The Mohist Canons are a set of brief statements on a variety of philosophical and other topics by anonymous members of the Mohist school, an influential philosophical, social, and religious movement of China’s Warring States period (479–221 B.C.). Written and compiled most likely between the late 4th and mid 3rd century B.C., the Canons are often referred to as the “later Mohist” or “Neo-Mohist” canons, since they seem chronologically later than the Mohist “triads,” the two dozen essays that constitute the bulk of the Mohist writings, which probably date from the mid-5th to the late 4th century. The Canons present philosophical ideas distinct from the older texts, though clearly closely related to or evolved from them. The later Mohists are also associated with the “School of Names,” a general label for ancient Chinese thinkers who were interested in language and argumentation. Early sources link the Mohists with the School of Names through a shared interest in disputation over the “hard and white” and the “same and different” (Zhuangzi, Book 33).
The Canons, their accompanying Explanations, and other later Mohist writings are among the most important texts in the history of Chinese ethics, philosophy of language, epistemology, logic, and science. They present elements of a sophisticated semantic theory, epistemology, consequentialist ethics, and theory of analogical argumentation, along with intriguing discussions of causality, space and time, and mereological ontology. Also recorded are inquiries in such diverse fields as geometry, mechanics, optics, and economics. The writers put forward terse, rigorous arguments that develop and defend Mohist ideas and rebut opponents’ views. The texts yield a rich taste of an approach to language, mind, and knowledge distinct from those dominant in the Western philosophical tradition. At the same time, by shedding light on technical notions employed in other ancient writings, they confirm that a grasp of early theories of language, knowledge, and argumentation is essential to a full understanding of classical Chinese thought. Indeed, the later Mohists decisively refute the once widespread view that ancient Chinese thinkers were concerned exclusively with ethics, moral psychology, and nature mysticism and uninterested in language, epistemology, and logic.
Given the breadth and richness of later Mohist thought, this article can present only a narrow sample. We will focus on a handful of core ideas and issues in ethics, philosophy of language, epistemology, ontology, and disputation. (For a rough guide to the pronunciation of some of the Chinese terms used in this article, see the supplementary document Pronunciation Guide.)
- 1. Background and Overview
- 2. The Texts
- 3. Ethics
- 4. Philosophy of Language
- 5. Epistemology
- 6. “Same” and “Different”
- 7. Argumentation and Logic
- 8. Concluding Remarks
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Background and Overview
The early Mohists hoped to develop objective moral standards by which to unify society and achieve social order. Part of their solution was to develop a theory of fǎ 法 (models, standards) that explained how to judge distinctions (biàn 辯) between shì 是 (this, right) and fēi 非 (not-this, wrong). The core idea was to identify clear, objective fǎ (models) to serve as paradigms for pattern recognition or analogical extension. Things relevantly similar to, or “matching” (zhòng 中), the fǎ would be shì (right, this); anything not relevantly similar would be fēi (wrong, not-this). The theory of fǎ applied not only to ethics but to other areas of thought as well. In epistemology, for instance, it could be applied to explain what it is to know something: it is knowing how to correctly distinguish what does or does not match the fǎ for that sort of thing. To determine whether some claim ‘A is B’ should be accepted, we compare A to the fǎ for B to see whether they are similar. To determine whether some doctrine is right, we can compare it to the “three models”—the deeds of the sage-kings, perceptual experience, and practical benefit. In logic, the theory yields a model of analogical argumentation. For the Mohists, an assertion is the application of a term to something. To support an assertion, we cite a fǎ for the term we are asserting and then show that the thing we are asserting it of is relevantly similar to the fǎ. In philosophy of language—though early Mohist texts do not explicitly take this step—the theory could be applied to explain why words denote the things they do. The extensions of terms are determined by social practices in which we associate fǎ with terms and distinguish what things do or do not match the fǎ. Everything that does is thereby properly referred to by the term in question.
Accounts can be given at several levels to explain the correctness of shì/fēi 是非 judgments. Most immediately, shì/fēi distinctions seem to rest on social norms for distinguishing various kinds of things. This view is suggested by how the Mohists describe the process by which we learn to judge shì and fēi: through conformity to the model set by social superiors. According to the theory of the “three models,” these norms for drawing distinctions rest in turn on three fundamental standards: the precedent set by wise leaders of the past, perceptual experience, and benefit to society. To some extent, then, the norms have a real basis in perceptual experience and in whatever strategies actually work, in practice, to promote “benefit,” which the early Mohists understood as wealth, population, and social order. The Mohists also seem to have thought they could ground at least some of these norms—specifically, ethical norms—in the patterns of action exemplified by tiān 天 (Heaven, nature) itself. The third of the “three models” is also grounded in the norms that tiān follows, specifically the norm of promoting benefit to all. So shì/fēi distinctions based on benefit are also, at least in an indirect sense, underwritten by tiān.
The later Mohist texts present a more detailed and sophisticated version of the same basic approach, grounded in the core notions of fǎ 法 (models), zhòng 中 (matching), shì/fēi (this/not-this) 是非, and biàn 辯 (distinguishing). They continue the search for objective standards of shì/fēi by which to guide action and judgment, and they explore numerous philosophical issues arising along the way. For instance, every shì/fēi distinction divides the world into what is and is not a certain thing or kind of thing. But why divide things up one way rather than another? What is it about particular things that makes them fall on one side of a distinction rather than the other? In practice, how do we make the similarity judgment needed to determine which side a particular thing belongs on? Shì/fēi distinctions are associated with “names” (míng 名) and thus with language. How do these distinctions underpin language and explain communication? What is their relation to knowledge?
One important difference from earlier Mohism is that the later texts seem to abandon the idea of grounding ethics or social norms in “Heaven’s intention” (tiān zhì 天志), or at least they say nothing about it. This move would might seem to push Mohist ethics toward a form of pragmatic consequentialism: the proper standards for shì/fēi distinctions would be whatever tends to promote human welfare. Extending this idea to language and epistemology, we might expect the Mohists to adopt some form of pragmatism or conventionalism, on which similarity distinctions between things are determined at least partly by human interests, practices, or conventions, presumably as they interact with human-independent features of the world. (One might argue that the earlier Mohists already held such a position concerning shì/fēi distinctions other than the fundamental ethical shì/fēi identified by Heaven’s intentions.) Yet, as Hansen suggests (1992, 242–243), in a few passages, their position seems to lean toward a brand of realism, here understood as the view that the world in itself, independently of human activity, fixes the similarities by which things are divided into kinds. It is unclear just how strong these realist tendencies are, however. The texts may be compatible with a view that allows some latitude in the kind distinctions we recognize, provided they rest on at least some objective basis for distinguishing similarities and differences.
2. The Texts
Our knowledge of later Mohist thought comes from six texts, which form Books 40 through 45 of the Mozi: two books of terse “canons” (jīng 經), generally just a sentence or two in length; two of slightly longer “explanations” (jīng shuō 經說), keyed to the canons, which provide explanations of or arguments for the statements in them; the “Greater Selection” (Dà Qǔ 大取), a collection of fragments on ethics, semantics, and logic, apparently including the remnants of two or more essays; and the “Lesser Selection” (Xiǎo Qǔ 小取), which appears to be either a coherent essay or a pair of essays. (The origin of the titles “Greater Selection” and “Lesser Selection” is unknown. Possibly these were two selections, one longer and one shorter, from the remnants of damaged bamboo scrolls.) The six books as a whole are conventionally known as the Mò Biàn 墨辯, or “Mohist Dialectics.” The Canons begin with 87 explications of or equivalence formulae for important philosophical, scientific, and mathematical terms. Some of these are in effect nominal definitions; others present substantive views. After a short, textually corrupt section, these are followed by 86 theses on a variety of subjects.
The content of the texts is roughly coherent but not tightly so. The concepts and theories presented generally fit together well, with variations in terminology. But the organization of the texts is unsystematic. There is no statement of their overall purpose, no clear organizational scheme, nor any headings indicating the themes of different parts. The canons do tend to fall into thematic groups, such as series on knowledge, the virtues, geometry, or argumentation, but the sequence of topics displays no clear pattern. Concepts are introduced only to never be mentioned again, and central terms sometimes go unexplained. Like early Chinese mathematicians, the Mohists had no conception of an axiomatic system, and the canons do not clearly identify anything corresponding to axioms, definitions, or theorems. Nor are they arranged as if to explore a specified set of themes or prove some distinct set of conclusions. As a result, interpretation of later Mohist doctrines can be testing. They must be reconstructed from terse, incomplete statements scattered about different parts of the corpus, and on some issues there is insufficient textual evidence to reach any firm conclusions.
For a brief overview of the fascinating history of the texts and the philological problems associated with them, see the following supplementary document:
The ethical theory of the Dialectics is probably a form of indirect consequentialism. Such a theory would be a natural continuation of earlier Mohist ethics, and it would explain why the texts link morality (yì 義) to benefit (lì 利) while also specifying norms of conduct that do not directly aim at benefit. This interpretation is necessarily partly conjectural, however. The Dialectics sketch a normative theory without presenting a fundamental justification for it, thus leaving some uncertainty as to the nature of the theory’s foundation. The fragmentary, unsystematic nature of the texts does not allow us to rule out the possibility that the later Mohists held a mixed theory, incorporating both consequentialist and deontological elements. Moreover, we should emphasize that the “Greater Selection,” in which much of the material on ethics is collected, has suffered severe textual damage, hindering our efforts to understand details of the theory and rendering much of the following summary tentative.
As in early Mohist thought, the core of the later Mohist ethical theory is a cluster of four interrelated concepts: “Morality” (yì 義, also “duty” or “right”), “benefit” (lì 利, perhaps also “welfare”), “benevolence” (rén 仁, also “kindness” or “humaneness”), and “care” (ài 愛). These notions are explicated more precisely than in the earlier texts, and they are fleshed out in ways that seem intended to rectify weaknesses in earlier Mohist ethics.
The texts remain committed to the Mohist doctrine of “inclusive care” (jiān ài 兼愛), or impartial moral concern for everyone, though they give no arguments to justify either it or the underlying consequentialist theory. Instead, they treat inclusive care as justified and address technical objections, such as whether the notion of all-inclusive caring is logically problematic. For an example of such a technical objection and the Mohists’ reply, see this supplement:
Compared with early Mohist ethics, the Dialectics specify more precisely what is meant by “inclusive” care, indicating that we are to have an equal degree of care for all, using the same phrase that in Mohist geometry refers to two equal lengths: “Inclusive care is equal; care for each one is equal” (EC13). At the same time, the texts clarify that the practice of inclusive care does not entail having equal obligations toward all or treating everyone alike. The degree to which we are to seek to promote others’ welfare depends on our relationship to them.
Besides these clarifications, later Mohist ethics introduces four major innovations. First, the texts no longer appeal to tiān 天 (Heaven) as a criterion and justification of ethical norms. Second, they explicate benefit (lì 利) and harm (hài 害) in terms of the happiness or dislike that results from obtaining something, instead of the goods of wealth, population, and order. Third, they introduce an explicit code under which individuals’ obligations to each other vary with their relationship. Fourth, they consider how benefit and harm are to be weighed in order to guide action in particular contexts. The following subsections will discuss these four points.
Unlike early Mohist texts, the Dialectics nowhere appeals to Heaven as a justification or epistemic criterion for moral judgment. However, it is unclear whether or not the later Mohists actually abandoned the doctrine of “Heaven’s intention” (tiān zhì 天志). One possibility is that they set aside the doctrine after noticing the epistemic problems involved in contending that Heaven supports one set of ethical norms rather than another. One isolated passage seems to recognize that the moral appeal to Heaven’s intention as a standard of morality is effectively empty, as it could be twisted by a criminal to claim that since Heaven (tiān 天, also “nature”) has given him a criminal disposition, it is right for him to engage in selfish behavior (EC1). However, the passage in question is so obscure and corrupt that it cannot be interpreted with confidence. Another possibility is that the writers merely omitted the doctrine of “Heaven’s intention” without actually rejecting it, since their texts treat only the content of the ethical theory, not its foundations. Another, similarly late book of the Mozi, “Models and Standards” (Book 4), continues to appeal to Heaven as an ethical model, though that text may be the work of a different branch of Mohists.
3.2 Benefit and Happiness
As in early Mohism, “benefit” (lì 利) is the fundamental standard of what is moral or right (yì 義), which underlies moral duties and virtues: “Morality is benefit” (A8, B76). Benevolence (rén 仁, also kindness) is “caring about individuals” (A7). “Care” (ài 愛) is left unexplained, though the texts indicate that the morally good care constitutive of benevolence (rén) involves caring about others for their own sake, and not as a means to an end (A7), and that a characteristic feature of care is desiring benefit for and disliking harm to a person (EC7).
Earlier Mohist texts give no simple, unified definition of benefit (lì 利), instead characterizing it loosely as an objective list of material and social goods, specifically wealth, population, and social order, this last good comprising a list of virtues and patterns of conduct. By contrast, the Canons take happiness or delight (xǐ 喜) as a criterion of benefit (lì) and thus of what is morally right (yì): “Benefit is what we get and are happy” (A26). Accordingly, “dislike” is a criterion of harm and thus of what is wrong: “Harm is what we get and dislike” (A27). This characterization of benefit and harm in terms of psychological attitudes is a remarkable shift from earlier Mohism. The new account can probably explain the older one, insofar as the Mohists might claim that wealth, population, and social order are basic needs whose satisfaction makes all people happy. But the new account opens up conceptual room to revise and expand Mohist ethics. Since what makes people happy is likely to vary in different circumstances, the content of the social dào 道 may change over time, and wealth, population, and social order may not be the only goods that it aims to promote.
