First published Mon Feb 8, 2021

A hyperintensional concept draws a distinction between necessarily equivalent contents. If the concept is expressed by an operator, \(H\), then \(H\) is hyperintensional insofar as \(HA\) and \(HB\) can differ in truth value in spite of \(A\) and \(B\)’s being necessarily equivalent. Necessary equivalence of claims is standardly understood in terms of possible worlds (ways things could have been): \(A\) and \(B\) are necessarily equivalent when they are true at the same worlds. This is sometimes put in terms of sentences sharing an intension. An extensional operator (e.g., Boolean negation) allows substitution salva veritate of sentences with the same extension, that is, truth value: if \(A\) has the same truth value as \(B\), then also \({\sim}A\) has the same truth value as \({\sim}B\). An intensional operator (e.g., the box of necessity) allows substitution salva veritate of sentences that express necessary equivalents: if \(A\) is necessarily equivalent to \(B\), then \(\Box A\) has the same truth value as \(\Box B\). The expression “hyperintensional” is thus for an \(H\) that defies substitution salva veritate even of expressions with the same intension.

Cresswell (1975) introduced the expression “hyperintensional” to pick out a position in a sentence where substitution fails for logical equivalents. Nowadays the term is used more broadly, with unrestrictedly necessary equivalence replacing logical equivalence. Candidates for unrestricted necessity often include, besides the logical, mathematical and metaphysical necessity. We don’t discuss whether one of these is reducible to the others—e.g., the mathematical to the logical, as claimed by logicists.

Hyperintensionality is pervasive. Take two claims on your prospects of getting a job you may apply for:

You have 40% chances of succeeding.
You have 60% chances of failing.

These are necessarily equivalent. However, psychological studies on framing effects (Tversky & Kahneman 1981; Kahneman 2011) show that people are more prone to believe in a positive outcome when presented with (1) than with (2), thus more likely to apply. Belief seems sensitive to hyperintensional distinctions: we can come to believe different things depending on how necessarily equivalent options are presented to us (Berto 2019). Framing has vast societal impacts (Thaler & Sunstein 2008).

On to your neighbor Mike:

Mike is Mike.
Mike is Jack the Ripper.

(3) is necessarily true. Suppose (4) is true. If “Jack the Ripper” works as a proper name, (4) is necessarily true, too (Barcan Marcus 1947; Kripke 1980). Thus, (3) and (4) are necessarily equivalent. But (3) is uninformative (you already knew things are self-identical), whereas learning (4) could save your life. Information, this fundamental concept of our age, also seems to display hyperintensional features. The difference between (3) and (4) is marked by saying that you can know (3), not (4), a priori. The concept of a priori, then, has hyperintensional features too.

Quine and Davidson’s idea that serious philosophy should use only extensional notions faded in the latter half of the twentieth century, which witnessed an intensional revolution: a collective effort to analyze notions which are fundamental for our understanding of the world and of ourselves, like belief, information, knowledge, meaning, content, essence, explanation, via a single theoretical system: employing possible worlds and constructions out of them. Standard possible worlds semantics (SPWS) found applications in logic, linguistics, game theory, artificial intelligence: a success story of philosophy. However, many of these phenomena (and, more: a survey in Section 1) are, arguably, hyperintensional, requiring hyperintensional language to do them justice. And SPWS tends to collapse any distinctions more fine-grained than necessary equivalence. The issue of how best to address hyperintensionality has emerged in piecemeal fashion, via a series of difficulties of SPWS (in Section 1, we list a few). Some have denied that hyperintensionality marks a set of real phenomena and have tried to explain away hyperintensional intuitions. Some of these general attempts are discussed in Section 2.

Even if genuinely hyperintensional language is accepted into our philosophical theorizing, this leaves many further issues open. One pressing one is the question of “just ‘how hyper’ hyperintensions are” (Jespersen & Duží 2015: 527): what new distinctions should our theorizing recognize beyond necessary equivalence? The mathematical structure of the realm of hyperintensionality is not well understood yet. We come to this in Section 3. However, the early twenty-first century is seeing a hyperintensional revolution (Nolan 2014), with different general approaches currently being developed, which qualify as hyperintensional in some sense. We provide a critical survey in Section 4, where we also assess the approaches in terms of how they fare with respect to hyperintensional phenomena singled out in previous Sections.

1. The Variety of Hyperintensional Phenomena

We provide a taxonomy of candidate hyperintensional notions by dividing them into two camps: (1) representational concepts pertain to ways of representing the world (1a) in thought and (1b) in language. In the former sub-camp (1a), we find mental states or activities like believing, knowing, imagining, conceiving, being or becoming informed. In the latter sub-camp (1b), notions such as meaning, content, and conditionality. (2) Non-representational hyperintensional concepts include allegedly mind-independent, “worldly” notions such as essence, grounding, metaphysical dependence, explanation.

(The division is not uncontroversial, e.g., some claim that explanation and indicative conditionals essentially involve cognition (Lycan 2001), so they would place them in (1a). Some claim that there exists “environmental” information (Barwise & Seligman 1997) that should go into (2). We stick to what we take to be mainstream views on where such concepts should go.)

For each of these notions, we provide (a) a brief explanation of how they have been dealt with in SPWS; and (b) examples illustrating their seemingly hyperintensional nature. These, if found persuasive, may work as data against which the theories described in Section 4 can be evaluated with respect to their hyperintensional aims.

1.1 Hyperintensionality in Representation

1.1.1 Intentional Concepts

Perhaps the most plausible hyperintensional environment is the realm of intentional concepts: notions that involve states of the mind which are directed towards contents, situations, etc. The two most studied such notions are knowledge and belief. Since Hintikka (1962), these have been understood in epistemic logic as modal operators: restricted quantifiers over possible worlds. Knowledge and belief are characterized in terms of what is true throughout a set of worlds which represent ways things could be, for all the cognitive agent knows, or given the agent’s evidence, etc. If \(K\) expresses the agent’s knowledge or belief state, \(w\) is a possible world, and \(R\) an epistemic accessibility relation on the space of worlds \(W\), the Hintikkan characterization goes:

\(KA\) is true at \(w\) iff \(A\) is true at all \(w_1\) such that wRw\(_1\).

Some views in mainstream epistemology follow the same path, e.g., in relevant alternatives approaches knowledge is “an evidential state in which all relevant alternatives (to what is known) are eliminated” (Dretske 1981: 367). Uneliminated alternatives work similarly to accessible worlds.

Such treatments of knowledge and belief witnessed an early manifestation of the hyperintensionality issue: the problem of logical omniscience (Fagin et al. 1995: 335–6)—a set of closure conditions for the relevant \(K\)s, of which perhaps the most important are:

If \(KA\) and \(A\) entails \(B\), then \(KB\)
If \(A\) is logically valid, then \(KA\)
It is not the case that: \(KA\) and \(K{\sim}A\)

(C1), often dubbed Closure under entailment or Full omniscience, has it that one knows or believes all the logical consequences of what one knows or believes. (C2), Knowledge of all validities or Belief in all validities, has it that one knows or believes all logical truths. (C3) ensures the consistency of knowledge or belief. All follow from understanding \(K\) as a quantifier over worlds, as per (H). (C1): if \(A\)’s entailing \(B\) is understood in terms of all \(A\)-worlds’ being \(B\)-worlds (in all the relevant models), and given that \(KA\) means that \(A\) is true at all the epistemically accessible worlds, \(B\) will be true there, too, and so \(KB\) will hold. (C2): if \(A\)’s being logically valid is understood as its holding at all worlds (of all the relevant models), then it will hold at all the epistemically accessible ones, and so \(KA\) will hold. (C3): no possible world, thus no accessible one, will make both \(A\) and \({\sim}A\) true.

These don’t sound right for real humans, as opposed to idealized, logically infallible agents. (C1): we know basic arithmetic truths like Peano’s postulates, and these entail (suppose) Goldbach’s Conjecture (Every even whole number larger than 2 is the sum of two primes); but we don’t know whether Goldbach’s Conjecture is true. (C2): “If \({\sim}{\sim}A\), then \(A\)” is (suppose) valid, but intuitionist logicians do not believe it. (C3): we can have, if implicitly, inconsistent beliefs.

One may treat “\(KA\)” in (H) as not really standing for knowledge or belief. We should read it as “\(A\) follows logically from the agent’s knowledge”, or “The agent is committed to \(A\), given what it knows/believes”. Then we still lack some logical account of knowledge and belief per se, as opposed to some derivative attitude or conditional commitment. The commitment itself may be questioned: are we committed to believing everything, given that we have inconsistent beliefs? In what sense must a finite agent believe infinitely many logical consequences? Such a “must” lacks a corresponding “can”.

Information received a modal treatment in the classic Bar-Hillel and Carnap (1952) account. The informative task of a sentence \(A\) is to split the totality of worlds into those where \(A\) is true and those where it isn’t. An agent’s becoming informed of \(A\) is its ruling out the not\(-A\) worlds as contenders for actuality: before being informed that it’s raining outside, for all you knew, it might have been raining or not. After you are informed, you can rule out all the non-rainy worlds.

But now, “If Kennedy was shot, then Kennedy was shot” and “\(x^n + y^n = z^n\) has no integer solutions for \(n \gt 2\)” are necessarily equivalent, given the unrestricted necessity of logical and mathematical truths, and SPWS. They are true at the same worlds: all of them. On the Bar-Hillel-Carnap view, one can rule out no world after learning either. But while one easily deems the former true, the latter, which expresses Fermat’s Last Theorem, took centuries to be proved and its proof brought significant news.

Generalizing: a merely intensional analysis of information entails that no logical, mathematical, or metaphysical necessary truth can ever be informative and denies the informativeness of logical deduction. But logical deductions are informative (Jago 2009, 2014). Besides, we can become informed of exactly one of two necessarily equivalent claims. Of necessity, “All woodchucks are woodchucks” is true if and only if “All woodchucks are whistle-pigs” is (Ripley 2012). But the former is trivial, whereas one may learn the latter from a zoologist.

