Robert Nozick’s Political Philosophy

First published Sun Jun 22, 2014; substantive revision Thu Apr 21, 2022

Robert Nozick (1938–2002) was a renowned American philosopher who first came to be widely known through his 1974 book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia (1974),[1] which won the National Book Award for Philosophy and Religion in 1975. Pressing further the anti-consequentialist aspects of John Rawls’ A Theory of Justice, Nozick argued that respect for individual rights is the key standard for assessing state action and, hence, that the only legitimate state is a minimal state that restricts its activities to the protection of the rights of life, liberty, property, and contract. Despite his highly acclaimed work in many other fields of philosophy, Nozick remained best known for the libertarian doctrine advanced in Anarchy, State, and Utopia.

1. Nozick’s Life and Times

Robert Nozick was born in Brooklyn in 1938 to a Russian Jewish immigrant family. He earned an undergraduate Philosophy degree from Columbia University in 1959 and a Ph.D. in Philosophy from Princeton University in 1963. He taught for a couple of years at Princeton, Harvard, and Rockefeller Universities before moving permanently to Harvard in 1969. He became widely known through his 1974 book, Anarchy, State, and Utopia, which shocked the philosophical world with its robust and sophisticated defense of the minimal state—the state that restricts its activities to the protection of individual rights of life, liberty, property, and contract and eschews the use of state power to redistribute income, to make people moral, or to protect people from harming themselves. Nozick went on to publish important works that ranged over metaphysics, epistemology, the philosophy of science, and axiology—Philosophical Explanations (1981), The Examined Life (1989), The Nature of Rationality (1993), Socratic Puzzles (1997), and Invariances (2001). Nozick’s always lively, engaging, audacious, and philosophically ambitious writings revealed an amazing knowledge of advanced work in many disciplines including decision theory, economics, mathematics, physics, psychology, and religion. Robert Nozick died in 2002 from stomach cancer for which he was first treated in 1994.

As an undergraduate student at Columbia and at least in his early days as a graduate student at Princeton, Nozick endorsed socialism. At Columbia, he was a founder of what was to become the local chapter of Students for a Democratic Society. The major force in his conversion to libertarian views was his conversations at Princeton with his fellow philosophy graduate student, Bruce Goldberg. It was through Goldberg that Nozick met the economist Murray Rothbard who was the major champion of “individualist anarchism” in the later decades of the twentieth century (Raico 2002, Other Internet Resources). Nozick’s encounter with Rothbard and Rothbard’s rights-based critique of the state (Rothbard 1973 and 1978)—including the minimal state—lead Nozick to the project of formulating a rights-based libertarianism that would vindicate the minimal state. There is, however, an intriguing lacuna in this story. Goldberg himself and the economists whose writings are often said to have influenced Nozick’s conversion to libertarianism—F.A. Hayek and Milton Friedman—were not at all friends of natural rights theory. So, we have no account of why the libertarianism that Nozick himself adopted came in the form of natural rights theory (and an associated doctrine of acquired property rights).

This account of the political philosophy of Robert Nozick is fundamentally an account of the rights-oriented libertarian doctrine that Nozick presents in Anarchy, State, and Utopia. That doctrine is the Nozickean doctrine.[2] Nozick never attempted to further develop the views that he expressed in ASU,[3] and he never responded to the extensive critical reaction to those views. Nozick did seem to repudiate at least some aspects of the ASU doctrine in The Examined Life and The Nature of Rationality (Nozick 1989: 286–296). Nozick’s real or apparent repudiation in these works turned on his doctrine of symbolic utility which cannot be examined here.[4] At later yet points in his life Nozick downplayed his apparent repudiation of political libertarianism.[5] In a 2001 interview, he said:

… the rumors of my deviation (or apostasy!) from libertarianism were much exaggerated. I think [Invariances] makes clear the extent to which I still am within the general framework of libertarianism, especially the ethics chapter and its section on the “Core Principle of Ethics”. (Sanchez 2001, Other Internet Resources)

According to that chapter, there are a number of layers of ethics. The first of these is the ethics of respect which consists of a set of negative rights. This layer and only this layer may be made mandatory in any society. “All that any society should (coercively) demand is adherence to the ethics of respect” (Nozick 2001: 282).

There are four main topics that most deserve discussion with respect to Anarchy, State, and Utopia. They are: (1) the underpinning (if any) and the character and robustness of the moral rights that constitute the basic normative framework for most of Anarchy, State, and Utopia; (2) the character and degree of success of Nozick’s defense of the minimal state against the charge by the individualist anarchist that “the state itself is intrinsically immoral” (ASU 51); (3) Nozick’s articulation and defense of his historical entitlement doctrine of justice in holdings and his associated critique of end-state and patterned doctrines of distributive justice, especially John Rawls’ difference principle (as defended in A Theory of Justice); and (4) Nozick’s argument that utopian aspirations provide a complementary route to the vindication of the minimal state. Our discussion of the first two topics focuses on Part I of ASU, entitled “State-of-Nature Theory or How to Back into a State without Really Trying”. Our investigation of the third topic, the historical entitlement doctrine of just holdings and competing conceptions of distributive justice, focuses on chapter 7, “Distributive Justice” of Part II of ASU, “Beyond the Minimal State?” Our discussion of the fourth topic, the utopian route to the minimal state, focuses on chapter 10, “A Framework for Utopia”, which is the whole of Part III of ASU, “Utopia”. Focusing on these four core topics leaves aside many of Nozick’s rich and intriguing side discussions.

2. Moral Rights and Side-Constraints

Anarchy, State, and Utopia opens with the famously bold claim that “Individuals have rights, and there are things no person or group may do to them (without violating their rights)” (ix).

2.1 State of Nature Rights

These moral rights are understood as state of nature rights. That is, they are rights that precede and provide a basis for assessing and constraining not only the actions of individuals and groups but also the conduct of political and legal institutions. These rights also precede any social contract; they morally constrain the conduct of individuals, groups, and institutions even in the absence of any social contract. In Locke’s language, these rights constitute a law of nature—or an especially important part of a law of nature—that governs the pre-political and pre-contractual state of nature (Locke 1690: Second Treatise §6).

Moreover, to possess such a right is not merely to be in some condition the promotion or maintenance of which is socially expedient. Part of the message of that opening proclamation is that there are certain things that may not be done to individuals even if, by some standard, they are socially optimizing. The rights that individuals have are moral bulwarks against behavior that promotes even the most radiant—or apparently radiant—social end. In addition, these state of nature moral rights are taken to be negative. They specify types of conduct that may not be done to individuals rather than types of conduct that must be done for people.

Finally, since these rights are not granted by institutions, created by any contractual process, or accorded to individuals for the sake of advancing some optimal social outcome, if they have any foundation, that foundation must consist in some morally impressive fact about the nature of individuals qua individuals. Some morally impressive fact about the nature of individuals—e.g., that they each have ends or projects of their own to which they rationally devote themselves—must provide others with reason to not treat them certain ways, e.g., as beings who ought to serve the ends of others. We shall see that Nozick advances a claim of this sort in his account of why agents should abide by moral side-constraints in their conduct toward others.

Recourse to the familiar distinction between claim-rights and liberty-rights will enable us to be somewhat more precise about the state of nature rights that Nozick ascribes to each individual. Liberty-rights are absences of obligations. You have a liberty-right to scratch your nose as long as you have no obligation not to. Claim-rights are moral (and enforceable) claims against others to their acting or not acting in certain ways. You have a claim-right against others not to be interfered with in the scratching of your nose if and only if others have an (enforceable) obligation not to interfere with you in this way. Standardly, when we speak of rights we are speaking of composites of liberty-rights and claim-rights. For instance, standardly, your right to scratch your nose consists in your having no obligation not to do so and others having (enforceable) obligations not to interfere with your doing so. Your moral liberty to scratch your nose is morally protected by your (enforceable) claim against others that they not interfere with your doing so.

When Nozick asserts that individuals possess pre-political, pre-contractual moral rights against certain things being done to them—even for the sake of ends that are or purport to be socially optimal—he is most obviously ascribing claim-rights to individuals correlative to which are pre-political and pre-contractual moral obligations of each agent not to do certain things to other individuals. Since, all state of nature obligations (that are rights-correlative and, hence, enforceable) are negative, in the state of nature individuals are morally at liberty to engage in any conduct that does not transgress others’ state of nature claim-rights. Thus, Nozick’s opening proclamation of rights affirms for each individual extensive liberty-rights—extensive freedom from obligations, especially positive obligations—that are systematically protected against interference by moral claim-rights. It needs to be mentioned that these moral rights are taken to be people’s baseline rights; they are rights that are subject to contraction or expansion through an individual’s actions and interactions. So, e.g., although each individual has a natural right against all others not to be struck in her nose, each may waive that right by agreeing to take place in a boxing match, and each may acquire a liberty-right to strike the other party to the boxing contract.

2.2 The Foundation of Rights

It is a commonplace to say that in ASU Nozick provides no foundation for his affirmation of such Lockean natural rights (Nagel 1975). And, not many pages after Nozick proclaims these rights, he himself points out that his book provides no “precise theory of the moral basis of individual rights” (xiv). Nevertheless, Nozick does have important things to say about the underpinning of these rights and about their deontic character and their stringency. Indeed, it is striking that, when Nozick seeks to motivate his opening affirmation of rights, he starts with the same understanding and critique of utilitarianism that Rawls offers in A Theory of Justice when Rawls begins to motivate his contractarian doctrine. What separates Nozick from Rawls at this very basic level is a difference in their construal of the implications of this common critique. Nozick may, in this way, offer as much of a foundation for adopting his natural rights stance as Rawls offers in A Theory of Justice for adopting his contractarian stance.

