Needs in Moral and Political Philosophy
Much ordinary discourse about political and moral matters invokes the language of needs. In such contexts claims about need are often thought to carry significant weight. By contrast, the role that needs should play in normative reasoning is contested among philosophers. In this article we discuss several core issues concerning needs in contemporary moral and political philosophy. We begin by discussing the normativity of needs and some of the disputes concerning the significance of needs claims.
We then canvass some reasons to be skeptical about needs and their ability to do any useful work in moral and political philosophy. These include skepticism about the objectivity of needs and therefore concerns about whether needs claims can ground relevant obligations. Some also maintain that distribution according to need is undesirable, for instance because it is essentially paternalistic, or because it can result in being confronted with an overly burdensome and possibly endless series of demands. In response to such potential problems we discuss widely used strategies for disarming the main forms of skepticism and evaluate their success.
On the face of it, human beings can claim to have a wide variety of needs. Which needs warrant normative attention? We discuss some influential recent accounts of the needs that matter morally, along with the arguments offered for why those needs are special. Here we discuss influential work by Harry Frankfurt, David Braybrooke, David Wiggins, David Miller, Len Doyal, and Ian Gough. While there are several common elements to these accounts, there are also important differences.
We then discuss needs in recent theories of distributive justice. Given the role needs seem to play in popular discourse about social justice it may seem odd that needs have largely been ignored by contemporary theorists concerned with distributive justice. But by means of a wide trawl through the dominant theories, we show that this is indeed the case. We offer some explanations for this apparently odd phenomenon.
Marx is well known for maintaining that a communist society would aspire to distribute resources according to the principle “from each according to his ability, to each according to his needs” (Marx 1977, 569). What would distribution according to need entail? We outline several possibilities, showing strengths and weaknesses with each interpretation. However, as we highlight, there is no uniquely defensible or best way of understanding what the principle of distribution according to need requires in all cases.
A needs-based approach played an important role in global public policy, especially concerning addressing poverty and human development, in the 1970s and early 1980s. However, the capabilities approach replaced it in the late 1980s. Policy-makers appeared to lose confidence in a needs-based approach and capabilities were considered by many of the most influential decision-makers to offer a more sophisticated conceptual framework. We review some of the arguments on both sides of this debate, discussing their strengths and weaknesses.
In our final section we identify some ways in which concern with needs extends to several contemporary debates, such as those concerning the scope and content of justice. What constraints do the needs of others who are not proximate (either geographically or temporally) place on fair distributions within states, for instance? We note where more extended treatment of these concerns occurs in several other articles in this encyclopedia.
- 1. The normativity of need
- 2. Skepticism about Needs and Common Response Strategies
- 3. Some Influential Accounts of the Normatively Salient Needs
- 4. Needs in Recent Theories of Distributive Justice
- 5. Distribution According to Need
- 6. Needs and Capabilities
- 7. How Concern with Needs is Covered in Some Other Prominent Debates
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The normativity of need
The role that needs should play in our practical reasoning is a hotly contested topic. On one side stand philosophers who argue that the needs of others always impose moral demands on us, or more strongly still that the very idea of moral obligation cannot be understood except with reference to needs (see Reader 2007, chs. 4–5; Weil 1952, 3–9). They are also likely to believe that meeting needs should be a primary aim of public policy. On the other side stand philosophers who argue that needs are a false currency; they appear to be both objective and fundamental, but in fact are neither, since claims of need always make tacit reference to some further end for which the thing claimed is necessary (Barry 1965, 47–9; Flew 1981, ch. 5; White 1975, ch. 8). Moreover in politics, appeals to need are not only misleading, but dangerous, because the obligations they apparently impose can serve to justify indefinitely expanding the scope of government at the expense of individual freedom (Minogue 1963, ch. 4).
How should we respond to this contest? It is tempting to sidestep the controversy over needs by substituting other concepts that cover some of the same terrain but are viewed as less contestable—such as resources, welfare, or capabilities—and as we shall see later, needs have played a smaller part than one might expect in recent political philosophy. Yet there remains something compelling about the idea of need. To say that a human being is in need—is ill, or starving, or threatened by danger—seems on the face of it to identify a state of affairs that calls for immediate remedy. In everyday life, the language of need is pervasive. We talk constantly of the needs of children, the elderly, the poor, the sick, the lonely, and so on. We should not be too quick, therefore, to assume that needs-talk can easily be replaced by some other idiom. Instead we should try to understand how the controversy has arisen, and whether it can be resolved by more careful specification of the needs claims that have non-derivative practical force.
1.1 Are Need Claims always Elliptical?
A good place to start is with the question whether claims of the form ‘\(A\) needs \(X\)’ are always elliptical, that is whether they are always opaque unless filled out by supplying the end, \(Y\), for which \(X\) is needed. Clearly many need statements have that property. If I say ‘Mary needs a hat’, then unless the context makes it clear already, it is apposite to ask ‘What does she need the hat for?’ to which the answer might be ‘To avoid getting sunburnt’. Yet other need claims seem not to be elliptical in that way. If I say ‘the baby needs its diaper changed’, it would be more than a little bizarre to ask ‘what for?’. Although it would no doubt be possible formally to expand the sentence by specifying a goal, no fresh information would be supplied to anyone who already knew what a baby was and what a diaper was, whereas in the case of Mary’s hat, the reference to sunburn does genuine explanatory work by displacing other reasons that Mary might have for needing suitable headgear.
It matters whether or not all need statements are elliptical because this is connected to the further question whether need claims can have independent justificatory force. For those who deny this, such as Barry, the fact that need claims always require spelling out in the form ‘\(A\) needs \(X\) in order to \(Y\)’ shows that what matters normatively are always the \(Y\) items, the ends for which the things needed are necessary. Barry concedes that there are ‘core’ cases of human need where the context makes it clear that the ends being invoked fall within a narrow range (health, for instance), yet concludes that ‘this modification does not affect my thesis that no special account has to be taken of “need”, for it is still derivative and the only interesting questions arise in connection with the ends’ (Barry 1965, 49).
