Mohism was an influential philosophical, social, and religious movement that flourished during the Warring States era (479–221 BCE) in ancient China. Mohism originates in the teachings of Mo Di, or “Mozi” (“Master Mo,” fl. ca. 430 BCE), from whom it takes its name. Mozi and his followers initiated philosophical argumentation and debate in China. They were the first in the tradition to engage, like Socrates in ancient Greece, in an explicit, reflective search for objective moral standards and to give step-by-step, tightly reasoned arguments for their views, though their reasoning is sometimes simplistic or rests on doubtful assumptions. They formulated China’s first explicit ethical and political theories and advanced the world’s earliest form of consequentialism, a remarkably sophisticated version based on a plurality of intrinsic goods taken as constitutive of collective human welfare. The Mohists applied a pragmatic, non-representational theory of language and knowledge and developed a rudimentary theory of analogical argumentation. They played a key role in articulating and shaping many of the central concepts, assumptions, and issues of classical Chinese philosophical discourse.
A later branch of the school (see the entry on Mohist Canons) formulated a sophisticated semantic theory, epistemology, consequentialist ethics, theory of analogical reasoning, and mereological ontology and undertook inquiries in such diverse fields as geometry, mechanics, optics, and economics. They addressed technical problems raised by their semantics and consequentialist ethics and produced a collection of terse, rigorous arguments that develop Mohist doctrines, defend them against criticisms, and rebut opponents’ views.
Central elements of Mohist thought include advocacy of a unified ethical and political order grounded in a consequentialist ethic emphasizing impartial concern for all; active opposition to military aggression and injury to others; devotion to utility and frugality and condemnation of waste and luxury; support for a centralized, authoritarian state led by a virtuous, benevolent sovereign and managed by a hierarchical, merit-based bureaucracy; and reverence for and obedience to Heaven (Tian, literally the sky) and the ghosts worshiped in traditional folk religion. Mohist ethics and epistemology are characterized by a concern with finding objective standards that will guide judgment and action reliably and impartially so as to produce beneficial, morally right consequences. The Mohists assume that people are naturally motivated to do what they believe is right, and thus with proper moral education will generally tend to conform to the correct ethical norms. They believe strongly in the power of discussion and persuasion to solve ethical problems and motivate action, and they are confident that moral and political questions have objective answers that can be discovered and defended by inquiry.
- 1. Mozi and the Mohists
- 2. The Ten Mohist Doctrines
- 3. The Search for Objective Standards
- 4. Epistemology
- 5. Logic and Argumentation
- 6. Political Theory
- 7. Ethical Theory
- 8. Religion
- 9. Historical Influence and Decline
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Mohism springs from the teachings of Mo Di, or Mozi (“Master Mo”), about whom little is known, not even what state he was from. The Shi Ji, a Han dynasty record, tells us only that he was an official of the state of Song and that he lived either at the same time as or after Confucius (d. 479 BCE), with whom he is often paired by Qin (221–206 BCE) and Han dynasty (206 BCE–219 CE) texts as the two great moral teachers of the Warring States era. Most likely, he flourished during the middle to late decades of the 5th century BCE, roughly contemporaneous with Socrates in the West. ‘Mo’ is an unusual surname and the common Chinese word for “ink.” Hence scholars have speculated that the name may have been an epithet referring to the dark or tattooed skin of a laborer or convict or a transliteration from a non-Chinese language. However, ‘Mo’ could simply have been an uncommon ancient surname that later ceased to be used.
A strong argument can be made that it is Mozi, not Confucius, who deserves the title of China’s first philosopher. Before the rise of the Mohist school, Ru or so-called “Confucian” thought seems to have consisted mostly of wise aphorisms offering moral coaching aimed at developing virtuous performers of social roles as described in traditional li (norms of ritual propriety). Mozi and his followers were the first in the Chinese tradition to point out that conformity to traditional mores in itself does not ensure that actions are morally right. This critical insight motivated a self-conscious search for objective moral standards, by which the Mohists hoped to unify the moral judgments of everyone in society, thus eliminating social disorder and ensuring that morality prevailed. The normative standard through which they proposed to achieve these aims was the “benefit (lì) of all the world”: Actions, practices, and policies that promote the overall welfare of society were to be considered morally right, those that interfere with it morally wrong. This consequentialist standard was justified by appeal to the intention of Heaven (Tian), a a sky or nature deity that the Mohists claimed is committed impartially to the benefit of all. Heaven’s intention provides a reliable epistemic criterion for moral judgment, they held, because Heaven is the wisest and noblest agent in the cosmos. This basic consequentialist and religious framework motivated a set of ten core ethical and political doctrines, which the Mohists sought to persuade the rulers of their day to put into practice. This article will discuss the motivation for the Mohist philosophical and political project, the central epistemic and logical notions that structure Mohist thought, and the details of the Mohists’ ethical and political doctrines, including their strengths and weaknesses.
Our primary source for the thought of Mozi and his followers is a corpus of anonymously authored texts collected into a book called the Mozi. Other, less direct sources include anecdotes and comments about the Mohists preserved in early texts such as the Lushi Chunqiu, Hanfeizi, Zhuangzi, and Huainanzi and criticisms of them by two of their major opponents, the Confucians Mencius (ca. 372–289 BCE) and Xunzi (fl. 289–238 BCE). The Mozi is a diverse compilation of polemical essays, short dialogues, anecdotes about Mozi, and compact philosophical discussions, the different parts of the book ranging in date from the 5th to the 3rd century BCE. For a detailed discussion of the organization, nature, and authorship of the Mozi, see the following supplement:
The Mohist texts provide only the barest handful of clues about Mozi’s life. One passage depicts King Hui of Chu (488–432 BCE) refusing to grant him an audience because of his low social status. Several anecdotes in the Mozi and other early texts depict him as a master craftsman and military engineer. The Huainanzi, a Han dynasty text, claims that Mozi was an apostate Ru (Confucian), but the Mozi itself provides no particular reason to believe this. A more likely conjecture, supported by the frequency of references to the crafts in Mohist texts, is that he was originally an artisan of some kind, probably a carpenter. Indeed, the many examples alluding to crafts, mechanics, trade, work, and economic hardship, the apparent “critical outsider” stance of the earliest Mohist texts, and the nearly total absence of references to the li (courtly ritual, ceremony, etiquette) so central to Confucian thought all tend to suggest that Mohism emerged from a rising class of craftsmen, merchants, and soldiers that grew in size and political influence during the Warring States era, a time of rapid social and political change. For an exploration of the impact of this social background on Mohist thought, see the following supplement:
As their movement flourished in the 4th and 3rd centuries BCE, the Mohists branched into a number of groups, each led by a juzi, or grand master. Two early sources, the Hanfeizi (Book 50, ca. 233 BCE or later) and the Zhuangzi (Book 33, perhaps 2nd century BCE), mention a total of six groups of Mohists, who apparently quarreled among themselves over the details of Mohist doctrine. Another early text, the Lushi Chunqiu (ca. 239 BCE), mentions at least three other Mohist juzi. Evidence from the Mozi and Lushi Chunqiu indicates that these Mohist groups were disciplined organizations devoted to moral and practical education, political advocacy, government service, and in some cases military service. Members underwent a period of study and training, after which the organization might find them positions in government or the military, probably in a Mohist regiment. Members were expected to contribute funds to the organization and could be expelled for failing to fulfill their duties. The Mohists were renowned for fervent commitment to their ethical principles and to a lifestyle of austerity and self-sacrifice. A Han dynasty text collected in the Zhuangzi claims that many Mohists believed it was their duty to emulate the legendary altruistic labors of the ancient sage king Yu:
Many of the Mohists of later ages wear furs and rough clothing, clogs and grass slippers, never resting day or night, taking self-sacrifice as the highest. They say, “One who cannot do this is not following the way of Yu and doesn’t deserve to be called a Mohist.” … They press each other forward in self-sacrifice until there’s no flesh left on their calves or hair on their shins. (Zhuangzi, Book 33, “Under Heaven”)
Such external testimony — albeit from an unsympathetic source — presents a minor puzzle in the interpretation of Mohist thought, for the texts preserved in the Mozi do not directly advocate self-sacrificing altruism, and at least one clearly rejects it. The same Zhuangzi passage tells us that different groups of Mohists disagreed strongly concerning the details of Mohist doctrine; perhaps this was one of the issues about which they differed.
As the name implies, the Warring States era saw the pre-imperial Chinese world divided into numerous states that frequently fell to war with each other, each of the larger, more powerful states aspiring to conquer its neighbors and unify the empire under its rule. The Mohists were deeply committed to the ideal of a harmonious, peaceful social order and to universal concern for the welfare of all the world. They condemned unprovoked military aggression and attempted to dissuade warlike rulers from attacking other states. Far from being pacifists, however, they saw a strong defense force as crucial to state survival. Indeed, many Mohists seem to have concluded that, since social order was a paramount value and gratuitous warfare was wrong, they had a duty to assist victims of aggression. Some Mohists became specialists in defensive warfare, rushing to the aid of cities and states under threat of attack. The last quarter of the Mozi preserves the texts of these militias, which present detailed information about ancient defense tactics and siege fortifications (for an overview, see Yates, 1980).
As their movement developed, the Mohists came to present themselves as offering a collection of ten key doctrines, divided into five pairs. The ten doctrines correspond to the titles of the ten triads, the ten sets of three essays that form the core of the Mozi. Although the essays in each triad differ in detail, the gist of each doctrine may be briefly summarized as follows.
- “Promoting the Worthy” and “Identifying Upward.” The purpose of government is to achieve a stable social, economic, and political order (zhi, pronounced “jr”) by promulgating a unified conception of morality (yi). This task of moral education is to be carried out by encouraging everyone to “identify upward” to the good example set by social and political superiors and by rewarding those who do so and punishing those who do not. Government is to be structured as a centralized, bureaucratic state led by a virtuous monarch and managed by a hierarchy of appointed officials. Appointments are to be made on the basis of competence and moral merit, without regard for candidates’ social status or origins.
- “Inclusive Care” and “Condemning Aggression.” To achieve social order and exemplify the key virtue of ren (benevolence, goodwill), people must inclusively care for each other, having as much concern for others’ lives, families, and communities as for their own, and in their relations with others seek to benefit them. Military aggression is wrong for the same reasons that theft, robbery, and murder are: it harms others in pursuit of selfish benefit, while ultimately failing to benefit Heaven, the spirits, or society as a whole.
- “Moderation in Use” and “Moderation in Burial.” To benefit society and care for the welfare of the people, wasteful luxury and useless expenditures must be eliminated. Seeking always to bring wealth to the people and order to society, the ren (benevolent) person avoids wasting resources on extravagant funerals and prolonged mourning (customs promoted by the Ru and others).
- “Heaven’s Intent” and “Understanding Ghosts.” Heaven is the noblest, wisest moral agent, so its intent is a reliable, objective standard of what is morally righteous (yi) and must be respected. Heaven rewards those who obey its intent and punishes those who defy it, hence people should strive to be benevolent and do what is righteous. Social and moral order (zhi) can be advanced by encouraging belief in ghosts and spirits who reward the good and punish the wicked.
- “Condemning Music” and “Condemning Fatalism.” The benevolent (ren) person opposes the extravagant musical entertainment and other luxuries enjoyed by rulers and high officials, because these waste resources that could otherwise be used for feeding and clothing the common people. Fatalism is not ren, because by teaching that our lot in life is predestined and human effort is useless, it interferes with the pursuit of economic wealth, a large population, and social order (three primary goods that the benevolent person desires for society). Fatalism fails to meet a series of justificatory criteria and so must be rejected.
When an audience with the ruler of a state was secured, different doctrines might be advocated first, depending on the circumstances in that state:
If the state is in disorder, then expound “promoting the worthy” and “identifying upward”; if the state is poor, then expound “moderation in use” and “moderation in burial”; if the state overindulges in musical entertainment, then expound “condemning music” and “condemning fate”; if the state is dissolute and indecorous, expound “honoring Heaven” and “serving ghosts”; if the state is devoted to aggression and intimidation, then expound “inclusive care” and “condemning aggression.” (Book 49, “Questions of Lu”).
As this passage and the capsule summaries of their ten core doctrines indicate, the Mohists saw themselves primarily as a moral, political, and religious advocacy group devoted to realizing what they saw as a morally right society and way of life, one that promotes “benefit” (lì) and eliminates “harm” (hai) for all the world. “Benefit” (lì) for them is a loose conception of general welfare comprising material prosperity, an abundant population, and sociopolitical “order” (zhi). This latter term denotes social conditions in which crime, deceit, harassment, strife, and military aggression are absent, people cooperate with and assist each other, those without family to support them are cared for, and individuals manifest the virtues appropriate to their roles as rulers, subjects, fathers, sons, and brothers. The Mohists’ ethical theory is an interesting, complex form of consequentialism that posits a plurality of intrinsic goods, which are to be promoted through a variety of strategies.
Aside from their ethical and political doctrines — the aspects of their philosophy they themselves see as central — the Mohists’ explicit theories and implicit assumptions about language, knowledge, reasoning, and moral psychology are of great philosophical interest. Many aspects of their views in these areas are probably not distinctively Mohist, but instead reflect background assumptions widely shared by other classical Chinese thinkers. Thus a greater understanding of Mohist thought advances our understanding of early Confucianism, Daoism, and other schools as well.
A central concern in Mohist thought is to secure zhi (pronounced “jr”), or moral, social, and political order, an intrinsic good that the Mohists assume everyone in society will value. According to Mohist political theory, this aim is achieved by unifying society’s moral standards, so that people will agree in their value judgments, thus eliminating any potential reasons for conflict. The unified moral standards cannot be chosen arbitrarily, however, for if people see that the standards do not genuinely promote social and moral order, they will defy them. So a crucial question for the Mohists is: What shall we take as the basis for unified moral norms?
One answer, accepted by many Ru (Confucians) and other “gentlemen of the world” criticized by the Mohists, is the li (ritual propriety, ceremony), a traditional code of propriety specifying behavior appropriate for individuals playing different social roles in various types of situations. We can take the li, supplemented by the situational discretion (quan) of the virtuous gentleman, as a basic standard of conduct. This solution of course presupposes a rough, gentlemanly consensus about what is and is not appropriate behavior. Such a consensus seems to be assumed by the major Confucian figure Mencius, for instance, who sees little need to develop an explicit normative ethical theory, focusing instead on moral psychology.
