Blaise Pascal

First published Tue Aug 21, 2007; substantive revision Mon Jun 22, 2015

Pascal did not publish any philosophical works during his relatively brief lifetime. His status in French literature today is based primarily on the posthumous publication of a notebook in which he drafted or recorded ideas for a planned defence of Christianity, the Pensées de M. Pascal sur la religion et sur quelques autres sujets (1670). Nonetheless, his philosophical commitments can be gleaned from his contributions to scientific and theological debates in France in the mid-seventeenth century.

1. Life and Works

Pascal was born in Clermont (now Clermont-Ferrand), France, on 19 June 1623, and died thirty-nine years later in Paris (19 August 1662). Following his mother's death when he was three years old, Blaise was reared by his father, Étienne, in the company of his two sisters, Gilberte (b. 1620) and Jacqueline (b. 1625). Later, in Paris, the family hired a maid named Louise Delfault, who became effectively a member of the close-knit family. Pascal's father was an accomplished mathematician, and he provided the only formal education that his son enjoyed. As Carraud (1992: Chapter 2) shows, this arrangement was unique in the seventeenth century for a young man of Pascal's social status. He was never trained in theology or the philosophy of the schools, and his exclusively domestic education focused initially on classical languages and mathematics. The decision to educate Pascal at home was motivated by the fact that he suffered from very poor health for most of his life, beginning at the age of two. Although his sister, Gilberte, may have exaggerated in her hagiographical biography, La vie de M. Pascal, she reported Pascal as claiming that “from the age of eighteen, he never passed a day without pain” (I, 67: all references to Pascal's works are to Pascal, 1998/2000, with volume and page number). He continued to be so ill that, at the age of twenty-four, he could tolerate no food other than in liquid form, which his sisters or his nurse warmed and fed to him drop by drop (Vie: I, 69). Gilberte's biography also confirms that, as his sisters matured, they assumed many of the nursing responsibilities for their infirm brother that would otherwise have been provided by his mother had she not died prematurely.

The Pascal family moved residence frequently, for political and financial reasons. They transferred initially to Paris in November 1631, although Étienne was forced to return seven years later to his original home in what had meantime become Clermont-Ferrand, because he expressed public dissent about the crown's fiscal policies. France had declared war on Spain in 1635, and this intermittent campaign lasted for most of Blaise Pascal's life. The international and local political context in which Pascal lived, together with very public disputes between competing religious and theological traditions in which he participated, helped determine the issues to which he contributed philosophical comments in the 1640s and 1650s. For example, following the revolt of the Nu-Pieds in Normandy in July 1639, Pascal's father was awarded a new post as a tax collector in Rouen, to which he moved in 1639; his son, Blaise, followed in 1640. While still in Paris, he had written the short Essai pour les coniques (1640) and, despite his youth, had been introduced to the Mersenne circle by his father as a promising young mathematician. Later at Rouen he developed the first prototype of his calculating machine (1645), and began to experiment with mercury barometers. Pascal's introduction to barometric experiments occurred by chance when the royal engineer, Pierre Petit (1598–1667), passed through Rouen in September 1646 and informed both Pascals, father and son, about Evangelista Torricelli's experiments in Italy. Pascal performed experiments with mercury barometers initially in Rouen and Paris, and published Expériences nouvelles touchant la vide in 1647. Since he was too ill to do so himself, he arranged for his brother-in-law, Florin Périer, to conduct on his behalf one of the most famous experiments of the scientific revolution on the puy-de-Dôme, in the Auvergne.

Périer arranged for two similar barometric tubes to be filled with mercury, on 19 September 1648. He left one at the bottom of the mountain, and charged a local friar to keep watch during the day and note any changes in the height of the mercury. Together with other witnesses, Périer climbed the mountain and took readings of the height of the mercury on the mountain top, and subsequently at two intermediate places on their return journey down the mountainside. As expected, the height of the mercury column varied inversely with the height (above sea-level) at which the measurements were taken. When the experimenters rejoined the friar at the bottom of the mountain and compared the measurements on both tubes, they concurred exactly. The friar reported that, throughout the day, there had been no variation in the height of the mercury column that he observed, “despite the fact that the weather was very changeable, sometimes calm, sometimes rainy, sometimes very foggy and sometimes windy” (I, 433). The results of this experiment were published as Récit de la grande expérience de l'équilibre des liqueurs (1648). Pascal concluded, mistakenly, that the experiment guaranteed his interpretation of its results [see below, Section 4].

Pascal's initial encounter with Jansenism had occurred when he was twenty-two years old. His father slipped on ice and dislocated or broke his thigh in January 1646. Following the accident, the Deschamps brothers, who had bone-setting and nursing skills, came to live in the Pascal household at Rouen for three months. They introduced the family to the strict observance of Christianity inspired by the Dutch theologian, Cornelius Jansen (1585–1638), and the French theologian, Jean Duvergier de Hauranne, who is more commonly known as the Abbé de Saint-Cyran (1581–1643). The evangelical work of the Deschamps brothers relied partly on Jansen's short treatise, the Discours sur la réformation le l'homme intérieur, which was based on the text of I John 2:16: “For all that is in the world is the concupiscence of the flesh and the concupiscence of the eyes and the pride of life, which is not of the Father but is of this world.” Jansen taught that a desire for knowledge was one form of concupiscence, and he argued that from this “illness … arises the investigation of nature's secrets (which are irrelevant to us), knowledge of which is useless, and which men do not wish to know except for the sake of knowing them” (Jansen 2004: 24). Jansen recommended that Christians should turn aside from the pride and concupiscence of human knowledge and scientific investigations, and that they should concentrate exclusively on knowledge of God. While this encounter with Jansenist theology is sometimes described as Pascal's first conversion, it is unlikely that he had already made the definitive choice about the insignificance of mathematical and scientific work that characterised his change of heart in the 1650s. He returned to Paris with his sister, Jacqueline, in 1647. Descartes met him there, in September 1647, during an extended trip to Paris from his usual residence in the north of Holland, and discussed with Pascal the results they might expect if they conducted the kind of experiment that was subsequently performed on the puy-de-Dôme.