The Mohist appeal to happiness and dislike is interestingly different from that of classical utilitarianism in the West. Utilitarians such as Bentham and Mill held a hedonistic theory of value, on which happiness is the fundamental good. Moral value for them lies in maximizing happiness. For the Mohists, by contrast, happiness is not a fundamental good, but a criterion by which to identify the goods that constitute benefit. Their theory thus sidesteps a well-known criticism of hedonistic theories of value, namely that happiness is an unconvincing explanation of or basis for moral value, since it generally is not a fundamental good but a byproduct of our achieving other goods.
On the other hand, the Mohists seem to assume without discussion that what is genuinely to our benefit will make us happy and that what makes us happy will be beneficial and morally right. Both of these points are open to question. A critic might object, for instance, that there may be goods that produce benefit without delighting us or things that produce delight without genuinely benefiting us (heroin use being a standard example). In the Mohists’ defense, one might argue that all goods at least produce some general feeling of satisfaction, if not delight, and that things that do not genuinely benefit us produce at best only a transient, unstable, or otherwise deficient form of satisfaction or delight. Under critical scrutiny, then, the Mohists’ explanation of benefit seems promising—there may well be a connection, perhaps even a necessary one, between benefit and some form of psychological satisfactoriness—but it probably needs to be revised or developed further.
Whose benefit counts in determining what morality (yì 義) is, and what are the scope of our moral duties? The Mohists hold that everyone’s benefit counts equally in determining what conduct or practices are right or wrong. As individuals, though, we may not each have a duty to treat everyone equally. In our basic motivations or intentions (zhì 志), we are to take “all under Heaven”—the world of living things—as our “portion” (fèn 份), or scope of responsibility, whose benefit we are committed to promoting (A8). But provided we are committed to the benefit of all and capable of acting on our commitment when the chance arises, we need not actually benefit everyone. Individuals’ moral worth is determined not by how much they actually benefit the world, which may be beyond their control (they may die young, for instance (EC3)), but by their intentions and abilities, which are largely within their control. (The Mohists may recognize an exception to this rule in the case of moral heroes, such as the ancient sage king Yu, whose moral worth surpasses other people’s.) Unless we hold high political office or are responding to an emergency, most of us will not have the chance to benefit the whole world directly and need not try to do so.
Instead, the extent to which we should seek to benefit others will normally depend on our relationship to them. The Mohists propose that our conduct toward others be guided by a code of responsibilities associated with various relationships, which they plausibly would have regarded as justified by its efficacy in promoting the welfare of all. This code is an articulation of the earlier Mohists’ commitment to the virtues associated with the paradigm social relations of ruler, subject, father, son, and brother. It may also have been a response to the criticism that impartial care for all undermines special personal relationships, which most of us agree are of great value. The Mohists often expressed their doctrine of all-inclusive care as “caring about others’ as one cares about one’s own,” a formulation open to the uncharitable construal that, for instance, one should treat everyone else’s father as having a status identical to one’s own. As the Mohists’ critics were quick to point out, the result would be that we fail to treat our father as our father, rather than simply as one male elder among others. On these grounds, Mencius, one of the Mohists’ Confucian opponents, claimed that the Mohist doctrine was tantamount to denying one’s father. The Mohists themselves clearly did not consider this a consequence of their position, which they repeatedly indicated was compatible with filial devotion (xiào 孝). But to settle the issue, an explicit account was needed of the role of special personal relationships in their ethics.
3.3 Relation Ranking
Perhaps partly to answer such critics, the later Mohists developed a doctrine they called “relation ranking” (lún liè 倫列). This is a code according to which we are to care for everyone while benefiting some people more and others less, in proportion to their relation to us. Our different obligations to people are determined by general standards of morality (yì)—most likely, by conforming to the social dào (conventional practices) that best promotes the benefit of all. “Doing more for those whom morality (yì 義) permits doing more for and less for those whom morality permits doing less for is called ‘relation ranking.’…If the kinship is close, do more; if the kinship is distant, do less” (EC9). Those for whom we are to do more include the sovereign, government officers, elders, and relatives (EC9). Inclusive care thus does not entail equal treatment of or obligations to others. In practice, the later Mohist view would probably coincide roughly with the view attributed to a Mohist named Yi Zhi in a dialogue in the Mencius (3A5): “In care, no degrees; in practice, begin from one’s parents.”
Another fragment indicates that we ourselves are among those for whom we are to do more: “Caring about [other] people does not exclude oneself; oneself is among those one cares about…. Caring about oneself according to relation ranking is ‘caring about people’” (EC10). So the Mohists were not committed to selfless altruism. As long as we do not exceed the degree stipulated by morality (yì), doing more for ourselves and our circle than for outsiders does not count as selfishness, but as conformity with the moral norm of all-inclusive care for all. On the other hand, benefiting some people more and others less without conforming to “relation ranking” is acting “for the sake of oneself” (EC10) rather than on behalf of all, as morality requires.
The texts provide enough detail about “relation ranking” for us to speculate that later Mohist ethics is consequentialist at the foundational level. Given the statements that morality (yì) is benefit (lì) (A8), that in our commitments, we are to take all the world as our “portion,” or object of responsibility (A8), and that care for all is to be equal (EC13), the most explanatorily powerful hypothesis for the empirical content of those texts is that the theory is foundationally consequentialist. “Relation ranking” was thus probably justified as a code of conduct on the grounds that its practice best promoted the welfare of all, making later Mohist ethics a form of indirect social-practice consequentialism. The Mohist position would have been that in practice the welfare of all is best secured by having everyone follow conventional relationship-roles where the whole social system leads to more universal well-being that an alternate set of social practices. So doing more for closer relations and less for distant would still be moral where everyone followed that convention, e.g. the elderly would generally have been more effectively cared for by their children, who loved them and better understood their needs, than by strangers. So equal concern for the welfare of all would have justified a code in which individuals provided primarily for their own elderly parents, not others’. This social dào could have been expected to meet the needs of most elderly, so it would have been unnecessary for everyone to provide equal benefits for other people’s parents. Outside of the family, generally only orphans and the childless elderly would have required help. The Mohists probably expected the burden of caring for them to be split across society, with the relatively well-off contributing from their surplus resources.
“Relation ranking” would thus have generated a system of practices and duties based on social relations that was largely congruent with the role-based duties recognized by the Ru (“erudites,” or Confucians), the Mohists’ main opponents. The major difference would have been in how the two schools grounded their views. Confucian ethics starts with a conception of the conduct appropriate to persons standing in various types of relationships and works outward, proposing an ideal by which persons extend concern for their in-group to embrace outsiders. Mohist ethics starts from the conviction that the only objectively or impartially justified fǎ (model or standard) of conduct is to promote the welfare of all. It then works downward, proposing a code of practices associated with particular social relations that, if generally followed, would best promote everyone’s welfare. The general fǎ (model) of promoting the welfare of all and the practices it grounds function as reasons for action analogous to moral principles. In the structure of the Mohist theory, however, they are conceptualized not as universal principles, applied by deductive reasoning, but as models or exemplars, applied by pattern recognition and analogical reasoning, against which we compare social practices or individual conduct to determine what is shì (right) and fēi (wrong).
On this interpretation, then, the later Mohist ethical theory is a plausible form of indirect consequentialism, though its formal structure is distinct from familiar forms of rule consequentialism in focusing on models and social practices rather than rules or principles. However, one of the problems with early Mohist ethics arises again in the later, more sophisticated theory. According to “relation ranking,” we are to do more to benefit those closest to us. But, consistent with earlier statements of the doctrine of inclusive care, the later Mohists also hold that we should care equally for all of humanity. Our treatment of others is to vary with their relation to us, but our degree of care for them is not. For example, though we are to devote more resources to ourselves than to distant strangers, there is to be no difference in the strength of our care (ai) for ourselves and for them (EC10). We are to be as concerned for others’ parents as for our own (EC12). Inclusive care is equal for all, and care about each person should be equal (EC13); the degree of “care about others” that we direct toward one individual is to be the same as that we direct toward any other (EC2). Indeed, were the whole world to be harmed by the death of one individual, we would expend vastly more effort looking after that person, but our degree of moral care would not increase (EC4). On the other hand, concern for an individual cannot be abandoned, even if the world were to benefit (EC2).
A critic might charge that this doctrine commits the Mohists to a counterintuitive split between the level of treatment we provide to others and the degree to which we care about their welfare. A more natural approach, the critic might argue, would be to allow the degree of care to vary with the closeness of the relationship, with the proviso that even distant strangers be the object of at least a minimal degree of care. This approach might allow individuals to perform the social roles of government official, subject, parent, child, and so forth more effectively, thus promoting the welfare of all. One might also question whether the costs of training everyone to maintain an equal degree of care for everyone else would not be too high, and whether it would even be psychologically feasible for us to devote more time, attention, and assistance to those closest to us without also caring more about them. In the Mohists’ defense, however, we might argue that by “care” (ài 愛) they seem to be referring primarily to a social attitude of moral regard or consideration, not one of individual, affective concern or attachment. For they see equal care as compatible with filial devotion (xiào 孝) and parental compassion (cí 慈), virtues normally associated with special affective concern for one’s parents or children, and they tie the absence of care to utter disregard for others (Mozi, Books 14–16). If in fact “care” here corresponds to moral consideration, then the Mohists may be on firm ground in advocating equal care for all. On the other hand, if “care” does refer primarily to an affective attitude, the doctrine of “relation ranking” could easily be modified to allow different degrees of care on the same consequentialist grounds that justify different degrees of benefit: doing so would better promote the welfare of all. Alternatively, the Mohists could recast the doctrine of equal care as a doctrine about moral justification: Institutions and practices are to be justified on the grounds that they reflect equal concern for the welfare of all. Educating people to think of justification in this way would probably be feasible; indeed, it might correspond largely to what we think of as commonsense moral education.
Though the Mohists advocate concern for all, it is unclear to what extent they endorse respect for the life or dignity of individuals. On the one hand, care about an individual cannot be abandoned, even if the world were to benefit (EC2). But one fragment in the Dialectics states, “Caring about them equally, select and execute one person among them,” and “if the benefit to the world is equal, then there’s no choosing between them. If the benefit of death and life are as one, then there’s no choosing between them” (EC6). Given their lack of context, any interpretation of these remarks must be tentative. But they might be taken to suggest that the only fundamental consideration in Mohist ethics is the greater benefit of all the world, not respect for individuals’ dignity or the intrinsic value of their lives. These remarks might seem to permit sacrificing an individual to increase overall welfare, or even just as long as there is no net decrease in welfare. However, the same fragment continues, “Killing a person to save the world, it’s not that we kill a person to benefit the world; killing oneself to save the world, it’s that one kills oneself to benefit the world.” This seems to indicate that even in the extreme case in which we can save the world by sacrificing another’s life, we do so not merely on the grounds of the net benefit to the world, since adopting such grounds might suggest that we could routinely sacrifice individuals for the benefit of society in less extreme cases as well. Rather, we do so because of the massive discrepancy between the harm we inflict and that we prevent—the loss of a single life versus loss of the whole world. If the life to be given up is our own, on the other hand, the fragment seems to imply that we should make the sacrifice on the grounds of benefiting the world, though only if the consequences are suitably weighty.
3.4 Practical Reasoning
The fourth area of novelty in the ethics of the Dialectics concerns an aspect of practical reasoning that the Mohists call “weighing” (quán 權). “Weighing” typically involves judging which of several alternative ends or courses of action is of greater benefit and lesser harm, and thus should determine how we act. The discussion of “weighing” is a response to two sorts of issues. One is how to handle conflicts between competing ends or values. The other is how to choose the best means of dealing with situations in which no course of action open to us is prima facie beneficial or right. Early Mohist texts contain no discussion of how benefit is to be aggregated or maximized—how the different elements of benefit are to be weighed against each other and combined so as to best promote the benefit of all. The later Mohist discussion of weighing can be seen as addressing this issue on the basis of the principle of favoring the greater part of a whole and thus choosing the greater of two benefits or the lesser of two harms.
The Mohists identify two forms of “weighing.” The first appears to be weighing of ends or things for which we act (the phrase in the text is “things treated as units”) (EC8). This sort of judgment is what the text calls weighing proper (quán). The second appears to be weighing of means (the phrase reads “affairs and action”). The text deems this process “seeking” (qiú 求), a term used elsewhere to explicate deliberation (see the section on epistemology below). It seems to refer to deliberation or planning about the course of action that would best achieve some end.
In principle, most action requires practical judgment, since general ethical standards alone are usually insufficient to guide action in concrete situations. But the cases that draw the Mohists’ (and other ancient Chinese writers’) attention are those in which different values or ethical standards conflict, pulling the agent in different directions, along with those in which one is forced to act when none of the available alternatives would normally justify or motivate action. The Mohists were particularly concerned to explain how their fundamental standard of benefit (lì) could guide action even when by normal standards none of the choices available are beneficial.