Perhaps partly because of their social origins, Mozi and his followers do not identify with the li (ritual) of the traditional high culture and so find this sort of traditionalist consensus an unconvincing moral guide. To the suggestion that tradition can serve as a reliable moral standard, they respond by distinguishing between traditional customs and morality as such, pointing out that conformity to tradition is not in itself sufficient to ensure moral correctness. They make this point by considering — at roughly the same time Herodotus was raising similar issues in Greece — the challenge to parochial conceptions of what is right posed by the existence of disparate cultural practices.
Now those who uphold rich burials and prolonged mourning say: “If rich burials and prolonged mourning turn out not to be the Way of the sage-kings, then how do we explain why the gentlemen of the central states perform them without ceasing and maintain them without choosing something else?!”
Our Master Mozi said, “This is what’s called deeming their habits convenient and their customs righteous. In the past, east of Yue there was the country of Gai Shu. When their eldest son was born, they chopped him up and ate him, calling this ‘advantageous to the younger brothers.’ When their grandfather died, they carried off their grandmother and abandoned her, saying, ‘One cannot live with the wife of a ghost.’ These practices superiors took as government policy and subordinates took as custom, performing them without ceasing and maintaining them without choosing something else. Yet how could these really be the Way of benevolence and righteousness?!” (Book 25, “Moderation in Burial”)
Different cultures may have different, conflicting customs, some of which may be morally wrong by our lights. Since other cultures’ customs may be wrong, by parity of reasoning, so might our own. The mere fact that a practice is traditional or customary, as the li (rituals, ceremonies) are, does not show that it is right in the objective, universal sense expressed by moral concepts such as ren (benevolence) and yi (righteousness, morality). The li thus cannot serve as an authoritative standard of a unified morality. We need to find other, objectively justified standards.
This search for objective moral standards by which to guide action and reform society lies at the heart of the Mohist philosophical and political project. The master idea driving Mohist thought is that in ethics and politics, as in any other practical field, we can indeed find and apply such standards, which the Mohists call fa (models, paradigms, standards). A text from one of the later portions of the Mozi explains the role of fa in this way:
Our Master Mozi said, “Those in the world who perform tasks cannot do without models (fa) and standards. There is no one who can accomplish their task without models and standards. Even officers serving as generals or ministers, they all have models; even the hundred artisans performing their tasks, they too all have models. The hundred artisans make squares with the set square, circles with the compass, straight lines with the string, vertical lines with the plumb line, and flat surfaces with the level. Whether skilled artisans or unskilled artisans, all take these five as models. The skilled are able to conform to them. The unskilled, though unable to conform to them, by following them in performing their tasks still surpass what they can do by themselves. Thus the hundred artisans in performing their tasks all have models to measure by.”
“Now for the greatest to order (zhi, also ‘govern’) the world and those the next level down to order great states without models to measure by, this is to be less discriminating than the hundred artisans.” (Book 4, “Models and Standards”)
As this passage indicates, the Mohists regard fa (models) as similar to tools used to guide and check the performance of skilled tasks, such as sawing a square corner or drawing a straight line. Fa are objective, reliable, and easy to use, so that with minimal training anyone can employ them to perform a task or check the results. Fa alone do not ensure success, nor do they erase the distinction between the skilled and unskilled — or between the virtuous and those still acquiring virtue — but for most of us they at least ensure that we will do better than we would without them.
Our primary task in governing or “ordering” (zhi) society, then, is to find reliable, objective models or standards to guide our actions, practices, and policies. As in the case of the li (ritual), however, the Mohists point out that any standard specific to our particular family, education, or community could turn out to be unreliable. “Models and Standards,” the text cited above, continues:
That being so, then what is acceptable to take as a model (fa) for order (zhi)? How would it be for everyone to model themselves on their parents? Those in the world who are parents are many, but those who are benevolent (ren) are few; if all model themselves on their parents, this is modeling the unbenevolent. Modeling on the unbenevolent — it’s not acceptable to take that as a model.
Having objected to taking parents as a fundamental moral model, the passage next rejects teachers (or “learning”) and rulers on the same grounds: We cannot be sure that all teachers and political leaders are benevolent (ren). The text concludes that “of these three, parents, teachers, and rulers, none is acceptable as a model for order.” An objective standard is needed, one that is not morally fallible in the way that any particular individual role model or cultural tradition might be. The Mohists propose that we can find such a standard by considering the attitudes of an ideally impartial, benevolent, and reliable moral agent: Tian (Heaven, nature, the sky), whom they revere as a quasi-personal god.
That being so, then what is acceptable to take as a model for order? So I say, Nothing is like modeling on Heaven. Heaven’s conduct is broad and impartial; its favors are rich and incur no debt; its brightness endures without fading. So the sage-kings modeled themselves on it. (Book 4, “Models and Standards”)
This notion of taking Heaven as a moral role model leads the Mohists to develop a credible normative theory based on equal, impartial concern for the welfare of all. At the same time, however, it steers them into formulating some of their central normative principles in a potentially problematic way. Their conception of Tian (Heaven) provides a compelling basis for arguing that everyone’s interests have equal moral worth. But since the Mohists believe that Tian acts impartially on everyone’s behalf, adopting it as a moral model tends to imply that each of us as individuals is obliged to treat others and ourselves equally — to act in others’ interest exactly as we act in our own. This view, if indeed the Mohists hold it, would invite several objections commonly leveled at crude forms of utilitarianism. The most obvious is that limitations on our time and resources make it practically impossible for us to act equally on others’ behalf as well as our own. (In practice, I cannot possibly make breakfast for everyone each morning, only for myself, my family, and perhaps a few neighbors.) Another possible objection would be that by demanding excessive attention to the needs of others, Mohist ethics leaves individuals with insufficient resources to live their own lives well, thus sacrificing much of what makes an individual life good.
The Mohists’ ethical theory thus raises fundamental questions concerning the moral claim on us of others’ interests, the role of impartiality, fairness, and benevolence in an adequate ethical code, and the elements of a good life — questions that remain vital in moral philosophy today. We will return to some of these issues and the Mohists’ response to them when we assess the Mohist ethical theory below. First, however, we need to explore further the concept of a “model” presupposed by Mohists’ notion of “taking Heaven as a model.”
The Mohists refer to the objective ethical standard they seek as a fa (model, standard), a concept that plays a central part in their ethics and their views on language, knowledge, and argumentation or reasoning. Fa is among the key notions through which Mohism had an important influence on the late Warring States Confucian thinker Xunzi and his student Han Fei, leading representative of a style of realpolitik thought that later became known as the fa jia (school of fa, often translated as “legalism”). Fa have a dual role, providing both practical guidelines and justificatory criteria for judgment and action. In their action-guiding role, fa serve as guidelines or decision criteria that direct action and practical reasoning. In this respect, they are an important part of the Mohists’ explanation of how we learn language and ethical norms and of the cognitive processes by which we reason, form judgments, and act. In their justificatory role, on the other hand, fa may function as fundamental standards of correctness by which to justify actions and judgments.
A notable feature of “Models and Standards,” the Mohist text discussed in the preceding section, is that the candidate fa considered are not ethical principles, but virtuous agents, such as parents and teachers, whom we can take as role models. This observation provides a key to understanding both the concept of fa and, more broadly, the orientation of Mohist views about language, knowledge, cognition, and reasoning.
The term fa denotes any guide, aid, or tool for following a norm or making a judgment. Explicit rules, laws, and definitions are all fa. But fa may also be role models, such as a virtuous parent, teacher, or ruler. They may be prototypes, exemplars, analogies, or pictures of some kind of thing, or they may be tools or measuring devices, such as a yardstick or a carpenter’s compass and set square. They may even be concepts, such as “the benefit (lì) of the world,” which the Mohists take to be co-extensive with and thus a criterion for identifying what is yi (morally righteous). In short, any criterion or paradigm that helps us to make correct judgments or to act correctly can be a fa.
The reason such a wide range of items can serve as fa is that the Mohists regard fa primarily not as principles or rules, but as different types of practical models used to guide the performance of norm-governed activities. The objective ethical standards they seek are not definitions or universal principles, from which they will derive particular consequences by deductive reasoning. Instead, they seek a reliable role model or paradigm for their actions and practices to copy or emulate. This is why they can propose, as their highest fa or ethical standard, not a normative principle, but Heaven itself, considered as the highest, most reliable moral agent in the natural order.
The prominence of practical models or exemplars reflects two fundamental features of Mohist thought and arguably of classical Chinese philosophy generally. The first is its practical, pragmatic orientation. The focus of early Chinese thought is on correct practical performance, not theoretical description or representation. The concept that stands at the center of the classical discourse is dao (way), a notion that refers to norms, patterns, and methods of acting, specifically of ordering the state and conducting one’s personal life. The central questions for early Chinese thinkers are not What is the truth, and how do we know it? but What is the dao (way), and how do we follow it? The fundamental aim is not an intellectual grasp of a definition or principle, but the practical ability to follow a norm or perform a task successfully. Fa are in effect tools to aid us in following the dao, and anything that guides practical performance effectively can serve as a fa. A concrete exemplar or model that one can emulate is considered as useful as a principle or definition (indeed, principles and definitions are apparently seen as one variety of practical model).
The second, interrelated feature is that the Mohists regard cognition, judgment, and inference as processes of analogical pattern recognition — specifically, processes of distinguishing relevantly similar kinds of objects, events, or actions from dissimilar ones. This sort of process is referred to as distinguishing (bian) what is “this” (shi) from what is “not” (fei). (Shi and fei are pronounced roughly “shr” and “fey.”) Drawing such distinctions is a practical skill, the execution of which can be aided by reference to models or exemplars — that is, fa. Fa are in effect reference prototypes for use in pattern recognition.
Both of these features are illustrated by how the Mohists describe the application of fa. The following passage explains the role of “Heaven’s intent” as an ethical fa by likening it to the compass, a model against which the wheelwright compares objects to distinguish whether they are round or not.
Thus our Master Mozi’s having Heaven’s intent, to give an analogy, is no different from the wheelwright’s having a compass or the carpenter’s having a set square. Now the wheelwright grasps his compass and uses it to measure the round and not round in the world, saying, “What conforms to my compass, call it ‘round,’ what doesn’t conform to my compass, call it ‘not round.’” Hence round and not round can both be known. What is the reason for this? It’s that the fa for “round” is clear. (Book 27, “Heaven’s Intent”)
Formally, ethical fa are not regarded as general principles that we apply as the major premise of a kind of deductive argument, such as a practical syllogism. Rather, they are seen as paradigms or prototypes against which we compare something to distinguish, or bian, whether or not it falls under the extension of a term, such as ‘yi’ (duty, righteousness). Drawing distinctions in this way is the functional equivalent, in Mohist thought, of making a judgment or forming a belief. The ability to draw the distinctions correctly is knowledge. Moreover, the process of citing a fa, comparing something to it, and then judging whether the two are similar constitutes the Mohists’ basic conception of practical reasoning. Since for the Mohists fa include rules as well as models and examples, in their eyes the process of deducing a conclusion from a general rule or principle is in effect a special case of the more general cognitive process of comparing things to models and drawing distinctions. Thus they tend to explain all forms of reasoning, including deductive inference, as species of pattern recognition or analogical reasoning.
Because they play such a central role in the Mohist conception of cognition and reasoning, fa can be treated as a key to understanding the Mohists’ approach not only to ethics, but to epistemology, semantics, and logic or argumentation. Action, linguistic communication, knowledge, and reasoning are all explained by appeal to the practical activity of drawing distinctions according to public norms. Fa are models or standards that aid us in following such norms reliably. In ethics, they take the place of universal ethical principles in moral reasoning and in guiding action. In epistemology, they are public criteria that guide distinction drawing and thus justify claims to knowledge. In semantic theory, they are part of the explanation of why words refer to what they do: a word is associated with a fa (exemplar) by convention and then refers to everything deemed relevantly similar to the fa. In reasoning or argument, a judgment is established or refuted by citing one or more fa and showing that the object of the judgment does or does not conform to the fa.
The Mohists apply several closely interrelated conceptions of knowledge, of which the central one is a form of recognition, or “knowledge-of.” Knowledge-of is manifested as a practical ability to correctly distinguish the referent(s) of the word, or “name” (ming), that denotes the object of knowledge. It is thus interrelated with and dependent on a kind of practical knowing-how. This knowing-how provides a behavioral criterion by which knowledge is assessed: to qualify as having knowledge of x, an agent must be able to reliably pick out the sorts of things denoted by the word ‘x’.
The Mohist conception of knowledge is thus fundamentally practical, not representational or theoretical. Having knowledge is not a matter of having a correct representation in one’s mind or being able to give a theoretical description of some state of affairs, but of being able to do something correctly in practice — specifically, being able to distinguish various kinds (lei) of things from one another. Propositional knowledge, to the limited extent that it is addressed, is implicitly explained terms of the ability to distinguish kinds properly: To know that a is F is to know to distinguish a as the kind of thing denoted by the term ‘F’.
The object of knowledge is typically regarded as a kind of object or event, denoted by a term, rather than a proposition, expressed by a sentence. (Grammatically, the verb zhi (to know) most often takes a noun or noun phrase as its object.) Also, since to know a thing is to know how to distinguish it from other kinds of things, the object of knowledge is sometimes taken to be a distinction, as when the Mohists speak of “knowing the distinction between righteous and unrighteous” (Book 17, “Condemning Aggression”).
The Mohists’ primary conception of knowledge is illustrated in following passage, which emphasizes that knowledge lies not in the ability to make correct statements, but the ability to “select” the things denoted by a word, or “name.”
Our Master Mozi said, “Now the blind say, ‘What’s bright is white, and what’s dark is black.’ Even the clear-sighted have no grounds for changing this. But collect white and black things together and make the blind select from among them, and they cannot know. So as to my saying the blind don’t know white and black, it’s not by their naming, it’s by their selecting.” (Book 47, “Valuing Duty”)
The passage depicts the knowledge the blind possess of the colors white and black as, what we would characterize as, propositional knowledge. Yet the text’s central claim is that the blind do not qualify as “knowing white and black,” because they are unable to identify them in practice. For the Mohists, the key criterion of knowledge is not the mere ability to make correct statements — as when the blind “use the names ‘white’ and ‘black’ in strings the same way” as the sighted — but the ability to “distinguish the things” denoted by these words (Book 19, “Condemning Aggression”).