Others, however, deny this. For Wiggins, the problem with the claim that all need claims are elliptical is that it blurs the distinction between the instrumental sense of ‘need’, where the purpose for which the claimed item is needed might be almost anything, and the categorical sense where ‘the purpose is already fixed, and fixed by virtue of the meaning of the word’ (Wiggins 1998, 9). In the case of categorical needs, needed items are things that human beings must have to avoid being harmed, but it is a mistake to see ‘avoidance of harm’ as a further end that explains why the need is a need; instead it is already present in the idea of need itself. A similar argument is made by Thomson (1987), though using a different vocabulary of derivative and basic needs. Of course these analyses of the concept of need do not yet tell us what our categorical or basic needs are. It is uncontroversial to say that the resources without which a human being could not survive, such as food and water, count as needs. But how far beyond this does the concept stretch? Could needs that only some people have count as categorical, for example? We return to this question in section 3 below when we discuss different substantive theories of need.
1.2 Needs and Moral Obligation
Consider next the alleged normative force of need claims. They are often singled out for discussion because on the one hand whether somebody has a need seems to be a matter of fact, while on the other the existence of the need once established seems to constitute a reason for acting so as to fulfil it. If John, who has a migraine, needs a painkiller (matter of fact), then I have a reason to give him one (normative reason). So needs serve as a bridge between ‘is’ and ‘ought’. Yet leaving aside general doubts as to whether such bridge-building is possible, we need to tread cautiously here. First, the thesis is only plausible in the case of categorical needs. In the case of instrumental needs, everything will turn on the end for which the needed item is required. An arsonist may need a match to start a fire, but there is no reason to hand him one. Second, even categorical needs only provide reasons for action when the need is presently unfulfilled. So we need to draw a distinction between ‘occurrent’ and ‘dispositional’ needs (Thomson 1987, 11–12; Reader 2007, 71). A dispositional need is a general need that human beings have, like the need for sleep. But whether a person has an occurrent need for sleep depends on whether he has just woken up after a good night’s rest or on the contrary has been unable to sleep for the last twenty-four hours. It is only in the latter case, where the need is occurrent, that others have a reason to meet it by offering the sleep-deprived person a bed to lie on.
What kinds of reason for action do basic needs create? Needs are sometimes described as ‘morally demanding’, and therefore as directly generating moral obligations on the part of those who can fulfil them (Reader 2007, chs. 4–6). But what kind of obligation? Some philosophers writing in defence of care ethics take responding to need as the paradigm case of, or even definitive of, a caring relationship. For Bubeck, for example, ‘caring for is the meeting of the needs of one person by another person where face-to-face interaction between carer and cared for is a crucial element of the overall activity and where the need is of such a nature that it cannot possibly be met by the person in need herself’ (Bubeck 1995, 129). This is echoed by Held (2006, 10): ‘the central focus of the ethics of care is on the compelling moral salience of attending to and meeting the needs of the particular others for whom we take responsibility’. However it would be a mistake to think that needs only have moral relevance in the context of caring relationships, even if it is within those relationships that they can be responded to most fully. For meeting needs is also sometimes demanded as a matter of justice: we explore the relationship between needs and justice more fully in section 4 below. We can see this most clearly in circumstances where resources are not plentiful enough to meet everyone’s needs in full. Then we face the problem of how to distribute them, and the principle we use to solve it will be a principle of justice. ‘To each according to their needs’ has over the last two centuries often been held up as the highest principle of distributive justice, although as we shall see in section 5 there are a number of different ways in which the requirement to distribute scarce resources according to need can be interpreted. Those who want to defend the supremacy of care as a moral value acknowledge that justice of this kind must have a place within caring relationships (Held 2006, ch. 4). The caring parent, for instance, must pay equal attention to the various different needs of each of his or her children.
1.3 The Significance of Relationships
Where a caring relationship already exists, it is easy to identify the person who has the moral obligation to meet another’s needs, but this raises the question whether needs as such can impose obligations on those who have the means to satisfy them, or whether there must already be a pre-existing relationship that explains why Alfred has an obligation to meet Betty’s needs. Reader (2007, 72) defends the view that ‘need only constitutes an actual moral demand in the context of a moral relationship’. But she is obliged to stretch the idea of a moral relationship to deal with emergency situations in which we intuitively think that rescuers are obliged to come to the aid of complete strangers when they can do so at little cost. She does so by arguing that ‘encounters’, even very brief ones, should count as a form of moral relationship (Reader 2007, 74–5). This, however, is implausible if it is intended to include cases such as those in which the person in need is unaware of the presence of her saviour (for example because she is lying unconscious). The relationship between rescuer and victim here consists simply in the former’s physical capacity to carry out the rescue at small cost: there is no person-to-person encounter between them prior to the rescue itself. So if we think that the rescuer in such cases does have an obligation to meet the needs of the victim, then we must concede that human need alone can impose obligations in the absence of any further relationship between the two parties.
A more nuanced view here would hold that it is only cases of extreme need—where life itself or serious bodily harm is at stake—that can create such obligations between perfect strangers. Where needs are less severe—for example our psychological needs for love or moral support—the obligation to meet them falls only on those already connected to the person in need. There is a parallel here to the debate in political morality about the obligations of states to meet the needs of those inside and outside their borders, respectively. One view is that states are required to meet a quite extensive set of needs on the part of their own citizens (including, for example, needs for elaborate and expensive forms of medical treatment), whereas their obligations to outsiders are more limited, and confined to cases such as famine or epidemic where lives are at risk. Others would challenge this distinction, and argue that where needs are at stake states have a duty to be impartial, so that if state \(S\) is for some reason unable to meet the extensive needs of its own citizens, other states have a duty to step in and fill the gap (See global justice).
2. Skepticism about Needs and Common Response Strategies
Many kinds of concerns have been raised about needs playing an important role in moral and political philosophy. We might divide these into two main categories. The first category focuses on whether or not we can identify clear criteria for determining needs, in particular those needs that are capable of playing such a role. In the second category the common theme is the inadequacy of need as a guide to our moral or political obligations. In the first part of this section we canvass some of these common concerns and in section 2.3 review some common response strategies.