As is well known, Rawls starts by ascribing to the utilitarian the claim that the rationality of a certain principle of social choice can be inferred from the rationality of a certain principle of individual choice. The principle of individual choice is that, at least if no other party is affected, it is rational for an individual to incur costs for herself (or to forego benefits for herself) if doing so will spare her greater costs (or provide her with greater benefits). According to Rawls, the utilitarian holds that by parity of reasoning it is rational for a member of society to incur costs for herself (or to forego benefits for herself) if doing so will spare any member of society greater costs (or provide any member of society with greater benefits). This is the purported rational principle of social choice. Thus, we get to the utilitarian conclusion that each agent as a member of society has reason to maximize the aggregate social good even at the expense of the individual good of herself (or others).

As is also well-known, Rawls rejects this reasoning on the grounds that it does not take seriously the separateness and distinctness of persons. Persons are markedly more separate and distinct from one another than are the different phases or time-slices of a given person’s life. Because of this, one cannot proceed from its being worthwhile for a given person to incur costs for herself in order to spare herself greater costs to its being worthwhile for a given person as a member of society to incur costs for herself in order to spare any member of society greater costs. According to Rawls, only if we conflate individuals—only if we mistakenly conceive of them as parts of a single person-like being, will the utilitarian principle of social choice be on a par with the principle of individual choice (Rawls 1971: 26–7).

Rawls summarizes his primary case against utilitarianism by saying,

… if we assume that the correct regulative principle for anything depends on the nature of that thing, and the plurality of distinct persons with separate systems of ends is an essential feature of human societies, we should not expect the principles of social choice to be utilitarian. (Rawls 1971: 29)

This summation goes well beyond the dismissal of the utilitarian regulative principle. For it strongly suggests a criterion for identifying the correct regulative principle (or set of principles) for the governance of social interaction. Such regulative principles must differ significantly from the utilitarian principle by being responsive to or reflective of the plurality of distinct persons with separate systems of ends. We should note here that what is crucial is not the bare normatively neutral fact that individuals have separate systems of ends but, rather that individuals rationally seek to promote their own ends. It is the rational propriety of each person’s pursuit her own good that basic regulative principles need to be responsive to or reflect. Rawls then offers his crucial contractarian construal of how regulative principles qualify as being responsive to or reflective of the plurality of persons. According to Rawls, they so qualify by being principles that all individuals concerned with the promotion of their own systems of ends would agree to under circumstances suitable for such agreement.

It is striking that Nozick proceeds through a highly similar critical treatment of utilitarianism when he asks why persons may not be violated for the greater social good.

Individually, we each sometimes choose to undergo some pain or sacrifice for a greater benefit or to avoid a greater harm… In each case, some cost is borne for the sake of the greater overall good. Why not, similarly, hold that some persons have to bear some costs that benefit other persons more, for the sake of the overall social good? (ASU 32)

Nozick’s response to this question is,

But there is no social entity with a good that undergoes some sacrifice for its own good. There are only individual people, different individual people, with their own individual lives. Using one of these people for the benefit of others, uses him and benefits the others. Nothing more. What happens is that something is done to him for the sake of others. Talk of an overall social good covers this up. (32–3)

Here Nozick makes things too easy for himself by ascribing to the utilitarian a belief in a social entity—as Rawls makes things too easy for himself by saying that the utilitarian argument depends on fusing or conflating persons. For the utilitarian may simply hold that the best explanation for the rationality of a given person incurring some cost for herself in order to avoid some greater cost for herself is the unrestricted rationality of minimizing net costs (or maximizing net benefits). According to this utilitarian, we do not have to move from the principle of individual choice to the principle of social choice. For, we start with the unrestricted rationality of minimizing costs (or maximizing benefits); and the principle of individual choice is simply the application of that principle of social choice to the special case in which there is only one agent who is also the one subject of benefits and costs.

To counter the contention that, at the outset, practical rationality calls for the minimization of net costs (or the maximization of net benefits), Rawls and Nozick need to hold that what makes it practically rational for a given individual to incur some cost to herself (or forego some benefit for herself) is the avoidance of some greater cost to herself (or the attainment of some greater benefit for herself). They need to hold that (at least absent further argument) the rational balancing of costs incurred (or benefits foregone) and costs avoided (or benefits attained) must take place within lives and not across lives. And this does seem to be part of the intended force of Rawls’ invocation of a “plurality of distinct persons with separate systems of ends”[6] and of Nozick’s insistence that there are “only individual people, different individual people, with their own individual lives” (33). In Nozick this stance is most explicit when he parses “the fact of our separate existences” as,

… the fact that no moral balancing act can take place among us; there is no moral outweighing of one of our lives by others so as to lead to a great overall social good. There is no justified sacrifice of some of us for others. (33)

Note, however, that this last sentence is ambiguous. It may mean simply that there is no moral balancing across individuals that requires individuals to sacrifice for others or that justifies others in imposing such sacrifices. However, that sentence may also mean that “no one may be sacrificed for others” (33) in the sense that those who impose such sacrifices wrong the individuals who are subjected to those losses. That is, it may also mean that there is (in Rawls’ terminology) a “correct regulative principle” that forbids and condemns the imposition of such sacrifices. It is clear that Nozick intends to assert this further claim even though he does not explicitly recognize that it is a further and distinct proposition. For, according to Nozick, one will not “sufficiently respect and take account of the fact that he [i.e., any given individual] is a separate person, that his is the only life he has” (33) unless one morally condemns and eschews uses of that person—in particular, impositions of losses on that person for the sake of (what purports to be) the social good.

The “fact of our separate existences” is “the fact that that no moral balancing act can take place among us” (because costs and benefits add up within persons’ lives and not across them). In contrast, the further fact that there are moral side-constraints against imposing sacrifices on some to serve the interests of others is a reflection of the “fact of our separate existences”. We come to the affirmation of those side-constraints when we sufficiently respect and take account of the separateness of persons.[7] This is what Nozick must mean when he says that “The moral side constraints upon what we may do… reflect the fact of our separate existences” (33). The fact of our separate existences—as Nozick parses that fact—is the morally impressive fact about the nature of individuals that provides us with reason to be circumspect in our conduct toward one another. We respect or honor others as agents with rational ends of their own not by promoting their ends as we do our own but, rather, by not sacrificing them to our ends.

If correct regulative principles for social interaction must sufficiently respect and take account of the plurality of distinct persons with separate systems of ends, those regulative principles must not treat persons as means for the attainment of any (putatively) choice-worthy social outcome. Regulative principles that endorse the use of persons for the sake of (purportedly) choice-worthy social outcomes—e.g., the social outcome of there being a choice-worthy distribution of goods among individuals—too much resemble the utilitarian regulative principle. They share the failure of the utilitarian principle to sufficiently respect and take account of the plurality of distinct persons with separate systems of ends. Thus, Nozick contends, correct regulative principles must take the form of moral side constraints upon what may be done to individuals even for the sake of really valuable, choice-worthy social outcomes. Rawls reads the willingness of utilitarianism to impose losses on individuals for the sake of the aggregate good as a mark of utilitarianism’s failure to recognize the status of individuals as ends-in-themselves and not merely means to the ends of others. Nozick follows suit in appropriating this Kantian language (see Cohen 1995: 238–243). But, contrary to Rawls, Nozick maintains that the endorsement of the imposition of sacrifices on individuals for the sake of any (non-trivial) conception of the social good—even, e.g., distribution-sensitive conceptions of the social good—fails to recognize the status of individuals as ends-in-themselves.[8]

So, Nozick offers very much the same type of argument for the existence of some correct regulative principle for social interaction as Rawls does in A Theory of Justice. The difference is that Nozick does not hold that the mark of principles being responsive to or reflective of the fact of our separate existences is that they would be agreed to by everyone under suitable agreement circumstances. Rather, he supposes that we can identify types of treatment of persons as not sufficiently respecting and taking account of the rationality of individuals pursuing of their own good without having to appeal to any actual or hypothetical agreement. In particular, the imposition of sacrifices upon individuals does not sufficiently take account of their being agents who rationally pursue their own systems of ends. The key “moral content gotten by this argument which focuses upon the fact that there are distinct individuals each with his own life to lead” is that “sacrificing one person to benefit another” is morally prohibited (34).

2.3 Rights as Side Constraints

For Nozick, a paradigmatic natural moral right is the right not to be subjected to (unprovoked) killing. Correlative to this right is the moral side constraint to which all individuals are naturally subject not to engage in the (unprovoked) killing of others. As Nozick understands this right, it forbids A’s (unprovoked) killing of B even if A can prevent W from killing X, Y, and Z only by killing B. Although it may in some sense be less bad for B to be killed than for X, Y, and Z to be killed, A remains bound not to kill B. A may not prevent the wrong that W will do in killing X, Y, and Z by killing B. For Nozick, rights express the moral inviolability of individuals; and B would not be morally inviolable—nor would any of us be—were B open to use by A even for the purpose of preventing the violation of the rights of X, Y, and Z. Not even the minimization of the violation of the right against being killed can justify the violation of that right.

According to Nozick, our core reason for abstaining from murder is not that abstention advances the goal of minimizing murders. Indeed, if that were our reason to eschew murder, A should not eschew murdering B if that is the only way that he can prevent W from murdering X, Y, and Z. Rather, Nozick’s deontological claim is that the status that each individual has as an end-in-himself morally constrains each other agent’s conduct toward those individuals. Both A and W are morally precluded from the (unprovoked) killing of B, X, Y, and Z (and of each other). W triply violates this side constraint when he kills X, Y, and Z; but A abides by this constraint only if he abstains from killing B—even if A’s killing of B would (somehow) prevent W’s killing of X, Y, and Z.