A natural response here would be to point out that the Mohists’ own view implicitly recognizes that knowledge of words, or “names,” constitutes a separate type of knowledge, distinct from knowledge of how to “select” things. The Mohists ought to categorize knowledge more finely, the response would run, by distinguishing between knowing how to use names and knowing how to distinguish the referents of names. (Full mastery of a concept would presumably require both abilities.) The later Mohist texts do precisely this, presenting a fourfold categorization of knowledge that includes knowledge of names, knowledge of things, knowledge of relations between names and things, and knowledge of how to act (see the separate entry for “Mohist Canons”). Nevertheless, in this earlier text, no value is attached to knowledge of names. What counts as genuine knowledge is the reliable ability to distinguish things in practice.
The Mohists’ view of knowledge thus illustrates the practical orientation of early Chinese thought, as sketched in the discussion of fa (models) in the previous section. For the Mohists, knowing x does not require knowing the definition, the essence, the meaning, the Platonic Form, nor a description of x. It requires only the practical ability to distinguish x from not-x. This pragmatic view of knowledge contrasts with the semantic orientation of the Greek tradition, as epitomized by Plato. We find Plato asking What is justice? and seeking to answer this question by determining the single essential form shared by all just things. By contrast, the Mohists never ask what the essence or definition of yi (righteousness) is. They are concerned only with the problem of how to reliably distinguish yi from not-yi. This problem can be solved, they assume, by finding appropriate models for drawing the distinction and teaching everyone to apply or emulate them. Such models may have a utilitarian, empirical basis; they may rest on independent moral grounds; or they may be based simply on the conviction that the actions of exemplary moral agents, such as Tian (Heaven) and the ancient sage-kings, cannot be wrong.
The Mohist conception of knowledge includes no explicit element corresponding to the justification component in the traditional Western analysis of knowledge as justified true belief. Instead, the Mohists seem to treat knowledge simply as correct judgment, which they understand as correct distinction drawing. Justification is not identified as a distinct requirement for knowledge, probably because the Mohists’ conception of “correct” distinction drawing implicitly incorporates an element of reliability. Knowledge is not merely drawing a distinction correctly in one case or another, but a reliable ability or disposition to draw distinctions correctly in a variety of cases over time.
Now suppose there is a person here, who, seeing a little black, says “Black,” but seeing much black, says “White.” Then surely we’d take this person to not know the distinction between white and black. Tasting a little of something bitter, he says “Bitter,” but tasting much of something bitter, he says, “Sweet.” Then surely we’d take this person to not know the distinction between sweet and bitter. (Book 17, “Condemning Aggression”)
A plausible account of the purpose of the justification component in the traditional tripartite analysis of knowledge is that it disqualifies accidentally true beliefs — beliefs that happen to be true, but are based on no good reason — from counting as knowledge. The Mohists handle this issue implicitly, by acknowledging only reliably correct distinction drawing as knowledge. Here again, their conception of knowledge reflects their overall focus on practical performance. Fundamentally, for them knowledge is not a correspondence between a mental state and the world, but an ability to perform certain skills reliably and correctly.
Accordingly, cognitive error — false assertion or belief — is not explained as inaccurate representation, as a lack of correspondence between assertion or belief and reality, or as a failure to grasp the unchanging reality behind shifting sensory appearances. (The distinction between appearance and reality plays no role in Mohist thought and probably none in early Chinese thought as a whole.) Instead, error is understood as “disorder” (luan) or “confusion” (huo) in drawing distinctions, in effect a failure to perform a skill correctly. Immorality is due to a failure to know how to distinguish right from wrong. Those who perpetrate unprovoked military aggression, for example, are criticized for the “disorder” in how they distinguish righteous (yi) from unrighteous (Book 17, “Condemning Aggression”).
The discussion of Mohist epistemology presented so far has been based on an interpretation of the conception of knowledge implicit in the Mohists’ remarks in a variety of contexts. Since, unlike the Mohist Canons, early Mohist texts do not treat the concept of knowledge explicitly, this interpretation is necessarily conjectural and incomplete. When we turn to the issue of justifying claims to knowledge, on the other hand, we are on firmer ground, for the Mohists present an explicit, though sketchy, theory based on the concept of fa (models, standards). In outline, the theory is this. To make a judgment is to distinguish what is “this” or “right” (shi, or “shr”) in some context from what is “not” or “wrong” (fei, “fey”). The process of evaluating whether some statement or action is correct is thus one of evaluating whether the distinction on which it is based is has been drawn properly. To guide us in getting the distinctions right, the Mohists propose that we should establish fa as standards or criteria: What matches the fa is “this,” and thus correct; what doesn’t is “not.” The fa can thus be applied to justify or check knowledge claims. Conformity to the fa provides good grounds for accepting a claim, non-conformity for rejecting it.
The Mohists propose three fa for “statements” or “sayings” (yan), by which “the distinctions between ‘this’ and ‘not’ and benefit and harm...can be clearly known” (Book 35, “Condemning Fatalism”). Three slightly different versions of this doctrine are found in the Mozi, one in each of the three denunciations of fatalism (books 35–37). For brevity, we will discuss only the first version.
The three fa are that statements must have a root, a source, and a use. The “root” is the historical precedent and evidence provided by the deeds of the ancient sage kings, moral exemplars who reliably distinguished right from wrong correctly and whose way we thus seek to follow. The “source” is that statements must have an empirical basis; they must be checked against what people see and hear. The “use” is that when adopted as a basis for punishment and government administration, the statement must produce benefit (lì) for the state, clan, and people.
The Mohists regularly appeal to these three criteria when justifying their core doctrines. When questions of existence are at stake, as when arguing for the existence of ghosts or the nonexistence of fate, they apply all three standards. In arguing against fatalism, for example, they contend that (1) historical examples show that security and order depend on government policy, not fate: the ancient sage kings achieved peace and security under the same social conditions in which the tyrants brought turmoil and danger. (2) No one has ever actually seen or heard fate. (3) Fatalism has detrimental social consequences: If people listen to the fatalists, they will devote no effort to being virtuous or industrious. (Oddly, the Mohists overlook the obvious fatalist rejoinders that the tyrants’ failure and sages’ success were predestined, that fate is not a physical object, and that some people are fated to be diligent, others not.) Similarly, in arguing for the existence of ghosts and spirits who reward the good and punish the wicked, the Mohists point out that (1) the sage kings all venerated the ghosts and spirits; (2) countless well-known stories report cases in which ghosts have been seen and heard; and (3) the teaching that ghosts and spirits reward the worthy and punish the wicked has beneficial social consequences, as fear of punishment will deter people from wrongdoing.
In contexts where empirical support is irrelevant, only the first and third standards are applied. In condemning elaborate musical shows, for instance, the writers contend that levying taxes to pay for expensive musical instruments contradicts the deeds of the sage-kings, who would tax the people only to pay for practical items such as boats and carts, which benefit everyone. Grand concerts and feasts are pleasant, but on balance they do not benefit the populace, since they interfere with work and waste resources that could otherwise be devoted to food and clothing.
How are the three fa themselves justified? The texts that present the theory do not say, but the Mohists probably view the third standard, benefit to society, as an application of their moral theory, which they justify by appeal to the model of Heaven, or nature. That appeal they might justify in turn by independent moral criteria such as impartiality, benevolence, and reliability, as we suggested briefly in the section on objective standards. Critics who reject the Mohist normative theory thus may find this fa objectionable as well. As to the second standard, what people see and hear, the Mohists offer no defense. They may have an inchoate theory of sense perception that explains why the second standard is reliable, but there is little or no discussion of such issues in early Mohist texts. The first standard reflects a shared pattern, in the Mohists’ intellectual milieu, of appealing to ancient sage-kings or culture heroes for authority. This habit was grounded in the assumption that the ancient sage-kings were dependable ethical exemplars and, in some cases, that they were the originators of the relevant normative practices. Such appeals are to some extent defensible, as they can be thought of as an appeal to experience — to norms and practices that were found ethically and practically satisfactory by wise, fair leaders in the past. Still, later Warring States thinkers will rightly question whether policies developed under ancient social conditions remain applicable today and whether we can even be sure what those policies were.
Concerns can be raised about the vagueness of the three standards, the potential for disagreement about their interpretation and application, and the extent to which the Mohists apply them fairly and rigorously (does belief in ghosts really satisfy the second and third standards?). Moreover, the Mohists seem to overlook the possibility of conflicts between the three, such as the likelihood that certain practices of the ancient sage-kings might not benefit society today. The third standard probably takes priority over the others, since the first stipulates only that we find some “root” in the (presumably benevolent) deeds of the sages, not that we imitate them slavishly, and since, in a remarkable passage in Book 31 (“Elucidating Ghosts”), Mozi is depicted as arguing that even if there really are no ghosts and spirits, we should still behave as if there are, because of the social benefit that ensues.
The priority of the third standard is a striking feature of the Mohist theory, for it entails that in at least some circumstances, they advocate applying a utilitarian criterion to resolve not only normative questions but descriptive ones as well. One explanation for this extraordinary view is that they see all judgments — descriptive, prescriptive, or otherwise — as a matter of distinguishing “this” (shi) from “not” (fei). They use this pair of pronouns to refer to right and wrong in an extremely general sense, without distinguishing between different notions of correctness and error as they bear on describing, ordering, recommending, permitting, or choosing, or on issues that to us fall into areas as diverse as science, politics, ethics, prudence, and etiquette. We might say that the Mohists are applying a very basic, primitive conception of correctness, of which truth, obligation, permissibility, and other notions are species. The crucial point is probably that their main theoretical focus is not descriptive truth, but the proper dao (way) by which to guide social and personal life. This focus on dao leads them to run together the empirical question of whether ghosts exist with the normative question of whether we should act on and promulgate the teaching that they do. The doctrine of the three models thus reflects the pragmatic orientation of their thought, in particular the assumption, common to many early Chinese thinkers, that the primary purpose of language and judgment is to guide action appropriately, rather than to describe facts.
This pragmatic orientation led Hansen (1985, 1992) to propose that we should not treat the Mohists (or other early Chinese theorists) as addressing the semantic issue of whether a claim is true, but the pragmatic or normative one of whether a certain way of using words is appropriate. Thus the first standard, the deeds of the sage-kings, serves as a historical precedent of normatively correct usage, which complements the straightforwardly normative appeal to utility in the third standard. Hansen suggests that in general we should avoid interpreting early Chinese discussions about the proper way to distinguish shi from fei as concerned with issues of truth. (Hansen’s view has been criticized by Graham 1989 and Harbsmeier 1998, among others. See Fraser 2020a for a critical discussion of both sides’ positions.) Construed as the claim that the Mohists are wholly unconcerned with or lack a concept corresponding to semantic truth, Hansen’s thesis is unconvincing, for classical Chinese notions such as “this” (shi), “fitting” (dang), and especially “so” (ran) play conceptual roles that overlap enough with that of semantic truth that early Chinese thinkers cannot defensibly be said not to be concerned with truth. Moreover, in recognizing the possibility that there may really be no ghosts—even when the statement that there are purportedly satisfies the three standards—the Mohists implicitly recognize that a claim that is useful or satisfies our criteria of correctness may yet be mistaken in the sense of falling short of the “facts” or “reality” (qing). Arguably, they thus acknowledge a distinction between utility or social norms and semantic truth (though their discussion here uses no word interpretable as “truth”). Yet they contend that even if ghosts really do not exist, the proper dao (way) is nevertheless to affirm that they do—a position that tends to support Hansen’s view that they are arguing primarily that we should promulgate and act on the teaching that ghosts exist. Again, it is unlikely that early Mohist texts fully distinguish questions of descriptive truth as a category separate from normative ethical or political questions. Their theoretical orientation tends to merge the two under the broader rubric of the proper dao by which to discriminate shi from fei.
Interestingly, one could argue on the Mohists’ own grounds that they should give priority to the second standard over the other two—or that they should explicitly distinguish descriptive from normative issues—since doing so would probably be more beneficial in the long run. As rule of thumb, we probably benefit more by distinguishing shi from fei on empirical grounds, when relevant, rather than on the basis of historical precedent or short-term utility. If ghosts and spirits indeed do not accord with people’s experience, for instance, then in the long run relying on fear of their wrath to deter crime will probably be less beneficial than developing a reliable system of moral education and law enforcement. Also, in practice, it is unlikely that the alleged social benefits could motivate doubters to sincerely act as if ghosts exist or to follow a moral code based partly on the existence of things they cannot experience.
Besides its role in their epistemology, the theory of the three fa (models) epitomizes the Mohists’ view of logic and argumentation. The Mohists do not investigate formal logic or develop a notion of logical consequence. Rather, since they see judgment as a matter of distinguishing whether something is one kind of thing or another, they tend to conceive of all reasoning on the model of informal, analogical inference. Particular pieces of reasoning in Mohist texts may be deductive, inductive, analogical, or causal. But the Mohists themselves seem to regard all of these as different ways of applying fa to draw distinctions between similar and dissimilar kinds of things.
Their basic model of reasoning can be thought of as comprising three parts. (1) One or more fa (standards, models, or examples) are cited by which to distinguish “this” from “not” or to guide the use of some term, such as ren (benevolent) or yi (morally righteous). (2) Then it is indicated how some object, event, or practice does or does not “conform” to or “coincide” with the fa. (3) Accordingly, the thing in question is distinguished as “this” or “not,” as benevolent and righteous or unbenevolent and unrighteous. So what we think of as the major premise in a syllogistic piece of reasoning, the Mohists probably see as citing a fa. What we call a minor premise, they see as a claim that something “conforms” to the fa. What we think of as drawing a conclusion, they see as distinguishing whether or not something is the same kind of thing as the fa. Later Mohist texts make it clear that this reasoning process is regarded as a form of analogical inference or projection, which they call “extending kinds” (tui lei) — that is, “extending” our judgment of what counts as “of the same kind” to include new cases. In practice, “extending kinds” amounts to taking the judgment that things are “of a kind” (lei) in one or more respects as a basis for treating them as “of a kind” in another.