The Pascal family (Étienne, Blaise, and Jacqueline) left Paris again during the civil war known as the Fronde (1648), and they returned later that year to a new address in the French capital. The settlement agreed by Mazarin and the regent with the parlement to end the Fronde meant that Étienne had become redundant as a tax-collector in Rouen. The return to Paris was followed within a few years by a radical change in the emotional and nursing support that Blaise Pascal had enjoyed since his earliest years. His older sister Gilberte had married Florin Périer in June 1641 and had moved to Clermont-Ferrand. However, his younger sister, Jacqueline, who had continued to act as his personal assistant, expressed a desire, in May 1648, to become a nun. She wanted to enter the Port-Royal convent in Paris, which was under the spiritual supervision of Jansenists and in which one of Arnauld's sisters was a prominent Abbess. Étienne's opposition caused Jacqueline to defer implementing her decision as long as he was still alive. However, four months after her father's death in 1651, and despite her brother's opposition, Jacqueline Pascal joined Port-Royal. Then, for the first time in his life, Blaise Pascal was alone and still in poor health. He soon began to accept spiritual guidance from his sister Jacqueline and subsequently from a prominent Jansenist, Antoine Singlin (1607–64).

In the summer of 1654, Pascal returned briefly to mathematics in correspondence with Pierre Fermat (1601–65) about calculating probabilities associated with gambling. He summarized his findings in the Traité du triangle arithmétique which, like much of his other work, remained unpublished until after his death. In fact, as Edwards explains (Hammond, 2003: Chapter 3), Pascal's contribution to probability theory was not recognised until it was used by Bernoulli in the early eighteenth century.

During the night of 23 November 1654, Pascal had a dreamlike or ecstatic experience which he interpreted as a religious conversion. He wrote a summary of the experience in a brief document entitled the Memorial, which he sewed into his coat and carried with him until his death eight years later. The intensity of this experience resulted in a definitive change in Pascal's lifestyle, in his intellectual interests, and in his personal ambitions. After 1654, he terminated the mathematical discussions about which he had correspondended with Fermat, and he cancelled plans to publish a booklet on the vacuum that was ready to go into print. This booklet appeared posthumously as Traités de l'équilibre des liqueurs et de la pesanteur de la masse de l'air (1663), with an introduction by Florin Périer. Périer may have exaggerated the other-worldly attitude of his late brother-in-law, when he wrote that, for more than ten years before his death, Pascal was aware of “the vanity and nothingness of all these types of knowledge, and that he had acquired such disgust for them that he could hardly tolerate intelligent people devoting their time to them and speaking seriously about them” (I, 459). Pascal had entered the final period of his life, which was dominated by religious controversy, continual illness, and loneliness. This was also the period in which he assumed the challenge of defending Arnauld and, more generally, Jansenist theology in the Provincial Letters.

Antoine Arnauld (1612–94) was a prominent theologian in the Sorbonne, who was most famous for his defence of Jansenism in De la fréquente communion (1643). Following the condemnation by Pope Innocent X (May 1653) of five propositions about grace that were allegedly found in Jansen's posthumously published book, Augustinus (1640), Arnauld was threatened with censure by the Theology Faculty at the Sorbonne. This provoked Pascal to write a series of open letters, between January 1656 and March 1657, which were published one by one under a pseudonym and became known as the Provincial Letters. They purported to inform someone living outside Paris (in the provinces) about the events that were newsworthy in theological debates at the Sorbonne and, more widely, in the Catholic Church in France. The Letters rely on satire and ridicule as much as on logic or argument to persuade readers of the justice of Arnauld's cause and of the unsustainability of his critics' objections. However, despite Pascal's efforts, Arnauld was expelled from the Sorbonne (February 1656). Those who lived at Port-Royal des Champs — another convent associated with Port-Royal, which was outside the city boundaries — agreed to leave voluntarily (March 1656) under threat of forcible expulsion, and the convent was eventually razed to the ground. The Provincial Letters are Pascal's deeply personal, angry response to the use of political power and church censure to decide what he considered to be a matter of fact, and to what he perceived as the undue influence of a lax, secular Jesuit morality on those who held political and ecclesiastical power in France. The Jesuits were not members of the Sorbonne and were not officially involved in Arnauld's censure; it is not immediately clear, therefore, why Pascal, in the course of writing the letters, devoted so much energy to criticizing the Jesuits. He may have blamed their influence in Rome and their political connections with the monarchy in France for Arnauld's censure.

