Antoine Arnauld

First published Sat Jan 27, 2007; substantive revision Mon Apr 24, 2017

Antoine Arnauld (1612–1694) was a powerful figure in the intellectual life of seventeenth-century Europe. He had a long and highly controversial career as a theologian, and was an able and influential philosopher. His writings were published and widely read over a period of more than fifty years and were assembled in 1775–1782 in forty-two large folio volumes.

Evaluations of Arnauld’s work as a theologian vary. Ian Hacking, for example, says that Arnauld was “perhaps the most brilliant theologian of his time” (Hacking 1975a, 25). Ronald Knox, on the other hand, says, “It was the fashion among the Jansenists to represent Antoine Arnauld as a great theologian; he should be remembered, rather as a great controversialist… A theologian by trade, Arnauld was a barrister by instinct” (Knox 1950, 196). It is agreed on all sides, however, that Arnauld was acute and learned in theology as well as in philosophy.

Arnauld was an important participant in the philosophical debates of his century, and carried out famous intellectual exchanges with Descartes, Malebranche, and Leibniz. In addition, the Port-Royal Logic, l’Art de penser, which he co-authored with Pierre Nicole, was a standard text in the field for two centuries. Less attention has been paid to Arnauld’s lifelong efforts to reconcile the doctrine of grâce efficace par elle-même with freedom of will, though they have many connections with the debate about determinism and free will that continues to this day.

1. Life and Works

Antoine Arnauld was born in Paris on February 6, 1612, the twentieth and last child of an important French family. He is often referred to in the French literature as Le Grand Arnauld. Another famous member of the family was his sister, Mère Angélique Arnauld. Installed by her wealthy and powerful father as abbess of the convent of Port-Royal in 1602 at the age of eleven, she later reformed the convent and it became a center of intense religious life. Several of Arnauld’s sisters were nuns at Port-Royal, where his mother joined them after the death of his father in 1621.

The young Antoine attended the Collège de Calvi-Sorbonne, where one of his fellow students was his nephew, Isaac Lemaître de Sacy. Arnauld went on to study philosophy at the Collège de Lisieux, and then decided to follow in his father’s steps as a lawyer. However, under the influence of his mother and her confessor, Jean Duvergier, the abbé de Saint-Cyran¸ he changed his mind and began studies in theology in 1633.

About 1640, he joined a small group of solitaires who lived in the countryside near Port-Royal and were associated with the convent. They included Pierre Nicole, Claude Launcelot, and Sacy. The solitaires initiated the petites écoles de Port-Royal which continued in various locations from the late 1630s until 1660. Their students included the dramatist Jean Racine. Later on, Arnauld cooperated with Sacy in the first important French translation of the Bible.[1] He also co-authored the Grammaire générale et raisonnée with Lancelot and La Logique ou l’Art de penser (hereinafter Logic), with Nicole. All of these collaborative projects had their origins in the petites écoles. Blaise Pascal was closely associated with the solitaires beginning in 1655.

The year 1641 was an eventful one for Arnauld. He was ordained a priest on September 21. During the year, he completed the “Fourth Objections” to Descartes’ Meditations and wrote De la Fréquente communion (published in 1643). The first work established his reputation as a philosopher. The second went through many editions and had an effect on Catholic sacramental practice up to the end of the nineteenth century. Jansen’s Augustinus was also published in Paris in 1641, having been published posthumously in the Netherlands a year earlier. It was attacked by the official theologian of Paris, Isaac Habert, who preached a series of sermons against Jansen in the cathedral of Paris during Lent, 1643. Arnauld, who had arrived at an interpretation of Augustine similar to, though not identical with, that of Jansen, undertook, at the request of Saint-Cyran, to defend Jansen against the accusation of heresy. This he did in his Première Apologie pour Jansénius, 1644, and Seconde Apologie, 1645. Although Arnauld did not agree with important details of Jansen’s view, he continued to defend Jansen against the charge of heresy off and on for the rest of his life.

In 1653 the famous five propositions attributed to Jansen were declared to be heretical by Pope Innocent X in the Constitution “Cum Occasione.” Arnauld and most of the Port-Royal group claimed that the five propositions, although heretical on their most likely interpretation, were not in fact in Jansen’s work. The dispute led to Arnauld’s expulsion from the Sorbonne after a celebrated trial, which lasted from December 1, 1655 to January 30, 1656. Pascal came to Arnauld’s defense with the Provincial Letters, published in installments from January 23, 1656 to May, 1657. The dispute lasted until 1669, when the French bishops who supported Arnauld worked out a compromise with Pope Clement IX, and Arnauld enjoyed almost a decade in the good graces of both the court and the Pope. During this time, Arnauld wrote voluminously on the Eucharist, but he also found time to co-author the Port-Royal Grammar and Logic, and to write his Nouveaux éléments de géométrie. However, in the late 1670s, the attacks on Port-Royal by civil and religious authorities resumed, and in 1679 Arnauld fled to the Netherlands, where he remained until his death, in Liège, on August 8, 1694.

The last fifteen years of Arnauld’s life, spent in self-imposed exile, were among his most fruitful in philosophy. During this period, he carried on his debates with Malebranche and Leibniz, and also reexamined his position on human free will. Arnauld’s published criticism of Malebranche began in 1683 with On True and False Ideas (hereinafter Ideas). But the central topic of the exchange was Malebranche’s use of occasionalism to explain how it is that not all human beings are saved. Arnauld provided a systematic criticism of that position in the three volumes of Réflexions philosophiques et théologiques sur le nouveau système de la nature et de la grâce (hereinafter Réflexions), published in 1685 and 1686. Arnauld’s famous correspondence with Leibniz was initiated by Leibniz in 1686, when he sent Arnauld the section headings of his projected Discourse on Metaphysics.

2. Arnauld on the Distinction between Philosophy and Theology

Arnauld considered it important to be clear about the distinction between philosophy and theology. This concern is present in his work from the beginning, in 1641, to the end of his published writings. Thus, he divides the “Fourth Objections” to Descartes’ Meditations into “the possible philosophical objections regarding the major issues of the nature of our mind and of God” and “the problems which a theologian might come up against in the work as a whole” (Descartes, 2:169). One of Arnauld’s criticisms of Malebranche is that he does not establish many of the principles in his system of nature and grace either by the proper methods of philosophy or of theology. Again, in Règles du bon sens, written the year before his death, Arnauld warns, “Be very careful about the nature of the question in dispute, whether it is philosophical or theological. For if it is theological, it must be decided principally by authority, whereas if it is philosophical, it must be decided principally by reason.”[2]

According to Arnauld, the chief purpose of theology is to defend the truths revealed by God through Sacred Scripture and the teaching tradition of the Church. Part of the ceremony in which he received the doctorate in theology from the Sorbonne was a vow, made before the altar of the Holy Martyrs, “that we will give our life before leaving the truth undefended.” In the speech he gave on that occasion, Arnauld emphasized the vow, which he said was instituted because “the obligation to defend the truth with force and courage is so indispensable in a theologian that those whose courage in this regard could weaken, should be committed to it by the holiness and piety of a solemn public vow” (Traduction du Discours latin prononcé par M. Arnauld en recevant le Bonnet de Docteur, OA, 43:12). This intense religious commitment to his role as a theologian continued throughout his life. Combined with his combative personality, it helps to explain the passion with which he defended individual theologians, especially Saint-Cyran and Jansen, as well as what he took to be the truths of revelation.

Regarding philosophy, Arnauld, like Descartes, held that its purpose was to acquire useful knowledge through reason. That reason ought to be employed only in the pursuit of useful knowledge is emphasized in the opening pages of the Logic. Arnauld and Nicole say that “speculative sciences, such as geometry, astronomy, and physics” can be used as instruments for perfecting judgment and reason. This provides a use for some of the “nooks and crannies” of those sciences, which would otherwise be “completely worthless.” They go on to say, “People are not born to spend their time measuring lines, examining the relations between angles, or contemplating different motions of matter. The mind is too large, life too short, time too precious to occupy oneself with such trivial objects. But they are obligated to be just, fair, and judicious in all their speech, their actions, and the business the conduct. Above all they ought to train and educate themselves for this” (Logic, 5). Arnauld did not think, however, that philosophical sciences are useful only as instruments for acquiring virtues. Natural philosophy or physics can be made to serve the good of human life in many ways and even metaphysics is useful in that it can help the theologian in the task of defending the truth.

An outstanding example of that sort of usefulness, in Arnauld’s view, was Descartes’ argument for the distinction of the soul or mind from the body. Arnauld refers to Descartes as a “Christian philosopher,” echoing Descartes’ own use of the phrase in the letter dedicating the Meditations on First Philosophy to the Faculty of Theology of the Sorbonne, where Descartes says that he carried out the injunction of the Fourth Lateran Council (1513–17) that “Christian philosophers” should try to prove the immateriality of the soul (Descartes, 2:4).

The authorities most often cited by Arnauld are Augustine and Aquinas in theology, and Augustine, Aquinas, and Descartes in philosophy. Arnauld’s attitude toward these predecessors is complex. From the outset of his published work in philosophy, he claimed that Augustinian themes were present in Descartes. However, in his late work, beginning with On True and False Ideas in 1683, he began to cite Aquinas frequently, as well as Augustine, both in philosophy and theology. Thus, in the 181 folio pages of Ideas, which Arnauld describes as dealing with a purely philosophical topic, he cites Augustine twenty times and Aquinas six times, always claiming that they agree with Descartes and with his own position. Similarly, in the theological part of Réflexions, Arnauld relies heavily on Aquinas’s Christology while arguing that Malebranche’s theodicy leads him into heterodox, if not downright heretical, positions (OA 39:777). Again, in his late work on the problem of human free will and grâce efficace par elle-même, Arnauld took over what he says is the Thomistic position that the will is free when it is a potestas ou facultas ad opposita. And in the controversy with Nicole and others over Nicole’s theory of a grâce générale, Arnauld relied heavily on Aquinas’s account of cognition. So frequently did Arnauld rely on Thomistic formulations in his late work that his friends reproached him for “abandoning Augustine in order to follow Aquinas, thus preferring the disciple to the master” (Règles du bon sens, OA, 10:154). This reproach had to do directly with Arnauld’s rejection of the “Platonism” in Augustine and Jansen. But as shown below, Arnauld, late in his career, also parted company with Augustine and Jansen on the nature of human free will, and with Jansen’s account of the nature of actual grace.

Arnauld had a scholarly knowledge of the history of philosophy and theology, and was certainly aware of the important differences among Augustine, Aquinas, and Descartes on such issues as the role of sense perception in human knowledge, the relation of the mind to the body, and the nature of human freedom. But Arnauld wanted to emphasize the continuity of Descartes with the Christian past. Arnauld feared that Descartes’ philosophy would be made into a weapon against the Christian tradition. Emphasizing those elements in Descartes’ philosophy that are in continuity with Augustine and Aquinas was part of Arnauld’s effort to make of Cartesianism an ally, rather than an enemy, of the faith.

3. Arnauld’s Cartesianism

Unlike Saint-Cyran, Jansen, and most of the Port-royalists, Arnauld had a positive appreciation of philosophy, and a lively interest in the subject (See Nadler 1989, 18 ff.). His philosophy is typically, and correctly, classified as Cartesian. Indeed, Leibniz said, in 1691, that Arnauld had been “in all ways for Descartes for a long time.”[3] Arnauld enthusiastically endorsed Descartes’ physics and the approach to mind-body dualism to which it gave rise. He also adopted some parts of Descartes’ views on philosophical method.