Other attitudes like hoping, fearing, supposing, imagining display hyperintensional features (Wansing 2017). One may be led to the general conclusion that thought is hyperintensional: our intentional states can treat necessarily equivalent contents differently. Lois Lane can wish that Superman is in love with her without wishing that Clark Kent is in love with her, although (if Barcan Marcus and Kripke are right) it is impossible for Superman to be other than Clark Kent. We can suppose that \(75 \times 12 = 900\) without supposing Fermat’s Last Theorem. Even intentional states involving perceptual experiences, like seeing, seem hyperintensional: you can see that Mary is eating an ice cream without seeing that Mary is eating an ice cream and John is either eating chips or not (you may not be seeing John at all). But \(A\) is logically equivalent to \(A \land (B \lor {\sim}B)\) in classical logic and even in many weaker logics (Barwise & Perry 1983).

1.1.2 Semantic Concepts

Propositions, taken as the contents or meanings of sentences, have often been interpreted starting from Wittgenstein’s insight that understanding a sentence is knowing what is the case if it is true (Wittgenstein 1921: 4.024). Truth conditions have been given via sets of possible worlds in the SPWS approaches of Montague (1970), Stalnaker (1976) and many others: the proposition expressed by “St Andrews is rainy” is the set of worlds where St Andrews is rainy.

This makes all necessarily equivalent propositions identical, for possible worlds can never disagree on them. “If Kennedy was shot, then Kennedy was shot” and “\(x^n + y^n = z^n\) has no integer solutions for \(n \gt 2\)” mean the same thing: the total set of worlds. This seems wrong, given that they don’t say the same thing: only one speaks about Diophantine equations. Similarly for necessary falsehoods: “Kennedy was both shot and not” and “\(2 + 3 = 6\)” are about different things, but they also end up expressing the same proposition: the empty set.

We can locate in the area of semantic concepts hyperintensional phenomena which have to do with conditionality. We start with indicative conditionals. The extensional material conditional, “\(\supset\)”, validates notoriously paradoxical inferences:

\({\sim}A\), therefore \(A \supset B\)
\(B\), therefore \(A \supset B\)

If the horseshoe captures the meaning of the indicative “if”, lots of bad-sounding conditionals from ordinary language come out true just because the antecedent is false or the consequent true: “If Clinton is Australian, then Mars is made of marbles”; “If Strasbourg is in Germany, then Clinton is American”.

One may think the issue is that the connection between antecedent and consequent is too contingent an affair here. One may require, for “If \(A\), then \(B\)” to be true, that it cannot be the case that the antecedent is true while the consequent is false. This gives the so-called strict conditional: a modal operator, “\(\prec\)”, such that “\(A \prec B\)” is understood as “At any possible world where \(A\) is true, \(B\) is true”.

This has its paradoxes, too. Where “\(\Box A\)” means that \(A\) is true at all possible worlds, and “\(\Diamond A\)” means that \(A\) is true at some, we get:

\({\sim}\Diamond A\), therefore \(A \prec B\)
\(\Box B\), therefore \(A \prec B\)

When \(A\) is true at no possible world, or \(B\) is true at all, there is no way for \(A\) to be true while \(B\) is false and so “\(A \prec B\)” is true. If the strict conditional captures the meaning of the indicative “if”, lots of bad conditionals come out true: “If \(6 + 3 = 11\), then Clinton is Australian”; “If Clinton is American, then \(6 + 3 = 9\)”. These are not obviously true, and there are some reasons to suppose they are false: there is no connection between antecedent and consequent, for example. Other conditional forms that the strict conditional validates but which are disputable include:

\(A \prec (B \prec B)\)
\(A \prec (B \lor {\sim}B)\)
\((A \land {\sim}A) \prec B\)

As an instance of (6), take “If Mars is made of marbles, then either St Andrews is in Scotland, or it isn’t”: the material constitution of Mars has little to do with St Andrews’ location. Some theorists argue that treatments of the conditional that do not render conditionals like these automatically true would be preferable.

On to counterfactuals or subjunctive conditionals—conditionals of the form, “If it were (had been) the case that \(A\), then it would be (have been) the case that \(B\)”. A common treatment, due to Stalnaker (1968) and Lewis (1973), analyses them in terms of possible worlds. In a simple version, they are true just in case at the closest worlds where \(A\) is true, \(B\) is true, where closeness is understood as similarity in relevant respects. “If Kangaroos had no tails, they would topple over” is true when, at all worlds where kangaroos have no tails and which are as relevantly similar as it gets to the actual world, kangaroos topple over.

This again makes all counterfactuals whose consequent is necessary, or whose antecedent is impossible, vacuously true: there are no worlds to falsify the consequent, or to verify the antecedent. Counterfactuals with impossible antecedents are called counterpossibles. They don’t seem to be all vacuously true. An often-cited example from Nolan (1997):

If Hobbes had (secretly) squared the circle, sick children in the mountains of South America at the time would have cared.
If Hobbes had (secretly) squared the circle, sick children in the mountains of South America at the time would not have cared.

Squaring the circle is a mathematical impossibility, in spite of Hobbes’ hopes. His achieving it, though, would have made no difference for those sick children. (9) should come out true for this reason, not because no possible world verifies the antecedent. For similar reasons, (8) should come out false. Against vacuism, some counterpossible pairs with opposite consequents should have different truth values (for a defense of vacuism, see Williamson 2007; for a discussion, see Berto et al. 2018).

1.2 Hyperintensionality in the Non-Representational World

Hyperintensionality was initially tied to representation: Cresswell (1975) discussed a semantics for a formal language where substitution of logical equivalents fails in intentional contexts (he mentioned “says that”, “knows that”, “believes that”, “deduces that”: 1975: 37). Other cases discussed above might contribute to the impression that our language contains hyperintensional expressions just because of phenomena involving representation.

However, various philosophers have employed hyperintensional resources to theorize about aspects of the world beyond representation. Famously, Fine (1994) argues that work on the essences of things must play a central role in metaphysics and essence talk must be hyperintensional. In the construction “\(x\) is essentially \(F\)”, we cannot be guaranteed to preserve truth by substituting necessarily equivalent predicates. Socrates is (suppose) essentially human, but not essentially (human and a member of a set), although necessarily someone is human if and only if they are human and a member of a set. Fine extends this to talk of real definition generally: it is the real definition of 2 that it is the successor of 1, but not the real definition of 2 that it is \(10-8\), even though “the successor of 1” and “\(10-8\)” necessarily have the same extension. (These examples are not in Fine 1994, but we take it he would endorse them given his discussion on pp. 4–5 and p 14.) Dunn (1990b) also argues that one needs hyperintensional resources (in his case, from relevant logic) to capture essentialist claims.

Nolan (2014) argues for the need to provide hyperintensional accounts of a range of non-representational aspects of reality. As well as a theory of essences, theories of counterfactuals, explanation, metaphysical grounding, of the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties, of dispositions, are all plausibly hyperintensional. Nolan also mentions the analysis of causation, laws of nature, objective confirmation, objective chance, and objective ethics. Other recent proposals in metaphysics that have employed hyperintensional resources include work on truthmakers, omissions, metaphysical dependence, and the distinction between qualitative and non-qualitative properties. Almost any area of metaphysics where necessity or counterfactuals have played a role is a candidate for hyperintensional approaches. We now give a flavor of hyperintensional theories of some of these topics.

The hyperintensionality of counterfactuals has been discussed above. Does their truth depend in the right kind of way on facts beyond our representational abilities? Nolan (2014: 156) argues that it sometimes does. Regular platonic solids come in only a handful of sizes (the most sides one can have, in three-dimensional space, is 20.) Still, this seems true:

If there were a piece of steel in the shape of a 36 sided platonic solid, it would have more sides than any piece of steel in the shape of a dodecahedron.

On the other hand,

If there were a piece of steel in the shape of a 36 sided platonic solid, it would have fewer sides than any piece of steel in the shape of a dodecahedron

seems false. The truth value of these is not just settled by whether the antecedent is necessary. They seem to be about pieces of steel and how they relate to each other. Which blocks of steel have which shapes is not just about us and our representations. It would not be even if steel could take shapes that it in fact cannot.

Explanation is plausibly hyperintensional: “explains” can be flanked by expressions that cannot be substituted with necessary equivalents salva veritate. One pure mathematical truth can explain another, but not every mathematical truth explains every other, even if every pure mathematical truth is a necessary truth (Baron, Colyvan, & Ripley 2020). Schneider (2011) argues that sometimes logical equivalents can explain each other, making a case that “because” is hyperintensional. \({\sim}{\sim}A\) is true because \(A\) is true, but not vice versa. If the correctness of explanations turns out to depend also on how the world is, rather than only on what suits our explanatory practices, these cases may be due to hyperintensional explanatory connections in the world. (How best to understand explanations, of course, remains a contentious philosophical question.)

Metaphysical grounding is widely regarded as hyperintensional. Sometimes a more fundamental fact necessarily leads to a less fundamental fact that it grounds, but the two are merely modally inseparable. A widely discussed example is the grounding of the existence of a set in the existence of its members. On one view, {Socrates, Plato} automatically exists if Socrates and Plato both exist, but it exists only in possible worlds where Socrates and Plato both exist. So the fact that Socrates and Plato both exist grounds the fact that {Socrates, Plato} exists (see Dunn 1990b; Fine 1994). But that {Socrates, Plato} exists is not supposed to ground the fact that Socrates and Plato both exist, even though necessarily one obtains only if the other does. On an attractive account, many complex logical truths are grounded in simpler ones. \({\sim}{\sim}A\) is grounded in \(A, (A \land A)\), is grounded in \(A\), and many other logical equivalents of \(A\) are grounded in \(A\), though they are not the same proposition as \(A\). And as before, while \((A \land A)\) is grounded in \(A, A\) is not grounded in \((A \land A)\) (see Poggiolesi 2018, 2020 for a formal logic of grounding).