It is often thought that there is something paradoxical about deontological propositions like the assertion that everyone is bound to abstain from the (unprovoked) killing of others.[9] This thought rests on two standard consequentialist ideas. The first is that the wrongness of a given sort of action—e.g., (unprovoked) killing—must derive from the badness of the (typical) consequences of actions of that sort. The second is that the badness of the consequences of multiple actions of a given sort can be aggregated so that (typically) the total badness of the results of a bunch of wrongful actions of that sort will be greater than the badness of the results of one action of that sort. For example, the total badness associated with W’s (unprovoked) killings of X, Y, and Z will (typically) be greater than the badness associated with A’s (unprovoked) killing of B. It follows that it will (typically) be wrong for A to abstain from killing B if that is the only way to prevent W’s (unprovoked) killings of X, Y, and Z. The supposed paradox is that the wrongfulness of (unprovoked) killing must rest on the badness of the (typical) results of such killings; but recourse to the badness of results in the assessment of actions (typically) leads to the endorsement of (unprovoked) killings in precisely those cases in which the advocate of deontic constraints wants to insist upon their wrongfulness. However, the construction of this paradox of deontology rests firmly upon ideas that, as we have seen, Nozick has rejected on his way to asserting deontic side constraints.

Nozick also provides a further and seemingly more conventional discussion of the bases for moral constraints in which various lofty capacities that human beings (usually) possess or are thought to possess are cited. He mentions being

[S]entient and self-conscious; rational (capable of using abstract concepts, not tied to responses to immediate stimuli); possessing free will; being a moral agent capable of guiding its behavior by moral principles and capable of engaging in mutual limitation of conduct; having a soul. (48)

To these he adds “the ability to regulate and guide its life in accordance with some overall conception it chooses to accept” (49). But, does the presence of these non-moral features underwrite moral constraints against preventing individuals from exercising these capacities in their own chosen ways? Nozick seeks to bolster the significance of these features by contending that a person can give meaning to his life only by exercising these capacities in accordance with some overall plan of his own (50). The suggestion is that it is not meaningfulness at large that is crucial for each individual but, rather the meaningfulness for him of the life that arises through his exercise of an overall plan for his life.[10] However, Nozick then asks

why not replace ‘happiness’ with ‘meaningfulness’ within utilitarian theory, and maximize the total ‘meaningfulness’ score of the persons in the world? (50)

This is surprising. For one would expect that, in accord with his separateness of persons argument, Nozick would say that the import of each individual having a meaningful life as his end is not a utilitarianism of meaningful lives but, rather, side constraints on interference with each individual’s pursuit of a meaningful life of his own. As Bader points out, for Nozick,

It is not the case that living a meaningful life is the goal that is to be achieved and that rights are the means that permit us to attain this goal. Rather, it is in virtue of the fact that human beings are agents whose lives can have meaning that we need to respect their choices, that we have to let them decide how to live their lives. (Bader 79–80)

2.4 The Attenuation of Rights

Nozick’s account of rights takes a surprising turn in his very complex chapter 4 on “Prohibition, Compensation, and Risk” (Mack 1981). Employing the language of rights as moral boundaries, Nozick asks whether all actions that cross boundaries may be prohibited, i.e., may permissibly be punished.[11] His unexpected answer is that not all boundary crossings may be prohibited. Some boundary crossings are to be allowed—without the consent of those subject to them—as long as due compensation is paid to those subjects. Nozick’s presumption within this chapter is that it does not follow from B’s having a right against A to A’s not inflicting treatment T on B that A’s inflicting T on B may be prohibited (59). All that follows from B’s having that right is that A may not inflict T on B unless A also duly compensates B.[12] All that follows is that B has a claim against A that A’s infliction of T on B not leave B’s utility or welfare on net diminished.

We can describe Nozick’s position here by utilizing the now common distinction between claims that are protected by property rules and claims that are protected by liability rules (338n6). One’s claim with respect to some object O is protected by a property rule if one must be allowed to do as one sees fit with O—as long as one abides by the applicable side constraints. Others may not deprive one of one’s choice with respect to O—even if they also compensate one for the utility or welfare loss of being precluded from doing as one sees fit with O. In contrast, one’s claim with respect to O is merely protected by a liability rule if others may determine (without one’s consent) what is done with O as long as they duly compensate one for the associated utility or welfare loss. In chapter 4, Nozick’s presumption seems to be that all that follows from one’s having a right is that one has a claim that is protected by a liability rule.

Of course, it may be impossible or severely difficult for A to duly compensate B for inflicting treatment T—as when T consists in killing B. Moreover, if it is impossible or severely difficult for A to duly compensate B for a given boundary crossing, A must not cross that boundary without B’s consent. The conjunction of the liability rule claim and the impossibility or difficulty of due compensation yields (the equivalent of) a property rule claim for B against A’s imposing T on B. The further conditions that render due compensation impossible or difficult boost what would otherwise merely be a liability rule claim against being subject to T into (the equivalent of) a property rule claim against being subject to T. As we see in the next section, Nozick thinks that such boosting conditions are pervasive. So, one of the things that Nozick is suggesting in his intricate chapter 4 is that, even the separateness of persons in itself only underwrites claims protected by liability rules, those claims need to be treated as though they are protected by property rules whenever due compensation for infringing upon them would be impossible or not feasible.

Perhaps, we ought not to be too surprised by Nozick’s chapter 4 presumption that in themselves rights are merely claims that are protected by liability rules. For recall the crucial role ascribed to natural rights within Nozick’s separateness of persons argument. That role is to provide individuals with moral protection against having sacrifices (i.e., net losses) imposed upon them. All that rights must do in order to play this role is to require that all boundary-crossings be accompanied by due compensation (and that they not be done if the provision of due accompanying compensation is not feasible).

However, Nozick’s focus on rights having the role of protecting individuals from net losses being imposed upon them raised concerns for him about whether invocations of rights would deliver the strong anti-paternalism that he favored.[13] If rights are in themselves merely claims against having one’s utility or welfare on net lowered by certain interferences, then one will have no right against interferences that on net raise one’s utility or welfare. Arguments that “will prohibit sacrificing one person to benefit another” will not themselves deliver “a prohibition on paternalist aggression” (34). Rights against paternalist interventions that really do serve interests of the paternalized party must protect the choices of that party—even choices that will lower her utility or welfare.

Moreover, the view that rights in themselves are claims protected by liability rules does not comport well with the overall tone of Anarchy, State, and Utopia. Nozick does not begin this work by declaring that there are things that may not be done to individuals unless, of course, they are duly compensated. Nor does the liability rule construal of rights fit well with Nozick’s affirmation of the inviolability of individuals, the Kantian claim that individuals “may not be sacrificed or used for the achieving of other ends without their consent” (31, emphasis added), or the moral sovereignty of individuals (34). Indeed, at one point Nozick himself says that “a system permitting boundary crossing, provided compensation is paid, embodies the use of persons as means…” (71, emphasis added). It embodies the use of persons as means because it allows such use as long as the utility or welfare of the used party is not on net diminished. The provision of due compensation may counteract the imposed loss of utility or welfare; but it does not counteract the wrong of the use.

In the next section, we shall focus on Nozick’s use of this liability rule attenuation of rights in his response to the anarchist. We should note, however, that after disposing of the anarchist Nozick reverts to the more robust property rule understanding of rights. Thus, in chapter 7, on “Distributive Justice”, Nozick says that,

The central core of the notion of a property rights in X … is the right to determine what shall be done with X, the right to choose which of the constrained set of options concerning X shall be realized or attempted. (171)

To have a right in X is to have a claim protected by a property rule. Others’ interference with one’s doing as one sees fit with X is impermissible—even if one is duly compensated for imposed utility or welfare losses. And Nozick goes on to extend this property rule construal to people’s rights in themselves and their labor.

This notion of property helps us understand why earlier theorists spoke of people as having property in themselves and their labor. They viewed each person as having a right to decide what would become of himself and what he would do… (171)

Indeed, in chapter 7, Nozick argues that seizing the fruits of a person’s labor is impermissible because this involves taking the time that this person devoted to this labor without that person’s consent. There is no hint that the taking of that time without that party’s consent would be permissible if only that party were duly compensated. There is no hint that the requirement that this individual consent to any taking depends upon due compensation for such a taking being impossible or severely difficult.

We should also note that this passage about earlier theorists speaking of people as having property in themselves is the closest Nozick ever comes to formulating his own position in terms of a doctrine of self-ownership. Contrary to common presentations of Nozick’s doctrine, there is no mention of self-ownership within his Part I discussion of state of nature theory.[14] Throughout Part I, Nozick is content to have his readers fill in the content of moral side constraints by drawing on their intuitions that, if there are any moral side constraints, they must include constraints against (unprovoked) killing, assaulting, maiming, enslaving. There is, at most, a hint that all of these constraints can be subsumed under a general constraint against aggression (34). (It seems, however, that aggression itself requires explication on the basis of a prior and independent specification of persons’ rights.)

Overall, Nozick maintains that there is something about the separateness of persons—something about the propriety of each seeking his own good in his own chosen way—that does not merely undermine the view that individuals should sacrifice themselves (and others) for the social good. Beyond that undermining, the separateness of persons positively supports each individual’s possession of fundamental, broad, natural, and negative moral claims that hold against all other agents. What Nozick needs is a more clearly articulated and persuasive transition from each individual having ends of his own that he is rational to pursue (and, hence, there being no proper moral balancing across persons) to each individual having a moral status vis-á-vis others that provides others with reason not to interfere with his chosen pursuits even in ways that would be on net beneficial to that individual. Nozick provides material that is suggestive of this transition but certainly not a compelling case for it. Nozick also fails to address the hard question of why—except perhaps to avoid “catastrophic moral horror” (29 footnote*)—rights always trump considerations of personal or social well-being.

