The History of Utilitarianism

First published Fri Mar 27, 2009; substantive revision Mon Sep 22, 2014

Utilitarianism is one of the most powerful and persuasive approaches to normative ethics in the history of philosophy. Though not fully articulated until the 19th century, proto-utilitarian positions can be discerned throughout the history of ethical theory.

Though there are many varieties of the view discussed, utilitarianism is generally held to be the view that the morally right action is the action that produces the most good. There are many ways to spell out this general claim. One thing to note is that the theory is a form of consequentialism: the right action is understood entirely in terms of consequences produced. What distinguishes utilitarianism from egoism has to do with the scope of the relevant consequences. On the utilitarian view one ought to maximize the overall good — that is, consider the good of others as well as one's own good.

The Classical Utilitarians, Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill, identified the good with pleasure, so, like Epicurus, were hedonists about value. They also held that we ought to maximize the good, that is, bring about ‘the greatest amount of good for the greatest number’.

Utilitarianism is also distinguished by impartiality and agent-neutrality. Everyone's happiness counts the same. When one maximizes the good, it is the good impartially considered. My good counts for no more than anyone else's good. Further, the reason I have to promote the overall good is the same reason anyone else has to so promote the good. It is not peculiar to me.

All of these features of this approach to moral evaluation and/or moral decision-making have proven to be somewhat controversial and subsequent controversies have led to changes in the Classical version of the theory.

1. Precursors to the Classical Approach

Though the first systematic account of utilitarianism was developed by Jeremy Bentham (1748–1832), the core insight motivating the theory occurred much earlier. That insight is that morally appropriate behavior will not harm others, but instead increase happiness or ‘utility.’ What is distinctive about utilitarianism is its approach in taking that insight and developing an account of moral evaluation and moral direction that expands on it. Early precursors to the Classical Utilitarians include the British Moralists, Cumberland, Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, Gay, and Hume. Of these, Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746) is explicitly utilitarian when it comes to action choice.

Some of the earliest utilitarian thinkers were the ‘theological’ utilitarians such as Richard Cumberland (1631–1718) and John Gay (1699–1745). They believed that promoting human happiness was incumbent on us since it was approved by God. After enumerating the ways in which humans come under obligations (by perceiving the “natural consequences of things”, the obligation to be virtuous, our civil obligations that arise from laws, and obligations arising from “the authority of God”) John Gay writes: “…from the consideration of these four sorts of obligation…it is evident that a full and complete obligation which will extend to all cases, can only be that arising from the authority of God; because God only can in all cases make a man happy or miserable: and therefore, since we are always obliged to that conformity called virtue, it is evident that the immediate rule or criterion of it is the will of God” (R, 412). Gay held that since God wants the happiness of mankind, and since God's will gives us the criterion of virtue, “…the happiness of mankind may be said to be the criterion of virtue, but once removed” (R, 413). This view was combined with a view of human motivation with egoistic elements. A person's individual salvation, her eternal happiness, depended on conformity to God's will, as did virtue itself. Promoting human happiness and one's own coincided, but, given God's design, it was not an accidental coincidence.

This approach to utilitarianism, however, is not theoretically clean in the sense that it isn't clear what essential work God does, at least in terms of normative ethics. God as the source of normativity is compatible with utilitarianism, but utilitarianism doesn't require this.

Gay's influence on later writers, such as Hume, deserves note. It is in Gay's essay that some of the questions that concerned Hume on the nature of virtue are addressed. For example, Gay was curious about how to explain our practice of approbation and disapprobation of action and character. When we see an act that is vicious we disapprove of it. Further, we associate certain things with their effects, so that we form positive associations and negative associations that also underwrite our moral judgments. Of course, that we view happiness, including the happiness of others as a good, is due to God's design. This is a feature crucial to the theological approach, which would clearly be rejected by Hume in favor of a naturalistic view of human nature and a reliance on our sympathetic engagement with others, an approach anticipated by Shaftesbury (below). The theological approach to utilitarianism would be developed later by William Paley, for example, but the lack of any theoretical necessity in appealing to God would result in its diminishing appeal.

Anthony Ashley Cooper, the 3rd Earl of Shaftesbury (1671–1713) is generally thought to have been the one of the earliest ‘moral sense’ theorists, holding that we possess a kind of “inner eye” that allows us to make moral discriminations. This seems to have been an innate sense of right and wrong, or moral beauty and deformity. Again, aspects of this doctrine would be picked up by Francis Hutcheson and David Hume (1711–1776). Hume, of course, would clearly reject any robust realist implications. If the moral sense is like the other perceptual senses and enables us to pick up on properties out there in the universe around us, properties that exist independent from our perception of them, that are objective, then Hume clearly was not a moral sense theorist in this regard. But perception picks up on features of our environment that one could regard as having a contingent quality. There is one famous passage where Hume likens moral discrimination to the perception of secondary qualities, such as color. In modern terminology, these are response-dependent properties, and lack objectivity in the sense that they do not exist independent of our responses. This is radical. If an act is vicious, its viciousness is a matter of the human response (given a corrected perspective) to the act (or its perceived effects) and thus has a kind of contingency that seems unsettling, certainly unsettling to those who opted for the theological option.