Whether grounding is indeed hyperintensional may depend on how grounding claims are best understood. Where “… grounds…” is a sentential operator, the cases discussed had best be captured hyperintensionally. “(Socrates and Plato both exist) grounds (The set {Socrates, Plato} exists)”, for example. Things may work differently if we take “… grounds…” as a two-place predicate applying to facts or occurrences: “The fact that Socrates and Plato both exist grounds the fact that {Socrates, Plato} exists” expresses a relation between two objects, and we might be able to preserve the truth of this statement by substitution of any other ways of referring to each of those objects. One complication is that one might take these expressions picking out facts to themselves have constituents designating propositions: “the fact that Socrates and Plato both exist” may have the logical form the fact that A, where that \(A\) is the proposition that Socrates and Plato exist. Interpreted that way, the expression is functioning hyperintensionally after all, since the necessarily equivalent proposition that {Socrates, Plato} exists cannot be substituted into that expression without changing the truth-value of the relevant grounding claims. Finally, one could take the primary way of expressing grounding relations to be by talking about objects in general, e.g., about Socrates and Plato grounding the set {Socrates, Plato} (Schaffer 2009). On this third approach it is natural to think that any other ways of designating those objects could be substituted salva veritate so that the grounding-between-objects predicate is extensional; though see Jenkins (2011) for a hyperintensional object-theoretic grounding approach that does not allow this substitution salva veritate.

Many grounding theorists have taken the sentential operator approach as primary: see Fine (2001: 15–16), Schneider (2011: 446–7). Those that do not fall on different sides of the question of whether expressing the full range of grounding claims requires hyperintensional resources. See Duncan, Miller, and Norton (2017) for a discussion of which styles of grounding claims are best treated as hyperintensional.

The distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties features in many metaphysical theories, and it appears to be representation-independent: presumably, if mass is intrinsic it would remain such whatever we said or did. One idea behind the distinction is that a property had intrinsically is had only in virtue of an object’s own nature, while extrinsic properties are partly a matter of how the object stands to other objects. Some have argued that necessarily coextensive properties can differ in whether they are intrinsic or extrinsic (Dunn 1990a; Eddon 2011; Bader 2013; Marshall 2015; Hoffmann-Kloss 2015). Being an instance of Barak’s actual favorite property is plausibly extrinsic, but having a mass may well be intrinsic, even if mass is Barak’s favorite property, and even though, given it is actually his favorite property, anything in any possible world has the first property iff it has the second. The above-named philosophers disagree on how to characterize the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction, but they share the view that it has to be hyperintensional.

Jenkins and Nolan (2012) argue that disposition ascriptions are hyperintensional. Heidi the gifted mathematician may be disposed to find the proof of a given conjecture, on condition that it has one. This disposition of Heidi’s can be known in advance of knowing whether the conjecture has a proof. (“Give this to Heidi: if there’s a proof to be found, she’ll find it”.) Suppose the conjecture is in fact false, though the mathematical community does not yet know that. Then the condition of the disposition ascription is impossible. Still, we cannot substitute any impossibility in the disposition ascription. It is plausibly false that Heidi is disposed to find the proof of that conjecture, on the condition that she was always both identical to the number 7 and innumerate, for example.

We use necessarily false conditions in disposition ascriptions outside talk about agents, too. Working with a model where the number of prey killed is a function of the number of predators, the model might say adding half a fox to a closed ecosystem, or adding \(1/\pi\) foxes to an ecosystem, produces a certain fraction of additional rabbits killed. But it is impossible to have, e.g., \(7+1/\pi\) foxes. Still, what the ecosystem is disposed to do on the condition \(7+1/\pi\) foxes are added and it is idealized in various ways is very different from what it is disposed to do with \(105+1/\pi\) foxes and the same idealization.

One way to specify probabilities is with propositional complements: the probability that it will rain tomorrow, or that this coin will come up heads 10 times in a row. Take claims such as “\(\rP(B) = 0.6\)”, where the proposition that \(B\) is, e.g., that this (biased) coin will come up heads 10 times in a row. \(\rP\) will be hyperintensional if we cannot guarantee that we preserve truth value by substitution of necessarily equivalent propositions.

If we use \(\rP\) to represent the (degrees of) beliefs of an agent—even a logically idealized one—we might want to allow different probability assignments to necessarily equivalent propositions: with all her exhaustive knowledge of pure arithmetic and logic, the agent might still be uncertain on whether water = H2O before investigating, in spite of certainty on the self-identity of water. If the hyperintensional probability function represented objective chance or frequency, however, hyperintensionality may also be tied to how the world is. Nolan (2016a) and Salmon (2019) have both recently argued that objective chance ascriptions are hyperintensional.

Plausibly, “ought” is hyperintensional: perhaps you ought to call your sister, but it is not the case that you ought to call your sister and be self-identical even though it is impossible to call your sister without calling your sister and being self-identical, and vice versa. (Perhaps you promised to call: but unless you are a philosopher you probably did not promise to be self-identical.) Some of these obligations might be dependent on our representational practices. But perhaps there are obligations of objective morality as well. Perhaps your moral obligation to not callously cause suffering is like this. If there are objective obligations, they might be best construed as hyperintensional: the Moral Law may enjoin you to avoid callously inflicting suffering, but it may be silent about whether you ought to avoid inflicting callous suffering while being self-identical. See Faroldi (2019) for a recent hyperintensional treatment of “ought”.

Truthmakers theorists have been looking for a relationship between true propositions and the aspects of the world that make those propositions true. Theories of this relation often make truthmaking hyperintensional: \(A\) and \(B\) may be necessarily equivalent, yet the worldly bit that makes \(A\) true is distinct from the one that makes \(B\) true. As Restall (1996a) points out, this seems to follow if one also endorses the Disjunction Thesis: something is a truthmaker for (\(A\) or \(B\)) iff it is a truthmaker for \(A\) or a truthmaker for \(B\). Independently of the Disjunction Thesis, a truthmaker for one necessary truth may plausibly not be a truthmaker for all others: “There are infinitely many prime numbers” should have as truthmaker something to do with numbers. “Anyone who eats and drinks at least eats” seems to not have anything to do with numbers. See MacBride (2013 [2020], the SEP entry on truthmakers, section 1) for some accounts of truthmaking where necessarily equivalent propositions need not have the same truthmaker.

Some occurrences are impossible, but may still have explanatory and even causal consequences. It may be impossible to prove a given mathematical conjecture: the conjecture might have a counterexample that nobody has yet noticed. Still, the fact that the conjecture is not proved may have various effects: if you have bet that you will prove it by a certain time you will lose the bet; if your tenure case in the mathematics department turns on whether you managed to prove the conjecture, you will miss out on tenure. Bernstein (2016) gives a theory of omissions of impossible outcomes, and argues that they play an explanatory and causal role.

Hoffmann-Kolss (2015) argues that a number of classifications of properties needed for metaphysics are hyperintensional. The intrinsic/extrinsic distinction is one example, discussed above. Hoffman-Kolss also argues the qualitative/non-qualitative distinction is hyperintensional (the distinction between properties that do not require a relationship to a particular and those that do—e.g., being square vs. being John’s neighbor: see also Hoffman-Kolss 2019). The dispositional/categorical distinction is arguably hyperintensional (Hoffmann-Kolss 2015: 341–342, 346). (One philosophically controversial example may illustrate: on some theories, there is a necessarily-existing God that is necessarily the only omnipotent being. Still, we might think being omnipotent is dispositional, concerning the powers of that being, while being God is categorical (2015: 346).) The distinction between perfectly natural properties that best carve at the joints, and the others, is, too (2015: 345). Hoffman-Kolss’s example here is to contrast the (supposedly) perfectly natural property of being an electron with the infinitely disjunctive identity property of being \(e_1\) or being \(e_2\) or… and so on for all possible electrons \(e\). If electronhood is essential to the objects that have it, something is an electron if and only if it is one of \(e_1\), \(e_2\), etc., but Hoffman-Kolss argues this latter condition is not a perfectly natural one.

Any item on this list might be controversial. You might think that counterfactual conditionals, for example, communicate more about how we explain or predict the world than anything about the world as it is. Or that what explains what is more a matter of the representations we make of the world, than of the world itself. One could try to explain away grounding’s putative hyperintensionality in terms of our cognitive structures, as Thompson (2016) suggests. Thompson and Byrne (2019) offer a general “conceptualist” alternative to taking any of the cases we discussed as requiring non-representational phenomena to be characterized in hyperintensional terms: an explanation of our use of hyperintensional language to capture these phenomena comes from an account of what it is to describe and explain in these areas (2019: 157). Still, if a need to recognize hyperintensional distinctions flows from more than facts about how we represent the world, hyperintensionality will be of interest well beyond philosophy of mind and language.

2. Is Hyperintensionality Real?

While Section 4 considers some difficulties for specific hyperintensional theories, here we discuss general objections to the very idea that we need a theory of language or mind that marks hyperintensional distinctions. One kind of argument in this ballpark has to do with a general “Boolean” challenge to formulating a semantics for hyperintensional expressions in the dominant truth-conditional framework. This style of argument will be discussed in §2.1.

Another kind of argument advanced by defenders of SPWS such as Stalnaker (1984) and Lewis (1982, 1986), has it that the prima facie hyperintensionality of knowledge, belief, or content is misleading, and that SPWS can still do the job once misleading intuitions have been explained away. This style of argument will be discussed in §2.2.

2.1 Hyperintensional Truth Conditions

One way to modify SPWS to give truth conditions for sentences is to resort to sets including both possible and impossible worlds (ways things could not have been). Sentences that agree in truth value in very possible world can still be assigned distinct truth-conditions, since those sentences might be true in different impossible worlds. (See §4.3). Another way is to use structured meanings, where sentences with the same possible-worlds truth conditions can have different meanings because of the way they are built up. (See §4.5). An objection to these approaches can be generalized to any approach that tries to make room for hyperintensionality in a truth-conditional framework.

