Population Genetics

First published Fri Sep 22, 2006; substantive revision Thu Nov 24, 2022

Population genetics is a field of biology that studies the genetic composition of biological populations, and the changes in genetic composition that result from the operation of various factors, including natural selection. Population geneticists develop abstract mathematical models of gene frequency dynamics, extract predictions about the likely patterns of genetic variation in actual populations, and test the predictions against empirical data. A number of the more robust generalizations to emerge from population-genetic analysis are discussed below.

Population genetics is intimately bound up with the study of evolution and natural selection, and is often regarded as the theoretical cornerstone of evolutionary biology. This is because “evolution” has traditionally been defined as any change in a population’s genetic composition (though this definition has been criticized); and natural selection is one important factor (though not the only one) that can lead to such a change. Natural selection occurs when some variants in a population out-reproduce other variants as a result of being better adapted to the environment, or ‘fitter’. Presuming the fitness differences are at least partly due to genetic differences, this will cause the population’s genetic makeup to change, as the genetic variants associated with higher fitness increase in frequency. By devising models of gene frequency change, population geneticists are thus able to shed light on the genetic basis of evolutionary change, and to permit the consequences of different evolutionary hypotheses to be explored in a quantitatively precise way.

Population genetics came into being in the 1920s and 1930s, thanks to the work of R.A. Fisher, J.B.S. Haldane and Sewall Wright. Their achievement was to integrate the principles of Mendelian genetics, which had been rediscovered at the turn of century, with Darwinian natural selection. Though the compatibility of Darwinism with Mendelian genetics is today taken for granted, in the early years of the twentieth century it was not. Many of the early Mendelians did not accept Darwin’s ‘gradualist’ account of evolution, believing instead that novel adaptations must arise in a single mutational step; conversely, many of the early Darwinians did not believe in Mendelian inheritance, often because of the erroneous belief that it was incompatible with the process of evolutionary modification as described by Darwin. By working out mathematically the consequences of selection acting on a population obeying the Mendelian rules of inheritance, Fisher, Haldane and Wright showed that Darwinism and Mendelism were not just compatible but excellent bed fellows; this played a key part in the formation of the ‘neo-Darwinian synthesis’, and explains why population genetics came to occupy so pivotal a role in evolutionary theory.

Population genetics is an important branch of science, but why should philosophers care about it? There are a number of reasons. Firstly, Darwinian evolution has long been a fruitful source of ideas for philosophers working in a variety of areas, including philosophy of mind, ethics and political philosophy. (Recall Darwin’s famous comment “he who understands baboon would do more for metaphysics than Locke”). To properly understand evolution requires a grasp of basic population genetics, which provides one motivation for philosophers to learn about this field. Secondly, population genetics is a possible “testing ground” for ideas developed in general philosophy of science about idealization, explanation, the role of abstract models, and the interplay between theory and data. Thirdly, population genetics features prominently in many debates in philosophy of biology over issues including the nature of evolutionary causation, the logic of selective explanation, the role of chance in evolution, and the relation between population-level and individual-level processes. Finally, population genetics is indirectly relevant to certain other philosophical debates, such as the debate over the reality of biological race, for example.

The discussion below is structured as follows. Section 1 briefly outlines the origins of population genetics, focusing on major themes and controversies. Section 2 explains the Hardy-Weinberg principle, the starting point of much population-genetic analysis. Section 3 outlines some elementary models in population genetics and their consequences. Section 4 discusses random drift (the chance fluctuations in gene frequency that arise in finite populations), and coalescence (the joining up of gene lineages as we trace them back in time). Section 5 discusses the status of population genetics in biology. Section 6 examines some of the philosophical issues raised by population genetics.

1. The Origins of Population Genetics

To understand how population genetics came into being, and to appreciate its intellectual significance, a brief excursion into the history of biology is necessary. Darwin’s Origin of Species, published in 1859, propounded two main theses: firstly, that modern species were descended from common ancestors, and secondly that the process of natural selection was the major mechanism of evolutionary change. The first thesis quickly won acceptance in the scientific community, but the second did not. Many people found it difficult to accept that natural selection could play the explanatory role required of it by Darwin’s theory. This situation—accepting that evolution had happened but doubting Darwin’s account of what had caused it to happen—persisted well into the twentieth century (Bowler 1988).

Opposition to natural selection was understandable, for Darwin’s theory, though compelling, contained a major lacuna: an account of the mechanism of inheritance. For evolution by natural selection to occur, it is necessary that parents should tend to resemble their offspring; otherwise, fitness-enhancing traits will have no tendency to spread through a population. In the Origin, Darwin rested his argument on the observed fact that offspring do tend to resemble their parents—‘the strong principle of inheritance’—while admitting that he did not know why this was. Darwin did later attempt an explicit theory of inheritance, based on hypothetical entities called ‘gemmules’, but it turned out to have no basis in fact.

Darwin was troubled by not having a proper understanding of the inheritance mechanism, for it left him unable to rebut a powerful objection to his theory. For a population to evolve by natural selection, the members of the population must vary—if all organisms are identical, no selection can occur. So for selection to gradually modify a population over a long period of time, in the manner suggested by Darwin, a continual supply of variation is needed. Fleeming Jenkin argued that the available variation would be used up too fast (Jenkin 1867). His reasoning assumed a ‘blending’ theory of inheritance, i.e., that an offspring’s phenotypic traits are a ‘blend’ of those of its parents. (So for example, if a short and a tall organism mate, the height of the offspring will be intermediate between the two.) Jenkin argued that given blending inheritance, a sexually reproducing population will become phenotypically homogenous in just a few generations, far shorter than the number of generations needed for natural selection to produce complex adaptations.

Fortunately for Darwin’s theory, inheritance does not actually work the way Jenkin thought. The type of inheritance that we call ‘Mendelian’, after Gregor Mendel, is ‘particulate’ rather than ‘blending’—offspring inherit discrete hereditary particles (genes) from their parents, which means that sexual reproduction does not diminish the heritable variation present in the population. (See section 2, ‘The Hardy-Weinberg Principle’.) However this realisation took a long time to come, for two reasons. Firstly, Mendel’s work was overlooked by the scientific community for forty years. Secondly, even after the rediscovery of Mendel’s work at the turn of the twentieth century, it was widely believed that Darwinian evolution and Mendelian inheritance were incompatible. The early Mendelians did not accept that natural selection played an important role in evolution, so were not well placed to see that Mendel had given Darwin’s theory the lifeline it needed. The synthesis of Darwinism and Mendelism, which marked the birth of population genetics, was achieved by a long and tortuous route (Provine 1971).

The key ideas behind Mendel’s theory of inheritance are straightforward. In his experimental work on pea plants, Mendel observed an unusual phenomenon. He began with two ‘pure breeding’ lines, one producing plants with round seeds, the other wrinkled seeds. He then crossed these to produce the first daughter generation (the F1 generation). The F1 plants all had round seeds—the wrinkled trait had disappeared from the population. Mendel then crossed the F1 plants with each other to produce the F2 generation. Strikingly, approximately one quarter of the F2 plants had wrinkled seeds. So the wrinkled trait had made a comeback, skipping a generation.

These and similar observations were explained by Mendel as follows. He hypothesised that each plant contains a pair of ‘factors’ that together determine some aspect of its phenotype—in this case, seed shape. A plant inherits one factor from each of its parents. Suppose that there is one factor for round seeds \((R)\), another for wrinkled seeds \((W)\). There are then three possible types of plant: \(RR,\) \(RW\) and \(WW\). An \(RR\) plant will have round seeds, a \(WW\) plant wrinkled seeds. What about an \(RW\) plant? Mendel suggested that it would have round seeds—the \(R\) factor is ‘dominant’ over the \(W\) factor. The observations could then be easily explained. The initial pure-breeding lines were \(RR\) and \(WW\). The F1 plants were formed by \(RR \times WW\) crosses, so were all of the \(RW\) type and thus had round seeds. The F2 plants were formed by \(RW \times RW\) crosses, so contained a mixture of the \(RR, RW\) and \(WW\) types. If we assume that each \(RW\) parent transmits the \(R\) and \(W\) factors to its offspring with equal probability, then the F2 plants would contain \(RR, RW\) and \(WW\) in approximately the ratio 1:2:1. (This assumption is known as Mendel’s First Law or The Law of Segregation.) Since \(RR\) and \(RW\) both have round seeds, this explains why three quarters of the F2 plants had round seeds, one quarter wrinkled seeds.

Our understanding of heredity today is vastly more sophisticated than Mendel’s, but the key elements of Mendel’s theory—discrete hereditary particles that come in different types, dominance and recessiveness, and the law of segregation—have turned out to be essentially correct. Mendel’s ‘factors’ are the genes of population genetics, and the alternative forms that a factor can take (e.g., \(R\) versus \(W\) in the pea plant example) are known as the alleles of a gene. The law of segregation is explained by the fact that during gametogenesis, each gamete (sex cell) receives only one of each chromosome pair from its parent organism. Other aspects of Mendel’s theory have been modified in the light of later discoveries. Mendel thought that most phenotypic traits were controlled by a single pair of factors, like seed shape in his pea plants, but it is now known that most traits are affected by many pairs of genes, not just one. Mendel believed that the pairs of factors responsible for different traits (e.g., seed shape and flower colour) segregated independently of each other, but we now know that this need not be so (see section 3.5, ‘Two-Locus Models and Linkage’, below). Despite these points, Mendel’s theory marks a turning point in our understanding of inheritance.