2.1 Insufficiently Objective
2.1.1 Are we Able to Compose a List of Needs that is Sufficiently Objective to Ground Relevant Obligations?
For need to play the fundamental normative role that its advocates envisage, it seems essential that there should be a consensus on what people really need. However, looking around at what people claim to need, we seem to be confronted with diverse, sometimes conflicting, possibilities. Consider, for instance, how members of a Bedouin tribe may claim to need some camels, pita bread, good copies of the Koran, and swords, in order to live a minimally good life. By contrast, so-called Millennials living in New York might claim that good Internet access, technological connectivity, and reliable mass transit systems are fundamental to their well-being. The concern here is that we will be unable to derive one robust list of needs that captures this variety, and is applicable to all people. Even if we limit our focus to one particular society we will note that there is still enormous variety in what people claim to need. Some may claim to be unable to enjoy life without music, art, long walks in natural habitats, or a large group of like-minded friends. Others might see no value in this list of reported essentials. Faced with such claims, how can real needs be identified?
2.1.2 Can Needs be Sharply Distinguished from Desires, Wants or Preferences?
Philosophers who write about the concept of need are keen to emphasize how needs differ from desires, wants, and preferences: we often want things that we do not need, and equally we may not want what we need because we fail to recognize its importance to us (all of this seems abundantly clear when we observe the eating patterns of many young children). Since, in general, we only have weak reasons to satisfy people’s desires and preferences, this contrast seems important if we want to maintain that meeting claims of need is morally obligatory (see e.g. Miller 2014, 20–22).
Yet on further reflection we may begin to doubt whether such a categorical separation between needs and wants is feasible. This relates back to the first set of concerns already mentioned in 2.1.1. We might observe that some things we once considered to be more aptly described as preferences, desires or wants have widely come to be thought of as needs. Examples of this phenomenon might include access to computers, the Internet, television sets, refrigeration, and central heating, which are widely thought of as among the necessities of modern life. Given these changes over time concerning what is regarded as a need, the suspicion may arise that a need is nothing more than a desire whose satisfaction has become socially expected, and therefore lacks the special moral force that its defenders claim for it.
2.2 The Undesirability of Distribution According to Need
Needs as grounds of distribution might be attacked by those who are keen to promote the virtues of self-reliance, self-sufficiency, and social independence. Rather than demanding of others that they should meet our needs, an objector might maintain that we should transcend our neediness, associated as it is with weakness, frailty, vulnerability, and other pathetic parts of our nature. Attending to need can be debilitating for both giver and receiver, on this line of objection. On the giver’s part, the demandingness of need is felt to threaten her capacity to carry out her own plan of life. Emerson gave vent to this thought:
Do not tell me, as a good man did today, of my obligation to put all poor men in good situations. Are they my poor? I tell thee, thou foolish philanthropist, that I grudge the dollar, the dime, the cent, I give to such men as do not belong to me and to whom I do not belong (Emerson 1901, 59).
On the receiver’s side, being dependent on others to meet our needs renders us subservient to them. Consider Adam Smith’s remark:
Nothing tends so much to corrupt and enervate and debase the mind as dependency, and nothing gives such noble and generous notions of probity as freedom and independence (Smith 1982 (originally 1762–1763), 333).
For Smith, commercial exchange in a free market serves to prevent the noted vices. Markets foster self-reliance, social independence, and exchange among equals, freeing us from relations of dominance, subservience, and servility.
In addition, if the state is in the business of attending to people’s needs, this raises the spectre of a bureaucratic, nanny state fostering one-sided dependence among citizens. The idea of distribution according to need, it is said, invokes or lends itself to a passive conception of agency. Those to whom goods are distributed will be seen as recipients of the state’s largesse. More worrisomely, the beneficiaries themselves may come to abandon the attempt to meet their own needs, as state policies promote a culture of dependence. This is destructive of people’s own sense of their agency and empowerment, and destructive of the very ethos a good society should be promoting. We should instead be encouraging people to take responsibility for their own well-being.
2.2.1 Paternalism and Abuse
Critics argue that using need as a criterion of distribution lends itself to paternalism, authoritarianism, or abuse. To ensure parity of treatment, an outside agency must decide what needs different people have. But it may seem instead that people should be allowed the freedom to decide for themselves what their needs are, how they should matter, and what weight should attach to them compared with other considerations that might subjectively seem more important. Griffin gives the example of a group of scholars having to choose between an extension to their library and exercise equipment to promote their health (Griffin 1986, 45). The latter can be construed as a need, whereas the former is only an informed desire, since it depends on aims that are peculiar to the scholarly community. Yet, Griffin argues, it would be odd to say that there is an obligation to provide the equipment that the scholars value less in preference to the resource that they value more. As those whose wellbeing is at issue, the scholars should be the ones to make judgements about how to weigh their needs with other core aspects of their wellbeing.
In short, distributing in accordance with needs allows too many opportunities for outsiders to get these matters wrong or to act paternalistically with regard to those they aim to assist. It is best to have individuals be in charge of managing their needs in the contexts of their own lives.
2.2.2 Bottomless Pits
Here the charge is that, once we think of needs as imposing obligations on us, there will be too many for us to satisfy. Some will be especially demanding. Consider how many medical needs are in this category, such as needs for renal dialysis machines or needs associated with organ transplantation. Even to attempt to meet all of them would be excessively burdensome on those who are required to assist, whether as charity donors or taxpayers.
There are at least two kinds of concerns associated with this “bottomless pit” worry. Reflecting, for instance, on the cost of meeting medical needs within most high-income countries and the fact that healthcare budgets are under significant pressures (even though reasonably high proportions of public resources are allocated to healthcare), it seems that we cannot satisfy all the healthcare needs that present themselves within our societies. Given scientific and technical advances, there will be an indefinitely large number of possible new treatments to promote the quality of life and to prolong it. So since the healthcare budget is finite, and limited by competing demands on public funds, it seems that in this area needs are in principle insatiable: there will always be more that we might do to fulfil them.