The objection, presented in Cresswell (2002) against structured propositions and suggested by Stalnaker (1996) against impossible worlds, can be illustrated by focusing on the meaning of negation. Given a statement \(A\), what truth-conditions can we offer for \({\sim}A\)? Plausibly, the truth conditions can be exhausted by specifying that \({\sim}A\) is true when \(A\) is false, and not otherwise. Since this exhausts the meaning of “\({\sim}\)”, it is tempting to identify the proposition \({\sim}A\) as being the proposition with this truth condition. Plausibly, also, the truth conditions for \({\sim}{\sim}A\) will just be the truth conditions for \(A\). (We may even want to derive this second claim from plausible principles about truth, falsehood, and necessity.) Now any theory which allows for distinct necessarily equivalent propositions will fall to the same objection: suppose \(C\) and \(D\) are distinct, necessarily equivalent propositions. Then \({\sim}C\) will be the proposition that is true just in case \(C\) is false, and \({\sim}D\) will be the proposition that is true just in case \(D\) is false: so \({\sim}C\) and \({\sim}D\) will be the same proposition. But then there will be a unique proposition with the truth conditions for \({\sim}{\sim}C (/{\sim}{\sim}D)\), since \({\sim}{\sim}C\) is the negation of \({\sim}C\). So \(C\) and \(D\) must be the same proposition after all. This is a reductio of the hypothesis that there can be a hyperintensional distinction between \(C\) and \(D\): if they are necessarily equivalent, they are identical.

We might call this an objection from Booleanism, both because uniqueness of truth-conditional complementation is characteristic of Boolean approaches to negation, and because similar objections can be motivated by Boolean thoughts about other operations. We might hope to define conjunction so that necessarily, \((A \land B)\) is true iff \(A\) is true and \(B\) is true, and indeed the truth condition for the proposition that \((A \land B)\) is just that both \(A\) and \(B\) are true. But then, with other innocuous assumptions, any two necessarily equivalent sentences will express the same proposition, by a similar chain of reasoning.

Cresswell (1975) was one of the pioneers of structured approaches to sentence meaning to handle hyperintensionality. So it is significant that he thinks this objection refutes a contention at the heart of orthodox structured meaning projects, though Cresswell thinks that we may still be interested in semantic structures for reasons other than how they might make a difference to the truth-conditions of complex embeddings.

Defenders of hyperintensional meanings need to resist the idea that for each proposition \(A\) there is only one proposition true whenever \(A\) is false. This leaves them with a challenge: how are we to understand logical operations such as negation and conjunction once these Boolean characterizations are rejected?

2.2 The Indispensability of Hyperintensions

Talk of belief, desire, and meaning is prima facie hyperintensional, as discussed above. But perhaps this appearance could be resisted. One strategy is to employ use/mention distinctions in novel ways. Instead of hyperintensional operations on propositions or other meanings, we can treat apparently hyperintensional language as expressing properties of or relations between sentences or other pieces of language. If we do this systematically, a theory can do away with merely intensional distinctions.

Quine (1953) suggests that modal operators, when we need them at all, are best interpreted as predicates of sentences. Quine (1956) and Davidson (1968) suggest an approach to propositional attitude ascriptions as implicitly talking about connections between people and sentences: “John believes that it is raining” is regimented as a two-place predicate holding between John and the sentence “It is raining”. For Davidson, this in effect asserts that John stands in a certain relation to a sentence that stands in the same-saying relation to the sentence “It is raining”. This supposedly accommodates how non-English speakers can believe that it is raining. Reconstruing mental attitude reports as reporting relations to sentences has fallen out of favor in contemporary philosophy, for reasons largely orthogonal to intensionality or hyperintensionality: see Propositional Attitude Ascriptions, section 7. Still, with enough ingenuity techniques like Quine’s and Davidson’s could be extended to apparently hyperintensional pieces of language.

Some philosophers who reject extensionalism nevertheless offer techniques for avoiding treating beliefs and desires as hyperintensional. Stalnaker (1984) tries to rescue the SPWS analysis of propositional content by explaining away hyperintensional intuitions via a sort of metalinguistic approach: when we fail to see that a proposition is necessarily true, or that two propositions are necessarily equivalent, we are actually failing to see what propositions are expressed by certain sentences. Given sentence \(A\), one should distinguish (1) the proposition \(P\) expressed by \(A\) (in a context), and (2) the proposition \(P\)* that A expresses \(P\), relating the sentence to what it expresses. Ignorance of necessary truths or equivalences is ignorance about P*.

Stalnaker maintains that whenever one fails to know or believe a necessary truth, \(A\), one actually fails to fully grasp the sentence \(A\)’s meaning: one doesn’t realize that \(A\) expresses the total set of worlds. Stalnaker points at the occasional distance between the syntactic structure of the relevant \(A\), which can be quite complex, and the expressed proposition—in SPWS, an unstructured entity (a set):

Whenever the structure of sentences is complicated, there will be a nontrivial question about the relation between sentences and the propositions they express, and so there will be room for reasonable doubt about what proposition is expressed by a given sentence. (Stalnaker 1984: 84)

For Stalnaker’s story to work in general, all cases of ignorance of necessary truths or equivalences must be instances of meaning ignorance. This is difficult to believe. A mathematician who wonders whether Goldbach’s conjecture is true can hardly be described as mistaken about what “Every even integer larger than two is the sum of two primes” means. They know the meanings of all constituents of the sentence—they have mastered the elementary-school-math concepts even integer, larger than, two, sum, prime number as much as any of us. As competent speakers of English, they understand how the syntax of the sentence makes its constituents conjure for it to express the content it expresses. What they have doubts about is whether that content is true. We sometimes seem to fully grasp the contents of sentences whose status of necessary truths, or falsities, we are ignorant of.

Lewis (1982) proposes a fragmentation strategy to explain away apparent failures of logical omniscience, in particular, apparent belief in inconsistencies which is not, however, belief in everything. One’s epistemic state may be split into different “frames of mind”. One may believe \(A\) in one mind frame, \({\sim}A\) in another one, but fail to put them together:

I used to think that Nassau Street ran roughly east-west; that the railroad nearby ran roughly north-south; and that the two were roughly parallel. […] So each sentence in an inconsistent triple was true according to my beliefs, but not everything was true according to my beliefs. […] My system of beliefs was broken into (overlapping) fragments. Different fragments came into action in different situations, and the whole system of beliefs never manifested itself all at once. […] The inconsistent conjunction of all three did not belong to, was in no way implied by, and was not true according to, any one fragment. That is why it was not true according to my system of beliefs taken as a whole. (Lewis 1982: 436)

Each fragment can be given the SPWS treatment, while trans-fragmental inconsistencies do not trivialize the belief system.

The account, just like Stalnaker’s, doesn’t seem to generalize. It seems strange to say that when agents don’t follow through the logical consequences of what they believe, it’s always because they haven’t conjoined the premises whereas, when they do, they suddenly come to believe all the infinitely many consequences (Jago 2014). It’s sometimes an easy logical step from \(A_1, A_2, A_3\), to \(A_1 \land A_2 \land A_3\). What is often difficult is to see whether a remote \(B\) follows from \(A_1 \land A_2 \land A_3\).

Even if Lewis and Stalnaker can explain away the apparent hyperintensionality of belief, these attempts to not extend in any straightforward way to all prima facie cases of hyperintensionality. Stalnaker, at least, seems committed to a project of explaining away many apparent cases of hyperintensionality, committed as he is to a SPWS account of linguistic meaning and mental content (Stalnaker 1984). So far as we can tell, Stalnaker is willing to take this project piece-meal.

Lewis seems more hospitable to hyperintensional approaches, provided they can be ultimately explained in terms of possible worlds and set-theoretic constructions out of them. In Lewis (1986: 49–50), he discusses a hyperintensional “trivially” operator that would apply differently to different necessary truths. In a posthumously published letter (Lewis 2004) he seems to acknowledge that there was more than one distinct impossible fiction, and presumably that “According to fiction \(f, A\)” was hyperintensional (since when \(f\) is an impossible fiction, there will be some impossible claim that is true according to it, but in general not all impossible claims will be).

Philosophers suspicious of hyperintensionality in particular areas should consider if this stems from features of the specific case or is general. If the latter, they may wish to attempt a general account of meaning that ensures we never need to acknowledge hyperintensionality: otherwise, a general suspicion will risk being undermined.

3. Granularity and the Structure of Hyperintensionality

The flip side of hyperintensionality’s pervasiveness is its encompassing very diverse phenomena. We now investigate what (little) we know about the general structure of hyperintensionality. The initial characterization, recall, merely tells us that a concept or operator is hyperintensional when it is more fine-grained than intensional or standard modal concepts or operators, marking a distinction invisible to the latter. As Jespersen and Duží reminded us, little is said on “how hyper” hyperintensions are. The tag of “granularity problems” (Barwise 1997; Jago 2014; Bjerring & Schwarz 2017) labels a set of issues concerning the right level of fine-grainedness. There are several related problems here, because different hyperintensional concepts seem to display different degrees of fine-grainedness. This can be understood again in terms of substitution salva veritate for the relevant operators: \(X\) is strictly more fine-grained than \(Y\) when all substitutions that go through for \(X\) also do for \(Y,\) but \(X\) fails some, which goes through for \(Y.\)

A requirement often suggested is that a hyperintensional account of this or that notion shouldn’t make it as fine-grained as the syntax of the language one is working with—on pain of giving away the very point of having a semantics for it. Propositions may be more fine-grained than sets of possible worlds, but they had better not be mappable 1:1 to the sentences expressing them. Otherwise, we would lose one main motivation for having propositions to begin with, namely that syntactically different sentences can say the same thing. It also seems intuitive that, e.g., the content of \(A\) should be the same as that of \(A \land A\), and that \(A \land B\) should have the same content as \(B \land A\): “It’s windy and rainy today” seems to just say the same thing as “It’s rainy and windy today” (for further motivations for coarse-graining, see Bjerring & Schwarz 2017). On the other hand, a limited cognitive agent may fail to make even the simplest inference starting from what she knows or believes: she may believe that \(A \land B\), fail to perform Conjunction Elimination, and thus fail to believe that \(A\). Psychologically very realistic accounts of knowledge or belief seem to require extreme fine-grainedness, cutting more finely than same-saying. Jespersen (2010) is one example of a theory that has very fine-grained meanings available for some constructions, while offering more coarse-grained meanings for some traditional purposes where little or no hyperintensionality is required.