The three fa method of argument is one application of this general type of argument by example or analogy. But the three fa are not the only standards or models the Mohists employ. They regularly cite others, such as the behavior of the paradigmatic benevolent person (ren ren) or filial son (xiao zi). Many Mohist arguments proceed by establishing such a model or example and then contending that Mohist doctrine conforms to it, and is thus correct. For instance, two of the main arguments for the doctrine of inclusive care begin by citing the model of the benevolent person, who “seeks to promote the world’s benefit and eliminate the world’s harm” (books 15 and 16). The text goes on to argue that the doctrine of inclusive care promotes benefit to all and so conforms to the standard set by the benevolent person. Thus inclusive care is benevolent and righteous.
A second example is the chief argument against extravagant funerals (Book 25). It too begins by citing the benevolent person as an ethical paradigm, but here the opening move is to establish, by analogy, the attitude of the filial son toward his parents as a model for that of the benevolent person toward society: “The benevolent person’s planning on behalf of the world, to give an analogy, is in no respect different from the filial son’s planning on behalf of his parents.” The filial son seeks to provide his parents with wealth, a large family, and social order. So too has the benevolent person “three duties” on behalf of society: to secure wealth, a large population, and social order. Having established these “three benefits” as criteria for what is benevolent and righteous, the text goes on to argue that the practice of lavish funerals and lengthy mourning yields poverty, a small population, and social turmoil, and thus is “unbenevolent, unrighteous, and not the deed of a filial son.”
Both the inclusive care argument and the funerals argument illustrate another common Mohist rhetorical strategy: tracing the causal consequences of a doctrine or policy, typically to show that Mohist doctrine yields results that tally with some standard while an opposing doctrine does not. One text (Book 16) dubs this argument technique “developing two alternatives” (liang er jin zhi). The text identifies two contrasting moral guidelines, “inclusive” versus “exclusive” moral concern, and explores their causal consequences to see which yields results that conform to the ethical standard of “promoting the world’s benefit and eliminating the world’s harm.” That alternative — “inclusive” concern, as the Mohists see it — is therefore “this” or “right” (shi), the other “not” (fei).
Mohist political thought begins with a distinctive, fascinating state of nature account of the origin and justification of the state. Unlike Hobbes’s well-known scenario, the Mohist myth depicts violent social disorder as resulting not from individuals’ untrammeled pursuit of self-interest in conditions of scarcity, but from disagreement about values. People’s primary motivation is not self-interest, but their diverse, individual conceptions of yi (morality, righteousness). Individuals all tend to do what they think is right; the problem is that everyone disagrees about what that is. Since for the Mohists yi is inherently social and shared, each person condemns values different from her own as morally wrong. The plurality of moral standards thus leads to contention, belligerence, and wasted resources. For simplicity, we will quote mainly from the first of the three versions of the theory, which describes the state of primal anarchy in this way:
Our Master Mozi stated, In antiquity, when people first arose, before there were penal codes and government, probably the saying was, “People have different norms of righteousness (yi).” Hence for one person, one norm; for two people, two norms; for ten people, ten norms—the more people, the more too the things they called ‘righteous’. Hence people deemed their norm right and by it deemed others’ norms wrong, so in interacting they deemed each other—wrong. Thus, inside the family, fathers and sons, elder and younger brothers became resentful and scattered, unable to remain together with each other peacefully. The people of the world all injured each other with water, fire, and poison. It reached the point that, having surplus strength, they couldn’t use it to labor for each other; letting surplus resources rot, they didn’t share them with each other; and concealing good dao (ways), they didn’t teach them to each other. The disorder (luan) in the world was like that among the birds and beasts. (Book 11, “Identifying Upward”)
The root of this chaos, as the Mohists see it, is the absence of political leaders who will unify moral standards and thus put an end to contention and animosity. The solution is to install a wise, virtuous sovereign who will establish unified moral norms and thus bring order (zhi, pronounced “jr”) to society.
It was understood that the people lacked government leaders to unify the world’s norms of righteousness, and so the world was in disorder. Thus the most worthy, sagely, and intelligent person in the world was chosen, established as the Son of Heaven, and commissioned to work to unify the world’s norms of righteousness (yi). (Book 12, “Identifying Upward”)
The texts do not explain how the ruler is selected, nor, given their differences, how people manage to agree on who qualifies as the most worthy candidate. No social contract is envisioned. Instead, the sovereign’s legitimacy seems to rest on an implicit, utilitarian consensus that social order is a paramount value, one that can be achieved only by establishing centralized political leadership that will impose unified moral standards. The texts pass over the question of how, given this shared commitment to utilitarian social order, the people developed such diverse conceptions of morality in the first place.
For the Mohists, then, the purpose of government is to achieve a stable social order by promulgating a unified conception of morality. The central task of the state is moral education, training everyone to reliably conform to the same moral standards in judgment and action. This is the basis for such other aims as national defense, public security, economic management, and social welfare. The responsibility of the state for moral education is a distinctive theme of classical Chinese thought, prominent in both Mohism and Confucianism and much criticized in Daoist texts.
To assist him in unifying the world’s morality, the sovereign, or “Son of Heaven,” appoints three dukes, who help him to divide the world into myriad states and appoint a lord for each. These lords in turn appoint other officials down to the level of the district, village, or clan head, until a complete hierarchical political system is established. Then the work of unifying moral standards begins. The main technique adopted for this task is model emulation. People are ordered to “identify upward” with the moral judgments articulated by their political superiors and not to ally together below. This moral guidance is reinforced by social and behavioral incentives. Those who conform and do good are praised, rewarded, and promoted; those who do not are censured and punished. For the Mohists, rewards and punishments are justified instrumentally, by their role in encouraging good behavior and discouraging bad.
Once the government leaders were in place, the Son of Heaven issued a government policy to the people of the world, stating, “Hearing of good and bad, in all cases report it to your superiors. What superiors deem right (shi), all must deem right; what superiors deem wrong (fei), all must deem wrong. If superiors commit errors, admonish them; if subordinates do good, recommend them. Identify upward and don’t align together below. This is what superiors will reward and subordinates will praise.”
“Or, if you hear of good and bad but don’t report it to superiors; are unable to deem right what superiors deem right; are unable to deem wrong what superiors deem wrong; don’t admonish superiors when they commit errors; don’t recommend subordinates when they do good; align together below and don’t identify upward, this is what superiors will punish and the people will denounce.” (Book 11, “Identifying Upward”)
Officials on each level of the political hierarchy repeat a variant of these instructions to their subordinates, urging them to model themselves on the good example set by the judgments, speech, and conduct of the leader on the next level up. Moral wisdom and a virtuous character are thus crucial qualifications for political leadership.
Thus the village head was the most benevolent man in the village. The village head issued a government policy to the people of the village, stating, “Hearing of good and bad, you must report it to the district head. What the district head deems right (shi), all must deem right; what the district head deems wrong (fei), all must deem wrong. Eliminate your bad statements and learn the good statements of the district head; eliminate your bad conduct and learn the good conduct of the district head. Then how could the district be in disorder?! Examine what put the district in order (zhi): it’s just that the district head was able to unify the district’s norms of righteousness (yi), and hence the district was in order.” (Book 11, “Identifying Upward”)
The village head leads his village to emulate the district head, who in turn leads his district to emulate the lord of the state. The lords of states lead their people to emulate the Son of Heaven, who brings order to all under heaven. The Son of Heaven is still fallible, however, and so cannot be the highest moral paragon. Above him is Heaven (Tian), to which the people must ultimately conform. In the Mohist myth, politics is not distinct from ethics and religion, and unlike in Hobbes, the sovereign’s power is not absolute, for he must answer to independent moral standards.
If the people of the world all identify upward with the Son of Heaven but don’t identify upward with Heaven, then disasters still will not go away. Now if in the heavens whirlwinds and bitter rain come again and again, this is how Heaven punishes the people for not identifying upward with Heaven. (Book 11, “Identifying Upward”)
A distinctive feature of the theory is that, as might be expected from the practical orientation of Mohist thought, moral education is regarded as akin to teaching a practical skill, such as how to speak a language. It is accomplished primarily by emulating the judgments and conduct of moral exemplars, specifically how they distinguish right (shi) from not (fei) and act accordingly. The basic source of moral guidance is thus practical training in social norms, which people are expected to master and extend to new cases. As in language learning, social superiors teach chiefly not by dictating rules or instructions, but by setting an example to be emulated and then praising or correcting the learner’s performance. Of course, sometimes they will set forth explicit fa (models, rules), as when the Son of Heaven issues the original order for everyone to identify upward. But moral education is not seen primarily as a matter of inculcating knowledge of rules, theoretical knowledge of the good, nor the reflective habit of testing the maxims on which one acts against the moral law. It is seen mainly as a kind of skill training. The outcome of such training will be virtues, reliable dispositions to distinguish right from not correctly in speech and action. As we saw earlier, such dispositions constitute the Mohists’ basic conception of knowledge.
Aspects of the Mohist political system are plausible and psychologically insightful. Consensus in moral judgments is indeed likely to yield social order, and moral education is probably a more effective device for ensuring compliance with ethical standards than laws and punishments alone. Most people probably are motivated to do what they think is right, and moral education may be an effective tool for channeling their good intentions. Model emulation is indeed a powerful educational process, as any parent knows, and many of our values and judgments are in fact learned by following the example of admired role models. Social coherence, peer pressure, and the approval of superiors are important motivational factors even for critical, reflective adults. The system might succeed in achieving a high degree of social order and stability, which would benefit everyone in society. The Mohists’ state of nature myth thus provides at least a prima facie instrumental justification of their vision of the state.
Yet the system’s authoritarian bent raises serious worries. The success of the system depends heavily on the moral character of the rulers. What if their judgment is wrong or misinformed? How can they be prevented from abusing their power by imposing pernicious, self-serving norms? The Mohists have several answers, of varying persuasiveness. The first is their version of the traditional Chinese doctrine that the sovereign rules by the mandate of Heaven (tian ming). Heaven will punish a corrupt ruler by causing him to be overthrown. Second, the sovereign and other leaders do not create the standards of right and wrong, but only exemplify, teach, and enforce them. Independent moral standards are provided by Mohist ethical theory, to which subordinates can appeal if their leaders are mistaken or corrupt. These independent criteria are explicitly incorporated into the third version of the political theory (Book 13), which specifies that people are to promote “care and benefit” to the clan, state, and world, instead of merely conforming to their superiors’ judgments of “right” and “not.” Third, the Mohists hold that facts about moral psychology prevent malicious abuse of the system, for it will collapse in the hands of a corrupt ruler. People must see that leaders govern fairly and in the interest of society as a whole, or they will resist the system and “ally below” against their superiors. The unified moral norms will disintegrate, rewards and punishments will lose their effectiveness, and disorder will ensue. Since this outcome is antithetical to everyone’s interests, including the ruler’s, even a self-interested leader has a motive to govern virtuously.
A further worry is that the Mohist political system implements a kind of command morality, in which subordinates do nothing but mindlessly follow their leaders, who decide for them what is right and wrong. This concern seems unfounded, however, for the sovereign’s original edict makes subordinates responsible for criticizing their superiors if they err. Clearly, those on the lower levels of the social hierarchy are expected to have the capacity to exercise independent judgment. The Mohists do tend toward a form of social, behavioral psychology and do not say enough about individual moral deliberation. But the aim of their system is education, not passive obedience. Their notion of a unified morality is two-sided. In one respect, subordinates must conform to their superiors, who lead and educate them, but in another, those above must conform to those below, for the system works only if the people genuinely approve of their leaders’ decisions.
A third worry, to contemporary eyes probably the most serious, is that the Mohists’ notion of a unified morality and their conception of social order (zhi) are disturbingly totalitarian. The Mohists are probably right to hold that social stability requires consensus on at least a minimal set of moral norms — one that rules out murder and theft, for instance — and that a strong government is needed to enforce such norms. The Mohist movement originated during an era of turmoil and violence, and it is possible that their conception of a unified morality is intended to comprise only the minimal moral standards needed to preserve social harmony. But the scope of the norms they envision seems much broader than this. Indeed, it seems to cover all value judgments whatsoever — all distinctions between “right” and “not” (shi and fei). To the Mohists, one suspects, even a moderate degree of diversity in how we draw such distinctions counts as social, moral, and even intellectual “disorder” (luan). The natural objection, for contemporary liberal readers, is that social order doesn’t require total consensus on values. It can be achieved through agreement on a limited, norms of justice, which leaves individuals free to determine other values for themselves. The Mohist system unduly restricts individual liberty, the objection would run, and in fact the Mohists’ own moral ideal of inclusive care and reciprocal benefit among everyone might best be satisfied by a political system that ensures extensive individual liberty.
These concerns underscore the nearly complete absence of individualism in Mohist thought. The Mohists presuppose a kind of communitarian system in which the fundamental concern is the interests of society as a whole, specifically social order (zhi), economic wealth, and a large population. What is right for the individual is determined by whatever dao (way) is right for society. The salient level of moral choice is that of the society; individuals who desire to do what is right are expected to take for granted that they should conform to the dao that is best for society. The individualist stance of the selfish, rational egoist does not occur to the Mohists as an alternative to be addressed or refuted. Nor do they see room for a distinction between public and private morality, between values that everyone must share in order to maintain a stable society and values about which individuals can disagree without disrupting social harmony.
The Mohists devote little or no attention to the rights, liberty, or equality of individuals, nor even to the question of what the most fulfilling kind of individual life is. They simply assume that the best life is one of adherence to yi (morality, duty) and thus of promoting overall utility. The paradigmatic individual — the benevolent person (ren ren) — is one who devotes himself to “promoting the benefit of and eliminating harm to the world.” Legitimate individual interests are identified through the individual’s role in the social project. The Mohists, like the Confucians, see individuals as largely constituted by the hierarchical, relational social roles they occupy, such as ruler or subject, father or son, elder or younger brother, male or female, elder or youth, or member of a family or community. It is primarily as occupants of such roles that individuals have ethical norms to follow and interests to pursue.
This communitarian focus is a major point of contrast with Western social contract theories and utilitarian political theory. Utilitarians and social contract theorists (excepting perhaps Rousseau) typically treat individuals’ interests as primary and construct social good out of individual good. The state is justified because it promotes individuals’ rights and interests better than any alternative. For the Mohists, by contrast, the state is instrumentally justified because social order (zhi) is an intrinsic good, sought by all, and government by a hierarchy of moral leaders is needed to achieve it.