The rediscovery of Mendel’s work in 1900 did not lead the scientific community to be converted to Mendelism overnight. The dominant approach to the study of heredity at the time was biometry, spearheaded by Karl Pearson in London, which involved statistical analysis of the phenotypic variation found in natural populations. Biometricians were mainly interested in continuously varying traits such as height, rather than the ‘discrete’ traits such as seed shape that Mendel studied, and were generally believers in Darwinian gradualism. Opposed to the biometricians were the Mendelians, spearheaded by William Bateson, who emphasized discontinuous variation, and believed that major adaptive change could be produced by single mutational steps, rather than by cumulative natural selection à la Darwin. A heated controversy between the biometricians and the Mendelians ensued. As a result, Mendelian inheritance came to be associated with an anti-Darwinian view of evolution.

Population genetics arose in part from the need to reconcile Mendel with Darwin, a need which became increasingly urgent as the empirical evidence for Mendelian inheritance began to pile up. A significant milestone was R.A. Fisher’s 1918 paper, ‘The Correlation between Relatives on the Supposition of Mendelian Inheritance’, which showed how the biometrical and Mendelian research traditions could be unified. Fisher demonstrated that if a given continuous trait, e.g., height, was affected by a large number of Mendelian factors, each of which made a small difference to the trait, then the trait would show an approximately normal distribution in a population. Since the Darwinian process was widely believed to work best on continuously varying traits, showing that the distribution of such traits was compatible with Mendelism was an important step towards reconciling Darwin with Mendel.

The full reconciliation was achieved in the 1920s and early 30s, thanks to the mathematical work of Fisher, Haldane and Wright (Fisher 1930, Haldane 1930–32, Wright 1931). These theorists developed formal models to explore how natural selection, and other evolutionary factors such as mutation and random drift, would modify the genetic composition of a Mendelian population over time. This work marked a major step forward in evolutionary biology, for it enabled the consequences of various evolutionary hypotheses to be explored quantitatively rather than just qualitatively. Verbal arguments about what natural selection could or could not achieve, or about the patterns of genetic variation to which it would give rise, were replaced with explicit mathematical arguments. The strategy of devising formal models to shed light on the evolutionary process remains the dominant methodology of population genetics today, though unlike in the 1930s, today’s modellers have a wealth of empirical data against which to test their predictions (Hartl 2020).

Fisher and Haldane were both strong Darwinians—they believed that natural selection was the most important factor affecting a population’s genetic composition. Wright did not downplay the role of natural selection, but he believed that chance also played a crucial role, as did migration between the constituent sub-populations of a species (See sections 4, ‘Random Drift’, and 3.3, ‘Migration’.) The respective roles of natural selection and chance (or random drift) in shaping genetic variation, both within and between species, became a major theme in population genetics, and is still a live issue today. The issue lay at the heart of the “neutralist versus selectionist” controversy of the 1960s and 1970. The neutralists, led by Motoo Kimura, argued that much of the molecular genetic variation found in natural populations was likely to be neutral, i.e., the different genetic variants at a given locus were mostly selectively equivalent (Kimura 1977, 1994). If true, this suggests a significant role for random drift. Though initially controversial, the idea of abundant neutral variation in DNA sequence is today quite standard (Jensen et al. 2019); though this is fully compatible with natural selection playing the major role in adaptive evolution (Kern and Hahn 2018).

Contemporary population genetics takes place in a very different scientific landscape to the one inhabited by Fisher, Haldane and Wright. They were working in the pre-molecular biology era, when the “gene” was a purely theoretical entity, posited to explain observed patterns of inheritance, but whose structure and molecular composition were unknown. Genetic variation could thus only be observed indirectly, though the phenotypic variation to which it (sometimes) gave rise. This meant that there was very little empirical data against which population genetic models could be tested; so the enterprise remained an essentially theoretical one. In the intervening century, the gene has gone from being a theoretical posit to being an entity whose molecular structure and functioning is understood in great detail. Since the 1980s, the technology for gene sequencing, i.e., determining the sequence of nucleotide bases in a length of DNA, has become increasingly fast and cheap. This has allowed population geneticists to directly study the genetic variation found in natural populations, by sampling a number of individuals and sequencing a gene of interest (or in some cases the whole genome). As a result, population genetics is now a “data rich” science, the polar opposite of the situation when the field was founded. Despite this, many of the models, techniques and conclusions provided by the earlier theoretical work remain directly relevant today (Charlesworth and Charlesworth 2017).

2. The Hardy-Weinberg Principle

The Hardy-Weinberg principle, discovered independently by G.H. Hardy and W. Weinberg in 1908, is one of the simplest and most important principles in population genetics (Hardy 1908, Weinberg 1908). To illustrate the principle, consider a large population of sexually reproducing organisms. The organisms are diploids, meaning that they contain two copies of each chromosome, one received from each parent. The gametes they produce are haploid, meaning that they contain only one of each chromosome pair. During sexual fusion, two haploid gametes fuse to form a diploid zygote, which then grows and develops into an adult organism. Most multi-celled animals and many plants have a lifecycle of this sort.

Suppose that at a given locus, or chromosomal ‘slot’, there are two possible alleles, \(A_1\) and \(A_2\); the locus is assumed to be on an autosome, not a sex chromosome. With respect to the locus in question, there are three possible genotypes in the population, \(A_1 A_1, A_1 A_2\) and \(A_2 A_2\) (just as in Mendel’s pea plant example above). Organisms with the \(A_1 A_1\) and \(A_2 A_2\) genotypes are called homozygotes; those with the \(A_1 A_2\) genotype are heterozygotes. The proportions, or relative frequencies, of the three genotypes in the overall population may be denoted \(f(A_1 A_1), f(A_1 A_2)\) and \(f(A_2 A_2)\) respectively, where \(f(A_1 A_1) + f(A_1 A_2) + f(A_2 A_2) = 1\). It is assumed that these genotypic frequencies are the same for both males and females. The relative frequencies of the \(A\) and \(B\) alleles in the population are denoted \(p\) and \(q\), where \(p = f(A_1 A_1) + \frac{1}{2}f(A_1 A_2)\) and \(q = f(A_2 A_2) + \frac{1}{2}f(A_1 A_2).\) Note that \(p + q = 1\).

The Hardy-Weinberg principle is about the relation between the allelic and the genotypic frequencies. It states that if mating is random in the population, and if natural selection, mutation, migration and drift are absent, then in the offspring generation the genotypic and allelic frequencies will be related by the following simple equations:

\[\begin{align} f(A_1 A_1) &= p^2, \\ f(A_1 A_2) &= 2pq, \\ f(A_2 A_2) &= q^2 \end{align}\]

Random mating means the absence of a genotypic correlation between mating partners, i.e., the probability that a given organism mates with an \(A_1 A_1\) partner, for example, does not depend on the organism’s own genotype, and similarly for the other two genotypes.

That random mating will lead the genotypes to be in the above proportions (“Hardy-Weinberg proportions”) is a consequence of Mendel’s law of segregation. To see this, note that random mating is in effect equivalent to offspring being formed by randomly picking pairs of gametes from a large ‘gamete pool’ and fusing them into a zygote. The gamete pool contains all the successful gametes of the parent organisms. Since we are assuming the absence of selection, all parents contribute equal numbers of gametes to the pool. By the law of segregation, an \(A_1 A_2\) heterozygote produces gametes bearing the \(A_1\) and \(A_2\) alleles in equal proportion (on average). Therefore, the relative frequencies of the \(A\) and \(B\) alleles in the gamete pool will be the same as in the parental population, namely \(p\) and \(q\) respectively. Given that the gamete pool is very large, when we pick pairs of gametes from the pool at random, we will get the ordered genotypic pairs \(\{A_1 A_1\},\) \(\{A_1 A_2\},\) \(\{A_2 A_1\},\) \(\{A_2 A_2\}\) in the proportions \(p^2 :pq:qp:q^2\). But order does not matter, so we can regard the \(\{A_1 A_2\}\) and \(\{A_2 A_1\}\) pairs as equivalent, giving the Hardy-Weinberg proportions for the unordered offspring genotypes.

This simple derivation of the Hardy-Weinberg principle deals with two alleles at a single locus, but can easily be extended to multiple alleles. (Extension to more than one locus is trickier; see section 3.6 below.) For the multi-allelic case, suppose there are \(n\) alleles at the locus, \(A_1 \ldots A_n\), with relative frequencies of \(p_1 \ldots p_n\) respectively, where \(p_1 + p_2 + \ldots + p_n = 1\). Assuming again that the population is large, mating is random, evolutionary forces are absent, and Mendel’s law of segregation holds, then in the offspring generation the frequency of the \(A_i A_i\) genotype will be \(p_i^2\), and the frequency of the (unordered) \(A_i A_j\) genotype \((i \ne j)\) will be \(2p_i p_j\). Note that the two allele case is a special case of this generalized principle.

Importantly, whatever the initial genotypic proportions, random mating will automatically produce offspring in Hardy-Weinberg proportions (for one-locus genotypes). So if generations are non-overlapping, i.e., parents die as soon as they have reproduced, just one round of random mating is needed to bring about Hardy-Weinberg proportions in the whole population; if generations overlap, more than one round of random mating is needed. Once Hardy-Weinberg proportions have been achieved, they will be maintained in subsequent generations so long as the population continues to mate at random and is unaffected by evolutionary forces. The population is then said to be in Hardy-Weinberg equilibrium—meaning that the genotypic frequencies are constant from generation to generation.