One may hope for a total ordering of hyperintensional notions by fine-grainedness, i.e., an ordering such that any two given ones are comparable: given any \(X\) and \(Y\), either \(X\) is at least as fine-grained as \(Y\), or vice versa. But one can show that the simple setting is wrong. One can provide intuitive examples (inspired by Hornischer 2017, which also includes a thorough discussion) of incomparable hyperintensional operators: \(X\) and \(Y\) for which there are sentences \(A\), \(B\), \(C\), \(D\), such that \(XA\) and \(XB\) are equivalent but \(YA\) and \(YB\) are not, \(YC\) and \(YD\) are equivalent but \(XC\) and \(XD\) are not.

Take “Lois Lane knows that …” and “… because Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum”. Consider the four sentences:

  • \(A =\) Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum
  • \(B =\) “Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum” is true
  • \(C =\) Clark Kent is in New York
  • \(D =\) Superman is in New York

Lois Lane knows that \(A\) (Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum) if and only if she knows that \(B\) (“Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum” is true) (surely Lois knows how truth works!). On the other hand, she knows that \(C\) (Clark Kent is in New York), but she doesn’t know that \(D\) (Superman, too, is), for she is not aware that Superman is Clark Kent.

Also, it is false that \(A\) (Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum) because Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum (facts can’t explain themselves), while it is true that \(B\) (“Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum” is true) because Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum (assuming truth supervenes on/is grounded in facts). On the other hand, \(C\) (Clark Kent is in New York) because Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum if and only if \(D\) (Superman is in New York) because Clark Kent loves the Guggenheim Museum, for Superman is Clark Kent.

So knows and because turn out to be incomparable, and, given that they are hyperintensional, there is no total ordering for hyperintensional notions. This may sustain some skepticism (ventilated, e.g., in Leitgeb 2019) on the possibility of a single theory for all hyperintensional operators. On the other hand, it makes sense to conjecture that these can be at least partially ordered. It is then an issue worth investigating, whether concepts belonging to a single sub-family, e.g., the non-representational ones, or the representational semantic ones, can be internally totally ordered (notice that knows is representational, while one may take because as belonging to “ontic” explanation). Or, the other way around, the identification of totally ordered subsets of the partially ordered set of hyperintensional concepts may be a good way to group such concepts into families that carve at the joints.

4. General Approaches to Hyperintensionality

We now provide a survey of general hyperintensional approaches. Hardly any of them has been put forth as a systematic account of all hyperintensional notions. However, we focus on frameworks that are general enough to handle a broad range of phenomena (thus we do not consider, e.g., hyperintensional epistemic logics that target only certain forms of logical omniscience, like justification logic). We briefly introduce the key ideas of each approach, and we discuss how it handles hyperintensional phenomena such as those introduced in Section 1. We highlight relative merits and open issues.

4.1 Two-Dimensional Semantics

Two-dimensional semantic theories (see entry on two-dimensional semantics) build on standard possible worlds semantics to handle a range of representational hyperintensional phenomena. Originating in two-dimensional modal logic (Segerberg 1973; van Fraassen 1977; Davies & Humberstone 1980), versions of the view have been presented by Kaplan (1989), Jackson (1994), and Chalmers (1996). (Stalnaker [1978] is a key pioneer of the approach, but he applied it to the pragmatics of communication, rather than to provide a hyperintensional semantics: see Stalnaker 2004.)

Sometimes what a word picks out depends on context. Indexicals (“I”, “you”, “here”, “yesterday”) and demonstratives (“this”, “that”, “over there”) are obvious cases: which thing someone refers to using “this” depends on what they are demonstrating at the time. Kaplan (1989) proposed that these expressions function as rigid designators on occasions of use: whether the proposition expressed by a sentence including one is true at a possible world depends on how things stand with the object, if any, referred to in the actual world. If on 5 March 2020 I say “Yesterday it was sunny”, I express a proposition true at a possible world iff it is sunny on 4 March 2020 in that world. Elvis says “I was born in 1935”: that is true at a possible world iff Elvis was born in 1935 there.

On this view, “I am Elvis”, said by Elvis, is true just in case Elvis is Elvis, thus necessarily true. Ditto for “Yesterday was 4 March 2020”, said on 5 March 2020, which is true just in case 4 March 2020 is 4 March 2020. Expressing those necessary truths can, however, give contingent information to hearers who already knew things are self-identical. To capture the difference between “I am Elvis” and “Elvis is Elvis”, when uttered by Elvis as well as by someone else—say, Aretha—we would need a story about the meaning of “I” that did not treat it as a name. Kaplan took such meaning as a function from a context of utterance to an object, selecting the speaker as the object. Similarly, the meaning of “yesterday” is a function from the day of utterance, selecting the day before. This function is called the character of the expression. My knowing the character (and facts about context) lets me take new information from the utterances. I know “I” picks out the speaker and that the speaker said “I am Elvis”. If I trust him, I can work out the speaker is Elvis. I might not have known that before, although I knew that Elvis is Elvis.

Meanings, in this view, have two components: a character and a content. The content is normally given via possible worlds. The character is a function from contexts of utterance to contents. The content of “I am Elvis”, uttered by Elvis, is the total set of worlds, since Elvis couldn’t but be Elvis. The character is a function from the context’s speaker to the content that that person is Elvis. So it is a function from Elvis to the content that Elvis is Elvis, from Aretha to the content that Aretha is Elvis, etc.

Traditionally, philosophers have found it useful to represent this interaction of character and content with a two-dimensional matrix, hence the expression “two dimensional semantics”. Let us illustrate with a small example. In \(W_1\), Elvis is singing but Aretha is not, and in \(W_2\), Aretha is singing but Elvis is not, and in \(W_3\), neither is singing. Consider the sentence “I am singing”, with two possible speakers, Elvis and Aretha. We get the following six scenarios, depending on which speaker is speaking and which world the resulting content is being evaluated at:

  \(W_1\) \(W_2\) \(W_3\)
Elvis T F F
Aretha F T F

Each horizontal line (row) of the matrix represents a content that can be associated with “I am singing”, with different rows representing the different contents produced by different contexts (due to different speakers, in this case). The entire matrix represents facts about the character of a sentence. These two-dimensional matrices become more interesting when more complex constructions are discussed, but the key ideas for current purposes are more easily presentable without further using matrices.

Now some proponents of two-dimensional semantics extend this setting beyond indexicals and demonstratives, e.g., to proper names and natural kind terms. Take “Robin Hood”. Its content, suppose, is just Robin. But its character is a function from contexts to such contents. In a world where our use of “Robin Hood” derives in the right kind of way from Robin, the character delivers our Robin as the content of “Robin Hood”. In a world where Richard leads a band of outlaws in Sherwood, uses “Robin Hood” as an alias, is famous for robbing for the rich to give to the poor, the character of “Robin Hood” picks out Richard. Similarly for expression “water” and H2O in our world, or “XYZ” in Twin Earth: the character of “water” picks out different substances in different contexts.

Character-sensitive expressions can give rise to hyperintensionality. Take “It is a priori that”: It is a priori that Hesperus is Hesperus; it is not a priori that Hesperus is Phosphorus. Although “Hesperus” and “Phosphorus” have the same content (the planet Venus), they can differ in character. There may be contingent a priori cases: Elvis says “I am here now” in a context where the assigned content is that Elvis Presley is in Graceland on noon of 25 December 1975. “I am here now”, some claim, can be known a priori by Elvis, but he cannot know a priori that Elvis is in Graceland on noon of 25 December 1975.

Propositional attitude contexts make for a salient case. The Sheriff of Nottingham believes Robin Hood is a dangerous outlaw. He does not believe that Robin of Locksley is a dangerous outlaw, although Robin Hood is Locksley. We can explain this if we take “believes that” as character-sensitive. “Robin Hood is a dangerous outlaw” and “Robin of Locksley is a dangerous outlaw” coincide in content (they are true in the same worlds). But we can assign different characters to “Robin Hood” and “Robin of Locksley” by looking at differences in how they are typically acquired, in the causal history leading back to their first uses, or if we tie them to how the Sheriff sees the world. This can be generalized to so-called intensional transitive verbs. The Sheriff can be looking for Robin Hood but not looking for Robin of Locksley if “looking for” is sensitive to character.

Two-dimensional approaches are somewhat controversial when they move beyond indexicals and demonstratives. (See the papers in García-Carpintero and Maciá 2006 for arguments for and against two-dimensional semantics.) But they can account for the apparent hyperintensionality of “it is a priori that…” or “… believes that…” without straying too far from a traditional possible-worlds framework. Contents keep being sets of possible worlds. Qua functions from contexts to contents, characters are familiar from standard treatments of context-dependent expressions such as Kaplan’s.

Two-dimensional semantics also has a nice story on the behavior of indexicals in belief contexts. “I believe you are Elvis”, said addressing Elvis, appears to mean something different from “I believe Elvis is Elvis”. I would happily utter the latter but not the former if I believe I am facing an Elvis impersonator. It is hard to avoid the impression that the character of expressions like “you” (or, “yesterday”, “that car”, etc.) makes the difference in such cases.

Two-dimensional semantic theories cannot easily offer a general account of hyperintensionality. Worldly hyperintensionality is especially recalcitrant. When, e.g., talk of essence is employed, and we say that Socrates is essentially human but is not essentially (human and \(2 + 2 = 4)\), or not essentially (human and either bats have wings or it is not the case that bats have wings), those two alternatives to “human” both have the same two-dimensional intension as “human”. Any context will pick out the same content for the predicates “is human”, “is human and such that \(2 + 2 = 4\)”, and “is human and either bats have wings or it is not the case that bats have wings”.