According to the Mohists, the ends for which we act may be distinguished as shì (right) or fēi (wrong) in two ways, either “directly” or by “weighing” (EC8). In a particular instance, for example, we might directly judge that something we normally take to be fēi is indeed fēi, or we might weigh the features of the situation and conclude that in this special case something normally fēi is actually shì. Similarly, desires and aversions may form in two ways. We may desire or dislike something directly or after weighing the benefits and harms of the available alternatives (A84). An example of the latter sort of desire is a desire for the lesser of two harms, which one might form after “weighing benefit.” The Mohists consider the case of a traveler captured by robbers who force him to choose between sacrificing his finger, his arm, or his life (EC8). Clearly, the traveler will sacrifice his finger, not his arm or his life. In absolute terms, he is choosing something harmful. But as the Mohists see it, selecting the lesser among harms counts as selecting benefit, not harm. They point out that the agent’s choices are not fully within his control. Forced to choose among harms, he selects the least harmful option. When compelled to give up something we possess, we choose the least harmful alternative. When free to select something we do not yet possess, we choose the most beneficial alternative. Either way, we still count as selecting benefit, not harm (EC8).
The decision-making procedure depicted in the discussion of “weighing” is tantamount to act consequentialism. However, as we have seen, later Mohist ethics overall seems to be a version of indirect consequentialism, in which actions are guided and justified by practices that are in turn justified by appeal to their beneficial consequences. The basic standard for “weighing”—“among benefits, select the greatest; among harms, select the smallest” (EC8)—appears to be a rule for resolving conflicts between standards or goods or for guiding action in exigent cases not covered by familiar moral norms.
4. Philosophy of Language
The later Mohists develop a sophisticated naturalistic semantic theory that explains reference, and thus communication, by appeal to speakers’ shared capacity to learn to distinguish different kinds of things on the basis of their characteristic features. As in the Analects, the other parts of the Mozi, and the Xunzi, theoretical attention focuses on the issue of applying names or terms to things correctly, and not on the structure or truth of sentences. (The “Lesser Selection” moves on to consider “expressions” (cí 辭) formed of strings of words, but these are treated along the same lines as terms.) Unlike traditional Western theories of language, such as Lockean conceptualism, the Mohists do not explain the relation between language and the world by appeal to mental ideas or meanings that words stand for. Instead, speakers are understood to communicate by mastering practices for distinguishing (biàn 辯) the referents of names for various kinds of things. By virtue of these practices, members of the same language community know that each general term stands for all similar things of a certain kind (lèi 類).
4.1 Names and Stuff
The Mohists regard all words as various types of “names” (míng 名). They draw no distinction between different parts of speech, probably because classical Chinese words have no obvious morphological features to indicate their different grammatical functions. They do identify three types of names, according to the scope of their denotation (A78): “all-reaching” names, such as ‘thing’ (wù 物), “reach to” or denote anything. “Kind” (lèi 類) names, such as ‘horse’, consistently “proceed to” (xíng 行, go on to be consistently predicable of) all things relevantly similar to each other. “Personal” or “private” names, such as the proper noun ‘Jack’, “stop” in one thing only, the individual that bears the name. Kind names are in effect general terms. They are established by dubbing things of a certain kind by that name. Having named something “horse,” for example, we are committed to applying the same name to all similar things (A78). (As we will see in section 6, the Mohists also seem to recognize how some general terms might refer to things grouped together on grounds other than being members of the same kind.)
Names are used to talk about various shí 實 (stuff, things, objects, reality). ‘Shí’ can be interpreted as roughly “stuff” or “solid” and has the connotation of “real” and “full.” Shí has a semantic range similar to, but broader than, the English ‘thing’, ‘object’, or ‘stuff’. It may refer to physical objects, conduct, events, or situations. It is also used to refer to “the facts,” the reality or genuine character of something, and the actual conduct or ability that matches or warrants a reputation. According to ancient Chinese beliefs about nature, everything in the cosmos consists of a dynamic, flowing elemental stuff called qì 氣 (breath or vapor). When used to refer to objects, shí in effect refers to regions where qì has condensed and thickened to fill out space and form a solid. The use to refer to “reality” or “the facts” seems to be an extension of this use; in both cases, shí refers to what is really, solidly there.
As an object or what is real or factual, shí contrasts not with “subject” or “subjective,” but with xū 虛 (empty, hollow, insubstantial, indeterminate) or with míng 名 (name), the linguistic label for the thing referred to. Nor is shí “substance,” as contrasted with a set of properties that are in, possessed by, or realized by it. What we think of as the properties of a shí are all just inherent parts of it. Instead of positing an essence or a set of essential properities instantiated by all things of a kind, the Mohists take it as a brute fact that shí may be similar or different in various respects, and they seek criteria by which to divide them into kinds based on these similarities and differences. As we will discuss when we consider the notions of “same” and “different,” features they cite as such criteria include “shape and look” (xíng mào 形貌), “residence and migration” (jū yùn 居運), and “amount and number” (liàng shù 量數) (NO2). Whether a particular thing falls within a certain kind, and thus takes a certain name, such as ‘horse’, is determined by comparing it with a fǎ 法 (model, exemplar) of that kind to see whether they are similar (A70). A particular horse counts a horse because its “look” or “characteristics” (mào 貌) are “like the model” (A71). As we will see, in some places, the writers of the Canons seem to assume that such similarity relations are fixed by nature, though they do not give an explicit defense of this stance.
The Mohists identify three kinds of “calling” (wèi 謂) (A79), or the speech act of uttering names. The first, “designating,” refers to “linking” (lì 灑/儷) two or more names together, as when we say “dogs are hounds.” The text leaves it unclear whether it is referring to predication in general, noun predication, or merely introducing a new name for something, since other passages indicate that ‘dog’ and ‘hound’ were considered coextensive. Probably the writers do not distinguish clearly between these different cases, and it is likely they are referring generally to all instances of noun predication, if not also verbal predication. A second kind of “calling,” “applying” or “attaching” (jiā 加), is illustrated by scolding a dog. Other passages in the Mozi suggest that “applying” refers to using a term of approval or disapproval of someone in order to praise or reproach the person. One possibility, though speculative, is that “applying” might refer to adjectival predication. The third type of speech act is “presenting” (jǔ 舉, also “bringing up” or “raising”), which is using a name to talk about something. For instance, uttering the word ‘dog’ or ‘hound’ is “presenting” dogs or hounds.
4.2 “Presenting” and Communication
Speaking or “stating” (yán 言) in general consists of a series of “presentings” (A32). “Presenting” something is explained as a form of “emulating” or “presenting a model for” it (A31). The Mohist view seems to be that names function as models of their referents, in effect “showing” others what the speaker is talking about (B53). Using a name of something is “describing” or “characterizing” (mào 貌) it, just as if we drew a picture of it (A32). (This idea might be motivated by the pictographic roots of Chinese writing.) If we “present” our friend as an example of a rich merchant, then we are using our friend’s name to show what a rich merchant is (B53).
“Presenting” (jǔ 舉) is related to but distinct from the contemporary concept of reference or denotation. Words can refer to or denote objects, but names cannot “present” shí (objects, reality). Rather, speakers use names to “present” shí 實. English concepts similar to jǔ 舉 include “raise” and “bring up,” as in sentences such as “Mary raised a question” nd “Mary brought up a possible candidate for the job.” In contexts where we might speak of a word or a speaker referring to an object, early Chinese texts typically use the expressions zhǐ 指 (point, indicate) or wèi 謂 (call) instead of jǔ 舉 (present, bring up).
The Mohists’ theory that using names to talk about things is a matter of modeling them can be seen as one version of the commonsense idea that words represent or signify things. But the Mohist notion of “emulating” (nǐ 擬) goes beyond this basic idea. It is part of a broader theory that names of kinds—general terms—enable us to communicate by appeal to shared practices for distinguishing similar from different kinds of things. On the Mohist view, words can represent things because they show us what the thing the speaker “presents” is “the same as” (tóng 同). They show us this because we have previously learned to distinguish the similar kind (lèi 類) of thing denoted by that name. Given this background learning, language tells us what something is “like” (ruò 若) and thus enables us to know (zhī 知) the thing (B70). When someone uses a word to present something, we know that thing is “the same” as other things denoted by that word. Hence using words is a process of “using what people understand to rectify what they don’t know” (B70). The Mohists compare this to using a measuring tool. We can use a ruler to measure length because we know the length of the marks on the ruler and we see that the thing measured is the same length as one of the marks. Analogously, through language, we can use what listeners are familiar with to inform them about what they don’t know. By using a name of something, we indicate that the thing is relevantly similar to the other things conventionally referred to by that name. When we say something is “white,” we are indicating that it is the same color as the other things we call “white.” By grasping the reference of each other’s words in this way, we are able to “connect thoughts” (tōng yì 通意) (B41) and thus to communicate.
As this conception of communication as “connecting thoughts” suggests, the Mohists see language as enabling speakers to express their yì 意 (thought, intention, point) (A92), a view shared by other early Chinese theories of language, including those of the Xunzi and The Annals of Lu Buwei. However, the role of “thought” or “intention” (yì 意) in these ancient Chinese theories is distinct from that of ideas, meanings, or intensions in certain familiar Western views. In Western folk theory—what we might call the Idea Theory or a “dog-legged” theory of language—a word’s meaning is the mental idea it stands for, which in turn represents some object in the world. The content of the idea explains why the word is used as it is, such as why it refers to certain things and not others. A well-known difficulty with this view is that it merely moves the explanandum back a step, since the content and function of ideas, a set of inner, private symbols, is just as much in need of explication as the content and function of language, a set of outer, public ones. The Mohist theory makes no detour through ideas or other mental entities to explain semantic content. Instead, the reference of words is explained by similarity relations and by practices for distinguishing the kind of thing designated by each word. The thought (yì 意) expressed by language does not explain why words are used as they are. Rather, the way words are used explains how it is that they can express thoughts. “Expressing thoughts” (shū yì 抒意) (NO11) or “connecting thoughts” (tōng yì 通意) (B41) is communication, the aim or result of using language, not an explanation of why terms refer to the things they do. One canon (B41) depicts a scenario in which we come to understand the thought (yì 意) of a speaker who uses an unfamiliar word by asking to what the word refers. The point is that if we can determine reference, we can communicate. There is no need to consider meanings or “ideas” corresponding to words, and indeed intensional concepts play no role in the Mohist theory.
Accordingly, yì 意 (thought) is typically associated not with words (míng 名, names), as one would expect if Chinese thinkers held an Idea Theory of meaning, but with “statements” (yán 言) and “expressions” (cí 辭). (An “expression,” in ancient Chinese philosophy of language, is any string of two or more words used to communicate a thought.) Understanding the yì (thought) expressed by an assertion or command is in effect “getting the point.” For this reason, in some contexts yì (thought) plays a conceptual role resembling that of “speaker’s meaning.” However, other passages suggest that it is not a semantic notion at all, but more akin to “what one is thinking” or one’s intentions. One canon tells us that “trustworthiness is statements agreeing with yì (thought)” (A14), a remark that is difficult to understand if yì is interpreted as a semantic concept. For if yì (thought) were speaker’s meaning, then what speakers say could not fail to agree with their yì, and if it were literal meaning, then failing to conform to it would show only that the speakers use words incorrectly, not that they are untrustworthy. People are trustworthy when what they say genuinely reflects what they have in mind, particularly what they intend to do. The best interpretation of yì in contexts concerning language, then, seems to be as a general notion of “thought” or a more specific notion of “intention,” and not as semantic meaning.
To sum up, the Dialectics presents a theory of language on which reference is explained by speakers’ associating “names” with kinds of similar objects, events, or situations (shí 實). Communication is explained by language users’ familiarity with the kinds of similar things referred to by “names.” The relation between language and the world is not explained by appeal to meanings, ideas, or concepts in the mind, nor abstract essences of things, but by practices for distinguishing different kinds of similar objects. This naturalistic theory seems highly plausible, as far as it goes. But it raises several crucial questions: How should things be divided into kinds? What makes things belong to one kind or another? What justifies recognizing certain kinds rather than others? As we will see, a weakness in later Mohist thought is that they leave these questions partly unanswered. Their texts make it clear that they recognize the issues. Yet they lack an explicit, principled explanation of what similarities and differences should count in distinguishing kinds of things and why.
These questions pertain not only to the Mohists’ philosophy of language, but to their epistemology. So before addressing them, we will survey later Mohist epistemology and its relation to semantic theory.
As in early Mohist thought, the focus of later Mohist epistemology is not on the justification or truth of beliefs, or propositional attitudes, but on knowing how to distinguish which things or situations are shì 是 (this) for some term and which are fēi 非 (not-this). As in the earlier texts, the core expression of knowledge is knowing how to apply terms to things correctly. However, the Dialectics identifies new aspects of knowledge to explain cases such as when someone is able to make a correct assertion about something but not to identify it perceptually or when someone can recognize a thing under one name but not another.
