, see the subsection intuitionistic logics and Beth and Kripke models in the supplementary document: Abstract Approaches to Information Structure.

Working with the frames from section 3.1,
non-constructive intuitionistic negation is defined in terms of the
constructive implication, (21), which is combined with
bottom, **0**, which holds nowhere, as specified by its
frame condition:

- (18)
*x*⊩**0**for no*x*∈**F**

Hence intuitionistic negation is defined as follows:

- (19)
- −
*A*:=*A*→**0**

Hence the frame condition for −*A* is as follows:

- (20)
*x*⊩ −*A*[*A*→ 0] iff for all*y*∈**F**, s.t.*x*⊑*y*, if*y*⊩*A*then*y*⊩ 0

(20) states that if *x* carries the information that
−*A*, then there no state *y* such that *y* is an
informational development of *x* where *y* carries the
information that *A*.

The definition of −*A* in terms
of *A* → **0** throws
up an asymmetry between positive and negative information. In an
information model −*A* holds at *x*
∈ **F** iff *A* does not hold at
any *y* ∈ **F** such
that *x* ⊑ *y*. Whilst the
verification of *A* at *x* ∈ **F** only
involves checking *x*, verifying −*A* at *x*
∈ **F** involves checking
all *y* ∈ **F** such
that *x* ⊑ *y*. According to
Gurevich (1977) and Wansing (1993), this asymmetry means that
intuitionistic logic does not provide an adequate treatment of
negative information, since, unlike the verification of *A*,
there is no way of verifying −*A* “on the spot”
so to speak. Gurevich and Wansing's objection to this asymmetry is a
critical response to Grzegorczyk (1964). For arguments in support of
Grzegorczyk's asymmetry between positive and negative information, see
Sequoiah-Grayson (2009). A fully constructive negation that allows for
falsification “on the spot” is known also as *Nelson
Negation* on account of it being embedded within Nelson's
constructive systems (Nelson 1949, 1959). For a contemporary
development of these constructive systems, see section 2.4.1 of
Wansing (1993).

In a static logic setting, negation is, at the very least, used to
rule out truth (if not to express explicit falsity). In a dynamic
setting, negation will be used to rule out
particular *processes*. For a development negative information
as process exclusion in the context of categorial information theory
see Sequoiah-Grayson (2013). This idea has its origins in the Dynamic
Predicate Logic of Groenendijk and Stokhof (1991), in particular with
their development of negative information via negation
as *test-failure*. For an exploration between the conceptions
of negative information as process exclusion and test-failure, see
Sequoiah-Grayson (2010).

In any logic for negation as process-exclusion, the
process-exclusion will be *non-directional* if the logic in
question is commutative. Directional process-exclusion will result
when we remove the structural rule of commutation. For a discussion of
the relationship between the formalisation of directional process
exclusion as commutation-failure along with symmetry-failure on
compatibility and incompatibility relations on information states, see
Sequoiah-Grayson (2011). For an extended discussion of negative
information in the context of categorial grammars, see Buszkowski
(1995).

## 6. Conclusion

There is a bi-directional relation between logic and information. On the one hand, information underlies the intuitive understanding of standard logical notions such as inference (commonly thought of as the process that turns implicit information into explicit one) and computation. On the other hand, logic provides a formal framework for the study of the notion of information.

The logical study of information reveals and studies some of the
most fundamental *qualitative* aspects of
information. Different stances on information naturally highlight some
of these aspects more than others. Thus, the information-as-range
stance most naturally highlights *agency* and the *dynamics
of information* in settings with multiple agents that
can *interact* with each other. The *aboutness of
information* (information is always about something) is a central
theme in the information-as-correlation stance, as it is the fact
that *information is situated* (what information is carried by
two instances of the same signal may have different informational
content). And the topic of *encoding* of information and
its *processing* (as in the case of formal inference) is at the
core of the information-as-code stance. None of these qualitative
aspects of information is exclusive to just one of the stances, even
if some stress some topics more than others, and in fact some themes
such as the *structure of information and its relation with
information content* are equally pertinent regardless of the
stance. The view of information studied in this entry thus differs
from other important formal frameworks that
study *quantitative* notions of information. For example,
Shannon's statistical theory of information is concerned with things
such as optimizing the amount of data that can be transmitted via a
noisy channel, and the Kolmogorov's complexity theory quantifies the
informational complexity of a string as the length of the shortest
program that outputs it when executed by a fixed universal Turing
machine.

The contributions of the logical approach to information include fruitful reinterpretations of known logical systems (such as epistemic logic or relevance logic), and also new systems that result from elaborating on these so to capture further informational aspects, or from combining aspects of two different stances, as the constraint systems of section 4. New frameworks (situation theory in the 80s) have also resulted from exploring from scratch what sorts of inference—maybe new and non-classical—one should allow in order to model certain aspects of information.

Looking for *interfaces* between the three stances is a
nascent direction of inquiry, discussed here
in section 4. A complementary issue is
whether the stances can be *unified*. There are several formal
frameworks that, beyond serving as potential settings for exploring
the issue of unification, are abstract mathematical theories of
information in their own right. Each of these goes well beyond the
scope of this entry, so they are just listed next.

- Domain Theory (Abramsky and Jung 1994): it has been used to study the processes of unraveling or “improvement” of informational states in terms of partial orderings of information states that naturally arise across the stances.
- Point-free topology: it has deep connections with computer science and it can actually be motivated as a logic of information (Vickers 1996).
- Chu Spaces (Pratt 1999): in category theory they are presented as generalizations of topologies. The immediate link with things discussed in this entry is that the classifications used in situation theory are simply Chu spaces, discovered independently and with different aims.
- Coalgebra: another branch of category theory that has also been presented as the “mathematics of sets and observations” (Jacobs 2012, Other Internet Resources). This framework has strong links with many notions discussed in this entry, in particular modal logic (section 1) and bisimulation (section 5.1).
- Probability Theory: it is clearly at the center of
abstract
*quantitative*approaches to information. Various versions of the inverse relationship principle that lead to measures of*semantic*information (see section 1.3 and Floridi 2013) descend from the version used by Shannon (1950): in a communication setting via noisy channels, the less expected a received message is, the more informative it is.

The logical study of information resembles in spirit other more traditional endeavours, such as the logical study of the concept of truth or computation: in all these cases the object of logical study plays a central role in the intuitive understanding of logic itself. The three perspectives on qualitative information presented in this entry (ranges, correlations, and code) portrait the diverse state of the art in this field, where many directions of research lay open, both on the way of looking for unifying or interfacing settings for the different stances, and of deepening the understanding of the main qualitative features of information (dynamics, aboutness, encoding, interaction, etc.) within each stance.

Finally, interested readers may wish to pursue the topics in the supplementary document

Abstract Approaches to Information Structure

which covers the topics intuitionistic logic, Beth and Kripke models, and algebraic and other approaches to modal information theory and related areas.

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### Acknowledgments

The authors would like to extend their thanks to the Editors of the Stanford Encyclopaedia of Philosophy, as well as to Johan van Benthem, Olivier Roy, and Eric Pacuit. Their assistance and advice has been invaluable.