The final years of Pascal's life were devoted to religious controversy, to the extent that his increasingly poor health permitted. During this period, he began to collect ideas and to draft notes for a book in defence of the Catholic faith. While his health and premature death partly explain his failure to realise that ambition, one might also suspect that an inherent contradiction in the project's design would have made its implementation impossible. Apologetic treatises in support of Christianity traditionally used reasons to support religious faith (e.g. a proof of God's existence, or historical arguments to show the credibility of witnesses whose evidence is reported in the New Testament); however, according to Pascal's radical theological position, it was impossible in principle to acquire or support genuine religious faith by reason, because genuine religious faith was a pure gift from God. Pascal had collected his notes into bundles or liasses before he died, and had provided tentative titles for each bundle; however, these notes gave no indication of the order in which they should be read, either within a given bundle or even between various bundles, and subsequent editors failed to agree on any numbering system for the posthumously published notes. The most frequently quoted modern editions of the Pensées—those of Lafuma, Sellier, or Le Guern—provide concordances to the numbering systems adopted by alternative editions. Given the status of the Pensées as a posthumously published notebook, it also remains unclear whether Pascal endorsed the opinions that are recorded there, or whether he planned to use some of them merely for comment or critique. They are reliably attributed to Pascal only when he expressed similar views elsewhere. One of the most famous and most extensive notes in the Pensées (Fragment 397: II, 676–81) is the so-called ‘wager’ in favour of belief in God.

Cole (1995, Chapter 15) argues that Pascal exhibited signs of manic depression and an almost infantile dependence on his family in his mature years. In addition, many of the reported details of his personal life suggest a fundamentalist interpretation of religious belief that is difficult to reconcile with the critical reflection that defines philosophy as a discipline. For example, his sister's Life recorded that Pascal had an almost obsessive repugnance to any expression of emotional attachment, which Gilberte attributed to his high regard for the virtue of modesty. She reports that “he could not even tolerate the caresses that I received from my own children” (I, 83). Pascal believed uncritically that God performs miracles, among which he included the occasion when his niece was cured of a serious eye condition and the cure was attributed to what was believed to be a thorn from the passion of Christ. In general, Pascal's commitment to Jansenism was unqualified, although he denied in the Provincial Letters that he was a member of Port-Royal (I, 781). Everything we know about Pascal during his maturity points to a single-minded, unwavering belief in the exclusive truth of a radical theological position that left no room for alternative religious perspectives, either within Christianity or outside it. This is not to suggest that it is impossible to be a religious believer and a philosopher; there are too many obvious counterexamples to such a suggestion. However, the intensity of Pascal's religious faith, following his conversion, seems to have made philosophical inquiries irrelevant to him, with the result that he approached all questions during the final ten years of his life almost exclusively from the perspective of his religious faith. It was this perspective that predominated in the Pensées.

There is a complementary reason for urging caution about reading Pascal as a philosopher. He wrote much but published little, none of which was philosophy in the sense in which that term is used today [see section 6]. Apart from his brief essays on the vacuum and the Provincial Letters, all his writings were edited and amended posthumously by collaborators who were still involved in the theological controversies that had dominated Pascal's later life. For example, he seems to have contributed to an early version of the Port-Royal Logic (Arnauld and Nicole, 1993) that was subsequently published in 1662; and the Entretien avec M. de Sacy was composed many years after his death, based on the recollections of an editor. Thus philosophical opinions that were attributed to him in various writings that he left only in draft versions should be read with caution, because they were published posthumously by partisan proponents of Jansenism rather than their original author. His apparent disenchantment with philosophical studies is reflected in Fragment 77 of the Pensées: “we do not believe the whole of philosophy to be worth one hour's effort” (II, 566). This may also testify to the extreme ill-health and loneliness he experienced in his final years, when he reported that he could find consolation for his misery only in religion.

Pascal was never employed in any capacity, and he lived modestly with the financial support provided by his family. He died in the care of his sister, Gilberte, and was buried in the church of Saint Étienne du Mont, in Paris. His younger sister, Jacqueline, had predeceased him at the Port-Royal convent in October 1661.

2. Nature and Grace

Pascal's philosophical reflections are dominated by a theological interpretation of the human condition that he claimed to have borrowed from Saint Augustine. On this view, Adam's fall from grace resulted in a human nature that is essentially corrupt, and there is no possibility of recovery by natural means or human effort. This theological perspective determined Pascal's views about human freedom, and about ethics and politics; it also set extra-philosophical limits to his theory of knowledge, and prompted the negative assessment that he adopted, during the final years of his life, of the value of scientific or mathematical research.

Following Augustine, Pascal emphasized the extent to which any recovery from the fallen state of human nature was a gift from God, which could not be earned or deserved in any way by human agents. This divine gift included, as one of its elements, religious faith itself, that is, the capacity of humans to believe the theological interpretation on which the implied worldview depended. Other philosophical commentators on Christian belief in the seventeenth century, such as John Locke or John Toland, argued that what a Christian is invited to believe must be intelligible; according to them, there were no mysteries in Christianity if that term includes propositions that we cannot understand. Thus religious faith merely compensated for a lack of evidence in support of a particular proposition, and made it possible for a Christian to accept it as true (Clarke, 2011). For Pascal, however, faith provides appropriately disposed Christians with a means to transcend the limits of what is intelligible and to accept as true even matters that they cannot understand. To claim otherwise would be to set limits to the reality of God and to reduce religious faith to the compass of human understanding. The Pensées suggest: “if one submits everything to reason, our religion will contain nothing that is mysterious or supernatural” (Fragment 162: II, 602). Thus those who are given the gift of genuine religious faith are expected not only to accept things that are uncertain but, especially, to accede to realities that are incomprehensible. Pascal offered no explanation of how this was possible.

This degree of incomprehensibility in the content of religious belief is consistent with a corresponding relativism about the competing claims of different religious traditions. For example, each religion or each Christian sect might be understood as an alternative and equally uncertain perspective on the transcendent. However, Pascal was as committed to the exclusive truth of Catholicism, and even to his preferred interpretation of that tradition, as he was unwavering in his belief in mysteries. “I see several inconsistent religions, all of which except one are false. Each one wishes to be believed on the basis of its own authority and threatens unbelievers. I therefore do not believe them for that reason” (Fragment 184: II, 608). For Pascal, the Roman Catholic Church was the only true church, “outside of which I am fully convinced there is no salvation” (Provincial Letters: I, 781).