On the other hand, it would certainly be unfair to Nozick to insist that there be one or a few core foundationalist arguments on which all of the rest of his doctrine firmly rests. It is clear that Nozick thinks that the coherence that obtains among the stances he develops within ASU enhances the plausibility of each of those stances. For instance, while his historical entitlement theory of justice in holdings is largely grounded in his critique of alternative conceptions of economic justice, Nozick takes the coherence between this theory with his affirmation of basic moral side constraints to increase the plausibility of his doctrine as a whole. Similarly, Nozick takes the coherence of his rights based defense of the minimal state in Part I of ASU with his less moralistic defense of the minimal state as a framework for utopia in Part III to enhance the overall case for the minimal state.[15]

3. The Minimal State versus Individualist Anarchism

The official purpose of Part I of ASU is to rebut the individualist anarchist’s claim that no state, not even the minimal, nightwatchman, state can be justified.[16] In this way, Part I is devoted to what Nozick takes to be the fundamental question of political philosophy, viz., “whether there should be any state at all” (4). Nozick seeks to counter the anarchist’s claim by showing how a minimal state—essentially a state that is limited to the protection of the rights of person, property, and contract—could arise without violating rights. At a later point within this section, we shall have to consider why Nozick focuses upon whether a minimal state could arise without violating rights rather than whether a minimal state could function without violating rights.

3.1 The Challenge of Individualist Anarchism

Nozick expects that it will take a considerable effort to answer the individualist anarchist precisely because this form of anti-statism is itself rooted in the moral rights that Nozick proclaims. Indeed, immediately following his ascription to individuals of pre-political, pre-contractual, negative moral rights Nozick tells us that these rights may so extensively limit the permissible use of force that no room is left for a morally acceptable state.

So strong and far-reaching are these rights that they raise the question of what, if anything the state and its officials may do. How much room do individual rights leave for the state? (ix)

To be clear about Nozick’s response, we first need to be clear about what alternative structure for the protection of rights is envisioned by the individualist anarchist. Second, we need to clearly identify the precise challenge that Nozick needs to overcome.

First, then, Nozick and the individualist anarchist agree that it is one thing for individuals to have rights and another thing for them to have rights to the protection of their rights. It is one thing to have a right against others that they not aggress against one; it is another thing to have rights against others that they protect one against aggression. Being a positive right, the right to protection against violations of one’s rights must arise through some special interaction between the agent who acquires the right and the agent who acquires the correlative obligation. The most common kind of special interaction that gives rise to one agent having a positive right against another is contract. However, the individualist anarchist and Nozick agree that there has never been any general social contract whereby individuals at large acquire from one another positive rights to the protection of their pre-contractual rights. And, “… tacit consent isn’t worth the paper it’s not written on” (287). Hence, if people are to acquire rights to have their rights protected, they must (at least for the most part) go shopping for them.

Moreover, the individualist anarchist asserts—and Nozick is strongly disposed to agree—that shoppers for any sort of service will do best when there is a competitive market in the supply of that sort of service. Competition among good-willed providers of the service of rights protection will induce lower prices and/or higher quality rights protection—including protection against “outlaw” agencies that seek to assist or protect rights violators. The interest of good-willed purchasers of rights protection in non-violent dispute resolution will press competing suppliers of rights protection to join in agreements that more sharply define the boundaries of their clients and establish procedures for resolving disputes among them. Any protective agency that is not part of a network of established conflict diminishing agreements and resolution procedures will be at a huge competitive disadvantage. Nozick refers to the resulting network as the dominant protective association; and he treats the question of whether the minimal state can arise without violating rights as a matter of whether such a dominant protective association can develop into a minimal state without violating rights.

Second, anarchists like Rothbard assert that the creation and maintenance of even the minimal state will violate rights in two fundamental ways. First, even the minimal state will arise through and sustain itself through imposed taxation. Second, even the minimal state will arise through and sustain itself through the coercive suppression or control of competing protective agencies. However, the minimal state that Nozick seeks to defend is simply not subject to the first of these challenges. For, despite some ill-chosen language that suggests the contrary (26–7), Nozick’s minimal state does not impose taxation—even to fund its rights protective activities.[17] Nozick’s minimal state does prohibit individuals who interact with its clients from becoming clients of competing agencies (that are not subject to supervision and constraint by the minimal state). However, it does not require anyone to subscribe to its services. Principled anarchists and even individuals who hope to free-ride on the minimal state’s overall suppression of rights violations[18] are morally at liberty to take their chances.

However, to be a state—even a minimal state—an institution has to have some sort of monopoly on the use of coercive force over a sufficiently large territory or set of people. To rise to statehood within a given territory or with respect to a set of people, a protective agency must fairly successfully fulfill its aspiration to be the suppressor of other actors who seek to engage in rights violating force and (at least) to be the controller of other actors who seek to engage in rights protecting force. Hence, to rise to statehood, a protective agency must either shut down or exercise substantial control over other non-outlaw agencies. In short, it seems that it must act toward its non-outlaw competitors in ways that Nozick would declare to be impermissible among competitors in the delivery of any other sort of service. Nozick must attempt to meet the anarchist’s second challenge by arguing that the dominant protective agency’s establishment of a monopoly in protective services differs markedly from the standard suppression or control of competitors.

3.2 Response to the Anarchist Challenge

Before considering how and how successfully Nozick meets this challenge, we need to take note of a questionable preliminary move on his part. When Nozick mentions the agreements that competing agencies would enter into in order to assure their prospective clients smooth and non-violent dispute resolution, he speaks of the emergence of “a system of appeals courts and agreed upon rules of jurisdiction and the conflict of laws”. He acknowledges that the emergence of this system allows for the continued operation of “different agencies”. Yet he then says that the result is “one unified federal judicial system of which they [presumably the various agencies] all are components” (16). On the basis of this description of the outcome of the networking process Nozick allows himself to speak of the rise of a dominant protective association that is united and federal.

This language seems to paper over the continued existence of “different agencies” which may well compete with one another not merely in terms of prices but also in terms of the packages of protective services they offer in response to diverse consumer demand for such services. So Nozick faces a problem even if he succeeds in showing that the confederation of agencies that emerges from such networking may permissibly eliminate its non-outlaw competitors. For, there may still be too much competition among the confederates that make up the dominant association for it to qualify as a state (Childs 1977 and Mack 1978).

Putting that initial problem aside, one possible way for Nozick to meet the anarchist’s challenge is to maintain that the dominant protective association will eliminate its competitors without using coercive force. Perhaps something about the production and delivery of rights protection makes that enterprise a natural monopoly. Nozick seems to be pursuing this route when he asks and answers the question, “Why would a virtual monopoly arise in this market without the government intervention that elsewhere creates and maintains it?” (17). His answer is that the value of the protective services offered by any agency will increase with the size of its clientele—presumably because disputes among clients of the same agency will be more cheaply or readily resolved than disputes among clients of competing agencies. So, clients of competing agencies will migrate to the dominant association and that migration will increase the incentive for yet others to follow the same path.[19]

However, this claim about the propensity for “virtual” monopoly to arise within the rights protection business is only intended by Nozick to explain the emergence of a dominant protective association; it is not intended to explain that association’s permissible suppression or control of its remaining non-outlaw competitors. Nozick accepts the anarchist contention that, for an agency to rise to or sustain itself as a state, it must suppress or control actual (or potential) non-outlaw competitors. To meet the anarchist’s challenge, Nozick sets out to show how the dominant association’s suppression or control of non-outlaw competitors is not a violation of the rights of those competitors—even though they are non-outlaws.

Nozick’s case relies upon the surprising attenuation of rights that we noted in the previous section, viz., the idea that in themselves rights are claims that are protected by liability rules. Absent further conditions that make due compensation for infringements impossible or severely difficult, rights are merely claims to be duly compensated for losses imposed by certain interferences. Given this construal of rights, the basic structure of Nozick’s response to the anarchist is quite simple. The rights of non-outlaw protective agencies (and non-outlaw independent self-protectors) to engage in their chosen procedures are merely claims that are protected by liability rules. Hence, those procedures may be interfered with as long as those subject to this interference are duly compensated. The anarchist is correct in saying that these non-outlaw agencies and individuals have rights against being interfered with; but he is mistaken in thinking that these rights forbid that interference.

Of course, a further premise is needed for this argument. This is that it will not be impossible or severely difficult to duly compensate those non-outlaw agencies and individuals for interference with their own protective activities and, hence, their claims against such interference do not acquire the force of claims protected by property rules. (If the claims do acquire that force, the anarchist correctly condemns the dominant association’s interference with those agencies or individuals.) To support this further premise, Nozick needs to survey the conditions that do made it impossible or severely difficult to supply due compensation for boundary crossings. A boundary will have the force of a claim protected by a property rule if and only if such a condition is present. Much of the intricacy (and opacity) of ASU’s chapter 4 resides within this survey.

There are some boundary crossings—like killings, maiming, or and lifetime enslaving—for which due compensation is simply impossible.

If some injuries are not compensable, they would not fall under a policy of being allowed as long as compensation is paid. (Rather, they would be allowed provided compensation was paid, but since the compensation could not be paid by anyone, in effect they would be unallowed.) (65–6)

However, Nozick focuses on two factors that severely complicate the task of identifying due compensation for boundary crossings. The first is fear (65–71). Here is one way that fear complicates the identification of due compensation. Suppose we treat the right that each individual has not to have her forearm broken as a claim protected by a liability rule. And suppose further that we know what the due compensation is for having one’s forearm broken. On this basis we decide to allow unconsented to forearm breaking as long as the forearm breaker duly compensates the subject of his ministrations. The effect of this will be to make many people fearful of having their arms broken who will never receive compensation for that fear because their arms will not in fact be broken.[20] Or if people are to be compensated simply for their fear, individuals whose conduct induces fear may be required to make compensation payments even though they never in fact break forearms. These sorts of problems are mitigated if the right not to have one’s forearm broken is treated as a claim protected by a property right.

The second factor that complicates recourse to due compensation for unconsented to boundary crossings is the fact that the best procedure for identifying the due compensation for a crossing is to require antecedent negotiation with and consent by the party who will be subject to the crossing (63–65). The best way to identify the due compensation for A for having her forearm broken by B is to see what payment A will accept to allow B to break her arm. However, this requires the prohibition of the boundary crossing under discussion unless the subject of the action agrees to it. When antecedent negotiation between subject A and actor B is feasible, the best route to due compensation for A (which is required under the liability rule construal of A’s right) consists in treating A’s right against B’s proposed action as a claim that is protected by a property rule. Especially since antecedent negotiation between subjects and actors is usually feasible, even rights that are in themselves only protected by liability rules are usually to be treated as boundaries that may not without consent be crossed.

