First published Sun Aug 30, 2015; substantive revision Fri Feb 5, 2021

This entry discusses philosophical idealism as a movement chiefly in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries, although anticipated by certain aspects of seventeenth century philosophy and continuing into the twentieth century. It revises the standard distinction between epistemological idealism, the view that the contents of human knowledge are ineluctably determined by the structure of human thought, and ontological idealism, the view that epistemological idealism delivers truth because reality itself is a form of thought and human thought participates in it, in favor of a distinction earlier suggested by A.C. Ewing, between epistemological and metaphysical arguments for idealism as itself a metaphysical position. After discussing precursors, the entry focuses on the eighteenth-century versions of idealism due to Berkeley, Hume, and Kant, the nineteenth-century movements of German idealism and subsequently British and American idealism, and then concludes with an examination of the attack upon idealism by Moore and Russell and the late defense of idealism by Brand Blanshard.

With the possible exception of the introduction (Section 1), each of the sections below can be read independently and readers are welcome to focus on the section(s) of most interest.

1. Introduction

The terms “idealism” and “idealist” are by no means used only within philosophy; they are used in many everyday contexts as well. Optimists who believe that, in the long run, good will prevail are often called “idealists”. This is not because such people are thought to be devoted to a philosophical doctrine but because of their outlook on life generally; indeed, they may even be pitied, or perhaps envied, for displaying a naïve worldview and not being philosophically critical at all. Even within philosophy, the terms “idealism” and “idealist” are used in different ways, which often makes their meaning dependent on the context. However, independently of context one can distinguish between a descriptive (or classificatory) use of these terms and a polemical one, although sometimes these different uses occur together. Their descriptive use is best documented by paying attention to the large number of different “idealisms” that appear in philosophical textbooks and encyclopedias, ranging from metaphysical idealism through epistemological and aesthetic to moral or ethical idealism. Within these idealisms one can find further distinctions, such as those between subjective, objective and absolute idealism, and even more obscure characterizations such as speculative idealism and transcendental idealism. It is also remarkable that the term “idealism”, at least within philosophy, is often used in such a way that it gets its meaning through what is taken to be its opposite: as the meaningful use of the term “outside” depends on a contrast with something considered to be inside, so the meaning of the term “idealism” is often fixed by what is taken to be its opposite. Thus, an idealist is someone who is not a realist, not a materialist, not a dogmatist, not an empiricist, and so on. Given the fact that many also want to distinguish between realism, materialism, dogmatism, and empiricism, it is obvious that thinking of the meaning of “idealism” as determined by what it is meant to be opposed to leads to further complexity and gives rise to the impression that underlying such characterizations lies some polemical intent.

Within modern philosophy there are sometimes taken to be two fundamental conceptions of idealism:

  1. something mental (the mind, spirit, reason, will) is the ultimate foundation of all reality, or even exhaustive of reality, and
  2. although the existence of something independent of the mind is conceded, everything that we can know about this mind-independent “reality” is held to be so permeated by the creative, formative, or constructive activities of the mind (of some kind or other) that all claims to knowledge must be considered, in some sense, to be a form of self-knowledge.

Idealism in sense (1) has been called “metaphysical” or “ontological idealism”, while idealism in sense (2) has been called “formal” or “epistemological idealism”. The modern paradigm of idealism in sense (1) might be considered to be George Berkeley’s “immaterialism”, according to which all that exists are ideas and the minds, less than divine or divine, that have them. (Berkeley himself did not use the term “idealism”.) The fountainhead for idealism in sense (2) might be the position that Immanuel Kant asserted (if not clearly in the first edition of his Critique of Pure Reason (1781) then in his Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783) and in the “Refutation of Idealism” in the second edition of the Critique) according to which idealism does “not concern the existence of things”, but asserts only that our “modes of representation” of them, above all space and time, are not “determinations that belong to things in themselves” but features of our own minds. Kant called his position “transcendental” and “critical” idealism, and it has also been called “formal” idealism. However, Kant’s position does not provide a clear model of idealism at all. While Kant himself claimed that his position combined “empirical realism” with “transcendental idealism”, that is, combined realism about external, spatio-temporal objects in ordinary life and science with the denial of the reality of space and time at the level of things as they are in themselves, it also insisted upon the reality of things as they are in themselves existing independently from our representations of them, thus denying their reducibility to representations or the minds that have them. In this way, Kant’s position actually combines the transcendental ideality of space and time with a kind of realism about the existence of things other than minds.

So instead of using Kant as any kind of model for epistemological idealism, in this entry we will distinguish between metaphysical and epistemological arguments for idealism understood as a metaphysical doctrine, namely that everything that exists is in some way mental. We thus agree with A.C. Ewing, who wrote in 1934 that all forms of idealism

have in common the view that there can be no physical objects existing apart from some experience, and this might perhaps be taken as the definition of idealism, provided that we regard thinking as part of experience and do not imply by “experience” passivity, and provided we include under experience not only human experience but the so-called “Absolute Experience” or the experience of a God such as Berkeley postulates. (Ewing 1934: 3)

in other words, while reducing all reality to some kind of perception is one form of idealism, it is not the only form—reality may be reduced to the mental on other conceptions of the latter. Thus Willem deVries’s more recent definition of idealism as the general theory that reduces reality to some form or other of the mental is just:

Roughly, the genus comprises theories that attribute ontological priority to the mental, especially the conceptual or ideational, over the non-mental. (deVries 2009: 211)

We also agree with Jeremy Dunham, Iain Hamilton Grant, and Sean Watson when they write that

the idealist, rather than being anti-realist, is in fact … a realist concerning elements more usually dismissed from reality. (Dunham, Grant, & Watson 2011: 4)

namely mind of some kind or other: the idealist denies the mind-independent reality of matter, but hardly denies the reality of mind (or, on their account, which goes back to Plato, Ideas or Forms as well as minds; we will not consider pre-modern forms of idealism in any detail). However, following Ewing (see his chapters II, IV–V, and VIII), we will distinguish metaphysical from epistemological arguments for idealism. Metaphysical arguments proceed by identifying some general constraints on existence and arguing that only minds of some sort or other satisfy such conditions; epistemological arguments work by identifying some conditions for knowledge and arguing that only objects that are in some sense or other mental can satisfy the conditions for being known. In particular, epistemological arguments for idealism assume that there is a necessary isomorphism between knowledge and its object that can obtain only if the object of knowledge is itself mental; we propose that this is the difference between epistemologically-motivated idealism and a more neutral position, which might be identified with philosophers such as Rudolf Carnap, W.V.O. Quine, and Donald Davidson, holding that of course we always know things from some point of view, but any “external” question about whether or not our point of view “corresponds” to independent reality is either meaningless or at least not answerable on theoretical grounds. It is in order to preserve the distinction between traditional idealism and positions such as the latter that we recommend retaining the claim that reality is in some way or other exclusively mental and thinking of epistemological arguments for idealism rather than epistemological idealism as such.

Of course these strategies can be combined by a single philosopher. Berkeley does so, and so does Kant in arguing for the transcendental idealist part of his complex position. Others separate them, for example F.H. Bradley and J.McT.E. McTaggart constructed metaphysical arguments for idealism, while Josiah Royce and Brand Blanshard offered epistemological arguments.

In what follows, we will concentrate mainly on the discussion of philosophical theories that either endorse or claim to endorse idealism on ontological and/or epistemological grounds. At some points in its complex history, however, above all in the social as well as philosophical movement that dominated British and American universities in the second half of the nineteenth century and through the first World War, idealism in either of its philosophical forms was indeed connected to idealism in the popular sense of progressive and optimistic social thought. This was true for figures such as Bradley and Royce and their predecessors and contemporaries such as Thomas Hill Green and Bernard Bosanquet. There has recently been considerable interest in British or more generally Anglophone idealism as a movement in social philosophy, or even a social movement, but we will not pursue that here (see Mander 2011; Boucher & Vincent 2012; Mander [ed.] 2000; and Mander & Panagakou [eds.] 2016).

Our distinctions between epistemological and ontological idealism, on the one hand, and that between metaphysical and epistemological arguments for idealism, on the other hand, has not always been clearly made. However, the American philosopher Josiah Royce pointed in the direction of our distinction at the end of the nineteenth century. On Royce’s definitions, epistemological idealism

involves a theory of the nature of our human knowledge; and various decidedly different theories are called by this name in view of one common feature, namely, the stress that they lay upon the “subjectivity” of a larger or smaller portion of what pretends to be our knowledge of things. (1892: xii–xiii)

Metaphysical idealism, he says, “is a theory as to the nature of the real world, however we may come to know that nature” (1892: xiii), namely, as he says quoting from another philosopher of the time,

the “belief in a spiritual principle at the basis of the world, without the reduction of the physical world to a mere illusion”. (1892: xiii; quoting Falckenberg 1886: 476).

But Royce then argued that epistemological idealism ultimately entails a foundation of metaphysical idealism, in particular that “the question as to how we ‘transcend’ the ‘subjective’ in our knowledge”, that is, the purely individual, although it exists for both metaphysical realists and idealists, can only be answered by metaphysical idealists (1892: xiv). We will argue similarly that while epistemology can entail idealism, on the assumption that the isomorphism between knowledge and the known must be in some sense necessary and that this can be so only if the known as well as knowledge is in some sense mental, this should be distinguished from the more general and extremely widespread view that our knowledge is always formed within our own point of view, conceptual framework, or web of belief. This view may well be the default position of much twentieth-century philosophy, “continental” as well as “analytic”, but does not by itself entail that reality is essentially mental.

Our distinction between epistemological and metaphysical arguments for idealism can also be associated with a distinction between two major kinds of motives for idealism: those which are grounded in self-conceptions, i.e., in convictions about the role that the self or the human being plays in the world, and those based on what might correspondingly be called world-convictions, i.e., on conceptions about the way the world is constituted objectively or at least appears to be constituted to a human subject. Concerning motives based on self-conceptions of human beings, idealism has seemed hard to avoid by many who have taken freedom in one of its many guises (freedom of choice, freedom of the will, freedom as autonomy) to be an integral part of any conception of the self worth pursuing, because the belief in the reality of freedom often goes together with a commitment to some version of mental causation, and it is tempting to think that the easiest (or at least the most economical) way to account for mental causation consists in “mentalizing” or idealizing all of reality, thus leading to ontological idealism, or at least to maintain that the kind of causal determinism that seems to conflict with freedom is only one of our ways of representing the world, thus leading to epistemological idealism. Motives for idealism based on world-convictions can be found in many different attitudes towards objectivity. If one is to believe in science as the best and only way to get an objective (subject-independent) conception of reality, one might still turn to idealism, at least epistemological idealism, because of the conditions supposed to be necessary in order to make sense of the very concept of a law (of nature) or of the normativity of logical inferences for nature itself. If one believes in the non-conventional reality of normative facts one might also be drawn to idealism in order to account for their non-physical reality—Plato’s idealism, which asserts the reality of non-physical Ideas to explain the status of norms and then reduces all other reality to mere simulacra of the former might be considered a forerunner of ontological idealism motivated by concern for the reality of norms. An inclination toward idealism might even arise from considerations pertaining to the ontological status of aesthetic values (is beauty an objective attribute of objects?) or from the inability or the unwillingness to think of the constitution of social and cultural phenomena like society or religion in terms of physical theory. In short: There are about as many motives and reasons for endorsing idealism as there are different aspects of reality to be known or explained.

Although we have just referred to Plato, the term “idealism” became the name for a whole family of positions in philosophy only in the course of the eighteenth century. Even then, those whom critics called “idealists” did not identify themselves as such until the time of Kant, and no sooner did the label come into use than did those to whom it was applied or who used it themselves attempt to escape it or refine it. As already mentioned, Berkeley, the paradigmatic idealist in the British tradition, did not use the name for his own position, which he called rather immaterialism; and Leibniz, at least some versions of whose monadology might be considered idealist, also did not call his position by that name. Rather, in contrasting Epicurus with Plato, Leibniz called the latter an idealist and the former a materialist, because according to him idealists like Plato hold that “everything occurs in the soul as if there were no body” whereas on the materialism of Epicurus “everything occurs in the body as if there were no soul” (“Reply to the Thoughts on the System of Pre-established Harmony contained in the Second Edition of Mr. Bayle’s Critical Dictionary, Article Rorarius”, 1702, PPL: 578), although in this text Leibniz also says that his own view combines both of these positions. It seems to have been Christian Wolff who first used “idealism” explicitly as a classificatory term. Wolff, often considered the most dedicated Leibnizian of his time (although in fact his position was more eclectic than at least some versions of Leibniz’s) set out to integrate the terms “idealism” and “materialism” into his taxonomy of philosophical attitudes of those “who strive towards the knowledge and philosophy of things” in the Preface to the other [second] Edition of his so-called German Metaphysics [Vernünfftige Gedancken von Gott, der Welt und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt, den Liebhabern der Wahrheit mitgetheilet (Halle: Carl Hermann Hemmerde, 1747)]. Wolff distinguishes between two basic attitudes, one of which he sees exemplified by the skeptic, the other by what he calls “the dogmatist”. The skeptic doubts the possibility of knowledge in general and thus refuses to defend any positive claim at all. By contrast, the dogmatist puts forward positive doctrines, and these can be divided into those which posit as fundamental either one single kind of entities [Art der Dinge] or two different kinds. Wolff names the supporters of the first position “monists” and the adherents of the second “dualists”. This amounts to the division of all dogmatic doctrines, i.e., all knowledge-claims with respect to the ultimate constitution of reality, into monistic and dualistic theories. Here is where the term “idealist” then makes its appearance in Wolff’s typology: he distinguishes within the monists between idealists and materialists. Idealists “concede only spirits or else those things that do not consist of matter”, whereas materialists “do not accept anything in philosophy other than the corporeal and take spirits and souls to be a corporeal force”. Dualists, on the contrary, are happy “to accept both bodies and spirits as real and mutually independent things”. Wolff then goes on to distinguish within idealism between “egoism” and “pluralism”, depending on whether an idealist thinks just of himself as a real entity or whether he will allow for more than one (spiritual) entity; the first of these positions would also come to be called solipsism, so that solipsism would be a variety of (ontological) idealism but not all idealism would be solipsism.

Wolff’s way of classifying a philosophical system was enormously influential in eighteenth-century Continental philosophy—for example, it was closely followed by Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten in his 1739 Metaphysica, which was in turn used by Kant as the textbook for his metaphysics (and anthropology) lectures throughout his career, and whose definition of dogmatic idealism, as contrasted to his own “transcendental” or “critical” idealism, would also be that it is the position according to which there are only minds—and so it is no surprise that almost all talk about idealism was heavily influenced by Wolff’s characterization. This is so because it reflects the main metaphysical disputes in seventeenth- and early eighteenth-century philosophy on the Continent quite well. In terms of Wolff’s distinctions, these disputes can be framed as disputes between (a) monists and dualists and (b) idealists and materialists; positions in this debate were often influenced by perplexities surrounding the (ontological) question of the interaction of substances, although they were also influenced by the (epistemological) debate over innatism. Although neither dualism, whose main representative was Descartes (who asserted the existence of both res cogitans and res extensa), nor monism, allegedly though debatably represented by Spinoza in its materialistic version (substantia, deus, natura) and by Leibniz in its idealistic form (monad, entelechy, simple substance) succeeded in finding satisfying answers to this and related questions, in the early modern era these disputes shaped the conception of what the object of metaphysics (metaphysica generalis sive ontologia) was supposed to be.

2. Idealism in Early Modern Rationalism

Prior to Wolff, neither defending nor refuting idealism seems to have been a central issue for rationalist philosophers, and none of them called themselves idealists. Yet what are by later lights idealistic tendencies can nevertheless be found among them.

While Descartes’s “first philosophy” clearly defends dualism, he takes his target to be skepticism rather than idealism, and thus is from our point of view concerned to resist the adoption of epistemological grounds; Spinoza is often though controversially thought to defend a form of materialism, but takes his primary target to be pluralism as contrasted to monism; and Leibniz does not seem overly worried about choosing between idealist and dualist forms of his “monadology”, while his famous thesis that each monad represents the entire universe from its own point of view might be taken to be a form of epistemological ground for idealism, but Leibniz does not seem to conceive of it as such. Nicolas Malebranche’s theory of “seeing all things in God” might be the closest we find to an explicit assertion in seventeenth-century philosophy of an argument for idealism on both epistemological and ontological grounds, and thus as a forerunner of the “absolute” idealism of the nineteenth century. While from a later point of view it may seem surprising that these rationalists were not more concerned with explicitly asserting or refuting one or both versions of idealism, perhaps they were more concerned with theological puzzles about the nature and essence of God, metaphysical questions as to how to reconcile the respective conception of God with views about the interaction of substances of fundamentally different kinds, and epistemological problems as to the possibility of knowledge and cognitive certainty than they were worried about whether the ultimate constituents of reality were mental or material elements.

However, if one were to situate their thoughts within the framework provided by Wolff it is not that difficult to find traces of idealism derived from both ontological and epistemological grounds in their respective positions. With respect to their metaphysical or ontological teachings, this claim may seem surprising. Whereas according to Wolff idealists are representatives of a species of metaphysical monism Descartes is one of the most outspoken metaphysical dualists. Hence to impute idealistic tendencies to Descartes’ metaphysics looks like a mistake. And in the case of Spinoza one could argue that although he definitely is a (very radical) monist and thus could count as an idealist within Wolff’s taxonomy, he is traditionally considered to be rather a materialist in Wolff’s sense. Consequently, it appears as if already for conceptual reasons there is no basis to burden either Descartes or Spinoza with idealism as defined by Wolff. Leibniz, meanwhile, often seems unwilling to commit himself to idealism even though that is the most natural interpretation of his monadology, while only Malebranche, as noted, seems to come close to explicitly asserting epistemological and perhaps ontological arguments for idealism as well.

Nevertheless, both Descartes and Spinoza provide a starting point for their metaphysical doctrines with their conceptions of God, a starting point that is already infected with idealistic elements if idealism is understood as implying a commitment to the primacy or at least the unavoidability and irreducibility of mental items in the constitution and order of things in general. Both agree that in order to gain insight into the constitution of the world one has to find out what God wants us, or maybe better: allows us to know about it (see, e.g., Descartes: Meditations IV, 7–8 and especially 13; Spinoza: Ethics I, XVI). They also agree that the world is created by God although they have different views as to what this means. Whereas Descartes thinks of God as existing outside the world of the existing things He created (see Meditations III, 13 and 22) Spinoza holds that whatever exists is just a peculiar way in which God is present (see Ethics I, XXV, Corollary). Of all existing things all that God permits us to know clearly and distinctly is (again according to both Descartes and Spinoza) that their nature consists either in thinking or in extension. This claim can be seen as providing in the case of Descartes the basis for his justification of ontological dualism. His distinction between extended and thinking substances is not just meant to give rise to a complete classification of all existing things in virtue of their main attributes but also to highlight the irreducibility of mental (thinking) substances to physical or corporeal (extended) substances because of differences between their intrinsic natures (see, e.g., Meditations VI, 19, and Principles of Philosophy I, 51–54). In the case of Spinoza thinking and extension not only refer to attributes of individual things but primarily to attributes of God (see Ethics II, Proposition I, II, and VII, Scholium), making them the fundamental ways in which God himself expresses his nature in each individual thing. This move gives rise to his ontological monism because he can claim that all individual things are just modes in which God’s presence is expressed according to these attributes.

Although the idea that God is the creator of the world of individual existing things (Descartes) or that God himself is manifested in every individual existing thing (Spinoza) might already be considered to be sufficient as a motivating force for subsequent disputes as to the true nature of reality and thus might have given rise to what were then called “idealistic” positions in ontology, other peculiarities within Descartes’ and Spinoza’s position might well have led to the same result, i.e., to the adoption of idealism on ontological grounds. Especially their disagreement about God’s corporeality might have been such a motive. Whereas Descartes vigorously denies the corporeality of God (Principles of Philosophy I, 23) and hence could be seen as endorsing idealism, Spinoza vehemently insists on God’s corporeality (Ethics I, Proposition XV, Scholium) and thus could be taken to be in favor of materialism.