Indeed, as we might expect from their communitarianism, the Mohists’ conception of zhi (order) contains the seeds of an argument that the state is intrinsically justified as well. The Mohists most often use zhi in a narrow sense, to refer to harmonious family and social relations. But some Mohist texts — mainly the triad devoted to the doctrine of “Heaven’s intent” — use zhi in a broader sense, in which it is identified with yi (righteousness, morality) and zheng (good governance), which in turn is taken to require a hierarchical political system administered by the noble and wise. The texts thus imply that the Mohist political system is not merely an instrument for producing utility, but is itself a component of the goods that constitute moral right and thus is intrinsically justified. Of course, even if we allow the Mohists to identify “morality” with “order” and “order” with their preferred form of political organization in this way, their line of argument justifies at most only the existence of the state, not the state’s promulgation of a totalitarian, all-encompassing norms of conduct.
Mohist political theory probably strongly influenced later Warring States political thinkers, such as the Confucian Xunzi and his two most famous students, the realpolitik theorist Han Fei and the statesman Li Si, political architect of China’s first empire. Yet this strand of authoritarian political thought did not lack critics. The Mohist conception of social order (zhi), along with those of Xunzi and Han Fei, epitomize views that are attacked sharply in ancient Daoist texts such as the Daodejing and Zhuangzi. By contrast, some parts of the Zhuangzi imply a relatively liberal political stance, on which individuals would probably be allowed the maximum amount of liberty compatible with avoiding social conflict.
As we have seen, the theory of “conforming upward” argues for a centralized state with a hierarchical, tightly organized bureaucracy. The other prominent Mohist political doctrine, “promoting the worthy,” contends that to ensure the success of the state in securing wealth, a large population, and social order, appointments to the bureaucracy must be based on ethical merit and professional ability. Talented commoners should be considered for office as well as those from elite backgrounds (particularly kinsmen of the ruler). This doctrine is partly a response to new administrative challenges arising from population growth, economic expansion, and interstate military rivalry, which called for a move beyond the traditional feudal system and the development of a more specialized, professional cohort of government officials. It is also a reaction against nepotism and incompetence and an appeal for greater equality of opportunity for those of non-elite origin, such as the Mohists themselves.
Above all, however, the doctrine is an important complement to the Mohist moral education and incentive system, an integral part of the implementation of the unified moral norms the Mohists see as crucial to social order and political legitimacy. For the system to work, it must be perceived as applying consistent, unified norms to promote and reward the worthy while offering a fair opportunity for advancement to all. Otherwise, those below will may be unable to identify with the system and thus may see no reason to emulate their superiors or cooperate with the state. Consistent with their communitarian orientation, the Mohists’ defense of equality of opportunity does not rest on the individualist view that, other things being equal, people intrinsically deserve to be treated similarly. The argument is rather that the utility of the state and society is promoted by employing the most qualified candidates, without regard for their social background, both because of their competence and because the state must be publicly perceived as enforcing unified, consistent standards.
Early Mohist writings have a practical, not theoretical orientation. The Mohists wrote political tracts aimed at persuading rulers, officials, and gentlemen to adopt their ethical and political doctrines, not abstract inquiries into ethical theory. In the course of arguing for their doctrines, however, they present a loose yet sophisticated form of consequentialism, an updated version of which would merit critical attention today. The leading principle — or as they think of it, fa (model, standard) — of their ethics is that people should have an attitude of “inclusive care” (jian ai) toward others and in their interactions seek to benefit (lì) each other. In this way, we promote “the benefit of all under heaven.”
The Mohists do not attempt to ground all ethical values or judgments on a single, fundamental good or principle, such as happiness or the moral law. Instead, plausibly, their theory is based on a loose notion of human welfare comprising a plurality of basic goods. Nor do they suggest that the ethical standards they propose will automatically resolve all moral problems, without the need for practical wisdom or trade-offs between goods. But they do hold, again plausibly, that a reflective, self-aware moral life demands that we develop some form of normative theory, some account of what practices are right and wrong and the reasons why.
The Mohist ethical theory bears a similarity to rule utilitarianism, but is probably better characterized as “practice consequentialism” or, even more appropriately, “dao (way) consequentialism.” For the Mohists, as for other classical Chinese thinkers, the salient unit of human activity and the focus of ethical reflection is not individual acts but dao (way), a general notion referring to a way, style, or pattern of life or of performing some kind of activity. Dao may be very broad in scope, including practices, institutions, and traditions, along with the rules, techniques, styles, attitudes, and dispositions associated with them. Since, as a way of life, a dao includes dispositions, and thus virtues, Mohist consequentialism incorporates some of the characteristics of motive consequentialism.
The Mohists’ primary concern, then, is not to provide a theory by which to judge whether particular acts are right or wrong, but to identify “the dao (way) of the benevolent (ren) and right (yi).” To the Mohists, the defining feature of this dao is that it promotes the welfare or “benefit” (lì) of and eliminates harm to everyone in society. “Benefit” is the general standard of moral permissibility.
The task of the benevolent is surely to diligently seek to promote the benefit of the world and eliminate harm to the world and to take this as a model (fa) throughout the world. Does it benefit people? Then do it. Does it not benefit people? Then stop. (Book 32, “Condemning Music”)
Some passages in the texts go beyond the simple distinction between what does and does not benefit people to recognize differences in degree. The extent to which an act is right or wrong is determined by the degree to which it benefits or harms others: “The more one injures another, the greater his unbenevolence, and the more severe the crime” (Book 17, “Condemning Aggression”). Typically, however, the moral problems the Mohists discuss concern general practices, such as funeral customs and warfare, not specific acts. The early texts are vague as to how the standard of benefit (lì) is to be applied in specific cases that do not fall neatly under one practice or another.
Unlike the classical utilitarianism of Bentham and Mill, Mohist consequentialism seeks to promote not individual happiness, but a range of goods, many of them public or collective. The general notion of “benefit” refers to an objective list of three sorts of goods: material wealth, a large population or family, and social order. These goods provide relatively concrete moral criteria. Practices and institutions that tend to advance them are benevolent and righteous; those that do not are malicious and wrong.
Might it be that, supposing we model ourselves on their statements, use their plans, and have rich burials with prolonged mourning, this can really enrich the poor, increase the few, secure the endangered, and bring order to the disordered? Then this is benevolent, righteous, and the task of a filial son. In planning for others, it is unacceptable not to encourage it. The benevolent will promote it throughout the world, establish it and make the people praise it, and never abandon it.
On the other hand, suppose that, modeling ourselves on their statements, using their plans, and having rich burials and prolonged mourning, this really cannot enrich the poor, increase the few, secure the endangered, and bring order to the disordered. Then this is not benevolent, not righteous, and not the task of a filially devoted son. In planning for others, it is unacceptable not to discourage it. The benevolent will seek to eliminate it from the world, abandon it and make people deem it wrong, and never do it. (Book 25, “Moderation in Burial”)
Consequentialist arguments based on one or more of these goods are used to justify nine of the ten core Mohist doctrines, including the fundamental moral principles of inclusive care and rejecting aggression. The tenth doctrine, “Heaven’s intent,” elucidates the justification for the consequentialist theory itself. (We will consider this doctrine below.)
Of the three goods, the Mohists’ concept of “order” (zhi) calls for special attention. This is a complex good comprising a variety of conditions the Mohists probably regard as constitutive of the good social life. From passages in which the Mohists characterize zhi (order) and its opposite, luan (disorder, turmoil), the elements of “order” seem to include at least four sorts of conditions.
- All levels of society conform to unified moral standards, and incentives and disincentives based on these standards are administered fairly by virtuous leaders, as described in Mohist political theory.
- Peace, security, and social harmony prevail, characterized negatively as the absence of crime, deceit, harassment, injury, conflict, and military aggression.
- Members of society manifest virtues constitutive of the proper performance of their relational social roles as ruler or subject, father or son, and elder or younger brother. Order obtains only when the ruler is benevolent, his subjects are loyal, fathers are kind, sons are filial, and elder and younger brothers display brotherly love and respect. (Like much ancient thought, Mohism has a sexist bias, and with few exceptions the texts disregard the social roles of women.)
- Community members habitually engage in reciprocal assistance and charity, sharing information, labor, education, and surplus goods and aiding the destitute and unfortunate.
In summary, “benefit to the world” is a general conception of welfare comprising social harmony and public security; economic prosperity and a thriving population and family; reciprocal cooperation among neighbors and charity for the needy; and good social relations, manifested in the exercise of virtues corresponding to the fundamental social roles.
This list of goods calls for several observations. First, though Mohist texts frequently state that the duty of the benevolent person is to promote benefit for all of society, the characterizations of “benefit” and “order” the texts give suggest that in itself the Mohist ethical theory does not call for selfless altruism. Rather, what is envisioned amounts to respect for others’ lives, property, families, and political sovereignty and reciprocal assistance and cooperation among community members. Altruistic charity is required only in cases of special hardship.
Second, the prominence of virtues associated with fundamental social roles indicates that the Mohists, like the Confucians, attach great importance to certain paradigmatic social relationships, probably seeing them as forming the basic framework of society. A flourishing society will be one in which these social roles are performed properly and wholeheartedly. Hence the Mohists view flourishing instances of these relationships as partly constitutive of social order (zhi) and thus of benefit (lì). Intriguingly, however, what the texts identify as goods are not the flourishing relationships themselves, but the role-specific virtues manifested by the persons bound together in them. This is probably because the Mohists see sincere, proper, fulfilling relationships as constituted by the practice of these role-specific virtues. The virtues are not simply a means to good relationships; their exercise is part of what it is to have a flourishing relationship of the relevant type. A morally admirable ruler-subject, father-son, or elder-younger brother bond is just one in which both parties exercise the relevant virtues — in which the ruler manifests benevolence and the subject loyalty, for example. For the Mohists, then, social order is partly constituted by the exercise of these virtues by persons in the relevant social roles. Accordingly, since these virtues are among the intrinsic goods of their ethical theory, the Mohists think it is intrinsically morally admirable and right to be a good brother, son, father, subject, or ruler.
If correct, this interpretation has interesting consequences. Despite their commitment to the principle of “inclusive care,” or moral concern for all, the Mohists evidently agree with the commonsense view that we have a greater ethical responsibility toward those with whom we have close personal relationships, and in practice we should care for them first. For in order to be a kind father or filial son, for example, we must give our children or parents preferential treatment over others. “Benefit to the world” includes good family relationships, and such relationships require special loving emotions toward and treatment for family members. Contrary to a common misperception, Mohist ethics does not advocate that we treat everyone alike, but only that we have similar moral concern for everyone. (We will explore this point further in the next subsection.)
Finally, the role of virtues in Mohist ethics suggests that a suitably revised version of their theory might be immune to an important criticism of modern moral theories such as utilitarianism. The criticism is that in focusing on abstract principles of justification, modern theories have tended to overlook the crucial role of motivation in the ethical life. Indeed, a theory that fails to adequately account for moral motivation may be self-defeating. For example, if my motive in giving a friend a birthday present is not friendship and affection, but a general desire to promote the greatest happiness of the greatest number, I may only succeed in disappointing and offending her, and thus actually reducing the amount of happiness in the world. To succeed in making others happy, we typically need to be motivated not by the greatest happiness principle, but by attitudes such as love, concern, or respect for them as individuals standing in particular relationships to us. To have such attitudes, of course, is just part of what it is to be benevolent, loyal, kind, filial, and brotherly. So by including these virtues among the goods that provide its fundamental ethical justifications, the Mohist theory may have the resources to avoid an untenable split between justification and motivation. It is possible that Mohist ethics may help to provide insights — whether positive or negative remains to be seen — into how to incorporate virtues into an adequate normative theory.
The ethical guideline for which the Mohists are most well known is jian ai, sometimes translated as “universal love” but probably better rendered as “inclusive care.” Jian (together, jointly) in this context has the connotation of including everyone in society together within a whole. Like the English ‘care’, ai (love, care) is ambiguous, since it may refer to a range of attitudes from strong affection to detached concern. In Mohist texts the word typically seems to refer to a dispassionate concern about the welfare of its object.
Inclusive care was generally not the doctrine that attracted criticism from the Mohists’ contemporaries. Ancient critics objected mostly to their frugal, austere lifestyle, opposition to music, and plain burial practices, which recognized no differences in social rank. Little was said about their core ethical doctrines. The exception was Mencius, who is reported to have equated inclusive care with renouncing one’s father (for this reason, he dismissed Mozi as a “beast”). Many later Confucian critics have followed Mencius in focusing on inclusive care, maintaining that it runs counter to human nature. The doctrine deserves careful attention, partly to evaluate this criticism and partly to draw philosophical lessons from how the Mohists apply the notion of impartiality that stands at the heart of their ethics.
In its complete form, the Mohist doctrine is that people are to follow the fa (standard, model) of “inclusively caring for each other, and in interaction benefiting each other.” As the full phrase suggests, the Mohists see the psychological attitude of care and the beneficial behavior that results from this attitude as two sides of a coin. They may hold that the presence of one is a sufficient condition for the other. Yet an important difference between the two is indicated by the adverbs in the two parts of the slogan. The attitude of care is all-inclusive, encompassing everyone. Beneficial behavior is not all-inclusive, but directed only at those with whom we actually interact. In practice, then, the slogan does not call for self-sacrificing altruism, but mainly for us to interact with others in a reciprocally beneficial way.
The Mohists offer two sorts of arguments to justify inclusive care. One, which we will treat shortly, is that inclusive care is Heaven’s intention. The other, applied in all three of the “Inclusive Care” texts, is by appeal to its good consequences. Social harm arises from excluding other people, families, cities, and states from the scope of moral concern. This exclusion leads to injury, crime, violence, and failure to practice the virtues associated with the fundamental social relations. By contrast, were we to practice inclusive care, we would eliminate these harms and promote “benefit to the world.” Or so argues the following passage, which interprets inclusive care as the attitude of being “for” — that is, concerned for the sake of — others’ interests just as we are “for” our own.
That being so, then what is the reason that inclusion can replace exclusion? He said, “Suppose people were for others’ states as for their state. Then who alone would deploy his state to attack others’ states? One would be for others as for oneself. Were people for others’ cities as for their city, then who alone would deploy his city to assault others’ cities? One would be for others as for oneself. Were people for others’ clans for their clan, then who alone would deploy his clan to disorder others’ clans? One would be for others as for oneself. That being so, then states and cities not attacking and assaulting each other, people and clans not disordering and injuring each other, is this harm to the world? Or is it benefit to the world? Then we must say, It is benefit to the world.”