Nozick describes the task of identifying the compensation due to A for undergoing B’s chosen action as the task of identifying the just division of the benefits generated by B’s action. B gains through his action; but justice requires that he share those gains with A—especially since the immediate effect of B’s action is a loss for A. The just division of the benefits is the division that A and B would settle upon in conjunction with A’s agreement to be subject to the action in question. And the best procedure for identifying what terms would be settled upon is to require antecedent negotiation and consent—when antecedent negotiation and consent is feasible.

We can now return to Nozick’s core argument against the anarchist’s challenge. Nozick calls for a three-fold distinction among agencies and individuals who operate outside of the dominant protective association. At one end of the spectrum are outlaw agencies or rogue individuals who either aim to perform actions that cross boundaries or pose substantial risks of crossing boundaries through their recklessness or negligence. The actions of such agencies or individuals may simply be suppressed to protect the rights that they threaten.[21] At the other end of the spectrum are agencies or individuals who are known to the dominant association to pursue rights protection in ways that are not markedly more likely to violate the rights of the association’s clients than the procedures of the association is likely to violate rights. Given its own procedures, the association cannot honestly proclaim that its clients have rights against the activities of these well-behaved agencies and individuals. (But the association may know that they are well-behaved precisely through its monitoring of those agencies and individuals.) In the middle of the spectrum are agencies and individuals whose procedures are not so risky as to justify straight-forward prohibition but are risky enough so that those whose rights are threatened seem to have some rights-based justification for suppressing those procedures.

According to Nozick, there would be no good answer to the question of how the dominant association should act toward agents in the middle of the spectrum if the association had to choose between straight-forward suppression and securing the voluntary consent of those agents to cease or modify their procedures. But, fortunately, an intermediate mode of action is available to the dominant association, viz., crossing the boundaries that protect those unacceptably risky procedures while duly compensating the subjects of those crossings.

It might be objected that either you have the right to forbid these people’s risky activities or you don’t. If you do, you needn’t compensate the people for doing to them what you have a right to do; and if you don’t … you ought simply to stop [the forbidding]… . But the dilemma, “either you have a right to forbid it so that you needn’t compensate, or you don’t have a right to forbid it so you should stop,” is too short. It may be that you do have a right to forbid an action but only provided you compensate those to whom it is forbidden. (83)

Nozick’s crucial move against the anarchist depends, then, on construing the claims to non-interference of agents who engage in actions that pose moderate risk to others’ rights as claims that are merely protected by liability rules. Since, they are merely protected by liability rules, those actions may be interfered with as long as those subject to that interference are duly compensated.

Why, though, do the rights of those who pose moderate risk to others’ rights not acquire the force of claims protected by property rules? With respect to the fear factor, Nozick seems simply to assume that the dominant association’s measures to suppress or control the activities of those moderately dangerous (but non-outlaw) agencies and individuals generate no complicating fear. With respect to the division of benefits factor, Nozick seems to hold that those who suppress (or mitigate) risky conduct by others should not be thought of as thereby benefiting. They are essentially merely diminishing the likelihood of harm being done.[22] Thus, there is no need for antecedent negotiation to determine the just division of the benefits generated by the dominant association’s suppression or mitigation of the moderately risky procedures of independent agencies or individuals. Everything else being equal, it seems to follow that moderately risky procedures by those independents may be suppressed or mitigated without any compensation. (Rather, it seems that they can be suppressed or mitigated with due compensation; but the due compensation is no compensation.)

However, according to Nozick, everything else is not quite equal. Some of these independent individuals or agencies may have adopted moderately risky procedures because they (or their clients) cannot afford more fastidious procedures. According to Nozick, if we had “a theory of disadvantage” (82), it would tell us that these independents (or these clients) will be disadvantaged by the dominant association’s interference with those moderately risky procedures. They will be disadvantaged even though they are only engaged in (or subscribing to) procedures that might infringe on others’ rights. So, Nozick concludes, the suppression or mitigation of the procedures engaged in (or subscribed to) by these independents must be accompanied by compensation for disadvantages imposed upon them. Thus, we arrive at Nozick’s principle of compensation:

those who are disadvantaged by being forbidden to do actions that only might harm others must be compensated for these disadvantages foisted upon them in order to provide security for the others. (82–3)

This principle of compensation explains (or expresses) the justification for the dominant association stepping in to suppress or exercise mitigating control over the procedures of moderately risky (but non-outlaw) agencies and individuals.

How does the principle of compensation get us to the minimal state? According to Nozick, through its enforced oversight over others’ provision of protective services the association exercises enough of a monopoly over the provision of those services to become an ultra-minimal state. However, under the principle of compensation, the dominant association’s interference with moderately risky independents who are disadvantaged by this interference will be permissible only if the association compensates those independents for those disadvantages. Nozick envisions that compensation naturally taking the form of the ultra-minimal state providing free or subsidized protective services to those who will (otherwise) be disadvantaged by its interferences. When the ultra-minimal state secures the permissibility of its monopoly oversight by providing free or subsidized protection to those who are (otherwise) disadvantaged by its oversight it becomes a (legitimate) minimal state.

In asserting the permissibility of its enforced oversight, the dominant association does not maintain that it has some unique claim to suppress or control moderately risky agencies or individuals. Nevertheless, by being the dominant association, it alone is in position to act under the aegis of the principle of compensation (108–110). Nozick’s minimal state provides free or subsidized protective services to some parties. To pay for those free or subsidized services, the minimal state charges its paying customers more than it otherwise would. This may appear to be enforced redistribution; but it is not. For, the additional charges incurred by the minimal state’s paying clients simply are payments that are needed to fund compensation that must be paid if the oversight that is imposed on behalf of the clients’ security is to be permissible.

Nozick provides an important second argument on behalf of the dominant association’s monopolistic oversight and constraint of other protective agencies. This argument focuses on procedural rights. Do the clients of the dominant association have (natural) procedural rights against having moderately risky protective measures directed against them? Nozick recognizes that it seems implausible to affirm procedural rights in the state of nature. Yet he seeks to back into such rights by starting with the proposition that even in the state of nature C acts wrongly and impermissibly toward D if C extracts restitution payments from D or punishes D without knowing (or having a well-justified belief) that D has violated C’s rights; C acts wrongly and impermissibly even if D has in fact violated those rights and the restitution or punishment imposed by C is appropriate for that violation (106). Nozick takes the wrongness and impermissibility of C’s epistemically ill-grounded reaction to justify the prohibition of C’s action against the guilty D. So D has at least the equivalent of a procedural right against C’s epistemically ill-grounded conduct (107). The dominant association can permissibly rise to statehood by enforcing its clients’ (equivalent of) procedural rights against those moderately risky competitors.[23] The problem here seems to be that, if saying that C’s ill-grounded reaction is “impermissible” is merely another way of saying that it is morally defective, one cannot infer from its impermissibility that it may be prohibited. It seems that one can only infer that C’s reaction may be prohibited if that reaction is impermissible in the much stronger sense of being (equivalent to) rights-violating. But one cannot assert that the reaction is impermissible in this stronger sense unless one already assumes what Nozick is purporting to show, viz., that there is a procedural right (or something equivalent to such a right) that the ill-grounded reaction violates.

3.3 Further Observations about the Minimal State

We have already noted that Nozick’s minimal state differs from common depictions of the minimal state because it does not impose taxation to finance its services. In many other ways as well, it is more like a business enterprise than a state. There are no rulers, no legislative body, no political elections, no contending parties and citizens. There is no sovereignty and no state territory. There are, instead, executives, a board of directors, shareholders, clients, and the assets of the enterprise. But the fly in the enterprise ointment is the absence of competitive market constraints on the price or the quality of the services offered by this monopoly. (If there is enough market competition to keep prices of protective services down and their quality up, there will be too much competition for this enterprise to count as a state.) It appears that the only other way to keep this monopoly in check would be through some sort of political-constitutional constraints. However, Nozick makes no mention of these. Of course, a protective association in pursuit of customers might commit itself to constitution-like constraints on its decisions and conduct as a way of reassuring potential clients. (Mack 2018 110–124)

It is striking that a more direct route to a more conventional minimal state—i.e., one that would fund the production of rights protection through taxes—is available to Nozick. (Mack 2011) That route is opened by his shift to the liability rule construal of rights. On that construal each individual’s right to her financial assets is at base merely a right to receive due compensation for the seizure of those assets. So, if the dominant association taxes individuals—seizes some of their financial assets without their consent—but provides compensating benefits for each of those individuals in the form of protective services, the association’s conduct will be perfectly permissible. On Nozick’s view, such non-negotiated accompanying compensation will be inferior to antecedently negotiated terms of exchange if such prior negotiation would have been feasible. However, Nozick could have advanced the common argument that such prior negotiation of payment for protective services would not be feasible.

That argument turns on the special public good feature of a system of rights protection, viz., that, if such a good is produced, if will be difficult to exclude individuals who do not voluntarily pay for that system from enjoying (many of) the benefits generated by the system. Perhaps the police whom I have not voluntarily paid won’t respond to my calls for assistance. But they will respond to the calls of my paying neighbors and, as a result, I will enjoy a lower level of neighborhood crime. Accordingly, antecedent negotiations about payment for protection will not be feasible because a significant number of individuals would decline to offer payment in the hope that they would to get (most of) the benefits of the production of those services even if they do not contract for them.[24] Hence, assuming that the taxation to fund the public good of rights protection is not itself feared, the rights to the financial assets that are seized in that taxation remain claims that are merely protected by liability rules. According to his argument, since the provision of that protection duly compensates for the seizures, the imposition of those taxes is permissible.[25]

One strand that runs throughout ASU is Nozick’s interest in invisible-hand explanations—explanations of complex orders like the adjustment of supply and demand in market economies that do not appeal to anyone’s intention to bring about the explained order (18–22). For Nozick, part of the charm of his story about the emergence of the minimal state is that it is an invisible hand story. The dominant association backs into being a state without really trying (to be a state) (118–119). This contrasts with the visible hand quality of social contract explanations or justifications of the state. Of course, no actual minimal state is explained or justified by Nozick’s invisible hand explanation. This is no philosophical problem because there is no actual minimal state that Nozick sets out to justify.