So, the view that it is part of our very nature to make moral discriminations is very much in Hume. Further — and what is relevant to the development of utilitarianism — the view of Shaftesbury that the virtuous person contributes to the good of the whole — would figure into Hume's writings, though modified. It is the virtue that contributes to the good of the whole system, in the case of Hume's artificial virtues.

Shaftesbury held that in judging someone virtuous or good in a moral sense we need to perceive that person's impact on the systems of which he or she is a part. Here it sometimes becomes difficult to disentangle egoistic versus utilitarian lines of thought in Shaftesbury. He clearly states that whatever guiding force there is has made nature such that it is “…the private interest and good of every one, to work towards the general good, which if a creature ceases to promote, he is actually so far wanting to himself, and ceases to promote his own happiness and welfare…” (R, 188). It is hard, sometimes, to discern the direction of the ‘because’ — if one should act to help others because it supports a system in which one's own happiness is more likely, then it looks really like a form of egoism. If one should help others because that's the right thing to do — and, fortunately, it also ends up promoting one's own interests, then that's more like utilitarianism, since the promotion of self-interest is a welcome effect but not what, all by itself, justifies one's character or actions.

Further, to be virtuous a person must have certain psychological capacities — they must be able to reflect on character, for example, and represent to themselves the qualities in others that are either approved or disapproved of.

…in this case alone it is we call any creature worthy or virtuous when it can have the notion of a public interest, and can attain the speculation or science of what is morally good or ill, admirable or blameable, right or wrong….we never say of….any mere beast, idiot, or changeling, though ever so good-natured, that he is worthy or virtuous. (Shaftesbury IVM; BKI, PII, sec. iii)

Thus, animals are not objects of moral appraisal on the view, since they lack the necessary reflective capacities. Animals also lack the capacity for moral discrimination and would therefore seem to lack the moral sense. This raises some interesting questions. It would seem that the moral sense is a perception that something is the case. So it isn't merely a discriminatory sense that allows us to sort perceptions. It also has a propositional aspect, so that animals, which are not lacking in other senses are lacking in this one.

The virtuous person is one whose affections, motives, dispositions are of the right sort, not one whose behavior is simply of the right sort and who is able to reflect on goodness, and her own goodness [see Gill]. Similarly, the vicious person is one who exemplifies the wrong sorts of mental states, affections, and so forth. A person who harms others through no fault of his own “…because he has convulsive fits which make him strike and wound such as approach him” is not vicious since he has no desire to harm anyone and his bodily movements in this case are beyond his control.

Shaftesbury approached moral evaluation via the virtues and vices. His utilitarian leanings are distinct from his moral sense approach, and his overall sentimentalism. However, this approach highlights the move away from egoistic views of human nature — a trend picked up by Hutcheson and Hume, and later adopted by Mill in criticism of Bentham's version of utilitarianism. For writers like Shaftesbury and Hutcheson the main contrast was with egoism rather than rationalism.

Like Shaftesbury, Francis Hutcheson was very much interested in virtue evaluation. He also adopted the moral sense approach. However, in his writings we also see an emphasis on action choice and the importance of moral deliberation to action choice. Hutcheson, in An Inquiry Concerning Moral Good and Evil, fairly explicitly spelled out a utilitarian principle of action choice. (Joachim Hruschka (1991) notes, however, that it was Leibniz who first spelled out a utilitarian decision procedure.)

….In comparing the moral qualities of actions…we are led by our moral sense of virtue to judge thus; that in equal degrees of happiness, expected to proceed from the action, the virtue is in proportion to the number of persons to whom the happiness shall extend (and here the dignity, or moral importance of persons, may compensate numbers); and, in equal numbers, the virtue is the quantity of the happiness, or natural good; or that the virtue is in a compound ratio of the quantity of good, and number of enjoyers….so that that action is best, which procures the greatest happiness for the greatest numbers; and that worst, which, in like manner, occasions misery. (R, 283–4)

Scarre notes that some hold the moral sense approach incompatible with this emphasis on the use of reason to determine what we ought to do; there is an opposition between just apprehending what's morally significant and a model in which we need to reason to figure out what morality demands of us. But Scarre notes these are not actually incompatible:

The picture which emerges from Hutcheson's discussion is of a division of labor, in which the moral sense causes us to look with favor on actions which benefit others and disfavor those which harm them, while consequentialist reasoning determines a more precise ranking order of practical options in given situations. (Scarre, 53–54)

Scarre then uses the example of telling a lie to illustrate: lying is harmful to the person to whom one lies, and so this is viewed with disfavor, in general. However, in a specific case, if a lie is necessary to achieve some notable good, consequentialist reasoning will lead us to favor the lying. But this example seems to put all the emphasis on a consideration of consequences in moral approval and disapproval. Stephen Darwall notes (1995, 216 ff.) that the moral sense is concerned with motives — we approve, for example, of the motive of benevolence, and the wider the scope the better. It is the motives rather than the consequences that are the objects of approval and disapproval. But inasmuch as the morally good person cares about what happens to others, and of course she will, she will rank order acts in terms of their effects on others, and reason is used in calculating effects. So there is no incompatibility at all.