Arnauld’s Descartes, however, is unlike the Descartes who is seen as the father of the enlightenment and who anticipated many of the preoccupations of recent analytical philosophy. Arnauld claims to set forth the gist of Descartes’ philosophy, but he did not hesitate to replace parts of Descartes’ philosophy with different though related propositions, especially when doing so made Descartes a more reliable ally in what Arnauld took to be his primary task, to defend the truths of the faith.

3.1 Philosophical method

In the Fourth Part of the Logic, “On Method,” Arnauld and Nicole present an account of the distinction between analysis and synthesis that they say is taken from a manuscript of Descartes lent to them by Clerselier. What they present is a free translation of Rule Thirteen of the Rules for the Direction of the Mind. They then paraphrase the four rules given by Descartes in Part Two of the Discourse on the Method, saying that although the rules are “often difficult to follow,” yet “it is always helpful to bear them in mind, and to heed them as much as possible whenever we try to find the truth by means of reason” (Logic, 234–39). But Arnauld developed the Cartesian position on philosophical method in a distinctive way. In particular, he reshaped the notion of an idea, of a confused idea, of a clear and distinct idea, and of methodic doubt.

An idea, according to Arnauld, is the same thing as a perception (in the broad sense of the term characteristic of seventeenth-century philosophy), and every perception has an object distinct from the perception itself. Every idea, i.e., every perception, is, in addition, a consciousness of itself. But this “implicit reflexion” makes present to the mind a perception that is, in the first place, of an object distinct from itself. As Arnauld puts it, “I know myself in knowing other things” (Ideas, 6). It is obviously true, he says, that we can know objects only through the mediation of our perceptions, i.e., our ideas, of them: “But if, by not knowing them immediately, is meant being able to know them only by representative beings distinct from perceptions, I hold that in this sense we can know material things, as well as God and our soul, not only mediately but also immediately, i.e., that we can know them without there being any intermediary between our perceptions and the object” (Ideas, 31).

Arnauld says that the object of any perception has objective being in the perception. Furthermore, the object has objective being in the perception as having properties. If an object exists objectively in a given perception as having a given property, then Arnauld says that the perception represents the object as having that property, that is, makes the object known to the mind as having that property.[4] Furthermore, an idea (or perception) can represent its object to the perceiving mind as having this or that property contingently or necessarily. Arnauld cites the dictum, “it is in the idea of each thing that we see its properties,” and takes it to refer to an explicit reflection upon an idea that represents its object as having certain properties necessarily.

Arnauld argues at length that this theory of ideas was also held by Descartes (Ideas, 26ff.). This claim has puzzled philosophers from Thomas Reid to the present. (Reid 1785, 169.) A good example of the more common interpretation of Descartes’ theory is provided by Ian Hacking, who also attributes the theory, as he understands it, to the Port-Royal Logic. Hacking begins with the first sentence of the First Part of the Logic: “We have no knowledge of what is outside us except by the mediation of the ideas within us,” and continues, “The Cartesian ego has set the stage. The ego able to contemplate what is within it ponders what lies outside …There are some objects that we can contemplate without being logically committed to the existence of anything other than the ego. These objects are ideas.” Borrowing an example from Elizabeth Anscombe’s comment on Berkeley, Hacking says that in the Cartesian (and Port-royalist) theory, “Ideas [in the mind] are paradigm ‘objects’ and coins [in a man’s pocket] are not” (Hacking 1975b, 28–30). But the sentence that Hacking quotes from the First Part of the Logic does not demand the interpretation he gives it. It is consistent with the position Arnauld develops in Ideas (published in the same year as the fifth and last edition of the Logic), according to which ideas are primarily perceptions of external objects distinct from the perceiver, coins in a man’s pocket; and only secondarily objects of reflexive perception. Arnauld makes a good case for the claim that this position was also held by Descartes, but the claim is not universally accepted.

Arnauld’s account of clarity and distinctness, obscurity and confusion of ideas can be found in the First Part, Chapter 9, of the Logic. The discussion proceeds by way of examples, rather than general definitions, but it can be summarized as follows: The basic properties of ideas are clarity and confusion. Clarity of ideas is the same as vividness, and this is a matter of degree; the opposite of clarity is obscurity. Confusion of ideas results when a number of ideas are connected by false judgments, and confusion produces obscurity. Opposite to confusedness of ideas is distinctness. Arnauld and Nicole apply these distinctions to the idea of pain: “We can say that all ideas are distinct insofar as they are clear, and that their obscurity derives only from their confusion, just as in pain the simple sensation which strikes us is clear and also distinct. But what is confused, namely that the sensation is in the hand, is by no means clear in us” (Logic, 48). Again, Arnauld and Nicole speak of “the obscure and confused ideas we have of sensible qualities, the soul adding its false judgments to what nature causes us to know” (Logic, 49–50). The simple idea of pain, for example, is a clear and distinct idea of a sensory state in the mind, and the idea of the pain in the hand is a compound and confused idea of something in the hand that exactly resembles pain. Being confused, the idea is also obscure, because what it is in the hand that exactly resembles pain is “by no means clear to us.”

These comments on the idea of pain are part of a larger position on “ideas of sensation.” In a famous passage in the “Fourth Objections,” Arnauld objected to Descartes’ statement, “If cold is merely the absence of heat, the idea of cold which represents it to me as a positive thing will be materially false” (Descartes, 2:145). As part of his reply, Descartes says, “If cold is simply an absence, the idea of cold is not coldness itself as it exists objectively in the intellect, but something else, which I erroneously mistake for this absence, namely a sensation which in fact has no existence outside the intellect” (Descartes, 2:163). Arnauld developed a general account of sensory ideas that builds on this part of Descartes’ reply. He sets out his account clearly in Ideas: Sensory ideas, like the idea of pain and the idea of cold, are perceptions of mental states. Taken apart from the judgments in which we falsely identify these mental states with states of material things, sensory ideas are clear and distinct. They become confused, and hence obscure, only as a result of the precipitous, false judgments of childhood. Arnauld quotes Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy, Part I, #68 in support of his account: “We know pain, color and the other sensations clearly and distinctly when we consider them simply as thoughts, but when we would judge that color, pain, etc., are things which subsist outside our thought, we do not conceive in any way what that color, that pain, etc., is” (Quoted by Arnauld in Ideas, 132).

Arnauld’s theory of clear and confused ideas implies that ideas, as they are given to us by nature, and thus by God, are clear and distinct, and therefore cannot be deceptive, or “materially false.” Any deceptiveness in our ideas derives from their confusedness and is the result of our misuse of freedom. It is not God who confuses us, but we who confuse ourselves.

Arnauld also gave a distinctive interpretation of Descartes’ method of doubt. In the “Fourth Objections,” Arnauld offers, as the first of “the problems which a theologian might come up against in the work as a whole,” the following: “I am afraid that the author’s somewhat free style of philosophizing, which calls everything into doubt, may cause offence to some people” (Descartes, 2:151). Arnauld recommends that the First Meditation be “furnished with a brief preface which explains that there is no serious doubt cast on these matters but that the purpose is to isolate temporarily those matters which leave room for even the ‘slightest’ and most ‘exaggerated’ doubt,” and that the clause “since I did not know the author of my being” be replaced by “since I was pretending that I did not know the author of my being.”

Arnauld was asking Descartes to make clear that his method did not involve real doubt, but only a consideration of what would happen if one were to doubt. Consider this passage from the Port-Royal Logic: “If there were people able to doubt that they were not sleeping or were not mad, or who could even believe that the existence of everything external is uncertain … at least no one could doubt, as St. Augustine says, that one exists, that one is thinking, or that they are alive… From this clear, certain, and indubitable knowledge one can form a rule for accepting as true all thoughts found to be as clear as this one appears to be” (Logic, p. 228).[5] This is as close as Arnauld comes to using methodic doubt, but it does not imply that one can really doubt the existence of an external world, much less that one ought to do so, even once in one’s lifetime.

It is not clear to what extent Descartes would have agreed with that interpretation of methodic doubt. He did not adopt the first of Arnauld’s two suggested revisions. Perhaps he thought that the point was covered in the “Synopsis” of the Meditations. But he did adopt Arnauld’s second recommendation by adding some words in parentheses in the Sixth Meditation, thus: “The second reason for doubt was that since I did not know the author of my being (or at least was pretending not to), I saw nothing to rule out the possibility that my natural constitution made me prone to error even in matters which seemed to me most true” (Descartes, 2:53). On the other hand, Descartes begins the Principles of Philosophy with the remark, “It seems that the only way of freeing ourselves from these [prejudices of childhood] is to make the effort, once in the course of our life, to doubt everything which we find to contain even the smallest suspicion of error” (Descartes, 1:193). Here Descartes advocates an effort to develop a real doubt on a wide scale, the sort of advocacy that had aroused Arnauld’s theological concern in the “Fourth Objections.”[6]

In sum, Arnauld adopted the Cartesian method that seeks to develop clear and distinct ideas and to limit assent to what is represented by them. But he gave his own distinctive interpretation of the key concepts in the method, and eliminated from it anything that he saw as being theologically dangerous.

3.2 Mind-body dualism

If there is one part of Descartes’ philosophy that met with Arnauld’s enthusiastic approval, it is Descartes’ mind-body dualism. Yet even here Arnauld’s version of the Cartesian philosophy departed in important ways from Descartes’ own views. Arnauld’s departure did not have to do with the distinction between mind and body; here he largely contents himself with endorsing what Descartes says.[7] It had to do rather with the union of the mind and body in a human being. Arnauld rejected a claim at the core of Descartes’ position, namely, that the union of a person’s mind and body makes it possible for the mind and the body to exercise real causal action on one another. Arnauld explicitly says that a person’s body cannot act causally on his mind, and had at least some difficulty with the notion that a person’s mind can act causally on his body.

In 1680 Arnauld wrote an extended defense of the “the philosophy of Descartes” regarding “the essence of body and the union of the soul with the body,” against an attack by Fr. Etienne Le Moine.[8] Throughout this work, Arnauld quotes Malebranche as representative of the Cartesian position, and what he defends under the heading, “the philosophy of Descartes,” is actually a modified version of Malebranche.[9] According to the Cartesian philosophy, says Arnauld, “All the union (alliance) of the mind and the body which is known to us consists in a natural and mutual correspondence of thoughts in the soul with traces in the brain and of emotions in the soul with movements of the [animal] spirits.” “It is not denied,” he adds, “that there may be something unknown to us in the union God has brought about between our soul and our body”; what we do know, however, suffices to show that the mind is not related to the body as a pilot to his ship, but rather that the two are united in “a greater and more intimate union” by which they form a single whole (Examen, OA, 38:141).

Arnauld next takes up a criticism raised by Le Moine against the Cartesian account of sense perception, and this leads to the question, “whether it is the bodily movements [in the eye] that cause the perceptions in the soul; or whether they are only the occasion on which the soul forms [the perceptions] in itself; or whether God gives [the perceptions] to [the soul]” (Examen, OA, 38:146). Arnauld says that it is “easy” to eliminate the first alternative: “For since the motion of a body can at best have no other effect than to move another body (I say at best because it may have not even that), who does not see that it can have no effect on a spiritual soul?” He adds that St. Augustine considered it beyond doubt that a body can have an effect only on our body, and not on our soul. Arnauld rules out the second of his three alternatives on the grounds that the soul cannot form sensible perceptions in itself on the occasion of particular motions in the bodily sensory apparatus because the soul is not aware of those motions. This leaves Arnauld with the third alternative, which he accepts, adding that God voluntarily undertakes to cause in our soul perceptions of sensible qualities whenever the corresponding motions occur in the sensory organs “according to the laws He himself has established in nature” (Examen, OA, 38:148). He summarizes this conclusion by saying that our body does not act on our soul as a “physical cause (cause physique)” but only as a “moral cause (cause morale)” (Examen, OA, 38:150).