The importance of the Hardy-Weinberg principle lies in the fact that it contains the solution to the problem of blending inheritance that troubled Darwin. Jenkin’s argument that sexual reproduction will rapidly diminish the variation in a population is disproved by the Hardy-Weinberg principle. Sexual reproduction has no inherent tendency to destroy genotypic variation, for the genotypic proportions remain constant over generations, given the assumptions noted above. It is true that natural selection often tends to destroy variation, and is thus a homogenizing force; but this is a quite different matter. The ‘blending’ objection was that sexual mixing itself would produce homogeneity, even in the absence of selection, and the Hardy-Weinberg principle shows that this is untrue.

Another benefit of the Hardy-Weinberg principle is that it greatly simplifies the task of modelling evolutionary change. When a population is in Hardy-Weinberg equilibrium, it is possible to track the genotypic composition of the population by directly tracking the allelic frequencies (or gametic frequencies). That this is so is clear—for if we know the relative frequencies of all the alleles (at a single locus), and know that the population is in Hardy-Weinberg equilibrium, the entire genotype frequency distribution can be easily computed. Were the population not in Hardy-Weinberg equilibrium, we would need to explicitly track the genotype frequencies themselves, which is more complicated.

Primarily for this reason, many population-genetic models assume that Hardy-Weinberg equilibrium obtains; this is tantamount to assuming that mating is random with respect to genotype. But is this assumption empirically plausible? The answer is sometimes but not always. In the human population, for example, mating is close to random with respect to ABO blood group, so the genotype that determines blood group is found in approximately Hardy-Weinberg proportions in many populations (Hartl and Clark 2006). But mating is not random with respect to height; on the contrary, people tend to choose mates similar in height to themselves. So if we consider a genotype that influences height, mating will not be random with respect to this genotype (see section 3.4 ‘Non-Random Mating’).

The population geneticist W.J. Ewens has written of the Hardy-Weinberg principle, “it does not often happen that the most important theorem in any subject is the easiest and most readily derived theorem for that subject” (1969, p. 1). The main importance of the principle, as Ewens stresses, is not the gain in mathematical simplicity that it permits, which is simply a beneficial side effect, but rather what it teaches us about the preservation of genetic variation in a sexually reproducing population.

3. Population-Genetic Models of Evolution

Evolutionary biologists often define ‘evolution’ as any change in a population’s genetic composition over time. The rationale for this definition is the idea that all other aspects of evolution, e.g., the spread of novel phenotypic traits and the formation of new species, stem ultimately from changes in gene frequencies within populations. The four factors that can bring about such a change are: natural selection, mutation, random genetic drift, and migration into or out of the population. (A fifth factor—changes to the mating pattern—can change the genotype but not the gene frequencies; many theorists would not count this as an evolutionary change.) A brief introduction to the standard population-genetic treatment of each of these factors is given below.

3.1 Selection at One Locus

Natural selection occurs when some variants in a population enjoy a survival or reproductive advantage over others. The simplest population-genetic model of natural selection focuses on a single autosomal locus with two alleles, \(A_1\) and \(A_2\), in a large population. Random mating is assumed. The three diploid genotypes \(A_1 A_1,\) \(A_1 A_2\) and \(A_2 A_2\) have different fitnesses, denoted by \(w_{11},\) \(w_{12}\) and \(w_{22}\) respectively. These fitnesses are assumed to be constant across generations. A genotype’s fitness may be defined, in this context, as the average number of successful gametes that an organism of that genotype contributes to the next generation—which depends on how well the organism survives, how many matings it achieves, and how fertile it is. Unless \(w_{11},\) \(w_{12}\) and \(w_{22}\) are all equal, then natural selection will occur, which may lead the genetic composition of the population to change.

Suppose that initially, i.e., before selection has operated, the zygote genotypes are in Hardy-Weinberg proportions and the frequencies of the \(A_1\) and \(A_2\) alleles are \(p\) and \(q\) respectively, where \(p + q = 1\). The zygotes then grow to adulthood and reproduce, giving rise to a new generation of offspring zygotes. Our task is to compute the frequencies of \(A_1\) and \(A_2\) in the second generation; let us denote these by \(p'\) and \(q'\) respectively, where \(p' + q' = 1\). (Note that in both generations, we consider gene frequencies at the zygotic stage; these may differ from the adult gene frequencies if there is differential survivorship.)

In the first generation, the genotypic frequencies at the zygotic stage are \(p^2 , 2pq\) and \(q^2\) for \(A_1 A_1,\) \(A_1 A_2,\) \(A_2 A_2\) respectively, by the Hardy-Weinberg principle. The three genotypes produce successful gametes in proportion to their fitnesses, i.e., in the ratio \(w_{11}:w_{12}:w_{22}\). The average fitness in the population is \(w = p^2 w_{11} + 2pq w_{12} + q^2 w_{22}\). Assuming there is no mutation, and that Mendel’s law of segregation holds, then an \(A_1 A_1\) organism will produce only \(A_1\) gametes, an \(A_2 A_2\) organism will produce only \(A_2\) gametes, and an \(A_1 A_2\) organism will produce \(A_1\) and \(A_2\) gametes in equal proportion (on average). Therefore, the proportion of \(A_1\) gametes, and thus the frequency of the \(A_1\) allele in the second generation at the zygotic stage, is:

\[\tag{1} \begin{align} p' &= \frac{p^2 w_{11} + \frac{1}{2} (2pq w_{12})}{w} \\ &= \frac{p^2 w_{11} + pq w_{12}}{w} \end{align}\]

Equation (1) is known as a ‘recurrence’ equation—it expresses the frequency of the \(A_1\) allele in the second generation in terms of its frequency in the first generation. The change in frequency between generations can then be written as:

\[\tag{2} \begin{align} \Delta p &= p' - p \\ &= \frac{p^2 w_{11} + pq w_{12}}{w} - p \\ &= \frac{pq[p(w_{11} - w_{12}) + q(w_{12} - w_{22})]}{w} \end{align}\]

If \(\Delta p \gt 0\), then natural selection has led the \(A_1\) allele to increase in frequency; if \(\Delta p \lt 0\) then selection has led the \(A_2\) allele to increase in frequency. If \(\Delta p = 0\) then no gene frequency change has occurred, i.e., the system is in allelic equilibrium. (Note, however, that the condition \(\Delta p = 0\) does not imply that no natural selection has occurred; the condition for that is \(w_{11} = w_{12} = w_{22}\). It is possible for natural selection to occur but to have no effect on gene frequencies.)

Equations (1) and (2) show, in precise terms, how fitness differences between genotypes will lead to evolutionary change. This enables us to explore the consequences of various different selective regimes.

Suppose firstly that \(w_{11} \gt w_{12} \gt w_{22}\), i.e., the \(A_1 A_1\) homozygote is fitter than the \(A_1 A_2\) heterozygote, which in turn is fitter than the \(A_2 A_2\) homozygote. By inspection of equation (2), we can see that \(\Delta p\) must be positive (so long as neither \(p\) nor \(q\) is zero). So in each generation, the frequency of the \(A_1\) allele will be greater than in the previous generation, until it eventually reaches fixation. Once the \(A_1\) allele reaches fixation, i.e., \(p = 1\) and \(q = 0\), no further evolutionary change will occur, for if \(p = 1\) then \(\Delta p = 0\). This makes good sense intuitively: since the \(A_1\) allele confers a fitness advantage on organisms that carry it, its relative frequency in the population will increase from generation to generation until it is fixed.

It is obvious that analogous reasoning applies in the case where \(w_{22} \gt w_{12} \gt w_{11}\). Equation (2) tells us that \(\Delta p\) must then be negative, so long as neither \(p\) nor \(q\) is zero, so the \(A_2\) allele will sweep to fixation.

A more interesting situation arises when the heterozygote is superior in fitness to both of the homozygotes, i.e., \(w_{12} \gt w_{11}\) and \(w_{12} \gt w_{22}\)—a phenomenon known as heteroygote superiority. Intuitively it is clear what should happen in this situation: an equilibrium situation should be reached in which both alleles are present in the population. Equation (2) confirms this intuition. It is easy to see that \(\Delta p = 0\) if either allele has gone to fixation (i.e., if \(p = 0\) or \(q = 0)\), or, thirdly, if the following condition obtains:

\[ p(w_{11} - w_{12}) + q(w_{12} - w_{22}) = 0 \]

which reduces to

\[ p = p^* = \frac{(w_{12} - w_{22})}{(w_{12} - w_{22}) + (w_{12} - w_{11})} \]

(The asterisk indicates that this is an equilibrium condition.) Since \(p\) must be non-negative, this condition can only be satisfied if there is heterozygote superiority or inferiority; it represents an equilibrium state of the population in which both alleles are present. This equilibrium is known as polymorphic, by contrast with the monomorphic equilibria that arise when either of the alleles has gone to fixation. The possibility of polymorphic equilibrium is quite significant. It teaches us that natural selection will not always lead to homogeneity; in some cases, selection preserves the genetic variation found in a population.

Numerous evolutionary questions can be addressed using simple population-genetic models of this sort. For example, by incorporating a parameter which measures the fitness differences between genotypes, we can study the rate of evolutionary change, permitting us to ask questions such as: how long will it take for selection to increase the frequency of the \(A_1\) allele from 0.1 to 0.9? If a given deleterious allele is recessive, how much longer will it take to eliminate it from the population than if it were dominant? In this way, population genetics converted the theory of evolution into a quantitatively precise one.