Hutcheson was committed to maximization, it seems. However, he insisted on a caveat — that “the dignity or moral importance of persons may compensate numbers.” He added a deontological constraint — that we have a duty to others in virtue of their personhood to accord them fundamental dignity regardless of the numbers of others whose happiness is to be affected by the action in question.

Hume was heavily influenced by Hutcheson, who was one of his teachers. His system also incorporates insights made by Shaftesbury, though he certainly lacks Shaftesbury's confidence that virtue is its own reward. In terms of his place in the history of utilitarianism we should note two distinct effects his system had. Firstly, his account of the social utility of the artificial virtues influenced Bentham's thought on utility. Secondly, his account of the role sentiment played in moral judgment and commitment to moral norms influenced Mill's thoughts about the internal sanctions of morality. Mill would diverge from Bentham in developing the ‘altruistic’ approach to Utilitarianism (which is actually a misnomer, but more on that later). Bentham, in contrast to Mill, represented the egoistic branch — his theory of human nature reflected Hobbesian psychological egoism.

2. The Classical Approach

The Classical Utilitarians, Bentham and Mill, were concerned with legal and social reform. If anything could be identified as the fundamental motivation behind the development of Classical Utilitarianism it would be the desire to see useless, corrupt laws and social practices changed. Accomplishing this goal required a normative ethical theory employed as a critical tool. What is the truth about what makes an action or a policy a morally good one, or morally right? But developing the theory itself was also influenced by strong views about what was wrong in their society. The conviction that, for example, some laws are bad resulted in analysis of why they were bad. And, for Jeremy Bentham, what made them bad was their lack of utility, their tendency to lead to unhappiness and misery without any compensating happiness. If a law or an action doesn't do any good, then it isn't any good.

2.1 Jeremy Bentham

Jeremy Bentham (1748–1832) was influenced both by Hobbes' account of human nature and Hume's account of social utility. He famously held that humans were ruled by two sovereign masters — pleasure and pain. We seek pleasure and the avoidance of pain, they “…govern us in all we do, in all we say, in all we think…” (Bentham PML, 1). Yet he also promulgated the principle of utility as the standard of right action on the part of governments and individuals. Actions are approved when they are such as to promote happiness, or pleasure, and disapproved of when they have a tendency to cause unhappiness, or pain (PML). Combine this criterion of rightness with a view that we should be actively trying to promote overall happiness, and one has a serious incompatibility with psychological egoism. Thus, his apparent endorsement of Hobbesian psychological egoism created problems in understanding his moral theory since psychological egoism rules out acting to promote the overall well-being when that it is incompatible with one's own. For the psychological egoist, that is not even a possibility. So, given ‘ought implies can’ it would follow that we are not obligated to act to promote overall well-being when that is incompatible with our own. This generates a serious tension in Bentham's thought, one that was drawn to his attention. He sometimes seemed to think that he could reconcile the two commitments empirically, that is, by noting that when people act to promote the good they are helping themselves, too. But this claim only serves to muddy the waters, since the standard understanding of psychological egoism — and Bentham's own statement of his view — identifies motives of action which are self-interested. Yet this seems, again, in conflict with his own specification of the method for making moral decisions which is not to focus on self-interest — indeed, the addition of extent as a parameter along which to measure pleasure produced distinguishes this approach from ethical egoism. Aware of the difficulty, in later years he seemed to pull back from a full-fledged commitment to psychological egoism, admitting that people do sometimes act benevolently — with the overall good of humanity in mind.

Bentham also benefited from Hume's work, though in many ways their approaches to moral philosophy were completely different. Hume rejected the egoistic view of human nature. Hume also focused on character evaluation in his system. Actions are significant as evidence of character, but only have this derivative significance. In moral evaluation the main concern is that of character. Yet Bentham focused on act-evaluation. There was a tendency — remarked on by J. B. Schneewind (1990), for example — to move away from focus on character evaluation after Hume and towards act-evaluation. Recall that Bentham was enormously interested in social reform. Indeed, reflection on what was morally problematic about laws and policies influenced his thinking on utility as a standard. When one legislates, however, one is legislating in support of, or against, certain actions. Character — that is, a person's true character — is known, if known at all, only by that person. If one finds the opacity of the will thesis plausible then character, while theoretically very interesting, isn't a practical focus for legislation. Further, as Schneewind notes, there was an increasing sense that focus on character would actually be disruptive, socially, particularly if one's view was that a person who didn't agree with one on a moral issues was defective in terms of his or her character, as opposed to simply making a mistake reflected in action.