The full range of non-trivial counterpossible conditionals are not easily handled either. Take “If Hobbes had squared the circle, Hobbes would have proved an impressive mathematical result”. This is plausibly true, whereas “If Archimedes had squared the circle, Hobbes would have proved an impressive mathematical result” is false: Archimedes lived well before Hobbes and so would have beaten him to it, and Hobbes did not otherwise prove any impressive results. The necessary falsehoods “Hobbes squared the circle” and “Archimedes squared the circle” seem to deliver different truth values as antecedents in same-consequent counterfactuals. Functions from contexts to contents taken as the usual sets of possible worlds don’t deliver the desired result: whichever other person a context picks out for “Hobbes”, it is hard to see how “\(x\) squared the circle” could pick out a contingent proposition that would be useful. Prospects are not quite hopeless here: approaches that employ two-dimensionalism as at least part of the picture about indicative conditionals have been suggested by Weatherson (2001) and Nolan (2003). One might hope for an extension to counterfactuals. Or perhaps some other approach might work: recent work on counter-analytic conditionals done by Locke (forthcoming) and Kocurek, Jerzak, and Rudolph (2020) is promising.

Two-dimensionalism may be appealing as an account of some hyperintensional phenomena even if it cannot be generalized: it can be seen as one tool among others for constructing semantic theories for hyperintensional expressions, if one is willing to forego a one-size-fits all approach.

4.2 Aboutness

Some theories of propositional content represent a number of hyperintensional distinctions by combining SPWS with ways of splitting the modal space. The main work in this area is Yablo’s book Aboutness (2014; and see Osorio-Kupferblum 2016 for a critical discussion). Aboutness is

the relation that meaningful items bear to whatever it is that they are on or of or that they address or concern, (Yablo 2014: 1)

namely, their subject matter. The subject matter of a sentence in context can be seen as a topic, an issue, or a question the sentence may be taken, in that context, as answering to. When the issue is the number of stars, the relevant question may be: “How many stars are there?”. As in inquisitive semantics (Ciardelli, Groenendijk, & Roelofsen 2013), one can associate the question with the set of its answers: There are no stars; There is one star; There are two stars; etc. Answers are propositions in the SPWS sense: sets of possible worlds. We now call these thin propositions for the full propositional contents of sentences will turn out to be richer than that. The question, thus, splits the totality of worlds into sets (the relevant thin propositions). Two worlds \(w_1\) and \(w_2\) end up in the same set just in case they agree on the answer—in our example: when the number of stars is the same at \(w_1\) and \(w_2\). When, as in the example, the question has just one correct answer, the thin propositions at issue form a partition of the set of worlds \(W\): a splitting into subsets such that their union is all of \(W\), and such that each \(w\) in \(W\) is in exactly one subset or cell. One cell has all the 0-star worlds, one all the 1-star worlds, one all the 2-star worlds, and so on.

While the idea is already in Lewis (1988) (see also Plebani and Spolaore forthcoming), Yablo proposes a generalization due to some questions’ having more than one correct answer: “Where’s a good Italian restaurant in Amsterdam?”. A world \(w_1\) can be in more than one cell now: it can agree with \(w_2\) by having a good Italian restaurant in Rembrandtplein, with \(w_3\) by having another good Italian restaurant in Keizersgracht. Here the question determines a division of \(W\): a splitting into subsets whose union is \(W\), but which can overlap.

There’s an intuitive mereology of issues, topics, or subject matters: they should be capable of overlapping and of fusing into wholes which inherit the proper features from the parts (Yablo 2014: Section 3.2). The topic philosophy and the topic mathematics overlap (the overlap including, presumably, logic). How things went in 1882 is included in the larger how things went in the nineteenth century. A larger subject matter induces smaller cells: \(w_1\) and \(w_2\) agree on what happened in their whole nineteenth century only if they agree on what happened in their 1882 to begin with.

Let \(|A|\), a subset of \(W\), be the thin proposition expressed by \(A\). The thick proposition expressed by \(A\), [\(A\)], is its thin proposition \(|A|\) together with \(A\)’s subject matter, \(s(A)\). How does one get the subject matter of \(A\)? Yablo suggests assigning a positive subject matter, the division corresponding to “Why is \(A\) true?”; a negative subject matter, the division corresponding to “Why is \(A\) false?”; and to identify the overall \(s(A)\) with its positive and negative subject matters taken together. Worlds agree on the overall subject matter of \(A\) when either \(A\) is true, or \(A\) is false, for the same reasons at them. Yablo calls the reasons for \(A\)’s being true (false), \(A\)’s truthmakers (falsemakers). He suggests not to read them in a metaphysically loaded way, as chunks of reality whose obtaining necessitates truth, and advocates a “semantic” conception of truthmaking: truth/falsemakers are cells of divisions of \(W\), thus, just sets of worlds again, i.e., thin propositions.

Thick propositions are hyperintensional. They cut at least as finely as ordinary sets of worlds: when \(|A|\) differs from \(|B|\), [\(A\)] will differ from [\(B\)]. Additionally, there will be \(A\)’s and \(B\)’s expressing different thick propositions in spite of being true at the same worlds, because they are about different things: \(s(A)\) will differ from \(s(B)\) even if \(|A| = |B|\). For example, “There is an even number of stars or there is not” and “There are no non-self-identical Italian restaurants” are both necessarily true, but they correspond to distinct thick propositions because of their different subject matters. The suggestion that adding subject matter to semantics is the key to handling hyperintensionality is discussed in Gioulatou (2016).

To get a precise answer on which hyperintensional distinctions the framework can make, one needs a full-fledged truthmaker assignment to all sentences of the target language. Yablo gives two “semantic pictures”, a reductive and a recursive one, which pull in different directions. We take the recursive route, which relies on van Fraassen (1969) and is found more plausible by some (e.g., Hawke 2018; Fine 2020), and leave the details to a consultation of Yablo (2014: 56–9). In a plain sentential language: when \(A\) is an atomic formula \(p\) one can assign it some truthmaker \(\{p^+\}\) and falsemaker \(\{p^-\}\). Negation flips: For \(A = {\sim}B\), what truthmakes \(A\) is what falsemakes \(B\) and vice versa. For \(A = B \land C\), what truthmakes \(A\) is the union of what truthmakes \(B\) and what truthmakes \(C\); what falsemakes \(A\) is what either falsemakes \(B\) or falsemakes \(C\). For \(A = B \lor C\), we flip the truth- and falsemakers of \(B \land C\). Then, e.g., \(p \land q\) is made true by \(\{p^+, q^+\}\), false by \(\{p^-\}\) and by \(\{q^-\}\); \(p \lor q\) is made true by \(\{p^+\}\) and by \(\{q^+\}\); false by \(\{p^-, q^-\}\).

Now \(p \lor {\sim}p\) and \(q \lor {\sim}q\) (“John is either a bachelor or not”, “Either 44 is the sum of two primes or not”) will express distinct thick propositions insofar as they are about different things (how things stand John-wise is a different issue from how things stand 44-wise). When, with distinct \(p\) and \(q\), the truthmakers of \(p \lor {\sim}p\) are \(\{p^+\}\) and \(\{p^-\}\), those of \(q \lor {\sim}q\) are \(\{q^+\}\) and \(\{q^-\}, s(p \lor {\sim}p)\) will differ from \(s(q \lor {\sim}q)\) and so the two thick propositions [\(p \lor {\sim}p\)] and [\(q \lor {\sim}q\)] will differ although \(|p \lor {\sim}p| = |q \lor {\sim}q| = W\). Also, [\(p\)] will differ from [\(p \land (q \lor {\sim}q)\)] as \(p\) is truthmade by \(\{p^+\}, p \land (q \lor {\sim}q)\) by \(\{p^+, q^+\}\) and \(\{p^+, q^-\}\), not by \(\{p^+\}\). So one can capture the idea that “You see that Mary is eating an ice cream” and “You see that Mary is eating an ice cream and John is either eating chips or not” don’t say the same, in the face of the logical equivalence of \(A\) and \(A \land (B \lor {\sim}B\)).

But even lacking a precise treatment for a predicative language, we can see that distinct, logically atomic necessarily true or false contents may be difficult to tell apart. Take “Mike is Mike”, \(m = m\), and “Mike is Jack the Ripper”, \(m = j\), which differ in informativeness. Given that Mike is Jack and the necessity of identity, \(|m = m| = |m = j| = W\); but also the subject matters will coincide: what makes both claims true is a fact about Mike, Mike’s being Mike. Nothing makes either false. “Hobbes squared the circle”, \(Sh\), and “Daniel Nolan squared the circle”, \(Sd\), concern different issues: one is about Hobbes’ mathematical (non)achievements, the other is about Daniel’s. But \(|Sh| = |Sd| = \emptyset\), and there’s no way to get truth/falsemakers as sets of possible worlds that will make \(s(Sh)\) and \(s(Sd)\) differ: no matter how one splits and groups possible worlds into sets, there will be no worlds available where Hobbes squares the circle or where Nolan does to begin with.

As noticed by Fine (2020), the difficulty may be due to the fact that the setting is conservative with respect to SPWS: it starts with the usual possible worlds and just adds ways of splitting and grouping them (see Hawke 2018 for further criticisms). The next approach promises to do better by looking at worlds that step beyond the possible.

4.3 Extended Worlds Semantics

If a theorist starts from a possible worlds framework, and comes under pressure to recognize hyperintensional distinctions, one response is to add impossible worlds (Priest 1992; Zalta 1997; Kiourti 2010; Jago 2015; Berto & Jago 2019) taken as ways things could not be, or worlds where some truth of logic, mathematics, or metaphysics fails. We will be brief on this topic here, as one can consult the entry on impossible worlds for more details.

In impossible worlds semantics, different impossibilities can be distinguished by being associated with different sets of worlds (only impossible worlds), and different necessary truths can also be distinguished by different sets of worlds (all possible worlds plus some of the impossible worlds). Each distinct necessary truth will correspond to a distinct set containing all possible worlds and some impossible worlds; and each distinct impossible proposition will correspond to a set of worlds that contains no possible worlds, but which may contain impossible worlds (Rantala 1982).

Kripke (1965) already introduced “non-normal worlds” for the semantics of modal systems such as C.I. Lewis’ S2 and S3: such worlds were points where all formulas of the form \(\Diamond A\) are true, and all those of the form \(\Box A\) are false (intuitively: everything is possible, nothing is necessary). Cresswell (1970) offered a logic of belief in which beliefs were modelled with sets of both possible and impossible worlds, so as to not treat every impossible belief the same as every other, and to allow someone to believe some necessary truths without believing them all. (See also Hintikka 1975). Since then, impossible worlds have been used to theorize about many of the hyperintensional phenomena discussed in this entry.