However, Nozick does seem to be committed to the view that the legitimacy of any actual minimal state that might arise will depend upon its having arisen through permissible, rights respecting activities; and this seems to be a problem. Consider a minimal state that comes into existence when some aggressive individuals seize control of a powerful coercive apparatus that has been built up through many years of murder and plunder but then immediately undergo conversion into conscientious libertarians. As quickly as they can those individuals redirect the coercive power at their disposal from aggressions against life, liberty, and property to the suppression of rights violations by non-violating means. It seems that our judgment about the legitimacy of this minimal state should turn at least primarily on how it now conducts itself and not on the impermissibility of the actions through which this state was founded (Paul 1979).

A new angle on this topic is presented in Ralf Bader’s ingenious explanation of how Nozick’s account of the way in which minimal states would arise without violating rights supports a demand in justice that actual more-than-minimal states be transformed into minimal states. (Bader 2017) The key is Bader’s idea that the rectification of economic injustice and the rectification of (what might be called) political justice are isomorphic. Economic rectification requires the transition from an array of holdings that is at least in part the product of rights violations to the array of holdings that would have arisen had holdings arisen justly. In parallel fashion, political rectification requires the transition from political institutions that are at least in part the product of rights violations to the political institutions that would have arisen had political institutions arisen justly. Nozick’s counterfactual account of the minimal state reveals that this is sort of political institution into which actual more-than-minimal states must, as a matter of justice, be transformed.

4. Justice in Holdings

While the core official purpose of Part I of ASU is the defense of the minimal state against the anarchist critique, the core official purpose of Part II of ASU, is to argue that “no more extensive state can be justified” (xi). In chapter 8 of Part II, “Equality, Envy, Exploitation, Etc.”, Nozick seeks to counter the force of a series of considerations that are invoked on behalf of a more extensive state. These include equality, equal opportunity, meaningful work, workers’ control, and exploitation. In chapter 9 of part II, “Demoktesis”, he constructs an invisible hand account of the rise of an unconstrained democratic state. The intention seems to be to undercut the appeal of such a state by showing what sorts of unattractive, albeit permissible, actions individuals would have to engage in to arrive at such a state. Nozick needs, then, to explain why a hypothetical invisible hand explanation of the minimal state much more legitimates it than a hypothetical invisible hand explanation of the unconstrained democratic state legitimates it (292–294).

Still, by far the most philosophically important chapter of Part II is chapter 7, “Distributive Justice” in which Nozick seeks to counter the view that a more extensive state is justified as an instrument of distributive justice. This chapter has been the subject of the bulk of the philosophical commentary on ASU. In this chapter, Nozick sketches his “historical entitlement” conception of justice in holdings, provides a number of quite general arguments against all alternative conceptions of justice in holdings, endorses a Lockean Proviso that adds a bit of complexity to the entitlement doctrine, and provides a powerful critique of Rawls’ case in A Theory of Justice for his strongly redistributive “difference principle”. This section focuses on the first three of these topics.

4.1 The Historical Entitlement Doctrine about Justice in Holdings

Nozick’s approach to justice in holdings has to be seen as emerging from his broad construal of the implications of the Rawlsian-Nozickean critique of utilitarianism. Whereas Rawls concludes that a due respect for the separateness of persons precludes imposing losses on individuals for the sake of the general welfare, Nozick concludes that it precludes imposing losses upon individuals for the sake of any conception of the overall social good—including deeply distribution-sensitive conceptions. The justice of a given individual’s possession of and discretionary control over certain economic goods cannot be a function of that possession and control contributing to the general welfare or to any other overall social end-state or pattern. All such consequentialist assessments of holdings are ruled out of court. So, if there is any acceptable account of the justice of individual holdings, it must be a backward-looking account. The justification must depend upon how the holdings in question have arisen.

If the holding came about by permissible and title-conferring modes of action, the possessor will be entitled to it. If the holding came about by modes of action that are not permissible (or are permissible but not title-conferring) the possessor will not be entitled to it. Thus, entitlements are historical. Individual A will have an entitlement to holding H if and only if A’s possession of H has the right sort of history. This stance accords with the common-sense intuition that an agent’s acquiring economically valuable objects in certain ways—e.g., creating those objects out of unowned natural materials—generates entitlements for that agent over those objects while an agent’s acquiring objects in other ways—e.g., seizing those objects from another who has created them out of unowned natural materials—does not generate entitlements for that agent over those objects. A distribution of holdings across individuals will be just insofar as the particular holdings that constitute that distribution are just—rather than the justice of any particular individual’s holding depending on the holistic justice of the distribution of which it is a part.

Just acquisition takes the form of just initial acquisition, just transfer, or just rectification of an unjust taking. An existing holding will be just if it arises from an act of just initial acquisition or an act of just initial acquisition followed by one or more acts of just transfer, or an act of just rectification that counteracts an unjust taking of a just holding. An adequate theory of justice in holdings will specify the processes that constitute just initial acquisitions, just transfers, and just acts of rectification. Nozick tells us that each of these principles is a “complicated truth” (150) that he will not attempt to formulate. Thus, we never get statements from Nozick of what specific initial acquisition or transfer or rectification processes that result in agent C’s possession of H generate or convey to C an entitlement over H. Nozick never directly seeks to explain why certain specific processes—certain specific means of acquisition—have the power to generate or convey entitlements. He never addresses the ways in which historical contingency and convention may select (from among morally eligible procedures) the specific procedures that count as entitlement conferring within a given society. (Mack 2010 and Bryan 2017)

Nozick’s lack of specification and explanation has mislead commentators such as Cohen into thinking that, for Nozick, any not unjust process that results in C’s possession of H generates or conveys an entitlement for C over H. “’[J]ust steps, for Nozick, are human actions that are free of injustice…” (Cohen 1995: 39). Consider Cohen’s example of D’s rolling pin accidentally rolling downhill from D’s kitchen into C’s kitchen where C innocently mistakes it for his long-lost rolling pin. Cohen thinks that, since nothing within this transfer process is unjust, Nozick is committed to the transfer being just and entitlement conveying and, hence, is committed to the implausible conclusion that C would acquire a just claim to the rolling pin. Although this sort of criticism rests on the mistaken idea that, for Nozick, just processes are simply not unjust processes, it does highlight how little Nozick does offer in the way of a positive account of the nature and power of entitlement generating or conveying processes.

Nozick thinks we are pushed to adopt some set of historical entitlement principles by the dethronement of consequentialist doctrines of justice in holdings; and he then implicitly relies on his readers’ intuitions about what the content of those principles will be. Such intuitions will, e.g., count against the thought that one can engage in the initial just acquisition of H by wanting H or by intensely focusing one’s attention on H and will support the thought that some sort of physical engagement with unowned materials is necessary for acquiring an entitlement to them. Similarly, such intuitions will count against the thought that an accidental transfer of a rolling pin from D’s kitchen to C’s kitchen will convey the right to the pin from D to C and will support the thought that such a conveyance requires some sort of informed and voluntary interaction between D and C.

4.2 The Critique of End-State and Patterned Principles

Nozick discerns two types of principles concerning justice in holdings other than the historical entitlement type. These are end-state principles and patterned principles. To a considerable extent, Nozick’s argument on behalf of his historical entitlement approach consists in his critiques of end-state and patterned doctrines. End-state principles hold that justice in the distribution of income (or economically valuable goods) is a matter of some arithmetical feature of one of the available distributions. Consider three available distributions of income among three individuals (or among three positions to be occupied by individuals):

  A B C
Distribution D1 12 10 9
Distribution D2 4 22 13
Distribution D3 20 8 8

A utilitarian (or income maximization) theory will select D2 as the just distribution on the ground that it has the greatest total income. An egalitarian theory will select D1 as the just distribution on the ground that it is the most equal distribution. Rawls’ difference principle will select D1 on the distinct ground that within it the lowest payoff is greater than the lowest payoff within any other available distribution. What makes each of these doctrines an end-state view is their shared conviction that the information provided by this sort of matrix is sufficient for determining which of the available distributions is the just one.

According to Nozick, a major problem for all end-state doctrines is precisely the falsity of this shared conviction. For surely information that cannot appear within such a matrix is essential to a sensible judgment about which of these available distributions is just. Consider, e.g., the following information. D2 is the distribution of income that obtains when A is enslaved to B who employs C as his effective overseer. D1 is the distribution that obtains when A is partially emancipated and is only subject to slavery-like exploitation by B and C one week per month. And D3 is the distribution that obtains when A is entirely emancipated. Given the obvious relevance of this sort of information for any responsible selection of one of these distributions as the just one, any doctrine that asserts or presumes that the information available in the matrix suffices has to be deeply flawed.

Patterned theories of distributive justice escape this problem because they hold that the just distribution is the available distribution in which the income accorded to individuals most tracks some feature of those individuals—e.g., their moral desert or their economic effort—and the incidence of that feature is not reported in that income matrix. Hence, one cannot say which of the distributions presented in the above table is to be selected until one also knows what the distribution of the to-be-tracked feature is among A, B, and C. In addition, plausible patterned doctrines will focus on features of individuals that are historical—e.g., how much moral desert particular individuals have amassed or how much economic effort they have evinced. So, plausible patterned doctrines will be historical. However, unlike historical entitlement doctrines, historical patterned theories will not determine the justice of the particular holdings of individuals on the basis of whether those individuals acquired those holdings through entitlement generating or conveying processes.