But Bentham does take from Hume the view that utility is the measure of virtue — that is, utility more broadly construed than Hume's actual usage of the term. This is because Hume made a distinction between pleasure that the perception of virtue generates in the observer, and social utility, which consisted in a trait's having tangible benefits for society, any instance of which may or may not generate pleasure in the observer. But Bentham is not simply reformulating a Humean position — he's merely been influenced by Hume's arguments to see pleasure as a measure or standard of moral value. So, why not move from pleasurable responses to traits to pleasure as a kind of consequence which is good, and in relation to which, actions are morally right or wrong? Bentham, in making this move, avoids a problem for Hume. On Hume's view it seems that the response — corrected, to be sure — determines the trait's quality as a virtue or vice. But on Bentham's view the action (or trait) is morally good, right, virtuous in view of the consequences it generates, the pleasure or utility it produces, which could be completely independent of what our responses are to the trait. So, unless Hume endorses a kind of ideal observer test for virtue, it will be harder for him to account for how it is people make mistakes in evaluations of virtue and vice. Bentham, on the other hand, can say that people may not respond to the actions good qualities — perhaps they don't perceive the good effects. But as long as there are these good effects which are, on balance, better than the effects of any alternative course of action, then the action is the right one. Rhetorically, anyway, one can see why this is an important move for Bentham to be able to make. He was a social reformer. He felt that people often had responses to certain actions — of pleasure or disgust — that did not reflect anything morally significant at all. Indeed, in his discussions of homosexuality, for example, he explicitly notes that ‘antipathy’ is not sufficient reason to legislate against a practice:

The circumstances from which this antipathy may have taken its rise may be worth enquiring to…. One is the physical antipathy to the offence…. The act is to the highest degree odious and disgusting, that is, not to the man who does it, for he does it only because it gives him pleasure, but to one who thinks [?] of it. Be it so, but what is that to him? (Bentham OAO, v. 4, 94)

Bentham then notes that people are prone to use their physical antipathy as a pretext to transition to moral antipathy, and the attending desire to punish the persons who offend their taste. This is illegitimate on his view for a variety of reasons, one of which is that to punish a person for violations of taste, or on the basis of prejudice, would result in runaway punishments, “…one should never know where to stop…” The prejudice in question can be dealt with by showing it “to be ill-grounded”. This reduces the antipathy to the act in question. This demonstrates an optimism in Bentham. If a pain can be demonstrated to be based on false beliefs then he believes that it can be altered or at the very least ‘assuaged and reduced’. This is distinct from the view that a pain or pleasure based on a false belief should be discounted. Bentham does not believe the latter. Thus Bentham's hedonism is a very straightforward hedonism. The one intrinsic good is pleasure, the bad is pain. We are to promote pleasure and act to reduce pain. When called upon to make a moral decision one measures an action's value with respect to pleasure and pain according to the following: intensity (how strong the pleasure or pain is), duration (how long it lasts), certainty (how likely the pleasure or pain is to be the result of the action), proximity (how close the sensation will be to performance of the action), fecundity (how likely it is to lead to further pleasures or pains), purity (how much intermixture there is with the other sensation). One also considers extent — the number of people affected by the action.

Keeping track of all of these parameters can be complicated and time consuming. Bentham does not recommend that they figure into every act of moral deliberation because of the efficiency costs which need to be considered. Experience can guide us. We know that the pleasure of kicking someone is generally outweighed by the pain inflicted on that person, so such calculations when confronted with a temptation to kick someone are unnecessary. It is reasonable to judge it wrong on the basis of past experience or consensus. One can use ‘rules of thumb’ to guide action, but these rules are overridable when abiding by them would conflict with the promotion of the good.

Bentham's view was surprising to many at the time at least in part because he viewed the moral quality of an action to be determined instrumentally. It isn't so much that there is a particular kind of action that is intrinsically wrong; actions that are wrong are wrong simply in virtue of their effects, thus, instrumentally wrong. This cut against the view that there are some actions that by their very nature are just wrong, regardless of their effects. Some may be wrong because they are ‘unnatural’ — and, again, Bentham would dismiss this as a legitimate criterion. Some may be wrong because they violate liberty, or autonomy. Again, Bentham would view liberty and autonomy as good — but good instrumentally, not intrinsically. Thus, any action deemed wrong due to a violation of autonomy is derivatively wrong on instrumental grounds as well. This is interesting in moral philosophy — as it is far removed from the Kantian approach to moral evaluation as well as from natural law approaches. It is also interesting in terms of political philosophy and social policy. On Bentham's view the law is not monolithic and immutable. Since effects of a given policy may change, the moral quality of the policy may change as well. Nancy Rosenblum noted that for Bentham one doesn't simply decide on good laws and leave it at that: “Lawmaking must be recognized as a continual process in response to diverse and changing desires that require adjustment” (Rosenblum 1978, 9). A law that is good at one point in time may be a bad law at some other point in time. Thus, lawmakers have to be sensitive to changing social circumstances. To be fair to Bentham's critics, of course, they are free to agree with him that this is the case in many situations, just not all — and that there is still a subset of laws that reflect the fact that some actions just are intrinsically wrong regardless of consequences. Bentham is in the much more difficult position of arguing that effects are all there are to moral evaluation of action and policy.