Things are different when it comes to epistemological grounds for idealism. It seems to be very difficult to connect Descartes’ and Spinoza’s views concerning knowledge with conceptions according to which knowledge has something to do with a cognizing subject actively contributing to the constitution of the object of knowledge. This is so because both Descartes and Spinoza think of cognition as a result of a process in which we become aware of what really is the case independently of us both with respect to the nature of objects and with respect to their conceptual and material relations. Descartes and Spinoza take cognition to be a process of grasping clear and distinct ideas of what is the true character of existing things rather than a process of contributing to the formation of their nature. According to Descartes the sources of our knowledge of things are our abilities to have intuitions of the simple nature of things and to draw conclusions from these intuitions via deduction (Rules for the Direction of the Mind III, 4 ff.). For him the cognitive procedure is a process of discovery (see Discourse on the Method, Part 6, 6) of what already is out there as the real nature of things created by God by finding out the clear and distinct ideas we can have of them (Discourse, Part 4, 3 and 7). In a similar vein Spinoza thinks of knowledge as an activity that in its highest form as intuitive (or third genus of) cognition leads to an adequate insight into the essence of things (Ethics II, Proposition XL, Scholium II, and Ethics V, Propositions XXV–XXVIII), an insight that gives rise to general concepts (notiones communes) on which ratiocinationes, i.e., the processes of inference and deduction, are based (Ethics II, Proposition XL, Scholium I) the results of which provide the second genus of cognition (ratio). Thus the problem for both Descartes and Spinoza is not so much that of the epistemologically motivated idealist, i.e., to uncover what we contribute through our cognitive faculties to our conception of an object, rather their problem is to determine how it comes that we very often have a distorted view of what there is and are accordingly led to misguided beliefs and errors. Given what they take to be a basic fact that God has endowed us with the capacity to know the truth (albeit within certain limits), i.e., to know to a certain degree how or what things really are, this interest in the possibility of error makes perfectly good sense (Meditations IV, 3–17; Principles of Philosophy I, 70–72; Ethics II, Proposition 49, Scholium).

In his project for a “universal characteristic”, Leibniz can be regarded as having taken great interest in a method for inquiry, but he does not seem to have taken much interest in the epistemological issue of skepticism or the possibility of knowledge, and thus did not explicitly characterize his famous “monadology” as a form of an epistemological ground for idealism. But he did take a great interest in the ontology of substances, God the infinite substance and everything else as finite substances (in contrast to Spinoza, he rejected monism). Yet while the logic of his monadology clearly points toward idealism, Leibniz frequently attempted to avoid this conclusion. One explicitly ontological argument for the monadology that Leibniz often deploys is that, on pain of infinite regress, everything composite must ultimately consist of simples, but that since space and time are infinitely divisible extended matter cannot be simple while thoughts, even with complex content, do not literally have parts, nor do the minds that have them, so minds, or monads, are the only candidates for the ultimate constituents of reality. Thus the late text entitled “The Monadology” begins with the assertions that

The monad which we are here to discuss is nothing but a simple substance which enters into compounds,


There must be simple substances, since there are compounds, [and] the compounded is but a collection or an aggregate of simples,

but that

where there are no parts, it is impossible to have either extension, or figure, or divisibility

and conversely where there is simplicity there cannot be extension or figure or divisibility (§§1–3). Yet monads must have some qualities in order to exist (§8) and to differ from one another, as they must (§9), and if the fundamental properties of matter are excluded, this leaves the fundamental properties of mind, which Leibniz holds to be perception, “The passing state which enfolds and represents a multitude in unity” (§14) and appetition, “the internal principle which brings about change or the passage from one perception to another” (§15; all from PPL: 643–4). This argument clearly seems to imply that all finite substances are ultimately mental in nature (and the infinite substance, God, is obviously mental in nature), thus it seems to be a paradigmatic ontological argument for idealism, from which an epistemological argument for idealism would automatically follow, since if there is knowledge of reality at all, which Leibniz hardly seems to doubt, and reality is ultimately mental, then knowledge too must be of the mental.

Yet Leibniz often seems to avert such a conclusion by appeal to his idea of “pre-established harmony”, and this is possible because he himself interprets this idea in two different ways. Early in his career, in such texts as “Primary Truths” (1680–84) and the “Discourse on Metaphysics” (1686) (both texts unpublished in Leibniz’s lifetime and not known to his immediate successors such as Wolff and Baumgarten), Leibniz introduces the doctrine of pre-established harmony on truth-theoretical grounds. His argument is that everything that is true of a substance is so because the predicate of a true proposition is contained in the complete concept of its subject and because that complete concept reflects the properties or “traces” in the substance that is that subject; that there are true propositions linking every substance in the world to every other, thus the complete concept of each substance must be a complete concept of the universe itself and each substance must bear within itself as properties traces of every other in the universe; and thus that each substance must reflect, or, as mental, represent the entire universe. Yet since (finite) substances are also defined as existing independently of one another (although not existing independently from the infinite substance, God), there is a question as to why each should truthfully represent all the others, which Leibniz answers by appeal to the idea of a pre-established harmony: although considered from the point of view of the concept of substance it does not seem necessary that every substance truly represent all the others, in his goodness, thus in his preference for a maximally harmonious world, God has nevertheless made it such that they do.

In this mood, Leibniz tends to explain the existence of body as an artifact of the fact that each monad represents the world from its own point of view: physical locations and the bodies that occupy them are just the way in which the difference in the points of view of the monads is represented by them, but have no deeper reality; or, as Leibniz often says, space, spatiality, and bodies are just phenomena bene fundata, i.e., “well-founded modes of our consideration” (PPL: 270).

However, sometimes Leibniz writes as if space and time are not merely the way in which the pre-established harmony among monads presents itself to (their) consciousness, but as if the mental and physical or extended are two separate realms, each evolving entirely in accordance with its own laws, but with a pre-established harmony between them creating the appearance of interaction. Perhaps Leibniz was genuinely undecided between two interpretations of the pre-established harmony and two conceptions of the reality of body, sometimes being a committed idealism and sometimes a dualist. (As we will see later, even among the most committed absolute idealists of the nineteenth century it is not always clear whether they are actually denying the existence of matter or only subordinating it to mind in one way or another).

Leibniz’s monadology could thus be seen as a forerunner of both epistemological and ontological arguments for idealism, and his conception of space and time as phenomena bene fundata was clearly a forerunner of Kant’s transcendental idealism. But as we have just seen, he did not himself unequivocally affirm idealism, and as we will shortly see subsequent Leibnizians such as Alexander Baumgarten argued for dualism and for a corresponding interpretation of pre-established harmony. Nicolas Malebranche was also a dualist, committed to the existence of both mind and body, and an occasionalist, who held that since causation is necessary connection and the only truly necessary connection is between God’s intentions and their effects, bodies cannot directly cause modifications of minds (or each other) but rather there can be a causal relation between body and mind only if God intends the mind to undergo a certain modification upon the occasion of a certain change in a body (hence the term “occasionalism”). This is a metaphysical argument. His further doctrine that the mind sees all things in God, however, can be seen as an epistemological argument, for it depends on his particular view of what modifications the mind undergoes in perception. He holds that sensations are literally modifications in the mind, but that they are highly indeterminate, or in later terminology lack determinate intentional objects, and that genuine understanding occurs only when and to the extent that the determinate ideas in the perfect intellect of God are disclosed to finite, human minds, to the extent that they are. Malebranche’s position can be considered a theological form of Platonism: Plato held that the true Ideas or Forms of things have a kind of perfection that neither ordinary objects nor representations of them in human minds do, and therefore must exist someplace else; Malebranche takes the obvious further step of supposing that perfect ideas can exist only in the perfect intellect of God. He then supposes that human thought is intelligible to the extent that these ideas are disclosed to it, on the occasion of various sensations themselves occasioned by God but not literally through those sensations. The crucial point is that genuine understanding consists in the apprehension of ideas, even though these are literally in the mind of God rather than of individual human beings, rather than of physical objects, even though the latter do exist. Malebranche had significant influence on both Berkeley and Hume, although neither the former and certainly not the latter accepted his position in its entirety. His position that knowledge consists in individual minds apprehending ideas in some greater mind would also be recreated by idealists as late as T.H. Green and Josiah Royce in the second half of the nineteenth century, as we will later see.

Before we turn to British or Anglophone versions of idealism, earlier or later, one last word about idealism within pre-Kantian rationalist philosophy is in order. As earlier mentioned, dualism rather than idealism became the default position of the German successors to Leibniz, the so-called “Leibnizo-Wolffians” who dominated the teaching of philosophy in many German universities for fifty years from the third decade of the eighteenth century until the time of Kant and in some cases even beyond, and they correspondingly opted for the interpretation of the pre-established harmony as a relation between minds and bodies rather than among minds or monads alone. It may also be noted that defending dualism by means of an explicit “refutation of idealism” became the norm among these philosophers. This may be seen in Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten’s Metaphysica of 1739, which would become Kant’s textbook for his lecture courses in metaphysics and “anthropology” (empirical psychology) until the very end of the eighteenth century. Baumgarten accepts that the ultimate constituents of the world must be simples, hence monads of some kind. But he does not suppose that monads are necessarily minds or intellects, hence a dualism of monads is at least possible. Idealism would be the position that there are only intellectual monads; he says that

An intellectual substance, i.e., a substance endowed with intellect, is a spirit (an intelligence, a person)…. Whoever admits only spirits in this world is an idealist. (Metaphysics, §402, pp. 175–6)

Baumgarten follows Wolff in distinguishing between two possible forms of idealism, first egoism, which admits the existence of only one spirit, that of the person contemplating such a doctrine, and then idealism proper, which allows the existence of multiple spirits. But both are refuted by the same argument. This argument builds on a Leibnizian principle not hitherto mentioned, the principle of plenitude, or the principle that the perfection of the most perfect world, which is the one that God created, consists in the maximal variety of the universe compatible with its unity or coherence (e.g., “Monadology”, §58, PPL: 648), which was in turn the basis of one of Leibniz’s arguments for the identity of indiscernibles. Baumgarten then argues simply that a universe that contains not only more substances but also more kinds of substances rather than fewer is a more perfect universe, and necessarily exists in preference to the other; and a universe that contains not only multiple minds rather than a single mind but also bodies in addition to minds is therefore a more perfect universe than either of the former would be, and is therefore the kind of world that actually exists. In his words,

the egotistical world, such as an egoist posits, is not the most perfect. And even if there is only one non-intellectual monad possible in itself that is compossible with spirits in the world, whose perfection either subtracts nothing from the perfection of the spirits, or does not subtract from the perfection of the spirits so much as it adds to the perfection of the whole, then the idealistic world, such as is posited by the idealist, is not the most perfect, (Metaphysics, §438, [2013: 183])

and hence not the kind of world that exists. No one outside of the immediate sphere of Leibnizianism would ever again proffer such a refutation of idealism. But both Baumgarten’s recognition of idealism and his refutation of it in a university textbook make it clear that by the middle of the eighteenth century idealism had become a standard topic for philosophical discussion, a position it would retain for another century and a half or more.

3. Idealism in Early Modern British philosophy

The relation between ontological and epistemological arguments for idealism is complex. Idealism can be argued for on ontological grounds, and then bring an epistemological argument in its train. Or an epistemological argument can be offered independently of ontological assumptions but lead to idealism, especially in the hope of avoiding skepticism. The first option may have been characteristic of some rationalists, such as Leibniz in his more strictly idealist mood. Both forms of argument are found within early modern British philosophy. We find epistemological considerations pushing toward idealism in both Hobbes and Locke in spite of the avowed materialism of the first and dualism of the second, who therefore obviously did not call themselves idealists. Berkeley argues for idealism on epistemological grounds and then adds ontological considerations in order to avert skepticism, although he calls his position immaterialism rather than idealism. Berkeley’s contemporary Arthur Collier, who explicitly denies the existence of mind-independent matter without giving his own position a name, argues first in an epistemological mood, then moves from epistemology to ontology. Hume, by contrast, although calling himself neither an immaterialist nor an idealist, nevertheless adopts epistemological arguments for idealism similar to some of Berkeley’s, but then uses that position as the basis for a critique of traditional metaphysical pretensions, including those to idealism—while also being drawn to idealism in resistance to what he regards as the natural tendency to dualism. Hume’s critical attitude toward metaphysics is subsequently taken up by Kant, although Kant famously asserts on practical grounds some of the very same metaphysical theses that he argues cannot be asserted on theoretical grounds.

The British philosophers were all hostile toward dogmatic metaphysics in Wolff’s sense, although until the time of Hume, who had some familiarity with Leibniz, the metaphysics with which they were familiar were those of Descartes, Aristotelian scholasticism, and Neo-Platonism, which had become domesticated in Britain through the work of the Cambridge Platonists in the second half of the seventeenth century. All of these movements fed into the general movement of rationalism, while the British philosophers, typically lumped together under the rubric of empiricism in spite of their own differences, all believed, albeit for different reasons, that the doctrines put forward by dogmatic metaphysicians rest on a totally unfounded conception of knowledge and cannot survive rational scrutiny (empiricists might themselves be considered critical rationalists). Thus the primary task of philosophy for these philosophers became that of providing a theory of knowledge based on an adequate assessment of the constitution of human nature, for they were interested in knowledge only as a human achievement. However, it is not human nature in general that is of interest in this context but the workings of those human powers or faculties that are responsible for our human ability to relate to the world in terms of knowledge-claims. (Thus Kant’s attempt to argue on practical grounds for metaphysical theses that could not be justified on theoretical grounds would be a major departure from the methods of the British empiricists.) These faculties were attributed by the British as well as their Continental opponents to what was called “spirit” or “mind” (mens, consciousness, Bewußtsein), an attribution which resulted in moving the “operations of the mind” into the center of philosophical attention. Reflections on the conditions of the possibility of knowledge led Hobbes and Locke to idealism in spite of their ontological commitments to materialism or dualism respectively, while Berkeley concluded that their epistemology would lead to a skepticism that could be avoided only by his own more radical “immaterialist” ontology. Hume’s position remains complex and for this reason controversial. His thesis that our beliefs in causation, external objects, and even the self are all founded on “custom” and imagination rather than “reason” may be considered an epistemological position without ontological implications, thus not an argument for idealism; but while he sometimes seems to attempt to avoid commitment on ontological questions altogether, at other times, as in his argument that the existence of external objects in addition to our impressions is only a fiction, he seems to infer idealism from his epistemology. In spite of their differences, almost all British philosophers from Hobbes up to and including Hume insisted that the highest priority for philosophy is to give an analysis of the conditions and the origin of knowledge, while they gave not only somewhat different accounts of what these conditions consist in and how they contribute to a convincing story about the origin of knowledge but they also had to face quite interesting “metaphysical” consequences from their respective accounts.

This is easily confirmed by looking briefly at some of their main convictions concerning knowledge, starting with Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679). As Hobbes points out in the chapters Of Philosophy and Of Method in the first part (Computation or Logic) of the first section (Concerning Body) of his Elements of Philosophy (1655), knowledge is the result of the manipulation of sensory input based on the employment of logical rules of reasoning (ratiocination) in acts of what he calls “computation”. He describes the details of this process most succinctly in a short passage in chapter 6 of the first part (Human Nature) of his The Elements of Law, Natural and Politic (1640), his first major philosophical work. After distinguishing what he calls “sense, or knowledge original” from “knowledge … which we call science”, he goes on to “define” knowledge “to be evidence of truth, from some beginning or principle of sense” and formulates four principles that are constitutive of knowledge:

The first principle of knowledge therefore is that we have such and such conceptions; the second, that we have thus and thus named the things whereof they are conceptions; the third is, that we have joined those names in such manner, as to make true propositions; the fourth and last is, that we have joined those propositions in such manner as they be concluding. (1640: I.6.4)

The message is straightforward with respect to both the basis and the formation of knowledge: senses (sensations) are basic to our acquisition of knowledge in that they lead to conceptions (representations) to which we attach names (concepts) which we then put together into propositions which, if true, already constitute knowledge, and from which there arise further knowledge if we draw conclusions in an orderly way from them.

Although the account given by Hobbes of the origin and the formation of knowledge is rightly called empiricist because it traces all knowledge back to the senses or sensations and their non-sensory causes, i.e., to what he calls “things without us”, it is by no means directly committed to either idealism or dualism; on the contrary, Hobbes’s preferred ontological position is materialism. Nevertheless, his account may lead to an early form of epistemologically motivated idealism. This is so because although Hobbes makes no claims as to either the constitution and the reality of what causes sensations or to any specific contribution on the part of the subject of knowledge to what we take to be the “accidents or qualities” of objects, he states, again most explicitly in the part on Human Nature in The Elements of Law, (1) that there are causes of our sensations which by way of their motions give rise to what we sense as qualities, but (2) that these qualities only have the status of “seemings and apparitions”. In his own words: “The things that really are in the world without us, are those motions by which these seemings are caused” (Elements of Law, I.2.10). While he is confident that there are external objects, and thus has no intention of affirming idealism, nevertheless because in Hobbes’s opinion we could have conceptions of these seemings even if there were no objects around (Elements of Law I.1.8) there is for him no basis on which to found any metaphysical claims to the real existence of an external world or any epistemological basis for claiming knowledge of the real constitution of a subject-independent world or its real existence. Thus, Hobbes’s epistemology allows him at most agnosticism about the existence of objects other than our representations of them, even if it does not force him into outright idealism. This is nicely confirmed by a passage from part II (The First Grounds of Philosophy) where he declares:

Now things may be considered, that is, be brought into account, either as internal accidents of our mind, in which manner we consider them when the question is about some faculty of the mind; or as species of external things, not as really existing, but appearing only to exist, or to have a being without us [emphasis added]. And in this manner we are now to consider them. (Elements of Law II.7.1)

In spite of a pre-reflective disposition toward dualism, an explicit argument for an agnostic attitude with respect to the ultimate constitution of reality is also characteristic of John Locke (1632–1704). Already in The Epistle to the Reader of An Essay concerning Human Understanding (1690) he denounces rationalist metaphysics as a “Sanctuary of Vanity and Ignorance” and declares in the first book of his Essay right at the outset:

I shall not at present meddle with the physical consideration of the mind; or trouble myself to examine, wherein its essence consists, or by what motions of our spirits, or alterations of our bodies, we come to have any sensation by our organs, or any ideas in our understandings; and whether those ideas do in their formation, any, or all of them, depend on matter or no [emphasis added]: These are speculations, which, however curious and entertaining, I shall decline. (Book I, chap. I, 2; see also II.XXI.73)

Instead he restricts his investigation to the “purpose to enquire into the original, certainty, and extent of human knowledge” (Essay I.I.2). Such an investigation presupposes an acquaintance with our own minds, and thus according to Locke the most pressing task is to understand the mind or the understanding itself. And because for Locke the sole material the mind has the ability to process are ideas, the most pressing task if one wants to understand the possibility of knowledge is to give an account of “how he [the mind] comes by them [the ideas]” (Essay II.I.1). There is no need to go into the details of Locke’s conception of how the mind gets ideas and what the understanding does with them in order to arrive at knowledge. Although his description of these processes differs in some interesting ways from the model Hobbes proposes, in the end both Hobbes and Locke share the view (1) that whatever we can know depends on our having ideas which must be somehow based in sensation, (2) that there must be some external cause (Hobbes) or some source of affection (Locke) which gives rise to sensory ideas, yet (3) ultimately we are ignorant about the real constitution of these causes and these sources. What we know is the content and structure of our own ideas, although we have no reason to deny the existence of external objects and even assume that in some regards external objects resemble our ideas of them (in the case of primary qualities).