A closely related way to extend possible worlds semantics is to introduce incomplete and inconsistent partial specifications of how things could be, and could not be. So-called situation semantics (Barwise & Perry 1983) employs these more general objects to handle hyperintensional constructions such as specifications of beliefs or information contents, as well as applications to avoid paradoxes that can arise from employing possible worlds. A version of situation semantics known as “truthmaker semantics” has recently been defended as being superior to standard world semantics (see Fine 2012, 2016, 2017; Hornischer 2020; Moltmann 2020, forthcoming).

With impossible worlds added to a theory, necessarily equivalent expressions no longer have to have the same semantic values. Apart from their widespread use in the semantics for logical systems, work has continued on using impossible worlds for giving theories of psychological attitude ascriptions and of claims about meaning: see Jago (2014) for one recent treatment of a number of issues involving mental content and reasoning. Impossible worlds also help in theories of other kinds of representations: for use in theories of impossible fictions, see Priest (1997) and Badura and Berto (2019). Epistemologists are starting to find applications for impossible worlds in theories of knowledge: see, for example, Melchior (forthcoming). And logicians are using them to model non-omniscient hyperintensional agents by combining impossible worlds semantics with dynamic epistemic logic (Bjerring and Skipper (2019); Solaki, Berto, & Smets forthcoming).

Given the limitations of Lewis-Stalnaker theories of counterfactual conditionals when dealing with impossible antecedents (see §1.1.2), it is natural to extend a theory of counterfactual conditionals with impossible worlds: see Routley (1989), Mares (1997), Nolan (1997), Brogaard and Salerno (2013). Similar theories can be offered of indicative conditionals: see Nolan (2016b).

Impossible worlds have also been employed to give theories of a range of hyperintensional phenomena in metaphysics. One early application was in the theory of de re necessity, in offering a theory of how it could be necessarily true that an artifact could be made of slightly different material, but not too different, without succumbing to Chisolm’s paradox (Salmon 1984). Impossible worlds can be used to give a hyperintensional theory of properties as sets of possible and impossible instances (Nolan 2013: 8). They can be used to offer a theory of metaphysical explanation (Kment 2014), or in a theory of essence (Brogaard & Salerno 2013: 646–8). They can play a central role in a theory of omissions of impossibilities (Bernstein 2016).

The literature to date has only scratched the surface of potential applications of impossible words in metaphysical theorizing. A range of concerns about postulating impossible worlds are discussed in the entry on impossible worlds, section 6, Nolan (2013), and Berto and Jago (2019), as well as the concerns discussed in §2 and §3 above.

4.4 Relevance/Relevant Logic

One should look at the SEP entry on relevance logic (also called “relevant logic”) for an introduction to this research program (see the seminal Anderson & Belnap 1975; Anderson, Belnap, & Dunn 1992; and, for a comprehensive introduction, Dunn & Restall 2002). We briefly discuss its connections to hyperintensionality here. Its origins lay in the aim to develop logical systems free from the “paradoxes of the material and strict conditional” discussed above. Another early motivation was to construct a conditional that could represent logical deducibility within the logical language itself.

In this program, an agreed upon necessary (though, in general, not sufficient) condition for a conditional to be logically valid is that there be some connection between antecedent and consequent. Historically, this has often been phrased via a requirement called the Variable Sharing Property (VSP): \(A \rightarrow B\) is valid only when \(A\) and \(B\) share some sentential variable or parameter (cf. Anderson & Belnap 1975: 32–3). VSP delivers hyperintensional distinctions: conditionals with (classically) impossible antecedents and necessary consequents are not all trivially valid or true. The infamous ex falso quodlibet, \((A \land \neg A) \rightarrow B\), for instance, fails (it’s not the case that anything is implied by a contradiction); whereas \((A \land \neg A) \rightarrow A\) holds in most mainstream relevant systems (plausibly, a conjunction relevantly implies its conjuncts).

A key feature of relevance logics, made apparent by their most developed semantics, the so-called Routley-Meyer frames (Routley & Meyer 1973), is that hyperintensional distinctions are not achieved by superimposing on an essentially classical or normal modal logic a filter that screens out irrelevancies. Relevance logics are weaker than normal modal logics with SPWS or Kripke frames because their semantics embeds points of evaluation for formulas different from classical (maximally consistent) possible worlds, which are accessible (via a ternary accessibility relation, different from the binary accessibility of Kripke frames) in the evaluation of conditionals.

Working out the intuitive interpretation of such points, of the ternary relation, and indeed of the Routley-Mayer semantics as a whole, has been a difficult task in the history of this research programme (see Copeland 1980; Read 1988; Restall 1996b; Mares 2004). The consensus on the points nowadays seems to be that they be understood as non-normal or logically impossible worlds (see Priest 2008: Ch, 10; Berto & Jago 2019: Ch. 6). See the SEP entry on impossible worlds for details. The impossible worlds of (the interpreted) Routley-Meyer frames can be seen as situations which can, e.g., be locally inconsistent (making true both \(A\) and \(\neg A\), for some \(A)\) without thereby being trivial (making true everything), and partial or locally incomplete (“taking no stance” on some \(A\) by making true neither it nor its negation).

The conditional of most mainstream relevant systems is taken as representing implication or (necessary) entailment, not a ceteris paribus or counterfactual conditional. But some of the first theories of counterpossible conditionals, addressing the limitations of the Lewis/Stalnaker account of counterfactuals, were developed against a relevance logic background: see Routley (1989); Mares and Fuhrmann (1995), and Mares (1997).

Other applications of relevance logic to areas where hyperintensional distinctions seem needed include applications to the theory of confirmation in science (Goddard 1977; Sylvan & Nola 1991); the logic of fiction (Routley 1979); and the theory of information (Mares 2004; Dunn 2015). Finally, a number of theories in deontic logic have been offered using a relevance logic base, including Anderson (1967), Goble (1999) and Tagawa and Cheng (2002).

Relevance logic has also been deployed to give theories of worldly hyperintensionality. In a series of papers, Michael Dunn developed a theory of relevant predication intended to illuminate a range of traditional metaphysical distinctions, including the differences between intrinsic and extrinsic properties, essential and accidental properties, and between essential properties and properties necessarily had when an object exists (Dunn 1987, 1990a, 1990b). And as mentioned above, Restall (1996a) employed relevant logic to offer a theory of truthmakers.

Overall, the tools provided by the relevance logic program offer theoretical resources for constructing theories of hyperintensional phenomena, whether representational or non-representational. To date, many of these proposals have been piece-meal, with less of a general story about how these techniques could be applied to handle hyperintensional language across the board. Some general strategies have been outlined for how a theory could be constructed that handles all hyperintensional phenomena: one such program was Richard Routley’s “Ultralogic as Universal”, first set out in Routley (1977). See Nolan (2018) and the essays in Routley (2019) for recent evaluations.

4.5 Structured Propositions

After Soames’ (1987) attack against unstructured accounts of propositions as sets of truth-supporting circumstances, structured propositions accounts (King 1995) have become the main rivals to SPWS views. Roughly: propositions are taken as structures, composed of the entities which are the semantic values of the corresponding sentences’ syntactic constituents. Take “Robin loves Batman”. It’s composed of a noun, “Robin”, and a verb phrase, “loves Batman”, itself made of a verb and a noun. Let the semantic values of the lexical items be: [Robin], [Batman], [loving]. Then the corresponding proposition can be taken as an ordered triple \(\langle\)[Robin], [loving], [Batman]\(\rangle\). Ordering is important: Batman may not return the feeling, and “Batman loves Robin” expresses a different proposition: \(\langle\)[Batman], [loving], [Robin]\(\rangle\). (A proposition is not just an ordered list, but we leave aside the difficult metaphysical issue of what ties its constituents together: see Gaskin 2008.)

What makes for the constituents? Broadly Russellian structured accounts, developed by authors like Salmon (1986), Soames (2008), are typically paired with direct reference or Millian accounts of names: thus, [Batman] is Batman and [Robin] is Robin. The semantic values of predicates and verb phrases can be taken as properties or relations. The logical vocabulary is typically interpreted as denoting logical operations, e.g., [\({\sim}\)] can be the unary function that flips truth and falsity, [\(\land\)] the binary function that outputs truth only if both inputs are truths, etc.

This delivers hyperintensional distinctions, e.g., “John is either a bachelor or not” and “Either 44 is the sum of two primes or not” will express different propositions: only one will include [John], i.e., John, as a constituent. Necessarily true/false atomic sentences will also be differentiated, even when their syntactic structure is the same (“Hobbes squared the circle” and “Daniel Nolan squared the circle”: [Daniel Nolan] isn’t [Hobbes]; “\(3 + 3 = 6\)” and “\(2 + 2 = 4\)”: [3] isn’t [2]). More challenging cases for the view come with the necessary a posteriori. “Mike is Mike” and “Mike is Jack the Ripper” express the same proposition, because [Mike] = [Jack the Ripper]. Same for “All woodchucks are woodchucks”, “All woodchucks are whistlepigs”, as [woodchuck] = [whistlepig]. This will create issues in intentional contexts:

Suppose Tama is familiar with both woodchucks and whistlepigs, but isn’t sure that they are the same kind of critter. He’s noticed the similarities, though, and so he has his suspicions. Suppose further that Tama knows he is allergic to whistlepigs, and knows that he has just been bitten by a woodchuck. In this scenario, [“Tama fears that all woodchucks are whistlepigs”] is likely true, while [“Tama fears that all woodchucks are woodchucks”] is almost certainly false. (Ripley 2012: 9)

Soames (1987) proposes a pragmatic-metalinguistic strategy similar to the one tried by Stalnaker (1984), discussed in §2.2: one should distinguish attitudes towards sentences and towards propositions. Soames comes up with examples showing that the former can be an unreliable guide to the latter, e.g., one can sometimes believe a proposition, but only assent to one of two distinct sentences expressing it. You do know that Mike is Jack the Ripper by knowing that Mike is Mike, for it’s the same proposition. But you will assent to, or assert, only the sentence that reports your knowledge in the trivial clothing. Then, the ancients believed that Hesperus is Phosphorus, Tama fears that all woodchucks are woodchucks, and so on. If you think otherwise, it’s because you confuse belief reports with reports of linguistic practices. Ripley (2012) argues that it’s difficult to account for phenomena concerning such attitude reports by throwing them in the box of pragmatics and conversational implicatures: failures of substitutivity salva veritate behave in systematics ways in contexts of iterated embeddings, and this calls for a systematic, compositional treatment.