2.2 John Stuart Mill

John Stuart Mill (1806–1873) was a follower of Bentham, and, through most of his life, greatly admired Bentham's work even though he disagreed with some of Bentham's claims — particularly on the nature of ‘happiness.’ Bentham, recall, had held that there were no qualitative differences between pleasures, only quantitative ones. This left him open to a variety of criticisms. First, Bentham's Hedonism was too egalitarian. Simple-minded pleasures, sensual pleasures, were just as good, at least intrinsically, than more sophisticated and complex pleasures. The pleasure of drinking a beer in front of the T.V. surely doesn't rate as highly as the pleasure one gets solving a complicated math problem, or reading a poem, or listening to Mozart. Second, Bentham's view that there were no qualitative differences in pleasures also left him open to the complaint that on his view human pleasures were of no more value than animal pleasures and, third, committed him to the corollary that the moral status of animals, tied to their sentience, was the same as that of humans. While harming a puppy and harming a person are both bad, however, most people had the view that harming the person was worse. Mill sought changes to the theory that could accommodate those sorts of intuitions.

To this end, Mill's hedonism was influenced by perfectionist intuitions. There are some pleasures that are more fitting than others. Intellectual pleasures are of a higher, better, sort than the ones that are merely sensual, and that we share with animals. To some this seems to mean that Mill really wasn't a hedonistic utilitarian. His view of the good did radically depart from Bentham's view. However, like Bentham, the good still consists in pleasure, it is still a psychological state. There is certainly that similarity. Further, the basic structures of the theories are the same (for more on this see Donner 1991). While it is true that Mill is more comfortable with notions like ‘rights’ this does not mean that he, in actuality, rejected utilitarianism. The rationale for all the rights he recognizes is utilitarian.

Mill's ‘proof’ of the claim that intellectual pleasures are better in kind than others, though, is highly suspect. He doesn't attempt a mere appeal to raw intuition. Instead, he argues that those persons who have experienced both view the higher as better than the lower. Who would rather be a happy oyster, living an enormously long life, than a person living a normal life? Or, to use his most famous example — it is better to be Socrates ‘dissatisfied’ than a fool ‘satisfied.’ In this way Mill was able to solve a problem for utilitarianism.

Mill also argued that the principle could be proven, using another rather notorious argument:

The only proof capable of being given that an object is visible is that people actually see it…. In like manner, I apprehend, the sole evidence it is possible to produce that anything is desirable is that people do actually desire it. If the end which the utilitarian doctrine proposes to itself were not, in theory and in practiced, acknowledged to be an end, nothing could ever convince any person that it was so. (Mill, U, 81)

Mill then continues to argue that people desire happiness — the utilitarian end — and that the general happiness is “a good to the aggregate of all persons.” (81)

G. E. Moore (1873–1958) criticized this as fallacious. He argued that it rested on an obvious ambiguity:

Mill has made as naïve and artless a use of the naturalistic fallacy as anybody could desire. “Good”, he tells us, means “desirable”, and you can only find out what is desirable by seeking to find out what is actually desired…. The fact is that “desirable” does not mean “able to be desired” as “visible” means “able to be seen.” The desirable means simply what ought to be desired or deserves to be desired; just as the detestable means not what can be but what ought to be detested… (Moore, PE, 66–7)

It should be noted, however, that Mill was offering this as an alternative to Bentham's view which had been itself criticized as a ‘swine morality,’ locating the good in pleasure in a kind of indiscriminate way. The distinctions he makes strike many as intuitively plausible ones. Bentham, however, can accommodate many of the same intuitions within his system. This is because he notes that there are a variety of parameters along which we quantitatively measure pleasure — intensity and duration are just two of those. His complete list is the following: intensity, duration, certainty or uncertainty, propinquity or remoteness, fecundity, purity, and extent. Thus, what Mill calls the intellectual pleasures will score more highly than the sensual ones along several parameters, and this could give us reason to prefer those pleasures — but it is a quantitative not a qualitative reason, on Bentham's view. When a student decides to study for an exam rather than go to a party, for example, she is making the best decision even though she is sacrificing short term pleasure. That's because studying for the exam, Bentham could argue, scores higher in terms of the long term pleasures doing well in school lead to, as well as the fecundity of the pleasure in leading to yet other pleasures. However, Bentham will have to concede that the very happy oyster that lives a very long time could, in principle, have a better life than a normal human.