In contrast therefore with many of his contemporaries in France, such as Descartes or Malebranche, Pascal also rejected the suggestion that one could prove the existence of God by rational arguments. “The metaphysical proofs … have little value” (Fragment 179: II, 605). A fortiori, he rejected the view adopted by Malebranche, that we have no basis for believing the alleged content of revelation unless we have a prior proof that there exists a God who is capable of communicating with us. For Pascal, reason was completely inadequate to the task of relating to a transcendent divinity, and the only way to God was by ‘faith’.

Thus the discussion of wagering in favour of religious belief in the Pensées (Fragment 397: II, 676–81), which Pascal drafted and revised a number of times, was written from the perspective of someone who already believed in God, and who assumed that their belief was itself a gift from God. Pascal had independently studied the mathematics of gambling, and while considering how to compose an apology or defence of Christianity, he reviewed ways in which a committed Christian might adapt the logic of wagering to show that their belief is not unreasonable. However, according to Pascal's deepest theological convictions, nothing that he wrote in this context could persuade an unbeliever to become a believer in any sense that could lead to salvation. No one can communicate religious faith in Pascal's sense to others by reasoning or wagering, nor can such faith be self-induced by the same methods. For Pascal, a decision to believe God's revelation (in the relevant sense of ‘believe’) is not based on rational calculation nor, as indicated above, does it presuppose a philosophical argument in favour of God's existence. A calculation of the probability of one's wager is logically posterior to belief, and it purports to show only that those who have accepted divine grace and believed in God have made a wager that is not unreasonable. Why? Because the significance or value of the belief as a means to eternal salvation would, if it were true, compensate for its relative implausibility.

The various kinds of divine assistance (or, in the language of theology, grace) by which human beings may overcome their Fallen condition were the subject of intense theological controversy in the seventeenth century. The Church had condemned as heretical the Pelagian theory that human beings could achieve eternal salvation by the use of their unaided, natural powers. Various opinions to the effect that they could make some independent contribution to this process were equally condemned as semi-Pelagian. These suggestions were thought to deny or mitigate the exclusive efficacy of the Incarnation. Jansenism represented a starkly exclusive interpretation of how God's assistance enabled Fallen human beings to recover from the effect of Original Sin by the influence of ‘efficacious grace’. However, such a unilateral interpretation of God's intervention seemed to make human effort redundant. Pascal mocked the suggestion that God assisted weak human beings by means of a ‘sufficient grace’ which was not sufficient, and that this insufficient grace required an independent contribution from human agents. “By sufficient grace you mean a grace that is not sufficient” (Provincial Letters: I, 601). In response to what he understood as various degrees of Pelagianism, Pascal defended the theory that no human effort could contribute to salvation, even as a partial cause, and that God's agency is completely efficacious if He chooses freely to assist undeserving sinners.

This controversy about the relative efficacy of God's grace was most evident in the discussion of free will, and in Pascal's account of how we come to know the truth about radically different kinds of reality, the natural and the supernatural.

3. Free Will

How to reconcile the complementary agency of God and of natural causes was a central metaphysical problem for those, in the seventeenth century, who accepted divine intervention in the natural world. One of the solutions offered (for example, by Malebranche and La Forge) was occasionalism, which resulted in part from a recognition of God's omnipotence. Unless God's causality were understood as inadequately efficacious, occasionalists thought it was redundant to require a supplementary causal activity on the part of natural phenomena or human agents in order to cause the effects that are attributed both to them and to God's agency. Pascal's account of free will reflected this dilemma at the heart of human choice. His discussion owes much to that of Augustine (2010), On Free Choice.

Pascal was little concerned about the freedom of human choices that result, for example, in deciding to read one book rather than another, or in analyses of what it means to claim that an agent could have chosen or done otherwise. The comprehensive concupiscence under which human nature struggled, according to Pascal's account of the Fall, implied that what are usually called human ‘choices’ are determined by the dominant desires of each individual. That provided a naturalistic theory of mundane human choices. The less mundane cases, which were the focus of Pascal's interest, include those where someone ‘chooses’ to act morally or otherwise. According to the Jansenist theory of grace, God intervenes in the lives of individuals and makes it possible for them to choose something that otherwise they could not have chosen, namely, to act in a manner that is conducive to salvation. If God's assistance is sufficient to guarantee the efficacy of a human choice, it would seem that the choice of a human agent is determined by God's greater power. On the other hand, if God's grace were inefficacious, it would seem as if He provides inadequate assistance because He relies on natural human powers to exercise free will and thereby to supply what is missing from divine grace. This latter position was rejected by Pascal as heretical and semi-Pelagian.

Pascal's solution was to endorse an interpretation of Augustine's theory of grace, and to re-describe as ‘free’ the choice of a human will that is ‘infallibly’ motivated by God's efficacious grace.