The one-locus model outlined above is unlikely to apply to many real-life populations, due to the simplifying assumptions it makes. In reality, selection is rarely the only evolutionary force in operation, genotypic fitnesses are unlikely to be constant across generations, Mendelian segregation does not always hold exactly, and not all evolving populations are large. Much effort in population genetics has been put into making more realistic models which relax these assumptions and are thus more complicated. But the one-locus model illustrates the essence of the population-genetic analysis of evolutionary change.

3.2 Selection-Mutation Balance

Mutation is the ultimate source of genetic variation, preventing populations from becoming genetically homogeneous. Once mutation is taken into account, the conclusions drawn in the previous section need to be modified. Even if one allele is selectively superior to all others at a given locus, it will not become fixed in the population; recurrent mutation will ensure that other alleles are present at low frequency, thus maintaining a degree of polymorphism. Population geneticists have long been interested in exploring what happens when selection and mutation act simultaneously.

Continuing with our one locus, two allele model, suppose that the \(A_1\) allele is selectively superior to \(A_2\), but recurrent mutation from \(A_1\) to \(A_2\) prevents \(A_1\) from spreading to fixation. The rate of mutation from \(A_1\) to \(A_2\) per generation, i.e., the proportion of \(A_1\) alleles that mutate every generation, is denoted \(u\). (Empirical estimates of mutation rates are typically in the region of \(10^{-6}\).) Back mutation from \(A_2\) to \(A_1\) can be ignored, because we are assuming that the \(A_2\) allele is at a very low frequency in the population, thanks to natural selection. What happens to the gene frequency dynamics under these assumptions? Recall equation (1) above, which expresses the frequency of the \(A_1\) allele in terms of its frequency in the previous generation. Since a certain fraction \((u)\) of the \(A_1\) alleles will have mutated to \(A_2\), this recurrence equation must be modified to:

\[ p' = \frac{(p^2 w_{11} + pq w_{12}) (1 - u)}{w} \]

to take account of mutation. As before, equilibrium is reached when \(p' = p\), i.e., \(\Delta p = 0\). The condition for equilibrium is therefore:

\[\tag{3} p = p^* = \frac{(p^2 w_{11} + pq w_{12}) (1 - u)}{w} \]

A useful simplification of equation (3) can be achieved by making some assumptions about the genotype fitnesses, and adopting a new notation. Let us suppose that the \(A_2\) allele is completely recessive (as is often the case for deleterious mutants). This means that the \(A_1 A_1\) and \(A_1 A_2\) genotypes have identical fitness. Therefore, genotypic fitnesses can be written \(w_{11} = 1,\) \(w_{12} = 1,\) \(w_{22} = 1 - s,\) where \(s\) denotes the difference in fitness of the \(A_2 A_2\) homozygote from that of the other two genotypes. \((s\) is known as the selection coefficient against \(A_2 A_2)\). Since we are assuming that the \(A_2\) allele is deleterious, it follows that \(s \gt 0\). Substituting these genotype fitnesses in equation (3) yields:

\[ p^* = \frac{p (1 - u)}{p^2 + 2pq + q^2 (1 - s)} \]

which reduces to:

\[ p^* = 1 - \left(\frac{u}{s}\right)^{\frac{1}{2}} \]

or equivalently (since \(p + q = 1)\):

\[\tag{4} q^* = \left(\frac{u}{s}\right)^{\frac{1}{2}} \]

Equation (4) gives the equilibrium frequency of the \(A_2\) allele, under the assumption that it is completely recessive. Note that as \(u\) increases, \(q\)* increases too. This is highly intuitive: the greater the mutation rate from \(A_1\) to \(A_2\), the greater the frequency of \(A_2\) that can be maintained at equilibrium, for a given value of \(s\). Conversely, as \(s\) increases, \(q\)* decreases. This is also intuitive: the stronger the selection against the \(A_2 A_2\) homozygote, the lower the equilibrium frequency of \(A_2\), for a given value of \(u\).

It is easy to see why equation (4) is said to describe selection-mutation balance—natural selection is continually removing \(A_2\) alleles from the population, while mutation is continually re-creating them. Equation (4) tells us the equilibrium frequency of \(A_2\) that will be maintained, as a function of the rate of mutation from \(A_1\) to \(A_2\) and the magnitude of the selective disadvantage suffered by the \(A_2 A_2\) homozygote. Though equation (4) was derived under the assumption that the \(A_2\) allele is completely recessive, it is straightforward to derive similar equations for the cases where the \(A_2\) allele is dominant, or partially dominant. In those cases, \(A_2\)’s equilibrium frequency will be lower than if it is completely recessive; for selection is more efficient at removing it from the population. A deleterious allele that is recessive can ‘hide’ in heterozygotes, and thus escape the purging power of selection, but a dominant allele cannot.

Our discussion in this section has focused on deleterious mutations, i.e., ones which reduce the fitness of their host organism. This may seem odd, given that beneficial mutations play a key role in the evolutionary process. The reason is that in population genetics, a major concern is to understand the causes of the genetic variability found in biological populations. If a gene is beneficial, natural selection is likely to be the major determinant of its equilibrium frequency; the rate of sporadic mutation to that gene will play at most a minor role. It is only where a gene is deleterious that mutation plays a major role in maintaining it in a population.

3.3 Migration

Migration into or out of a population is a third factor that can affect its genetic composition. Obviously, if immigrants are genetically different from the population they are entering, this will cause the population’s genetic composition to change. The evolutionary importance of migration stems from the fact that many species are composed of a number of distinct subpopulations, largely isolated from each other but connected by occasional migration. Migration between subpopulations gives rise to gene flow, which acts as a sort of ‘glue’, limiting the extent to which subpopulations can diverge from each other genetically.

The simplest model for analysing migration assumes that a given population receives a number of migrants each generation, but sends out no emigrants. Suppose the frequency of the \(A_1\) allele in the resident population is \(p\), and the frequency of the \(A_1\) allele among the migrants arriving in the population is \(p_m\). The proportion of migrants coming into the population each generation is \(m\) (i.e., as a proportion of the resident population.) So post-migration, the frequency of the \(A_1\) allele in the population is:

\[ p' = (1 - m) p + mp_m \]

The change in gene frequency across generations is therefore:

\[\begin{align} \Delta p &= p' - p \\ &= -m(p - p_m) \end{align}\]

Therefore, migration will increase the frequency of the \(A_1\) allele if \(p_m \gt p\), decrease its frequency if \(p \gt p_m\), and leave its frequency unchanged if \(p = p_m\). We can then derive an equation giving the gene frequency in generation \(t\) as a function of its initial frequency and the rate of migration::

\[ p_t = p_m + (p_0 - p_m)(1 - m)^t \]

where \(p_0\) is the initial frequency of the \(A_1\) allele in the population, i.e., before any migration has taken place. Since the expression \((1 - m)^t\) tends towards zero as \(t\) grows large, it follows that equilibrium will eventually be reached when \(p_t = p_m\), i.e., when the gene frequency of the migrants equals the gene frequency of the resident population.

This simple model assumes that migration is the only factor affecting gene frequency at the locus, but this is unlikely to be the case. So it is necessary to consider how migration will interact with selection, drift and mutation (cf. Rice 2004, ch.5). A balance between migration and selection can lead to the maintenance of a deleterious allele in a population, in a manner analogous to mutation-selection balance. The interaction between migration and drift is especially interesting. Genetic drift will often lead the separate subpopulations of a species to diverge genetically. Migration opposes this trend—it is a homogenising force that tends to make subpopulations more alike. Mathematical models suggest that that even a fairly small rate of migration will be sufficient to prevent the subpopulations of a species from diverging genetically (Hartl and Clark 2006). Some theorists have used this to argue against the evolutionary importance of group selection, on the grounds that genetic differences between groups, which are essential for group selection to operate, are unlikely to persist in the face of migration.

3.4 Non-Random Mating

Recall that the Hardy-Weinberg principle was derived under the assumption of random mating. But departures from random mating are actually quite common. Organisms may tend to choose mates who are similar to them phenotypically or genotypically—a mating system known as ‘positive assortment’. Alternatively, organisms may choose mates dissimilar to them—‘negative assortment’. Another type of departure from random mating is inbreeding, or preferentially mating with relatives.

Analysing the consequences of non-random mating gets quite complicated, but some conclusions are fairly easily seen. Firstly, non-random mating does not in itself affect gene frequencies (so arguably is not an evolutionary ‘force’ on a par with selection, mutation and migration); rather, it affects genotype frequencies. To appreciate this point, note that the gene frequency of a population, at the zygotic stage, is equal to the gene frequency in the pool of successful gametes from which the zygotes are formed. The pattern of mating simply determines the way in which haploid gametes are ‘packaged’ into diploid zygotes. Thus if a random mating population suddenly starts to mate non-randomly, this will have no effect on gene frequencies.

Secondly, positive assortative mating will tend to decrease the proportion of heterozygotes in the population,. To see this, consider again a single locus with two alleles, \(A_1\) and \(A_2\), with frequencies \(p\) and \(q\) in a given population. Suppose that initially the population is at Hardy-Weinberg equilibrium, so the proportion of \(A_1 A_2\) heterozygotes is \(2pq\). If the population then starts to mate completely assortatively, i.e., mating only occurs between organisms of identical genotype, it is obvious that the proportion of heterozygotes must decline. For \(A_1 A_1 \times A_1 A_1\) and \(A_2 A_2 \times A_2 A_2\) matings will produce no heterozygotes; and only half the progeny of \(A_1 A_2 \times A_1 A_2\) matings will be heterozygotic (on average). So the proportion of heterozygotes in the second generation must be less than \(2pq\). Conversely, negative assortment will tend to increase the proportion of heterozygotes from what it would be under Hardy-Weinberg equilibrium.