Arnauld had a quite different position regarding the causation of voluntary movements in the body. He held that, in general, it is possible for immaterial, thinking beings to act causally on material things, and that, in fact, God has on occasion given angels the power to do so. He also held that the mind of Adam and of Eve had the power to bring about voluntary motions in their bodies before the Fall, and that the minds of the blessed in heaven will enjoy that power. He suggests that the voluntary bodily motions of human beings in this life here below are not caused by the person’s volitions. His reason for this negative position is that post-lapsarian human beings do not know how to bring about the movements of the animal spirits that cause the motions of their muscles and limbs. Thus he says, “If one can say [that God has not given our soul a real power to determine the course of the animal spirits toward the muscles of the parts of our body that we want to move], it is not [on the grounds of a general occasionalism like Malebranche’s]… It is only because our soul does not know what must be done in order to move our arm by means of the animal spirits” (My italics; Dissertation sur les Miracles de l’ancienne loi, OA, 38:690). Steven Nadler cites this text while arguing that Arnauld was an “occasionalist” both about the causation of sensory perceptions by bodies, and about the causation of voluntary movements by the human mind (Nadler 1995, 138). Nadler recognizes that Arnauld had quite different attitudes toward the two cases, but nevertheless says that Arnauld “alone among Cartesians” recognized mind-body interaction as a specific problem in Descartes’ metaphysics, and “used an occasionalist solution” (Nadler 1995, 144).

Arnauld’s treatment of the union of mind and body shows that he was not a docile follower of Descartes, and indeed was prepared to develop “the philosophy of Descartes” in ways that Descartes would probably not have accepted. It also shows that Arnauld was prepared to modify Descartes’ philosophy in a way that increased its similarity to Augustine. It is well known that Arnauld pointed out similarities between Augustine and Descartes from the beginning of his published work, in the “Fourth Objections.” In the present case, however, Arnauld changes the philosophy of Descartes in a way that increases its similarity to Augustine. Arnauld did not mention Aquinas, though he could have done so, as another authority who held that a material thing cannot produce an immaterial effect. It was only a few years later, in On True and False Ideas, that Arnauld began to claim an affinity between the views of Descartes and those of Aquinas. But in his development of the Cartesian position on the union of mind and body, one can already see Arnauld attempting to make of Descartes a Christian philosopher standing in continuity with his great patristic and scholastic predecessors. This attempt on Arnauld’s part is explored in the journal Dix-Septieme Sciecle, 2013/2 no. 259.

3.3 The Creation of the Eternal Truths

There is a continuing discussion of Arnauld’s attitude toward the view which Descartes expressed in answer to Mersenne’s question “by what kind of causality God established the eternal truths.” Descartes replied, “by the same kind of causality as he created all things, that is to say, as their efficient and total cause” (Descartes, p. 25).[10] The debate has been greatly influenced by Jean-Luc Marion’s interpretation, in La théologie blanche de Descartes, according to which Descartes’ position on the matter is fundamental to his metaphysics. Consequently, to the extent that Arnauld, in his mature writings, adopted Descartes’ metaphysics, it has seemed reasonable to say that Arnauld agreed with Descartes about “the creation of the eternal truths.” Various attempts have been made to to explain why Arnauld never made his posiiton explicit. The discussion is complicated by the difficulty of interpreting Descartes’ own view.

4. Arnauld and Malebranche

Nicolas Malebranche was born in 1638, when Arnauld was twenty-six years old. In 1660, Malebranche joined the Oratory, a center for priests in Paris that had many connections with Port-Royal. Malebranche and Arnauld were on friendly terms in the early 1670s, but late in the decade they had a falling out over Malebranche’s explanation of the fact that not all men are saved, and related matters.[11] In 1680, Malebranche published his position, against Arnauld’s advice, in the Treatise of Nature and Grace (hereinafter TNG). The ensuing public controversy between the two was a central event in the intellectual life of Europe in the late seventeenth century.

Arnauld’s attack on TNG began in a surprising way, with the publication of On True and False Ideas in 1683. In it, Arnauld presents his own position on the nature of ideas, which was described above, and argues that Malebranche’s view that we see all things (or at least all bodily things) in God and by means of God’s ideas is not only mistaken, but thoroughly confused and wrong-headed. This work engendered a preliminary debate that lasted for two years. The publication of Réflexions in 1685–86, preceded in 1685 by the publication of Arnauld’s Dissertation sur les miracles de l’ancien loi, provoked further exchanges between the two in 1687, with a last gasp on Arnauld’s part in 1694, the year of his death, and on Malebranche’s part ten years later, in 1704.[12]

4.1 Malebranche’s position in the Treatise of Nature and Grace

TNG provides a general account of God’s reasons for creating a world with the evils that the world contains. But Malebranche is mainly interested in one particular evil, namely, that not all men are saved. That not all men are saved he took to be a datum of revelation, plainly expressed in the Scriptures. But he denied that it follows that God does not want all men to be saved. Indeed, he says his motive in writing TNG was to refute those who concluded that God did not have a “sincere will” to save all men:

If there were not in this century people determined to hold that God does not have a sincere will to save all men, it would not be necessary to establish principles suitable for destroying that unhappy opinion. But the need to combat errors brings to light principles suitable to that end. I protest before God that that was the principal motive that made me write.[13]

If God wants to save all men, something must prevent Him from doing what He wants to do. In the “Troisième Eclaircissement” to TNG, Malebranche says that since God is omnipotent, He can bring about whatever He wants to bring about. But because His will is “the love He bears for His own attributes,” He cannot, by a “practical” will,[14] will anything or will in any way that is not wise: “The wisdom of God renders Him impotent in this sense that it does not permit him to will certain things, or to act in certain ways” (OM, 5:180). What prevents God from carrying out His will to save all men, Malebranche concludes, must be that doing so would require ways or manners of willing that are unwise. As he puts it a few pages later, God’s wisdom “holds His volitions in check, in the sense that not all of His volitions are practical volitions” (OM, 5:184).

Malebranche argues that God’s wisdom restrains Him from sanctifying and saving all men because it directs Him not only to create a world that is good, but also to create “in a way worthy of Him, by ways (par des voyes) that are simple, general, constant, and uniform” (OM, 5:49). More precisely, God’s wisdom directs Him to an act of creating that best combines goodness or perfection of the created world with simplicity of ways of creating. An analogy may help explain Malebranche’s position. Suppose that someone sets out to buy a car and wants to do the best possible job of car-buying. Suppose further that the second-best car is available at a much better price than the best car. In this case, doing the best job of car-buying might require buying less than the best car. In a somewhat similar way, Malebranche holds that the best job of creating, the one most worthy of God, involves creating a world less perfect than He might have made it, in particular, a world in which not all human beings are saved.

Malebranche’s notion of the simplicity of God’s ways of creating depends on his occasionalism. According to that theory of efficient causality, God is the only true efficient cause. When creatures appear to be efficient causes, they are really only occasional causes. That is, the events in which the apparent created causes take part are followed by other events in accordance with laws of nature, which are God’s general volitions. But the created “causes” do not really cause the events that follow. These events, like every created reality, are really caused by God.[15] For Malebranche, the simplicity of God’s ways depends on there being a small number of laws of nature, and on there being few exceptions to the laws. Malebranche maintains that in order to do the job of creating that best combines goodness of the world created with simplicity of ways of creating, God had to make a world with precisely the natural evils (misshapen animals, human suffering, ugly landscapes, etc.) that that are present in the world as it is.

The anomalies in the order of grace are explained in a similar way. Malebranche divides grace, the divine assistance given to human beings, into two kinds, which he calls “grace of light (lumière)” and “grace of feeling (sentiment)” (OM, 5:96–97; 131). The former is, quite simply, knowledge. Malebranche also calls it “the grace of the Creator,” because it is given, in different forms, both to Adam and Eve and to human beings after their Fall. Grace of feeling is “the grace of Jesus Christ,” and was merited for human beings by the life and death of Jesus. Malebranche also describes it as a “pleasure (délectation)” which makes a person love God (TNG, OM, 5:135). According to Malebranche, the grace of the Creator is “dry, abstract, entirely pure and entirely intelligible” and does not lead us to love God. The grace of Christ, in contrast, is “efficace par elle-même” in that it “always has its effect, always carries us toward God” (OM, 5:132). Human beings, after the fall of Adam, are unable to grow in holiness, or even to be saved from damnation, without the grace of Christ. But the love of God produced by grace is a sort of instinctive love, which is not meritorious and is not sufficient for salvation. Whether the person who receives the grace of Christ is saved depends on the person’s free consent to the movement toward God that grace produces, which converts the instinctive love of God into a “free and rational” love. This consent is not produced by grace.

Now Malebranche holds that God could give to each person grace that would assure the person’s salvation: “God is the master of hearts. He can give to the impious a grace such that it will convert him, since God knows what degree of grace to give, and when it must be given, in order that it bring about the conversion of the sinner” (OM, 5:186). Similarly, God knows what sort of grace would ensure that any person is not only saved, but also attain the maximum holiness of which he or she is capable. But many who receive grace do not grow in holiness and are not saved. For example, many who enter the Church later fall away. On the other hand, many fail to receive the grace that would ensure their holiness or even their salvation. For Malebranche, this is a troubling disorder in the distribution of grace parallel to the disorder found in nature: “God often distributes graces, without their having the effect that His goodness makes us believe He would make them have. He makes the piety of some people increase right up to the end of their life, but sin overcomes them at death and throws them into Hell. He makes the rain of grace fall upon hardened hearts as well as on earth that is prepared: people resist it and make it useless for their salvation. … How can that be reconciled with wisdom?” (OM, 5:48)

Malebranche’s answer is that God’s wisdom dictates that He act, in the distribution of both sorts of grace, according general volitions determined by created occasional causes to particular effects. In the case of the grace of the Creator, the general volitions are laws of nature and the occasional causes are “the diverse movements of our will” and “the encounter of sensible objects that act on our mind” (TNG, 5:102). For the grace of Jesus Christ, the occasional cause if Jesus Christ, in his human nature, and the general volition is that grace be given to human beings if and only if Jesus Christ, in his human nature, asks that it be given. Jesus’ requests for grace are made in view of the needs of the Church. But Jesus, in his human nature, does not always think of “the future determination of the will” of those for whom he requests grace. The result is that, often enough, people receive grace that does not lead to their holiness and salvation, or fail to receive the grace that would have done so (TNG, OM, 5:83).

4.2 Two themes in Arnauld’s criticism of the Treatise of Nature and Grace

Arnauld thought that Malebranche’s position was dangerous, and that if accepted it would have ruinous consequences for the Catholic faith. He was “furious,” as Denis Moreau has aptly said, “and decided to leave nothing standing in a philosophy that clearly frightened him” (Moreau 1999, 240). Here only the general lines of Arnauld’s attack are clarified. First, two pervasive themes in Arnauld’s criticism are described: (1) that Malebranche often did not proceed by the proper method of either philosophy or theology; and (2) that Malebranche speaks of God in anthropomorphic terms, as if He were subject to the limitations of a human agent.[16] Then we turn to Arnauld’s main criticisms of Malebranche’s position that God acts vis-a-vis creatures by “general volitions.”