The core of later Mohist epistemology is presented in two places, a group of canons describing basic cognitive functions (A3–6) and another canon listing sources and types of knowledge (A80). It is not entirely clear how, or whether, the doctrines presented in the two places fit together as a system. (The texts make no attempt to link the two, and Canon A80 treats aspects of knowledge that do not mesh directly with the account in A3–A6.) But they do give a reasonably informative picture of the later Mohists’ approach to knowledge.
5.1 Awareness, Knowing, and Understanding
Humans who are alive and awake have a capacity or resource (cái 材) called “the knowing” (zhī 知) (A3, A22), roughly akin to the capacity or disposition to have conscious states and perform cognitive functions. (“The knowing” is thus comparable in different respects to our notions of consciousness and of “the understanding.”) “The knowing” is inactive in dreamless sleep (A23), and it is what has desires and aversions (A25). It is the capacity by which we are aware and have knowledge of things, and, provided we are awake, it cannot fail to be aware of something. The text compares it to eyesight: sighted people who open their eyes always see something, in the sense of having some visual experience, even if what they see is only pitch black darkness or their perception is mistaken. The functions the Mohists ascribe to “the knowing” overlap with those other early texts ascribe to the heart-mind (xīn 心), a concept that plays no role in later Mohist thought.
One function of “the knowing” is deliberation or forethought (lv̀ 慮), which is described as a process of mentally “seeking” something. This may involve visualizing various courses of action and identifying their benefits and harms, which can then be “weighed” (quán 權) to reach a decision on how to act. An interesting difference from prominent views in the Western tradition is that deliberation is understood as seeking various features by which to draw a distinction between shì 是 and fēi 非 or benefit and harm. It is not conceived of as, for instance, running through the steps of a practical syllogism in one’s head. Rather, extending the vision analogy, the texts suggest that whereas “the knowing” is comparable to eyesight, deliberation is analogous to peering this way or that while trying to spot something.
Another function of “the knowing” is to know or recognize (zhī 知) things, which is explained as “contacting” them (A5). Here the analogy is to the eyesight veridically seeing something. The text explains this sense of knowledge as “to know is, by means of ‘the knowing’, passing by something and being able to describe it.” Interestingly, knowing is here characterized as the practical ability (néng 能) to “describe” (mào 貌) something encountered, probably by applying a term to it. It is not regarded as an inner mental state that represents the world accurately, nor as an attitude toward a sentence or proposition. Technically, the ability to correctly apply a term to something (such as by saying, “This is a dog” or by pointing at a dog and declaring, “Dog!”) can be understood as an expression of propositional knowledge. But the text explains such knowledge in terms of an ability or know-how.
This passage seems to characterize knowing (zhī 知) quite narrowly, as the ability to recognize something encountered in perceptual experience. Elsewhere the Canons and Explanations use the word ‘know’ (zhī 知) with a broader scope, so that it includes cases other than perceptual knowledge, or at least other than knowledge of things the knower has personally experienced. One passage explains that though the senses are the source of perceptual knowledge, once we know something, we need not rely on the senses in order to continue to know it (B46). Our knowledge of something—that is, our ability to describe it—can remain even after we no longer perceive it. We can also come to know something by having it reported or explained to us without having perceived it ourselves (A80, B9).
A third function or capacity of “the knowing” is discursive knowledge, here equated with understanding (A6). This form of knowledge is explained as “by means of ‘the knowing,’ sorting things [into kinds] in such a way that one’s knowing [correctly recognizing] them is obvious.” Whereas knowing in the sense of recognition is analogous to seeing something, knowledge or understanding in the sense explained here is analogous to being clear-sighted. The two are closely interrelated, though the text does not make the details of the relationship entirely explicit. One reasonable interpretation is that zhī, or “to know,” as described in Canon A5 is primarily a verb that refers to recognizing or knowing of some particular thing or another, while knowledge or understanding as characterized in A6 is a noun referring to the underlying, systematic ability to recognize and sort (lùn 論) or classify various things. Knowledge (in the sense of A6) may be the underlying skill or ability that enables one to know or recognize things (in the sense of A5) in various contexts. Knowing (A5) would then be an application of knowledge (A6). At the same time, however, knowing (A5) is in effect a component of knowledge (A6), since the text says that the latter lies in being able to sort things in a way that shows one knows them, presumably in the sense of A5. Another passage tells us that knowing—again, presumably in the sense of A5—is the means by which one sorts things (B34), which is the sign of knowledge in the sense of A6.
Knowledge or understanding (A6) seems to be the Mohist analogue to what we might call discursive or theoretical knowledge, systematic knowledge of various things and relations between them. But there are interesting differences between the Mohist conception of such knowledge and conceptions prevalent in the Western tradition. The Mohists regard the structure of such knowledge as a system of classifications—of relations and distinctions among various kinds (lèi 類)—and not, for example, as a deductive system. They do not see knowledge as having a sentential or propositional structure. Knowing is not a matter of the subject’s standing in a certain relation to a true proposition; indeed, their account makes no mention of beliefs, propositions, or truth. Rather, knowledge or understanding is explained as a kind of ability or know-how: the ability to use ‘the knowing’ to “sort” things, which is to distinguish them into kinds and apply the appropriate names to them. This know-how corresponds functionally to propositional knowledge, in that it will typically be expressed in statements of the form “A is B”—such as “oxen are animals”—which by our lights express facts or true propositions. But the Mohists’ explanation is that such a statement manifests the skill or ability to “sort” or “distinguish” oxen as falling within the kind animal.
5.2 Sources and Objects of Knowledge
Canon A80 gives a categorization of three sources and four objects of knowledge. The sources of knowledge are hearsay, or testimony; “explanation,” or inference; and “in person,” or observation. Hearsay or testimony (wén 聞) is explained as “receiving it as passed along.” Elsewhere, “passing along” is glossed as “someone reports it” (A81), and “reporting” (gào 告, also “informing”) is itself explained as “making someone know” (B9). Explanation (shuō 說) is illustrated by the example “squares do not rotate.” Other passages explain it as “that by which one understands” (A72) and as a process of citing reasons or causes (NO11). “In person” or “personal” (qīn 親) is explained as “observing it there oneself.” This notion is probably the closest the Mohists come to articulating a conception of experience. However, since they do not, in fact, use any term interpretable as expressing an explicit concept of experience, we should stick closely to their terminology and characterize “personal knowledge” (qīn zhī 親知, B70) as knowledge by observation (guān 觀).
Interestingly, in discussing “personal knowledge,” the Mohists do not posit any sort of intermediary, such as the British Empiricists’ ideas or impressions, that stands between objects and the mind. Rather, we perceive things by means of the sense organs (B46), which allow perceived features to enter directly into “the knowing” (A98). “Personal knowledge” contrasts with “knowledge by explanation” (shuō zhī 說知, B70), which is in effect knowledge obtained by inference or reasoning. The Mohists probably understand explanation (shuō 說, also “account” or “doctrine”) as a process of giving reasons (gù 故) to support or explain some claim (NO11, B66). Explanation enables us to obtain knowledge that goes beyond direct personal observation, such as by drawing inferences from information provided by others. Having been told that an object hidden in a room is the same color as a white object before us, we know “by explanation,” without observation, that the hidden object is white (B70). In a debate, or biàn 辯, having an explanation allows us to assert more than merely that something does or does not match an agreed-upon model. We can assert, for instance, that a circle is nowhere straight (A98). However, knowledge by explanation probably does not reflect a conception of reason in itself as a distinct source of knowledge, an idea familiar from Western rationalism. For the clearest example the Mohists give of it is not knowledge of an a priori proposition, but knowledge obtained by analogical inference from information provided by an informant (B70). So “knowledge by explanation” seems a catch-all term for knowledge obtained by inference, whether deductive, inductive, abductive, or analogical.
In comparison with the Western tradition, it is notable that the Mohists privilege neither observation nor explanation—and by extension, neither experience nor reason—as a more fundamental source of knowledge. Both are given equal weight. Nor do they emphasize a distinction between the type or quality of knowledge derived from the two sources, such as that one is more certain than the other. Moreover, they take observation and explanation to be on a par with a third source of knowledge, “hearsay,” or the reports of other people. They thus explicitly recognize the social aspects of knowledge, a topic that has recently attracted much interest in contemporary epistemology.
The four objects of knowledge (A80) are names (míng 名, words), stuff (shí 實, including objects, events, and situations), “matching” (hé 合), and acting (wéi 為). The first two are explained by their role in language. Names are “that by which we call” (what we use to talk). Stuff (shí) is “what we call” (what we talk about). The next two concern the correctness of assertion and action. “Matching” is when name and thing fit together properly. “Acting” is intentional conduct.
The first two kinds of knowledge concern acquaintance or familiarity—what we might call “knowing-of.” Knowledge of names probably refers to knowing words, without necessarily knowing how to correctly distinguish what shí (stuff, objects) they refer to. An example would probably be the blind man who can use the words ‘black’ and ‘white’ in statements such as “Bright things are white and dark things are black” but cannot identify black or white objects when presented with them. Presumably the criterion for knowing a name is knowing how to use it in at least some contexts.
Knowing stuff probably refers to recognizing objects, events, or situations under some name—at the very least, under the “all-reaching” or “universal” name ‘thing’, which applies to everything—without necessarily knowing the correct name for them. For example, sometimes the same kind of object may have two names, such as ‘dog’ and ‘hound’ (B39). Someone might know of this kind of object and know to call it “dog,” without also knowing to call it “hound.” Then the person would know the stuff referred to by ‘hound’ but not the name ‘hound’.
Knowledge of “matching” is knowing how to correctly distinguish, or identify, the kind of thing to which a name refers. This is the sort of practical know-how that the blind man lacks. Early Mohist epistemology seems to have focused on this form of knowledge to the exclusion of the preceding two. The later Mohists also seem to have taken this as their primary focus, since as we saw above they explain both perceptual knowledge and understanding as an ability to match names with things by describing them (A5) or sorting them into kinds (A6). (Clearly, though, a person could learn a good deal about sorting into kinds merely on the basis of knowing names.) The fourth type of knowledge, knowledge of acting, is knowing how to act correctly—probably, given the context, knowing how to respond appropriately to the sort of thing denoted by a particular name or term. That this is included in a categorization of the objects of zhī (knowledge) underscores the theoretical unity of knowledge and action for the Mohists. Cognition and practical wisdom, or knowing what to do and when to do it, are both considered aspects or forms of zhī (knowledge).
Another, unfortunately obscure canon identifies four sources of doubt, or potential causes of erroneous judgment (B10): accidental circumstances, inconclusive evidence, causal overdetermination, and transience. The first of these seems to refer to error due to atypical circumstances. In a dense fog, for instance, someone might mistake a man for an ox. Unseasonable weather might cause a person who has moved to a light hut in summer to unexpectedly feel cold. The possibility of error in such difficult or unexpected circumstances can provide a reason to doubt a judgment. The second source of doubt is insufficient evidence. We have reason to doubt that someone who lifts a load of feathers is strong or that someone who shaves wood along the grain is skilled woodworker, because these tasks are too easy to be firm evidence of strength or skill. The third source is the presence of multiple causes that could explain something. The cause of a fighter’s collapse might have been that he was drinking alcohol before the match or that he was overcome by the heat of the noonday sun. Since we cannot know which factor was decisive, we have grounds to doubt any claim that one or the other was. The fourth source refers to situations in which the object of knowledge may change, such that what we know ceases to be the case. An obvious example—the Mohists do not give one—is knowing the status of the weather. We knew it was raining when we ran in from the storm, but after some time we may have grounds to doubt whether it is still raining.
Interestingly, particularly in comparison with the Western tradition, the Mohists do not regard the fallibility of perceptual or cognitive processes as grounds for doubt. In their view, the sources of doubt lie not in the nature of the cognitive subject, but in contingent features of particular circumstances—that they are potentially confusing, atypical, causally overdetermined, transient, or simply provide inadequate evidence. With the exception of causal overdetermination, in most cases doubt can be resolved by further investigation. Nor is reality considered inherently unknowable, because of incessant phenomenal change or because appearances mislead us as to how things actually are. Accordingly, ancient Chinese skepticism—as expressed in the Zhuangzi, for example—is not concerned with the unreliability of sense perception or a gap between appearance and reality, but with the problem of grounding the norms by which we draw distinctions between things.
An interesting consequence of the Mohists’ account of knowledge as grounded in know-how, or practical ability, is that they do not treat justification as a component that must be added to a state corresponding to belief in order to produce knowledge. (Reasons (gù 故) have a role in the later Mohist theory of dialectics or argumentation, but not in the canons on knowledge.) The text recognizes a contrast between knowing and “taking to be so” (A24, B10), an attitude corresponding to belief, but this attitude is not treated as a constituent of knowledge, to which something must be added to yield knowledge. Instead, perceptual knowledge and discursive knowledge seem to lie primarily in the ability to recognize and respond to things appropriately, mainly by naming and sorting them correctly. Probably no role is assigned to justification because the Mohist conception of knowledge is just a type of reliable capacity. The role of justification in the account of knowledge as justified true belief is mainly to exclude accidentally true beliefs, such as lucky guesses, from counting as knowledge. The Mohists handle this point by taking only correct naming and sorting that issues from a reliable skill or ability to be knowledge. A reliability component is obvious in the case of the discursive knowledge characterized in Canon A6, which is a comprehensive, systematic ability to sort things into kinds. But reliability may also be part of the Mohist conception of perceptual knowledge, a prerequisite for which is the reliable ability to recognize and name things correctly. The Mohists’ account of knowledge converges in places with themes in contemporary virtue epistemology, in particular with a position that we might call “ability reliabilism.” The relationship between the Mohist view of mind and knowledge and contemporary epistemology is an area that deserves further research.