What about inbreeding? In general, inbreeding will tend to increase the homozygosity of a population, like positive assortment (Hartl 2020, ch. 3). This is because relatives tend to be genotypically similar. Inbreeding often has negative effects on organismic fitness—a phenomenon known as ‘inbreeding depression’. The explanation for this is that deleterious alleles often tend to be recessive, so have no phenotypic effect when found in heterozygotes. Inbreeding reduces the proportion of heterozygotes, making recessive alleles more likely to be found in homozygotes where their negative phenotypic effects become apparent. The converse phenomenon—‘hybrid vigour’ resulting from outbreeding—is widely utilised by animal and plant breeders.

3.5 Two-Locus Models and Linkage

The one-locus model outlined above is unrealistic, since in practice evolution may occur at multiple loci simultaneously. The simplest two-locus model assumes two autosomal loci, \(A\) and \(B\), each with two alleles, \(A_1\) and \(A_2, B_1\) and \(B_2\). Thus there are four types of haploid gamete in the population—\(A_1 B_1, A_1 B_2, A_2 B_1\) and \(A_2 B_2\)—whose frequencies we will denote by \(x_1, x_2, x_3\) and \(x_4\) respectively. (Note that the \(x_i\) are not allele frequencies; in the two-locus case, we cannot equate ‘gamete frequency’ with ‘allelic frequency’, as is possible for a single locus.) Diploid organisms are formed by the fusion of two gametes, as before. Thus there are ten possible diploid genotypes in the population—found by taking every gamete type in combination with every other.

In the one-locus case, we saw that in a large randomly-mating population, there is a simple relationship between the gametic and zygotic frequencies. In the two-locus case, the same relationship holds. Thus for example, the frequency of the \(A_1 B_1 / A_1 B_1\) genotype will be \((x_1)^2\); the frequency of the \(A_1 B_1 / A_2 B_1\) genotype will be \(2x_1 x_3\), and so-on. (This can be established rigorously with an argument based on random sampling of gametes, just as in the one-locus case.) The first aspect of the Hardy-Weinberg principle—genotypic frequencies given by the square of the array of gametic frequencies—therefore transposes neatly to the two-locus case. However, the second aspect of Hardy-Weinberg—stable genotypic frequencies after one round of random mating—does not generally apply in the two-locus case.

A key concept in two-locus population genetics is that of linkage, or lack of independence between the two loci. To understand linkage, consider the set of gametes produced by an organism of the \(A_1 B_1 / A_2 B_2\) genotype, i.e., a double heterozygote. If the two loci are unlinked, then the composition of this set (on average) will be \(\{ \frac{1}{4} A_1 B_1, \frac{1}{4} A_1 B_2, \frac{1}{4} A_2 B_1, \frac{1}{4} A_2 B_2\}\), i.e., all four gamete types are equally represented. (This assumes that Mendel’s first law holds at both loci.) So unlinked loci are independent—which allele a gamete has at the \(A\) locus tells us nothing about which allele it has at the \(B\) locus. The opposite extreme is perfect linkage. If the two loci are perfectly linked, then the set of gametes produced by the \(A_1 B_1 / A_2 B_2\) double heterozygote has the composition \(\{\frac{1}{2} A_1 B_1, \frac{1}{2} A_2 B_2\}\); this means that if a gamete receives the \(A_1\) allele at the \(A\) locus, it necessarily receives the \(B_1\) allele at the \(B\) locus and vice versa.

In physical terms, perfect linkage means that the \(A\) and \(B\) loci are located close together on the same chromosome; the alleles at the two loci are thus inherited as a single unit. Unlinked loci are either on different chromosomes, or on the same chromosome but separated by a considerable distance, hence likely to be broken up by recombination. Where the loci are on the same chromosome, perfect linkage and complete lack of linkage are two ends of a continuum. The degree of linkage is measured by the recombination fraction \(r\), where \(0 \le r \le \frac{1}{2}\). The composition of the set of gametes produced by an organism of the \(A_1 B_1 / A_2 B_2\) genotype can be written in terms of \(r\), as follows:

\(A_1 B_1\) \(\frac{1}{2} (1 - r)\)
\(A_1 B_2\) \(\frac{1}{2} r\)
\(A_2 B_1\) \(\frac{1}{2} r\)
\(A_2 B_2\) \(\frac{1}{2} (1 - r)\)

It is easy to see that \(r = \frac{1}{2}\) means that the loci are unlinked, while \(r = 0\) means that they are perfectly linked.

In a two-locus model, the gametic (and therefore genotypic) frequencies need not be constant across generations, even in the absence of selection, mutation, migration and drift, unlike in the one-locus case. (Though allelic frequencies will be constant, in the absence of these evolutionary forces.) It is possible to derive recurrence equations for the gamete frequencies, as a function of their frequencies in the previous generation plus the recombination fraction:

\[\begin{align} x_1' &= x_1 + r(x_2 x_3 - x_1 x_4) \\ x_2' &= x_2 + r(x_2 x_3 - x_1 x_4) \\ x_3' &= x_3 + r(x_2 x_3 - x_1 x_4) \\ x_4' &= x_4 + r(x_2 x_3 - x_1 x_4) \end{align}\]

(See Ewens 1969 or Edwards 2000 for an explicit derivation of these equations.)

From the recurrence equations, it follows that gametic (and thus genotypic) frequencies will be stable across generations, i.e., \(x_i' = x_i\) for each \(i\), under either of two conditions: (i) \(r = 0\), or (ii) \(x_2 x_3 - x_1 x_4 = 0\). Condition (i) means that the two loci are perfectly linked and thus in effect behave as one; condition (ii) means that the two loci are in ‘linkage equilibrium’, so that alleles at the \(A\)-locus are in random association with alleles at the \(B\)-locus. More precisely, linkage equilibrium means that the population-wide frequency of the \(A_i B_i\) gamete is equal to the frequency of the \(A_i\) allele multiplied by the frequency of the \(B_i\) allele.

An important result in two-locus theory shows that, given random mating, the quantity \((x_2 x_3 - x_1 x_4)\) will decrease every generation until it reaches zero—at which point the genotype frequencies will be in equilibrium. So a population initially in linkage disequilibrium will approach linkage equilibrium over a number of generations, at a rate that depends on \(r\), the recombination fraction. Note the contrast with the one-locus case, where just one round of random mating is sufficient to bring the genotype frequencies into equilibrium.

4. Random Drift

Random genetic drift refers to the chance fluctuations in gene frequency that arise in finite populations. In many evolutionary models, including those outlined in section 3 above. the population is assumed to be very large (technically, infinite) precisely in order to abstract away from such fluctuations. But though mathematically convenient, this assumption is often unrealistic. In real life populations, particularly those of small size, stochasticity is an important source of evolutionary change. Thus a given allele may increase or decrease in frequency not because of any effect it has on organismic survival or reproduction, but simply by chance. Understanding such stochastic changes in gene frequency, and their interaction with natural selection, is a major topic in population genetics, past and present.

The term “random drift” has both a narrow and a broad sense (Kimura 1964; Rice 2004; Millstein 2016). In the narrow sense, it refers to gene frequency changes that arise from the random sampling of gametes to form the offspring generation. (The point here is that organisms produce many more gametes than will ever make it into a fertilized zygote, and only half of a diploid organism’s genes are transmitted to each gamete). In the broader sense, drift refers to gene frequency changes arising from all stochastic factors, including for example random fluctuations in selection intensities, or in survival and mating success. The narrower sense of the term is used here.

Random drift greatly complicates the task of the population geneticist. For in the presence of drift, it is no longer possible to deduce the genetic composition of the population in generation \(t+1\) from its composition in generation \(t\); so no recurrence relation for an allele’s frequency, of the sort expressed in equation (1) above, can be derived. Instead, the aim must be to deduce the probability distribution over all the possible genetic compositions of the population in generation \(t+1\). From this, it is sometimes possible to extract a prediction about the long-term fate of an allele.

The simplest and most widely-used model for analysing random drift is known as the Wright-Fisher model. This model deals with a finite population containing \(N\) diploid organisms. \(N\) is assumed constant over generations (perhaps because of ecological constraints). Generations are non-overlapping, meaning that parents die as soon as they have reproduced, and mating is random. Selection, migration and mutation are assumed absent. The offspring generation is formed by randomly sampling \(2N\) of the gametes produced by the parental generation. Time is discrete, with one generation corresponding to one time period. Consider a particular allele of interest. Let \(X(t)\) denote the number of copies of the allele in the population in generation \(t\), where \(0 \leq X(t) \leq 2N\) (since organisms are diploid). The allele’s frequency \(p(t)\) is then equal to \(\frac{1}{2N}X(t),\) where \(0 \leq p(t) \leq 1\).

We are interested in \(X(t+1)\) and \(p(t+1)\), the number of copies and frequency of the allele in generation \(t+1,\) respectively. (They are related by \(p(t+1) = \frac{1}{2N}X(t+1).\)) Now, \(X(t+1)\) is a random variable that can take any of \(2N+1\) possible values from the set \(\{0, 1, 2, \ldots ,2N\}\). Since the offspring generation is formed by random sampling from the parental gamete pool, the probability distribution of \(X(t+1)\) is given by the binomial distribution:

\[ \textit{Prob}(X(t+1) = x) = \binom{2N}{x}p(t)^x(1-p(t))^{2N-x} \]

This formula tells us, for each possible value of \(X(t+1)\), what its probability is as a function of the population size \(N\) and the allele’s frequency in the parental generation \(p(t).\) From this, we can easily compute the expected value of \(X(t+1)\), denoted \(E(X(t + 1))\), which turns out to simply be equal to \(X(t)\). This is quite intuitive: since the second generation is formed by random sampling, the number of copies of the allele is just as likely to increase as to decrease, so the expected number of copies in generation \(t+1\) equals the actual number of copies in generation \(t.\) It follows that the expected change in allele frequency from generation \(t\) to \(t+1,\) denoted \(E(\Delta p)\), is equal to zero.