“If we try to fundamentally investigate what these many benefits are produced from, what are they produced from? Are they produced from detesting others and injuring others? Then we must say, It’s not so. We must say, They are produced from caring about others and benefiting others. If we demarcate and name caring about others and benefiting others in the world, is it ‘exclusion’? Or is it ‘inclusion’? Then we must say it is ‘inclusion.’ That being so, then doesn’t this interacting by inclusion turn out to produce great benefit to the world?” Thus our Master Mozi said, “Inclusion is right (shi).” (Book 16, “Inclusive Care”)
The Mohists contrast inclusive concern with an attitude they call “exclusion” (bie, distinguishing or separating off as “other”). This attitude is not, as sometimes thought, one of distinguishing differences of degree in our concern for others, according to the closeness of their relation to us. Indeed, the Mohists never seriously consider that alternative. Rather, bie refers to “despising and hurting others,” excluding them from moral consideration altogether. So the Mohists’ case is for inclusive care as against complete disregard for others. We can grant that their arguments establish that bie, or excluding others from all concern, is morally wrong, and that inclusive care has good consequences and is thus benevolent and permissible. But if their aim is to show that inclusive care is obligatory, then the Mohists are posing a false dilemma. A different ethical guideline might promote “benefit to the world” equally or more effectively, without the stringent demand that everyone be as concerned for others’ interests as for their own. Alternatively, instead of criticizing the Mohists for trading on a false dilemma, we could say that their arguments justify inclusive care, but only in the weak sense that we are obliged to be morally concerned for everyone to at least some degree. The question then is, to what degree?
When we look to the texts for specifics of what inclusive care demands, the answer is not obvious. What we find is a disparity between statements describing the attitude of inclusive care and concrete examples of its practice. In theory, inclusive care is apparently equal concern for all. The passage quoted above, for example, describes it as being concerned “for others as though for oneself.” Another text tells us that “the fa (model) of inclusively caring for each other and in interaction benefiting each other” is “to regard others’ states as though regarding one’s state, regard others’ families as though regarding one’s family, and regard other persons as though regarding one’s person” (Book 15). Adopting this as a moral fa (model, standard) probably involves doing two things: striving toward the ideal of caring about others’ lives, families, and communities to exactly the same degree as we care about our own, and in the meantime, acting as if we in fact already cared about them equally.
If this interpretation is correct, the doctrine is probably untenable. Most human beings are naturally inclined to feel sympathy for others, including strangers, and thus to care to some degree about their welfare. But it would take a heroic feat of social engineering to get us all to care about strangers exactly as much as we care about ourselves and those close to us. And even with the proviso that we need benefit only those with whom we actually interact, the standard of equal care for others would seem to carry with it impossibly high practical demands.
Oddly, then, the consequences and examples of inclusive care described elsewhere in the texts suggest that the practical requirements of the doctrine are not especially burdensome. Indeed, the specific examples given largely conform to what many citizens of contemporary Western liberal democracies would consider commonsense moral decency. The actual practice of inclusive care seems to demand no more than the absence of harm or hostility to others; virtuous performance of our social roles as ruler, subject, father, son, or brother, thus contributing to the welfare of our family and community; helping friends and neighbors in need; and assisting the elderly, solitary, and orphaned, who have no family to care for them. Since lacking a family is identified as the main reason people are likely to need assistance, we can infer that the Mohists take the family to be the primary institution for meeting people’s needs, and that in practice inclusive care normally involves caring chiefly for our own family. The only individuals expected to work equally on behalf of everyone are government leaders, who are responsible for benefiting all of their subjects. So we find a gap between the description of inclusive care as the attitude of caring equally for everyone and the practical examples in the texts. The latter suggest that inclusive care does not require extensive self-sacrifice or altruism, but is mainly a matter of looking after our family, neighbors, and community and not interfering with others as they attempt to do the same.
The later Mohist texts provide an explanation of this disparity, though one might dispute whether we are justified in reading the later doctrine into the earlier essays. Fragments preserved in the Da Qu, Book 44 of the Mozi, maintain that we are to care equally for everyone, but to benefit some people more and others less, depending on the nature of their relation to us. Equal care does not entail equal treatment. How we treat people is determined by the notion of righteousness (yi), which is based on intrinsic goods such as social order (zhi), the Mohists’ conception of which, as we saw above, entails that we do more for those standing in close relationships to us. The later Mohist view is roughly that attributed to a Mohist named Yi Zhi in a dialogue in the Mencius (3A:5): “In care, no degrees; in practice, begin from what is close.”
As political and moral reformers, the Mohists were concerned not only to justify the doctrine of inclusive care, but to persuade everyone in society to adopt and practice it. This aim induces a number of practical problems concerning moral reform and motivation, some of which are raised in a series of objections discussed in the “Inclusive Care” texts. The main point of the Mohists’ response to these objections is that inclusive care is consistent with most people’s existing motives and values, so we already have the motivation needed to practice it.
The first and most obvious objection is that inclusive care is too difficult. In response, the Mohists claim that in fact it is far less difficult than other deeds rulers have led their people to perform in the past, such as sacrificing their lives, limiting their diets, and wearing rough clothing. Inclusive care seems difficult only because people don’t recognize that it is to their long-term benefit. If, as Mohist political theory proposes, institutions are set up to encourage cooperation and prevent abuse, then “within a generation” people can be led to practice it, because several existing lines of motivation will converge to support it. First, people naturally tend to emulate admired and respected leaders, so if rulers encourage inclusive care, people will tend to practice it. Second, rulers can institute rewards and punishments so that practicing inclusive care is in everyone’s short-term self-interest. Third, people naturally tend to reciprocate good treatment, so caring for and benefiting others is in our long-term self-interest. The Mohists’ case here is reasonably persuasive, provided we keep in mind that they are focusing on the practice of reciprocal benefit, not the psychological attitude of equal concern, and that the practical demands of inclusive care are not especially taxing.
The second objection is that inclusive care is practically impossible. The reply is that it is possible, because the sage-kings actually practiced it. The texts cite purportedly historical examples to show that the sage-kings ruled fairly and impartially, performed public works projects that benefited everyone, brought peace to society, and ensured that the needy were provided for. Again, these examples tend to suggest that the crux of, and perhaps a sufficient condition for, the practice of inclusive care is beneficial actions, not the psychological attitude of equal care for everyone.
A third challenge is that inclusive care cannot be “used,” referring most likely to implementing it as a policy people can follow. (Generating benefits when put into use as a social policy is the third of the three models the Mohists propose to evaluate statements or teachings.) The Mohists present a pair of hypothetical scenarios intended to show that people committed to caring for their own and their family’s welfare would prefer inclusive care as a policy to be followed by those around them, since we would all prefer to live under the rule of or entrust the care of our family to someone who practices it. That is, acting from an existing motive that nearly all people share—protecting one’s own and one’s family’s welfare—people select inclusive care as a dao to be followed by those around them, and therefore it indeed “can be used.” The Mohists criticize opponents who raise this objection for a practical contradiction: In their statements, they reject inclusive care, but in practice, they would select it as a social dao, just as the people in the hypothetical scenarios do. Interestingly, this criticism works only because the writers assume that the issue at hand is the choice of a dao (way), a universal, social system of norms of conduct. They seem to assume that all of our choices and actions issue from such norms. Thus they hold that in preferring inclusive care in others, we commit ourselves to it as a code to be observed by all, including ourselves. To them, the stance of a rational egoist who prefers that everyone else, but not he, practice the dao is incoherent.
The last objection considered is that inclusive care may fail to benefit one’s parents and thus interfere with filial piety. The Mohists’ response is that a filial son would desire that others care about and benefit his parents. An effective way to achieve this end, they contend, is by caring for and benefiting others’ parents, leading others to reciprocate in kind. (Here, as in their reply to the first objection, the Mohists make the plausible assumption that humans have a natural tendency toward reciprocity.) Psychologically, then, inclusive care is consistent with our existing motivation to care for our parents, while morally it is justified as an indirect means of benefiting them.
Because these arguments are directed at opponents who resist the more optimistic aspects of Mohist moral psychology, they appeal mainly to self-interest and the interest of one’s in-group, motives the writers assume are reliably shared by everyone. Other Mohist texts present a fuller picture of moral motivation. Its central premises are that people tend to be strongly committed to doing what they think is right, they tend to desire the basic goods that follow from the practice of inclusive care, they tend to follow political leadership and seek peer approval, and with the exception of miscreants responsible for social disorder, they tend to seek not only their own self-interest but the interest of their family and community. Hence most people already possess strong moral motivation and some degree of empathy for others. Moreover, because they desire to be good, or ren (benevolent), they are prepared to accept the force of the better normative reason (gu, also “cause,” “basis”) in discussion.
Benevolent people inform each other of the patterns by which they select or reject, deem right or deem wrong. Those who lack a reason follow those who have a reason. Those who don’t know something follow those who have knowledge. Lacking remarks to offer in their defense, they surely submit; seeing good, they surely reform. (Book 39, “Condemning Confucianism”)
What is needed to get most people to act morally, then, is mainly education and normative arguments, which will help them to correctly identify what is right. Such arguments will convince them to guide their actions by the fa (model) of “regarding others as though regarding oneself,” and this fa will in turn strengthen the habit of acting out of sympathy for others’ interests.
The Mohists justify their consequentialist ethics by appeal to the intention of Heaven (Tian), which they believe provides an objective criterion of morality. Among their reasons for obeying Heaven’s intention are gratitude for its gifts, fear of punishment, and their belief that it is the noblest, wisest moral agent in the cosmos. Here we will examine this third, philosophically more interesting rationale, setting aside for the moment Heaven’s role as an object of religious worship and enforcer of moral order.
The crux of the Mohists’ appeal to Heaven is that as the highest, wisest moral agent, Heaven conducts itself in a way (a dao) that unfailingly sets an example of correct ethical norms. Its intentions are consistently or reliably benevolent and righteous. To obtain an objective criterion of moral right and wrong, then, we can observe Heaven’s conduct and notice the norms it is committed to and enforces. Heaven’s intention can serve as a fundamental ethical fa (model, standard), one that is clear and easy for anyone to apply, just as a craftsman’s measuring tools are.
Thus our Master Mozi’s having Heaven’s intention, to give an analogy, is no different from the wheelwright’s having a compass or the carpenter’s having a set square.... Above, he uses it to measure how the kings, dukes, and great men of the world administer the penal codes and government; below, he uses it to gauge how the myriad people of the world engage in writings and studies and present statements and discussions. Observe their conduct; if it follows Heaven’s intention, call it good intentions and conduct; if it opposes Heaven’s intention, call it bad intentions and conduct. Observe their statements and discussions; if they follow Heaven’s intention, call them good statements and discussions; if they oppose Heaven’s intention, call them bad statements and discussions. Observe their penal codes and government; if they follow Heaven’s intention, call them good penal codes and government; if they oppose Heaven’s intention, call them bad penal codes and government. So he sets this up as a fa (model), establishes this as a standard, and uses it to measure the benevolence (ren) and unbenevolence of the kings, dukes, great men, secretaries, and ministers in the world, and, to give an analogy, it is like dividing black from white.
Thus our Master Mozi said, “Now the kings, dukes, great men, officers, and gentlemen of the world, if, within, they really desire to follow the dao (way), benefit the people, and fundamentally examine the root of benevolence (ren) and righteousness (yi), then it’s unacceptable not to follow Heaven’s intention. Following Heaven’s intention is the fa (model) of righteousness (yi).” (Book 27, “Heaven’s Intent”)
Though the Mohists themselves do not draw the distinction, we can identify two interrelated roles that Heaven’s intention plays. On the one hand, it serves as a criterion of what is morally righteous and thus a basis for ethical justification. In the passage above, for example, it is used to evaluate whether actions, statements, and practices are morally right. On the other hand, it also serves as a practical moral guideline. In practice, we can test particular actions or types of conduct against it to determine how to proceed. “Having taken Heaven as fa, we must measure our movements and conduct against Heaven. What Heaven desires, do it; what Heaven does not desire, stop” (Book 4, “Models and Standards”).
Why is Heaven’s intention a reliable ethical standard? The Mohists give a number of moral reasons. As we saw earlier, they argue that unlike any particular human role model or cultural or historical standard, Heaven is reliably ren (benevolent), because it is impartial, benevolent, and enduring. They further claim that if we examine “that from which righteousness (yi) issues,” we find that “righteousness issues from Heaven” (Book 27, “Heaven’s Intent”). They support this conclusion by running through a quick circle of extensional equivalences. Righteousness is good government, because a necessary and sufficient condition for social order is that righteousness obtain in the world. In good government, the noble and knowledgeable govern the ignorant and common. Moral righteousness thus “issues from” the noble and knowledgeable, in that it obtains only in circumstances in which they rule. Heaven is the noblest and most knowledgeable, so righteousness issues from it.
To follow the right dao, then, we can emulate Heaven and learn to conform to the norms it follows. Of course, we are not deities and so cannot imitate Heaven’s actions directly. But we can observe its actions, deduce its desires and intentions, and then conform to those. And what we find is that Heaven desires that people care for and benefit each other (Book 4). It desires that righteousness (yi) prevail, and thus desires life, wealth, and social order for people (Book 26). Indeed, it desires all of the goods posited by Mohist ethical theory, including peace and security, social harmony and cooperation, economic sufficiency, and the practice of the virtues associated with the key social roles (Book 27). We know Heaven desires these things because its actions show that it cares for and benefits everyone without discrimination. It is benevolent, providing all people with life, sustenance, and natural resources. It enforces morality by avenging crimes against the innocent. It rewarded the six ancient sage-kings, who cared for and benefited the people, and punished the four tyrants, who despised and hurt the people. It possesses all the people of the world as a ruler possesses his subjects, and thus it cares about everyone, just as a ruler cares about his subjects.
In short, Heaven itself desires the goods the Mohist ethical theory adopts as criteria of what is morally right. That theory is thus correct, the Mohists think, because it captures the ethical norms followed by Heaven, the wise, impartial, and benevolent agent at the apex of the cosmic political hierarchy, to whom all people should “identifying upward”.