1. Throughout Réflexions, beginning with the “Avant-Propos” to the work, Arnauld challenges Malebranche to make clear whether his claims are based on reason or on Scripture and tradition.[17] He had mounted this sort of challenge even earlier, in Ideas: “He does not say that he learned those grand maxims on which all of that [Treatise of Nature and Grace] turns by the revelation of God: that if God wills to act externally, it is because He wills to obtain an honor worthy of Himself; that He acts by the simplest ways; that He does not act by particular volitions; but by general volitions which are determined by occasional causes” (Ideas, 174). Nor could all of those maxims be demonstrated, in Malebranche’s sense of the term, for Malebranche says that only necessary truths can be demonstrated, and yet he admits that God does sometimes act by particular volitions, namely, when He performs miracles. Hence Malebranche himself would have to admit that the third maxim, at least, is not demonstrable. In Arnauld’s view, Malebranche came to accept such principles because he thought they made God more loveable and hence were favorable to the cause of religion. Thus he introduces, on the basis of religious considerations, principles that are not found in Scripture and tradition.

Arnauld thought that this unholy introduction of religion into what ought to be treated as philosophical questions began with Malebranche’s theory of ideas, according to which “we see all things in God.” Thus, in the “Conclusion” of his Défense contre la Réponse au livre des vraies et des fausses Idées (OA, hereafter Défense), Arnauld takes up “two or three objections” that might be raised against Ideas. The second objection is one that had been raised by Nicole: “I could have avoided this philosophical topic [of the nature of ideas] so as not to interrupt what I had begun to write about the Treatise of Nature and Grace.” In reply, Arnauld says, “What was at the outset a question of philosophy … is not such for [Malebranche]. For him it is a question of theology, very sublime and very elevated. He considers it a religious duty to devote his whole mind to its defense. He finds it bad that others should disagree with him, and even says that anyone who is not of his opinion must be ‘either an unenlightened philosopher or a man insensitive to his duties.’ Thus he has changed the form of the dispute. He has involved religion, and has become so devoted to his novel thoughts as to hold that anyone who does not approve of them lacks respect for the wisdom of God Himself” (Défense, OA, 39:666).

In Arnauld’s direct attack on TNG, he says again and again that Malebranche relies on principles that have neither a proper theological basis in Scripture and tradition, nor a proper philosophical basis in reason. Clearly he thought that this criticism applied as well to Malebranche’s theory of ideas. But if Arnauld took seriously the remark at the beginning of the Logic, “The reflections we can make on our ideas are perhaps the most important part of logic, since they are the foundation of everything else,” he may well have thought that Malebranche’s theory of ideas was an important source of the confusion of theology with philosophy that plagues TNG. That, in turn, would help to explain his decision to begin his attack on TNG with a treatise on the nature of ideas.[18]

2. Arnauld agreed with Malebranche that God’s will is reasonable, but he disagreed with Malebranche’s way of conceiving God’s reasonableness.[19] In both Book I and Book II of Réflexions, he tries to show that Malebranche conceives of God’s reasonableness as if it were the reasonableness of a human being. In the second chapter of Book I, he reports a series of arguments given by Malebranche early in TNG for the conclusion that God acts in the order of nature only by general volitions. These arguments, says Arnauld, are “only comparisons with men, which … cannot prove anything with regard to God; or popular thoughts not worthy … of a philosopher” (OA, 39:188). For example, Malebranche says that God decides to create that which can be produced and conserved by the simplest laws because he is an excellent workman, and “an excellent workman … does not do by complicated ways what he could carry out by simpler ones” (TNG, OM, 5:28). Arnauld objects that there is no similarity between an excellent human workman and God, “since all the ways of executing His plans are equally easy for Him, and ‘His power,’ as the author [Malebranche] recognizes, ‘makes Him so much the master of all things, and so independent of help from elsewhere, that it suffices that He will, in order for His volitions to be carried out’ (OA, 39;189–90). Hence God’s volitions are not based on reasoning about the means to achieve a desired end.

Book II of Réflexions, which deals with God’s way of acting in the order of grace, opens with a related criticism. Arnauld begins by analyzing a line of thought that Malebranche presents in the ”Troisième Eclaircissement“ to TNG ” (OA, 39:425–51). The line of thought begins with two claims: that “God can act only for Himself. If He wills to act, it is because He wills to procure an honor worthy of Himself” and that “God can receive an honor worthy of Himself only from Himself.” Yet I am created, so I must be able to render to God an honor worthy of Him. This I can do, says Malebranche, only by becoming a part of the Church, of which the Incarnate Second Person of the Trinity is the cornerstone. More generally, “God’s great plan is to build in His own honor a spiritual temple, of which Jesus Christ is the cornerstone … His plan is that this Temple should be as large and perfect as possible.” Malebranche then draws an important conclusion: “God wills that all men enter into this spiritual building, to enlarge it. God wills that all men be saved … God also hopes that men will merit outstanding degrees of glory: His will is our sanctification” (OM, 5:183). But although God wants the salvation and sanctification of all men, “He loves His wisdom infinitely more,” and His wisdom requires that He act in the way that is wisest and most worthy of Himself, that is, in “general, constant and uniform way,” with the result that “He does not save all men, although He truly wills that they all be saved” (OM, 5:185).

Arnauld has much to say against that line of thought, and he begins be attacking its very first step, the claim that God “can act externally only in order to procure an honor worthy of Himself” (OA, 39:428–40).[20] He objects that this is not a proper way to speak about an infinitely perfect being. Once again, Malebranche is guilty of anthropomorphism. For he says, in effect, “that [God] could resolve to create me, me and the other creatures, only for some advantage He wanted to obtain for Himself by creating us…. That is how [Malebranche] lowers [God], by claiming that He cannot decide to create anything externally, except to procure an honor worthy of Himself” (OA, 39:429). Arnauld goes on to contrast Malebranche’s way of describing God’s creation with that of St. Thomas, who say that the reason God creates is that His goodness tends to overflow and communicate itself to other things.[21]

Arnauld also says that to speak about God as consulting His wisdom before acting is to speak about God as one would about a human being who wills an end and is thereby caused to will the means to that end (OA, 39:432). It is to compare God to a man who consults his wisdom about everything he wants to do “as if he were afraid of not acting well, and his will needed to be ruled by something other than itself in order to do only what is good” (OA, 39:599–600). “Is it an expression of rigorous exactitude to say of God that He consults His wisdom, and that is how it comes about that everything He wills is wise,” Arnauld asks, “as if the word consult is suitable for an infinitely perfect being when one professes not to speak in popular language? As if God needed to consult His wisdom so that what He wills should be wise? As if His will were not His wisdom? As if everything He wills were not essentially wise, by virtue of the fact that He wills it?” (OA, 39:578). God’s will is not a force that needs to be tamed. The truth, according to Arnauld, is that it is impossible that God should have an actual (sincere) will for something that is not in fact wise.

In a related criticism, Arnauld chides Malebranche for allowing “very little freedom and indifference” in God’s creative action. Arnauld quotes Malebranche: “Assuming that God wills to produce outside of Himself a work worthy of Himself, He is not indifferent in the choice; He ought to produce the most perfect work possible by relation to the simplicity of the ways by which He acts; He owes it to Himself to follow the rules of his wisdom” (Quoted by Arnauld at Réflexions, OA, 39:598, from TNG, OM, 5: 110). Malebranche tries to save for God at least freedom and indifference with regard to creating or not creating. But Arnauld suggests that this move is ruled out by “the way in which he conceives God’s action,” for supposedly, on Malebranche’s view, God would consult His wisdom before deciding whether to create or not, and just as His wisdom advises Him to create this world rather than a less perfect one, assuming that the two could be created in an equally simple way, His wisdom would also advise Him that it is better to create than not to create (OA, 39:599–600).[22]

4.3 Does God act only by general volitions?

Arnauld devoted much of Réflexions to Malebranche’s position that God acts by general volitions and not by particular volitions. In Book I of Réflexions, his focus is on the order of nature and he tries to show that Malebranche’s claim that God acts only by general volitions is confused and even self-contradictory. In Book II, his focus is on the order of grace and he attacks Malebranche’s claim that God does not distribute grace by particular volitions.

Arnauld begins his criticism in Book I by claiming that Malebranche confuses acting by general volitions and acting according to general laws. Arnauld grants that God acts according to general laws. But against the claim that God acts by general volitions, he provides an argument that is simple, and, his view, decisive: “Whatever [God] does, He does in particular, and not in general. But since to will and to do, in God, are the same thing, given that He creates each soul by a particular action, He must also will to create it by a particular will” (OA, 39:175).

In some passages, Malebranche’s language suggests that God’s wisdom dictates that He engage in the act of creating that best combines the goodness of the world created with the simplicity of the laws according to which the world is created, and not with simplicity of the volition whereby God creates (TNG, OM, 5:147). This suggests that for Malebranche God does will particular created effects, though He wills that they take place according to certain laws. But Arnauld did not think that this was Malebranche’s view. For suppose that God creates the world according to a simple set of laws. Let these laws, as regards bodies, be the laws of motion. A world created according to such laws might be more perfect than a world not created according to general laws, or created according to a different set of laws. But that would be of no help to Malebranche. For he does not say that a world regulated by simpler laws is a more perfect world. Rather he maintains that creating such a world is a simpler act of creation in God Himself. But it is not at all clear how simplicity of laws according to which the world is created would make God’s way of creating simpler, especially if God’s creative activity includes the will to create every particular part of the creative world. Malebranche’s real position, according to Arnauld, emerges in those passages in which he identifies the “ways” in which the word is created with the actions whereby God creates. For example, in the passage, “An excellent workman ought to proportion his action to his work; he does not accomplish by highly complex ways (voyes) what He can execute by simpler ones” (TNG, OM, 5:28). To this Arnauld objects that the volitions by which God creates are particular.

Arnauld next points out that Malebranche does not say, without qualification, that God creates by general volitions. Rather, Malebranche says that God’s creative will is “the cause of a particular effect; but he calls it general, because he holds that God has this will only when He is determined to have it by an occasional cause, which must be a creature” (OA, 39:176). In other words, according to Malebranche, God causes particular effects in creation, but the contribution of God’s volition, as opposed to the contribution of created occasional causes, is general. Later on, Arnauld says that, on Malebranche’s view, it is really only the free volitions of creatures that can be said to determine God, in view of His general volitions, to produce a particular effect. For, according to Malebranche, God is the cause of every bodily event, including those which, together with the general laws, are supposed to determine any given consequent event. (OA, 39:230). But Malebranche is committed, so Arnauld argues, to the position that the free volitions of creatures are not caused by God (OA, 39:248–57).[23]

Arnauld goes further and says that Malebranche’s position on God’s creative will is, in fact, self-contradictory. For Malebranche “was not of the opinion of those philosophers who believe that God originally created all things, gave them the qualities necessary for their conservation and the powers they needed in order to act, and then left them to act without further involving Himself.” On the contrary, Malebranche insists that “God is the sole cause of everything in the world, up to the smallest movement of the smallest atom.” But he also holds that God “acts in the world only as a universal cause, whose general volitions are determined by the … changes … in creatures, as by so many occasional causes.” Arnauld tries to show that these two positions are inconsistent with one another (OA, 39:231–37).