Nozick offers a series of arguments each of which is supposed to discredit all (non-trivial) end-state and patterned principles. (At this point, Nozick employs the term “patterned” to refer both to end-state principles and track-the-feature principles.) We must focus here on two of those arguments. The first, most famous, and most misunderstood of these arguments appears in the section of ASU that is entitled “How Liberty Upsets Patterns” (160–164). The second appears in the section entitled “Redistribution and Property Rights” (167–174).

In “How Liberty Upsets Patterns”, Nozick asks each of his readers to envision an income distribution that accords with her favorite patterning principle. Then Nozick points out that more or less as soon as that pattern P1 is instituted, individuals will engage in highly innocuous dispositions of what has been assigned to them in the name of justice that will engender a different pattern P2. For instance, a million fans will each pay Wilt Chamberlain 25 cents to see him play basketball. However, this new pattern P2 will almost certainly be convertible through fine-tuned social engineering into another pattern P3 that better realizes the favored patterning principle. Imagine, e.g., that the $250,000 that is concentrated in Wilt’s hands within P2 can be effectively redistributed downward whereas it could not be effectively redistributed downward when it was still spread out among Wilt’s moderately prosperous fans. Thus, if we continue to assess distributions on the basis of the selected patterning principle, we will have to declare P2 to be unjust and maintain that justice requires its conversion into P3. And, more or less as soon as P3 is instituted, individuals will engage in highly innocuous dispositions of what has just been assigned to them in the name of renewed justice that will engender a different pattern P4 … and so on. Nozick then identified two problems with this continued application of the favored patterned rule.

This first problem is that, if (as stipulated) the holdings of individuals under P1 were just and if (as stipulated) interactions that converted P1 into P2 were all just, it is difficult to see how P2 can become infected with injustice. Of course, P2 (almost certainly) must be judged to be unjust if one continues to assess the justice of distributions on the basis of the adopted patterned principle. But it seems reasonable to demand an explanation of how that asserted injustice could have entered P2 given the justice of P1 and of the processes through which P2 emerges from P1.

By what process could such a transfer among two persons give rise to a legitimate claim of distributive justice on a portion of what was transferred, by a third party who has no claim of justice on any holding of the others before the transfer? (161–2)

It does not seem to be a sufficient answer to say that injustice must have entered in P2 because, after all, when we apply the operative distributive principle to P2 we reach the conclusion that P2 is unjust.

The second problem is that the endorsement of redistributive interference with the outcomes of persons’ innocuous deployments of their assigned holdings seems to be inconsistent with the justice of that assignment of holdings. For surely one may dispose as one chooses of one’s just holdings as long as one does not unjustly impinge upon others and their just holdings.

If the people were entitled to dispose of the resources to which they were entitled (under D1), didn’t this include their being entitled to give it to, or exchange it with Wilt Chamberlain? (161)

To endorse redistributive interference with the outcomes of persons’ non-impinging dispositions of the holdings that have been assigned to them seems to rescind the justice of that assignment of holdings.

Patterned distributional principles do not give people what entitlement principles do, only better distributed. They do not give the right to choose what to do with what one has… (167)

This aspect of Nozick’s critique is nicely summed up in Hillel Steiner’s quip that patterned theories of justice “create rights to interfere with the rights that they have created” (Steiner 1977: 43).[26]

It is important to note that the problems that Nozick’s identifies are problems internal to the ongoing application of any patterned principle. Nozick should not be read as making the question-begging external argument that, since conforming to liberty is the standard by which theories of justice in holdings should be assessed and patterned theories often call for interferences with liberty, patterned theories must be dismissed. Nevertheless, Nozick bears considerable responsibility for this reading when he says,

The general point… is that no end-state principle or distributional patterned principle of justice can be continually realized without continuous interference with people’s lives. (163)

Nor should Nozick be pictured as holding that the problem with patterned theories is that they would forbid any departure from a P1 that is instituted because, at the time it is instituted, it is the available distribution that best realizes some favored pattern. Nozick is not charging patterning theorists with forbidding the exchange between Wilt and his fans.

An important response to Nozick’s “How Liberty Upsets Patterns” arguments is that they rely upon a mistaken picture of the patterned theorist’s program. According to this response, Nozick represents the patterned theorist as aiming at the daily (or weekly or monthly) fullest available realization of her favorite pattern. On this representation, at the end of each day (or week or month) the advocate of, e.g., the Rawlsian difference principle will determine whether the existing distribution can be transformed into one that provides a higher income for those in the lowest income positions for the next day (or week or month); if such a transformation is available then (on this representation) the difference principle advocate will require it as a matter of justice. Hence, the continuous interference in the name of justice with the results of people acting as they choose with their purported just holdings. However, the advocate of the difference principle will maintain that this principle guides the design of the basic institutional structure of society; it provides the basic structure with the aim of raising the lifetime income of the representative lowest income individual as much as possible. What is assigned to individuals as a matter of distributive justice is a lifetime stream of income that arises through some combination of permitted and protected modes of income acquisition, tax and regulatory structures, and tax-funded assistance. Wilt does not have a claim in justice to his holdings on the day before the fans transfer $250,000 to him or to his holdings on the following day. He has a claim in justice to the lifetime income that will accrue to him when a basic structure is in place which, through enabling income acquisition, taxing, regulating, and subsidizing income yields (something like) the highest possible lifetime income for the least advantaged. That claim in justice is not violated when the IRS seizes, say, 70% of his $250,000 windfall.

Hence, in his most direct response to Nozick’s challenge, Rawls declares,

There are no unannounced and unpredictable interferences with citizens’ expectations and acquisitions. Entitlements are earned, and honored as the public system declares. Taxes and restrictions are all in principle foreseeable, and holdings are acquired on the known condition that certain transfers and redistributions will be made. (Rawls 1993: 283, emphasis added)

It would seem, however, that Nozick can insist that any ongoing attempt to maximize lifetime incomes for the worst off (or to sustain any other non-trivial pattern) will require unannounced and unpredictable interferences with citizens’ expectations and acquisitions. For, as economic preferences, needs, opportunities, beliefs, insights, and capacities change in unannounced and unpredictable ways, the public system will similarly have to change if it is going to continue to aim at maximizing lifetime incomes for the worst off. And as further unannounced and unpredictable changes occur, the basic structure will again have to be changed in unannounced and unpredictable ways. As Rawls himself says, “… even in a well-ordered society, adjustments in the basic structure are always necessary” (Rawls 1993: 284, Mack 2018: 124–129). The institution of those adjustments will almost certainly have to dishonor some of the entitlements proclaimed under the previous public system and treat some of people’s previously earned holdings to previously unannounced and unpredictable transfers and redistributions (Mack 2002a, 85–91).

In “Redistribution and Property Rights” Nozick offers a more external argument against all patterned theories of justice. The argument is that the institutional operation of any (non-trivial) patterned doctrine amounts to the institution of partial ownership of some people by other people.

Whether it is done through taxation on wages or on wages over a certain amount, or through seizure of profits, or through there being a big social pot so that it’s not clear what’s coming from where and what’s going where, patterned principles of distributive justice involve appropriating the actions of other persons. Seizing the results of someone’s labor is equivalent to seizing hours from him and directing him to carry on various activities… . This process … makes [those who carry it out] a part-owner of you; it gives them a property right in you. Just as having such partial control and power of decision, by right, over an animal or inanimate object would be to have a property right in it. (172)

Nozick distances himself from a Lockean labor-mixing account of just initial holdings by jokingly asking whether one comes to own the ocean by pouring one’s can of tomato juice into it (175). And, in the passage above, he carefully avoids saying that the operation of any patterned doctrine infringes upon one’s self-ownership by way of appropriating one’s labor.

Nevertheless, the argument in this passage seems to be quite Lockean in its basic structure. Rather than focusing on particular expropriations of this or that labor infused object, the argument attends to the configuration of control over individuals’ actions, time, and decisions that the institution of any (non-trivial) distributive pattern will require. According to Nozick, such a configuration of control wrongly treats the individuals who are subject to it without their consent as though they are in part the property of those who establish and exercise that control. Note that even here Nozick does not seem to be proposing specific content for the principles of just initial acquisition and just transfer. Rather, the goal is to provide a general vindication of the historical entitlement approach by undercutting the end-state and patterned approaches.

4.3 Nozick’s Lockean Proviso

Nozick follows Locke in adopting a version of the claim that an individual will have a complaint in justice against otherwise perfectly just acquisitions by others if those acquisitions do not leave that individual with “enough, and as good” (174–182). Although Nozick’s discussion of his Lockean proviso is somewhat murky, we can identify three important features of that proviso doctrine.

First, whether an individual has a complaint under Nozick’s Lockean proviso will not be a matter of whether too little natural material has been left in common by others or too little material has been left for that individual to initially acquire. Rather, that individual will have a just complaint against others’ acquisitions if and only if those acquisitions leave her on net worse off in terms of utility or welfare. The individual will have no just complaint even if her utility or welfare is diminished by a decrease in what remains in common or a decrease in what remains available for her initial acquisition as long as she is duly compensated in terms of utility or welfare by other effects of the acquisitive actions of others. The claim at the core of Nozick’s “enough, and as good” proviso is only protected by a liability rule.

Second, in his main discussion of it, Nozick maintains that this proviso is readily satisfied in free market economies.[27] This is in part due to the strong tendency of the rising tide of such economies to raise up all those who are willing to swim with it (177). It is also in part due to the low baseline set by the proviso. Nozick never carefully spells out that baseline. But it must be something like how well off the individual under consideration would have been had all natural stuff remained in the common or, perhaps, how well off that individual would be (over his lifetime) were all natural stuff (or even all owned stuff) now returned to the common.