Obviously it is mainly point (3) that is of importance for the question of whether dualism or idealism is involved in Locke’s version of the operations of the mind. Again, as in the case of Hobbes, it seems that Locke’s position is meant to be neutral against and compatible with all these alternatives and that he wishes to stay agnostic with respect to them. This is indicated especially well by his theory of substance and his remarks concerning the limits of knowledge. Substances, Locke famously holds,

are such combinations of simple Ideas, as are taken to represent distinct particular things subsisting by themselves. (Essay II.XII.6)

If one analyzes our concept of a substance one

will find he has no other Idea of it at all, but only a Supposition of he knows not what support of such qualities, which are capable of producing simple Ideas in us. (Essay II.XXIII.2)

The reasons for this supposition are two: (1) we cannot make sense of the concept of an unsupported quality or of ideas subsisting by themselves, (2) we know from experience that “a certain number of these simple Ideas go constantly together” or “exist together” (Essay II.XXIII.2–3). Although Locke thinks of these reasons as totally compelling, he sees quite well that they do not justify any claim as to what a substance or a thing really is, what its nature or constitution consists in. Thus he never gets tired of emphasizing that we only have a confused idea of substance (a claim also made by Leibniz about three-quarters of our knowledge, although he held that we have a clear concept of what substance is), and repeats quite often (at least three times in Essay book II, chap. XXIII alone) that

Whatever therefore be the secret, abstract nature of substance in general, all the ideas we have of particular distinct sorts of substances, are nothing but several combinations of simple ideas, co-existing in such, though unknown, cause of their union, as makes the whole subsist of itself. (Essay II.XXIII.6)

He restricts this agnostic attitude not just to corporeal substances or bodies but extends it to spiritual substances or minds as well:

It is plain then, that the idea of corporeal substance in matter is as remote from our conceptions and apprehensions, as that of spiritual substance or spirit; and therefore from our not having any notion of the substance of spirit, we can no more conclude its non-existence, than we can for the same reason deny the existence of body; it being as rational to affirm there is no body, because we have no clear and distinct idea of the substance of matter, as to say there is no spirit, because we have no clear and distinct idea of the substance of a spirit. (Essay II.XXIII.5)

This criticism of any metaphysical claims concerning the ultimate constitution of reality is accompanied by a more general warning against the overstepping of the natural limits of our cognitive faculties. According to Locke it is just a fact about human nature that there are limits to the powers of the understanding. These powers are meant to be bestowed to us by God to an extent sufficient for us to know “Whatever is necessary for the Conveniences of Life, and Information of Virtue” (Essay I.I.5; see also II.XXIII.12) but only to that extent. If therefore the nature and the constitution of substances both corporeal and spiritual are beyond our cognitive grasp then we should take this to be a hint that God has set limits to what we can know because he sees no reason for us to know everything. Even if the powers He endowed on us would be magnified infinitely we still would remain clueless as to what substances really are because we still would be stuck in a world of qualities (this is one way of reading Essay II.XXIII.12). Thus, in the end metaphysical knowledge of any kind is meant to be beyond our reach. This, however, is nothing we should be concerned about:

For, though the comprehension of our understandings comes exceeding short of the vast extent of things; yet we shall have cause enough to magnify the bountiful author of our being, for that proportion and degree of knowledge he has bestowed on us, so far above all the rest of the inhabitants of this our mansion. (Essay I.I.5)

For Locke, ontological agnosticism is an expression of piety. Locke’s position may be regarded as a theological expression of the most fundamental epistemological motivation for idealism: no matter how much we know about objects and at what level of detail, we still know them only from our own, human point of view, but whether objects exist beyond our experience of them is really none of our business. But neither is Locke prepared to assert that only spirits or minds exist; that too would exceed the bounds of human knowledge.

The agnosticism with respect to the ultimate constitution of substances and things or of the fundamentum in re of “the ideas thereof” characteristic of Hobbes and Locke is challenged forcefully by George Berkeley (1685–1753), for whom their agnosticism becomes a form of skepticism and even impiety. In his Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge (1710) he raises doubts about whether an agnostic stance along the lines of Hobbes and Locke can be upheld consistently if one thinks about the origin and the properties of ideas the way they do. Although in his Treatise Berkeley does not mention Hobbes at all and addresses Locke not by his name but by formulas like “esteemed philosopher” and “learned author” (1710: Introduction, §11) very few times, it is abundantly clear that he wants to confront especially Locke with a painful choice: either his conception of a substance or a thing has “no distinct meaning annexed to” it (1710: Part I, §17) and is nonsense, or he has to endorse not just epistemological agnosticism but full-blown idealism or, in Berkeley’s term, immaterialism. In other words, Berkeley’s point is that Locke cannot afford to be agnostic with respect to the metaphysical status of substances and things if he wants us to think of ideas as the immediate objects of human knowledge. Arthur Collier (1680–1732) would make a similar argument.

Berkeley offers both epistemological and metaphysical arguments for his immaterialism. His epistemological arguments begin from the premise that ideas and only ideas are the objects of human knowledge, a presupposition that he at least considered uncontroversial. Although his taxonomy of the different kinds of ideas deviate in ways that are not of interest here from Locke’s classification, he agrees with Locke that ideas exist only “in the mind” (1710: Part I, §2). He takes the mind to be a “perceiving, active being” which itself is not

any one of my ideas, but a thing entirely distinct from them, wherein they exist or, which is the same thing, whereby they are perceived. (1710: Part I, §2)

From these stipulations he derives his most fundamental and famous claim (1) that “the existence of an idea consists in being perceived” (1710: Part I, §2) or that “their esse is percipi” (1710: Part I, §3) by the perceiving, active mind. Already here Berkeley has the means in place to cast into doubt the meaningfulness of the assumption that there might exist unperceived objects or things. This is due to his restriction of existence to what is perceivable or, even narrower, to what is perceived: If the only objects that exist for a mind—whether it is my own mind or the mind of other human beings or the divine mind—are ideas because there is nothing else that can exist for the mind, then the very concept of something that exists but is not for the mind or is unperceived is a contradiction in terms. Thus if, as Berkeley supposes Locke does, one thinks of things as consisting of collections of ideas, he asks how could one take a thing to be something other than ideas and nevertheless to exist? This question underlies Berkeley’s confidence in what is often referred to as his “master argument”, the argument that one cannot conceive of anything existing unconceived because in trying to do so one is still conceiving of the object (1710: Part I, §23). This seems open to the obvious objection that he is confusing the content of a proposition (for example, “The earth may still exist after the extinction of all conscious life”) with the act of entertaining (“conceiving”) such a proposition, which of course cannot take place except in a conscious being; but if he is already committed to the thought that objects of knowledge are nothing but ideas, it is at least understandable that he should overlook this distinction.

The second conviction, also meant to be damaging to Locke’s view about substances, on which Berkeley rests his case in favor of idealism is the more strictly metaphysical claim (2) that “an idea can be like nothing but an idea” (1710: Part I, §8). Although this claim is initially put forward in the context of his well-known criticism of Locke’s primary-secondary-quality distinction, it is equally relevant for his denial that there are things “without the mind”. The reasoning on which this claim is based seems to be the following: For two items to stand in the relation of likeness they must have something in common. However, if an idea is mind-dependent and if ideas are all there is for the mind, then what is “without the mind” must be different in every respect from an idea. Thus a relation of likeness cannot obtain between ideas “in the mind” and things “without the mind”. Berkeley puts this point quite bluntly by appealing to observation:

If we look but ever so little into our thoughts, we shall find it impossible for us to conceive a likeness except only between our ideas. Again, I ask whether those supposed originals or external things, of which our ideas are the pictures or representations, be themselves perceivable or no? if they are, then they are ideas, and we have gained our point; but if you say they are not, I appeal to any one whether it be sense, to assert a colour is like something which is invisible; hard or soft, like something which is intangible; and so of the rest. (1710: Part I, §8)

There is a third metaphysical claim that is essential to both Berkeley’s criticism of Locke and the idealistic position he is going to adopt for himself. This is the claim (3) that ideas are passive and causally inert, i.e., they can neither produce nor alter another idea (1710: Part I, §25). This claim he also purports to base on observation:

whoever shall attend to his ideas, whether of sense or reflection, will not perceive in them any power or activity; there is therefore no such thing contained in them. A little attention will discover to us that the very being of an idea implies passiveness and inertness in it, insomuch that it is impossible for an idea to do any thing, or, strictly speaking, to be the cause of any thing. (1710: Part I, §25)

Perhaps this is intended as an epistemological premise for an ontological claim. Be that as it may, again the primary function of this claim is to discredit a Lockean view according to which we have to think of the primary qualities of things—which are contents of the most fundamental ideas we have of them—as the causes of sensations or of sensory ideas. It is, however, also meant to support the untenability of the assumption that agnosticism with respect to the real existence of mind-independent things is a viable option for a believer in Locke’s model of how and by what means we acquire knowledge of objects.

Berkeley’s criticism of Locke’s theory concerning substances is not carried out for its own sake. On the contrary, it is meant to establish what Berkeley thinks to be the unavoidable metaphysical consequences of a position that takes ideas “in the mind” to be the only material for the operations of the mind in its acquisition of knowledge. These metaphysical consequences consist in a thoroughgoing idealism or “immaterialism” with respect to the nature and constitution of things or substances. Berkeley’s way of establishing this result is open to many questions. However, the basic outline of his overall argument can be sketched thus: If existence is restricted to ideas (and minds) and if, what is undoubtedly the case, things or substances exist, then things or substances must be ideas (or minds) too. Now, as Locke has convincingly shown, we can have ideas of particular things or substances, e.g., gold and lead, humans and sheep, distinguished by our ideas of their various properties, but we have only a confused or obscure idea of substance in general, which we suppose to underlie whatever collection of ideas we take to be a thing or a substance of one kind or another. But if we cannot have any ideas of things or substances other than our ideas of their properties, which clearly exist in minds, then the only clear ideas of things that we have is as ideas, and in that case, if they do not seem to exist in our own individual, human minds, then things or substances must be ideas in some other non-human, i.e., divine mind. This divine mind cannot be itself an idea because it must be conceived as an active principle that can be the cause of ideas, a principle of which we can have no idea but only a “notion” (1710: Part I, §26, §27). Therefore, the very fact that we take things or substances to be real commits us to the claim that things are ideal entities perceived by the mind of God. Idealism, one could say, is the only tenable basis for a realistic stance for Berkeley, but it leads to a realism about minds, human and divine, rather than of what he always calls material substance. And if one is to accept his re-interpretation of causality as a purported relation between ideas in terms of his theory of marks and signs, in particular his theory that what we think of as ideas of objects are signs of (God’s plan for) future possible ideas for us (cf. 1710: Part I, §65 f.), then one also has to agree to idealism. In Berkeley’s view, the only alternative to idealism is not materialism but skepticism.

Up until the point at which he introduces the mind of God into his argument, all of Berkeley’s epistemological considerations might be thought of as expressions of the basic insight that we can only conceive of reality from our own point of view, which are then extended into full-blown idealism in order to avoid the whiff of agnosticism or skepticism and supplemented with the existence of a divine mind in order to satisfy an ineliminable tendency to believe in the existence of something more than one’s own mind or even of human minds in general. We will later see that the tendency to preserve both the impulse to idealism and the conviction that there is something more than ordinary human minds by positing a more than human mind is characteristic of many versions of idealism until the end of its glory days at the beginning of the twentieth century. This tendency is decidedly absent from the philosophy of David Hume, however.

Arthur Collier was a much more obscure clergyman than Berkeley. He published his Clavis Universalis: Or, A New Inquiry after Truth, Being a Demonstration of the Non-Existence, or Impossibility, of an External World in 1713, the same year that Berkeley’s Principles of Human Knowledge appeared, and three years after Berkeley’s Three Dialogues; however, he states that he had originally conceived his position a decade earlier, so before he could have read Berkeley. Although the work was not widely read, it was translated into German by Johann Christian Eschenbach in 1756, and then noticed by Thomas Reid and following him Dugald Stewart. It was republished in English in 1837 along with Collier’s other philosophical work, A Specimen of True Philosophy, in a collection of Metaphysical Tracts edited by Samuel Parr, and then again in 1909, edited with an introduction by Ethel Bowman. By “external” Collier meant “independent, absolute, or self-existent”, and his position is that “all matter, body, extension, &c.” (which he also frequently calls “expansion”) depends “on mind, thought, or perception, and that it is not capable of an existence, which is not thus dependent” (Collier 1713 [1909: 6]). Collier’s position is thus full-throated idealism, which he emphasizes is neither skepticism nor a denial that bodies exist, but the position that

such and such bodies, which are supposed to exist, do not exist externally; or in universal terms, that there is no such thing as an external world. (1713 [1909: 9])

Collier argues for his idealism on both epistemological and more purely metaphysical ground. His work, although a footnote in the history of philosophy, is interesting precisely because it so clearly illustrates the dual strategies for arguing for idealism,

Collier’s most purely epistemological argument is that we are all familiar with (visual) experiences that are assumed to be of external objects but which do not differ from similar experiences which are clearly not of external objects, yet that there is no discernible difference between the latter and the former, thus that if the latter are in or entirely dependent upon the mind, then so must be the former. He uses examples such as those of imaginary beings, chimeras or centaurs (1713 [1909: 17]), which he supposes we (visually) represent just as vividly (his term, anticipating Hume) as other objects, secondary qualities (1713 [1909: 21–2]), cases of double vision, cases of experiences which change, such as different phases of the moon, when no one would believe that the external objects is changing (1713 [1909: 33]), and mirror images, which everyone believes exist in the mind, not in the piece of glass outside us, and yet are indiscernible from other images of their objects. He also equates being visible with being “present to the mind”, and asks how something could be present to the mind if it were elsewhere from the mind? (1713 [1909: 35]). He infers that to be visible is to be in or dependent upon the mind, and thus that to be outside of the mind would necessarily be to be invisible (1713 [1909: 56]).

This begins the more purely metaphysical part of Collier’s argument: that to be visible is to be in the mind we can consider an epistemological premise, but then he argues that nothing can be both visible and invisible at the same time, which is of course quite true independently of epistemology. A further argument he makes is that since God can give created minds any ideas directly, it would be needless for him to give us our ideas indirectly, by creating independent objects to cause ideas in us, and God does nothing useless (1713 [1909: 60–2]). This is a metaphysical, in this case theological argument, directed against the occasionalists Nicholas Malebranche and his English follower John Norris rather than against Locke. The most interesting of Collier’s metaphysical arguments for idealism, however, take the form of antinomies, and have sometimes been held to anticipate Kant’s first and second antinomies (Bowman in Collier [1713] 1909: xxiv). Collier argues that there are sound arguments that an external world must be both finite and infinite in “expanse” or extension (1713 [1909: 63]), that it must be both finitely and infinitely divisible (1713 [1909: 68]), and that it must both be in motion as a whole and have moveable parts, but also cannot be either of these (1713 [1909: 78]). Since the concept of an external world is in these ways contradictory, such a thing cannot exist. It is striking, however, that Collier does not actually provide the arguments for what would become the theses and antitheses of Kant’s first two antinomies, instead providing only a version of Zeno’s paradox to prove the impossibility of moving parts within an extended universe, an antinomy that Kant dos not take over.

It is not inconceivable that Kant knew of Collier’s work through Eschenbach’s translation, although there is no direct evidence for that. It is more likely that Collier’s argument that the difference between what we ordinarily take to be a veridical perception and a mere imagination or hallucination is merely a matter of vividness, and that the latter can become as vivid as the former and thereby undermine any use of vividness as a criterion of externality (1713 [1909: 19–20]), could have been known to Hume and influenced his formulation of the distinction between impressions and ideas in his Treatise of Human Nature (1739–40). So at this point we can turn to Hume.

Whether or not David Hume (1711–1776) learned from Collier, he learned a great deal from Berkeley, above all his empiricist epistemology, but for the most part he tried to avoid Berkeley’s outright commitment to idealism. Hume’s view that our knowledge consists of our ideas, our recognition of “philosophical” relations among them, such as identity and difference, and our recognition of “natural” relations among them such as causation, which are established by imagination and custom, could constitute an epistemological ground for idealism—causality, in particular, which Hume regards as the basis of all our knowledge of existence, is at the same time reduced to a way of feeling and thinking, in other words a state of mind. But depending on how he is read, Hume either accepts the skepticism about possible external objects that Berkeley tries to avoid with his ontology that renders any external objects other than other human or divine minds impossible, or else holds that even if there are valid arguments for skepticism it is psychologically impossible for human beings to remain in a skeptical frame of mind, thus we naturally even if not rationally believe in the existence of objects apart from our ideas of them. However, in those passages, prominently in Book I, Part IV of his early Treatise of Human Nature (1739–40), where Hume entertains a kind of monism that sees both “minds” and “objects” as nothing but different sets or “bundles” of one sort of thing, namely, perceptions, impressions and their paler copies, ideas, his position might seem much like Berkeley’s idealism, with the difference that while he reduces all reality to mental states like impressions and ideas he does not see these as properties that must inhere in substantial minds any more than in substantial bodies, both of which are fictions that we introduce in order to explain continuities among those impressions or ideas (although it may be difficult to explain who is introducing those fictions without resorting to substantial minds after all).

Hume’s potentially idealist approach to causation is clearly on view in his 1748 Enquiry concerning Human Knowledge, which was quickly translated into German and would eventually provide Kant with the stimulus for his own aprioristic rather than empiricist argument for idealism with regard not only to causation but to all of what he called the categories of pure reason, including especially substance and interaction as well as causation. But since Kant was not familiar with the contents of Hume’s earlier Treatise of Human Nature, he did not know that Hume too had generalized his approach to causality to the cases of mind and body, nor did he know that Hume may have tried to sidestep Berkeley’s commitment to substances but not his idealism altogether by his theory of both minds and bodies as bundles of perceptions. Kant would try to avert Berkeley’s version of idealism by a different stratagem, but before we come to that we must consider Hume’s position more fully. Hume accepted from Locke and Descartes before him that the immediate objects of consciousness are what they had called ideas, although he reserves that word for copies or subsequently recalled perceptions rather than the originally experienced perceptions that he calls impressions. He also adopts the view of his predecessors that knowledge lies in the recognition of relations among impressions, ideas, or both, and divides those relations into two kinds, philosophical and natural. Philosophical relations are those immediately evident on reflection on or comparison of particular ideas, and include resemblance, identity, spatial and temporal relations such as above and below or before and after, number and degree, and logical contrariety (Hume 1739–40: I.I.5), while natural relations are those that are not immediately evident on reflection on a single impression or idea or in a single comparison of any number, but which instead become evident, or more properly are formed, only through repeated experience. Hume’s best known argument is then that causation is not a philosophical but a natural relation: the causal relation is comprised by temporal succession, spatial contiguity, and necessary connection, and while the first two are philosophical relations that are immediately apparent, the necessary connection between different ideas—those of a cause and its separate effect—is, unlike the necessary identity of two qualitatively similar ideas, not immediately apparent, as Hume puts it, to reason (1739–40: I.III.2), but instead grows only out of repeated experience, the repeated experience of qualitatively similar pairs of impressions which causes them to become linked in the mind, as we would ordinarily say, or at least in consciousness, as the careful Hume should say at most (1739–40: I.III.6). In fact, Hume’s argument is that repeated experience itself has two effects: it creates a habit of thought such that upon the presentation of an impression of one kind that has repeatedly been experienced in spatial and temporal conjunction with one of another kind, a vivid version of the idea of the kind of impression with which the first kind of impression has been repeatedly associated immediately occurs—this is the essence of causal inference or belief, because a belief is nothing but an idea that is almost as vivid and forceful as the impression of which it was once a copy (1739–40: I.III.7–8; this is the thought Hume could have learned from Arthur Collier)—and further, there is an actual feeling of the mind (as we would ordinarily say) being tugged from the one impression to the other idea—this is the basis of the idea of necessary connection, a connection which the mind then “spreads” upon its objects to form the idea of a necessary connection among them or their states (1739–40: I.III.14).

Hume’s theory of causation points toward idealism by relocating the relation of causation from the external objects where we would ordinarily suppose it to obtain to the mind, which we would ordinarily suppose knows but does not constitute the relation known. In Hume’s words,

Tho’ the several resembling instances, which give rise to the idea of power, have no influence on each other, and can never produce any new quality in the object, which can be a model of that idea [of power or causation], yet the observation of this resemblance produces a new impression in the mind, which is its real model…. Necessity, then, is the effect of this observation, and is nothing but an internal impression of the mind, or a determination to carry our thoughts from one object to another. (1739–40: I.III.14, para. 20)

Several things may be noted about this theory. For one, if it had been Hume’s intent to raise a general skepticism about causation, based on the famous worry about induction that he himself raises, especially in the subsequent Enquiry, namely that an assertion of causality claims that future impressions will occur in the same patterns as past ones but there is no basis “in reason” for assuming that the future will resemble the past, then the relocation of causation from the domain of objects to the domain of the mind should make no difference, because we have no more reason to believe that the mind will behave the same way in the future as it has in the past than we do to believe that about anything else. So we must either believe that Hume is very confused, not realizing that his skepticism about induction as applied to external objects must undermine our confidence in his application of induction to the mind itself, or else that he is very arch, and that he means us to do his skeptical work for him by carrying over skepticism about induction to the case of the mind itself, or else that he is not really worrying about issues of justification and thus of the threat of skepticism at all, but just means to be giving a plausible description of the only possible basis for causal inference, namely the mind’s experience of itself. The last possibility may well seem to be the most plausible, leading to the “naturalist” reading of Hume promoted by Norman Kemp Smith, Barry Stroud, and Don Garrett rather than the “skeptical” reading of Hume accepted by Hume’s contemporaries such as James Beattie and Thomas Reid and defended recently and more skillfully by Robert Fogelin.