This appeal to a conjunction religious beliefs about Heaven and the political doctrine of “identifying upward” has led some scholars to suggest that Mohist ethics might ultimately be a form of divine command theory. Drawing mainly on the claim that Heaven is “that from which righteousness issues,” for instance, Soles (1999) contends that for the Mohists, “What makes Heaven’s commands right is the mere fact that Heaven commands them” (p. 46). Without question, a few passages in the texts urge people to conform to moral norms specifically because doing so is Heaven’s intention, and the doctrine that obedience to Heaven brings reward and disobedience punishment is redolent of a divine command theory. Moreover, these religious beliefs are crucial to the Mohist worldview, and an inaccurate, distorted picture of their thought results if we neglect them.
Still, there are strong grounds for denying that the Mohists hold a divine command theory. First, the texts never analyze, define, or explain the notion of righteousness (yi) in terms of Heaven’s intention. To the contrary, all four of the texts about Heaven’s intention assign it an epistemic role, as a test or criterion by which to distinguish right from wrong. They argue that Heaven’s intention can be taken as a model (fa) or canon (jing) of righteousness (yi). This claim asserts an extensional equivalence, not an analysis, definition, or exposition. The point is that Heaven’s intention and ‘righteousness’ distinguish the same things, not that what is righteous is so because it is Heaven’s intention. Even the claim that righteousness “issues from” Heaven need not be read as implying anything stronger than that a righteous society can exist only when people all follow the model or example set by Heaven’s intentions and conduct.
Second, and more important, the Mohists give independent moral reasons to support their claim that Heaven’s intention is a reliable moral guide. Their grounds are not simply the religious belief that Heaven must be obeyed because it is a deity or because it punishes disobedience. Rather, they argue that Heaven is a guide to what is benevolent and righteous because it is a supremely noble, wise, impartial, benevolent, and reliable agent. Their reasons apply evaluative concepts of benevolence, righteousness, good government, and social order (zhi) that are independent of Heaven’s intention. To support their contention that Heaven desires what is righteous (yi), for example, they characterize righteousness as comprising life, wealth, and order and claim that Heaven desires these. Phrased in terms of the Euthyphro dilemma, their stance is fairly clear: What is righteous is not righteous because Heaven intends it. Rather, Heaven intends it because it is righteous. Heaven’s conduct and intentions exemplify moral norms that hold independently of its intent.
Given how the Mohists’ conception of Heaven fits into the framework of their ethics, the appeal to Heaven to justify and explicate their normative stance risks circularity. Their conception of Heaven is in effect that of a morally ideal sovereign, whom they characterize as wise or all-knowing, all-embracing, benevolent, generous, and impartial. The Mohists imply that the correct moral norms are those that such an agent would follow or intend that human beings follow. The problem is that the characteristics they build into this conception of an ideal agent are just those they already hold should be articulated by a satisfactory ethical theory, such as impartial, benevolent concern for the welfare of all. Arguably, then, the appeal to Heaven does not justify Mohist ethics so much as simply illustrate or articulate it.
A potential problem with the appeal to Heaven arises from the way the Mohists’ concept of a fa (model) runs together the notions of a criterion of righteousness, a practical guideline, and a role model. The idea of objectively justifying our practices and standards of conduct by appeal to the abstract, decontextualized stance of an ideally impartial and benevolent agent is at least prima facie plausible. But the Mohist theory risks confusing this with the much less plausible idea that in practice we should guide our conduct by emulating a benevolent deity who cares impartially for all. In effect, they conflate the idea of seeking an impartial justification for our actions, which are taken from within a particular, and thus necessarily partial, context, with that of adopting an impartial point of view, but one that, impossibly, is abstracted from any particular context. In some contexts, Mohist arguments are careful to avoid conflating these points, but in others they verge on identifying the attitudes of the benevolent person with those of Heaven itself.
The basic structure of the Mohist ethical theory is simple yet profound. At its base stands the notion of impartial concern for the benefit of all, as epitomized by the point of view of Heaven, an ideally benevolent, impartial agent who cares equally about everyone’s welfare. From this foundation, the Mohists develop a consequentialist account of the benevolent (ren) and the righteous (yi) in terms of a set of goods that constitute benefit or welfare. Community practices are justified by their instrumental value in promoting the welfare of all. The theory recognizes that individuals exist within a web of social relations, which partly define their identities and duties, and that strong social relationships are a crucial part of human welfare. It assigns virtues a role in guiding action and in constituting good social relations. The theory is loosely formulated, inelegantly expressed, and supported by arguments that to modern readers may in places seem rudimentary or simplistic. Still, coming at the beginning of the philosophical discourse of ancient China, it represents a quantum leap in theory construction and argumentation in comparison to earlier Confucian discourse. Moreover, the general type of consequentialist approach it lays out remains a well-regarded option in ethical theory today.
The strong point of the Mohist theory is that it grounds moral righteousness (yi) on two key notions, impartiality and human welfare. Yet the major defects of Mohist ethical thought lie precisely in how these ideas are handled. The locus of impartiality is misplaced, and the conception of human welfare is too narrow.
The problem with the Mohists’ treatment of impartiality is that they locate it in the attitude of moral concern, instead of in the justification for our actions or practices. Their approach to finding objective, impartial ethical norms is to advocate that each individual be impartially motivated by equal concern for all. We are to conform to the standard of “regarding others as though regarding oneself” or to model ourselves on the God’s-eye stance of Heaven. But in practice we cannot possibly act for all others as though acting for ourselves, and unlike Heaven, we are rarely in a position to act on behalf of everyone. So the Mohists fail to articulate a conception of impartiality that is viable in practice. Impartial, equal concern cannot defensibly be advocated as the ideal ethical motivation of individual agents.
One plausible response to this problem would be to develop a form of rule or practice consequentialism. The Mohists could apply their basic standard of righteousness — what “promotes benefit to and eliminates harm from the world” — as a criterion by which to justify a social dao (way), or set of practices and norms, that best promotes everyone’s welfare. These impartially justified practices and norms could then guide action in particular situations. In practice, of course, the Mohists adopt roughly just this approach. They advocate equal care for all, but allow that how we actually treat others will vary depending on our relation to them. According to the later Mohist texts, where this doctrine of equal care but different treatment is presented explicitly, our treatment of others will be guided by standards of yi (righteousness), which probably articulate practices the Mohists think best promote the welfare of everyone in society.
The hitch is that such a practice-consequentialist approach is unlikely to support the Mohist doctrine of equal care for all. Presumably, in line with the compelling points in the Mohists’ arguments, the norms and practices justified by this approach would lead individuals to adopt the attitude of inclusive care, and so to include everyone within the scope of their moral concern. But the consequentialist standard of promoting everyone’s welfare probably would not demand that each of us realize the attitude of equal care, or equal and impartial concern for everyone. Rather, both treatment and care would probably be allowed to vary with relationship and context, provided that a basic minimum standard of concern — perhaps only non-interference, basic courtesy, and help in emergencies — were met for strangers to whom we have no special relation.
To this, the Mohists might respond that we should still practice equal care, because it is the way of the sage-kings and the intention of Heaven, the highest moral exemplar, and its practice produces great benefit for the world. The Mohists recognize no distinction between obligation and supererogation, and perhaps their religious beliefs convince them that the best life is one that most fully complies with Heaven’s desire that we care for and benefit others. Also, as the Zhuangzi passage quoted earlier attests, many Mohists particularly revered and emulated Yu, the most self-sacrificing and altruistic of the sage-kings.
But it is probably false that the general practice of equal care would yield the most benefit for the world. Setting aside emergencies and the special duties of highly demanding jobs such as sage-king, it is likely that the Mohists’ own basic goods are best promoted not only by treating those closest to us differently from others, but by caring about them more, too. The idea of disconnecting care from treatment is counterintuitive. In particular, it seems unlikely that we could genuinely exercise the virtues associated with the key social relations without also caring more about the people to whom we are related. It is hard to envision someone really being a loyal minister or kind father without also caring more about his ruler or children than a stranger’s. Moreover, tremendous practical problems would be involved in training everyone to care equally for all, requiring a vast expenditure of effort and wealth on ends that could be achieved just as well by the practice of inclusive, but unequal care.
The second major defect of Mohist ethical thought is its excessively narrow, material conception of human welfare or benefit (lì), which comprises little more than material well-being and peaceful, harmonious social relations. With a handful of exceptions, Mohist ethics dismisses aesthetic value and overlooks the psychophysical fulfillment achieved through the exercise of acquired skills—goods that are central to the Confucian and Daoist ways of life. Little attention is devoted to individual happiness or fulfillment or to articulating a conception of well-rounded human excellence. Moreover, the Mohist conception of morality can at times seem aggressively one-sided and burdensome. One passage in the Mozi presents a conception of ideal human flourishing as a life of complete devotion to moral duty:
When silent, ponder; when speaking, instruct; when acting, work. Make these three alternate and surely you will be a sage. You must eliminate happiness and eliminate anger, eliminate joy and eliminate sorrow, eliminate fondness and eliminate dislike, and use benevolence and righteousness. Your hands, feet, mouth, nose, and ears undertaking righteousness, surely you will be a sage. (Book 47, “Valuing Righteousness”)
Their thin conception of human welfare may be one reason some Mohists saw a life of altruistic self-sacrifice as the way of the sages. If satisfying basic material needs is sufficient to secure our welfare, then once those needs are met, we have little worthwhile to do but help others.
To be fair, however, the Mohists’ minimalist conception of welfare may have been a reasonable response to the difficult social and economic circumstances in which they lived, particularly as representatives of sub-elite social classes. Their texts imply an environment in which hardship due to poverty, poor harvests, cold, hunger, or war is never far off. So naturally they focus on the basic goods needed for physical and economic security: a stable government, material wealth, strong family bonds, and charity to neighbors in need. Mohism is in effect a refugee ethic, born from hard times, that values material welfare and parsimony above all else. Their doctrine of “Moderation in Use” advocates eliminating all luxuries—particularly those of the aristocracy—and reducing consumption of food, clothing, and housing to the minimum level needed for basic comfort. If conditions are really as harsh as the Mohists imply — a premise that Xunzi, a friend of the aristocracy, will deny — then their narrow focus is defensible, and in arguing that elaborate musical shows and burial practices are wasteful and immoral, for instance, they are on firm ground. The problem is that the Mohists never reflect on the possibility that in more prosperous and egalitarian conditions, music and other cultural activities could be valuable contributions to human well-being.
If Mohist ethics faces a problem of moral motivation, it is probably because their impoverished conception of human welfare excludes too much that people genuinely value. When the Zhuangzi criticizes the Mohists for “going against the heart of all under heaven,” it is not referring to inclusive care, but to their severe, frugal lifestyle. As Xunzi said, “Mozi was blinkered by utility and did not recognize adornment” (Xunzi, Book 21, “Dispelling Blindness”).
The Mohists’ religious beliefs play a central part in their thought, providing a foundation for their view that an objective moral code obtains in the cosmos and thus perhaps much of the motivation for their way of life. Though brief, their descriptions of their beliefs and practices provide a rare direct glimpse into the religion of one portion of the sub-elite populace of ancient China.
Like much traditional Chinese religious thought, Mohist beliefs are in effect an extension of the social and political system to incorporate relations with a personified conception of nature and various sentient, intelligent entities with whom humans share the natural world. The Zhou dynasty nature deity Tian (Heaven, nature, the sky) is the counterpart (and superior) in this extended system of the human sovereign. Other elements include the Shang dynasty high god di and a variety of ghosts and spirits, from those of deceased human ancestors to those of natural, geographical features such as mountains and rivers. The various beings that constitute this personified natural setting enforce morality by rewarding the worthy and punishing the wicked. Humans view them as objects of respect, gratitude, and fear, sacrificing animals and offering millet and wine to feed and placate them and to seek their blessings.
At the pinnacle of the cosmic sociopolitical hierarchy stands Tian. Tian created humans, set the sun, moon, and stars on their regular paths through the sky, fashioned the landscape, and established the four seasons and weather so that crops could grow. It provides people with the sustenance and natural resources by which they live. It established government to watch over people and administer rewards and punishments. All people are its subjects and owe it veneration and gratitude for its many gifts. It reigns virtuously over the human emperor — the “Son of Tian” — as a kind of cosmic sovereign and all-seeing, all-powerful policeman. As the highest, noblest, and wisest moral agent, it embodies correct moral norms and thus serves as a role model by which to judge the morality of practices and actions.
It is often convenient to translate Tian as “Heaven,” a word that similarly refers to both the sky and a deity. Yet Tian is dissimilar from the Judeo-Christian conception of God or Heaven in several ways. Tian does not exist outside of time, space, or nature, nor is it considered perfect or unchanging. It is not the creator of nature, but rather is nature, or part thereof. (Combined with ‘di’ (earth), the word ‘tian’ forms the compound ‘tian-di’ (sky-and-earth), which refers to the natural world.) Tian is personified as a sociopolitical authority, but it is considerably less anthropomorphic than the Judeo-Christian God. It has desires and intentions, and it speaks, but only as if thinking to itself, not directly to humans. Tian generally does not inform humans of its desires or intentions by revelation (though in crises it may dispatch a spirit envoy, such as a fantastic talking bird). Rather, we must discern them for ourselves by observing its behavior. Humans sacrifice to Tian, but usually do not pray to it or address it directly. However, we do have an implicit agreement with Tian that if we conform to its desires, it will reward us in turn. Specifically, care for and benefit to others will be rewarded, contempt and injury punished.
The Mohists have no concept of religious salvation or of another realm to which we go after death. (Tian is of course not a transcendent place or realm but an embodiment of nature.) When people die, they become ghosts, which exist within the natural world. Unlike in Christianity, people are not rewarded or punished in the next world for their deeds in this one. Rather, the Mohists insist that Tian and the ghosts will reward and punish people while they are alive. As one might expect, this belief was strongly challenged by the Mohists’ opponents, who pointed out instances in which it is at odds with everyday experience. Unfortunately, the Mohist responses to these criticisms in the end amount mainly to ad hoc excuses.
Despite the genuine tone of reverence in the Mohists’ descriptions of Tian, some readers find Mohist religion to lack the sense of holiness, religious awe, and spiritual transcendence that contemporary Westerners customarily associate with religion, particularly in contrast with Confucian appreciation of the beauty of ritual or Daoist wonder at the mysteries of nature. The mundane tone of their religious thought is perhaps partly due to the Mohists’ general disregard of aesthetic and cultural value. Yet it would be indefensibly parochial to expect them to conform to a modern Westerner’s conception of religiosity, since the comparatively mundane character of Mohist religion is typical of much traditional Chinese folk religion. In fact, the Mohists are deeply dedicated to maintaining harmonious, reverential relations with Tian, ancestral ghosts, and nature spirits, and both their rhetoric and practices devote much energy to religious veneration.