The fact that \(E(\Delta p) = 0\) does not imply that drift will have no evolutionary effect. For \(\Delta p\) may have a substantial variance around the mean of zero (depending on the value of \(N\)), so it may be quite probable that \(\Delta p\) deviates from zero by a substantial amount. (Similarly, if one flips a fair coin 20 times, the expected number of heads is 10, but the probability that the actual number of heads is 8 or less is quite substantial – approximately 25%). In the Wright-Fisher model, the variance of \(\Delta p\) turns out to be \(Var(\Delta p) = \frac{1}{2N}p(1-p)\). Thus as the population size increases, the variance of \(\Delta p\) gets smaller and smaller, which illustrates the point that random drift is more important in small than in large populations.

What will happen in the long run? Under the assumptions of the Wright-Fisher model, the sequence of allele frequencies in successive generations \(\{p(0), p(1), p(2), \ldots \}\)constitutes what is known as a Markov chain, that is, a sequence of random variables (stochastic process) where the probability distribution of any variable depends only on the value of the immediately preceding variable. That is, the probability that the allele has a frequency of (say) 0.8 in generation \(t+1\), denoted \(\textit{Prob}(p(t+1) = 0.8)\), depends on the value of \(p(t),\) the allele’s frequency in generation \(t\), but not on its frequency in earlier generations. Importantly, this Markov chain has a special feature, namely that the the two extremal values of \(p(t)\), i.e., 0 and 1, are absorbing boundaries, meaning that if the system reaches one of these boundaries it stays there. That is, if the allele goes extinct in generation \(t\), so has a frequency of zero, then in all subsequent generations its frequency will also be zero (since we are ignoring mutation). Similarly, if the allele goes to fixation in generation \(t\), it will remain fixed in subsequent generations. Formally, we can express these facts as: \(\textit{Prob}(p(t+1) = 0 \mid p(t) = 0) = 1\) and \(\textit{Prob}(p(t+1) = 1 \mid p(t) = 1) = 1\). Since there is no upper bound on the number of generations, eventually random drift must lead the allele to go extinct or to become fixed in the population (and similarly for other alleles). This is because of the absorbing boundary assumption, which implies that every stochastic trajectory must eventually end up at \(p(t) = 0\) or \(p(t) = 1\), for some value of \(t.\)

This leads naturally to the following question. What is the probability that the allele will become fixed in the population, rather than going extinct? The Wright-Fisher model yields a very simple answer to this question. If a given (neutral) allele has a frequency \(p(t)\) in generation \(t\) , then the probability that it eventually fixes is simply \(p(t).\) This is a fairly intuitive result. For if the allele is rare, it is quite likely that it will be lost from the population by chance. Conversely, if the allele is common, it is most unlikely to be lost from the population, as this would require an improbable series of chance events to occur together. An immediate consequence of this result is that the probability of fixation of a novel (neutral) genetic variant, that has arisen in the population by sporadic mutation, is \(\frac{1}{2N}\) – since initially there is one copy of the novel variant in the population. Thus for appreciable \(N\), it is overwhelmingly likely that any given novel variant will be lost to genetic drift. This illustrates the general fact that genetic drift has a homogenizing tendency over many generations, reducing the genetic variation in a population.

Importantly, the equality between an allele’s current frequency and its probability of becoming fixed assumes that the allele in question, and other alleles at the same locus, are selectively neutral—meaning that random drift is the sole determinant of the changes in frequency. If this assumption is relaxed, matters become more complicated. The fate of an allele then depends on both drift and on its selective advantage or disadvantage. This takes us beyond the confines of the simple Wright-Fisher model since now there are two evolutionary factors at work—random drift and natural selection. In a finite population, an allele that is selectively advantageous, so has a positive selection coefficient, will have a higher probability of fixation that a neutral allele; and conversely for one that is selectively disadvantageous. This is fairly obvious. What is less obvious, but still true, is that even if a novel variant arises that confers a significant selective advantage, it is still more likely to be eliminated by drift than to become fixed. To quantitatively study the combined effects of selection and drift, population geneticists use an advanced probabilistic technique known as diffusion analysis, which lies beyond the scope of this article (see Rice 2004 ch.5, Hartl 2020, ch.6. or Otto and Day 2007, ch.15). But one key result deserves mention, which is that the eventual fate of an allele depends on the relative magnitude of two quantities, namely \(4N_e\) and \(s\). Here \(N_e\) denotes the “effective population size” (which corrects the actual population size to take account of deviations from the idealized assumptions of the Wright-Fisher model), and \(s\) is the selection coefficient, which is a measure of the relative fitness of organisms with the allele compared to organisms without, where \(0 \leq s \leq 1\). It turns out that if \(4N_e s \gg 1\) then natural selection will determine the fate of an allele, while if \(4N_e s \ll 1\) then drift will determine its fate.

The respective roles of drift and natural selection in molecular evolution was the subject of the selectionist versus neutralist controversy in the 1960s and 1970s, as noted in the Introduction (cf. Dietrich 1994). The neutralist camp, headed by Kimura, argued that most molecular variants had no effect on phenotype, so were not subject to natural selection; random drift was instead the main determinant of their fate. Kimura argued that the apparently constant rate at which the amino acid sequences of proteins evolved, and the extent of genetic polymorphism observed in natural populations, could best be explained by the neutralist hypothesis (Kimura 1977, 1994). Selectionists countered that natural selection was also capable of explaining the observed polymorphism. The controversy ended without a clear victory for either side, in part due to paucity of data. However the opposition between selection and drift remains a central topic in molecular population genetics today, where there is an abundance of data on DNA sequence variation in natural populations. Sophisticated methods have been developed to allow researchers to hunt for signatures of past selection in the genomes of modern organisms. It has become clear that there is indeed much neutral molecular variation in DNA sequence (in part due to “synonymous” mutations that leave unchanged the amino acid sequence of the protein that the gene codes for). However, there is also much evidence showing that the genomes of contemporary species have been substantially influenced by natural selection (Casillas and Barbadilla 2017, Kern and Hahn 2018). Moreover, the idea that drift is the sole determinant of a neutral variant’s frequency, as the original neutralists held, is not necessarily true. Another possibility, championed by J. Gillespie (2004), is that a neutral variant’s spread in a population may be heavily influenced by selection at linked loci, a process known as “hitchhiking” or “genetic draft”; see Skipper (2004) for discussion. A recent evaluation of the selection versus drift issue concludes that “the extent to which DNA sequence evolution is caused by selection versus drift remains an important unanswered general question” (Charlesworth and Charlesworth 2017, p.6).

Though random drift is well-understood mathematically, and is the subject of much empirical research in biology, a number of philosophers have suggested that it is conceptually less clearcut than one might think. Thus for example Millstein (2002) has argued that the term “random drift” as used by biologists is often ambiguous as between a process (such as random sampling) and an outcome (such as change in gene frequency). Millstein’s point has given rise to a considerable philosophical literature on how exactly the terms “drift” and “selection” should be defined; see the entry on genetic drift for discussion and references.

4.1 Coalescence

Traditional population genetics models of the sort sketched above are “forward-looking”, in that their goal is to predict the future genetic composition of a population, or the fate of an allele, based on various assumptions about the evolutionary processes at work. Starting in the 1980s, a different approach to population genetics was developed known as “coalescent theory”, originally as a result of work in applied probability (Kingman 1982). Coalescent theory has a “backwards-looking” orientation: it aims to make inferences about a population’s history based on a sample of genes drawn from the current population (Wakeley 2008). Compared to the traditional forwards-looking models, coalescent theory allows a different set of evolutionary questions to be asked, and also yields simpler ways of calculating certain quantities of interest in the traditional models, such as fixation probabilities (Rice 2004, ch. 5). Also, coalescent theory yields predictions, for example about the amount of DNA sequence variation we should expect to find in a sample of genes from a natural population, that can be directly tested against data.

Coalescent theory is all about tracing lines of ancestry between genes in a (diploid) population. Ordinarily we think of ancestor-descendant lineages of organisms, but we can equally (indeed more easily) think in terms of lineages of genes at a locus, while simply ignoring the organisms that the genes are housed within. The starting point of coalescent theory is the observation that all the genes at a locus in a current population must ultimately stem from a single ancestral gene copy in the past (the “most recent common ancestor” or MRCA). This is in effect the flip-side of genetic drift. If we go back far enough in a population’s ancestry, we must arrive at a point at which all of the genes bar one have left no descendants in the current population. This is because, at every round of reproduction, a given gene copy has a certain chance of not leaving any descendants in the next generation, i.e., being eliminated by drift. This implies that, as we trace back in time, the gene lineages will join up, or “coalesce”.