Near the end of Book II of Réflexions, Arnauld takes up Malebranche’s arguments for the claim, “God does not act, in the order of grace, by particular volitions,” as summarized by Malebranche in the Premier Eclaircissement to TNG (OA, 39:621). Malebranche says that the proposition in question can be proved by reason “in two ways; à priori & à posteriori; that is, by our idea of God, and by the effects of grace.” The chief “a priori” argument involves the claim that “to choose occasional causes, and to establish general laws for carrying out some work, indicates an infinitely more extensive knowledge than to act by particular volitions.” Arnauld retorts, “Is it something to be put up with, that human beings … should have the temerity to make themselves judges of what is a sign in God of greater intelligence and wisdom?” (OA, 39:624).

Arnauld quotes Malebranche’s statement, “The à priori proofs are too abstract to convince most people of the truth I am proposing. It is more à propos to prove it à posteriori,” and goes on to consider the a posteriori arguments (OA, 39:625–43). He is less sarcastic in dealing with these arguments than with the a priori ones. He says that there are “three or four of them, but they all amount to the same thing: There are graces that are inefficacious, and this would not occur if God gave His graces by particular volitions.” He mentions three such arguments, based on the premise that graces are given to sinners who are not entirely converted; on the premise that grace often falls upon hearts disposed in such a way that the grace does not bear fruit; and, finally, on the premise that graces given to sinners sometimes end up making them even more guilty.

Arnauld assumes that these arguments have to do with “the true grace of Jesus Christ, as defined by St. Augustine: Inspiratio dilectionis, ut cognita sancto amore faciamus, an inspiration of love given to us so that we should do the good with holy affection.” Such grace is efficacious if it infallibly has its effect. But the effect in question may be either proximate (prochain) or remote (éloigné). As in the famous example of Augustine, a grace may be efficacious in that it produces the desire to be chaste, and yet not efficacious in that it fails to produces chastity itself. Similarly, Malebranche’s arguments assume that “Every grace has the effect for which God gives it.” But once again, this phrase may refer to the effect for which God gives the grace by His absolute will, or to the effect that grace tends to produce by its nature and which for which God gives the grace by His antecedent will. Arnauld grants that if God gives efficacious graces by particular volitions, then there are none that fail to have the proximate effect, which God intends they have by His absolute will. But they may well fail to have remote effects to which they tend by their nature and which God wills only by His antecedent will. For example, if an efficacious grace has the effect that a sinner repents, only to lapse back into sin, then the grace had the proximate effect God intended it to have by His absolute will, even though it failed to have all the effect to which it tended by its nature and which God willed by His antecedent will. In this way, he disposes of Malebranche’s three a posteriori arguments.

Arnauld ends Book II with a consideration of what he takes to be Malebranche’s master argument. It is a fourth a posteriori argument. He quotes from the Troisième Eclaircissement: “There is no other way than [by saying that God does not act by particular volitions] to reconcile the proposition in Holy Scripture, ‘God wants to save all men,’ with this proposition, ‘Not all men are saved’” (OA, 39:637). Arnauld rejects this argument mainly because, like the other three a posteriori ones, it assumes that “God wills, by a true volition, the salvation of all men, and the conversion of sinners” (OA, 39:641).

Arnauld agreed with Malebranche that God could have brought it about that all men are saved and did not do so. But he favored an Augustinian view that “all men” in this context means “all sorts of men,” that is, men of all races, occupations, etc. He did not entirely reject the Thomistic view that God’s will for the salvation of all men is God’s “antecedent will” rather than His “consequent will,” that is, God’s will other things being equal rather than God’s will all things considered. Arnauld points out that Malebranche’s position might be thought to be a version of the Thomistic one, but adds that according to St. Thomas God’s antecedent will is a wish rather than an absolute volition (une velleité plutôt qu’une volonté absolue) (Réflexions, OA, 39:198, cf. 39:576).[24] Arnauld firmly rejects any notion that God wills the sanctification and salvation of each and every person in a strong sense of “will” such that His will would be carried out unless there were something to prevent it, or, in Malebranche’s words, to hold it in check.[25]

4.4 Arnauld’s Criticism of Malebranche’s Occasionalism

Arnauld opened a different line of attack in his Dissertation sur les miracles le l’ancien loi. This new attack is directed against the occasionalism which is assumed in Malebranche’s account of the wisdom of God’s ways of creating. In a foreword to the Dissertation, Arnauld says that he had completed his treatment of the first two books of the Reflexions, and was beginning work on the third, when he received the fourth edition of the Treatise:[26]

I had finished two books examining the new system of nature and grace, and there remained only one further book to complete the task, when I received from Rotterdam a new edition of the Treatise, published that year, 1684, with several additions. The main one was a third Eclaircissement, with the title: The frequent miracles of the Old Law do not at all indicate that God often acts by particular volitions. And the only reason which the author of the system gives is that the miracles were done by the ministry of the angels, who were their occasional causes.

Arnauld interrupted his work on the Reflexions to write the Dissertation, which was published in 1685 together with the first chapter of Book Three of the Reflexions, a chapter dealing with Malebranche’s position that Jesus Christ, in his human nature, is the occasional cause of the distribution of grace. Arnauld raises theological objections to both positions, but also attacks the underlying occasionalism. The Dissertation touched off a rapid series of replies and ounter-replies in 1685. The first volume of Reflexions was published later in 1685, and the second and third volumes in 1686.

Arnauld begins his attack by citing the opening sentence of the Dernier Eclaircissement, in which Malebranche says that he expects his readers to agree with the principle that “God causes (fait) everything, and hence He communicates His power to creatures only by establishing them as occasional causes…” (OM, 5, 197). Arnauld adds that Malebranche “does ot understand ‘God causes everything’ as ordinary philosophers do, who way that the creature does not act al all unless God acts with it, which they call ‘concurrence’ … But what he means when he says that God causes everything is that He causes everything that one imagines the creature causes, and that the creature causes nothing at all.” It is not difficult, Arnauld says, to show that the first conjunct, so understood, is false. For “it destroys the nature of intelligent beings, who would not be free if they did not, as real causes, form in themselves the determination of their will toward particular goods”. (As Arnauld points out, the italicized words are Malebranche’s.) The second conjunct of the principle is dispatched in a similar way: “For intelligent beings receive from God their power to form the determination of their will toward particular goods. But it is not only as occasional causes but as real causes that they form in themselves that determination of their will” (OA, 5, 198).

Having established to his satisfaction that the principle “taken generally” is false, Arnauld goes on to say that there is no reason to deny that God has given angels power to move bodies and that they are real, not mere occasional, causes of the miraculous events attributed to them. Again, “it is not so easy to demonstrate” that our soul does not have the real power to move the parts of the body to which it is united.

In the exchange of publications that grew out of the Dissertation, Arnauld objects in a similar way to Malebranche’s use of occasionalism to explain “how grace acts in us without wounding [liberty]” (OM, 5, 8). In his explanation, Malebranche distinguishes the effect of grace, which is from God and is not free, from the recipient’s free response, which is from the recipient and not from God. Arnauld says that Malebranche would have done well to heed Aquinas’s advice that one should not distinguish “between what is from grace and what is from free will, as if the same thing could not be from both” (OA, 39, 114).

Both Malebranche and Arnauld continued to write about divine causality and human freedom in their later work. Arnauld’s late work on the topic is describe in Section 6 below. Malebranche’s last effort on the topic was his Reflexions sur la Premotion Physique, published in 1715, the year of his death.

5. Arnauld and Leibniz

On February 11, 1686, while the controversy between Arnauld and Malebranche was at a peak of intensity, Leibniz wrote to Landgrave Ernst von Hessen-Rheinfels, asking that the Landgrave send Arnauld a summary of “a short discourse” on “questions of grace, the concourse of God and creatures, the nature of miracles, the cause of sin and the origin of evil, the immortality of the soul, ideas, etc.” (The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence, Die Philosophischen Schriften von Leibniz, herausgegeben von K. I. Gerhardt, Vol. 2, hereinafter LA, 11). The ensuing correspondence occurred at a crucial point in the development of Leibniz’s philosophy. The Discourse on Metaphysics, the final version of the short discourse, marks the beginning of Leibniz’s mature metaphysics, and it shows the influence of the correspondence with Arnauld.

Leibniz had corresponded with Arnauld some fifteen years earlier, in connection with Leibniz’s efforts to reunite the Christian churches. These efforts took a new turn in March, 1672, when Leibniz, then just 25 years old, left Mainz for Paris on a secret political mission for his patron, Baron Johann Christian von Boineburg, who was in turn minister to Johann Philipp von Schönborn, the Elector of Mainz. Both men were converts from Lutheranism to Catholicism. Leibniz’s diplomatic mission was a failure, but he had other reasons for wanting to visit Paris. He was eager to enter into the brilliant intellectual life of the French capital, and he stayed there, with a brief sojourn in England, until 1676, making the acquaintance of a number of leading intellectuals. During this time, he undertook for the first time the serious study of mathematics. But he also continued to work toward a philosophical position that he hoped would help reunify the churches.

Before coming to Paris, he had discussed the project of reunifying the churches with his patron Boineburg, and had corresponded with Arnauld, in 1671, about the Eucharist, proposing an account of the real presence that he thought would be acceptable to both Lutherans and Catholics. But it was Leibniz’s interest in theodicy, and related problems about justification, that flourished in Paris. There, in 1673, he composed Confessio Philosophi, a dialogue in Latin between a theologian and a philosopher that is sometimes referred to as “his first theodicy.” Thirty-seven years later in the Theodicy, Leibniz says, “While I was in France, I communicated to M. Arnauld a dialogue I had written in Latin on the cause of evil and the justice of God. This was not only before his disputes with R. P. Malebranche, but even before the book on The Search after Truth had appeared. The principle that I here maintain, that sin was permitted because it was involved in the best plan for the universe, was already employed there, and M. Arnauld did not seem hostile to it” (Theodicy, #211).

Soon after Leibniz’s arrival in Paris, both Boineborg and von Schönborn died, and Leibniz turned for support to another important German noble and convert from Lutheranism to Catholicism, Johann Friedrich von Braunschweig-Lüneberg (Hannover). On 26 March 1673, Leibniz wrote as follows to Johann Friedrich:

The famous Arnauld is a man of the most profound and wide-ranging thought that a true philosopher can have; his aim is not only to illuminate hearts with the clarity of religion, but, further, to revive the flame of reason, eclipsed by human passions; not only to convert heretics, but, further, those who are today in the greatest heresy—the atheists and libertines; not only to vanquish his opponents, but, further, to improve those of his persuasion. His thoughts, then, come to seeking how, so far as it is possible, a reform of abuses, frankly wide-spread among dissidents, would overcome the cause of the division. In this design, on several points of importance, he has made the first step and, as a prudent man, he goes by degrees. I am distressed that we have lost von Boineburg just when I have struck up an acquaintance with Arnauld; for I had hoped to bring these two minds, so similar in their honest soundness, on the road to a closer agreement, The Church, as well as the Fatherland, has sustained a loss with this man (Quoted in Sleigh 1990, 15–16).

There is no record of any response by Arnauld to the Confessio Philosophi, but when Leibniz returned to the problems of theodicy, in 1686, he once again sought Arnauld’s cooperation by sending Arnauld the outline of the Discourse on Metaphysics that was mentioned above. The outline sent to Arnauld was no more than a list of the propositions that were to appear as the titles of the thirty-seven sections of the Discourse; the entire correspondence was carried out through the intermediary of Hessen-Rheinfels; and the copies of letters received by the two major correspondents were sometimes defective. These facts, together with the extreme subtlety of the philosophical contents of the letters, have made interpretation of the correspondence very difficult.