The Mohists’ conception of knowledge and understanding as grounded in the ability to name and sort things correctly leads us back to the questions we raised in response to their theory of language. What determines kind distinctions? What makes it correct to distinguish a particular thing as part of one kind or another? In practice, how do we determine to which kinds things belong? These questions must be answered before we can determine whether we actually have knowledge in particular cases. For the later Mohists’ answers to these questions, we need to look to their account of the notions of “sameness” and “difference” and their theory of argumentation.
6. “Same” and “Different”
The notions of “same” or “similar” (tóng 同) and “different” (yì 異) lie at the heart of later Mohist thought. As we have seen, they are a core part of the explanation of how words refer to things and how we use language to communicate. They determine what counts as correct “describing,” “sorting,” and “matching” of names and things and thus what knowledge is. The issues of how to distinguish the “same” from “different” kinds of things and how to identify particular individuals as belonging to one kind or another are central issues in Mohist semantics and epistemology, and through them, in the Mohist theory of argumentation as well.
The Dialectics explore aspects of “sameness” (tóng 同) and “difference” (yì 異) in several places. Fragments collected in the “Greater Selection” indicate that the writers were developing a detailed classification of types of “sameness,” and one canon (A88) appears to explore a contrast between relative and absolute sameness or difference. Textual problems make it impractical to discuss these passages here, but one pair of canons presents a clear, intelligible taxonomy of four types of sameness and difference (A86–87):
- Sameness in being identical or coextensive, as when two names refer to the same shí 實 (object, event, situation). This sort of sameness contrasts with difference in the sense of being two different shí.
- Sameness in being parts of the same unit (tǐ 體), as when things are included within a single whole (jiān 兼). This contrasts with difference in the sense of not being connected or attached. The concept of a “whole” here corresponds roughly to a mereological whole or fusion and includes functional wholes, such as the body. It may cover sets as well, although the textual evidence suggests that the Mohists probably assimilated set-member relations to part-whole relations.
- Sameness in being together or united, as when things share the same location. This contrasts with difference in the sense of not being in the same place. One suggestion is that this sense of sameness might refer to the relation between the hard and the white features of a hard, white stone (B37), the body and “the knowing” of a living thing (A22), or the length and breadth of an object (B4) (Graham 2003: 335). Different aspects or features of a single thing might be considered “the same” in this sense. Another plausible hypothesis is that this type of sameness refers to things being grouped together on the basis of location or other extrinsic facts about them, such as how they are used. All the items in my desk drawer or all draft animals could be considered “the same” in this sense and thereby take the same general “name” (Fraser forthcoming). Such groupings of things contrast with groupings on the basis of intrinsic similarity, the fourth type of “sameness.”
- Sameness in being “of a kind” (lèi 類), explained here as “having a respect in which they are the same.” This contrasts with difference in being “not of a kind,” which is “not the same in any respect.” Unlike the first three types of sameness, being “of a kind” entails that things are intrinsically similar (ruò 若) in some respect other than that defined by these notions of “sameness.” Being “of a kind” explains why things are referred to by the same “kind name,” or general term for things of that kind. As we saw in the section on language, the names of kinds apply to all the similar things that are members of the kind (A78).
This list invites an intriguing observation. The writers take the general notion of “sameness” (tóng 同) to express (at least) four different types of relations: identity or coextension; part-whole relations; being constituent features of something or, alternatively, being grouped together on some extrinsic grounds; and sharing some intrinsic similarity and thereby being “of a kind.” These relations correspond roughly to those of identity, part versus whole, constitution, set membership, and kind relations, which in European languages are all typically expressed using the verb to be, or the copula. We can say, for example, that Cicero is Tully, in that he is identical with Tully; that Cicero’s finger is Cicero, in that it is part of the whole that is Cicero; that Cicero is his body, in that he is constituted by his body; that Cicero is a magistrate, in that he was a Roman public official; and that Cicero is human, in that he is a member of the kind human.
This parallel between the forms of “sameness” (tóng) the Mohists identify and our use of to be strongly suggests that the concept of “sameness” plays a theoretical role for classical Chinese thinkers comparable to that of to be or the copula in European languages. It is likely that the Mohists and other early Chinese thinkers implicitly understood an assertion we would translate into the form ‘A is B’ as claiming that A and B are “the same,” in one of the several senses specified above. Evaluating the truth of such an assertion would be understood as evaluating whether A and B are indeed “the same” in the relevant way. More generally, early Chinese theorists probably regarded assertion, judgment, and reasoning all as processes of distinguishing whether things are “the same” or not. Stating a fact about the world would have been seen as a matter of identifying a sameness or difference, in one of four (or more) senses of “sameness.” “White horses are horses” would be interpreted as in effect claiming that white horses and horses are “the same,” and “Oxen are not horses” as claiming that oxen and horses are “different.” If these interpretive hypotheses are correct, then it is no exaggeration to say that distinguishing same and different—in effect, pattern recognition or analogical extension—is the core explanatory notion underlying classical Chinese philosophy of language, epistemology, and logic.
6.1 The Basis for Distinguishing Kinds
The explanation of sameness in being “of a kind” bears on the questions raised at the end of section 4 about the grounds for recognizing some kinds and not others and the explanation of why particular things count as members of one kind or another. The Mohists’ explanation of being “of a kind”—“having a respect in which they’re the same”—might at first glance seem to allow that any group of things with anything in common could be considered a kind. Could the collection of items in your desk drawer then constitute a kind by virtue of their similarity in being in the drawer? A view that allows an affirmative answer might make identification of kinds highly arbitrary, leading to an extreme relativist or conventionalist view on which almost any group of things could count as a kind. However, the Mohists would probably reject such an extreme view. A collection of things in a drawer might be “the same” in being united, or grouped together, the third of the four types of sameness above, but presumably it would not be “the same” in being “of a kind.” Rather, the Mohists seem to hold that to be of the same kind, things must possess one or more shared, intrinsically similar features, such as their visible characteristics (mào 貌) or shape (xíng 形) (Robins 2012). Nevertheless, since there are indefinitely many respects in which things might have similar observable features, the Mohist stance could still be quite liberal, allowing things to be divided up into various kind distinctions depending on which features a speech community happens to attend to.
The Mohists specify three sorts of general criteria for naming things, as we mentioned briefly in the section on language. (There may originally have been further criteria, as only a series of fragments remain of the text or texts that treated these issues.) Some general names refer to objects that share the same “shape and looks” (xíng mào 形貌, visible form and observable features). Examples include mountains, hills, houses, shrines, swords, humans, and parts of the body (NO1–2, 7). Such names are likely regarded as denoting kinds, since their use is based on features regarded as intrinsically similar. Other general names distinguish things on the basis of “residence and migration” (jū yùn 居運). These include anything named after a place, such as a Qin horse, or anything located in a place. Instead of picking out things that count as kinds in the sense of sharing some intrinsic similarity, this criterion seems to identify things that are “the same” by virtue of being “united” in some way, such as by being in the same location. A third set of criteria are “amount and number” (liàng shù 量數) (NO2). Perhaps an example of a kind based on such criteria might be “quadruped.”
These general criteria are hardly enough to resolve all of our questions about the basis for kind distinctions, however. Kinds are discriminated from other things by citing or “presenting” (jǔ 舉) distinctive features shared by their members. These features must be selected carefully. If we choose features that are not genuinely relevant or comparable, then the distinctions we draw will be specious (B76). If we cite features shared by individuals of more than one kind, we will fail to distinguish the kinds correctly and reliably. The Mohists call the use of such specious or unreliable criteria “wild presenting” (kuáng jǔ 狂舉, citing features “crazily” or “arbitrarily”). As canon B66 explains, we cannot recognize the differences between kinds of things correctly if we cite features that different kinds both have (as oxen and horses both have teeth and tails) or features that only some but not all of one kind have (as some but not all cattle have horns).
The specific issue framed in B66 is how, assuming that oxen and horses are indeed different kinds, we can specify distinguishing features to differentiate them reliably. But the Mohists’ rejection of “wild presenting” raises a more general issue. What determines the distinctions between kinds, such that citing some features is “wild” and others not? Instead of distinguishing oxen from horses, could we instead group hornless oxen and horses together as a kind? The Mohists’ implicit view seems to be—though the textual evidence is sparse and open to competing interpretations—that the difference between kinds such as oxen and horses lies in distinctive similarities shared by members of each kind that are inherent in their shí 實 (stuff), obtaining independently of human activity. Hence kind relations are determined by the natural world, not by human attitudes or conventions. Which kind distinctions we attend to and employ may be up to us, but that some group of things forms a kind is not. In seeking to distinguish kinds, then, our task is to identify features that allow us to recognize the inherent differences between them reliably.
This view seems implied by canon B1, which depicts two parties to a debate discussing how to “settle” (zhǐ 止) what kind (lèi 類) they are referring to by considering in turn whether the presence or absence of various features in one or more individual exemplars generalizes to the entire kind. The scenario depicted seems to presuppose that the particular exemplar (a horse, suppose) is inherently a member of a predetermined kind (horses). (This implicit assumption is reflected in the text’s referring to the exemplar as “this/these here” [cǐ 此] and to the kind it is understood to belong to as “this (kind)” [shì 是].) The debaters’ task is not to agree on features by which to establish or institute the kind, but to find features that reliably distinguish a collection of inherently similar things from other, non-similar things. They cannot simply stipulate what the features of the kind will be, just as they cannot simply stipulate that oxen are distinguished from horses by having horns. The similarity relation between the exemplar horse and other horses that constitutes being “of a kind” is intrinsic to them and does not depend on our deeming them similar. Hence it seems appropriate to characterize the Mohist stance as “realist,” specifically in the sense that the “sameness” relations that determine kinds are inherent in things and not a product of human attitudes or practices.
This implicitly realist view of similarity relations and kind distinctions seems operative as well in canon B2, which indicates that we can be mistaken in how we project kind relations, since features of individual exemplars may not generalise to all members of their kind. The canon again seems to assume that the kind relation between an exemplar and others of its kind exists independently of our identifying it, and so questions can arise as to whether we are extending kinds properly. If kind relations were not independent in this way, the features by which we distinguish and name the exemplar could simply define what features are “so” of the kind.
On this line of interpretation, then, we find the Mohists contending in canons B8 and B72 that although we can “borrow” the name of one kind and use it of another thing—their examples are that we might name a dog “Crane” or a family might be surnamed “Crane”—it is impermissible to claim things just are whatever we call them. The dog is not actually a water bird. Whether or not something is the sort of thing designated by a name is determined not by our happening to deem it so, but by whether it is in fact relevantly similar to other things that take that name. General terms must “proceed” (xíng 行), or be projectible to, their extensions in regular, predictable ways. Names of kinds must “proceed” on the basis of inherent similarities. Canon B72 is in effect attacking the stance, associated with the “School of Names” and discussed in certain Zhuangzi passages, that anything can arbitrarily be deemed “so” with respect to some kind.
The issues at stake here matter not only for the Mohists. They are among the central questions in classical Chinese philosophy, addressed in different ways by Mohists, Daoists, Confucians, and others. For what scheme of kind distinctions we adopt was seen as determining values, norms of action, and even the organization of society. In the Western tradition, views on similar issues have tended to fall into one of three general categories: realism, conceptualism, or nominalism. This taxonomy is unhelpful in understanding classical Chinese thought, however, for the various positions in the Chinese discourse all tend to fall roughly under the label of nominalism, appealing neither to universals nor to concepts to explain the relation between a thing and its kind. The range of Chinese positions can more usefully be plotted along a spectrum from a form of realism to various forms of conventionalism or relativism, representing the extent to which they treat distinctions between kinds as fixed and independent of human activity, on the one hand, or as relative to our (potentially plural and variable) attitudes, practices, context, or point of view, on the other. On one end of this spectrum would be monistic realism, the view that kind distinctions are determined by a single, uniquely correct pattern of similarity relations fixed by the world itself, such that exactly one set of kind distinctions are the correct ones. Next might come a weaker form of realism, on which kind distinctions rest on similarity relations fixed by the world, but different speech communities might employ kind names that pick out some or other of these distinctions depending on their interests or customs. Further in the relativist direction would be Xunzi’s pragmatic conventionalism, which holds that the similarity relations that underwrite kind distinctions are not inherent in things themselves but are determined by social conventions based on our natural biological disposition to classify certain things similarly, our cultural traditions, political decisions, and practical efficacy in securing socioeconomic order. Still further in the relativist direction would be the positions of the “Discourse on Evening Things Out” and “Autumn Waters” essays in the Zhuangzi, both of which hold that, though the schemes of kind distinctions we employ are grounded in similarities between things, these similarities themselves are determined by our perspective, practices, or context. At the extreme relativist end of the spectrum would be the view that kind distinctions are entirely arbitrary, fixed only by the contingent whims of the person doing the classifying. It is unclear whether any early Chinese thinker actually held such a view, though ideas associated with Hui Shi and Gongsun Long suggest that they might have.