This in principle insatiability concern can easily transform into an overdemandingness concern if we extend the scope of the needs that we have a responsibility to meet to other societies besides our own. Consider the vast number of people across the planet who have unmet needs for healthcare alone, never mind all the other domains in which their needs go unfulfilled. One might easily conclude that if needs have normative force, we will be overwhelmed by the apparent bottomless pits of needs that exist globally.
2.3 Common Strategies for Responding to such Skepticism
Many philosophers have engaged with these kinds of objections. One strategy frequently used to address concerns related to a lack of objectivity is to argue that what counts as a need, especially one that is to have normative importance, can be decided in principled ways (e.g. Braybrooke 1987, Doyal and Gough 1991, Wiggins 1987). Various authors delineate the principles differently though there is also important convergence and overlap, as we discuss in section 3 below. A common theme is that the needs that are normatively salient, especially in political distribution, are those that are necessary, indispensable, or inescapable, given the kinds of creatures that we are and the requirements for functioning in social settings.
All authors grapple somewhat with the level at which we should specify what it is people need. While reflection on our common humanity might well be an important source of understanding about what humans need, to articulate that more precisely we need to engage with particular social contexts to flesh out any lists that will apply within particular societies and have purchase in policy matters. One common distinction in the literature is to differentiate between needs and their satisfiers. The idea is that we can give a fairly high-level statement of our human needs, but for particular societies we will often require a more specific account of what forms the satisfiers could take in those societal contexts. So to illustrate, we might say that all people need sufficient health and sufficient protection from environmental hazards. To specify what that amounts to for members of particular societies, we need to examine threats to health in particular environments (along with whatever general ones also apply to all human beings). Consider how prudent precautions for Inuit will differ from those that are recommended in societies where mosquito-borne illnesses are rampant (even if it is also true that a number of similar precautions apply to both). And this will be the case for all our human needs. Even when we make claims about our human needs, the forms that satisfying those needs may take in particular societies can admit of huge variation.
So, differentiating between needs and their satisfiers plays an important role in explaining some of the diversity we see reflected around the world, along with some of the diversity we see within societies. Consider an intra-societal example. While we all might have a need for appropriate recreation, the form this takes may well vary. For some, recreational needs are satisfied by listening to music, while for others nothing short of mountain walking will do. So while some people claim that they couldn’t possibly live without music, and other say the same about walking in the mountains, what they are disagreeing about is satisfiers rather than basic human needs. They can agree that there is a need for recreation even if they disagree about the form satisfaction of the need should take for them.
Another distinction that can often account for other examples of apparent diversity is also worth mentioning. As David Braybrooke suggests, there is a difference between ‘adventitious needs’ and ‘course-of-life’ needs (Braybrooke 1987, 29). Adventitious needs are those that become important given a certain project, practice, or activity. But within one society not all citizens may wish to undertake those activities. The needs may not be shared by all, even if it is true that the item claimed to be needed is indeed essential to undertake that activity. By contrast, a course-of-life need is one that is widely shared and is not dependent on particular projects; during the course of human lives lived in that society, one typically needs items on the list.
In response to the concerns that distribution according to need is undesirable because it lends itself to paternalism, authoritarianism, undesirable conceptions of agency, or overwhelming demands, a common approach is to point out that each of the objections makes dispensable assumptions. For instance, why assume that the individuals whose needs are a target of policy will not play a role in the relevant determinations of what they need, how these might best be satisfied, or other important features of needs policy? In fact, on several important accounts, the decision procedures concerning how to settle questions of need should include a range of individuals, including those in need (Braybrooke 1987, Doyal and Gough 1991). So distribution according to need is not automatically vulnerable to charges of paternalism, and the like. Particular decision-making procedures for arriving at policies about needs may well be characterized in these terms, but this is not an inevitable feature of all such policies.
The concern about being overwhelmed by a bottomless pit of needs-related responsibilities can be deflated similarly using various strategies. One is to point out that claims of need might have variable importance depending on key features such as the relationships among relevant parties, resources available, and the burdens that meeting them would place on others (e.g. Copp 1998, Brock 2009). And, of course, the issue of responsibilities that needs generate and how to distribute responsibilities for meeting needs is an enormous topic (e.g., Braybrooke 1987, Miller 1999, Miller 2007), one that will be discussed below (for instance, in sections 4 and 5). For now, it is worth pointing out that we need not assume what this objection does, namely that meeting needs is an all or nothing affair, so that either needs have normative force (in which case they have too much) or else they can have none at all.
3. Some Influential Accounts of the Normatively Salient Needs
Philosophers have suggested various ways to identify the needs that warrant normative attention. While there are several common elements in these accounts, they also reveal important differences. We review here five of the more prominent accounts in the philosophical literature on needs.
Harry Frankfurt (1984) asks how needs must be understood if they are to have the special moral significance that we attribute to them relative to mere desires. He argues that we must distinguish between free volitional needs, where an item is needed only to satisfy a desire over which a person has control—he could choose not to have it; constrained volitional needs, where an item is needed to satisfy a desire a person cannot rid himself of, such as an addiction; and non-volitional needs that are entirely independent of desires, such as a sick person’s need for medicine. Only in the case of the latter two categories of need will a person be harmed by being denied what she needs, Frankfurt argues, and it is only these needs that have the special moral force that the language of ‘need’ is usually understood to convey.
Harm arising from factors beyond one’s control is also central to why needs matter, when they do, on David Wiggins’s account (1987, 1998). Wiggins develops these ideas and introduces various terms to reflect central features of the concept. There is the gravity of the harm that would ensue if the need is not met (‘badness’), which is different from the urgency to prevent harm from ensuing. Needs may be entrenched when they are inflexible to modification, or substitutable when they are not. A need is basic if it results from a law of nature, an unalterable and invariable environmental fact, or a fact about human constitution. Using this terminology, Wiggins defines vital needs as ones that are bad in a way that is entrenched and scarcely substitutable, and it is these vital needs that matter morally according to him.