There is a further issue with Hume’s treatment of causation that is largely suppressed in the Enquiry but that was evident in the Treatise, namely, that although, as we saw in the last passage quoted, Hume sometimes describes necessary connection as being displaced from the object to the mind, on his own strict interpretation of empiricism there is a problem in positing the existence of either objects or minds distinct from perceptions. This is what pushes Hume towards his own form of idealism. That is, although we naturally speak of perceptions as being of objects and in or by the mind, on the view that all knowledge is founded on perception and that in perception we are immediately acquainted with nothing but perceptions, it becomes problematic how we could have knowledge either of the mind itself or of any object of perceptions distinct from those perceptions. Hume puts the former point succinctly by arguing that we have no perception of the self distinct from our perception of its perceptual states:

For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I can never catch myself at any time without a perception, and never can observe any thing but the perception. (1739–40: I.IV.6.3)

He then argues that in fact the self is

nothing but a bundle of different perceptions, which succeed each other with an inconceivable rapidity, and are in a perpetual flux and movement. (1739–40: I.IV.6.4)

and that the idea of a continuous self is but a fiction or illusion created by relations of resemblance and continuity among perceptions in the bundle, just as both the idea of and belief in causal connection were created by repetition of pairs of impressions. Without saying that the objects of perception are also nothing but bundles of related perceptions, Hume presents a similar account of how the idea of objects distinct from our perceptions of them is generated by our impression of continuity among perceptions: although only philosophers reflect on this, in fact we know that perceptions are fleeting and transitory; we mistake continuity among them for enduring identity; and we then invent something other than perceptions, something not fleeting and transitory, to which to ascribe that enduring identity (1739–40: I.IV.2). In neither case, however, do we actually have a clear idea of any object or substance distinct from our perceptions: we do not have such an idea of external objects or their substance, but neither do we have a clear idea of the mind or its substance. The only ideas we have are copies of our impressions, or perceptions.

Hume’s attack on the supposition that we have an idea of the mind as distinct from its impressions thus constitutes a rejection of Berkeley’s commitment to the existence of mental substances, but not of idealism altogether. On Hume’s account, we are not entitled to assert the existence of both ideas and the minds, human or divine, that have them, but only the existence of the former. At the same time, he does not seem to think that we are forced into skepticism about either minds or external objects by his approach, that is, into a position that there may really be minds and external objects but we cannot know that fact or their real qualities; yet he still has a lingering worry that although there are psychological mechanisms leading us to form the fictions of minds and bodies beyond perceptions, we do not really know what we are talking about when we talk about such things, and thus cannot even coherently doubt whether we have knowledge of them—our talk about them is explicable but meaningless. Hume thus seems to end up with an uneasy compromise between idealism and agnosticism.

4. Kant

The first major philosopher actually to call himself an idealist was Immanuel Kant (1724–1804), although as soon as he did so he labored to distinguish his position from Berkeley’s by calling his position empirical realism combined with transcendental idealism, by which he means that space and time are ineliminable properties of our experience and of things as they appear to us but not real properties of things as they are in themselves. However, since Kant neither denies the existence of things independent from our representations of them nor asserts that these things must be mental in nature, the transcendental idealist part of his position cannot be straightforwardly identified with idealism as he understood it or as we are understanding it here, namely, as the position that reality is ultimately mental in nature. While Kant thinks that he has given a sound argument for the transcendental ideality of space and time, he thinks he has given no reason at all to question the existence of things independent from our representations of them.

The sources as well as the form of Kant’s position are complex. Kant was deeply impressed by what he knew of Leibniz (many of the texts that are crucial to later understandings of Leibniz, such as “Primary Truths”, having been unknown in Kant’s times, or others, such as the New Essays on Human Understanding, having been published only when he was well into his career) and the view that space and time are phaenomena bene fundata as well as by what he knew of Hume and his view that causation is a form of thinking that we impose upon our experience rather than something we directly experience. He was more generally impressed by the empiricist argument that our knowledge of objects depends upon experience of them. However, he thought that both the Leibnizian and the Humean approaches failed to account for the possibility of synthetic a priori knowledge, that is, knowledge that goes beyond the mere analysis of concepts, that thus does more than merely unpack explicit or tacit definitions, but yet legitimately claims universal and necessary validity. But, unlike Plato, the original apriorist avant la lettre, he does not see synthetic a priori knowledge as leading to realism about objects having the features that we know a priori, nor, like Malebranche, the theological Platonist, does he see such knowledge as knowledge of the mind of God; rather, he sees it as providing the conclusive argument for the idealist aspect of his position through the premise that we can only know to be necessary and therefore universally valid the forms that we ourselves impose upon our experience. Thus precisely because we have a priori knowledge of space and time, in his view they can be only features of our own representations of things, not properties or relations of those things as they are in themselves. At the same time, even though when he wrote his main works he was not well-informed on the aporia about subjects and objects about which Hume had ultimately thrown up his arms in the Treatise, which has here been characterized as the tension in Hume between agnosticism and idealism, Kant recognized that we cannot talk about what he called appearances without conceding the real existence of subjects to which objects appear as well as the objects that appear to such subjects. Kant was thus led to what he called “transcendental idealism”, a position that combines idealism about the main forms of objects, that is, the view that we ourselves impose spatiality, temporality, substantiality, causality, and other forms upon our experience and precisely because we know these forms a priori cannot regard them as also the real forms of objects independent of ourselves, with a kind of ontological realism, the view that in some sense both our selves and our objects really do exist independently of our representations of them. Although he identifies his own “transcendental idealism” with “empirical realism” he does not want to call his own position “transcendental realism”, because for him that would be the view that objects independent of our representations do exist with the forms that we represent them as having; that is, in Kant’s terms, transcendental realism would be the view that things really are spatial and temporal independently of our representing them as such. Neither would he even be happy to call this conception of things in themselves a kind of idealism, because it is part of his position that, at least from what he calls a theoretical point of view, we cannot suppose that even our own minds are really as they appear to us, nor can we assert that the reality that ultimately underlies the appearance of minds is essentially different from the reality that ultimately underlies the appearance of bodies. Yet he remains confident that we are entitled to assert the existence of some sort of reality underlying the appearance of both minds and bodies. And to make matters even more complicated, he is confident that we can rationally believe both ourselves and God to be mental in nature from what he calls a “practical” point of view, that is, as necessary presuppositions of rationally attempting to do what morality commands. A complete characterization of Kant’s position would thus be empirical realism about space, time, causation, and the other categories, transcendental idealism about space and time but combined with realism about the existence of things in themselves, and now practical idealism about the nature of ourselves as things in themselves and the nature of God, as in both cases essentially mental or spiritual.

Kant had already published a number of substantial scientific as well as philosophical works before the “great light” of transcendental idealism came to him in 1769, leading to his first statement of it the following year in his inaugural dissertation, On the Forms and Principles of the Sensible and Intelligible Worlds (1770). But it would then take him another decade, the so-called “silent decade”, to publish his full argument for transcendental idealism in the first edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, which appeared in 1781, and even then the relation between the empirical realism and transcendental idealism that he developed in that work continued to vex him: the first substantial review of the book in 1782 charged him with Berkeleianism, in other words, with idealism, and Kant then tried to rebut that accusation in his attempted popularization of the Critique, the Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics of 1783, and to further defend that rebuttal of ordinary idealism in the “Refutation of Idealism” that he added to the second edition of the Critique of Pure Reason in 1787. Even then he was not done with the subject, as we know from a dozen further drafts of the “Refutation” that he composed after that second edition of the Critique. Indeed, Kant continued to struggle with the clarification of his own position to the end of his life, attempting a restatement of transcendental idealism in the uncompleted material for a final book that has come down to us under the name of the Opus postumum. But since it was Kant’s presentations of his position in the two editions of the Critique and the Prolegomena that were most influential in his own time and have been since, we shall concentrate on those texts here. It was in these texts that Kant attempted to perfect his combination of empirical realism about space, time, and the categories, transcendental idealism with regard to space and time, and yet realism (agnosticism) about the actual existence of things distinct from our representations of them. It was then primarily in his writings in moral philosophy, above all the Critique of Practical Reason of 1788, that he developed what we have called his practical idealism about the real nature of the self and God. The second half of Kant’s third and final critique, namely, the Critique of Teleological Judgment in the Critique of the Power of Judgment, uses Kant’s complex position to justify the revival of a teleological approach to nature that would seem to have already been outmoded in Kant’s time, but that will lie beyond the purview of the present article (see Guyer 2005).

Kant’s arguments for his transcendental idealism are distributed across all parts of his Critique of Pure Reason. He gives a direct argument for it in the Transcendental Aesthetic, supplemented by the Transcendental Analytic, and he gives an indirect argument for it in the Transcendental Dialectic by arguing that only his transcendental idealism can allow us to avoid the paradoxes or confusions of traditional metaphysics. We will comment first on Kant’s direct argument for transcendental idealism and then on his indirect argument for it through the critique of traditional metaphysics.

The direct argument is based on Kant’s claim, substantiated in the Transcendental Aesthetic, that we necessarily represent space and time and objects in them by means of our a priori representations of space and time, which are thus pure forms for the intuition of particular objects, and that we can construct proofs of theorems about space and time by appeal to our a priori representations or in “pure intuition”. But how does this lead to any form of idealism? Kant’s chief argument is that space and time can represent

no property at all of any things in themselves nor any relations of them to each other, i.e., no determination of them that attaches to objects themselves and that would remain even if one were to abstract from all subjective conditions of intuition,

and that space and time themselves can instead be only our a priori representations of them and the spatial and temporal features of objects in space and time only features of our representations of them or of the “appearances” of objects, because

neither absolute nor relative determinations can be intuited prior to the existence of the things to which they pertain, thus be intuited a priori. (A 26/B 42)

The decisive point of this argument is the following: although because of our forms of intuition our particular representations necessarily have spatio-temporal structure, any objects that had that structure independently of our so representing them would at best have such structure contingently, and thus the supposedly synthetic a priori propositions about space, time, and their mathematics would not be necessarily true throughout their domain. This argument thus exploits the key epistemological premise for idealism, namely that any isomorphism between knowledge and the known must be necessary. Kant is arguing that since we have no ground to assert a necessary isomorphism between the spatio-temporal structure of our experience and the spatio-temporal structure in things as they are in themselves, we must deny the latter altogether. Kant makes this key move several times. In the Critique, he poses the rhetorical question,

If there did not lie in you a faculty for intuiting a priori; if this subjective condition were not at the same time the universal a priori condition under which alone the object of…intuition is possible; if the object ([e.g.,] the triangle) were something in itself without relation to your subject: then how could you say that what necessarily lies in your subjective conditions for constructing a triangle must also necessarily pertain to the triangle in itself. (A 48/B 65)

Similarly, in the Prolegomena he writes that

Pure mathematics, and especially pure geometry, can have objective reality only under the single condition that it refers merely to objects of the senses, with regard to which objects, however, the principle remains fixed, that our sensory representation is by no means a representation of things in themselves, but only of the way in which they appear to us,

for on the contrary supposition

it absolutely would not follow from the representation of [e.g.] space, a representation that serves a priori, with all the various properties of space, as foundation for the geometer, that all of this, together with what is deduced from it, must be exactly so in nature. The space of the geometer would [or could] be taken for mere fabrication and credited with no objective validity, because it is simply not to be seen how things would have to agree necessarily with the image that we form of them by ourselves and in advance. (§13, Note I, 4:287)

So, Kant concludes, in order to be necessarily true throughout their domain, the synthetic a priori propositions about space and time—and this includes not just the specific propositions of geometry or mathematics more generally but also the general propositions derived in the metaphysical expositions, such as that space and time are infinite singular wholes with parts rather than instances—must be true only of the representations on which we impose our own forms of intuition, and cannot be true of things as they are in themselves. This is Kant’s chief argument for transcendental idealism, the view that the way things appear to us essentially reflects our cognitive capacities rather anything intrinsic to them, combined with what we could call theoretically indeterminate ontological realism, the view that there are things independent of our representations of them but because our most fundamental ways of representing things cannot be true of them we cannot know anything about them other than this fact itself—until, that is, Kant brings his practical argument for our own ultimately mental nature and the mental nature of God on board.

In a passage added to the second edition of the Critique, Kant also points out that by arguing for the “transcendental ideality” of spatio-temporality—that it is a necessary feature of our representations of things but not a feature of things as they are in themselves at all—he does not mean to degrade space to a “mere illusion”, as did “the good Berkeley” (B 71): his position is that it is a subjective but necessary feature of our way of representing things, similar to secondary qualities such as color or fragrance (B 70n) in being subjective but unlike them in being necessary (see also A 29/B 45), and he thinks that by failing to see that the spatiality (in particular) of our representations is necessary, Berkeley has unnecessarily “demoted” it to a mere illusion. Kant’s larger objection to the charge that his position is not different from Berkeley’s is, however, that while denying the spatiality and temporality of things as they are in themselves, he has provided no reason to deny that there are things distinct from our representations of them and our own minds as representing them. But since this larger objection is most clearly expounded and defended in the Prolegomena and the “Refutation of Idealism” added to the second edition of the Critique, which is inserted into the Transcendental Analytic, discussion of it can be deferred for now.

Kant does not need to mount a separate argument for transcendental idealism in the Transcendental Analytic, because while that is aimed at showing that the use of certain concepts (the categories of pure understanding) and principles (the principles of pure understanding) are necessary conditions of any cognition of objects at all, indeed of self-consciousness (apperception) itself, but also yield knowledge only when applied to intuitions, pure intuitions in the case of pure mathematical cognition and empirical intuitions in the case of everything else (thus Kant’s famous statement “Without sensibility no object would be given to us, and without understanding none would be thought. Thoughts without content are empty, intuitions without concepts are blind”, A 51/B 75), since empirical intuitions have already been shown to yield appearances rather than things in themselves, it automatically follows that the categories and principles of pure understanding will also yield cognition only of appearances. Nevertheless, Kant reaffirms transcendental idealism during the course of the Transcendental Analytic.

The Transcendental Dialectic, the second half of the Critique of Pure Reason in which Kant provides the critique of traditional metaphysics is explicitly intended to give an indirect proof of transcendental idealism (B xx). Specifically, the middle section of the Dialectic, entitled “The Antinomy of Pure Reason”, is supposed to provide this indirect proof. All three sections of the Dialectic, thus the preceding “Paralogisms of Pure Reason” and the following “Ideal of Pure Reason”, are supposed to show that the faculty of reason’s inevitable conception of the “unconditioned”, that which is a condition for everything else but itself has no condition, can never provide knowledge of any object because knowledge requires intuition as well as concept, and intuition is always conditioned—the representation of any region of space is conditioned by more surrounding it, and that of any region of time is likewise conditioned by the representation of more time before and after it. Reason can form “transcendental ideas”, more properly, “transcendent concepts” (A 327/B 384), that is, the ideas of an unconditioned subject (the self as substance), an unconditioned whole of all things and events (a completed world-whole), and an unconditioned ground of all possibility (God) (A 334/B 393). These ideas, according to Kant, may be useful as guidelines for scientific research and even necessary for the purposes of practical reason, but they outrun the limits of intuition and therefore theoretical cognition. This general claim itself does not entail transcendental idealism, that is, it does not identify space and time with our own forms of intuition. However, Kant’s claim is that the paradoxes diagnosed in the “Antinomy of Pure Reason” can only be resolved on the basis of transcendental idealism. In the case of the first two antinomies he argues that both sides essentially concern space and time or the things in them (these are the arguments that as we saw were missing from Arthur Collier’s anticipation of the first two antinomies), and that since space and time as forms of intuition are indefinitely extendable and divisible, both sides of the debates, the theses and the antitheses, are false: space and time and thus the totality of things and events in them (the world) are neither bounded and finite or unbounded and infinite but indefinite (even though particular things within space or periods within time may have determinate boundaries). In the case of the third and fourth antinomies, however, Kant argues that the distinction between appearances and things in themselves that is at the heart of transcendental idealism makes it possible for both sides to be considered true, since they concern different objects: in the empirical world of experience, there are only ever indefinitely extending chains of causes and effects, each moment of which is necessary relative to its causal laws (the third antithesis) but contingent because no antecedent cause is absolutely necessary or necessary considered in itself, but outside of the empirical world there is nothing to prevent there being an absolutely necessary thing in itself (God) nor acts of absolute spontaneity on the part of that absolutely necessary being or even lesser beings, such as finite agents. Thus, Kant argues that the antitheses of the third and fourth antinomies are actually true of the world as it appears, while the theses of these two antinomies are possibly true of things in themselves, namely of God as the ground of the entire world of appearance and of ourselves as spontaneous agents grounding our own appearances of action. Again, Kant’s ultimate claim will be that we have necessary and sufficient practical grounds for affirming both our own freedom and the existence of God, but these do not yield theoretical cognition (B xxx).

Kant’s antinomies led to the dialectical methods of Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel, and were thus to prove immensely influential. But it was clearly controversial whether the antinomies in fact required the distinction between appearances and things in themselves; Hegel, for example, surely thought not. For the argument that only transcendental idealism can resolve the antinomies seems to be circular: unless one assumes that our representations of space and time give us not only reliable but also complete information about the nature of space and time and all things in them, there is no reason to assume that the limits of our representations of space and time—their indefiniteness and the contingency of any starting- or stopping-point in them—are also in fact true of space and time and everything in them in themselves. Kant’s indirect proof for transcendental idealism therefore is not conclusive (see Guyer 1987: chapter 18).

Kant himself did not think so, of course. He was utterly committed to transcendental idealism. When confronted with the challenge that transcendental idealism was nothing but Berkeleianism, however, that is, the reduction of all reality to ideas and the minds that have them, he recoiled. This objection was made in the first substantial review of the first edition of the Critique, written from an empiricist point of view by Christian Garve and then redacted by J.H. Feder in 1782 (Garve-Feder 1782, Garve 1783, in Sassen 2000, pp. 53–8, 59–77). Kant defended himself by a more precise formulation of his doctrine in the Prolegomena (1783) and further by the insertion of a “Refutation of Idealism”, specifically “material idealism”, into the Transcendental Analytic in the second edition of the Critique (1787). Kant’s claim in the Prolegomena is that his position should be called “formal” or “critical” idealism rather than “material” idealism because it merely identifies space and time with our forms of intuition but does not otherwise deny the reality of the objects in space and time. As he puts it:

There are things given to us as objects of our senses existing outside us, yet we know nothing of them as they may be in themselves, but are acquainted only with their appearances, i.e., with the representations that they produce in us because they affect our senses. Accordingly, I by all means avow that there are bodies outside us, i.e., things which, though completely unknown to us as to what they may be in themselves, we know through the representations which their influence on our sensibility provides for us, and to which we give the name of a body—which word therefore merely signifies the appearance of this object that is unknown to us but is nonetheless real. Can this be called idealism? It is the very opposite of it. (4:288–9)

At this stage, Kant’s response to the identification of his position with traditional ontological idealism is basically incredulity: he cannot understand it because in his view he has only given reasons for removing space and time from things to our representations of them, just as earlier philosophers had given (different) reasons for relocating properties like color from object to subject, but has provided no arguments against the existence of those things themselves, which he, like any other sane person, takes for granted.

By the time of the second edition of the Critique, however, Kant must have come to see the need for a positive defense of the assumption of the existence of things in themselves that ground our spatio-temporal representations of body (although, since those things in themselves are not supposed to be spatio-temporal and causality is supposed to be a spatio-temporal relation, they cannot precisely be said to cause our spatio-temporal representations). Kant’s argument—which in the following years he would attempt to improve a dozen times (see Guyer 1983, Guyer 1987: Part IV, and Kant 2005)—is that we can only achieve “empirically determined consciousness” of our own existence, or a determinate temporal ordering of our own representations, by correlating them with something enduring outside of and distinct from them:

The perception of this persistent thing is possible only through a thing outside me and not through the mere representation of a thing outside me. (B 275)

Spatiality may be acknowledged to be only my way of representing things outside me, but insofar as anything in space is used to determine the order of my own representations it must be regarded as being ontologically distinct from my representations of it even if its phenomenology is subjective, that is, even if spatiality is only our way of representing ontological independence (see A 22/B 37). In this way Kant proves, contra Berkeley who denies it and Descartes who doubts it, that our phenomenologically spatial representations are “grounded” in something ontologically distinct from those representations. Kant’s “Refutation” was intended precisely to demonstrate that transcendental idealism, the argument that our most basic forms of knowledge in fact reflect only our own forms of intuition and conceptualization, could and must be combined with indeterminate ontological realism, that is, assurance of the existence of objects independent of our representations of them combined with ignorance of their nature, other than their non-spatio-temporality.