The Mohists can be credited with a number of significant philosophical achievements, including China’s first ethical and political theories and history’s earliest form of consequentialism. They strive for but do not quite achieve a viable account of an impartial, objectively justified moral code. Both their insights and their errors are of great philosophical interest. Their ethical theory has important defects, but one of its major strengths is that these could probably be remedied without abandoning the basic structure of the theory.
Mohism never achieved a position of dominance or orthodoxy, but at its peak in the 4th and 3rd centuries BCE, no school was more influential. This status is attested by no less an authority than Mencius, who lamented that “the statements of Mo Di and Yang Zhu [another rival thinker] fill the world,” and by the attention Xunzi devotes to refuting Mohist economic doctrines. Though their importance is routinely slighted in Confucian-biased accounts of Chinese thought, the Mohists articulated much of the theoretical framework of early Chinese epistemology, logic, political theory, and ethics. Their ideas were a crucial stimulus for Mencius, Xunzi, the Daoists, and the so-called “legalist” political thinkers, all of whom either borrowed Mohist ideas or developed their own views partly in reaction to them. One sign of the Mohists’ status is that their shared critics typically paired them with the Confucians (Ru) as a bloc, referring to the two as Ru-Mo, the two “moralizing” schools devoted to ren (benevolence) and yi (righteousness). Confucianism owes an unacknowledged debt to Mohism for its notion of comprehensive moral concern, as reflected, for instance, in Mencius’s doctrine of extending our natural concern for kin so that it reaches everyone. The phrase “inclusive care” begins to appear in Confucian texts toward the end of the Warring States era — a late passage in the Xunzi refers to “comprehensive benefit and inclusive care” (Book 25) — and by the Han dynasty, we find the Confucian Gongsun Hong explaining the virtue of ren (benevolence) in explicitly Mohist terms, as “extending benefit and eliminating harm, inclusively caring without partiality” (Han Shu, Vol. 58).
With few exceptions, Chinese thought after the Han turned away from the Mohists’ epistemological, semantic, and logical interests to focus on moral metaphysics and moral psychology, thus passing over what might have been their chief legacy. Hence Mohism is sometimes depicted as a splinter movement not genuinely representative of the Chinese philosophical tradition. This view is false and anachronistic, however. Much of what is plausible or intriguing in Mohist thought directly reflects concepts, assumptions, and problems that were elements of mainstream Warring States intellectual discourse.
Following the unification of China under the Qin dynasty (221–207 BCE), the Mohist movement declined, eventually vanishing altogether by the middle of the Western Han (206 BCE–24 CE). After Confucianism won imperial favor in 136 BCE, Confucius gradually came to be venerated as China’s greatest sage. Mozi and his school fell into neglect and obscurity, their texts largely unread. Centuries later, the bulk of the Mozi was nearly lost to history, surviving only because it had been copied into a massive collection of Daoist scripture. Interest in Mohism revived only late in the Qing dynasty (1644–1911 CE), when scholars, stimulated partly by contact with the West, went looking for untapped intellectual resources in their own tradition, particularly materials related to science and logic.
A number of factors can be cited to explain Mohism’s decline and disappearance. Graham is probably right, for instance, to suggest that after the Qin unification, the Mohists lost the political influence they had exerted as expert craftsmen and defense specialists who helped smaller states survive during the Warring States era (1989, p. 34). But the major factor is probably that as a social and philosophical movement, Mohism gradually collapsed into irrelevance. By the middle of the former Han dynasty, the more appealing aspects of Mohist thought were all shared with rival schools. Their core ethical doctrines had largely been absorbed into Confucianism, though in a modified and unsystematic form. Key features of their political philosophy were probably shared with most other political thinkers, and their trademark opposition to warfare had been rendered effectively redundant by unification. The philosophy of language, epistemology, metaphysics, and science of the later Mohist Canons were recorded in difficult, dense texts that would have been nearly unintelligible to most readers (and that in any case quickly became corrupt). What remained as distinctively Mohist was a package of harsh, unappealing economic and cultural views, such as their obsession with parsimony and their rejection of music and ritual. Compared with the classical learning and rituals of the Confucians, the speculative metaphysics of Yin-Yang thinkers, and the romantic nature mysticism and literary sophistication of the Daoists, Mohism offered little to attract adherents, especially politically powerful ones.
The Mohists helped to articulate much of the framework of classical Chinese philosophical discourse while advocating a way of life so at odds with most people’s conception of the good life that it stood little chance of ever inspiring a wide following. The school had always shown undue enthusiasm for radical, simplistic positions. Unwilling or unable to modify their doctrines or to develop new positions in response to their changing social and intellectual setting, the Mohists probably died out in the imperial era because their Warring States reformist social and political platform had become obsolete.
Works cited in the article:
- Brooks, A. Taeko, 1996a, MZ 14–16: Universal Love, Warring States Working Group Note 92rev, Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts.
- –––, 1996b, MZ 17–19, Warring States Working Group Note 93, Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts.
- –––, 1996c, Evolution of the Mician Ethical Triplets, Warring States Working Group Note 94rev, Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts.
- Durrant, Stephen W., 1977–78, “A Consideration of Differences in the Grammar of the Mo Tzu ‘Essays’ and ‘Dialogues’,” Monumenta Serica, 33: 248–267.
- Fraser, Chris, 2010a, “Is Mozi 17 a Fragment of Mozi 26?,” Warring States Papers, I: 122–125.
- –––, 2010b, “Doctrinal Developments in in MZ 14–16,” Warring States Papers I: 132–136.
- –––, 2010c, “Thematic Relationships in the Mozi Political Essays,” Warring States Papers, I: 137–142.
- –––, 2020a, “Truth in Pre-Han Thought,” in Dao Companion to Chinese Philosophy of Logic, Yiu-ming Fung (ed.), Dordrecht: Springer, 113–127.
- Garrett, Mary, 1993, “Classical Chinese Conceptions of Argumentation and Persuasion,” Argumentation and Advocacy, 29(3): 105–15.
- Geaney, Jane, 1999, “A Critique of A. C. Graham’s Reconstruction of the ‘Neo-Mohist Canons,’” Journal of the American Oriental Society, 119(1): 1–11.
- Graham, A. C., 1978, Later Mohist Logic, Ethics and Science, Hong Kong: Chinese University Press.
- –––, 1985, Divisions in Early Mohism Reflected in the Core Chapters of Mo-tzu, Singapore: National University of Singapore, Institute of East Asian Philosophies.
- –––, 1989, Disputers of the Tao, LaSalle: Open Court.
- Hansen, Chad, 1985, “Chinese Language, Chinese Philosophy, and ‘Truth,’” Journal of Asian Studies, 44(3): 491–519.
- –––, 1992, A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Harbsmeier, Christoph, 1993, “Conceptions of Knowledge in Ancient China,” in H. Lenk and G. Paul, eds., Epistemological Issues in Classical Chinese Philosophy, Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 11–33.
- –––, 1998, Science and Civilisation in China, Vol. 7, Part 1: Language and Logic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Lau, D. C., 1963, Lao Tzu: Tao Te Ching, London: Penguin.
- Maeder, Erik W., 1992, “Some Observations on the Composition of the ‘Core Chapters’ of the Mozi,” Early China, 17: 27–82.
- Munro, Donald, 1969, The Concept of Man in Early China, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
- Soles, David, 1999, “Mo Tzu and the Foundations of Morality,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 26(1): 37–48.
- Watanabe, Takashi, 1973, Kodai Chugoku shiso no kenkyu, Tokyo: Sobunsha.
- Yates, Robin D. S., 1980, “The Mohists on Warfare: Technology, Technique, and Justification,” Journal of the American Academy of Religion, 47(3) (Thematic Issue S): 549–603.
Translations of the Mozi:
- Fraser, Chris, 2020, The Essential Mozi, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Ivanhoe, Philip J., and Bryan W. Van Norden, eds., 2000, Readings in Classical Chinese Philosophy, Seven Bridges Press. (Partial translation.)
- Johnston, Ian, tr., 2010, The Mozi: A Complete Translation, New York: Columbia University Press. (Complete translation.)
- Knoblock, John, and Jeffrey Riegel (trans.), 2013, Mozi: A Study and Translation of the Ethical and Political Writings, Berkeley: Institute of East Asian Studies, University of California. (Partial translation.)
- Mei, Yi-pao, tr., 1929, The Ethical and Political Works of Motse, London: Probsthain. (Partial translation.)
- Watson, Burton, tr., 1963, Mo Tzu: Basic Writings, New York: Columbia University Press. (Partial translation.)
General surveys of classical Chinese thought:
- Fung Yu-lan, 1952, A History of Chinese Philosophy, Vol. I, Derk Bodde(trans.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Graham, A.C., 1989, Disputers of the Tao, La Salle: Open Court.
- Hansen, Chad, 1992, A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Lai, Karyn, 2005, An Introduction to Chinese Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Nivison, David, 1999, “The Classical Philosophical Writings,” in The Cambridge History of Ancient China, E. Shaughnessy and M. Loewe (eds.), New York: Cambridge University Press, 745–812.
- Schwartz, Benjamin, 1985, The World of Thought in Ancient China, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press.
Other selected works in English relevant to Mohism:
- Ahern, Dennis, 1976, “Is Mo Tzu a Utilitarian?” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 3(2): 185–93.
- Back, Youngsun, 2017, “Reconstructing Mozi’s Jian’ai,” Philosophy East and West, 67(4): 1092–1117.
- –––, 2019, “Rethinking Mozi’s Jian’ai: The Rule to Care,” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy, 18(4): 531–553.
- Chiu, Wai Wai, 2013, “Jian ai and the Mohist attack of Early Confucianism,” Philosophy Compass, 8(5): 425–437.
- –––, 2014, “Assessment of Li 利 in the Mencius and the Mozi,” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy, 13(2): 199–221.
- Defoort, Carine, 2005, “The Growing Scope of ‘jian’: Differences Between Chapters 14, 15 and 16 of the Mozi,” Oriens Extremus, 45: 119–140.
- Defoort, Carine, and Nicolas Standaert (eds.), 2013, The Mozi as an Evolving Text: Different Voices in Early Chinese Thought, Leiden: Brill.
- Ding, Weixiang, 2008, “Mengzi’s Inheritance, Criticism, and Overcoming of Mohist Thought,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 38(3): 403–19.
- Duda, Kristopher, 2001, “Reconsidering Mo Tzu on the Foundations of Morality,” Asian Philosophy, 11(1): 23–31.
- Flanagan, Owen, 2008, “Moral Contagion and Logical Persuasion in the Mozi,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 38(3): 473–91.
- Fraser, Chris, 2008, “Moism and Self-Interest,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 38(3): 437–54.
- –––, 2011, “Mohism and Motivation,” in C. Fraser, D. Robins, and T. O’Leary, eds., Ethics in Early China, Hong Kong: HKU Press, 83–103.
- –––, 2013, “The Ethics of the Mohist ‘Dialogues’,” in The Mozi as an Evolving Text: Different Voices in Early Chinese Thought, Carine Defoort and Nicolas Standaert (eds.), Leiden: Brill, 175–204.
- –––, 2015, “The Mohist Conception of Reality,” in Chinese Metaphysics and its Problems, Chenyang Li and Franklin Perkins (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 69–84.
- –––, 2016a, “The Mozi and Just War Theory in Pre-Han Thought,” Journal of Chinese Military History, 5(2): 135–175.
- –––, 2016b, The Philosophy of the Mozi, New York: Columbia University Press.
- Hansen, Chad, 1989, “Mozi: Language Utilitarianism: The Structure of Ethics in Classical China,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 16: 355–80.
- Harris, Eirik, 2020, “Mohist Naturalism,” Philosophical Forum, 51(1): 17–31.
- Hu Shih, 1922, The Development of the Logical Method in Ancient China, Shanghai: Commercial Press.
- Johnson, Daniel, 2011, “Mozi’s Moral Theory: Breaking the Hermeneutical Stalemate,” Philosophy East and West, 61(2): 347–364.
- Lowe, Scott, 1992, Mo Tzu’s Religious Blueprint for a Chinese Utopia, Lewiston: Edwin Mellen.
- Loy, Hui Chieh, 2013, “On the Argument for Jian’Ai,” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy, 12(4): 487–504.
- –––, 2008, “Justification and Debate: Thoughts on Moist Moral Epistemology,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 38(3): 455–71.
- –––, 2006, “The Moral Philosophy of the Mozi ‘Core Chapters’,” Ph.D. Dissertation, University of California, Berkeley.
- Loy, Hui Chieh, and Benjamin Wong, 2004, “War and Ghosts in Mozi’s Political Philosophy,” Philosophy East and West, 54(3): 343–364.
- Lum, Alice, 1977, “Social Utilitarianism in the Philosophy of Mo Tzu,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 4(2): 187–207.
- Mei, Y. P., 1934, Mo-tse, the Neglected Rival of Confucius, London: Probsthain.
- Perkins, Franklin, 2008, “The Moist Criticism of the Confucian Use of Fate,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 38(3): 421–36.
- –––, 2014a, Heaven and Earth are Not Humane, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
- –––, 2014b, “The Mozi and the Daodejing,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 41(1–2): 18–32.
- Robins, Dan, 2008, “The Moists and the Gentlemen of the World,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 38(3): 385–402.
- –––, 2012, “Mohist Care,” Philosophy East and West, 62(1): 60–91.
- Shun, Kwong-loi, 1996, Mencius and Early Chinese Thought, Stanford: Stanford University Press.
- Taylor, Rodney, 1979, “Religion and utilitarianism: Mo Tzu on spirits and funerals,” Philosophy East and West, 29(3): 337–346.
- Van Norden, Bryan, 2007, Virtue Ethics and Consequentialism in Early Chinese Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Vorenkamp, Dirck, 1992, “Another Look at Utilitarianism in Mo-Tzu’s Thought,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 19(4): 423–443.
- Wong, David, 1989, “Universalism vs. Love with Distinctions: An Ancient Debate Revived,” Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 16 (3/4): 251–72.
- Wu, Yun and Amin Ebrahimi Afrouzi, 2020, “The Mohist Notion of Gongyi,” Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy, 19(2): 269–287.
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