The simplest approach to coalescence uses the Wright-Fisher model, expounded above. Recall that this model involves a diploid population of fixed size \(N\), in which selection is absent, mating is random, and generations are non-overlapping. Each new generation is formed by randomly sampling \(2N\) of the gametes produced by the previous generation. To illustrate coalescence, suppose that we pick two gene copies at random from the current population. There are then two possibilities: either both derive from a single copy in the preceding generation, or they do not. These two events occur with probabilities \(\frac{1}{2N}\) and \((1 - \frac{1}{2N})\) respectively. To see this, note that the first gene we pick must have some parent or other in the previous generation; so the probability that the two genes we pick derive from a single copy in the previous generation is simply the probability that the second gene has the same parent as the first; since there are \(2N\) possible parents, this equals \(\frac{1}{2N}\). So the alternative possibility, that the two genes do not coalesce in the previous generation, has the complementary probability of \((1 - \frac{1}{2N})\).

This reasoning can be repeated in a natural way. Suppose that the two genes we pick do not coalesce in the immediately previous generation, i.e., they have different parents. Then, those two parents genes will themselves either derive from a single copy in the previous generation, or they will not. If so, then the two genes we have picked will coalesce two generations ago, i.e., derive from a single grandparent gene. The probability of this is \(\frac{1}{2N} \times (1 - \frac{1}{2N})\). By iterating this reasoning, we can work out the probability distribution that two randomly chosen gene copies in the current generation derive from a common ancestor t generations ago. This is given by:

\[ \textit{Prob}(\text{coalescence}~t~\text{generations ago}) = \frac{1}{2N} \times \left(1 - \frac{1}{2N}\right)^{t-1}. \]

The next question to ask is what the expected value of this distribution is, that is, what the mean time to coalescence is? The answer turns out to be approximately \(2N\). Thus on average, a pair of randomly picked genes at a given locus will coalesce after \(2N\) generations, where \(N\) is population size. However, there is considerable variability about this mean, meaning that there is a significant chance that coalescence will occur much quicker, or much slower, than this. By building on this simple analysis, coalescent theory allows a range of more complicated questions to be answered, involving, for example, multiple alleles, sub-divided populations, populations that change in size over time, plus other deviations from the assumptions of the basic Wright-Fisher model. For example, coalescent theory yields a straightforward calculation of how many generations back we must go, on average, to find the MRCA of a number of different genes at a locus (Otto and Day 2007, ch. 13).

5. Population Genetics and its Critics

The status of population genetics in contemporary biology is an interesting issue. Despite its centrality to evolutionary theory, and its historical importance, population genetics is not without its critics. Some argue that population geneticists have devoted too much energy to developing theoretical models, often with great mathematical ingenuity, and too little to actually testing the models against empirical data (Wade 2005). This was probably a fair criticism at one time, however the recent flourishing of molecular population genetics has changed the situation, allowing much greater contact between theory and data (Hahn 2018). Others argue that population-genetic models are usually too idealized to shed any real light on the evolutionary process, and are limited in what they can teach us about phenotypic evolution (Pigliucci 2008). Still others have argued that, historically, population genetics has had a relatively minor impact on the actual practice of most evolutionary biologists, despite the lip-service often paid to it (Lewontin 1980). However, not all biologists accept these criticisms. Thus the geneticist Michael Lynch (2007), for example, has written that “nothing in biology makes sense except in the light of population genetics”, in a twist on Dobzhansky’s famous dictum; see Bromham (2009) and Pigliucci (2008) for discussion of Lynch’s arguments. And in a recent survey of 50 years of population genetics, Charlesworth and Charlesworth (2017) argue that population-genetic analysis has not only enabled us to understand the nature and causes of molecular genetic variation, but has also provided deep insights into a variety of topics in evolutionary biology.

Population-genetic models of evolution have sometimes been criticised on the grounds that few phenotypic traits are controlled by genotype at a single locus, or even two or three loci. (Multi-locus population-genetic models do exist, but they are inevitably very complicated.) There is an alternative body of theory, known as quantitative genetics, which deals with so-called ‘polygenic’ or ‘continuous’ traits, such as height, which are thought to be affected by genes at many different loci in the genome, rather than just one or two; see Falconer (1995) or Walsh and Lynch (2018) for good overviews. Quantitative genetics employs a quite different methodology from population genetics. The latter, as we have seen, aims to track gene and genotype frequencies across generations. By contrast, quantitative genetics does not directly deal with gene frequencies; the aim is to track the phenotype distribution, or moments of the distribution such as the mean or the variance, across generations. Though widely used by animal and plant breeders, quantitative genetics is usually regarded as a less fundamental body of theory than population genetics, given its ‘phenotypic’ orientation. Nonetheless, the relationship between population and quantitative genetics is essentially harmonious.

A different criticism of the population-genetic approach to evolution is that it ignores embryological development; this criticism really applies to the evolutionary theory of the ‘modern synthesis’ era more generally, which had population genetics at its core. As we have seen, population-genetic reasoning assumes that an organism’s genes somehow affect its phenotype, and thus its fitness, but it is silent about the details of how genes actually build organisms, i.e., about embryology. The founders of the modern synthesis treated embryology as a ‘black box’, the details of which could be ignored for the purposes of evolutionary theory; their focus was on the transmission of genes across generations, not the process by which genes make organisms (see the entry on evolution and development). This strategy was perfectly reasonable, given how little was understood about development at the time. But since the 1990s, great strides have been made in molecular developmental genetics, which has renewed hopes of integrating the study of embryological development with evolutionary theory and has led to the emergence of the discipline of ‘evolutionary developmental biology’, or evo-devo (see Arthur 2021 for a recent overview or the entry on evolution and development). It is sometimes argued that evo-devo is in tension with traditional neo-Darwinism (e.g., Amundson 2007), but it is more plausible to view them as complementary ways of studying evolution that have different emphases.

In a 2005 book, Sean Carroll, a leading evo-devo researcher, argued that population genetics no longer deserves pride-of-place on the evolutionary biology curriculum. He writes: “millions of biology students have been taught the view (from population genetics) that ‘evolution is change in gene frequencies’ … This view forces the explanation toward mathematics and abstract descriptions of genes, and away from butterflies and zebras, or Australopithecines and Neanderthals” (2005 p. 294). A similar argument has been made by Pigliucci (2008). Carroll argues that instead of defining evolution as ‘change in gene frequencies’, we should define it as ‘change in development’, in recognition of the fact that most morphological evolution is brought about through mutations that affect organismic development. Carroll may be right that evo-devo makes for a more accessible introduction to evolutionary biology than population genetics, and that an exclusive focus on gene frequency dynamics is not the best way to understand all evolutionary phenomena; but population genetics arguably remains indispensable to a full understanding of the evolutionary process.

In recent years, a vigourous debate has opened up about whether the “modern synthesis” (MS) is still adequate to the needs of biology. The MS, or neo-Darwinian synthesis, is the intellectual edifice that arose in the 20th century from the integration of Darwin’s theory of evolution with Mendelian genetics, which had population genetics at its core, as we have seen. Proponents of the “extended evolutionary synthesis”, or EES, argue that the main principle of the MS—that adaptive evolution arises from natural selection acting on sporadic genetic mutation—is not wrong but is not the whole story either, and needs supplementation in the light of recent discoveries (Pigliucci and Muller eds. 2010; Laland et al. 2014, 2015). They point to phenomena such as niche construction, epigenetic inheritance, multi-level selection, phenotypic plasticity and developmental bias, which, they claim, do not fit easily with the MS’s emphasis on gene-based evolution. The EES’s proponents are typically somewhat suspicious of population genetics, and seek to downplay its explanatory significance. However, their views are controversial. Defenders of the traditional MS argue that the empirical phenomena in question are of relatively minor evolutionary importance and / or that they can be accommodated within the MS without any major paradigm shift (Wray et al. 2014; Walsh and Lynch 2018; Charlesworth, Barton and Charlesworth 2017). This debate looks set to continue.

Despite the criticisms levelled against it, population genetics has certainly had a major influence on our understanding of evolution. For example, the well-known ‘gene’s eye’ view of evolution, developed by G.C. Williams (1966), W. D. Hamilton (1964) and R. Dawkins (1976), stems directly from population-genetic reasoning; indeed, important aspects of gene’s eye thinking were already present in Fisher’s writings (Okasha 2008, Ewens 2011). Proponents of the gene’s eye view argue that genes are the real beneficiaries of the evolutionary process; genotypes and organisms are mere temporary manifestations. Natural selection is at root a matter of competition between gene lineages for greater representation in the gene pool; creating organisms with adaptive features is a ‘strategy’ that genes have devised to secure their posterity (Dawkins 1976, 1982). Gene’s eye thinking has revolutionised many areas of evolutionary biology in the last fifty years, particularly in the field of animal behaviour (cf. Agren 2021), but in many ways it is simply a colourful gloss on the conception of evolution implicit in the formalisms of population genetics.

6. Philosophical and Conceptual Issues in Population Genetics

Population genetics raises a number of interesting conceptual and philosophical issues. One such issue concerns the concept of the gene itself. As we have seen, population genetics came into being in the 1920s and 1930s, long before the molecular structure of genes had been discovered. In these pre-molecular days, the gene was a theoretical entity, postulated in order to explain observed patterns of inheritance in breeding experiments; what genes were made of, how they caused phenotypic changes, and how they were transmitted from parent to offspring were not known. Today we do know the answers to these questions, thanks to the spectacular success of molecular genetics and genomics. The gene has gone from being a theoretical entity to being something that can actually be manipulated in the laboratory.