It may well be asked of Kant’s “Refutation of Idealism”, as it had already been asked of his yet-to-be-named transcendental idealism in 1770 by such distinguished contemporaries as Johann Heinrich Lambert, Johann Georg Sulzer, and Moses Mendelssohn, whether it is really compatible with the transcendental ideality of time, that is, whether it does not presuppose the reality of the temporality of the enduring object it proposes by means of which to determine the sequence of our own representations as well as of the self that has that sequence of representations (isn’t the sequence of representations, they essentially asked, really a sequence?). But we will not further pursue that question here, because all of Kant’s successors were more concerned with the viability of Kant’s general distinction between appearances and things in themselves rather than with the specifics of Kant’s argument for transcendental idealism from a priori knowledge or of Kant’s proof that we can assert the existence of things in themselves in spite of that distinction. This concern began with the famous objection of F.H. Jacobi, made in the appendix to his 1787 book on David Hume, that without the assumption of things in themselves he could not enter into the critical system, but that with it he could not remain within the system; that is, he felt that once the distinction between appearances and things in themselves was made all ground for the assumption of the existence of things other than our own representations was removed even if Kant had made no explicit argument against that existence. We will also not further explore what we have called Kant’s practical transcendental realism, that is, his argument that morality requires us to believe that we have free wills and immortal souls and that there is an omniscient, omni-benevolent, and all-wise God, thus that those constituents of reality are essentially mental in nature. Rather, we now turn to Kant’s successors to see how they tried to save Kant’s insight into the idea that the most fundamental forms of knowledge ultimately depend on fundamental operations of self-consciousness without ending up with Kant’s combination of that with indeterminate ontological realism.

5. German Idealism

Kant can thus be seen to have made two major points about transcendental idealism. (1) Although he never questions the existence of something independent of our representations of it, he can claim to have shown that when it comes to the ultimate constitution of this reality as it may be considered independently of the way it appears to beings endowed with reason and (human) sensibility we can know nothing on theoretical grounds; on practical grounds, as we have seen, he insisted that we can rationally believe, for example, that we really are free. We neither can know whether—to use a Hobbesian expression again—“without us” or—to use Kant’s own term “in itself”—there are material objects that consist of substances and their attributes standing in spatio-temporal or other (e.g., causal) relations to each other and constituting a law-governed whole called nature. Nor can we know whether whatever we experience as an object is in the end some mental product of a divine mind having creative powers totally different from those of which we can make sense. Thus we are bound to be agnostic with regard to any metaphysical theoretical claims as to the real constitution of the world, and this implies that there is no way to convince us of either idealism or determinate realism about the character of things in themselves. (2) However, whenever we talk about objects of cognition, i.e., of objects that are addressed by us in terms of concepts and judgments, we have to accept them as being conceptual constructions based on our subjective forms of intuitions and on very specific conceptual rules for bringing together or unifying data: an object of cognition is that “in whose concept a manifold of what is given through sensibility is united” (Critique of Pure Reason, B 137). This means, according to Kant, that the assumption of the conceptual constitution of objects of cognition is unavoidable. This is the part of his position that Kant calls empirical realism.

Kant’s Solomonic verdict was not much appreciated by the main representatives of post-Kantian German idealism. Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, as already mentioned, immediately criticized Kant’s allowance of things in themselves of unknown determinations, and replaced it with a straightforward fideism about external existence (which he alleged to find in Hume’s rejection of the psychological possibility of skepticism). However, the general tendency of the idealists, beginning with Johann Gottlieb Fichte, was to reject Kant’s transcendental idealism by arguing that there is no real opposition between what is traditionally taken to be a subject-independent world that is present to us in the mode of “givenness” and “being” and a world that is conceived of as subject-dependent in that it is formed by conceptual tools or other “thought-ingredients” stemming from some subjective activity or other. In other words, Kant’s successors removed his restriction of a necessary isomorphism between knowledge and the known to the case of appearances, and took it to be a general relation between thought and being. This led to a new conception of idealism whose distinguishing character consists in the endorsement of the claim of the “inseparability of being and thinking” where the term “inseparability” is meant to cover sometimes reciprocal dependence and sometimes strict identity. This conception was established primarily by epistemological considerations and realized by introducing entirely new ways of thinking about what ultimately constitutes reality based on a dynamic conception of self-consciousness that the German idealists took to be at the heart of Kant’s theory of the transcendental unity of apperception (and had been arrived at by Kant on the basis of epistemological, not: ontological, considerations!). According to this conception, reality has to be conceived as a result of an activity paradigmatically manifested in the unique manner in which consciousness of oneself arises. Reality is essentially mental, while the mental is essentially active. In order to find out the true nature of reality one has to gain insight into the operations of this activity.

This approach to answering fundamental metaphysical questions by casting into doubt the traditional distinction between ontology and epistemology not only leads to a different conception of what idealism is all about. Above all, it means that one has to sketch out the difference between idealism and whatever is taken to be its opposite (realism, naturalism, materialism, sensualism etc.) not in terms of different kinds of “stuff” either material or mental but to turn away from any “matter” whatsoever. Rather, idealism is now defined in terms of the opposition between dynamic elements like activities and forces as the primary constituents of reality and more substantial items like material objects and (spiritual) persons. Idealism understood in this fashion becomes the name of a “metaphysical” (in a non-traditional sense) world-view that is opposed to what especially Fichte and Schelling liked to call “dogmatism” and is rooted in assumptions about dynamic processes that are operative in the course of self- and object-constitution. There is thus a fundamental difference between the idealism of German idealism and the immaterialism of Berkeley: where Berkeley’s idealism focused on ideas as the “stuff” of existence and assumed minds, whether human or divine, as their repository, the German idealists focused on the mind as active and largely tried to suppress the traditional ontology of substances and their accidents within which Berkeley still worked, which Hume questioned but for which he supplied no alternative, and which Kant again defended by conceiving of substance and accident as relational categories.

Although overcoming the distinction between thought and being by relying on self-relating activities might be seen as a common goal of all the major German idealistic thinkers, they pursued this project in very different directions. The first post-Kantian philosopher who embarked explicitly on the project to elaborate a dynamic idealistic conception of reality that was based on what he took to be conditions of knowledge/cognition and agency and that was built on a specific conception of self-consciousness was Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762–1814) while he was a professor at the university of Saxe-Weimar in Jena from 1794 to 1799. In his Doctrine of Science (1794/95) and in the First and Second Introduction into the Doctrine of Science (1797) he famously set out to demonstrate that the primordial act of self-positing lies at the basis of all reality as far as it is an object of knowledge/cognition and agency. His starting-point is an epistemological question: how does it come that we cannot help but experience objective reality the way we do, i.e., in terms of spatio-temporal objects standing in determinate relations? Where do these representations of objects, of relations and especially the belief that they exist come from? And (most importantly): how can we have knowledge of objective reality that is not subject to skeptical doubts? In order to answer these questions Fichte pursues at different times different strategies. The best known and most influential of these attempts is documented in the first published version of his Doctrine of Science. In what follows we will focus primarily on the line of thought presented in this text, although Fichte changed his arguments considerably in the First and Second Introductions into the Doctrine of Science.

Following the early Doctrine of Science, we must, according to Fichte, accept three fundamental principles (Grundsätze) of human knowledge without which we could not even make sense of the idea that we can know that there is something real at all. The first states that self-consciousness or the I is a spontaneous (unconditioned) act that in taking place creates or posits the I as having existence or being (ein Akt, der im Vollzug sein eigenes Sein schafft). The I understood as this self-positing act that gives rise to its own being and reality Fichte characterizes as “deed-act”, also translated as “Act” (Tathandlung), and it is through this deed-act/Act that what we take to be real or having being comes to the fore. Fichte arrives at what he presents as his first principle of human knowledge on the basis of two assumptions. The first is that we can only properly be said to know assertions (judgments or propositions) which exhibit the character of certainty [Gewissheit], or those which thus express what is actually and certainly the case; the second maintains that a regress in the process of justification with regard to such assertions can only be avoided if we are able to furnish some principle or fundamental proposition which is “utterly unconditioned” [schlechthin unbedingt] (as Fichte puts it), one, that is, which cannot be derived from any other principle, and which, for its part, is of such a kind that it alone guarantees the utter certainty, and thus the indubitability, that is, the immunity to skeptical objections, of a given proposition. This second assumption leads him to the claim that the unquestionable certainty of a proposition can never be demonstrated discursively (by appeal to purely conceptual considerations) or intuitively (by appeal to any sensuous perception), and that, on the contrary, the ground of unconditional certainty can only be found in the constitution of self-consciousness itself. Fichte identifies as an appropriate method by means of which the principle in question can be derived a procedure which he calls “abstractive reflection”. This kind of reflection, according to Fichte, takes its point of departure from a proposition which everyone regards as unquestionably certain, from a so-called “fact of empirical consciousness”. From this fact, this indubitable proposition, the process of reflection isolates (abstracts) the elements which belong to the content of such a proposition, i.e., belong to that about which the proposition asserts something. What is supposedly left, after this abstraction, is simply the form of the proposition which consists precisely in affirming the ascription, or non-ascription, of a predicate to a subject. The proposition which Fichte selects as the point of departure for his “abstractive reflection” is the logical law of identity in the form “A = A”, a law that is rightly regarded as utterly certain, i.e., certain without recourse to any further grounds and thus as intrinsically certain. This fact alone already shows that we have the capacity (the faculty) of claiming something as certain without reference to any further grounds, or, in Fichte’s own terminology, of “positing” something absolutely [etwas schlechthin zu setzen]. Reflection on this fact shows according to Fichte that the utter certainty of the law of identity is grounded in the positing activity of the I (which in this case posits identity), an activity which consists precisely in postulating the being of what has been posited as identical. Otherwise this activity would not be real, would have no being.

This result, however, is not yet sufficient to give us the first unconditioned and fundamental principle of all knowledge. This is so because we have arrived at the I as the guarantee of the absolute certainty of a proposition only on the basis of an empirical fact, namely the proposition “A is A” which has been presupposed as utterly certain. Fichte now rightly observes that the “I am”, as the condition of the certainty of an empirical fact, itself merely possesses the status of an empirical fact [Tatsache]—if the utterly certain proposition were not given, one would never be able to affirm the utter certainty of the “I am”. Up to this point the “I am” has “only been grounded on a fact, and possesses no other validity than that attaching to a fact” (GA I, 2, 257). But in order to discover the first utterly unconditioned principle of all knowledge, we must establish not only the utter certainty of the law of identity, but also the unconditional certainty of the “I am” in such a way that this certainty does not depend upon the presence of a fact at all. In other words: we must be able to answer the question how the utterly unconditioned certainty of the proposition “I am” is possible. It is Fichte’s reflections on this question which lead to his conception of the I as a deed-act/Act (Tathandlung). He reasons along the following lines: we know from our analysis of the conditions of certainty of the law of identity that the I has the capacity to posit something absolutely in the I. But in order to be able to posit something absolutely in the I, the I itself must be posited. We have also already seen that the absolute positing of the I consists in the activity of positing being. If this is so, and if the “I am” is to depend on nothing else as its condition, we must think of the I as the product of its own positing activity, since it would otherwise be quite impossible to explain its being. Now this, in turn, is supposed to imply that we must think the I as an activity which posits its own existence insofar as it is active: the I

is at the same time the actor and the product of the act; the actor, and that which the activity brings forth; act and deed are one and the same; and the “I am” is therefore the expression of an Act. (GA I, 2, 259)

For Fichte, a deed-act/Act is not supposed to be a fact, that is, something which is simply already discovered as given, since the Act is logically and ontologically prior to any facts insofar as it ultimately constitutes (posits) everything which can be a fact for an I. The I, understood as Act, is supposed to be something absolutely posited precisely because it posits itself, and this self-positing constitutes its essence and guarantees its being, its reality. Again, as Fichte says: “That whose being (essence) merely consists in positing itself as being, is the I, as absolute subject” (GA I, 2, 259). This means, for Fichte, that the I, so understood, displays all the characteristics which make it an appropriate candidate for the first utterly unconditioned principle of all knowledge. Fichte tries out various formulations for expressing this first principle in a really adequate fashion. His most accessible formulation is certainly the one he furnishes at the end of section 10 of the first paragraph of the Doctrine of Science: “The I originally posits its own being absolutely” (GA I, 2, 261). This insight that the I must be conceived as self-positing activity, an activity whose performance consists in its self-realization is meant to make any distinction between epistemological and metaphysical idealism obsolete.

The second principle postulates a necessary act of counter-positing (Entgegensetzen) to the self-positing activity of the I resulting in what Fichte calls a Non-I, and the third focuses on an activity that gives rise to the concept of divisibility. Fichte attempts to justify the introduction of these two principle on systematic grounds, although these principles can only be described as unconditional in a qualified respect, by exploiting his own distinction between the form and the content of a proposition. According to Fichte, every proposition (judgment) can be treated as either conditioned or unconditioned in relation to its content, or to its form, or to both. If a proposition is unconditioned in either or both of these respects, then it can be described, in Fichte’s terminology, as a fundamental principle [Grundsatz]. While the second principle is meant to establish (as a condition of knowledge/cognition!) the possibility of the reality of “otherness”, of something which is not the I, the third principle shows how to mediate between the self-positing and the counter-positing acts of the I by reciprocal limitation, thereby introducing a subject-object opposition within the I. Both these principles are presented as codifications of two further unconditional acts of positing on the part of the I. According to Fichte, the I possesses, in addition to the capacity for self-positing that is captured in the first principle, the further capacity of positing a non-I freely and simply (without any further ground). That is to say, it has the ability, through what Fichte calls an “absolute act” [absolute Handlung], to posit something as non-I that is opposed to the I. Fichte’s second principle codifies this act of “counter-positing”. Finally, the I is further characterized by a third capacity, that of freely and simply positing the divisibility of the I and the non-I. The third principle specifically captures this notion of divisibility.

It is not difficult to grasp what Fichte is attempting to accomplish with the introduction of his second principle. It is supposed to do justice to our inexpungible everyday conviction that there is an external world independent of ourselves, the objects of which are outside of and distinguished from us, and to which we can relate in terms of knowledge and action alike. But for Fichte this conviction is justified not because an external world independent of ourselves compels us to understand it as characterized in such and such a way. On the contrary, it is justified because it belongs to the distinctive structure of the I to organize its world dichotomously through the subject-object distinction or the opposition of the I and the non-I. It is more difficult, on the other hand, to grasp the significance which Fichte wishes to ascribe to the third principle of divisibility. The motivation for introducing it is obviously to present the non-I not only as the negation of the reality which the I claims to posit in positing its own being, but rather to ascribe independent reality, independent being, to the non-I. In pursuing this purpose by recourse to the concept of divisibility, Fichte appears to make the implicit presupposition that being or reality should be regarded as a kind of quantity, as something given in degrees (intensively considered) or parts (extensively considered). Once we accept this presupposition, then we cannot in fact avoid bringing something like Fichte’s third principle into play. For the assumption that we have to conceive reality as a distributable plurality, together with the notion that there are real objects possessed of an existence independent of the subject, means that it is necessary, within the Fichtean model of positing, to identify a factor responsible for distributing reality between the I, understood as the knowing subject (and not as absolute self-positing ego), and the non-I, understood as the object that it is to be known.

On the basis of these three principles and by reflecting on the purported interplay between self-positing and counter-positing in a highly original way, Fichte arrives at a portrait of reality in which all “ordinary” objects, like walls, trees and people, and their “normal” interactions and dependencies, like causal, spatio-temporal, and physical force relations, find a place. This portrait is claimed to be idealistic because it is the outcome of an insight into the dynamics of these fundamental and opposed positing acts and because in the end these activities, according to Fichte, are, metaphysically speaking, all there is: “for the philosopher there is acting, and nothing but acting; because, as a philosopher, he thinks idealistically” (Second Introduction, section 7; Werke I, 498). Idealism thus starts to become what could be called from a traditional point of view a “hybrid” position that intimately connects epistemological and ontological elements in that it “explains … the determinations of consciousness”. i.e., our common sense conception of reality as an object of knowledge/cognition and agency, “out of the acting of the intellect [Intelligenz]” without thinking of the intellect as some sort of existing subject:

For idealism the intellect is an acting and absolutely nothing else; one should not even call it something active because by this expression one points to something substantial which is the subject of this activity. (First Introduction, section 7, Werke I, 440)

A consequence that Fichte explicitly draws from this understanding of idealism is that one can no longer think of realism as a position that is opposed to idealism. Rather

realism, … i.e., the assumption that objects totally independently of us exist outside of us, is contained in idealism itself and becomes explained and deduced in it. (Second Introduction, footnote at end of section 1, Werke I, 455)

Because in Fichte’s philosophical world everything is based on the I as a pure activity, it is not that surprising that his idealism very often was called “subjective idealism”, even though he would resist any identification with Berkeley’s substance-accident form of immaterialism. He avoids that conception by introducing what could be called an ontology of pure action.

Fichte’s dynamic conception of idealism was adopted almost immediately by Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling (1775–1854), who in the first period of his philosophical career became next to Fichte the most outspoken defender of this hybrid variety of idealism. In doing so he transformed Fichte’s I-centered approach to reality via an analysis of the conditions of knowledge/cognition and agency into an idealistic version of a monistic ontology. In this he was followed by Hegel. Whereas Fichte had mainly struggled to find an adequate expression for his activity-based conception of a self-positing I and had referred to anything outside the I only as the non-I posited by the I itself, in his early writings on the philosophy of nature Schelling tries to supplement Fichte’s approach by giving a much fuller account of nature, understood as everything that appears to be independent of us, in terms of the I-constituting activities. Because of Schelling’s elevation of nature to a central topic in his presentation of an idealistic worldview his position became characterized, although somewhat misleadingly, as “objective idealism”. On his account, we have to think of reality as an original unity (ursprüngliche Einheit) or a primordial totality (uranfängliche Ganzheit) of opposites that is internally differentiated in such a way that every particular item within reality can be seen as a partial, incomplete, or one-sided expression, manifestation, or interpretation of the most basic dynamic opposition characteristic of the whole of reality. This view of reality, which in early Schelling is quite explicitly linked to Spinoza’s one-substance ontology, obviously does not lead directly to any idealism whatsoever: one could just as well give it a naturalistic reading. In order to connect a monistic ontology to idealism, one has to somehow identify the activities at work in the constitution of the world-whole with mental or spiritual elements that are supposed to give conceptual structure to reality. This can be and was done by Schelling at different stages of his philosophical career in different ways. In the first edition (1797) of his book Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature (Ideen zu einer Philosophie der Natur), he set out to prove idealism by trying to show that “the system of Nature is at the same time the system of our mind” (IP 30; SW 1, 134). This claim is not meant to state a reciprocal relation of dependence between nature and mind and their characteristic features, i.e., according to Schelling, matter and concept, thereby presupposing that nature and mind, matter and concept nevertheless have some reality independently of each other. He rather wants us to think of nature and mind, matter and concept as being identical in the sense of being the same: the one is the other and vice versa. The reason why we as finite minds have to differentiate between them at all lies in a double perspective which is forced on us by our natural predisposition to distinguish the “outside us” from the “in us” (cf. IP 39; SW 1, 138) when looking at reality—thus Schelling sees dualism as a psychological tendency but not a philosophical option. If this disposition and its conditions were understood in the right way, we would comprehend that, as he famously writes, “Nature should be made Mind visible, Mind the invisible Nature” (IP 42; SW 1, 151) thereby making room for an idealistic conception of reality as World-Soul (On the World-Soul is also the title of a 1798 publication by Schelling.)