Salmon also resorts to a distinction between “semantically encoded” and “pragmatically imparted information” (Salmon 1986: 78) for the “Mike is Mike” vs. “Mike is Jack the Ripper” cases. He introduces different representational guises under which one can have attitudes to the proposition expressed by different sentences. For direct reference to work, we need [Mike] to be [Jack the Ripper], but we can allow Mike-guises to differ from Jack-the-Ripper-guises, and claim that (de dicto) intentional attitudes are relations to propositions mediated by guises: Lois Lane loves Kal-El under the guise of Superman, not under the guise of Clark Kent. Guises don’t belong in semantics but in pragmatics, and don’t determine denotations.

Salmon’s view can in principle account for compositional phenomena involving embeddings. It has been criticized because of this: Forbes (1987) argues that guises look too much like Fregean senses in disguise. Branquinho (1990) argues that the correspondence may not reduce Salmon’s account to a relabelled Fregean view.

Guises are supposed to be mobilized within attitude reports. Beyond attitude reports, as argued by Ripley (2012), Jago (2014), there are hyperintensional phenomena involving indicative and counterfactual conditionals structuralism doesn’t seem to handle. As Jago (2014: 76–7) has it, we can be at the 1972 Ziggy Stardust Tour and wonder if Ziggy is David Bowie. We come up with the following:

If Ziggy isn’t Bowie, then Bowie isn’t Bowie.
If Bowie isn’t Bowie, then Bowie isn’t Bowie.
If Ziggy weren’t Bowie, then Bowie wouldn’t be Bowie.
If Bowie weren’t Bowie, then Bowie wouldn’t be Bowie.

All of (1)–(4) have metaphysically impossible antecedents. (1) and (3) are plausibly false (unless one is a vacuist: see Williamson 2007), but (2) and (4) are trivial truths. (A nonvacuist conditional semantics using impossible worlds delivers just these results: see Berto et al. 2018.) But the structuralist has (1)–(2) and (3)–(4), respectively, express the same propositions, given that [Ziggy] = [Bowie]. If conditionals in general, or even only counterfactuals, don’t involve intentionality, guises will offer little help if they are not supposed to come into play here. However, there are treatments of conditionality along the lines of epistemic modals (Kratzer 1986; Lycan 2001), and the Russellian structuralist may appeal to one of them, or come up with a new one.

Could a broadly Fregean account of structured propositions do better? In this view, we don’t take the constituents of structured propositions as denotations (think objects and properties), rather as Fregean senses. Much now depends on how these are understood. If they are taken à la Carnap, as functions from the possible worlds of SPWS to extensions, there is little hope to account for “Mike is Mike” vs. “Mike is Jack the Ripper” cases. Now [Mike] and [Jack the Ripper] are functions from possible worlds to individuals; but unless one clashes with the Kripkean criticisms of descriptivism on names (Kripke 1980), they had better be constant functions: given that they both actually pick out Mike, they should output Mike at all possible worlds (at which Mike exists). But then [Mike] and [Jack the Ripper] will be defined on the same set of things and will give the same output for any input.

One may enlarge or change the set of circumstances that provides the inputs, admitting metaphysically impossible situations where Mike is distinct from Jack the Ripper, and have the two as the outputs of [Mike] and [Jack the Ripper] there, respectively. But then, as remarked by Ripley (2012) and Jago (2014) again, it is not so much structuralism that does the job of giving the required hyperintensional distinctions, but rather the fact that we are not working (only) with standard (metaphysically) possible worlds anymore.

A recent interesting proposal to improve on the Fregean situation comes from Hawke (2018), combining a theory of subject matter with a structuralist account of propositions resorting to Fregean-senses-lookalikes. Subject matter sensitivity allows Hawke to make hyperintensional distinction unavailable to standard Fregean structuralism.

One logically sophisticated, neo-Fregean structured account, offering a systematic analysis of a range of hyperintensional phenomena, is the Transparent Intensional Logic approach. The view, pioneered by Tichý (1968, 1971, 1988), treats the meanings of expressions as given by structural procedures, called constructions, built out of entities that are somewhat like Fregean senses. In particular, different names and different predicates, even if they necessarily co-designate, may be associated with different senses, so the meanings of “Robin Hood” and “Robin of Locksley”, or of “furze” and “gorse”, may be distinct even if those meanings are not built up out of others. This gives the system resources to handle many hyperintensional contexts straightforwardly. In particular, it manages to give a powerful compositional account where other approaches have to resort to pragmatics. The approach is less popular than it should be in contemporary semantics, possibly due its resorting to a technical apparatus of typed lambda-calculus. For hyperintensional applications and a comprehensive discussion of Transparent Intensional Logic, see Duží, Jespersen, and Materna (2010) and Duží and Jespersen (2015).

We mention one final, recent proposal in the Fregean camp, by Skipper and Bjerring (2020). This pivots on another Fregean notion, namely that of cognitive equipollence: \(P\) and \(Q\) are cognitively equipollent when one cannot rationally regard either as true and the other as false (see Schellenberg 2012). This gives a cognitive or epistemic notion of sentential meaning which, the authors claim, is more fine-grained than SPWS intensions, but less than extra-fine-grained extended (e.g., impossible) worlds semantics.

4.6 Algebraic and Object Theory Approaches

A final family of approaches to hyperintensionality to be discussed is the algebraic. Algebraic approaches to semantics typically do not try to give an account of meaning in terms of anything else at all. Instead, they treat meanings as primitive and focus on the relationships between them to give a semantic theory.

By defining in a direct way how the meanings of different parts of language go together to yield sentence meanings, these approaches are not under pressure to identify the meanings of sentences true in all the same possible circumstances, or even sentences which are logically equivalent. So it is easy to see how a general algebraic approach can make room for hyperintensional differences between parts of language. Even if sentence meanings are necessarily equivalent, if they relate differently to a “believes that” operator they do not have to be substitutable in “John believes that \(A\)” contexts. Bealer (1979) touts this flexibility as an advantage in dealing with puzzles like the semantics of belief attributions, as does Menzel (1993).

Some algebraic approaches do not take as much advantage of this flexibility as one might expect with respect to hyperintensionality puzzles. Keenan and Faltz (1984)’s algebraic approach identifies necessary equivalents. Bacon (2018) adopts a Boolean account in which the propositions associated with logical equivalents in predicate logic are identified with each other (e.g., the proposition that \({\sim}({\sim}A \lor {\sim}B)\) is identical to the proposition that \((A \land B))\). This leaves room for distinguishing merely necessarily equivalent propositions, e.g., the proposition that \(2+2=4\) and the proposition that it rains if and only if it rains. But it does little to help with cases where we want to discriminate between logical equivalents: if we were to think that \(A\) explains why \({\sim}{\sim}A\), or capture the belief content of the confused man who believes something of the form \((A \land B)\) but does not believe \({\sim}({\sim}A \lor {\sim}B)\). So it is not the algebraic approach per se that yields solutions to particular puzzles about hyperintensionality, but the algebraic approach combined with theoretical choices about the structure of the algebra.

Algebraic approaches are largely silent on the question of what meanings are, and how meanings come to stand in the relations they do. (Or, if every structure of relations between meanings can be found somewhere in Platonic heaven, how we come to be associated with our particular structure rather than others.) Of course, theories which say more about the nature of meanings (e.g., that they are set-theoretic constructions from worlds, or they are ordered sets of objects and properties) also face the challenge of explaining how our concrete practices explain which structures of meanings are associated with our speech and writing. So it may be that these concerns are general, and algebraic semantics can employ the same kinds of answers to these questions as their rivals.

A close relative of algebraic theories is the object theory of Zalta (1988). It also supplies distinct fine-grained meanings to, e.g., be the suitably distinct inputs so that “John believes all triangles have internal angles that add up to 180°” and “John believes all trilaterals have internal angles that add up to 180°” express different propositions. Zalta says a little more about the identity conditions of his hyperintensionally-distinguished properties: according to Zalta, properties are identical if and only if they are encoded by the same objects.

Algebraic accounts of meaning may have little to say about worldly hyperintensionality. There is nothing in the general motivations of algebraic theories that would rule out the hypothesis that we need hyperintensional language to best capture the non-representational aspects of reality, but nor does there appear to be anything in the general motivations that would indicate why we would, or how that might manifest in our language. This is not really an objection to algebraic approaches, however. One might think that a theory of meaning should be silent on substantive questions about what the world is like. We do not want our theory of meaning to tell us which physics or chemical theory to adopt. Likewise, it might be good for a theory of meaning to be neutral about how to understand essences, or intrinsicness of properties, or causation. Of course, a theory of meaning may not be able to be completely neutral about metaphysical questions—it should have something to say about what meanings are, whether there are abstract representations, and so on—but perhaps algebraic theories not taking a stand on worldly hyperintensionality is an attractive feature rather than a drawback.


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Versions of this entry have been presented at the Arché Metaphysics and Logic research seminar at the University of St Andrews, at the Logic of Conceivability seminar at the University of Amsterdam, and at the 2020 Hamburg Summer School, at the Institute of Philosophy of the University of Hamburg. We are grateful to the participants, as well as Sara Bernstein, Max Cresswell, Greg Restall and two referees of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, for their valuable feedback. Franz Berto’s research for this entry has been funded by the European Research Council (ERC CoG), Grant Number 681404.

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Daniel Nolan <dnolan2@nd.edu>

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