Human beings, by their own nature, always have the power to sin and to resist grace, and since the time of their corruption they always have an unfortunate depth of concupiscence which infinitely increases this power of resistance. Nevertheless, when it pleases God to touch them with his mercy, He makes them do what he wants them to do and in the manner in which he wishes them to act, without this infallibility of God's operation destroying in any way the natural freedom of human beings … That is how God disposes the free will of human beings without imposing any necessity on them, and how free will, which can always resist grace but does not always wish to do so, directs itself both freely and infallibly towards God. (Provincial Letters: I, 800, 801)

The Écrits sur la grâce, which was drafted at about the same time as the Provincial Letters, summarizes the Augustinian position as follows: God predestines some human beings for salvation and saves them by “means that are certain and infallible” (II, 262). There are also others to whom God gave graces “that would have led them to salvation had they used them properly” (I, 262), but He chose not to provide them with the ‘unique grace of perseverance’ without which it is impossible to be saved. By defending the necessity of God's grace and its infallible efficacy, and by assuming that some people resist this divine assistance, Pascal was forced by the logic of his position to endorse a theory of divine predestination. If God were to provide efficacious grace to each person, they could not fail to be saved. Therefore, if some are damned, that must be because God has decided not to rescue them from the Fallen condition into which they have been born as a result of Adam's sin.

It would be easy, philosophically, to accept the limitations of human powers on which this account is based as a theologically inspired account of weakness of the will. However, it is difficult to see in what sense human choice is free when it is determined infallibly by a divinely originated desire that the will of each individual, to whom it is granted, finds irresistible. For Pascal, one's choice of salvation is free in the sense that it expresses one's strongest desire; but the desire itself is communicated only to those who are predestined by God, and is such that the recipient is guaranteed to follow it.

4. Theory of Knowledge

Pascal did not publish an explicit theory of knowledge or philosophy of science in any single text. One can infer from disparate works—such as his essays on the vacuum (written during the late 1640s), De l'esprit géométrique (1655), and the Entretien avec M. de Sacy (published posthumously)—that he had conflicting intuitions about natural knowledge, although they all recognise the special role of religious belief. The Provincial Letters provide a statement of his general overview: “How do we learn the truth about facts? That will be from our eyes … which are the appropriate judges of fact, as reason is of natural and intelligible things, and the faith is of things that are supernatural and revealed” (I, 810). ‘The faith’ is not simply any religious faith; it is the specific kind of belief to which Roman Catholics had access as a gift from God. Apart from faith, which is directed to revealed truths and the supernatural world, Pascal identified ‘experience and reason’ (I, 454) as the only ways of acquiring knowledge of the natural world.

The scientific and theological controversies in which Pascal became involved engaged him in epistemological disputes that were both commonplace and unresolved in the seventeenth century. These included questions about observations or experiments as sources of evidence, the certainty or otherwise of various types of knowledge claim, and the epistemic status of hypotheses that are constructed to explain natural phenomena.

Pascal was sympathetic to the mild, comprehensive pyrrhonism that is found in Montaigne: “Montaigne is incomparable … for disabusing those who cling to their opinions and who believe that they have found unshakeable truths in the sciences” (Entretien: II, 97). Despite this tendency towards scepticism, Pascal frequently expressed confidence in the certainty with which we can know ‘matters of fact.’ For example, he argued in the Provincial Letters that “matters of fact are proved only by the senses” and that they are “easily decided” (I, 812, 723). This was consistent with one of the main lines of argument in the Letters. Pascal's defence of Arnauld hinged on the claim that the five propositions condemned by the Pope as heretical did not occur in the text of Augustinus, and that this fact could be established easily by inspection, i.e. by reading the book. On questions of fact, therefore, even the Pope (who, Pascal accepted, was an authoritative teacher of revealed truths) could be mistaken, and it is inappropriate to appeal to any authority apart from one's senses to decide a factual question: ‘authority is useless in that context’ (Preface to the Traité du vide: I, 452). The same kind of certainty about experimental facts, he thought, should have resolved the dispute about heliocentrisim that led to Galileo's house arrest. “It was in vain” therefore that the Jesuits “obtained from Rome a decree against Galileo … That is not what will prove that the earth does not move; and if one had unchanging observations that proved that the earth revolves, all the men in the world could not stop it moving” (Provincial Letters: I, 813).

Even if facts could be known with certainty by observation, Pascal conceded that it would require the use of reason to understand or explain natural phenomena, and that “the secrets of nature are hidden” (Preface to the Traité du vide: I, 455). To penetrate those secrets, one has to have recourse to hypotheses. Pascal's account of how hypotheses are confirmed, and the degree of certainty that one could claim for them, were ambivalent. When reflecting on the results of the puy-de-Dôme experiment, he argued against critics that not only had he established that the mercury rises in a barometer because of the weight of the air, but that the empty space at the top of a barometric tube is a vacuum. Others (including Descartes) accepted the experimental results, but disputed this interpretation of them. They agreed that mercury is supported in a barometer by the weight of the atmosphere; they also argued, however, that the apparently empty space in a barometric tube contains a subtle matter of some kind, that it has physical properties (for example, a specific size, or the capacity to be penetrated by light, etc.), and that their interpretation of the apparent vacuum was as consistent as Pascal's with the experimental results.

Pascal's analysis of arguments that originate from hypotheses seems to have been borrowed from mathematics. He argued that there are three types of hypothesis. The negation of some hypotheses implies an absurd consequence, and they must therefore be true. The affirmation of others implies an absurdity, and these must be false. In a third category, if no absurd conclusion results from either the affirmation or negation of an hypothesis, one cannot draw any valid conclusion about its truth. Logically, different assumptions may “lead to the same conclusion, for everyone knows that truth is often concluded from falsehood” (Entretien: II, 90). When applied to experimental situations, it meant that one could get apparently confirming results from a poorly executed experiment or one that is based on a mistaken hypothesis. Accordingly, even the phenomenal success of the puy-de-Dôme experiment did not show conclusively that Pascal was correct about the vacuum. On the other hand, Pascal implicitly assumed that a negative experimental result would have disconfirmed the hypothesis that his experiment was designed to test because, by analogy with the claim that ‘absurd’ consequences disconfirm mathematical hypotheses, he failed to realize that scientific experiments test clusters of interconnected hypotheses rather than individual hypotheses. The Duhem-Quine thesis, as it is known today, shows that negative experimental results may be attributed to any of the many hypotheses that are assumed in observations or experiments, and that the certainty to which Pascal aspired cannot be realized even when experimental results are inconsistent with expectations.