As a systematic counterpart to the construction of the phenomena of nature out of different dynamic factors (forces, activities), in 1800 Schelling presented his System of Transcendental Idealism. Here he set out to demonstrate the development of mental phenomena out of these factors which he here calls the unconscious and the conscious activity starting with sensation (Empfindung) and intuition (Anschauung) until he arrives via acts of willing at the aesthetic activity manifested in works of art. He thinks of these transcendental idealistic demonstrations as a necessary complement to his philosophy of nature (cf. SW III, 331 f.) and describes their mutual relation thus:

As the philosophy of nature brings idealism forth out of realism, in that it spiritualizes the laws of nature into laws of intelligence, or adds the formal to the material, so does transcendental philosophy bring realism out of idealism, by materializing the laws of intelligence into laws of nature, or adds the material to the form. (SW III, 352)

On this conception both together, philosophy of nature and transcendental idealism, exhaust the entire scope of philosophy, which reveals itself in the end to be nothing but a “progressive history of self-consciousness” (fortgehende Geschichte des Selbstbewusstseins) (SW III 331).

This early approach to establishing an idealistic monism and thereby vindicating a Fichte-inspired dynamic version of ontological idealism was in turn given up by Schelling a couple of years later in the second edition of the Ideas and criticized by him as providing a basis only for what he now calls “relative idealism” (IP 52; SW 1, 163). It is replaced by what he now names “absolute idealism” (IP 50; SW 1, 162). Both his criticism of his earlier World-Soul conception and his endorsement of absolute idealism are at least to a certain degree due to Hegel’s discussion of Schelling’s philosophy in his Difference between Fichte’s and Schelling’s System of Philosophy (1801). Schelling’s new conception, which underlies what came to be known as his “System of Identity” (Identitätssystem), takes reality to be a dynamic whole which he describes as the “undivorced” (ungeschieden) or undifferentiated unity of the absolute-ideal or subjectivity and the absolute-real or objectivity in an “eternal act of cognition” (IP 47; SW 1, 157). This eternal act is all there is, it is “the absolute”. It is disclosed in two fundamentally different forms, one of which is characterized by the prevalence of subjectivity whereas in the other form objectivity prevails. These two forms give rise to the distinction between an “ideal world” and “Nature” (IP 49; SW 1, 161). However, according to Schelling these forms have to be distinguished from the “eternal cognitive act” or the absolute from which the ideal world and Nature originate. This act is pure activity of knowing that creates its objects in the very act of cognition by giving them a form. Because reality is conceived thus as a dynamic self-organizing cognitive process that lies at the basis of even the most fundamental opposition between subject and object, Schelling thinks of his ontological monism as a version of idealism. He writes:

If we therefore define philosophy as a whole according to that wherein it surveys and presents everything, namely the absolute act of cognition, of which even Nature is again only one side, the Idea of all ideas, then it is Idealism. Idealism is and remains, therefore, the whole of philosophy, and only under itself does the latter again comprehend idealism and realism, save that the first absolute Idealism is not to be confused with this other, which is of a merely relative kind. (IP 50; SW 1, 162)

In the end, then, after 1800 Schelling (arguably as well as Fichte in his post-Jena period) seems pushed toward a “non-dogmatic” idealism that combines ontological as well as epistemological idealism within a monistic framework.

Although Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel (1770–1831) too embraces a dynamical conception of idealism in the spirit of Fichte and Schelling, he deviates from both of them by not relying on mental activities of some subject or other or on some primordial subjectless cognitive act as the most basic features of reality. He thus tries to transcend any traditional form of idealism. Given his deep distrust of irreconcilable dichotomies, of anything unmediated and one-sided, one cannot expect Hegel to be an advocate of an idea of idealism that is conceived of in terms of an alternative to or an opposition against realism or materialism or whatever else. He thus shares with Fichte and Schelling the hostility against any attempts to privilege idealism over and against realism (or something else) or the other way round, but avoids the suspicion of a reversion to idealism in a monistic guise better than either of his predecessors. In the case of Hegel, this hostility towards privileging idealism shows especially well in his criticism of reductive programs as well as of “bifurcating” (entzweiend) or separating positions in metaphysics and epistemology. A reductive program according to which either everything physical/material is reducible to something mental and thus confirms idealism or everything mental can be reduced to something physical/material and thus gives rise to realism or materialism is, in his eyes, “ridiculous” (cf. GW 6, 290 ff). A bifurcating or separating position results from a project that is based on the claim that one has to distinguish between a world “for us” and a world “in itself”, where the former is a subject-dependent and in this sense idealistic world while the latter is the “real” world although it is essentially totally inaccessible by any subjective cognitive means. It is because of its one-sidedness and its putting “the real” outside of our grasp that such a “subjective” idealism is for Hegel unacceptable (see his criticism of Kant in Faith and Knowledge, GW 4, 325 ff.). His objections to and his contempt for both idealism and realism in their mutually exclusive forms are well documented in almost all of his writings throughout his philosophical career.

Thus, when Hegel in the second edition of his Science of Logic (1831) nevertheless claims that in the end “[e]very philosophy is essentially idealism or at least has it as its principle” (GW 21, 142), he must mean by idealism something other than traditional idealism and certainly something other than Kant’s indeterminate ontological realism. Rather, he must mean by idealism a philosophical outlook that is immune against the charge of grounding a philosophical system in a conception of reality that is committed to the acceptance of any irreconcilable oppositions. Now, for Hegel the most fundamental opposition both from a systematic and a historical perspective is the opposition between thinking and being, or rather, in the preferred terms, between subject and object. Looked at from a systematic perspective, this opposition is fundamental because of its apparent unavoidability, already at a descriptive level, when it comes to an assessment of the ultimate characteristics of reality: after all, we want to be able to hold fast to the distinction between what is only (in) our (subjective) thought and what is (objectively) the case. Considered from a historical point of view it shows that—at least within the tradition of occidental philosophy—the opposition between thinking and being lies at the bottom of the most influential attempts (with very few exceptions like Parmenides and possibly Spinoza) to give a philosophical account of the essence of reality and its multifarious ways of appearing to us. The traditional conviction of the fundamental and irreconcilable opposition between thinking and being finds expression in many different ways. These ways include the belief that there is being that is totally independent of or without any relation to thinking, or the conviction that thinking is somehow external to being in that being is just the self-standing provider of material on which a by itself contentless (inhaltslos) thinking imposes a certain conceptual form, or the assumption that even if there were no thinking there would be being and vice versa. However, according to Hegel it can be demonstrated that to think of thinking and being as fundamentally opposed in any of these ways leads to inconsistencies resulting in contradictions, antinomies and other bewildering deficiencies. Hence an idealistic philosophical system that is to overcome these deficiencies has to get rid of the underlying fundamental opposition and to show that thinking and being are not opposed but ultimately the same. This claim as to the sameness or the identity of thinking and being (subject and object) is the cornerstone of Hegel’s metaphysical credo and together with some other assumptions leads relatively smoothly to a version of ontological monism as the only convincing shape of an idealistic system.

However, a closer look at how Hegel tries to realize a monistic idealism reveals that it proved rather complicated to establish a philosophical system based on the identity of thinking and being or subject and object. At the outset this project was to be realized within the boundaries of two conditions. The first was to present an argument in favor of the superiority of idealism that would not just make the endorsement of idealism a question of individual character or what a person wants to be, a move he thought to be characteristic of both Fichte’s and Schelling’s defense of idealism. The second was to abandon the view also, according to Hegel, sometimes to be found in Fichte and Schelling, that one has to think of idealism as an alternative and in opposition to dogmatism/ realism/ materialism. Not to meet these two conditions were in Hegel’s eyes two unacceptable shortcomings of any attempt to establish a convincing idealistic worldview. He expressed his dissatisfaction with attempts of this kind to establish idealism as the superior approach in philosophy quite early (Faith and Knowledge, 1802) by referring to them under the title “philosophy of reflection of subjectivity” (Reflexionsphilosophie der Subjektivität). This kind of philosophy of reflection, though favoring subjectivity and hence giving priority to the conceptual and in this sense ideal contributions of the mind to what shows up as reality is still according to Hegel stuck in what he later used to call the “opposition of consciousness” (Gegensatz des Bewusstseins) (in both the, Phenomenology and the Science of Logic). This kind of philosophy is committed to a mode of thinking that takes place within a framework in which the opposition of thinking and being or subject and object is still basic, dissolved only superficially by either abstracting from one of the opposed sides or by establishing a relation of domination between the elements opposed, without transcending and transforming them into a whole, his renowned “Subject-Object”, a whole that is both constituted by these elements, the subject and the object, and that at the same time constitutes them as its own internal differentiations. This way of overcoming oppositions by thinking of the elements opposed as having significance only insofar as their mutual relation can be conceived of as being constituted by the unity they together form led Hegel to claim that in order to avoid the idea of self-standing or irreducible oppositions and hence to escape the charge of one-sidedness in cases where the prioritization of opposites is at stake, one has to follow the methodological maxim that for every opposition there has to be a unity in place that consists of the elements opposed. Hegel took this principle to imply that the “absolute”, the totality of what there is and can be, must be conceived of as what he sometimes calls the “identity of identity and non-identity” (Difference-Writing, beginning of Schelling chapter) or as the “unity of unity and multiplicity/diversity” (Natural Law Essay, section II) where the terms “identity/unity” in each of these formulations are meant to refer to both the whole that gives rise to what is opposed and to one of the elements in opposition.

But does the acceptance of such a methodological recipe as a means by which to transcend oppositions in order to solve the problem of one-sidedness not just give rise to a justification of an idealism that is not just a one-sided alternative to realism/dogmatism/materialism? It appears that on the basis of this methodological device two sensible options are available both of which do not settle the question of superiority. However, whereas the first option leads to a negative result regarding the alleged superiority of idealism, the second opens up at least the chance of a positive result. Those favoring the negative option would start from the claim that the very idea of a “Subject-Object”, i.e., of a whole that is prior to and constitutive of its elements, cannot be defended by any rational means. They would end up recommending just giving up on idealism as well as its opposites as positions whose superiority can be defended philosophically, because there is no rational way to decide which of them has to be favored over the other. It is in fact a reaction Hegel himself sometimes advocates when he states, e.g., in his Lectures on the History of Philosophy (chapter on later skeptics) that both idealism and dogmatism have the status of proclamations/assurances and thus turn out to be equipollent. Supporters of the positive option would have to give credit to the rationality of the strategy, sketched above, of how to overcome oppositions in a philosophically acceptable way and thus would allow for a “Subject-Object” as the common whole in which the opposed sides can be united. But even such an admission would not lead directly to an argument for the superiority of idealism. It would only provide a reason for favoring a position that could be described as real-idealism (Real-Idealismus), a synthetic product that integrates idealism and its opposites into a unity whose elements, though still distinguishable, are at the same time in some sense identical or (in Hegel’s idiom) sublated (aufgehoben). It is easy to show that most of the German idealists were strongly attracted by this positive solution. At some point in their philosophical careers both Fichte and Schelling explicitly used the term “Real-idealism” in order to characterize their views. Even Hegel late in life, in a review of a treatise by Ohlert (GW 16, 287 ff.), made use of this term as a name for his metaphysical teachings.

This solution seems to have been in line with Hegel’s way of conceiving of how to overcome oppositions in his early Jena writings. Unsurprisingly, however, he became dissatisfied with such a tactic because of its inherent limitations. This dissatisfaction shows explicitly for the first time in the preface of the Phenomenology of Spirit. From then onwards he tried in different ways to find a justification of idealism in sensu stricto, i.e., a justification of a view that (1) attributes priority to non-sensible activities, especially to the activity of thinking, that (2) makes realism/materialism/dogmatism obsolete and that (3) allows for subject-object identity without thereby being committed to Real-Idealism. The reasons for his dissatisfaction with attempts that lead to Real-Idealism (among them most of his own pre-phenomenological systematic sketches) are quite simple. In the first place, it is rather obvious that the move to transcend oppositions by making the opposed elements parts of an integrating unity looks like a makeshift, a terminological stipulation that cannot do justice to what it is meant to achieve, namely, to allow the opposed elements to develop out of a unity that is prior to them. Instead of commencing with a developing unity, this move, according to Hegel, remains damaged by presupposing the opposed components as self-standing, thereby making the unity dependent on the elements and not the other way around. Secondly, the unity presented as resulting from a process of integration of what is taken to be opposed cannot be conceived as representing a real identity of opposites because of its status as a synthetic product. Unities in order to qualify as real unities after Hegel’s taste could be pictured in analogy to the “Kippfiguren” of Gestalt psychology. Both these reasons (together with a couple of more idiosyncratic ones) led Hegel to believe that the method of overcoming oppositions by stipulating unities is not ultimately feasible for the task at hand, hence not able to solve the problem of one-sidedness and consequently of no use in the endeavor of justifying the superiority of idealism.

The question, then, is how to proceed in order to establish a version of the subject-object-identity idea that is neither subject to the charge of one-sidedness nor to that of just postulating it without any argument as a given fact. Though this seems to be a purely technical task, i.e., a task to conceptualize the Subject-Object unity/identity in a different way than had been done in the real-idealism approach, and although Hegel recognized early the insufficiencies of Fichte’s, Schelling’s, and even his own initial suggestions for overcoming oppositions, it took him quite a while to come up with a proposal that both avoids the one-sidedness problem and the suspicion that it operates with unfounded assumptions while at the same time it supports the superiority of idealism as a metaphysical doctrine. This is so because he had to realize that it is not just a metaphysical/ontological question as to the status of the Subject-Object unity/identity that is at stake, but that there is an epistemological worry to be answered before the metaphysical/ontological question can even be addressed. As became increasingly clear to him, the task he had to face consists in demonstrating two things: (1) that it is epistemologically warranted to claim that there are indeed unities of basic oppositions (like subject-object, identity-nonidentity, unity-multiplicity, thinking-being) that precede their constitutive elements/parts in that they are at the basis of their constitution while at the same time consisting of them and (2) that it is metaphysically/ontologically necessary to think of the most basic unity/identity, i.e., that of subject and object in an idealistic fashion, i.e., as a spiritual/mental (geistig) item paradigmatically realized in thinking. For Hegel it is the epistemological task that must be solved first before the metaphysical task of giving an idealistic account of the subject-object unity/identity in terms of the sameness of what is different/opposed can be tackled. His idealism needs epistemology as well as metaphysics.

The first task mentioned amounts to answering the question: how can one convince what he calls in the Phenomenology a “natural consciousness” (natürliches Bewusstsein), i.e., an ordinary human being that is committed to the common discursive/conceptual standards of reasoning—how can one convince such a subject by discursive means (and not just by appeal to some strange non-standard procedures like intellectual intuition or revelation) of the epistemic legitimacy of the assumption of a subject-object unity/identity that is prior to and constitutive of its parts/elements? Because the answer to this epistemological question is meant to ground the metaphysical/ontological claim concerning the ultimate constitution of reality, Hegel thought fit to address it in the form of an introduction to what subsequently had to be elaborated in a systematic way as a metaphysical doctrine about what there ultimately is. This epistemological task turned out to be much more difficult than Hegel initially thought. This is documented by the surprisingly many numbers of different sketches of what he took to be an “introduction” to his system even before he published the best known version of this introduction, the Phenomenology of Spirit in 1807. Actually, the Phenomenology is not just the best known, it is the only version of an introduction Hegel ever elaborated in detail, at least in print, that explicitly addressed the task at hand as an epistemological problem. In the second edition of the exposition proper of his system, the Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences in Outline published much later in 1827 (first edition 1817) he chose a different introductory path to his metaphysical project under the title “Positions of Thought towards Objectivity” (Stellungen des Gedankens zur Objektivität) for reasons that have to do with a different assessment of the epistemological task. However, the Phenomenology still remains the most straightforward attempt to settle the question as to the metaphysical priority of the subject-object identity as an epistemological problem.

Although looking at Hegel’s different pre-phenomenological attempts to find a suitable introduction to his central metaphysical/ontological doctrine is an interesting enterprise in its own right, it cannot be dealt with here in detail. It would lead to a discussion of why Hegel initially, i.e., from 1801 to maybe 1806, thought of what he in this early period called “logic” as a discipline that could function as an introduction to his metaphysics. Of all the fragments that were passed down to us from this period the most complete “logical” version of an introduction is the so-called Jena Systemdraft II from 1804/05. This system-draft contains a so-called Logic as a discipline that is meant to present the process of “elevating” (erheben) an epistemic subject equipped with traditionally accepted methodological and logical convictions to the “standpoint of science” (Standpunkt der Wissenschaft), i.e., to a standpoint that is based on the metaphysical doctrine of Subject-Object identity. This process is delineated by Hegel as an introductory logical process that proceeds by means of a criticism of standard logical forms like judgments and inferences as well as of object constituting concepts, i.e., of Kantian categories.

In order to deal with the epistemological problem of demonstrating the priority of unities/identities over and against their opposed elements, in the Phenomenology Hegel starts with an analysis of the conditions of knowledge where knowledge is understood as an achievement of a subject’s activity of dealing discursively/conceptually with the objective world or the world of objects. For him an inquiry into the conditions of knowledge is the right starting point because knowledge understood as the activity of gaining conceptual access to the world is the only discursive attitude available to a subject towards determining what is objectively real, i.e., towards the world. The approach Hegel is pursuing in order to arrive at the desired result, i.e., the proof of the priority of unity/identity, can be outlined thus: he first introduces the conception of knowledge (Erkennen) that is leading his investigation. According to this conception knowledge is to be taken as a discursive/conceptual relation established between a subject and an object that allows for some sort of correspondence (Entsprechung) between them. The possibility of this correspondence depends on getting hold of structural features that are shared by subject and object on the basis of which a knowledge relation can be established. This is the assumption of isomorphism that underlies any epistemologically-motivated move toward idealism.

With the concept of knowledge settled, Hegel chooses as the point of departure for his analysis a configuration of this knowledge relation between subject and object that proceeds on the assumption that the relata of this relation, i.e., the subject and the object stand in complete opposition to each other, each of them being self-standing and a pure another to each other. This configuration is what Hegel calls “sense certainty”, a configuration in which the knowledge relation is supposed to obtain between two items, a subject-this and an object-this, that are totally isolated from each other, have no conceptualizable internal connection whatsoever. Such a conception of the knowledge relation proves to be unwarranted because, according to Hegel, it can be shown that the idea of a cognitive relation between totally independent items makes no sense. Instead one has to acknowledge that the very attempt to establish such a (unreasonable) conception already presupposes that there indeed is a structural affinity between subject and object, an affinity that enables an object to be an object for a subject and that enables the subject to relate to the object. Hegel wants us to think of this mutual affinity in terms of conceptual determinations necessary to come up both with the concept of an object of knowledge and with a tenable account of a knowing subject. Thus in the case of e.g., “sense certainty” the affinity claim is expressed in the result that in order to be an epistemic object an object of cognition has to exhibit the conceptual characteristics of universality (Allgemeinheit) and singularity (Einzelnheit) provided by the subject and that the subject itself in order to be thought of as an epistemic subject must have at its disposal the conceptual resources (in this case the concepts of universality and singularity) necessary to determine the conceptual features of its object. The entire process run through in the Phenomenology is meant to enrich the features a subject and an object have to share in order to arrive at a complete concept of both what a subject and an object are.

In the Phenomenology the initial scenario of “sense certainty” that is based on the absolute opposition between the knowing subject and the object known sets the stage for a long series of configurations or models of knowledge that is aimed at demonstrating that knowledge in a complete or absolute sense can only take place in a setting where subject and object share all their respective structural features, i.e., where both, the subject and the object, have the same conceptual determinations and thus are identical. This amounts according to Hegel to the insight that if knowledge is analyzed in terms of a subject-object relation there is for knowledge (Erkennen) in the end no difference between the subject and the object or, as he is fond of saying, that there is a difference that is no difference (ein Unterschied, der keiner ist). Among other things this means for Hegel that knowledge in the strict sense is ultimately self-knowledge or a state of affairs where a subject that stands in the relation of knowing (erkennen) to an object is “in truth” related to itself, or, as he famously puts it, in the act of knowing (Erkenntnisakt) the subject “is in the other (the object) with itself (exclusively related to itself)” (im Anderen bei sich selbst sein).

This epistemological account presented in the Phenomenology of how the very possibility of discursive/conceptual knowledge is based in an original identity of opposites or a subject-object unity/identity becomes metaphysical/ontological implications because of the conviction Hegel shares with the other post-Kantian idealists that knowledge is a real relation. By this he and his idealistic allies mean (a) that knowledge is a relation between real relata and (b) that knowledge is real only if the relata are real. This conviction puts constraints on how to conceive of this unity/identity when it comes to its content (in a metaphorically analogous way in which, say, in propositional logic a semantics puts constraints on the interpretation of its syntax). This unity/identity established as the basis of knowledge has to meet (at least) two conditions. First of all it has to be such that the subject-object split can be grounded in it and secondly it must allow for an interpretation according to which it is real or has being (Sein). These conditions function as constraints on how to conceive of subject-object-unity/identity because they specify what can count as an acceptable interpretation (a semantics) of an otherwise purely structural item (a syntactic feature). Without meeting these two conditions all we have by now (i.e., at the end of the Phenomenology) is a claim as to the grounding function of a unity/identity of subject and object structure (a syntactic item) that is still lacking an interpretation as to the content (the semantic element) of all the terms involved in that structure.