David Braybrooke (1987) develops an account of basic needs that connects needs to social functioning. For Braybrooke something is a basic need if, without its satisfaction, one would be unable to carry out four basic social roles, namely, those of citizen, parent, householder, and worker. By reflecting on what is needed to have the genuine choice to adopt the role or carry out tasks associated with it, we can arrive at a list of needs. To assist in this process he also examines several proposed lists and extracts many common elements that, over the course of a life, are necessary for the four roles he identifies as important. Focusing on what humans typically do (through consideration of these roles) provides Braybrooke with a good reference point for compiling this list. The needs that make the list are the need for a life-supporting relation to the environment; for whatever is indispensable to preserving the body intact in important respects (including food, water, exercise, and periodic rest); for companionship; for education; for social acceptance and recognition; for sexual activity; for recreation; and for freedom from harassment, including not being continually frightened.
Len Doyal and Ian Gough (1991) offer a highly influential account that aims to connect philosophical and empirical disciplines. On their view, needs are universalizable preconditions that enable non-impaired participation in any form of life. Physical health and autonomy (by which they mean the mental competence to deliberate and choose) are the two basic needs. An additional class of intermediate needs connect these two basic needs with social science knowledge that can be useful in measuring needs fulfilment. The intermediate needs are nutritious food and clean water, protective housing, a non-hazardous work environment, a non-hazardous physical environment, appropriate health care, security in childhood, significant primary relationships, physical security, economic security, appropriate education, safe birth control, and safe child-bearing. Armed with these intermediate needs they drill down even further, offering specific ideas about the kinds of metrics we should adopt to help gain a sense of whether needs are being met. These metrics are also helpful in measuring progress with respect to meeting needs over time.
David Miller (1999, ch. 10; 2007, ch. 7) follows Wiggins conceptually in defining needs as conditions that must be met if a person is not to suffer harm. But the harm in question is not merely physiological. Instead, on Miller’s view, a person is harmed when she is unable to live a minimally decent life in the society to which she belongs. Needs, therefore, cannot be identified without reference to the social norms that define the requirements of decency in a particular place. Since this will depend on cultural factors peculiar to each society, Miller further distinguishes between basic needs and societal needs, where the former are understood as the conditions required for a decent life in any society, and the latter as the larger set of requirements for a decent life in the particular society to which a person belongs. Thus food is a basic need, while literacy is a societal need in any technologically advanced society. Miller argues that this societal variability does not impugn the objectivity or moral force of need claims.
There are some important common elements to these and other recent accounts of normatively salient needs. The needs that matter morally are those that are necessary, indispensable, or inescapable, at least with respect to some important goals such as human functioning in social groups (Braybrooke 1987, Thomson 1987, Wiggins 1998), our ability to function as human agents (Copp 1998, Gewirth 1978, O’Neill 1998, Shue 1980), or promoting human flourishing (Reader 2005) especially when we consider the many ways in which human agents typically engage with their social environments. While needs theorists are of the view that normatively salient needs must be importantly connected to functioning in social settings, they vary on whether only widely shared needs can have this standing or whether needs that are specific to particular people can have this standing as well. Reader (2007, chs. 4–5) is notable for her claim that there is nothing normatively special about needs that are rooted in common human nature, though she adds that while this holds true in moral philosophy, in political philosophy and policy it is understandable that widely recognized and entrenched needs should be the focus of attention.
4. Needs in Recent Theories of Distributive Justice
Given the prominent role that needs appear to play in popular conceptions of social justice, it may seem remarkable that they have been largely sidelined in the theories of distributive justice developed by philosophers over the last half century, as this section will demonstrate. It is perhaps not a surprise that libertarian theorists such as Robert Nozick should deny that justice might require redistribution on behalf of those in need (Nozick 1974, ch. 8; for a critique see Brock 1995). On such a view, while it might be charitable or benevolent to help a person in need, justice is defined in terms of the obligation to respect an individual’s personal and property rights, and so need only becomes relevant when a person’s needy condition is the result of a prior rights-violation (say, because they have been robbed of their means of subsistence).
Most liberal philosophers, however, rather than explicitly rejecting claims of need, have chosen instead to subsume them within some broader theory of justice, thereby denying them any special force. Consider, for example, utilitarian philosophers who advocate using overall welfare, understood either as happiness or as desire satisfaction, as the goal by which proposed policies should be evaluated. Needs will feature indirectly in this picture: an unfulfilled need is likely to be a source of pain or frustration, a fulfilled need a source of satisfaction. But there is no reason of principle to discriminate between, for example, a need and a strong desire. As we saw in section 2.2.1, Griffin (1986) uses the example of scholars preferring to build a library extension in place of a gym to illustrate the error in supposing that needs should always trump well-informed wants. From a welfarist perspective, there is nothing special about meeting claims of need.
John Rawls’s theory of justice is often presented as a corrective to the deficiencies of utilitarianism. But like his utilitarian rivals, Rawls pays no specific attention to needs. In the first full presentation of his theory, what Rawls refers to as ‘the precept of need’ is given one paragraph in a book of 600 pages (Rawls 1971, 276–77). The reason for this neglect is fairly clear. According to Rawls, social justice concerns the distribution of ‘primary goods’—listed as ‘rights and liberties, opportunities and powers, income and wealth’—and he assesses that distribution by looking at how representative individuals occupying different social positions, like unskilled worker, fare. So the need claims of particular individuals, such as those with disabilities or special health care requirements, never enter the picture (see further Sen 1980). Rawls speaks of needs only when discussing the transfer branch of government, which is supposed to correct the market distribution of income and wealth by giving resources to those who are worst off economically. In other words, need-based claims for income are subsumed under the general principle of controlling inequalities so as to maximise the living standard of the least advantaged group—the so-called ‘difference principle’ (Rawls 1971, § 12–13). Rawls mentions in passing a different kind of justice that concerns the allocation of goods to particular persons, but at this stage he simply excludes it from his theory as a potentially misleading distraction (Rawls 1971, 88–89).