Mill's version of utilitarianism differed from Bentham's also in that he placed weight on the effectiveness of internal sanctions — emotions like guilt and remorse which serve to regulate our actions. This is an off-shoot of the different view of human nature adopted by Mill. We are the sorts of beings that have social feelings, feelings for others, not just ourselves. We care about them, and when we perceive harms to them this causes painful experiences in us. When one perceives oneself to be the agent of that harm, the negative emotions are centered on the self. One feels guilt for what one has done, not for what one sees another doing. Like external forms of punishment, internal sanctions are instrumentally very important to appropriate action. Mill also held that natural features of human psychology, such as conscience and a sense of justice, underwrite motivation. The sense of justice, for example, results from very natural impulses. Part of this sense involves a desire to punish those who have harmed others, and this desire in turn “…is a spontaneous outgrowth from two sentiments, both in the highest degree natural…; the impulse of self-defense, and the feeling of sympathy.” (Chapter 5, Utilitarianism) Of course, he goes on, the justification must be a separate issue. The feeling is there naturally, but it is our ‘enlarged’ sense, our capacity to include the welfare of others into our considerations, and make intelligent decisions, that gives it the right normative force.

Like Bentham, Mill sought to use utilitarianism to inform law and social policy. The aim of increasing happiness underlies his arguments for women's suffrage and free speech. We can be said to have certain rights, then — but those rights are underwritten by utility. If one can show that a purported right or duty is harmful, then one has shown that it is not genuine. One of Mills most famous arguments to this effect can be found in his writing on women's suffrage when he discusses the ideal marriage of partners, noting that the ideal exists between individuals of “cultivated faculties” who influence each other equally. Improving the social status of women was important because they were capable of these cultivated faculties, and denying them access to education and other opportunities for development is forgoing a significant source of happiness. Further, the men who would deny women the opportunity for education, self-improvement, and political expression do so out of base motives, and the resulting pleasures are not ones that are of the best sort.

Bentham and Mill both attacked social traditions that were justified by appeals to natural order. The correct appeal is to utility itself. Traditions often turned out to be “relics” of “barbarous” times, and appeals to nature as a form of justification were just ways to try rationalize continued deference to those relics.

In the latter part of the 20th century some writers criticized utilitarianism for its failure to accommodate virtue evaluation. However, though virtue is not the central normative concept in Mill's theory, it is an extremely important one. In Chapter 4 of Utilitarianism Mill noted

… does the utilitarian doctrine deny that people desire virtue, or maintain that virtue is not a thing to be desired? The very reverse. It maintains not only that virtue is to be desired, but also that it is to be desired disinterestedly, for itself. Whatever may be the opinion of utilitarian moralists as to the original conditions by which virtue is made virtue … they not only place virtue at the very head of things which are good as a means to the ultimate end, but they also recognize as a psychological fact the possibility of its being, to the individual, a good in itself, without looking to any end beyond it; and hold, that the mind is not in a right state, not in a state conformable to Utility, not in the state most conducive to the general happiness, unless it does love virtue in this manner …

In Utilitarianism Mill argues that virtue not only has instrumental value, but is constitutive of the good life. A person without virtue is morally lacking, is not as able to promote the good. However, this view of virtue is someone complicated by rather cryptic remarks Mill makes about virtue in his A System of Logic in the section in which he discusses the “Art of Life.” There he seems to associate virtue with aesthetics, and morality is reserved for the sphere of ‘right’ or ‘duty‘. Wendy Donner notes that separating virtue from right allows Mill to solve another problem for the theory: the demandingness problem (Donner 2011). This is the problem that holds that if we ought to maximize utility, if that is the right thing to do, then doing right requires enormous sacrifices (under actual conditions), and that requiring such sacrifices is too demanding. With duties, on Mill's view, it is important that we get compliance, and that justifies coercion. In the case of virtue, however, virtuous actions are those which it is “…for the general interest that they remain free.”

3. Henry Sidgwick

Henry Sidgwick's (1838–1900) The Methods of Ethics (1874) is one of the most well known works in utilitarian moral philosophy, and deservedly so. It offers a defense of utilitarianism, though some writers (Schneewind 1977) have argued that it should not primarily be read as a defense of utilitarianism. In The Methods Sidgwick is concerned with developing an account of “…the different methods of Ethics that I find implicit in our common moral reasoning…” These methods are egoism, intuition based morality, and utilitarianism. On Sidgwick's view, utilitarianism is the more basic theory. A simple reliance on intuition, for example, cannot resolve fundamental conflicts between values, or rules, such as Truth and Justice that may conflict. In Sidgwick's words “…we require some higher principle to decide the issue…” That will be utilitarianism. Further, the rules which seem to be a fundamental part of common sense morality are often vague and underdescribed, and applying them will actually require appeal to something theoretically more basic — again, utilitarianism. Yet further, absolute interpretations of rules seem highly counter-intuitive, and yet we need some justification for any exceptions — provided, again, by utilitarianism. Sidgwick provides a compelling case for the theoretical primacy of utilitarianism.