It is by providing an interpretation to the unity/identity structure that Hegel arrives at a defense of idealism in a non-oppositional sense. Put somewhat distant from his terminology but relying heavily on his own preliminary remarks on the question “With What must the Beginning of Science be made?” in the Science of Logic, his line of thought can be sketched roughly thus: the Phenomenology has demonstrated that knowledge can only be realized if it establishes a relation between real items. These items have to be structurally identical. Realized or “real” knowledge (wahres Wissen) in contradistinction to opinion/defective knowledge (what Hegel calls “false knowledge”) is a discursive/conceptual relation that can only be established by thinking. Hence if there is knowledge thinking must be real, must have being (Sein haben). Now, thinking is an objective, a real activity in the sense that it gives rise to determinations that constitute both the subject and the object. Because it is a discursive/conceptual activity its reality/objectivity implies that what is constituted by it, i.e., the subject and the object have to be conceived of as discursive/conceptual structures whose reality/being just consists in nothing else than their being thought—not their being the object of thought. Conceived of that way thinking not only fulfills the two conditions mentioned above (i.e., it grounds the subject-object divide and it is real, has being), it is at the same time the only candidate to satisfy them (because there is no other discursive/conceptual activity available). Therefore, in order to account for a discursive/conceptual model of reality one has to start from the identity of thinking and being or from the fact that only thinking is real.

From this argument as to the sole reality of thinking, it is easy to derive a new conception of idealism that is not subject to the objections mentioned above that Hegel raised against (what were, in his eyes) the one-sided attempts by his fellow post-Kantians, in particular Fichte and Schelling. If all there is is thinking and if thinking is taken to be not only/primarily an activity of a (human) subject or something that can be present to the senses, but is conceived of as self-standing discursive/conceptual and in this respect ideal activity that opens up first and foremost a space for opposition in the general shape of subject and object then indeed, as he puts it, “every philosophy is essentially idealism” (GW 21, 142) as long as it shares (regardless of whether explicitly or implicitly) this basic conviction of the reality of thinking. This idealism is non-oppositional, for it “the opposition between idealistic and realistic philosophy is therefore without meaning” (GW 21, 142). One might doubt whether the term “idealism” is a very fitting name for the position Hegel endorses. In a way this term is rather misleading in that it seems to suggest that for Hegel the term “thinking” has connotations that point in the direction of the mental, the spiritual. Though Hegel definitely wants these connotations to obtain in certain contexts, they play no role in his metaphysical views. There the only relevant fact is the reality of thinking and the consequences of this fact. Hegel himself seems not to have been too happy with the term “idealism” as a characterization of his philosophy. This is shown by the fact that he very rarely uses it to this purpose. However, setting aside questions of terminology, it is safe to say that for Hegel’s general conception and defense of idealism three points are the most important to acknowledge: (1) it is a metaphysical (and not primarily an epistemological) conception of idealism, (2) it is a conception that establishes idealism by relying on the sole reality of thinking which in turn is taken to be an immediate fact, a given (Vorhandenes, cf. GW 21, 55f.) in an almost Cartesian fashion, (3) however, contrary to the Cartesian “I think” this real thinking is not conceived of as an activity of a human or non-human subject but as an autochtonous activity that in the process of its own determination gives rise to conceptions of both subject and object founded in the primordial identity of thinking and being. Hegel certainly departs from Berkeley’s substance-based idealism, on which all that exists is finite minds and their ideas and the infinite mind and its, although it can certainly be asked what pure thinking not grounded in thinkers is supposed to be.

Hegel’s basic claim as to the identity of thinking and being might be said to have some initial plausibility if one takes such a claim to be a somewhat metaphorical expression of the view that in our ways of thinking about objects some conceptual elements are invariably involved. Understood along these lines, Hegel’s claim could be considered, as it often is, as nothing but a peculiar version of Kant’s empirical realism. Such an interpretation might even be suggested by the impression that Hegel as well as Kant takes thinking to be an activity that is characterized by operating on and with concepts and that what Hegel calls “being” can easily be identified with what within Kant’s epistemological framework is called “reality”, that is, the empirical reality of intuited objects rather than their transcendent grounds. Although this impression is by no means entirely groundless, it is still misleading because it does not do justice to the ontological connotations that Hegel wants to connect with this claim. For Hegel’s idealism it is indeed essential to convince us that it is a demonstrable fact that the world ultimately has to be conceived of as a thought (and thus as a conceptual item) that has objective existence or (in his terminology) that the world is the unique (because all-encompassing) Concept (written with a capital “C”) that is engaged in the process of its own realization (its objective expression), i.e., a realized concept. Therefore each individual object contained in the world, be it a physical (a tree, a lemon), a social (a society, a state) or a cultural (an artwork, a religion) object, has to be taken to be an element in this process, thus having the status of a partial manifestation of the all-encompassing Concept/world (subject/object, thinking/being). Obviously this conception of what the world and the objects it consists of really are—if it is not meant to be just another variation of either a dogmatic idealist claim in the spirit of Berkeley or a transcendental idealism à la Kant—has to use the terms “concept” and “real” in a way that is different from their traditional or normal use in the history of modern philosophy since Descartes. And so it is. For Hegel a concept is not a general representation in the mind of a subject nor is the term “real” meant to be restricted to hinting at the presence of some type of matter either physical or mental. Rather, Hegel thinks of a concept as providing what could be called a “structure plan” for its own realization, and he takes the term “real” to designate the successful realization of a structure plan or a concept; thus Hegel attempts to use these terms in a teleological sense without any mentalistic (i.e., psychological or representationalistic) ontological commitments. Although these somewhat unconventional connotations of Hegel’s concepts of “concept” and “real” (which have a certain basis in a peculiar German use of these terms) might be confusing, they are—at least in his eyes—by no means without descriptive value. Thus, to use examples that Hegel mentions in the Preface to the Phenomenology of Spirit, it makes perfectly good sense to describe a fully grown oak-tree as the realization of its concept, i.e., what is contained as genetic structure in the acorn out of which the tree has developed, or to think of a political state as a realization of what belongs to the concept of a state, making the state the realization of a concept or an “objective thought”. However, although these examples can throw some light on why Hegel might think of his approach as leading to an ultimately idealistic conception of reality, the idealistic aspect of his view strictly speaking has to do with his theory of what he calls “the Concept” (with a “C”) whose realization is the world. It is this theory that commits him not just to idealism because of its radical conceptualism but also to metaphysical monism because of the singularity of the Concept, i.e., the world. Within the framework of this theory the Concept is conceived of as providing something like the master plan or the universal structure that governs not only the conceptual structure of individual kinds of objects but the structure of individual objects as well. This universal structure comes about by means of a process of conceptual self-determination that results in a complete exposition of the conceptual elements contained in the Concept, a process that is documented in Hegel’s Science of Logic. This process of self-determination is understood by Hegel as the way in which the Concept realizes itself. After all, the Concept, being a thought-object or an object-thought itself, must also have reality or being and thus has to realize itself.

Although Hegel definitely wants to overcome what he takes to be shortcomings both of Kant’s philosophy and of the positions of his post-Kantian contemporaries Fichte and Schelling, at the same time he does not want to give up on the post-Kantian project of transforming Kant’s transcendental idealism, which restricts knowledge to the subject’s own experience, into a robust new idealism based on dynamic principles of world-constitution. He differs from Fichte and Schelling in that he does not ground these principles either in some activity of a subject (Fichte) or in a cognitively inaccessible primordial unity (Schelling) but in the idea of a thoroughly conceptual organization of reality giving rise to what he calls in the introduction to the second edition of the Science of Logic an “intellectual view of the universe” (Intellektualansicht des Universums) (GW 21, 34). In this way, Hegel does try to reconcile the need for conceptual elements constitutive of traditional epistemological idealism with (most of) the categorical commitments characteristic of traditional ontological idealism yet in a way that no longer requires the opposition between epistemology and ontology.

6. Schopenhauer

Arthur Schopenhauer (1788–1860) heaped a great deal of invective on Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel. For that reason, Schopenhauer is not always included among the German idealists. And indeed, nothing could be further from Hegel’s version of absolute idealism than Schopenhauer’s theory on which behind the realm of appearances constructed in accordance with our own conceptions of space, time, and causality—his form of the empirical realism side of transcendental idealism—there is a unitary reality that is utterly irrational or at least arational—his form of Kant’s ontological realism, but flipped from practical to theoretical and from rational to arational. Nevertheless, since Schopenhauer works within a Kantian framework, and identifies underlying reality with pure activity, although of an arational rather than rational kind, it is useful to think of him within the framework of idealism.

Schopenhauer puts forward his theory in his main work The World as Will and Representation (Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung), first published in December, 1818 (with an 1819 date on its title page), and then in a much-expanded second edition in 1844 and yet another expanded edition in 1857. This book had been preceded by a doctoral dissertation On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (1813), which Schopenhauer subsequently regarded as the introduction to his magnum opus. The earlier work includes Schopenhauer’s main modifications to the structure of Kant’s epistemology, while the later work accepts Kant’s idealist interpretation of this epistemology (Book I) and then replaces Kant’s version of the doctrine of things in themselves with Schopenhauer’s own version of the unitary non-rational will underlying all appearance (Book II).

Schopenhauer’s acceptance of the empirical side of Kant’s transcendental idealism combined with his non-rational version of Kant’s ontological realism is, however, on display throughout The World as Will and Representation. Schopenhauer accepts without reservation Kant’s argument that space, time, and causality are forms of our own representation that we know a priori and impose upon the appearances of objects. He does precede this acceptance with a Fichtean argument that “The world is my representation”, where the sheer “mineness” of representation is supposed to be a “form…more universal than any other form”, including space, time, and causality (WWR, §1, p. 23). Schopenhauer holds that

no truth is more certain, no truth is more independent of all others and no truth is less in need of proof than this one: that everything there is for cognition (i.e., the whole world) is only an object in relation to a subject, an intuition of a beholder. (WWR, §1, pp. 23–4)

This simple and perhaps inescapable thought may be regarded as the most fundamental epistemological motivation for any form of idealism. On the basis of this proposition, Schopenhauer then tries to distinguish his position from what he takes to be the skepticism of Hume, that there is a real question about whether there is either a subject or an object in addition to representations, and from the dogmatism of Fichte, that both of these can be proved; his own view as initially stated is rather that

the object as such always presupposes the subject as its necessary correlate: so the subject always remains outside the jurisdiction of the principle of sufficient reason. (WWR, §5, p. 35)

But, speaking of dogmatism, he simply accepts from Kant that

space and time can not only be conceived abstractly, on their own and independently of their content, but they can also be intuited immediately,

and that

This intuition is not some phantasm derived from repeated experience; rather, it is something independent of experience, and to such an extent that experience must in fact be conceived as dependent on it, since the properties of time and space, as they are known a priori in intuition, apply to all experience as laws that it must always come out in accordance with. (WWR, §3, p. 27)

By this remark, Schopenhauer indicates his recognition that Kant derives his epistemological idealism from his understanding of the implications of our a priori cognition of space and time, but he does not attempt to explain Kant’s inference or to add any argument of his own. Schopenhauer also does not doubt that there is something other than the representing subject beyond what it represents, an underlying reality beginning with its own body as it is rather than as it merely appears.

Schopenhauer’s fundamental departure from Kant is already suggested in this passage:

We have immediate cognition of the thing in itself when it appears to us as our own body; but our cognition is only indirect when the thing in itself is objectified in other objects of intuition. (WWR, §6, pp. 40–1)

What Schopenhauer means is that although we have an experience of our own bodies, as it were from the outside, through the same forms of space, time, and causality through which we experience all other bodies, including other animate bodies, and in this regard we experience all bodies including our own as mere appearance through the forms we impose on experience, we also have another experience, each of us of his or her own body, as it were from the inside, namely we have an experience of willing an action and of our bodies as the instruments of our wills, with no separation between will and action and thus no relevance of spatial separation, temporal succession, or difference between cause and effect. However—and this is the argument of Book II—our immediate experience of our own bodies as instruments of our wills is an experience of our actions being immediately determined by desire rather than by reason. “To the pure subject of cognition as such, [his] body is a representation like any other among objects”, but

will…and this alone gives him the key to his own appearance, reveals to him the meaning and shows him the inner workings of his essence, his deeds, his movements; (WWR, §18, p. 124)

and what we discover when we look closely at our wills is that they are governed not by reason but by impulse, at its most fundamental level a “dark, dull driving” (WWR, §27, p. 174), and even at its highest, most clarified level, still desires or apparently “creative drives” that only “seem to perform their tasks from abstract, rational motives” (WWR, §27, p. 182). It is not our planning and calculating drives that best express the real nature of the will but our genitals (WWR, §20, p. 133). Of course, it is well known that following the lead of one’s genitals is a pretty good formula for disappointment, and for Schopenhauer this reveals the frustration to which a will driven by desire ultimately leads: either one does not get what one wants, the object of one’s desire, and is frustrated, or one does, but then one wants more, and either does not get that, so is frustrated, or does, but then wants more, and so on ad infinitum. Trying to truly satisfy desire is the height of irrationality, but for Schopenhauer there is nothing else we can will—we can at best try to escape from the clutches of will altogether, whether through art, asceticism, or compassion.

But of course, if the underlying nature of reality, the thing in itself, is nothing other than will, then escape from its clutches should not really be possible but should at most be apparent. And not only does Schopenhauer equate our experience of ourselves “from the inside” as desire-driven will with our own ultimate reality, our character as things in themselves; he also argues that we have no choice but to think of the underlying reality of all appearance in this way, because this is our only form of insight into—or acquaintance with—anything as a thing in itself. We can only “take the key to the understanding of the essence in itself of things” to be the

key provided…by the immediate cognition of our own essence, and apply it to [the] appearances in the inorganic [and organic] world as well,

even appearances that are more remote from us than any others. Ultimate reality, because, Schopenhauer assumes,

it is everywhere one and the same,…must be called will here as well as there, a name signifying the being in itself of every thing in the world and the sole kernel of every appearance. (WWR, §23, pp. 142–3)

Schopenhauer devotes many pages to empirical descriptions of the similarities between the forces at work throughout the rest of nature and the merely apparently rational but really non-rational character of our own behavior, but of course the character of things in themselves cannot be inferred directly from any amount of empirical data; Schopenhauer derives his conclusion not from all this empirical illustration but rather from our allegedly immediate rather than empirical insight into the character of our own wills and the very problematic premise that at bottom everything is essentially one. His position thus begins from an epistemological premise, namely that we can know ultimate reality through knowing ourselves, and reaches an ontological conclusion, that ultimate reality must be like ourselves, but in opposition to Kant and the other German idealists he assumes that our own nature is essentially non-rational and therefore that the ultimate character of reality, although it is in a certain sense like the mental, is also fundamentally non-rational.

7. Nietzsche (and a glimpse beyond)

It may seem far-fetched to think of Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900) as an idealist. After all, he presented himself as an almost fanatical anti-idealist throughout his life. In many of his published and unpublished writings as well as in his letters he expresses over and again his dislike and his disdain for what he calls “idealism”. A telling summary of his position concerning idealism is to be found in his letter to Malvida von Meysenburg (20 October 1888):

and I treat idealism as untruthfulness that has become an instinct, a not-wanting-to-see reality at any price: every sentence of my writings contains contempt for idealism. (Nietzsche, eKGWB BVN-1888, 1135)

This harsh assessment is by no means easy to understand given his known sympathies with a perspectival approach to objects of cognition, his insistence that falsification or tampering (Verfälschung) is at the basis of most of our cognitive judgments, and his claims as to the dependence of knowledge on needs. Considerations like these suggest that in spite of his protests, idealistic modes of thinking are not alien to Nietzsche. At least some of his beliefs are compatible with what has been called here epistemological arguments for idealism although Nietzsche himself would have taken these beliefs to express a form of realism. However, before searching for and elaborating on possible idealistic tendencies in his own thoughts, we should find out what “idealism” meant for Nietzsche and why he was so hostile to it.

Idealism, for Nietzsche, seems to be a particularly unappealing form of metaphysics, in other words of philosophy as it has been practiced throughout history from the era of the ancient Greeks up to his own time (because of his contempt for Kant’s postulates of pure practical reason, Nietzsche gave little credence to Kant’s theoretical critique of traditional metaphysics). Philosophy in this traditional shape he took to be a somewhat enigmatic endeavor to pursue the mutually excluding tasks of (culture-forming) art and religion on the one hand and of (cognition-focused) science on the other (see Nachgelassene Fragmente: Notebook 19, [47], [62], [218]; KSA 7. 434). It is doomed to failure because of two fundamental shortcomings. The first is that it gives a privileged status to truth in declaring truth to be the ultimate goal at which it aims. This preoccupation with truth is based on the implicit assumption that truth has some overriding value. This assumption has never been justified, not even addressed by any philosopher. Nietzsche writes in the Genealogy of Morals (1887: Section 24):

Turn to the most ancient and most modern philosophies: all of them lack a consciousness of the extent to which the will to truth itself needs a justification, here is a gap in every philosophy—where does it come from? Because the ascetic ideal has so far been lord over all philosophy, because truth was set as being, as god, as the highest authority itself, because truth was not allowed to be a problem. Do you understand this “allowed to be”?—From the very moment that faith in the God of the ascetic ideal is denied, there is a new problem as well: that of the value of truth.—The will to truth needs a critique—let us hereby define our own task—the value of truth is tentatively to be called into question. (KSA 5. 401; Third Essay)

However, it is not the problem of the value of truth but the second shortcoming that, in Nietzsche’s eyes, leads directly to metaphysics. It is the tendency of philosophers to deny the obvious, to neglect surfaces in favor of what is allegedly behind them, out of habitual weakness and anxiety to prefer the stable and immutable over and against change and becoming. This critical sentiment Nietzsche expresses quite often at different places in many of his published and unpublished writings. A nice example is the following note:

On the psychology of metaphysics. This world is apparent—consequently there is a true world. This world is conditioned—consequently there is an unconditioned world. This world is full of contradiction—consequently there is a world free from contradiction. This world is becoming—consequently there is an existing [seiende] world. All false inferences (blind trust in reason: if A is, there must be its opposing concept B). It is suffering that inspires these inferences: at bottom there are wishes that such a world might be; similarly hatred of a world that causes suffering expresses itself through the imagination of another world, one full of value: the ressentiment of the metaphysicians against the actual world is here creative. (Notebook 8 [2]; reprinted in KSA 12. 327)

This tendency to “falsify” (verfälschen) or to “re-evaluate/reframe” (umdeuten) reality out of resentment is, according to Nietzsche, especially well documented in the idealistic tradition in metaphysics, as is shown paradigmatically in Plato’s idealism. It was Plato who invented the idea of another world that is much more real, much more true than the ever changing, always unstable world in which we live; he invented the fiction of the supreme reality of an imperishable and everlasting ideal world inhabited by archetypal ideas and immutable forms, a “world in itself” in comparison to which the “Lebenswelt” of everyday experience is just a pale shadow. Yet Nietzsche seems undecided how to evaluate the real motives that led Plato to his idealism. Sometimes he wants to distinguish Plato from other idealists by crediting him with some obscure positive reason for endorsing idealism. In section 372 of The Gay Science, entitled precisely “Why we are not idealists”, he writes:

In sum: all philosophical idealism until now was something like an illness, except where, as in the case of Plato, it was the caution of an overabundant and dangerous health, the fear of overpowerful senses, the shrewdness of a shrewd Socratic. (KSA 3. 623)

However, there are other passages where Nietzsche is not in such a charitable mood and where he presents the ultimate reasons for Plato’s strong leanings towards idealism as rooted in weakness and resentment just as with all the other idealists in the history of philosophy (e.g., Ecce Homo 3; reprinted in KSA 6. 311). His ultimate verdict on metaphysics in all its ancient and modern forms is nicely expressed in the following note:

On the psychology of metaphysics. The influence of fearfulness. What has been most feared, the cause of the most powerful suffering (the lust for domination, sexual lust, etc.) has been treated by humans most hostile and eliminated from the “true” world. Thus they have step by step wiped out the affects—claimed God to be the opposite of the evil, i.e., reality to consist in the negation of desires and affects (which is to say precisely in nothingness). Likewise they hate the irrational, the arbitrary, the accidental (as the cause of countless physical suffering). Consequently they negate this element in that-which-is-in-itself, they conceive it as absolute “rationality” and “purposiveness”. In the same way they fear change, transitoriness: therein is expressed an oppressed soul, full of mistrust and bad experience (The case of Spinoza: an inverted sort of person would count this change as charming). A playful being overladen with power would call precisely the affects, unreason and change good in an eudaimonistic sense, together with their consequences, with danger, contrast, dissolution, etc.. (KSA 13. 536)

However, this thoroughly critical assessment of all forms of idealisms as abominable expressions of intellectual weakness and vindictiveness seems to be at odds with another of Nietzsche’s cherished beliefs, according to which we have to take reality to be not only dependent on but ultimately constituted by the respective perspectives on or the respective ways of interpreting what we encounter. This Nietzschean view can give rise to the impression that in the end he might have been closer to endorsing some form of epistemologically motivated idealism. This leads to the topics of perspectivism and interpretation (Auslegung) in Nietzsche.