In his later presentation of the theory (Rawls 2001), Rawls tried to respond to the charge that he had overlooked one important dimension of social justice by failing to notice how citizens who had the same share of primary goods might nonetheless have very different individual needs (for this criticism, see especially Sen 1980, 1992, ch. 5). He did so by arguing that access to medical care, specifically, should be regarded as one component of the basic bundle of goods whose size the difference principle aimed to maximise (Rawls 2001, § 51). Each citizen could anticipate that over the course of her lifetime she could expect to require some medical treatment, and so access to health care should be factored into the calculation of her life prospects. Rawls did not, however, have anything more specific to say about justice in health care—for instance about who among the needy had the strongest claims to be treated—nor about needs of other kinds, nor about the position of people with serious disabilities who could not aspire to be ‘fully co-operating members of society’. Thus arguably the most influential theory of social justice to have appeared in the last half-century virtually eliminated need as an independent criterion of distribution.
Consider next Ronald Dworkin’s ‘equality of resources’ view (Dworkin 1981). This might appear to give more scope to needs than Rawls’s theory by virtue of the fact that it regards personal capacities and incapacities as among the resources that a theory of justice must take into account. Thus insofar as need can be represented as an internal resource deficiency, we might expect Dworkin to count it as a feature that may entitle its bearer to receive additional resources by way of compensation. And he does indeed devote some attention both to the issue of people with handicaps and to the issue of health care in Dworkin 2000 (especially chs 2 and 8). He tackles this problem through the device of hypothetical insurance: to illustrate this in the case of medical needs, in order to decide what provision a state should make for health care—how much it should spend and what priorities it should adopt when resources are scarce—we should ask what health care insurance people would buy in advance if they did not know what their own medical needs would turn out to be. Since this is likely to vary from one person to the next, depending on how averse they are to particular risks, Dworkin has to stipulate that what justice requires the state to provide is the level of coverage that most people would choose to buy under these conditions. In reaching a decision, people would be expected to trade off buying different levels of insurance against other ways of using their money. So again this is a case in which need considerations get subsumed under a wider principle, in this case compensating people for disadvantages which they would have insured against suffering in advance. Need claims aren’t allowed to have independent force. Dworkin’s answer to the question ‘is satisfying this particular need a matter of justice?’ is ‘it depends on whether people generally would have chosen to purchase insurance against the chance of having it’. The same principle is applied to other misfortunes, such as the chance of becoming unemployed.
Finally here, consider so-called luck egalitarian theories of distributive justice (see, for example, Temkin 1993; Knight 2009; Cohen 2011, Part 1; Knight and Stemplowska 2011; Tan 2012). These hold that no-one should be worse off than anyone else unless they are responsible for being worse-off, for example by developing expensive tastes or gambling away their resources. Conversely, inequalities that can be attributed to brute luck—such as a storm that demolishes my house but not yours—should be compensated for by redistribution from the lucky to the unlucky. At first sight, it looks as though this principle will be sensitive to variations in need: being prone to disease or requiring more calories than average to stay healthy look like exactly the kind of involuntary misfortunes that luck egalitarians will seek to rectify via resource transfers. But notice that special needs of this sort are treated no differently from other sources of disadvantage, like having meagre talents or being born into a poor family. Luck egalitarians use an undiscriminating, and often ill-defined, currency of advantage/disadvantage that can respond to the fact that some people are needier than others, but without giving those differences any special weight. Notice also that a luck egalitarian will distinguish between needs that a person has as a result of her innate bodily features or of accidents that befall her, and needs that she has as a result of lifestyle or other choices for which she is personally responsible, and will mandate that she be compensated only for having special needs in the first category. This has led critics such as Anderson (1999) to accuse the doctrine of harshness for abandoning negligent victims and discriminating among the disabled according to the source of their disability. For luck egalitarians, justice doesn’t require that we should respond to people’s needs regardless of how they have arisen.
5. Distribution According to Need
For those who believe that claims of need can also be claims of justice, the idea that what justice requires is that resources should be distributed according to need has an obvious appeal: the needier someone is, the more resources they should be assigned. Marx famously wrote that in the higher state of communist society, resource distribution would be governed by the principle ‘from each according to his ability, to each according to his needs’ (Marx 1977, 569). But he prefaced this by pointing out that this could only happen once ‘the productive forces have also increased with the all-round development of the individual, and all the springs of co-operative wealth flow more abundantly’—that is to say, scarcity had been overcome. Because of this assumption, it is arguable whether the principle as proposed by Marx should be seen as a principle of justice, or as a principle for a world that has moved beyond the circumstances for justice (see Buchanan 1982; Lukes 1985, ch.4; Wood 1980).
5.1 Proportionality Principle
Under conditions of abundance, it is perfectly clear what distribution according to need entails: everyone should receive the resources that are required to fulfil all of their needs. The much more difficult question is to provide an interpretation of the principle under conditions of scarcity where needs cannot be met in full (for longer discussions, see Miller 1999, ch. 10 and Miller, forthcoming). We can think of each person as having a need-based claim which is measured by the size of the gap between what she now has, and what she would have to be given to meet her need in full. For example, if for a healthy life a woman needs food that provides 2000 kilocalories per day, but the amount of food now available to her only provides 1500, then her claim is for additional food that provides 500 kilocalories. It might then seem that to distribute according to need means to distribute in proportion to the size of claims: the person whose claim is 1000 kcal should receive twice as much food as the person whose claim is 500. This models distribution according to need on distribution according to (comparative) desert, where a proportionality principle is generally thought to be the appropriate one to use. But in the case of needs, there are two objections to this solution.
First, there is no general reason to think that people will be equally effective in converting need-satisfying resources into satisfied needs. This will depend, for example, on the body’s capacity to metabolize food or medicine. So a distribution of resources that is proportionate to initial need claims won’t necessarily bring about a proportionate decrease in those claims. Second, even if conversion rates are the same, applying the proportionality principle will still leave those with larger initial claims worse off. For example, suppose we only have enough food to supply 600 kcal of energy to the two people in the previous paragraph. Using the proportionality principle, we award 400 kcal to the first person and 200 kcal to the second. But the outcome is that the first person is left with an unsatisfied claim for 600 kcal and the second for only 300 kcal. Intuitively, this is not what it means to attend to their needs fairly.