Sidgwick was also a British philosopher, and his views developed out of and in response to those of Bentham and Mill. His Methods offer an engagement with the theory as it had been presented before him, and was an exploration of it and the main alternatives as well as a defense.

Sidgwick was also concerned with clarifying fundamental features of the theory, and in this respect his account has been enormously influential to later writers, not only to utilitarians and consequentialists, generally, but to intuitionists as well. Sidgwick's thorough and penetrating discussion of the theory raised many of the concerns that have been developed by recent moral philosophers.

One extremely controversial feature of Sidgwick's views relates to his rejection of a publicity requirement for moral theory. He writes:

Thus, the Utilitarian conclusion, carefully stated, would seem to be this; that the opinion that secrecy may render an action right which would not otherwise be so should itself be kept comparatively secret; and similarly it seems expedient that the doctrine that esoteric morality is expedient should itself be kept esoteric. Or, if this concealment be difficult to maintain, it may be desirable that Common Sense should repudiate the doctrines which it is expedient to confine to an enlightened few. And thus a Utilitarian may reasonably desire, on Utilitarian principles, that some of his conclusions should be rejected by mankind generally; or even that the vulgar should keep aloof from his system as a whole, in so far as the inevitable indefiniteness and complexity of its calculations render it likely to lead to bad results in their hands. (490)

This accepts that utilitarianism may be self-effacing; that is, that it may be best if people do not believe it, even though it is true. Further, it rendered the theory subject to Bernard Williams' (1995) criticism that the theory really simply reflected the colonial elitism of Sidgwick's time, that it was ‘Government House Utilitarianism.’ The elitism in his remarks may reflect a broader attitude, one in which the educated are considered better policy makers than the uneducated.

One issue raised in the above remarks is relevant to practical deliberation in general. To what extent should proponents of a given theory, or a given rule, or a given policy — or even proponents of a given one-off action — consider what they think people will actually do, as opposed to what they think those same people ought to do (under full and reasonable reflection, for example)? This is an example of something that comes up in the Actualism/possibilism debate in accounts of practical deliberation. Extrapolating from the example used above, we have people who advocate telling the truth, or what they believe to be the truth, even if the effects are bad because the truth is somehow misused by others. On the other hand are those who recommend not telling the truth when it is predicted that the truth will be misused by others to achieve bad results. Of course it is the case that the truth ought not be misused, that its misuse can be avoided and is not inevitable, but the misuse is entirely predictable. Sidgwick seems to recommending that we follow the course that we predict will have the best outcome, given as part of our calculations the data that others may fail in some way — either due to having bad desires, or simply not being able to reason effectively. The worry Williams points to really isn't a worry specifically with utilitarianism (Driver 2011). Sidgwick would point out that if it is bad to hide the truth, because ‘Government House’ types, for example, typically engage in self-deceptive rationalizations of their policies (which seems entirely plausible), then one shouldn't do it. And of course, that heavily influences our intuitions.

Sidgwick raised issues that run much deeper to our basic understanding of utilitarianism. For example, the way earlier utilitarians characterized the principle of utility left open serious indeterminacies. The major one rests on the distinction between total and average utility. He raised the issue in the context of population growth and increasing utility levels by increasing numbers of people (or sentient beings):

Assuming, then, that the average happiness of human beings is a positive quantity, it seems clear that, supposing the average happiness enjoyed remains undiminished, Utilitarianism directs us to make the number enjoying it as great as possible. But if we foresee as possible that an increase in numbers will be accompanied by a decrease in average happiness or vice versa, a point arises which has not only never been formally noticed, but which seems to have been substantially overlooked by many Utilitarians. For if we take Utilitarianism to prescribe, as the ultimate end of action, happiness on the whole, and not any individual's happiness, unless considered as an element of the whole, it would follow that, if the additional population enjoy on the whole positive happiness, we ought to weigh the amount of happiness gained by the extra number against the amount lost by the remainder. (415)

For Sidgwick, the conclusion on this issue is not to simply strive to greater average utility, but to increase population to the point where we maximize the product of the number of persons who are currently alive and the amount of average happiness. So it seems to be a hybrid, total-average view. This discussion also raised the issue of policy with respect to population growth, and both would be pursued in more detail by later writers, most notably Derek Parfit (1986).