Third, the proviso adds “an additional bit of complexity into the structure of the entitlement theory” (174). It specifies a way in which things could go especially badly for an individual even if the acquisitions of others are entirely in accord with the principles of justice in acquisition and it asserts that individuals would have a complaint in justice should things go that badly for them in that way. For Nozick, the primary case for the justice of any holding continues to turn on its having arisen through processes that accord with the principles of just initial acquisition, just transfer, and (if relevant) just rectification. (This is why it is such a serious problem that Nozick never spells out those principles and never explains why acquisition in accordance with them has the power to engender or convey entitlements.) For Nozick, even if the proviso is violated, those who have acquired justly do not have to surrender their holdings—albeit they need to provide compensation to those whose situations are on net worsened by the existing system of holdings.[28]

4.4 The Rectification of Historical Injustices

Nozick recognizes that even in relatively free societies the historical processes that have yielded existing holdings have been shot through with injustices. The history of almost all existing holdings includes lots of appropriation by way of murder, plunder, enslavement, fraudulent dealings, and other illicit coercive transfers (usually on behalf of the rich and powerful). We do not need a delicately worked out theory of rectification in order to say that, if A has grabbed B’s goat yesterday, he can be required to return it to B today. But we do need a highly elaborate theory to inform us about what rectification payments (if any) should now be required of whom on behalf of who else because of injustices performed 20 or 50 or 200 years ago. Presumably any acceptable doctrine will require that only current victims of past injustices have just claims to rectification payments and that they only have just claims against current beneficiaries of those past injustices. Perhaps, then, bygones should be treated as bygones when we lack the information that a well-developed doctrine of rectification would require us to have to justly rectify long past injustices.[29]

Nozick closes chapter 7 with two thoughts concerning rectification. The first is that proper rectification may have to take the form of rough and ready payments to classes of people whose members are likely to be worse off than they otherwise would be because of historical injustices—payments that would be funded by taxes upon classes of people whose members are likely to be better off than they otherwise would be because of those historical injustices. The second is that some end-state principle might come into play as a guide for these required payments—albeit “it may well be implausible” (231) to select the difference principle as this guide.

5. Utopia

The official purpose of Part III of ASU, “Utopia”, is to show that the minimal state is not merely legitimate and just; it is also inspiring. This purpose is advanced by sketching a framework for utopia that is inspiring and noting that this framework is highly akin to—Nozick actually says “equivalent to” (333)—the minimal state. Yet Nozick also says that the framework might not have any “central authority” (329). Still, the framework is akin to the minimal state because it is an institutional structure that enforces peaceful co-existence among voluntarily formed communities. It protects the independence of such communities and their freedom to recruit members and also protects the liberty of individuals to enter and exit communities as they respectively choose. Although Nozick is not explicit about this, we have to presume that the framework enforces the same norms of personal freedom, property, and contractual compliance that the minimal state enforces except insofar as individuals voluntarily relinquish such rights within the communities they enter.

The framework is inspiring because of the way it contributes to persons’ identification of and participation in communities (and other networks of relationships) through which they will find meaning and well-being. It is inspiring to anyone who appreciates how little each of us knows about what sorts of communities best suit human beings in all their depth and diversity and how much the operation of the framework assists individuals in their discovery of and engagement in communities that enhance their respective well-being. Moreover, many persons may value the framework not merely for the way it enhances their own good but, also, for the ways in which it allows them to participate vicariously in others’ achievement of their different modes of flourishing (Lomasky 2002).

5.1 The Framework as Discovery Procedure

The framework is—or, more precisely, sustains—a discovery procedure. Under the protective umbrella of the framework, individuals are presented with and can try out diverse communities while communities themselves arise and modify themselves in their competitive search to sustain, improve, or increase their membership. A wide range of communities will continually arise out of and in response to the evolving perceptions that diverse individuals will have about what modes of sociality will best suit them and will best attract welcome partners. Communities will survive and perhaps expand or be imitated insofar as they actually embody modes of relationship that serve well their actual or prospective membership or insofar as they successfully refine their offerings in the market place of communities. The framework also insures that those who are already confident that they know what sort of community is best for them will be free to form those communities by voluntary subscription and, thereby, to manifest their actual value (or disvalue) to themselves and to other seekers of well-being.

Part of Nozick’s sub-text here is a message to socialist utopians that nothing in the framework (or the minimal state) precludes their non-coercive pursuit of their ideal communities. How, therefore, can socialists object to the framework (or the minimal state)? This generalizes Nozick’s earlier claims in ASU that that advocates of meaningful work and workers’ control of productive enterprises ought not to be hostile to the minimal state since the minimal state is fully tolerant of non-coercive endeavors to establish such conditions (246–253).

In a short essay in Reason magazine published four years after ASU, Nozick asked, “Who Would Choose Socialism?” (Nozick 1978). More precisely, his question was: What percent of the adult population would choose “to participate in socialist interpersonal relations of equality and community” were they in position to choose between “a reasonably attractive socialist option and also a reasonably attractive non-socialist one?” (Nozick 1978: 277). Nozick takes the choice available to Israelis between membership and non-membership in kibbutzim to be a good instance of a choice between such options and notes that around six percent of the adult population of Israel in the 1970s had chosen the socialist option. He speculates that socialists are at least “tempted” to be imperialists, i.e., to impose on everyone one their own vision of utopia, precisely because they sense that there will be too few volunteers (Nozick 1978: 279).

The discovery procedure that the framework sustains is a version of Millian experiments in living—albeit it is a version that places much more emphasis on the role of a marketplace of communities in providing individuals with experimental options. This discovery procedure (like Millian experiments in living) is, of course, a Hayekian invisible hand process. Given the enormous diversity among individuals, we do not know what one form of community would be best.

The idea that there is one best composite answer to all of these questions [about what features utopia has], one best society for everyone to live in, seems to me to be an incredible one. (And the idea that, if there is one, we now know enough to describe it is even more incredible.) (311)

Nor do we know what distinct modes of community would be best for distinct types of persons. Thus, we cannot design an inclusive utopia; nor can we design an array of mini-utopia such that some significantly fulfilling community will be available to everyone—or even to most.

It is helpful to imagine cavemen sitting together to think up what, for all time, will be the best possible society and then setting out to institute it. Do none of the reasons that make you smile at this apply to us? (313–314)

Given our ignorance, the best way to realize utopia—almost certainly many distinct utopia—is through the discovery procedure that the framework sustains. (We should note, however, an implicit, somewhat puzzling, and wholly unnecessary presupposition of Nozick’s discussion, viz, that individuals with utopian aspirations will generally seek out communities that are made up of other individuals like themselves. The suggestion is that chosen communities will be internally homogeneous with heterogeneity existing only across these communities.)

5.2. An Independent Route to the Minimal State

The role of the framework in sustaining a discovery procedure brings us to the second main purpose of “Utopia”. This is the provision of an independent vindication of the minimal state—one that specifically does not depend on “the moral arguments for individual liberty” (309 footnote*) offered in Parts I and II of Anarchy, State, and Utopia. Although the activities of the framework are described in terms of protecting the rights that are affirmed in early parts of the book, the utopian advocacy of the framework does not rely upon the validity of those rights. Rather, that advocacy turns on a general endorsement of utopian aspiration combined with the core epistemic claim that, given our ignorance, the only sensible route to utopia is the discovery procedure that the framework sustains.

There is, however, an apparent problem with Nozick’s independence claim. Nozick distinguishes among three sorts of utopians. There are “existential utopians” who have a particular utopia in mind for themselves and others who will be drawn to it but have no problem with yet others being drawn to different utopia. There are “missionary utopians” who hope “to persuade or convince everyone to live in one particular kind of community, but will not force them to do so”. And there are “imperialistic utopians” who countenance “the forcing of everyone into one pattern of community” (319–320). While existential utopians will embrace the framework and missionary utopians will (less heartily) support it, imperialistic “will oppose the framework as long as some others do not agree with them” (320). Nozick’s response to the imperialist is to say “Well you can’t satisfy everyone, especially if there are those who will be dissatisfied unless not everybody is satisfied” (320). The suggestion—never explicitly stated by Nozick—is that the imperialist pursuit of utopia is to be suppressed by the framework precisely because it is impermissibly coercive. But, if so, the justification for this crucial operation of the framework must appeal to some of “the moral arguments for individual liberty” from which Nozick wants his utopia argument to be independent.

However, Nozick may be able to escape from this problem by emphasizing that imperialists are being excluded on epistemic rather than moral grounds. The question is, on what procedures will epistemically sensible utopians—utopians with a due appreciation for the difficulties involved in identifying and instituting utopia—converge? And the answer is, on the processes of voluntary association and dissociation and adjustment that the framework aims to sustain. Imperialist utopian coercion is simply not part of the process that all utopians have reason to favor because of its epistemic fecundity. Moreover, the operation of the framework does not preclude the establishment—for some people or for all—of the mode of community favored by any utopian.

Since any particular community may be established within the framework, it is compatible with all particular utopian visions, while guaranteeing none. (320)

Any utopian who wants her (current) vision to be guaranteed by being forced upon others has good epistemic reasons to shed that desire.

Still, it might be maintained that the most informative discovery procedure is one that embodies no-holds-barred competition among communities. For surely we want to know which communities or associations of communities, if any, will be capable of defending themselves against the imperialists. Since it seems that the most informative discovery procedure would not exclude imperialist utopians, it seems that the real basis for the exclusion of imperialists must be moral. Hence, it appears that their exclusion does undercut Nozick’s goal of providing an independent vindication of the minimal state.

However, this problem also may be just a matter of appearance. After all, the framework proposed by Nozick does not exclude imperialists in the sense of stipulating their non-existence. Rather, one of the core roles of the framework is precisely to protect non-imperialists and their voluntary modes of association and dissociation from those epistemically short-sighted, albeit still existing, imperialists. The operation of the framework should, therefore, be seen as a two-level discovery procedure. On one level it operates as Nozick explicitly describes—as a competitive market place of communities serving individuals who are becoming more informed about their taste for community. However, on another level, the operation of the framework is a procedure through which non-imperialist communities and non-imperialist individuals who do not enter any utopian community discover how, if at all, they can cooperate in maintaining and operating the framework so as to protect themselves and their epistemic quest from the imperialists.


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