5.2 Equalising Outcomes
This suggests an alternative principle: distribute in whatever way leaves people at the end of the distribution with unsatisfied claims that are as nearly equal in size as possible. In the example given, that would mean aiming for an outcome in which each person falls 450 kcal short of a fully adequate diet. But this too faces objections. One is that it may look implausible in cases where some people are very poor at converting resources into need-satisfaction. Suppose, for example, we have to allocate medical resources between a number of people some of whom are very ill but whose condition can be improved only slightly by the resources we have. The equal outcome principle may entail devoting all of the available resources to those people, and this may seem unfair to those who otherwise could be helped much more. The principle in its unqualified form might also recommend levelling down—i.e., withholding resources from people where supplying them would have the effect of increasing final inequality in need-satisfaction.
5.3 Minimising Neediness
In complete contrast, distribution according to need could be interpreted to mean minimising unmet need, in other words satisfying need claims to the greatest possible extent overall. This, however, seems more like a principle of efficiency than a principle of justice. As such, it is vulnerable to the objection that it doesn’t take seriously the separateness of persons. It is likely to require consistently favouring those who are best at converting resources into need-satisfaction, and conversely it may recommend doing nothing for people who have large need claims but whose situation is such that it can only materially be improved by deploying a lot of resources. Once again this seems intuitively unfair.
5.4 Weighted Priority Principle
It follows that to assess what someone is due under a needs-based principle of distribution, we will have to take into account at least the following three factors: how large their claim is in absolute terms; how large their claim is compared with the claims of others in the relevant group; and how capable they are of converting resources into diminished levels of need. This raises the question whether there is any single principle of distribution that is sensitive to each of these factors. One principle that might appear to be is the weighted priority principle defended, for example, in Crisp 2002. Whereas a strict priority principle tells us always to begin by attending to those with the largest need claims—and therefore fall foul of the problem noted above, of paying no attention to relative capacity to benefit, so that it may instruct us to focus exclusively on bringing about small improvements in the condition of the most needy—a weighted priority principle works differently. It calculates gains by multiplying reductions in needs score by a factor that reflects the absolute starting position of the person in question. So if we return to the simple case where one person needs 1000 kcals and another 500 kcals, and use an arithmetic weighting factor, then we would count reducing the first person’s level of need to 800 kcals as equivalent to reducing the second person’s level of need to 400. The needier person’s gain is treated as twice as significant as the less needy person’s.
But this principle too has implications that in some cases seem counterintuitive. One is that, despite the tilt in favour of the neediest, there are going to be cases in which it advocates helping a large number of less needy people instead. If enough people can have minor headaches relieved at the cost of denying someone a kidney transplant, the principle will advocate doing that. Crisp responds to this problem by introducing a needs threshold such that those with relatively trivial needs are excluded at the first stage of implementation and only come into consideration if there are surplus resources after the weighted priority principle is applied to those above the threshold. But, as he himself puts it, ‘where the threshold falls, of course, is the key question any proponent of this view must answer’ (Crisp 2002, 140).
Another problem with the weighted priority view is that it pays no direct attention to horizontal fairness between people, in the following sense: we think that if two people begin in the same condition of need—say they have sustained similar injuries—there is value in their receiving treatment that gives them the same outcome, so long as this is feasible and not excessively costly. But the weighted priority principle cannot ensure this, since it has a bias in favour of the victim who can be treated at lesser cost; by choosing to treat that person rather than the equally needy other, more needs overall can be satisfied. So although there might be exceptional cases in which we are willing to practice a form of triage, because we can see that treating John’s needs will have opportunity costs that are simply too high, the weighted priority principle risks taking us too far in that direction.
5.5 Effectiveness Principle
A variant on the weighted priority view has been proposed by Hassoun in the form of her ‘effectiveness principle’, defined as follows:
First, rank the possible policies from best to worst according to how much weighted need they alleviate. Second, rank the possible policies from best to worst according to the number of people they help. Third, for each policy, combine its ranking in terms of how much weighted need it alleviates with its ranking for how many people it helps to yield its final score (Hassoun 2009, 259–60).
The new element introduced by Hassoun here is the idea that needs policies are better to the extent that they help more people rather than fewer even if the overall improvement in (weighted) need-satisfaction remains the same. Of course this would be liable to make matters worse in the kind of case that worries Crisp. Where the weighted priority principle can be faulted for allowing many relatively minor need claims to outweigh the more serious claims of a few badly-off people, adding in a component that gives credit simply for the number of people who are aided only adds to the problem. Nonetheless, it is worth asking whether the justice of an allocation should be sensitive to the sheer number of people whose needs are met.
One reason for thinking so might be that it always shows respect for a person to attend practically to their needs, even if only in a small way. So the more people who are treated when an allocation is performed, the more recognition is extended to those in need. The challenge, however, is to understand why sufficient respect is not being shown when everyone’s claims are properly considered by whoever is performing an allocation, even if the end result is that some people get nothing because whatever claim they might have is justifiably outweighed by the stronger claims of other people. So one might question whether the numbers being aided has the deeper significance that Hassoun’s effectiveness principle implies, as opposed merely to providing evidence that no-one’s claim has been overlooked.
The upshot of this discussion is that in conditions of scarcity, there is no uniquely defensible way of spelling out the principle of distribution according to need. We face conflicting imperatives: to meet as many needs as possible, taking into account how much each costs to satisfy, and to preserve comparative justice by ensuring that people whose needs are similar are treated in the same way. This can be presented as a trade-off between efficiency and justice, but since as noted earlier we are often required to meet needs as a matter of justice, it can also be seen as a clash between non-comparative and comparative justice.