The later Mohists most likely fall on the realist side of this spectrum, although their account of the grounds for kind distinctions is so sketchy that any interpretation of their position is partly conjectural. Their stance seems to be that whether we recognize some kind by dubbing its exemplars with a name—as when we dub horses “horse”—is determined by our practices, but that whether a group of objects, such as horses, form a kind is determined by whether the objects are intrinsically similar, independently of our practices (A78, A86). The texts do not clearly indicate whether, for example, the aggregate oxen-and-horses—that is, draft animals—could conventionally be deemed a kind (cf. B67). Perhaps the Mohists would instead hold that, as draft animals, oxen and horses are “the same” in being “united” by their function in pulling carts (that is, by the third of the four types of “sameness”). Canon B66 seems to imply that hornless oxen and horses cannot form a kind, probably because no feature distinguishes just this grouping of hornless animals from all others. By contrast, perhaps hornless quadrupeds could constitute a kind, because their inherent similarity in having four legs but lacking horns distinguishes them from all other creatures. In the end, later Mohist texts offer no explicit, detailed explanation of exactly which similarities between things constitute the basis for kinds. On this point, their treatment contrasts with that of, for example, Xunzi, who clearly indicates that the relevant “samenesses” are constituted through social practices. 
7. Argumentation and Logic
As we have seen, Mohist semantics and epistemology are grounded in the notion of distinguishing things as “the same” (tóng 同) or “different” (yì 異). To predicate a general term of something is to distinguish it as similar to, or of a kind (lèi 類) with, other things denoted by that term. Knowledge and understanding are explained in terms of the ability to distinguish and name things correctly. In this theoretical framework, judgment amounts to the act of either grouping things together as “similar” or “the same” or distinguishing them as “different.” An assertion is in effect a claim that something is or is not “the same” or “of a kind” with something else. Thus argumentation or disputation—the process of supporting an assertion by citing other, established claims—is typically seen as a process of distinguishing whether two things are or are not “the same” or whether something belongs to a certain kind.
As might be expected, given this background, the Mohists’ logical investigations focus on analogical reasoning, and indeed they tend to treat all argumentation as fundamentally analogical in nature. They do not investigate formal logic or deductive inference, nor formulate an explicit notion of logical consequence. They do apply versions of the laws of excluded middle and non-contradiction, along with concepts of logical “permissibility” (kě 可) and “perversity” (bèi 悖, 誖) that are intertwined with a rough notion of logical consistency. They also employ a rigorous system of quantifiers and conjunctions of implication. Still, none of these logical notions is addressed as an explicit topic of investigation, nor are they organized and presented in a systematic way. The Mohists’ discussion focuses on semantics and analogical argumentation.
The Mohists refer to the field of activity in which we support, evaluate, and argue over assertions as biàn 辯, a word interpretable as “dialectics,” “distinction drawing,” “discriminating,” or “disputation.” (For convenience, we will translate it as “disputation,” though, as we will see, Chinese thinkers understand it very literally as a process of “discriminating,” or drawing distinctions.) Early Chinese texts describe disputation at several levels of generality. In its broadest sense, disputation is extensive in scope, covering aspects of semantics, argumentation, logic, and rhetoric. It is comparable to the Greek notion of dialectics, considered loosely as debate or reasoning aimed at knowledge. The Mohists’ “Lesser Selection” (Xiǎo Qǔ) depicts it as a general process of reasoning and judgment that covers virtually all cognitive activity, including topics corresponding to politics, semantics, natural science, and ethics.
Disputation (biàn 辯), by it we clarify divisions between this (shì 是) and not-this (fēi 非) to examine the guidelines of order and disorder; clarify points of sameness and difference to discern the patterns of names (míng 名) and stuff (shí 實); and settle benefit and harm to resolve uncertainty and doubt. Only then can we lay out what is so of the myriad things and sort out parallels in groups of statements. (NO6)
Other texts portray disputation as a competitive, argumentative activity, a kind of public debate or dispute. The narrowest, most specific descriptions depict it as a process of arguing over whether, with respect to some name or term (míng), something is shì (this) or fēi (not-this), part of the extension of the term or not. Any two or more things that are shì (this) are thereby “the same” in some way. So disputation is in effect a process of distinguishing what is or is not “the same.” At each level of generality, it is said to involve distinguishing shì/fēi 是非 (this/not-this) and tóng/yì 同異 (same/different). Disputation in the narrow sense of arguing over whether a term can properly be predicated of a thing is probably the basic component activity of disputation in the wider senses. Disputation in the broadest sense of “debate” or “dialectics” is in effect an extended process of disputation in the narrow sense.
Canons A73–74 give a precise explication of disputation in its most concrete sense. It is contending over which of two complementary terms, such as ‘ox’ and ‘non-ox’, “fits” (dàng 當) a thing (shí) (A74). Such pairs of terms divide everything in the world into two mutually exclusive categories: any one thing is either ox or non-ox. In disputation, one side calls a thing “ox,” the other “non-ox”; the side whose claim fits the thing wins. The text cites a version of the law of excluded middle (A73) to show that at least one of the pair of terms must fit and a version of the law of non-contradiction (A74) to show that at least one must fail to fit. The speech act of calling the thing “ox” or “non-ox” has the pragmatic significance of an assertion, and so disputation can be understood by our lights as a debate over which of two contradictory assertions is true. But the Mohists do not view it this way. They see it as contending over whether the shí (stuff, thing) at hand is of the kind ox or not. Equivalently, they see it as debating whether, with respect to the term ‘ox’, the thing at hand is “this” (shì) or “not-this” (fēi)—whether the term “fits” it or not.
How do we determine whether something is “this” or not? As explained in section 4.1, we cite a model or paradigm (fǎ 法) of the kind in question and try to show that the thing is or is not relevantly similar to it. A thing is “so” (rán 然) when its “looks” (mào 貌, observable features) are similar (ruò 若) to the model (fǎ) (A70–71). Models may include a thought of the thing, measuring tools or other devices for identifying it, or concrete examples. Things can “match” (hé 合) the model “exactly,” as when a circle is exactly the same shape as the model, or by what is “appropriate,” as when we deem a man “swarthy” by the color of his skin, not his hair or eyes (A83, A96). The overall process of citing a model, explaining the reasons for distinguishing something as “this” or “not-this,” and thus achieving understanding is called “explanation” or “persuasion” (shuō 說) (A72, NO11). “Explanation” (shuō) is the analogue, in the Chinese context, of giving an argument for a claim. However, an “explanation” has no particular formal structure. Nor is it regarded as proving a conclusion; the Mohists develop no conception of deductive proof. It is simply the process of explaining the grounds (gù 故) for distinguishing something as “this” or “not-this.”
A series of canons following those just discussed describe detailed procedures for disputation, but textual and interpretive problems place them beyond the scope of this article. Several other canons—equally obscure, but worth summarizing briefly here—identify potential problems in disputation. These have two main sources: the inherently fallible nature of analogical extension and the Mohists’ discovery that similar grammatical structure need not reliably reflect similar semantics.
7.1 “The Difficulty of Extending Kinds”
In a typical disputation (biàn 辯), we compare something to a model or exemplar of the kind (lèi 類) of thing denoted by some term and judge whether or not they are “the same.” In the narrowest sort of case, we might dispute whether a particular individual is of a certain kind, such as oxen. At a higher level of generality, we might dispute whether or not one kind of thing, A, is also of another kind, B. For instance, we might dispute whether or not oxen are of the kind four-footed animals. In either sort of case, we are considering whether to “extend” our judgment about what is of a kind to include something new. In classical Chinese thought, judging that some new thing falls within a recognized kind is called “analogical extension” or “extending kinds” (tuī lèi 推類).
Such judgments will typically be based on comparison with selected features of a limited set of exemplars. We will usually proceed by identifying a few distinguishing features of a handful of representatives of the kind, a process the Mohists call “settling the kind” (B1). Yet things of the same kind may be dissimilar in some respects, while things of different kinds may nevertheless share some similarities. So problems can arise in identifying distinguishing features and differentiating kinds. The Mohists call this the “difficulty of extending kinds” (B2). The canon that presents the problem is corrupt and obscure, but we can make an educated conjecture as to its gist. It identifies two sources of difficulty: first, some features, but not all, are shared by every member of a kind; second, because kinds may be larger or smaller in scope, two things may be similar in both falling under one kind without being similar in falling under another. All quadrupeds are alike in having four feet, but not all are alike in being oxen, horses, or deer. Birds and all other animals are alike in being living creatures, but not all animals are birds. One cannot invariably generalize from features of an exemplar to claims about an entire kind, because—with the exception of special cases such as being four-footed—it is not obvious from the exemplar which features are shared by all members of the kind. Thus in disputation the process of identifying features of individual exemplars that are indeed representative of their kind will always be fallible.
Other problems concerned the semantics of compound terms, or phrases. The simplest early Chinese model of language—probably the default starting point for the Mohists’ and other ancient Chinese thinkers’ reflections—is what we might call the one-name-one-thing model (cf. Hansen 1983). On this view, names or words (míng 名) are taken to stand in a one-to-one correspondence with kinds of shí 實 (stuff, things, events, situations). When the Mohists moved on to consider phrases or expressions (cí 辭) formed by combining two or more words, they discovered that the language-world relation is more complex than this naive model suggests. Linguistic structure does not always directly reflect the structure of things in the world. When two names are strung together, the reference of the resulting phrase may change in unpredictable ways. Combining ‘oxen’ and ‘horses’ gives ‘oxen-and-horses’ (niú mǎ 牛馬), a phrase denoting the sum of all oxen and horses (B12). But combining ‘hard’ and ‘white’ does not produce a phrase denoting the sum of all hard things and white things. It forms one denoting things that are both hard and white in the same place at the same time (A66, B37). Everything hard-and-white (jiān bái 堅白) is white. But not everything falling within the extension of ‘oxen-and-horses’ is oxen. In fact, a dispute over whether oxen-and-horses are oxen or not is undecidable, since if we claim that they are, on the grounds that part of the sum is oxen, our opponent can claim in response that they are not, on exactly parallel grounds (B67) (Fraser 2007b). ‘White horse’ and ‘blind horse’ have the same grammatical structure. But whereas a white horse is white all over, a blind horse is not “blind all over”; only its eyes are blind (B3). Deeming someone “fū 夫” (husband) but combining the word with ‘yóng 勇’ (brave) to form the phrase ‘yóng fū 勇夫’ (“brave man”) is not deeming him a husband. But deeming a pair of things “shoes” while combining the word with ‘buying clothes’ (“buying clothes and shoes”) is still deeming them shoes (B3).
Observations about such formally similar but semantically dissimilar phrases led the Mohists to doubt that complex linguistic structures have any regular or reliable relation to the patterns of similarity and difference that ground their correct use. Formal parallels between the words and phrases we use to talk about things can guide us in discriminating kinds only up to a point, because linguistic similarities may not reflect actual similarities in things. In classical Chinese, ‘oxen-and-horses’ (niú mǎ 牛馬) and ‘white horse’ (bái mǎ 白馬) have a similar formal structure, but the first denotes the sum of two kinds of things, the second a portion of one kind of thing. Formal similarities in linguistic structure are thus an unreliable guide to distinguishing kinds. To discriminate kinds properly, we need to examine the semantic criteria (yīn 因) or grounds (gù 故) that determine the proper use of the words or phrases that denote them, and not rely only on structural similarities to other words or phrases. In some cases, we may need to point out that structurally similar expressions in fact have very different semantics. This is a key theme of the “Lesser Selection” (Xiǎo Qǔ), a brief summary and illustration of Mohist dialectics that is probably the most important text in the history of Chinese logic.
7.2 Methods of Argumentation in the “Lesser Selection”
We quoted the opening paragraph of the “Lesser Selection” above: The text depicts disputation as the general method of achieving understanding in virtually all areas of inquiry. Specifically, it is the means by which we can determine “what is so” of things—what terms are predicable of them, and thus what claims are correct—and “sort out parallels” between various types of statements, thus determining what relations between statements might provide good grounds for accepting one statement on the basis of another. The text continues by introducing basic concepts and principles of disputation:
By names (míng 名), present stuff (shí 實); by expressions (cí 辭), put across thoughts (yì 意); by explanations (shuō 說), bring out reasons (gù 故). Accept and propose on the basis of kinds (lèi 類). Having it in our case, we do not reject it in the other’s; lacking it in our case, we do not demand it in the other’s.
From the perspective of comparative philosophy, this statement is of far-reaching significance. Here, in an explicit, systematic presentation of their theory of dialectics, the most logically inclined thinkers in the Chinese tradition tell us directly that assertions are put forth and accepted or rejected on the basis of analogical extension, by deeming things to be of the same kind or not. They add a principle of fairness, stipulating that the same grounds or demands be applied whether evaluating our own claims or the opponent’s. They thus indicate that their dialectics is primarily not the study of deductive logic, or formally valid inference. It is the study of fair or unbiased analogical persuasion. Interestingly, this is an instance of the explicit study of logic in a culture reflecting prevailing patterns of reasoning across other fields. Early Chinese mathematics and science are likewise based on analogical reasoning and taxonomy, rather than on the model of the deductive system that dominates ancient Greek thought.