This analysis left unresolved the status of scientific hypotheses. Do hypotheses provide genuine knowledge, despite their uncertainty? Or did Pascal anticipate the solution later adopted by Locke and restrict genuine knowledge to two categories: (a) what is perceived, and (b) what is ‘demonstrated’? De l'esprit géométrique adopts a foundationalist perspective on knowledge, in which ‘principles’ are first established and the certainty of other knowledge-claims derives from that of the principles. Such logically interconnected principles and conclusions were called ‘demonstrations’. Thus every demonstration requires that one first identify “the evident principles that it requires. For, if one does not guarantee the foundations, one cannot guarantee the building” (II, 175). One establishes the certainty of propositions if they are “deducible by infallible and necessary logical steps from such axioms or principles, on the certitude of which depends all the certitude of the consequences that are properly deduced from them” (letter to Father Noël: I, 378). This invites the question: does physical science provide demonstrations in this sense? Pascal limited ‘demonstration’ to mathematics and ‘whatever imitates it’ (II, 180). At the same time, he seems to have believed that his own physical investigations were sufficiently similar to mathematics that they amounted to demonstrated knowledge, and that experiments or observations provided their foundational principles.

Accordingly, Pascal's preface to the Traité du vide (1651) claims: “the experiments that provide us with an understanding of nature continually proliferate; and, since they are the only principles of physics, their consequences proliferate accordingly” (I, 455). The certainty of experimental results based on observation, their role as principles of a scientific demonstration, and the facility with which natural philosophers could perform appropriate experiments or make relevant observations, led Pascal to an optimistic interpretation of scientific progress. He claimed that, when researchers work together, they “make continual progress in science in proportion as the world gets older” (I, 456). This apparently bright future for physical sciences contrasted with the scientific failure of earlier natural philosophers, “those timid people who did not dare to discover anything in physics” (Preface to the Traité du vide: I, 454) and is reflected in the comment in the Pensées, Fragment 654: “To what extent have telescopes revealed realities to us that did not exist for earlier philosophers?” (II, 807).

In summary, Pascal adopted an interpretation of natural science that exaggerated both the ease with which the consequences of observations and experiments could be determined, and the simplicity of the logical links between theories or hypotheses and their apparently confirming or disconfirming evidence.

In contrast with all knowledge that is derived from experience and reason, Pascal identified ‘authority’ as the exclusive foundation of religious belief. Authority depends on memory and is purely historical, because the objective is simply to find out what someone said or wrote. This applies ‘especially in theology’ (Preface to the Traité du vide: I, 452), a discipline which Pascal presents as if there could be no dispute about what is revealed in the scriptures or, more fundamentally, about whether a particular writing belongs among the canonical texts. He could not have avoided noticing that there were many religious traditions that claimed to report divine revelations, and that each in turn rested its claims on its own authority as a reliable witness to earlier historical events and their interpretation. This was apparent even with Christianity and, within Catholicism, Pascal was familiar with decisions of church Councils that determined which interpretations of its doctrinal history were acceptable and which were anathemized as heretical. Thus the history of churches was rife with disputes about how to identify the appropriate religious authorities. Since Pascal rejected the validity of rational arguments as a criterion for distinguishing between what was authentic or otherwise in Christian belief, he had to rely ultimately on a personal choice of what to believe about the supernatural, and then to interpret that personal choice as if it were inspired by a special grace from God.

It seems evident that the circularity of Pascal's self-justification could be repeated, with appropriate changes, by equally committed members of other religious traditions.

5. Ethics and Politics

In the discussion of what he described in the Provincial Letters as the ‘perniciously lax’ morality of the Jesuits, Pascal classifies many human actions — such as homicide, in cases where is it not justifiable as self-defence — as obviously immoral, and as widely recognised as such. He characterizes these immoral actions variously as contrary to the ‘natural light’, to ‘common sense’ or the ‘natural law.’ As Ferreyrolles (1984) shows, there are numerous references in Pascal to a ‘law of nature’. However, Pascal does not argue that this natural law can be discovered by reason, or that it acquires its obligatory force from human convention or contracts. The Jansenist interpretation of the human condition implied that human nature is corrupt, and therefore that reason is now an unreliable moral guide. “There are undoubtedly natural laws, but our fine corrupted reason has corrupted everything” (Fragment 56: II, 560). According to this view, God had provided reliable moral guidance to human beings in the prelapsarian state of nature, and some remnants of God's law continue to be reflected in Fallen nature. Natural law, therefore, is what remains of God's law in the state of concupiscence of human nature after the Fall. There is thus no independent, philosophical account of morality available in Pascal, apart from the law of God which is more or less dimly revealed.

According to God's law, or those elements of it which survive in the widely held opinions of human beings all over the world, there are certain actions which are intrinsically evil or good. Our moral duties include not only the more familiar examples, such as the obligation to refrain from voluntary homicide; Pascal also quotes with approval from Cajetan that “we are obliged by justice to give alms from our surplus, to alleviate even the common necessities of the poor … those who are rich are merely stewards of their surplus, in order to give it to whoever they select from among those who are in need” (Letters: I, 714).