Proposition 8 in Leibniz’s outline is: “In order to distinguish the actions of God from those of creatures, it is explained wherein consists the notion of an individual substance” (LA,8). The notion of a substance is, for Leibniz, the notion of a thing that acts. To explain the notion of a created individual substance, therefore, he has to explain the notion of a created agent, which requires that he distinguish correctly between the actions of creatures and the actions of God. Part of Leibniz’s account of the notion of an individual substance is given in Proposition 13: “The individual notion of each person includes once and for all everything that will ever happen to him,” so that “one sees in [that notion] a priori proofs of the truth of each event, that is, why one [event] has occurred rather than another” (LA, 8). The debate between Arnauld and Leibniz begins here. Proposition 13, Arnauld said in his first letter to Leibniz, implies that “once God decided to create Adam, everything that has happened since and will ever happen to the human race was and is obliged to happen with a more than fatal necessity” (LA, 27). For example, given proposition 13, if Adam exists, then necessarily Adam is father of Cain and Abel as sons, grandfather of their children, great-grandfather of their children, etc., and everything that will ever happen to all of them is already determined.

After a complicated three-way exchange of letters, Arnauld withdrew his complaint in a letter dated September 28, 1686. At the outset, Arnauld assumed that according to Leibniz whatever is contained in the individual notion of a person is contained there as a necessary property of the person. But in response to Arnauld, Leibniz says that he does not “ask for more of a connection here” than that which obtains between an individual substance and its “external denominations” (LA, p. 56). Given this understanding of the way that individual notion of a person contains everything that will ever happen to him, Arnauld was prepared to concede that Leibniz’s position did not involve fatalism (LA, 63–64).

Arnauld adds that he continues to have difficulty with Leibniz’s account of “the possibility of things” and his conception of God as choosing the actual world out of an infinity of possible worlds, a point on which Leibniz agreed with Malebranche. But Arnauld says he does not want to go into that difficulty. Instead, he asks Leibniz to clarify his “hypothesis of concomitance or agreement between substances,” and his statement that if a material thing is not merely an appearance, like a rainbow, or an accidental aggregation of parts, like a pile of stones, it must have a “substantial form.” Leibniz had mentioned both of these points in his immediately preceding letter (LA, 64–66, 58). According to the hypothesis of concomitance no created substance ever acts upon any other created substance. But every later state of any given created substance is caused by an earlier state of the same substance, and the histories of the individuals are coordinated by God so that they fit together into the history of the actual world. Leibniz also says that one substance, x, may “express” another substance, y, more distinctly than y expresses x, and in that case, one may say that x causes changes to occur in y. He uses this position to explain the relation of mind and body. Arnauld asked him to explain his view further by applying it to the example of a man who feels pain when his arm is wounded, and the example of a man wants to take off his hat and raises his arm. Arnauld also raises seven objections to Leibniz’s claims about substantial forms (LA, 66–67) and defends the Cartesian view that extension is the real nature of matter, which he takes to imply that bodies have only varying degrees of “improper unity” (LA, 88).

Leibniz provided the further clarification Arnauld requested in several long letters, which drew two replies from Arnauld. Arnauld continued to find Leibniz’s position unclear. “I have no clear notion,” says Arnauld, “of what you mean by the word ‘expression’, when you say that our soul expresses more distinctly (all other things being equal) what pertains to its body, since it is an expression even of the whole universe in a certain sense” (LA, 105). He takes Leibniz’s views about substantial forms to be a strange and unsuccessful attempt “to ascribe true unity to bodies [in particular the bodies of animals] which would not otherwise have it” (LA, 107).

Arnauld’s last letter to Leibniz is dated August 28, 1687. Leibniz tried to get Arnauld to continue the discussion, but Arnauld was fully occupied with other projects. On August 31, 1687, Arnauld wrote to Hessen-Rheinfels, saying, “It would be preferable if [Leibniz] gave up, at least for a time, this sort of speculation, and applied himself to the greatest business he can have, the choice of the true religion… a decision that is of such importance for his salvation” (LA, 110).

Evidently Arnauld had less interest in Leibniz’s philosophy than Malebranche’s, and less patience with it. This is not surprising, given that Arnauld considered his work in philosophy subordinate to his work as a theologian. The fact that Malebranche was a Catholic made his philosophically motivated departures from the tradition all the more dangerous in Arnauld’s eyes. It also gave Arnauld some hope that he could lever Malebranche out of his position by pointing out its heterodox implications. Leibniz did not pose a similar danger, nor were there grounds for a similar hope in his regard, unless, of course, he heeded Arnauld’s advice and converted to Catholicism.

6. Arnauld’s Compatibilism

Throughout his enormously active life as a philosopher and theologian, Arnauld was above all concerned to defend the doctrine that human beings, after the fall of Adam, can perform meritorious actions, but only if the actions are the result of a supernatural grâce efficace par elle-même. Arnauld claimed to find this doctrine in the writings of Augustine; he defended Jansen’s version of the doctrine against the charge of heresy, even though Jansen’s version was significantly different from that espoused by Arnauld himself; and he attributed the doctrine to Aquinas. But Arnauld, like Augustine, Aquinas, and Jansen, also held that actions are meritorious only if they are free. For this reason, Arnauld is sometimes said to be a “compatibilist.” For example, Robert Sleigh says, “It is worth noting that Leibniz and Arnauld both ascribed compatibilism to St. Thomas and that both accepted compatibilism as well” (Sleigh 1990, 29).

There is, however, a case to be made that the position Arnauld defended and attributed to St. Thomas is in fact quite different from what is nowadays referred to as “compatibilism.” The position is connected with Arnauld’s treatment of free will during the last decade of his life, at the time when he was wrestling with Malebranche’s theory of nature and grace. At that time, Arnauld adopted the position that the human will is free when and only when it is a “potestas ou facultas ad opposita.” But first, it is necessary to provide some background for the notion of grâce efficace par elle-même.

6.1 The Congregationes de Auxiliis and seventeenth-century controversy about grace

The point of departure for the disputes about grace and free will in seventeenth-century Europe was the inconclusive ending of the Congregationes de Auxiliis Divinae Gratiae.[27] These were ad hoc committees of Cardinals convoked to resolve a dispute between the Jesuits and Dominicans about grace, predestination, and free will. The dispute was concerned with a work by the Jesuit Luis de Molina, whose lengthy title indicates the scope and complexity of the dispute: Concordia Liberi Arbitrii cum Gratia Donis, Divina Praescientia, Providentia, Praedestinatione et Reprobatione ad Nonnullos Primae Partis Divi Thomae Articulos (The Agreement of Free will with the Gift of Grace, Divine Foreknowledge, Providence, Predestination and Reprobation, according to several articles in the First Part of St. Thomas). The work was published in 1588 and was immediately attacked by the Dominican school of Salamanca, led by Domingo Bañez. The Congregationes were convoked by Pope Clement VIII with the aim of resolving what had become a widespread struggle between the two orders. His hope was frustrated; the meetings began on January 2, 1598 and were terminated on August 28, 1607 (the feast day of St. Augustine!) by Pope Paul V, who declared that neither side was heretical and that both sides had merit.

A central question at the meetings of the Congregationes had to do with the relation of supernatural grace to meritorious, free acts of will. It was assumed on both sides that a human being cannot perform a meritorious act of will without supernatural assistance from God, that God sometimes gives this assistance, and that it is sometimes part of God’s providential plan that the recipient freely cooperate and thus perform the act in question. Meritorious acts of will include, among others, the decision to pray, to seek forgiveness for past sins, and to perform a good action for the love of God. It was assumed by both Jesuits and Dominicans that God’s providential plan is infallibly realized. Hence both sides agreed that supernatural grace is, in at least some cases, infallibly efficacious (Vansteenberghe 1928, #2140). The issue was whether the supernatural grace in question is efficacious by itself, in other words, intrinsically efficacious, or whether it is efficacious only by virtue of the independent, divinely foreknown cooperation of the one who receives the grace (Vansteenberghe 1928, #2154–65). Several sorts of supernatural grace were distinguished. For our purposes, the most important distinctions are (a) between habitual grace (especially the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity) and actual grace; (b) between external actual grace (e.g., hearing a good sermon) and internal actual grace (grace consisting in internal, mental acts); and (c) between internal actual grace of the intellect and internal actual grace of the will. The question was whether the actual grace of the will that infallibly produces a meritorious act of will is efficacious by itself, or whether instead its efficaciousness is explained in part by God’s knowledge that the recipient would cooperate with the grace.

6.2 Bañez, Jansen, and Arnauld on the nature of efficacious actual grace of the will

Jansen and Arnauld, like Bañez, defended the position that actual grace of the will is sometimes intrinsically efficacious.[28] But they disagreed about the nature of such grace. According to Bañez, efficacious grace is the supernatural counterpart of “physical premotion.” The elusive notion of physical premotion is part of a general account of God’s causation of the actions of creatures. According to this account, God is a cause of a creature’s action by bringing about in the creature a “premotion” that results in the creature’s carrying out the action in question. For Bañez, then, the actual grace in question is a sort of supernatural beginning of volition that is produced in the human being by God and that infallibly results in a meritorious act of will. Jansen rejected this notion, arguing that it is an obscure hypothesis that explains nothing. He held that efficacious grace is, instead, a feeling of love, which he called a “delectatio victrix (victorious pleasure)” and which infallibly leads to a meritorious act.

Arnauld accepted neither of those views. In a work published in 1656, he considers two positions on the nature of efficacious grace, in so far as it is the principle of good will: “Some say that such grace consists in the mercy of God and in an inherent form [in the creature],” while others say that it consists “only in the mercy of God, which brings about (operatur) the interior movement of the mind.” Arnauld says “I am not far” from the second position, which he attributes to “Bradwardine, Estius, Tiphanius, and many other [Thomists]” (Dissertatio theologica quadripartita, OA, 20:237).

When Arnauld returned to questions about efficacious grace and free will toward the end of his life, he was more categorical: “The true opinion of St. Augustine, St. Bernard, and St. Thomas concerning actual grace, is that of Estius, who posits nothing created by God in the will in between the will of God, which he calls uncreated grace, and the free movement of the human will which the uncreated grace produces in the human will.” Jansen was “surely mistaken,” Arnauld adds, when he defined actual grace as a non-deliberate “victorious pleasure” (Letter to du Vaucel, 8 May 1693, OA, 3:636).[29] In a short treatise on human freedom written almost a decade earlier, Arnauld illustrates his criticism of Jansen (without mentioning him by name) with an example: “Suppose that a man who is not very generous is approached by a beggar who asks him for alms. He deliberates, proposes to himself the commandment of Christ, and gives alms for the sake of God” (De la liberté de l’homme, OA, 10:620). Hereinafter Liberté). Jansen assumes that there is a non-deliberate act of victorious pleasure in between the man’s deliberation and his decision to give alms for the sake of God, and that this non-deliberate pleasure is the actual grace that enables him to act in a meritorious way. Arnauld rejects this position and instead identifies the efficacious grace with God’s merciful will that the man arrive at the deliberate decision to give alms for the sake of God.