The passage is also significant for what it tells us about the components and structure of disputation. Three sorts of linguistic units are mentioned, all of them explained in terms of function, not structure. “Names,” or words, are used to “present” or talk about things. “Expressions” are used to express thoughts and thus to make assertions. “Expressions” overlap functionally with what we would identify as sentences. However, a sentence is a grammatical unit, composed of a subject and a predicate. The Mohists do not characterize expressions as grammatical units, nor as comprising a subject and predicate. They see them simply as strings of names that enable us to express thoughts. Since in classical Chinese a predicate term standing alone can express a thought, presumably such a term can also be an “expression.” “Explanations” are used to elucidate the reasons for drawing distinctions one way or another. Functionally, an “explanation” is roughly analogous to an argument, or, more precisely, to the premises of an argument, in that it serves to support an assertion by giving reasons. However, an explanation is not described as having any particular structure, nor any particular logical relation to an assertion other than giving reasons for it.
The text next introduces several further notions, including that of “emulation,” or the use of models to distinguish shì/fēi, before explaining four standard rhetorical techniques used in disputation. The four techniques and the text’s explanation of them are as follows:
- Analogy (pì 譬): “Presenting other things and using them to clarify it.”
- “Paralleling” (móu 侔): “Placing expressions side by side and jointly proceeding.”
- “Pulling” (yuán 援): “Saying, ‘You are so, how is it that I alone cannot be so?’”
- “Pushing” (tuī 推): “On the grounds that what they don’t accept is the same as what they do accept, propose it.”
Scholars have debated the relationship between these four techniques, some suggesting that they are a sequence of steps employed in the process of establishing a claim, others that they are inference procedures. It is unlikely they form a fixed sequence of steps, since rhetorically in many cases giving an analogy might make presenting parallel claims unnecessary, or “pulling” (appealing to the opponent’s precedent) alone might be sufficient to establish one’s point. Probably there is no fixed relation between the four, and disputers may apply one or more of them as needed to make their case. Frequently, using just one may be sufficient.
A key point to note about the four techniques, relating back to the principle that we “accept and propose on the basis of kinds,” is that all are specifically procedures for analogical argumentation, aimed at distinguishing similarities and differences between kinds of things and assertions about them. This point is underscored by the next line of the text, which describes the two standard responses to the four rhetorical moves: “‘This is like what’s been said’ is ‘the same.’ ‘How can I call it that?’ is ‘different.’” However, the four techniques apply analogical judgment and reasoning in different ways. A concise way of capturing the differences between them is that analogy is grounded in similarities between things, “paralleling” in similarities in phrasing, and “pulling” and “pushing” in similarities between the discursive commitments of the two opponents—between claims one side has previously accepted and analogous claims the other side now seeks to establish.
A further point is that these techniques—along with the general Mohist practice of citing models or exemplars to support one’s claims—are not the proprietary methods of the Mohist school. As any reader of the ancient literature will notice, three of them, at least, are standard rhetorical moves employed by classical Chinese thinkers and debaters of all stripes. (“Paralleling” seems to be used less frequently, but examples can be found nonetheless.) The Mozi contains numerous arguments matching these descriptions. But so too do the scores of essays and anecdotes collected in The Annals of Lü Buwei (Lüshi Chunqiu), for instance. Mencius, not a thinker one normally associates with the study of logic, is depicted as using them regularly (though not always correctly or intelligibly; see Mencius 6A:3). The four moves are thus probably representative of the art of disputation as generally practiced in the 3rd century B.C.E.
Analogy (pì 譬) is the easiest of the four to explain. It refers to drawing an analogy between one case and another, more familiar or easily understood one, in order to clarify the case at hand and presumably to establish a claim about it. It is based on an analogical inference from a similarity between selected features of the analogue and features of the case at hand to some further similarity between the two. Analogies are used regularly in argumentation throughout the Mozi and in the “Lesser Selection” as well.
Two of the techniques, “pulling” and “pushing,” are technically forms of argument ad hominem, in that the immediate basis for an assertion is the opponent’s commitment to a similar assertion concerning what we take to be a similar case. Rhetorically, these two moves attempt to support a claim not directly by appeal to features of the thing we are talking about, nor its similarity to something else, as in analogy, but by appeal to a claim the opponent has already accepted. “Pulling” refers to citing the opponent’s precedent in accepting an assertion about something and challenging the opponent to explain how the precedent is distinct from the case at hand. It is typically signaled by a rhetorical question asking how the present case is any different from the precedent. If no explanation is forthcoming, a similar assertion about the case at hand stands. “Pulling” thus amounts to shifting the burden of argument to the other side and inviting them to try to block an implicit analogical inference from the precedent to the case at hand by showing how the two are actually dissimilar. “Pushing” refers to proposing a claim about something on the basis of similarity to another claim the opponent has already accepted. In early Chinese thought, the term for “pushing,” tuī 推, is typically used to refer to analogical extension, and “pushing” indeed involves an extension from one claim to a new one on grounds that the cases are similar.
Since “pulling” and “pushing” are primarily ad hominem techniques used in face-to-face debate, not in argumentative writing, they appear in early Chinese texts mainly in contexts depicting speakers engaged in debate (biàn 辯) or attempting to persuade each other of something. The “Lesser Selection” itself contains two examples of “pushing,” one of which is presented in section 7.3. Clear-cut examples of “pulling” in the Mozi are difficult to find. What we generally see instead are instances in which Mozi challenges the audience to explain how a case under discussion is any different from a simpler, analogous case. For instance, in the third “Heaven’s Intention” essay, Mozi cites the case of people who “do not know the difference between black and white,” for on seeing a small amount of black, they say it is “black,” while on seeing a large amount, they say it is “white.” He compares this to the case of warlike rulers who forbid murder—the killing of a single person—yet deem it right for their soldiers to kill as many people of a neighboring state as possible. Of this way of distinguishing right from wrong, he asks, “How is this any different from confusing the difference between white and black?”
A more unambiguous example of “pulling” comes from the famous dialogue between Mencius and King Xuan in section 1A7 of the Mencius. Mencius argues that the king has the ability to be a genuine king—and not merely a king in name only—because of the compassion he displayed in sparing a frightened ox from sacrificial slaughter. He offers two examples of people who claim to be able to perform a difficult feat but not an easy, related task: a person who claims to be able to lift a heavy weight but not a feather and one who claims to be able to see the tip of an autumn hair but not a cartload of firewood. The king agrees that such claims would be unacceptable. Mencius then points out that the king’s benevolence is sufficient to reach animals—a “difficult” feat, he thinks, insofar as feeling compassion for an ox comes less naturally to us than feeling it for other humans—yet the benefits of this benevolence do not reach his people—an “easy” task, since being moved to help other people should be easier for us than being moved to help animals. He then asks how the king’s case is any different from the preceding examples. The implicit conclusion is that the claim that the King is unable to benefit his people is as unacceptable as a strong man saying he cannot lift a feather. Thus the king’s failure is not due to a lack of ability.
The remaining technique, “paralleling” (móu 侔), or presenting parallel, syntactically analogous utterances, is the most intriguing of the four and the most difficult and controversial to interpret. A variety of accounts have been proposed. The interpretive difficulty is due partly to the unfamiliarity of the technique, which has no obvious counterpart in other logical traditions, partly to the absence of any clearly specified examples in the text, and partly to the terminology the Mohists use to explain it. To paraphrase the text, “paralleling” is lining up expressions side-by-side and jointly proceeding with them all (bǐ cí ér jù xíng 比辭而俱行). This description is extremely general, telling us little more than that paralleling involves some form of linguistic comparison in which strings of utterances are extended or developed in some parallel or analogous way. What exactly is referred to by “expressions” (cí 辭) is vague, since, as we saw above, the only explanation the Mohists give is functional, that “expressions” are used to express thoughts. “Expressions” could conceivably refer to anything from a phrase to a sentence to several sentences. “Proceeding” (xíng 行) is also ambiguous. “Proceed” is used in relation to semantics in two other places in the Dialectics, Canons B1 and B72. In both, it seems to refer to “proceeding” to using a general term consistently of similar kinds of things. So “proceeding” in the present context could refer to going on to make consistent, unproblematic utterances. But perhaps it might refer to drawing inferences or simply to uttering strings of interrelated “expressions.” Even the conjunction “and” (er 而) here is open to different interpretations, as it could refer to a two-step process of first comparing expressions and then jointly proceeding with them or, more likely, to a single step of jointly proceeding with them in parallel.
Let me tentatively suggest that the following, relatively simple interpretation may have the greatest explanatory value: “paralleling” (móu 侔) refers very generally to presenting a series of syntactically parallel utterances, one or more of which are used to argue by analogy that one or more others should be accepted. The formal similarity between the structure or phrasing of the utterances is supposed to lead us to also see an analogical relation between the things or situations described, such that if we accept some of the parallels, we should accept them all. The following is one example of paralleling:
White horses are horses; riding white horses is riding horses.
Black horses are horses; riding black horses is riding horses.
On the proposed interpretation, the first utterance above could be taken as grounds for asserting the second. Alternatively, both utterances together could be taken as grounds for asserting a further parallel utterance:
Brown horses are horses; riding brown horses is riding horses.
As the Mohists understand paralleling, these examples could also support utterances unrelated to riding horses, such as the following:
Yellow dogs are dogs; feeding yellow dogs is feeding dogs.
Oxen are animals; feeding oxen is feeding animals.
The point of paralleling is to employ similarity in syntax or phrasing to persuade us to accept new, parallel utterances. The formal parallelism is intended to guide us to recognize that the cases in the utterances about brown horses, yellow dogs, and oxen are analogous to those in the ones about white and black horses.
The form of the above examples is “x is y, Fx is Fy,” where “F” is a predicate applied to both x and y. Paralleling is not limited to utterances of this form, however. On the basis of the Mohists’ discussion in the “Lesser Selection,” paralleling can be used with a variety of structural patterns, including the following, for example:
Reading books isn’t books; liking reading books is liking books.
Cockfights aren’t gamecocks; liking cockfighting is liking gamecocks.
Being about to fall into a well isn’t falling into a well; stopping someone about to fall into a well is stopping someone from falling into a well.
Being about to go out the door isn’t going out the door; stopping someone about to go out the door is stopping someone from going out the door.
By analogy to this list of parallel utterances, the Mohists contend we should also accept the following:
Being about to die young isn’t dying young; stopping someone from being about to die young is stopping someone from dying young.
Holding there is fate isn’t fate; rejecting holding there is fate is rejecting fate.
The litany of parallel examples is intended to prime us to accept the new, parallel utterances and to see them as identifying further cases in which, although x is not y, Fx is Fy.
The latter half of the “Lesser Selection” presents a taxonomy of cases in which the Mohists contend that syntactic parallels between utterances can indeed help justify similar, parallel utterances, along with examples of cases in which they cannot. One of the text’s central claims is that parallelism—and indeed all four of the rhetorical techniques introduced—is potentially misleading and can be used only with meticulous attention to the semantic grounds underlying the correct use of names and expressions. This claim underscores the nature of the logical inquiries in the “Lesser Selection.” The text is not exploring formally valid, truth-functional inference procedures, but examining ways in which analogical inferences—in particular those based on syntactic parallelism—do or do not yield what the writers consider semantically correct utterances. When they do not, the Mohists reject the results by appeal to what they take to be basic norms governing the semantics of names and expressions, which they see as more fundamental than syntactical or formal features. As this characterization suggests, although their observations about the misleading nature of syntactic parallels may have helped point them away from any significant study of formal, truth-functional logic, their inquiries were oriented in a different direction from the start.
7.3 Limitations of the Methods
Despite the Mohists’ general optimism about the power of disputation (biàn 辯) to resolve scientific, ethical, and political problems, an important aim of the “Lesser Selection” is to warn against blindly relying on its formal methods. Unlike a valid deductive argument, analogical distinction-drawing is not invariably reliable. According to the Mohists’ characterization of the four techniques, a typical piece of disputation might involve giving an analogy to support an assertion; presenting pairs or series of syntactically parallel statements and contending that since we accept some, we should accept others; appealing to an opponent’s precedent and challenging the opponent to explain how the case at hand is different; or asserting a statement on grounds we take to be similar to those for one our opponent has already accepted. The Mohists see four sorts of problems that may arise in drawing distinctions and thus making assertions on these grounds, one for each of the four procedures. (1) Analogies are not always reliable, because things similar in some respects may be importantly different in others. (2) Formal parallels hold only up to a point. (3) The grounds by which an opponent’s precedent and our own assertion are “so” (correct) or not may be quite different. (4) Likewise, an opponent’s reasons for accepting some assertion may be different from ours. The “Lesser Selection” explains:
Things have respects in which they are similar, yet it doesn’t follow that they are completely similar. Parallels between expressions are correct only up to a point. When things are “so,” there is that by which they are “so.” Their being “so” is the same, but that by which they are “so” isn’t necessarily the same. When people accept things, there is that by which they accept them. Their accepting them is the same, but that by which they accept them isn’t necessarily the same. Hence expressions in analogies, paralleling, “pulling,” and “pushing” become different as they proceed, become dangerous as they change direction, fail when taken too far, and leave their roots as they flow, and so one cannot fail to be cautious and cannot invariably use them. Thus statements have many methods, separate kinds have different reasons, and so one cannot look at only one side.