Having assumed that there are objective moral obligations, Pascal directs his critique, both in the Provincial Letters and in his contributions to the Écrits des Curés de Paris, to the claim, attributed to Jesuit casuists, that one can change the moral character of actions by changing one's intention at the time of their performance. On this account, if an agent acts immorally while formally intending to act immorally, nothing can excuse the action in question. In all other cases, however, Pascal described Jesuit casuisty as teaching that it is possible to modify the moral character of an action by applying the method of “directing the intention, which consists in selecting something that is permitted as the objective of one's actions” (Letters: I, 649). This escape from moral responsibility relies on the principle that “it is the intention which determines the [moral] quality of an action” (Letters: I, 679).

The claim that one could direct one's intention away from what is otherwise a morally reprehensible action was consistent with the casuists' defence of the doctrine of ‘probabilism’. This doctrine, to which Pascal also objected, meant that one may decide moral issues according to any opinion which is said to be ‘probable’, even if it is much less probable than alternative opinions. ‘Probable’ in this context had little to do with calculations of probability, but was defined as “everything that is approved by well-known authors” (Letters: I, 732). The limits of what was morally acceptable were thus provided by examining the writings of approved authors and finding the least demanding moral opinions available in the literature. Pascal's satirical critique of Jesuit casuistry assumes, in contrast, that human actions have a moral character that is independent of the private thoughts or intentions of the agent who performs them, and that one cannot ameliorate them by ‘intending’ results that differ from the actual effects or consequences that follow naturally from a given action. In that sense, Pascal's critique is an early version of a modern objection to the so-called ‘Principle of Double Effect.’

Pascal's political theory was likewise dictated by his account of human concupiscence. According to Fragment 90 of the Pensées, “concupiscence and force are the sources of all our actions. Concupiscence causes voluntary actions, and force causes those that are involuntary” (II, 570). Although the state of nature before the Fall of Adam was capable of guiding human behaviour, human relations are now completely compromised by concupiscence and by the exercise of power by one person over another. One inevitable effect of this unwelcome subservience is that we are coerced into obeying those who exercise political power over us, and this can be interpreted as punishment for our sinful condition. This pessimistic interpretation of political power and its a possible abuse coincided with that of Luther and Calvin. The Trois Discours sur la condition des grands distinguishes between natural gifts or abilities, which vary from one individual to another and may provide a basis for our esteem, and variations in social status or political power, which result from human contingency and require only that we obey and salute those who happen to be our superiors (II, 194–9). The natural equality of human beings that is implicit in this analysis, however, provides no basis for any theory of justice which would justify opposition to an established civil society or government, no matter how tyrannical it may be (Bove et al., 2007: pp. 295 ff). In fact, there is no independent perspective available to corrupt human beings from which one may query whether the laws of a country are just; they are just, by definition, simply because they are the laws. “Justice is what is established; thus all our established laws will necessarily be accepted as just without being examined, because they are established” (Fragment 545: II, 776). A more extreme expression of the same view, in the Pensées, is that “justice, like finery, is dictated by fashion” (Fragment 57; II, 562).

This political conservatism, which was partly motivated by Pascal's experience of wars and partly by his theory of corrupt human nature, is reflected in his claim that “the worst evil of all is civil war” (Fragment 87: II, 569). In the Provincial Letters, he directs readers to the moral teaching of the Gospels to guide them in political action. “The Church … has always taught her children not to render evil for evil … to obey magistrates and superiors, even those who are unjust, because we must always respect in them the power of God who has set them over us” (I, 744). This compulsory tolerance of the status quo, for the sake of the common good, did not preclude comparative assessments of the merits or otherwise of different political systems. However, even in such assessments, the criterion applied by Pascal remained narrowly and theologically focused on the extent to which political arrangements facilitated citizens in the performance of their primary duties to God.

The appropriate attitude of subjects or citizens to established political authorities that govern them was exemplified, acutely, in the demand by the civil powers in Paris that even conscientiously objecting Jansenists had to sign and obey the formulary which condemned the five propositions allegedly found in Jansen's work. Dissenters like Pascal were not required to assent, in conscience, to what they did not believe; but they were required to assent in their behaviour, and to obey their political and ecclesiastical superiors. Likewise, the subjects of Pascal's polity were not required to esteem their political masters, nor to hold beliefs about them as human beings which they did not believe were true. It was enough that they obey them, that they observe the laws in their behaviour, and that they offer them the public deference that was appropriate to their status as God's representatives, worthy or otherwise, on earth.

6. Pascal and Human Existence

While it would be anachronistic to describe Pascal as an existentialist, one of the most prominent features of his work is the philosophical reflection on the radical contingency of human affairs that emerges especially in the final years of his life. He used these reflections to puncture the pride, arrogance, and self-love of those who thought of themselves as superior to the vicissitudes of human life. Oliver Cromwell provided a contemporary illustration by his fall from power as a result of a relatively trivial illness. “Cromwell would have ravaged the whole of Christendom; the royal family was lost, and his own family was about to become all-powerful, except for a little grain of sand that lodged in his bladder. Even Rome was about to tremble beneath him. Once this little piece of stone became lodged there, he died, his family was disgraced, peace was established all round, and the king was restored” (Fragment 632: II, 799). Many of Pascal's intuitions about the contingency of human existence were a commonplace in the period, especially among Calvinist theologians (Rivet, 1651). They were inspired in part by a growing acceptance within cosmology of the infinite extent of the universe and, in contrast, the relative brevity of human lives. They owed even more to a theological perspective that claimed to represent human affairs from God's perspective, including the absolute will by which He predestines individuals for salvation or eternal perdition. Pascal's distinctive contribution was to capture some of these insights in the elegant, pithy phrases that characterized the poetic style of the Pensées. Fragment 104, for example, compares a human life to a ‘thinking reed.’ “It is not in space that I should search for my dignity, but in the control of my thoughts … The universe comprehends me by space and engulfs me like a point; by means of thought, I comprehend it” (II, 574).