6. Needs and Capabilities
Needs have long played a role as guides to public policy, not only domestically but also internationally, where the so-called Basic Needs Approach to global poverty and international development became dominant in the 1970s and early 1980s. More recently, however, it has been displaced by the ‘capabilities approach’ developed especially by Amartya Sen and implemented in policy instruments such as the UN’s Human Development Index. Sen (1984) argued that the basic needs approach was too narrow for these purposes, as well as being defective for a number of other reasons, and should therefore be subsumed within his capabilities approach. In this section we review the arguments for and against replacing needs with capabilities as a tool of policy evaluation (see also Reader 2006). For a much fuller discussion of capabilities themselves, see the entry on the capability approach.
The capability approach provides a way of measuring a person’s level of well-being. It combines two elements: ‘functionings’, that is the various activities that a person performs or states that they achieve, and ‘capabilities’, that is the option of realizing functionings if one so chooses. Thus ‘being adequately nourished’ and ‘working as a computer programmer’ are examples of functionings, whereas ‘having the choice to be adequately nourished’ and ‘having the option to work as a computer programmer’ are examples of capabilities. The approach places most emphasis on capabilities out of a concern for freedom of choice. A concern for functionings alone, it is argued, might justify forcing people to behave in certain ways (eat healthy food, for example). A person’s well-being is then measured by the size of her capability set: the more capabilities she has, the better off she is judged to be.
As will immediately be clear, capabilities capture many more aspects of human well-being than do needs, and this is claimed to be an advantage of the approach. But it comes with a corresponding disadvantage, namely that capabilities lack the normative force that needs possess. Some capabilities (like the option of being adequately nourished) are morally important, while others (like the option to buy a fancy sports car) are trivial. So whereas a person’s being in need always counts as a strong pro tanto reason to aid them, a person’s lacking a capability may be of no moral concern at all.
In response to this problem, Sen has introduced the idea of ‘basic capabilities’, understood as ‘the ability to satisfy certain elementary and crucially important functionings up to certain levels’ (Sen 1992, 45), for use in definitions of global poverty. In this case the basic needs approach and the capabilities approach will converge, since identifying these ‘crucially important functionings’ will involve the same exercise as identifying universal human needs, namely establishing what is necessary for human beings to enjoy a minimally decent life. It is a mistake, therefore, to imagine that by switching from needs to capabilities one can avoid the difficult semi-empirical task of establishing what conditions are essential to human beings if they are to avoid being harmed.
Capability theorists, including Sen, have levelled a number of criticisms against the basic needs approach. One is that the approach is excessively commodity-focused. However, this criticism does not seem to be appropriate if we look at either the original or subsequent defenders of needs as a policy tool for international development (though perhaps the complaint has more traction if targeted at the implementation priorities of the time). The original defenders often included non-material needs, such as employment (Streeten 1981; Stewart 1985). More generally, there is no reason to assume that only commodities are relevant need satisfiers, and this is obvious when we look at how needs theorists develop their accounts (see further Reader 2006). Consider Braybrooke (1987) as one prominent example: his list includes such important items as the need for a life-supporting relation to the environment, for social acceptance and recognition, for freedom from harassment, and for companionship. Indeed, reflecting on the whole list, we notice that while commodities might be relevant to satisfying some of these needs, they are not relevant to (or only a very small part of) fulfilling most of the items on his list.
A second charge levelled by Sen is that ‘a concentration on just the minimum requirements may lead to a softening of the opposition to inequality in general’ (Sen 1984, 515). This draws attention to the fact that needs define a standard of sufficiency (see Frankfurt 2015) and cannot be appealed to directly to determine how any available surplus resources above that line should be allocated. However the point should not be overstated. In today’s world, reducing inequality by redistribution from rich to poor may be a necessary precondition for meeting everyone’s basic needs. Moreover if we widen the focus to consider needs that arise in particular societies, we will often find that needs and inequality interact, since what is essential for a minimally decent life will depend in part on the general standard of living in the society in question. It is for this reason that poverty is often defined in relative terms, as having an income below a certain percentage of the social median.
Finally, the most prominent claim made on behalf of the capability approach is that, unlike a needs-based approach, it puts front and center the values of choice and participation (Alkire 2002 and 2005). There are several responses available to this objection. First, the charge assumes that the recipients of needs-meeting policy will not have their choices respected and, more generally, will not participate in activities aimed at meeting their needs. However we might think that providing options for enabling people to meet their needs, while leaving final choices to them as to whether they avail themselves of those options, is all that plausible needs-directed policy requires. There is plenty of scope for respecting choices consistently with providing such options. Second, capability theorists can be accused of a kind of “freedom fetishism” by overstating the importance of freedom of choice in many cases. Here we might draw attention to the important problem of adaptive preferences which might lead people to fail to seize opportunities that would otherwise allow them to meet their needs. In these circumstances, less weight should be attached to people’s choices or their expressed views about these choices. Indeed capability theorists themselves recognize the force of this point insofar as they include achieved functionings alongside capabilities in their overall metric of personal well-being. In some cases it is the functioning itself, rather than the capability, that matters: if our task is to supply drinkable water to a village that up to now has lacked it, there is no reason to leave the old polluted well open so that the villagers have the capacity to choose between clean and unclean water. Providing clean water is all that should concern us.
7. How Concern with Needs is Covered in Some Other Prominent Debates
For much of this entry we have been considering needs in a societal context and have focused on needs-related responsibilities to currently existing members of our society. But questions about responsibilities in connection with needs are certainly not confined to this context. Are nonhuman animals’ needs normatively salient, and if so, how should they be weighed against human needs? Should the needs of future generations bear on current decisions concerning distributing according to need? How should the grave and urgent needs of those in low-income countries condition responsibilities to meet less dire needs of compatriots? These kinds of questions raise a huge range of further issues that we cannot discuss here. Fortunately, there are several entries in this Encyclopedia that discuss such questions and several of these are listed in the section on Related Entries below. For more on the first question see moral status of animals. For more on the second issue see intergenerational justice. For more on the third topic see global justice and international distributive justice.
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