Whether something is “so” (rán 然)—that is, whether some term is correctly predicable of it—depends on “that which makes it so,” in effect the satisfaction conditions for the term. Things may be similar in some respects without fulfilling the satisfaction conditions for the same term. Linguistic expressions may be similar in structure while having dissimilar satisfaction conditions. Hence we must be cautious in using the techniques of disputation. Any guidance provided by similarities between things or parallels between expressions must always be checked against our know-how concerning the “reasons” (gù 故, the grounds or criteria) for using various expressions.
The Mohists appear to have been particularly concerned about potentially misleading formal parallels. We can illustrate their worries by considering a series of examples that contrast parallels they accept with others they reject. Recall that they affirm the parallel utterances “white horses are horses, riding white horses is riding horses” and “black horses are horses, riding black horses is riding horses.” As they see it, this sort of parallel could provide analogical grounds for also affirming “Jane is a person, caring about Jane is caring about people” and presumably also “neighbors are people, helping neighbors is helping people.” This category of cases the Mohists call “this and so,” (shì ér rán 是而然) because the first part of the utterance correctly states that something is “this” (shì 是) with respect to some kind name (as white or black horses are “this” with respect to ‘horse’), while the second part correctly states that some action is “so” (rán 然) with respect to some predicate (as riding white or black horses satisfies the predicate ‘riding horses’). Cases of the “this and so” kind (lèi 類) can be offered as analogical parallels to support other “this and so” utterances on the grounds that they present the same kind of case.
Now consider the utterance “carts are wood, riding carts is riding wood.” Structurally, this is parallel to the examples about horses. Yet the Mohists reject this utterance, presumably because they think the predicate “riding wood” is a nonsense phrase that is never “so,” since nothing satisfies it. The correct utterance to make in this case is “carts are wood, riding carts is not riding wood.” Rather than “this and so,” then, the cart example is of the kind “this but not so” (shì ér bù rán 是而不然). As with “this and so,” parallels between “this but not so” utterances can be drawn to support further “this but not so” utterances. For example, “carts are wood, riding carts isn’t riding wood” might be cited as a parallel to support “boats are wood, getting in boats isn’t getting in wood” and “houses are brick, living in houses isn’t living in brick.” Since paralleling reliably guides utterances only when used in cases of the same kind, however, dialecticians must carefully distinguish between cases properly treated as “this and so” and those properly treated as “this but not so.” Otherwise, they may draw faulty parallels, such as thinking that, since helping neighbors is helping people, living in houses is living in brick.
The underlying aim of the second half of the “Lesser Selection” is to clear up such confusion and by so doing lay the groundwork for defending Mohist positions. (Two positions mentioned specifically are those on capital punishment for bandits and on the rejection of fatalism.) Toward this end, the text identifies five kinds of cases in which “expressions” (cí 辭) are used differently. The first two are “this and so” and “this but not so”; the others are “not this but so,” “one universal and one not,” and “one this and one not this.” An effective way to illustrate the Mohists’ approach here is to consider their defense of capital punishment, which turns on the distinction between the first two kinds of cases. Mohist communities prohibited murder, punishing it by death. They also apparently advocated capital punishment for, or at least lethal self-defense against, the roving gangs of robbers who terrorized small communities and traveling merchants. The “Lesser Selection” implies that they were accused of inconsistency for these positions. Robbers are people, so killing robbers is killing people. If killing people is wrong, isn’t killing robbers wrong? Moreover, Mohist ethics advocates caring inclusively about all people. Since robbers are people, caring about robbers is caring about people. Killing them seems inconsistent with caring about them.
In response, the “Lesser Selection” contends that the critics are mistaken to claim that killing robbers is killing people and caring about robbers is caring about people. In the Mohists’ view, these are in fact cases of the kind “this but not so”: robbers are people, but killing robbers is not killing people, and caring about robbers is not caring about people. The “Lesser Selection” employs paralleling (móu 侔) to give the following explanation of the Mohist stance:
Jill’s parents are people; [but] Jill’s serving her parents isn’t serving people [it is not being employed as a servant].
Her brother is a handsome man; [but] caring about her brother isn’t caring about a handsome man [it is not sexual attraction].
Carts are wood; [but] riding carts isn’t riding wood.
Boats are wood; [but] getting in boats isn’t getting in wood.
Robber-people are people; [but] there being many robbers isn’t there being many people;
there being no robbers isn’t there being no people.
How do we clarify it?
Detesting there being many robbers isn’t detesting there being many people;
desiring there be no robbers isn’t desiring there be no people.
All the world accompany each other in together deeming these right (shì 是). If it is like this, then although robber-people are people,
caring about robbers isn’t caring about people [it is not practicing inclusive care];
not caring about robbers isn’t not caring about people [it is not failing to practice inclusive care];
killing robber-people isn’t killing people.
There’s no difficulty in this. These cases and those previous ones [the preceding, purportedly uncontroversial examples] are the same kind. The world accepts those without condemning themselves; the Mohists accept these but the world condemns them.…These are cases of “this but not so.”
On the grounds of parallelism with (supposedly) uncontroversial utterances that “all the world” purportedly agree are right, we are expected to affirm that killing robbers is not killing people and that not caring about robbers—being unconcerned for their benefit—is not failing to care about people. Since we acknowledge other, parallel “this but not so” cases, the text asserts, we should accept these as well. Just as lacking robbers isn’t lacking people, working on behalf of one’s parents isn’t working as a servant, and riding carts isn’t riding wood, executing robbers isn’t murdering people and not caring about them isn’t failing to practice inclusive care.
In contemporary terms, of course, we could reconstruct the passage as offering a somewhat bizarre analogical argument for the conclusion that “killing robber-people isn’t killing people.” The Mohists themselves do not understand it that way, however. They do not see the passage as presenting a series of premises for the one-sentence conclusion “killing robber-people isn’t killing people.” They see it as laying out a series of syntactically parallel utterances to illustrate that utterances like “robber-people are people, [but] killing robber-people isn’t killing people” and “robber-people are people, [but] caring about robbers isn’t caring about people” fit into an accepted pattern of statements describing a familiar kind of situation in which, although x is y, Fx is not deemed an act of the kind Fy.
The text gives no further, substantive explanation of this stance. The Mohists simply declare that the robbers case is “this but not so,” rather than “this and so,” and thus despite the obvious formal similarity between “riding black horses is riding horses” and “killing robber-people is killing people,” drawing parallels (móu 侔) between them is misleading. Previously, of course, the text explained that expressions of different kinds rest on different grounds (gù 故, reasons). On the Mohists’ behalf, then, we can conjecture that the grounds (gù) that justify applying the predicate ‘killing robbers’ diverge from those for ‘killing people’, such that when ‘killing robbers’ is “so,” ‘killing people’ is “not so.” Killing people is murder, the unjustified killing of innocents; killing robbers is the morally justified, legally sanctioned execution of guilty criminals. Similar considerations would apply to the predicates ‘caring about people’ and ‘caring about robbers’. For example, to the Mohists, caring about people entails concern for all people’s benefit; perhaps they hold that since robbers harm others, caring about them is incompatible with concern for all people’s benefit.
Still, what makes killing robbers a case of “this but not so” rather than “this and so”? Indeed, what is the basis for the entire fivefold taxonomy of cases? The Mohists answer neither question explicitly. Nor do they offer a principled or systematic diagnosis of the failures of syntactic parallelism. They simply stipulate that killing robbers belongs with the other examples under “this but not so.” A critic might respond that the entire “this but not so” group looks suspiciously ad hoc. Why isn’t Jill’s caring about her good-looking brother an instance of caring about a handsome man? Granted that sibling affection is different from sexual attraction, it is still care, in this case directed at a man who happens to be handsome. Similarly, granted that executing criminals is different from murder, it is still an event in which people are killed. The Mohists could probably have found a more compelling way to do justice to the distinctions at stake than by insisting on the apparently paradoxical claim—later attacked by Xunzi—that although robbers are people, killing robbers isn’t killing people. One promising alternative consistent with their program might have been to distinguish between different kinds of killing. They could have pointed out that ‘killing people’ refers generally to all kinds of actions in which one person causes another to die. These include a range of more specific kinds of actions, among them intentional, morally wrong killing of the innocent (murder) and community-sanctioned, morally justified killing of criminals (execution). Thus killing robbers could be an action of the kind killing people without being of the kind morally wrong killing.
This is roughly the approach that Xunzi adopts in handling a related issue. He contends that a general term, such as ‘honor’ or ‘disgrace’, can have two or more distinct uses, grounded in different bases or “starting points” (duān 端). The different uses can be specified by compounding (jiān 兼) names in a way that narrows their extension. He argues, for instance, that there are two kinds of honor and disgrace, “moral honor and disgrace” and “status honor and disgrace.” A person could be honored with high status while in fact being morally disgraceful or held in disgrace while in fact being morally honorable. The Mohists could similarly distinguish two kinds of killing people, “moral killing” and “immoral killing.”
Why don’t they? Part of the explanation, of course, may be simply that this route didn’t occur to them. Writing after the Mohists and probably building on their work, Xunzi (or his ghostwriter) seems to have improved on their semantic theory in this respect. Unlike the Mohists, who as we saw distinguish only three sorts of names—reaching, kind, and personal—Xunzi distinguishes many possible levels of general terms (gòng míng 共名), specifically explaining that, among general terms, a “compound” name (such as ‘moral killing’) and a “single” name (such as ‘killing’) can both refer to the same thing, the single name being more general. Xunzi’s approach might help to resolve some of the Mohists’ concerns about name compounding.
But there may be another, deeper explanation as well. The Mohists seem never to have moved fully beyond the one-name-one-thing view. The idea that each unit of language should denote some discrete kind (lèi 類), or part of reality, lingers in their treatment of the robbers example. Their study of name compounding showed that the extension of most phrases is not determined merely by summing the extensions of their component words. Unlike the case of ‘oxen-and-horses’, ‘white horse’ does not denote the sum of all white things and all horses. The semantics of phrases or “expressions” (cí 辭) requires a separate explanation of its own, beyond our explanation of the semantics of names (míng 名). Yet the robbers example shows the Mohists treating phrases the same way they handle names, attempting to pin down a one-to-one referential relation between ‘killing robbers’ or ‘caring about handsome men’ and distinct kinds of shí 實 (stuff, situations). They still seem to assume that the key to distinguishing kinds correctly and reliably lies in specifying the discrete kind of shí denoted by each expression. Specifying one-to-one reference relations in this way, so as to eliminate uncertainty or ambiguity in distinguishing the things denoted by each name, is precisely what texts such as the Analects, Xunzi, and The Annals of Lü Buwei call “rectifying names” (zhèng míng 正名). So, as Hansen observes (1992, 251), in the “Lesser Selection” the Mohists are in effect aiming to rectify phrases, instead of only names. They stipulate, for instance, that ‘killing people’ be used to refer only to a certain kind of shí (stuff, event, situation), distinct from that denoted by ‘killing robbers’. The simple one-name-one-thing view has no room for referential ambiguity or for terms of different scope, some of whose extensions fall within others. It holds that the extensions of different phrases must be distinct—as, on a commonsense interpretation, those of ‘killing robbers’ and ‘killing people’ are not—or confusion and error will result. But this view has counterintuitive consequences, and there are more compelling alternatives, as we have seen. To more fully exploit the resources provided by their approach to semantics, the Mohists needed to break with the one-name-one-thing model more decisively.
8. Concluding Remarks
In later Mohist philosophy, we see ancient Chinese thinkers making remarkable advances in ethics, philosophy of language, epistemology, and informal logic. In each of these areas, the Mohists develop credible, even brilliant theories and discover philosophical problems that they grapple with vigorously, if not always fully successfully. Their ethical theory is a tremendous achievement: history’s first explicit form of indirect consequentialism, grounded in a conception of benefit or welfare as what produces happiness. Their naturalistic semantic theory and epistemology offer an intriguing, non-mentalistic approach to language, mind, and knowledge, one that deserves further attention today. They pioneer the study of logic in China and develop an interesting theory of analogical argumentation, though making only limited progress in exploring cogency in analogical extension. And this is not to mention their investigations in metaphysics, mechanics, optics, and geometry. Regrettably, the Mohists’ multifaceted inquiries came to an end as their movement faded away during the first century of the former Han dynasty (206 B.C.E.–8 C.E.). Interest in issues inspired by language arose again among a few intellectuals during the later Han (25–220 C.E.) and the Wei-Jin period (220–589 C.E.), but in ethical theory, language, logic, and epistemology, later Chinese thinkers never surpassed the achievements of their classical forebears.
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Other Internet Resources
- Links for Chinese Religions and Philosophy, maintained by Joseph Adler (Kenyon College)
- Chinese Philosophy Links, maintained by Chris Fraser (University of Hong Kong)
- Chad Hansen’s Chinese philosophy pages, maintained by Chad Hansen (University of Hong Kong)
- List of China-related links, maintained by Stephen C. Angle (Wesleyan University)
I am grateful to Chad Hansen for numerous constructive comments on an earlier draft of this article, many of which have been incorporated into the present version.