The relationship between the gene of classical (pre-molecular) genetics, and the gene of modern molecular genetics is a subtle and much discussed topic (Beurton, Falk and Rheinberger (eds.) 2000, Griffiths and Stotz 2006, Moss 2003, Meunier 2022). In molecular genetics, ‘gene’ refers, more or less, to a stretch of DNA that codes for a particular protein—so a gene is a unit of function. But in classical population genetics, ‘gene’ refers, more or less, to a portion of hereditary material that is inherited intact across generations—so a gene is a unit of transmission, not a unit of function. In many cases, the two concepts of gene will pick out roughly the same entities—which has led some philosophers to argue that classical genetics can be ‘reduced’ to molecular genetics (Sarkar 1998). But it is clear that the two concepts do not have precisely the same extension; not every molecular gene is a classical gene, nor vice-versa. Some theorists go further than this, arguing that what molecular biology really shows is that there are no such things as classical genes.

Whatever one’s view of this debate, it is striking that virtually all of the central concepts of population genetics were devised in the pre-molecular era, when so little was known about what genes were; the basic structure of population-genetic theory has changed little since the days of Fisher, Haldane and Wright (Charlesworth and Charlesworth 2017). This reflects the fact that the empirical presuppositions of population-genetic models are really quite slim; the basic presupposition is simply the existence of hereditary particles that obey the Mendelian rules of transmission, and that somehow affect the phenotype. Therefore, even without knowing what these hereditary particles are made of, or how they exert their phenotypic effects, the early population geneticists were able to devise an impressive body of theory. That the theory continues to be useful today illustrates the power of abstract models in science.

This leads us to another facet of population genetics that has attracted philosophers’ attention: the way in which abstract models, that involve simplifying assumptions known to be false, can illuminate actual empirical phenomena. Idealized models of this sort play a central role in many sciences, including physics, economics and biology, and raise interesting methodological issues. In particular, there is often a trade-off between realism and tractability; the more realistic a model the more complicated it becomes, which typically limits its usefulness and its range of applicability. This general problem and others like it have been extensively discussed in the philosophical literature on modelling (e.g., Godfrey-Smith 2006, Weisberg 2006, Frigg and Hartmann 2006), and are related to population genetics by Plutynski (2006).

It is clear that population genetics models rely on assumptions known to be false, and are subject to the realism / tractability trade-off. The simplest population-genetic models assume random mating, non-overlapping generations, infinite population size, perfect Mendelian segregation, frequency-independent genotype fitnesses, and the absence of stochastic effects; it is very unlikely (and in the case of the infinite population assumption, impossible) that any of these assumptions hold true of any actual biological population. More realistic models, that relax one of more of the above assumptions, have been constructed, but they are invariably much harder to analyze. It is an interesting historical question whether these ‘standard’ population-genetic assumptions were originally made because they simplified the mathematics, or because they were believed to be a reasonable approximation to reality, or both. This question is taken up by Morrison (2004, 2014) in relation to Fisher’s early population-genetic work.

Another philosophical issue raised by population genetics is reductionism. It is often argued that the population-genetic view of evolution is inherently reductionistic, by both its critics and its defenders. This is apparent from how population geneticists define evolution: change in gene frequency. Implicit in this definition is the idea that evolutionary phenomena such as speciation, adaptive radiation and diversification, as well as phenotypic evolution, can ultimately be reduced to gene frequency change. But do we really know this to be true? Many biologists, particularly ‘whole organism’ biologists, are not convinced, and thus reject both the population-genetic definition of evolution and the primacy traditionally accorded to population genetics within evolutionary biology (Pigliucci 2008).

This is a large question, and is related to the issues discussed in section 5 above. The question can be usefully divided into two: (i) can microevolutionary processes explain all of evolution?; (ii) can all of microevolution be reduced to population genetics? ‘Microevolution’ refers to evolutionary changes that take place within a given population, over relatively short periods of time (e.g., a few hundred generations). These changes typically involve the substitution of a gene for its alleles, of exactly the sort modelled by population genetics. So over microevolutionary time-scales, we do not typically expect to see extinction, speciation or major morphological change — phenomena which are called ‘macroevolutionary’. Many biologists believe that macroevolution is simply ‘microevolution writ large’, but this view is not universal. Authors such as Gould (2002) and Eldredge (1989), for example, have argued persuasively that macroevolutionary phenomena are governed by autonomous dynamics, irreducible to a microevolutionary basis. Philosophical discussions of this issue include Sterelny (1996), Grantham (1995) and Okasha (2006). A useful overview is provided by Turner and Havstad (2019).

Setting aside the reducibility of macro to microevolution, there is still the issue of whether an exclusively population-genetic approach to the latter is satisfactory. Some reasons for doubting this have been discussed already; they include the complexity of the genotype-phenotype relation, the fact that population genetics treats development as a black-box, and the idealizing assumptions that its models rest on. Another point, not discussed above, is the fact that population genetics models are (deliberately) silent about the causes of the fitness differences between genotypes whose consequences they model (Sober 1984, Glymour 2006). For example, in the simple one-locus model of section 3.1, nothing is said about why the three genotypes leave different numbers of successful gametes. To fully understand evolution, the ecological factors that lead to these fitness differences must also be understood. While this is a valid point, the most it shows is that an exclusively population-genetic approach cannot yield a complete understanding of the evolutionary process. This does not really threaten the traditional view that population genetics is fundamental to evolutionary theory.

A final suite of philosophical issues surrounding population genetics concerns causation. Evolutionary biology is standardly thought of as a science that yields causal explanations: it tells us the causes of particular evolutionary phenomena (Okasha 2009, Otsuka 2016a). This causal dimension to evolutionary explanations is echoed in population genetics, where selection, mutation, migration and random drift are often described as causes, or ‘forces’, that lead to gene frequency change (Sober 1984). The basis for this way of speaking is obvious enough. If the frequency of allele \(A\) in a population increases from one generation to another, and if the population obeys the rules of Mendelian inheritance, then as a matter of logic one of three things must have happened: (I) migrants bearing allele \(A\) entered the population (II); there was mutation to allele \(A\) from another allele; (III) the average number of descendants left by each copy of \(A\) in the parental generation exceeded the average for all genes. It is straightforward to verify that if none of (I)–(III) occurred, then the frequency of allele \(A\) would have been unchanged. Note that case (III) covers both selection and random drift, depending on whether copies of \(A\) left more descendants than average by chance, or because of some systematic effect of \(A\) on organismic fitness.

Despite this point, a number of philosophers have objected to the idea that evolutionary change can usefully be thought of as caused by different factors, including natural selection (e.g., Matthen and Ariew 2009, Walsh 2007). A variety of objections to this apparently innocent way of speaking have been levelled; some of these seem to be objections to the metaphor of ‘forces’ in particular, while others turn on more general considerations to do with causality and chance. The status of these objections is a controversial matter; see Reisman and Forber (2005), Brandon and Ramsey (2007), Sarkar (2011) and in particular Otsuka (2016b) for critical discussion. The ‘non-causal’ (or ‘statisticalist’ as it is sometimes called) view of evolution is certainly a radical one, since the idea that natural selection, in particular, is a potential cause of evolutionary change is virtually axiomatic in evolutionary biology, and routinely taught to students of the subject. As Millstein (2002) points out, if one abandons this view it becomes hard to make sense of important episodes in the history of evolutionary biology, such as the selectionist / neutralist controversy mentioned above.

A full resolution of this issue cannot be attempted here; however, it is worth making one observation about the idea that mutation, selection, migration and drift should be regarded as ‘causes’ of gene frequency change. There is an important difference between drift on the one hand and the other three factors on the other. This is because mutation, selection and migration are directional; they typically lead to a non-zero expected change in gene frequencies (Rice 2004 p. 132). Random drift on the other hand is non-directional; the expected change due to drift is by definition zero. As Rice (2004) points out, this means that mutation, selection and migration can each be represented by a vector field on the space of gene frequencies; their combined effects on the overall evolutionary change is then represented by ordinary vector addition (which arguably lends substance of the “force” metaphor). But drift cannot be treated this way, for it has a magnitude but not a direction. In so far as proponents of the ‘non-causal’ view are motivated by the oddity of regarding drift, or chance, as a force, they have a point. However this line of argument is specific to random drift; it does not generalize to all the factors that affect gene frequency change. And it does not alter the fact that, in attributing the spread of a gene to random drift, we have given a bona fide scientific explanation that is potentially falsifiable; for we have said that the gene’s spread was not due to any systematic advantage that the gene conferred on organisms that had it.

A final area of philosophical concern to which population genetics is relevant is the debate over the status of racial categories. This is a central topic within the philosophy of race, a burgeoning sub-field of philosophy (see the entry on race for an overview). One influential line of argument has it that racial categories are social constructions rather than natural kinds. On this view, the division of the human species into distinct “races” (which can be done in multiple ways), should be understood primarily in terms of the social and political role that such racial categories play. This view is sometimes called “anti-realism” about race, since it holds that the usual ways of dividing humans into races (as employed in national censuses, for example) are conventional rather than real. Opponents of anti-realism have sometimes drawn on human population genetics to bolster the rival position that racial divisions are in fact real (Andreasen 2007, Sesardic 2010, Spencer 2015). Empirical studies of how genetic variation in humans is structured, using machine learning techniques, have found genetic clusters that appear to roughly correspond to certain broad racial groupings (such as “African” and “Eurasian”) (Rosenberg et al. 2002, Li et al. 2008). However, the precise bearing of these empirical results on the question of the reality versus conventionality of racial divisions is a matter of ongoing philosophical dispute (Kopec 2014, Winther 2014).

To conclude, there are a number of interesting philosophical issues surrounding population genetics discussed in the recent literature. In addition to these, population genetics is indirectly relevant to a still broader set of philosophical concerns, given its centrality to evolutionary biology, a science replete with implications for many branches of philosophy.

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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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Samir Okasha <samir.okasha@bristol.ac.uk>

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