Yet Arnauld also assumed that the man’s decision, like any meritorious act of will, was free. Arnauld’s basic position on the compatibility of the intrinsic efficacy of grace with the freedom of the volitions produced by the grace, is that we know from Scripture and Tradition, supported by philosophical reflection on God’s omnipotence (a) that the grace of Christ is intrinsically efficacious; and we know “from our own experience” (b) that our volitions of the relevant kind are free. Hence we know that (a) and (b) are consistent, even though we have “great difficulty” in seeing how they fit together (OA, 10:436).

6.3 The limits of Arnauld’s compatibilism

Arnauld was, then, a compatibilist of sorts. The compatibilism he espoused, and attributed to St. Thomas, however, was limited, and differs in a number ways from the sort of position philosophers now label “compatibilism.”

1. Arnauld was not a determinist, nor did he attribute determinism to St. Thomas. Arnauld cites Aquinas (Summa Theologicae I, 19, 3) as an authority in favor of his own view that God’s will with regard to creatures are not necessary (OA, 39:598).

2. Arnauld held that freedom of human volitions is incompatible with the determination of the choices by laws of nature together with temporally antecedent events. Thus he responds to Malebranche’s statement that the destruction of Jerusalem by the Romans some seventy years after the death of Jesus was “a necessary outcome of the laws of nature,” by saying, “It is clear … that a long series of diverse events, that depended on an infinity of free movements of the wills of men, could have been, and indeed were, regulated by the providence of Him who has an almighty power to move the hearts of men, and to direct them as He pleases … But it cannot be said that it was a necessary consequence of the laws of nature without degrading human beings, making them act like lower animals, and depriving them of their liberty, a position that has been declared anathema by the Council of Trent” (OA, 39:301). He repeats the criticism a few pages later: “As I have shown above, to hold that events that depended on an infinity of free volitions of human beings were a necessary consequence of laws of nature is to deprive human beings of their freedom, after the example of Wycliffe” (OA, 39:316).[30]

3. According to the position Arnauld attributes to Aquinas, the sinful choices of human beings are not determined by any cause exterior to the sinner. Arnauld agreed with Aquinas that God is the sole exterior cause of the volitions of a human being, that is, the only efficient cause of volitions outside the human being himself or herself, but God never causes a person to sin. Arnauld cites Summa Theologiae, I-IIae, 9, 6, ad 3, in which Aquinas answers the objection that God cannot be the sole exterior cause of sinful choices. Aquinas says, “God, as the universal mover, moves the will of man to the universal object of the will, which is the good. And without this universal movement man cannot will anything; but man through reason determines himself to will this or that, whether it be a true or only an apparent good. Nevertheless God sometimes moves some men especially to will something determinate that is good (interdum movet Deus specialiter aliquos ad aliquid determinatè volendum quod est bonum), as in those He moves by grace” (Vera S. Thomae de gratia sufficiente et efficaci doctrina dilucide explanata, OA, 20:63).[31] Arnauld’s purpose in citing this text is to show that, according to Aquinas, when one sins, one is not moved by grace.[32] But the text, together with the premise that there is no exterior cause of human volition other than God, implies that sinful choices are not determined by any cause outside the sinner.

6.4 Arnauld’s late position on the nature of free will

In several letters toward the end of his life, Arnauld recommends a “little Latin text” on human freedom that he wrote at the time he was wrestling with Malebranche’s theory of nature and grace, saying that it is particularly helpful in connection with the problem of reconciling intrinsically efficacious grace with freedom of will.[33] The core of Arnauld’s new theory is that the human soul has freedom of will with respect to a true or apparent good when it has the power to will that good and the power not to will it. In such cases, the soul “determines itself” to will or not will the good in question. The human soul is said to have this power with respect to any particular good it apprehends, as long as the particular good does not encompass all the good toward which the will tends. Arnauld cites I-IIae, 13, 6 as part of the Thomistic origin of his theory:

Man does not choose of necessity. And this is because that which is possible not to be, is not of necessity…. For man can will and not will, act and not act; again, he can will this or that, and do this or that. The reason of this is seated in the very power of the reason. For the will can tend to whatever the reason can apprehend as good. Now the reason can apprehend as good, not only this, viz. “to will” or “to act,” but also this, viz. “not to will” or “not to act.” Again, in all particular goods, the reason can consider an aspect of some good, and the lack of some good, which has the aspect of evil: and in this respect, it can apprehend any single one of such goods as to be chosen or to be avoided. The perfect good alone, which is happiness, cannot be apprehended by the reason as an evil, or as lacking in any way. Consequently man wills happiness of necessity, nor can he will not to be happy, or to be unhappy… Therefore man chooses not of necessity, but freely. (cited at OA, 10:630–31)

Arnauld follows Aquinas in saying that the will is not free with regard to two objects, first, happiness, apprehended as the ultimate object of volition, and, second, God, seen face to face by the blessed in heaven. In these two cases, one wills (or loves) the object with “necessity of nature,” and hence not freely. In all other cases, the will is free, and when one wills, one does so freely.[34] Arnauld provides a compact formula for this theory: “The best and shortest notion one can have of free will is to say with St. Thomas that it is potestas ou facultas ad opposita” (Letter to Bossuet, juillet 1693, OA, 3:662).[35]

6.5 The advantages Arnauld claims for his new theory over Jansen’s theory

Arnauld claims a number of advantages for his theory of free will over that of Jansen. In particular, he claims that, when combined with the account of the nature of grace that he found in Estius, it makes it easier to reconcile the intrinsic efficacy of grace with freedom. “In following [Estius’s opinion regarding efficacious grace], it is much easier to explain the efficacy of the grace, and to reconcile it with freedom, especially when we define free will, following St. Thomas, as a facultas ad opposita” (Letter to Bossuet, juillet 1694, OA, 3:664).

Explaining the efficacy of grace is easier on Estius’s theory than on the competing theories, because it is simpler. On the competing theories, which include Jansen’s, the efficacy of actual grace of the will depends on a connection of some sort, within the mind of a creature, between a created grace, like Jansen’s “victorious pleasure,” and a meritorious choice. Estius’s theory is simpler: The efficacy of actual grace is a direct consequence of the general principle that God’s absolute will is infallibly realized.

But how does Estius’s theory, combined with the account of free will that Arnauld derived from St. Thomas, help to reconcile the efficacy of grace with free will? According to Jansen, freedom of will is the same as spontaneity, and so every act of will is essentially free. Jansen qualifies that position by adding that during life here on earth, human beings have another kind of freedom: “The freedom of man the pilgrim is not only exempt from constraint, but even from immutable voluntary necessity (necessitatis immutabilis voluntariae), that it, this freedom is indifferent between doing good and doing evil, between acting and not acting” (Quoted by Arnauld in Seconde Apologie, OA, 17:242). When he says that the will is indifferent as between doing good and doing evil, and between acting or not acting, during this life here below, Jansen means that during life on Earth, the will remains mutable or “flexible” between doing good and doing evil, and again, willing or not willing any particular action or end. In other words, the will is not confirmed in good or evil during this life in such a way that it could not fall away from willing the good or be converted from willing what is evil, and again in such a way that it could not cease willing what it does will or begin willing what it does not will.

Now on theories like those of Jansen and Bañez, the intrinsic efficacy of grace involves the determination of a person’s volition by an antecedent state of his or her mind, and this seems to conflict with the proposition that the volition is free. On Estius’s view, on the other hand, a person’s meritorious volition is determined not by an antecedent state of his or her mind, but rather by the will of God. Is this an improvement, with respect to explaining the compatibility of efficacious grace with free will? Arnauld says it is, “especially when we define free will, following St. Thomas, as a facultas ad opposita.”

Here Arnauld appeals to the Thomistic principle that when God causes a creature to act, He always causes the creature to act in accordance with its nature. Paraphrasing Aquinas (Summa Theologiae, I, 82, 1, ad 3), Arnauld says,

When God works our volition in us, He brings it about that we will in conformity with our nature, that is by determining ourselves to what we are not determined by nature. Thus no matter with what efficacy the mind is moved by God, it acts as master of its very own action, and it wills because it wills, determining itself to all other things by its volition to be happy, and hence it acts freely. (Liberté, OA, 10:616).[36]

Arnauld’s line of thought seems to be as follows: Human beings are attracted to limited goods only as means to the unlimited good of happiness. Therefore, whenever a human being is attracted to a limited good, he or she can attend to its goodness and will it, or attend to some way in which it falls short of the unlimited good and refrain from willing it. Which of these options is realized is determined by the human being, or more precisely, the human being’s mind; thus, in willing or not willing any limited good, the human mind is self-determining and free. All this is part of the nature of the human mind. So if God moves the human mind to will a limited good, He moves it to will in a self-determining and free way.

If pressed for more details about how God by His merciful will (uncreated grace) moves a human being to will a particular good, while yet leaving it up to the human being whether he or she wills that good, Arnauld would surely say that we human beings cannot understand God’s causality well enough to supply such details. Our inability to understand God’s causality with regard to the created world is a common theme in Arnauld. It is expressed forcefully in his first contribution to the Leibniz-Arnauld exchange, written in 1686, not long after Liberté. Arnauld says that although we are certain that God, “by a single and very simple act, which is His essence,” knows all things, including things that might not have been, and wills things that He might not have willed by His will, which is also His essence, nevertheless we cannot understand how God does these things, because “as far as we are concerned (à notre égard) God dwells in inaccessible light” (LA, p. 31–32).[37]

Before presenting the above theory of free will in Liberté, Arnauld prepares the ground by presenting two examples in which a person’s volition occurs “infallibly” and yet freely, in the sense of freedom “that is necessary and sufficient for merit or demerit” (Liberté, OA, 10:620). The examples are preceded by the statement, “However infallible be the determination by which the will is determined with the attention of reason, to objects to which it is not naturally determined, freedom suffers no damage (préjudice); because the infallible determination does not prevent the soul from willing because it wills; and hence it is master of its action” (Liberté, OA, 10:615–16). The first example is that of a prince who is in love with a woman and has “a vehement passion for the pleasures of the flesh.” If the woman offers herself to the prince, “he will infallibly satisfy his passion.” The second example is that of a cruel and revengeful king, who has been offended by one of his subjects and has the subject in his power: “Infallibly he will destroy him.”[38] Everyone who is not “entirely barbarian,” says Arnauld, will agree that the prince and the king have acted demeritoriously and deserve punishment. Thus all such people agree that the king and the prince acted in a relevantly free way.

One might take these passages to suggest that the freedom necessary and sufficient for merit and demerit is compatible with determination of the will by psychological causes. But this misses Arnauld’s point, and is an unlikely interpretation. To begin with, Arnauld surely realized that neither the lascivious prince nor the cruel tyrant infallibly act in the ways described, in any strict sense of the term. People do sometimes act out of character. Arnauld seems to think of infallibility, like its cousin, certainty, as a matter of degree. This is indicated by the phrase, “However infallible be the determination by which the will is determined with the attention of reason …” The certainty that the cruel king and the lascivious prince will act in the ways indicated is so high that one would say, in a loose and popular sense of the word, that infallibly the king will revenge himself and the prince satisfy his passion.

Arnauld’s point is not that the actions of the prince and the king are causally determined by psychological states antecedent to their volitions. In both cases he says that the action is free because the person could have willed not to perform the action, or again, because the person’s will was a potestas ad opposita. Arnauld’s point is that our certainty that the prince and the king will act in the ways described does not lessen our certainty that they will act freely. The same, he says, is true of our certainty that a meritorious act will be carried out as a result of efficacious grace, that is, as a result of God’s merciful will moving a person to that act. Arnauld claims that our certainty about the freedom of the act produced by efficacious grace, like our certainty about the freedom of the actions of the prince and the kind, is well grounded because in all of these cases, the person had the power to refrain from the act in question; in all of these cases, the person’s will is a facultas ad opposita.