4. Ideal Utilitarianism

G. E. Moore strongly disagreed with the hedonistic value theory adopted by the Classical Utilitarians. Moore agreed that we ought to promote the good, but believed that the good included far more than what could be reduced to pleasure. He was a pluralist, rather than a monist, regarding intrinsic value. For example, he believed that ‘beauty’ was an intrinsic good. A beautiful object had value independent of any pleasure it might generate in a viewer. Thus, Moore differed from Sidgwick who regarded the good as consisting in some consciousness. Some objective states in the world are intrinsically good, and on Moore's view, beauty is just such a state. He used one of his more notorious thought experiments to make this point: he asked the reader to compare two worlds, one was entirely beautiful, full of things which complemented each other; the other was a hideous, ugly world, filled with “everything that is most disgusting to us.” Further, there are not human beings, one imagines, around to appreciate or be disgusted by the worlds. The question then is, which of these worlds is better, which one's existence would be better than the other's? Of course, Moore believed it was clear that the beautiful world was better, even though no one was around to appreciate its beauty. This emphasis on beauty was one facet of Moore's work that made him a darling of the Bloomsbury Group. If beauty was a part of the good independent of its effects on the psychological states of others — independent of, really, how it affected others, then one needn't sacrifice morality on the altar of beauty anymore. Following beauty is not a mere indulgence, but may even be a moral obligation. Though Moore himself certainly never applied his view to such cases, it does provide the resources for dealing with what the contemporary literature has dubbed ‘admirable immorality’ cases, at least some of them. Gauguin may have abandoned his wife and children, but it was to a beautiful end.

Moore's targets in arguing against hedonism were the earlier utilitarians who argued that the good was some state of consciousness such as pleasure. He actually waffled on this issue a bit, but always disagreed with Hedonism in that even when he held that beauty all by itself was not an intrinsic good, he also held that for the appreciation of beauty to be a good the beauty must actually be there, in the world, and not be the result of illusion.

Moore further criticized the view that pleasure itself was an intrinsic good, since it failed a kind of isolation test that he proposed for intrinsic value. If one compared an empty universe with a universe of sadists, the empty universe would strike one as better. This is true even though there is a good deal of pleasure, and no pain, in the universe of sadists. This would seem to indicate that what is necessary for the good is at least the absence of bad intentionality. The pleasures of sadists, in virtue of their desires to harm others, get discounted — they are not good, even though they are pleasures. Note this radical departure from Bentham who held that even malicious pleasure was intrinsically good, and that if nothing instrumentally bad attached to the pleasure, it was wholly good as well.

One of Moore's important contributions was to put forward an ‘organic unity’ or ‘organic whole’ view of value. The principle of organic unity is vague, and there is some disagreement about what Moore actually meant in presenting it. Moore states that ‘organic’ is used “…to denote the fact that a whole has an intrinsic value different in amount from the sum of the values of its parts.” (PE, 36) And, for Moore, that is all it is supposed to denote. So, for example, one cannot determine the value of a body by adding up the value of its parts. Some parts of the body may have value only in relation to the whole. An arm or a leg, for example, may have no value at all separated from the body, but have a great deal of value attached to the body, and increase the value of the body, even. In the section of Principia Ethica on the Ideal, the principle of organic unity comes into play in noting that when persons experience pleasure through perception of something beautiful (which involves a positive emotion in the face of a recognition of an appropriate object — an emotive and cognitive set of elements), the experience of the beauty is better when the object of the experience, the beautiful object, actually exists. The idea was that experiencing beauty has a small positive value, and existence of beauty has a small positive value, but combining them has a great deal of value, more than the simple addition of the two small values (PE, 189 ff.). Moore noted: “A true belief in the reality of an object greatly increases the value of many valuable wholes…” (199).

This principle in Moore — particularly as applied to the significance of actual existence and value, or knowledge and value, provided utilitarians with tools to meet some significant challenges. For example, deluded happiness would be severely lacking on Moore's view, especially in comparison to happiness based on knowledge.

5. Conclusion

Since the early 20th Century utilitarianism has undergone a variety of refinements. After the middle of the 20th Century it has become more common to identify as a ‘Consequentialist’ since very few philosophers agree entirely with the view proposed by the Classical Utilitarians, particularly with respect to the hedonistic value theory. But the influence of the Classical Utilitarians has been profound — not only within moral philosophy, but within political philosophy and social policy. The question Bentham asked, “What use is it?,” is a cornerstone of policy formation. It is a completely secular, forward-looking question. The articulation and systematic development of this approach to policy formation is owed to the Classical Utilitarians.


Primary Literature

  • Bentham, Jeremy, 1789 [PML]. An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation., Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1907.
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Secondary Literature

  • Crisp, Roger, 1997. Mill on Utilitarianism., London: Routledge.
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  • –––, 2011. Consequentialism, London: Routledge.
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  • Rosenblum, Nancy, 1978. Bentham's Theory of the Modern State, New York: Cambridge University Press.
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  • –––, 1990. “The Misfortunes of Virtue,” Ethics, 101: 42–63.
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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


The editors would like to thank Gintautas Miliauskas (Vilnius University) for notifying us about several typographical errors in this entry.

Copyright © 2014 by
Julia Driver <>

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