One could question the validity of considering the value of finite beings from the naturalistic perspective of an infinite universe, or even the conceivability of a divine perspective that, even according to Pascal, is not naturally accessible to finite minds. Given his extremely poor health and the expressions of abandonment that emerge from his later writings, one cannot avoid considering whether Pascal's choice of ‘wretchedness’ (la misère) as a sub-title for one group of ‘thoughts’ reflected his personal experiences. “The greatness of human beings consists in their ability to know their wretchedness” (Fragment 105: II, 574). Pascal's rejection of any naturalistic explanation of the human mind or soul, his emphasis on dread of an unknown future (because, according to his theology, we do not know whether we are saved or damned), the apparent insignificance of human existence, and the experience of being dominated by political and natural forces that far exceed our limited powers, strike a chord of recognition with some of the existentialist writings that emerged in Europe following the Second World War. This was philosophy in a different register. For that reason, some commentators reject the suggestion that Pascal was not a philosopher (Brun, 1992; Hunter, 2013). Rather than speculate about matters that transcend the limited capacity of the human intellect, Pascal invites his readers to recognize the description of his personal experiences as resonating with their own. While emphasizing the natural insignificance of individual human lives, he did not conclude that human existence was absurd. He pointed instead, as Christian existentialists have done since, to a source of meaning that would transcend the limitations of our thought. Access, however, was strictly limited to those to whom God freely gave the gift of religious faith, without any merit on the part of the recipient.


Pascal's Works

  • Oeuvres complètes, L. Lafuma (ed.), Paris: Éditions du Seuil, 1963.
  • Oeuvres complètes, J. Mesnard (ed.), 4 out of 7 projected volumes published to date, Paris: Desclée de Brouwer, 1964–92.
  • Oeuvres complètes, M. Le Guern (ed.), 2 vols., Paris: Gallimard, 1998–2000.
  • The Physical Treatises of Pascal, I. H. B. and A. G. H. Spiers (trans.), New York: Octagon Books, 1973.
  • Pensées, P. Sellier (ed.), Paris: Bords, 1991.
  • The Provincial Letters, A. J. Krailsheimer (trans.), Harmondsworth, UK: Penguin, 1967.
  • Pensées and other writings, H. Levi (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.

Related Early Works

  • Arnauld, A., 1703. De la fréquente communion, ou les sentimens des Peres, des papes, et des Conciles, touchant l'usage des Sacrements de Penitence & d'Eucharistie sont fidellement exposez. Lyon: Plaignard. (1st edn. 1644).
  • Arnauld, A. and P. Nicole, 1662. La Logique ou l'art de penser, 2nd edn., P. Clair and F. Girbal (eds.), Paris: Vrin, 1993. Logic or the Art of Thinking, J. Buroker, (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Augustine, On the Free Choice of the Will, On Grace and Free Choice, and Other Writings, P. King (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • Jansenius, C., 1640. Augustinus, Louvain.
  • Jansenius, C., 1642. Discours de la réformation de l'homme intérieur, Paris: Éditions Manucius, 2004.
  • La Forge, Louis de, 1666. Traitté de l'esprit de l'homme, Paris: T. Girard. Treatise on the Human Mind, D. Clarke (trans.), Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1997.
  • Rivet, André, 1651. Les dernieres heures de Monsieur Rivet vivant, Ministere de la Parole de Dieu, Delf: Woodward.

Recommended Secondary Literature

  • Baird, A. W. S., 1975. Studies in Pascal's Ethics, The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Bove, L., Bras, G. and Méchoulan (eds.), 2007. Pascal et Spinoza, Paris: Éditions Amsterdam.
  • Brun, Jean, 1992. La philosophie de Pascal, Paris: Presses universitaires de France.
  • Carraud, V., 1992. Pascal et la philosophie, Paris: Presses universitaires de France.
  • Cléro, J-P., 1999. Les Pascals à Rouen 1640–48, Rouen: l'Université de Rouen.
  • Clarke, Desmond M., 2011. “The Epistemology of Religious Belief,” in D. M. Clarke and C. Wilson (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy in Early Modern Europe, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 548–70.
  • Cole, J. R., 1995. Pascal: The Man and his Two Loves, New York and London: New York University Press.
  • Davidson, H. and P. H. Dubé (eds.), 1975. A Concordance to Pascal's Pensées, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Edwards, A. W. F., 1987/2002. Pascal's Arithmetical Triangle, London: Griffin; Oxford: Oxford University Press; Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Ferreyrolles, G., 1984. Pascal et la raison du politique, Paris: Presses universitaires de France.
  • Hacking, I., 1975. The Emergence of Probability, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hammond, N. (ed.), 2003. The Cambridge Companion to Pascal, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hunter, Graeme, 2013. Pascal the Philosopher: An Introduction, Toronto and London: University of Toronto Press.
  • Kremer, E. J. (ed.), 1994. The Great Arnauld and Some of his Philosophical Correspondents, Toronto and London: University of Toronto Press.
  • Le Guern, M., 2003. Pascal et Arnauld, Paris: Champion.
  • Maire, A. (ed.), 1925–27. Bibliographie générale des oeuvres de Blaise Pascal, 5 vols., Paris: H. Leclerc.
  • Moriarty, Michael, 2006. Fallen Nature, Fallen Selves: Early Modern French Thought II, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sellier, P., 1970. Pascal et Saint Augustin, Paris: Armand Colin.

Other Internet Resources

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