There is, of course, an important difference between examples like those of the prince and the king, and example of an action to which one is moved by efficacious grace. In examples of the former sort, the action occurs only with very great, but not absolute, certainty, whereas in the case of efficacious grace, the action follows with absolute certainty upon God’s intention that it take place. This difference may seem to damage Arnauld’s case: One can plausibly say that it was within the power of the prince, for example, not to will to satisfy his lust, precisely because it was not absolutely certain that, in the given circumstances, he would do so. But no similar claim can be made about the person whom God moves, by efficacious grace, to elicit a meritorious volition. Yet Arnauld insists that in the latter case also, it is within the power of the person not to elicit the volition. It is at this point that Arnauld’s views about the mysteriousness of divine causality come into play. Our inability to understand how God moves a person to a meritorious volition, while leaving it within the person’s power not to elicit the volition, thus moving the person to will in a self-determining way, is not, in Arnauld’s view, surprising, for we are unable, in general, to understand how God produces effects outside of Himself.

Arnauld’s work between 1682 and 1694 is a testament to his intellectual vitality. It is remarkable that he was hard at work, until his death at the age of 82, on a set of connected controversies and issues, both philosophical and theological, having to do with creation, grace, and free will. Though he did not construct a philosophical system, he stands out in a century of geniuses for the vigorous and penetrating way in which he dealt with many of the important philosophers and philosophical problems of the time.


Arnauld’s Works

Principal Editions

  • Arnauld, Antoine, Oeuvres de Messire Antoine Arnauld (43 vols.) (edited by G. Du Pac De Bellegarde and J. Hautefage, with a Vie de Messire Antoine Arnauld by N. De Larrière) Paris-Lausanne: Sigismond D’Arnay et Cie 1775-83. Cited as OA.
  • Oeuvres Philosophiques d’Arnauld (6 vols.) (edited and introduced by Elmar J. Kremer and Denis Moreau) Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2003.

Other Editions of Works by Arnauld

  • Des vraies et des fausses idées, Librairie Arthème Fayard, 1986. (A reprinting of the original 1683 text, but without the pagination of the original)
  • Des vraies et des fausses idées, a critical edition by Denis Moreau, Paris, J. Vrin, 2011.
  • Examen d’un Ecrit qui a pour titre: Traité de l’essence du corps, et de l’union de l’ame avec le corps contre la philosophie de M. Descartes, Texte revu par Emmanuel Faye, Librairie Arthème Fayard, 1999.
  • Nouveau éléments de géometrie d’Arnauld, critical edition by Dominique Descotes, in Géometries du Port-Royal, Paris, Champion, 2009.
  • La logique ou l’Art de penser, Édition critique par Pierre Clair et François Girbal, Seconde édition revue,
  • La Logique ou l’art de penser, critical edition by Dominique Descartes, Paris, Champion, 2011.

English Translations of Arnauld’s Works

  • Arnauld, Antoine, and Lancelot, Claude, General and Rational Grammar: The Port-Royal Grammar, translated by Jacques Rieux and Bernard E. Rollin, The Hague: Mouton, 1975.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, The Art of Thinking, Port-Royal Logic, translated by James Dickhoff and Patricia James, New York: Library of Liberal Arts, 1964.
  • Arnauld, Antoine and Nicole, Pierre, Logic or the Art of Thinking, translated by Jill Vance Buroker, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, On True and False Ideas, translated by Elmar J. Kremer, Lewiston/Queenston: The Edwin Mellen Press, 1990.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, On True and False Ideas, translated by Stephen Gaukroger, Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1990.

Translation of Arnauld’s Works from Latin into French

  • Arnauld, Textes philosophiques, Introduction, traduction et notes par Denis Moreau, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2001.

Individual Works of Arnauld Cited

  • Défense contre la Réponse au Livre des vraies et des fausses Idées, OA, 38: 367–671.
  • De la fréquente communion, OA, 27: 71–673.
  • Des vraies et des fausses idées, OA, 38: 177–365.
  • Dissertation sur les Miracles de l’ancienne loi, OA, 38: 673–741.
  • Dissertatio theologica quadripartita, OA, 20: 159–314.
  • Examen d’un Ecrit qui a pour titre: Traité de l’essence du corps, et de l’union de l’âme avec le corps contre la philosophie de M. Descartes, OA, 38: 89–176.
  • Grammaire génerale et raisonnée, OA, 16: 3–82.
  • Instruction, par demandes & par réponses touchant l’accord de la Grace avec la liberté, OA, 10: 435–41.
  • Humanae Libertatis Notio, in Kremer and Moreau, Oeuvres Philosophiques d’Arnauld, 2003, end of Volume 6; and Moreau, Arnauld, Textes philosophiques, 2001, pp. 236–59.
  • De la liberté de l’homme, OA, 10: 610–14. (A French translation, by Pasquier Quesnel, of Humanae Libertatis Notio.)
  • La Logique ou l’Art de penser, OA, 16: 99–416.
  • Nouvelle Défense de la Traduction du Nouveau Testament imprimée a Mons contre M. Mallet, OA, 7: 67–915.
  • Nouveaux éléments de géométrie, OA, 42: 1–342.
  • Neuf lettres de M. Arnauld au R.P. Malebranche sur les idées génerales, la grâce et l’étendue intelligible, OA, 39: 1–153.
  • Première Apologie pour Jansénius, OA, 16: 39–323.
  • Réflexions philosophiques et théologiques sur le nouveau système de la nature et de la grâce, OA, 39: 155–848.
  • Règles du bon sens, OA, 40: 153–260.
  • Traduction du Discours latin prononcé par M. Arnauld en recevant le Bonnet de Docteur, OA, 43: 11–13.
  • Seconde Apologie pour Jansénius, OA, 17: 1–637.
  • Vera S. Thomae de gratia sufficiente et efficaci doctrina dilucide explanatae, OA, 20: 39–77.

Related Early Modern Works

  • La Bible, traduction de LeMaître De Sacy, (préface et textes d’introduction établis par Philippe Sellier) Paris: Robert Laffont, 1990.
  • The Philosophical Writings of Descartes (translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch) 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984–85. Cited as Descartes.
  • Briefwechsel Leibniz, Arnauld und dem Landgrafen Ernst von Hessen-Rheinfels, in Die philosophischen schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, herausgegeben von C. I. Gerhardt, Berlin, 1875–1890, reprint, Hildesheim: Georg Olms, 1965, volume 2. Cited as LA.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, Discourse on Metaphysics, Correspondence with Arnauld, Monadology, (translated by George R. Montgomery), LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court Publishing Co., 1950
  • –––, Theodicy, Essays on the Goodness of God, the Freedom of Man, and the Origin of Evil (translated by E. M. Huggard and edited with an introduction by Austin Farrer) La Salle, IL: Open Court Press, 1985.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, Oeuvres complètes de Malebranche, (direction: André Robinet) 20 volumes, Paris: J. Vrin, 1958–74. Cited as OM.
  • –––, Treatise on Nature and Grace (translated by Patrick Riley) Oxford: Clarendon University Press, 1992. (Riley translates an early edition of the Traité, which does not contain some texts on which Arnauld comments. Hence, I have given my own translation of the text found in volume 5 of OM.)
  • Molina, Luis de, On Divine Foreknowledge (Part IV of the Concordia), (translated, with an introduction and notes, by Alfred J. Freddoso), Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press, 1988.
  • Reid, Thomas, Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (1785), (edited by Derek R. Brookes) Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2002.

Secondary Works Cited

  • Faye, Emmanuel, 2005, “The Cartesianism of Desgabets and Arnauld and the Problem of Eternal Truths,” in D. Garber and S. Nadler (eds.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosphy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hacking, Ian, 1975a, The Emergence of Probability, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hacking, Ian, 1975b, Why Does Language Matter to Philosophy?, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Knox, R.A., 1950,Enthusiasm, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kremer, Elmar J., 1995, “L’Accord de la Grace avec la Liberte selon Arnauld,” Chroniques de Port-Royal, Antoine Arnauld (1612-1694) Philosophe, Ecrivain, Theologien, Paris: Bibliotheque Mazarine.
  • Kremer, Elmar J., 2000, “Malebranche on Human Freedom,” in S. Nadler (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Malebranche, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 1996, Interpreting Arnauld, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Moreau, Denis, 1999, Deux Cartésiens, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • –––, 2011, “La ‘Philosophie d’Antoine Arnauld’: Un Bilan,” in Chroniques de Port-royal, 115-128.
  • Moreau, Denis, 2004, Malebranche, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Marion, Jean-Luc, 1981, Sur la théologie blanche de Descartes, Paris: PUF.
  • Nadler, Steven, 1989, Arnauld and the Cartesian Philosophy of Ideas, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1995, “Occasionalism and the Question of Arnauld’s Cartesianism,” in Ariew, Roger and Grene, Marjorie, editors, Descartes and His Contemporaries, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, pp. 129–144.
  • –––, 2008, “Arnauld’s God,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, pp. 517–38.
  • Nelson, Alan, 1996, “The Falsity in Sensory Ideas: Descartes and Arnauld,” in Kremer (ed.) 1996, pp. 13–32.
  • Sleigh, Jr., R.C., 1996, “Arnauld on Efficacious Grace and Free Choice,” in Kremer (ed.) 1996, pp. 164–75.
  • –––, 1990, Leibniz and Arnauld, a Commentary on Their Correspondence, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Solère, Jean-Luc, 1996, “Arnauld versus Nicole: a Medieval Dispute,” in Kremer (ed.) 1996, pp. 127–46
  • Vansteenberghe, E., 1929, “Molinism,” in the Dictionnaire de Théologie Catholique, sous la direction de A. Vacant, E. Mangenot et É. Aman, Tome Dixième Paris-VI: Librairie Letouzey et Ané, cols. 2094–2187.

Other Recommended Secondary Works

  • Antoine Arnauld (1612–1694), Philosophe, Écrivain, Théologien, Chroniques de Port-Royal, Numéro 44, Paris: Bibliothèqie Mazarine, 1995.
  • Port-Royal et l’Oratoire, Chroniques de Port-Royal, Numéro 50, Paris: Bibliothèque Mazarine, 2001.
  • Kilcullen, John, 1988, Sincerity and Truth: Essays on Arnauld, Bayle and Toleration, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kremer, Elmar J. (ed.), 1994, The Great Arnauld and Some of His Philosophical Correspondents, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Laporte, Jean, 1922, La Doctrine de la Grace chez Arnauld, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.
  • Michon, Cyrille, 2013, “Le compatibilisme thomiste d’Antoine Arnauld,” Dix-septième siècle, 2(259): 265-279.
  • Ndiaye, A.-R., 1991, La Philosophie d’Antoine Arnauld, Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Paola, Nicolas, 2013, “Arnauld et la foi implicite: un refuge cartésien,” Dix-septième siècle, 2(259): 249-63.
  • Pariente, Jean-Claude, 1985, L’analyse du langage à Port-Royal, Paris: Les Editions du Minuit.
  • Schmaltz, Tad M., 2002, Radical Cartesianism, The French Reception of Descartes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Yolton, John, 1984, Perceptual Acquaintance from Descartes to Reid, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.


The author would like to thank Alfred J. Freddoso for his help with Section 6.2.

Copyright © 2017 by
Elmar Kremer <>

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