Although the details are far from clear, the general tendency of his perspectivism is expressed quite well in aphorism 374 from The Gay Science:

How far the perspectival character of existence extends, indeed whether it has any other character; whether an existence without interpretation, without “sense”, does not become “non-sense”; whether, on the other hand, all existence is not essentially an interpreting existence—that cannot be decided, as would be fair, even by the most studious and scrupulous analysis and self-examination of the intellect; for in the course of this analysis, the human intellect cannot avoid seeing itself under its perspectival forms, and solely in these.…Rather, the world has once again become infinite to us: insofar as we cannot reject the possibility that it includes infinite interpretations. (KSA 3. 626)

This view, according to which, further, the world each of us is experiencing is the product of an interpretation forced on us by some unconscious overriding drive (Trieb) that is the formative mark of the individual character of each of us, might be seen as endorsing a version of idealism if, as it is here, idealism is understood as the claim that what appears to be known as it is independent of the mind is in the end inescapably marked by the creative, formative, constructive activities of human mind, whether individual or collective. However, it is far from clear whether Nietzsche wants us to think of this process of interpretation which leads to a specific perspective as a mind-dependent activity. Sometimes it seems as if he is favoring a quasi-Humean view according to which the intellect operates in the service of some anonymous affective and emotional drives in such a way that it just provides a set of necessary means to consciously realize what drives force us to do. The following note, for example, points in this direction:

Against positivism, which would stand by the position “There are only facts”, I would say: no, there are precisely no facts, only interpretations. We can establish no fact “in itself”: it is perhaps nonsense to want such a thing. You say “Everything is subjective”: but that is already an interpretation, the “subject” is not anything given, but something invented and added, something stuck behind…To the extent that the word “knowledge” [Erkenntnis] has any sense, the world is knowable: but it is interpretable differently, it has no sense behind it, but innumerable senses, “perspectivism”. It is our needs that interpret the world: our drives and their to and fro. Every drive is a kind of domination, every one has its perspective, which it would force on all other drives as a norm. (Notebook 7 [60]. KSA 12. 315)

In other passages Nietzsche seems to be more in line with a by and large Kantian view according to which the intellect provides some rules of transformation of what is given by the senses as individual and discrete data into more general representations. Thus we find him claiming in section 354 of The Gay Science:

This is what I understand to be true phenomenalism and perspectivism: that due to the nature of animal consciousness, the world of which we can become conscious is merely a surface- and sign-world, a world turned into generalities and thereby debased to its lowest common denominator,—that everything that enters consciousness thereby becomes superficial, thin, relatively stupid, general, a sign, a mark of the herd, that all becoming-conscious involves a vast and fundamental corruption, falsification, superficialization, and generalization. (KSA 3. 593)

Be this as it may, at least as far as epistemological idealism is concerned it is by no means obvious that either his explicit criticism of idealism or his remarks on the ways we make up epistemic worlds prevent Nietzsche from coming close to an idealist position himself. This is so because in epistemology his main enemy does not seem to be idealism but all forms of realism.

Although his epistemology does not explicitly imply any ontological claims, one could be tempted to see Nietzsche as toying with some ontologically idealistic fantasies. His speculations concerning the will to power as the ultimate dynamic foundation of all reality fall into this category. For example,

Perspectivism is only a complex form of specificity[.] My idea is, that every specific body strives to become lord over all of space and to expand its force (—its will to power) and to repel everything that resists its own expansion. But it perpetually collides with the equal efforts of other bodies, and ends by making an arrangement (“unifying”) with those that are closely enough related to it:—thus they conspire together to power. And the process goes on…. (Notebook 14 [186]. KSA 13. 373 f.)

This idea of conspiring forces as the supreme world-constituting entities can look like an allusion to Kant’s physics of attraction and repulsion, but also to a version of ontological idealism like those of Fichte and Schelling because it too invites us to conceive of dynamic processes as ontologically prior to (physical or mental) objects and events. Thus, in the end there are no real obstacles to thinking of Nietzsche as an idealist on ontological as well as epistemological grounds, although the speculations that lead him in the former direction may be separable from the latter.

However, even after the heyday of German idealism that ended with Hegel’s death, it is not just the work of Schopenhauer and Nietzsche that show traces of idealistic thinking in the German speaking world. Although it goes beyond the scope of this article, some hints about the fate of idealism in Germany might be appropriate. Interest especially in metaphysical versions of idealism waned in Germany in the second half of the nineteenth century and the first decades of the twentieth (although it remained lively in other parts of Europe, e.g., in Italy, in the person of Benedetto Croce), but engagement with idealist positions and points of view did not entirely vanish. The decline of interest in idealism during this period had to do primarily with a certain aversion against what was taken to have been an excessive and extravagant usurpation of all fields of intellectual discourse by the classical German philosophers under the pretext of idealism. This line of criticism was voiced most forcefully by influential natural scientists like Hermann von Helmholtz. Marginalization of idealism in these years also was an effect of the rise of Neo-Kantianism, which at least partly came into being both in its Marburg-school (Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, Ernst Cassirer) and in its Southwest(Heidelberg)-school (Wilhelm Windelband, Heinrich Rickert, Emil Lask) version as a reaction against the German idealists. Although insofar as Neo-Kantianism was a reaction mainly to absolute idealism it could not entirely reject epistemological arguments of the kind that had traditionally led to idealism, especially in its Kantian variety. Hence idealistic tendencies can be found in Neo-Kantianism too, and Martin Heidegger’s later version of realism can be interpreted as a response to the idealism in Neo-Kantianism.

Despite these critical attitudes towards idealism, which contributed to its decline as a major philosophical position in the German intellectual milieu before the first World War, idealistic claims based on metaphysical and/or epistemological arguments can still be found in the works of some of the (at least at that time) better known philosophers. In particular, the writings of Friedrich Adolf Trendelenburg (1802–1872) and Rudolf Hermann Lotze (1817–1881) are documents of a lasting influence of idealistic figures and practices of thought, as was highlighted in detail by Beiser (2013). Trendelenburg’s interpretation of his central concept of motion (Bewegung) and Lotze’s vindication of his theory of value (Wert) reveal quite tellingly their efforts to preserve essential idealistic features of both Hegel’s metaphysics (Trendelenburg) and Kant’s epistemology (Lotze). It also has to be kept in mind that during this period there were still active right (old) and left (new) Hegelians who were either critically or apologetically committed to a broadly Hegelian or idealistic framework in philosophy. There were also those around who sympathized with certain aspects of Hegel’s philosophy. All these voices had some impact on philosophical discussions mainly about religion (e.g., Immanuel Hermann Fichte, Christian Hermann Weisse) and politics (e.g., Bruno Bauer, Ludwig Feuerbach, David Friedrich Strauss). A similar observation can be made with respect to Karl Marx and the Marxists: although they were outspoken opponents of an idealism in Hegel’s sense, their anti-idealism did not stop them from entertaining idealistic notions of the development of history or the unavoidability of social progress, with eventually profound consequences for twentieth-century history. In spite of all this, it is fair to say that idealism fell out of fashion in the German speaking world, and has stayed that way.

8. British and American Idealism

Things were different in the English-speaking world, where idealism became an important topic in a wide spectrum of philosophical discussions ranging from metaphysics via aesthetics to moral and social theories. In England, Scotland, and Wales an idealism that was ultimately both epistemological and ontological in motivation became the dominant approach to philosophy for several decades, while in the United States idealism could not monopolize philosophy, having to share the stage with and ultimately reach an accommodation with pragmatism, but it nevertheless also flourished for several decades. The best known and most outspoken spokesmen in favor of idealistic conceptions in metaphysics and elsewhere in Britain in these years were Thomas Hill Green and Francis Herbert Bradley at Oxford and John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart at Cambridge, while in the United States the most prominent idealist was Josiah Royce at Harvard, where idealism’s having to share the stage with pragmatism was personified in Royce’s friendly rivalry with William James and in Royce’s ultimate attempt to synthesize his view with that of Charles Sanders Peirce. Although all of these figures are frequently characterized as being indebted to Hegel’s writings and advocating a Hegelian view of reality, their various positions are at best in a somewhat indirect, almost only metaphorical, sense informed by Hegel’s philosophy. In fact, these philosophers were more willing to call themselves idealists than had been the earlier German idealists who supposedly inspired them, but who as has been argued were just as interested in escaping as in accepting the label. This is shown most tellingly insofar as their approach to a defense of idealism goes back to a state of the discussion characteristic of the period prior to Hegel and German idealism in general, rather connecting more directly to an understanding of idealism influenced by eighteenth-century disputes in the wake of Berkeley. None of these figures except perhaps Royce continued to explore a dynamic conception of idealism distinctive of Hegel and the other German idealists—Royce in fact wrote more extensively and insightfully on Hegel and his immediate predecessors than any of the others with the exception of McTaggart. In general, the late nineteenth-century idealists were more inclined to think of idealism or, maybe more accurately, spiritualism again as a genuine alternative to materialism and embark again on the controversy whether matter or mind/spirit is the ultimate “stuff” of reality. These philosophers were thus more willing to identify themselves as idealists than had been their predecessors. However, these philosophers were not all equally monists. Both Bradley and McTaggart, for whom a defense of idealism consists mainly in establishing the ontological point that reality is exclusively spirit, were, and thus their idealism could also be called “spiritual monism”. But both Green at the beginning of the movement and Royce towards its end strove for more nuanced positions, not excluding the existence of matter from their idealisms, and thus resisted monism. But all their efforts to establish a convincing form of idealism, whether in the form of spiritualism or in a form that allowed some role for matter as well, became rapidly unfashionable even during the lifetimes of all these philosophers (except for Green, who died young) due to what was called “the revolt against idealism” staged at the turn of the twentieth century in Britain by Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore and a decade later in the United States by a group of “New Realists”. However, as we will suggest at least Russell was himself pushed back in the direction of some form of idealism, perhaps only on epistemological grounds, by the time his own thought reached the stage of his “logical atomism”. For the most part, however, after the attacks on Bradley and Royce, explicit avowal of idealism became rare, with a few exceptions such as the prominent defense of idealism by Brand Blanshard in the 1930s and less prominent defenses by Timothy Sprigge and John Foster in the early 1980s

Thomas Hill Green (1836–82) was the first of the great Oxford idealists. He is best remembered for a lengthy polemic with Hume that he published in the form of an introduction to a collected edition of Hume that he co-edited and for his posthumously published Prolegomena to Ethics, which is a polemic against utilitarianism from the point of view of a perfectionism inspired by Kant as well as by Hegel. But the first of the four books of the Prolegomena is a “Metaphysics of Knowledge”, beginning with a statement of “The Spiritual Principle in Knowledge and in Nature” (1893: 13), which argues for a form of idealism on both epistemological and ontological grounds, and Green’s posthumous works also included a set of lectures on Kant in which he engaged quite directly with Kant’s form of idealism. Green also left behind a set of Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation that form one of the crucial documents of the political and social philosophy of British idealism and of idealism in the broadest sense mentioned at the outset of this entry.

Green’s motivation in arguing for idealism in the Prolegomena is to prepare the way for a conception of the will as free and creative as the foundation of his ethics—in this regard Green’s view is as much in the spirit of Kant’s practical idealism as it is Hegelian. Green’s idealism is expounded in three main steps. First, and here also much influenced by Kant, he argues that knowledge never consists in the mere apprehension of discrete items, but in the recognition of order or relation, and that such order or relation is not given but is constituted by and in consciousness. Thus,

The terms “real” and “objective”…have no meaning except for a consciousness which presents its experiences to itself as determined by relations, and at the same time conceives a single and unalterable order of relations determining them, with which its temporary presentation, as each experience occurs, of the relations determining it may be contrasted. (Prolegomena, 1893: 17)

From this he infers that

experience, in the sense of a consciousness of events as a related series—and in no other sense can it help to account for the knowledge of an order of nature—cannot be explained by any natural history, properly so called, (1893: 21–22)

but must instead be constituted by mind itself, or,

the understanding which presents an order of nature to us is in principle one with an understanding which constitutes that order itself. (1893: 23)

Thus far, Green’s position could be considered an epistemological argument for idealism. However, he quickly moves beyond a merely epistemological argument, because his next move is to argue that since the order of which any individual human being is in various ways and to various degrees aware obviously extends beyond what could plausibly be thought to be constituted just by that individual, the order of which we are each aware must be constituted by a mind or intelligence greater than that of any of us, thus there must be “an eternal intelligence realized in the related facts of the world”, and the world must be “a system of related facts rendered possible by such an intelligence”, which intelligence “partially and gradually reproduces itself in us, communicating piece-meal but in inseparable correlation” aspects of that order to each of us if not complete knowledge of it to any of us (1893: 38). Green’s insistence on a supra-individual intelligence as the source of cosmic order in which individual intelligences in some way participate is a decided move beyond epistemology, and in his own view it is also a significant departure from Kant, whose agnosticism about the real nature of things in themselves, at least in the theoretical mood, “would at once withhold us” from such an inference to the “spirituality of the real world” (1893: 43). However, and here is the third main thesis of Green’s form of idealism, the participation of individual human beings in the supra-individual intelligence which constitutes the comprehensive system of relations can be seen as an apprehension of some portion of that order by animal organisms:

in the growth of our experience, in the process of our learning to know the world, an animal organism, which has its history in time, gradually becomes the vehicle of an eternally complete consciousness; (1893: 72)

it is the eternal consciousness,

as so far realized in or communicated to us through modification of the animal organism, that constitutes our knowledge, with the relations, characteristic of knowledge, into which time does not enter, which are not in becoming but are once for all what they are. (1893: 73)

Green’s form of spiritualism is thus not incompatible with ontological dualism: the object of all knowledge is the complete and eternal order of things, which must be constituted by an intelligence greater than that of any individual human being, but individual human beings are in fact organisms, thus matter, to which some aspect of that intelligence is communicated. The epistemological aspect of Green’s idealism is complete, because knowledge on the part of an individual is understood as consisting in a grasp of an order that is itself mental, but his ontology is not exclusively mentalistic, for while it includes the necessary existence of a supra-individual intelligence or spirit but allows the existence of animal organisms (and thus presumably of other forms of matter as well).

Francis Herbert Bradley (1846–1924), however, argued for a more exclusive spiritualism, or an idealist ontology. Bradley presents his metaphysical views on the constitution and the main characteristics of reality most explicitly in Appearance and Reality: A Metaphysical Essay, which was first published in 1893 and reprinted many times during his lifetime. He famously proceeds from the claim that the traditional and received “ideas by which we try to understand the universe” are contradictory (1893: 11 [1897: 9]). He substantiates this claim by examining a range of central concepts from metaphysics and epistemology, among them the concepts of primary and secondary qualities, of substance and attribute, of quality and relation, space and time, of causality as well as the concept of a thing and that of the self. The best known of his destructive arguments against these conceptions is that against qualities and relations because it played a role in the discussion that arose at the turn of the twentieth century between Bradley, Russell and Moore (among others) about the logical and ontological status of relations, i.e., whether they are “internal’’ or “external” to their terms. As to qualities and relations Bradley claims:

The arrangement of given facts into relations and qualities may be necessary in practice, but it is theoretically unintelligible. The reality, so characterized, is not true reality, but is appearance. (1893: 25 [1897: 21])

He starts with pointing out that “[q]ualities are nothing without relations” (ibid.). This is so because in order to be qualities they have to differ from other qualities and hence have to be distinct. However, without relations they could not be distinct. But distinctiveness presupposes plurality and plurality relations.

Their plurality depends on relation, and, without that relation, they are not distinct. But, if not distinct, then not different, and therefore not qualities. (1893: 28 [1897: 24])

Not only without relations are qualities nothing, “[u]nfortunately, taken together with them, they are equally unintelligible” (1893: 30 [1897: 25]). The reason is that one cannot account for their distinctiveness if their distinctiveness is based on their being different: “In short, qualities in a relation have turned out as unintelligible as were qualities without one” (1893: 31–32 [1897: 27]). The same holds, according to Bradley, from the side of relations. “They are nothing intelligible, either with or without their qualities” (1893: 32 [1897: 27]). They are nothing intelligible without qualities because “a relation without terms seems mere verbiage” (ibid.). They are nothing intelligible with qualities either for in order for a relation to relate it must stand in a relation to what it relates which makes it into a quality that requires “a new connecting relation” (ibid.) if it is to relate to that quality. Bradley summarizes as the result:

The conclusion to which I am brought is that a relational way of thought—any one that moves by the machinery of terms and relations—must give appearance, and not truth. (1893: 33 [1897: 28])

The result of his examination not just of the concepts of quality and relation but of all the other concepts he deals with consists in the verdict that all attempts to capture the true nature of reality in terms of these categories are futile because all these concepts are unintelligible, inconsistent and in the end self-contradictory. This means that what is designated by means of them cannot be real, but can only reflect the way the world appears to us, not the way it really is. This diagnosis is based on Bradley’s fundamental conviction that “ultimate reality is such that it does not contradict itself” (1893: 136 [1897: 120]). He takes this to be “an absolute criterion” (ibid.). However, to be just appearance is not to be unreal in the sense of an illusion. On the contrary, although appearance is “inconsistent with itself”, one cannot deny its existence or “divorce it from reality” because “reality, set on one side and apart from all appearance, would assuredly be nothing” (1893: 132 [1897: 114]).

But does this ontological argument for idealism exclude epistemology altogether? That is, since appearance always proves to be an inadequate way in which reality is present to us, is it beyond our means ever to become acquainted with the true essence of ultimate reality or can we avoid skepticism and claim that it is indeed possible for us to have access to the constitutive nature of reality? Bradley emphatically endorses the latter possibility. According to him, the self-contradictoriness of what is appearance already implies that there is positive knowledge of reality: reality has to be One in the sense that it does not allow discord and it must be such that it can include diversity (cf. 1893: 140 [1897: 123]), i.e., “the Absolute is … an individual and a system” (1893: 144 [1897: 127]). This character of reality as an internally diversified individual system is revealed to us in sentient experience. “Sentient experience … is reality, and what is not this is not real” (ibid.). According to Bradley it is this sentient experience that “is commonly called psychical existence” (ibid.). The material basis of sentient experience is exhausted in feeling, thought, and volition. Thus reality consists in what has to be taken as the undifferentiated unity of these modes of sentient experience before these modes make their appearance as different aspects of experience. This leads Bradley to assume that what is ultimately real is just what gives rise to appearances where appearances have to be understood as specific forms under which the underlying undifferentiated unity appears in each of these different aspects of experience. In his words:

… there is no way of qualifying the Real except by appearances, and outside the Real there remains no space in which appearances could live. (1893: 551 [1897: 489])

Although he concedes “our complete inability to understand this concrete unity in detail” he insists that this inability “is no good ground for our declining to entertain it” (1894: 160 [1897: 141]). And although he claims at the end of his metaphysical essay that he does not know whether his “conclusions” are to be called Realism or Idealism (1893: 547 [1897: 485]), at the very end he nevertheless abruptly states: “We may fairly close this work then by insisting that Reality is spiritual” (1893: 552 [1897: 489). This might lead us to assume that, “in the end” (a favorite phrase of Bradley’s), it was primarily his search for a basis for spiritualism and not so much a defense of idealism understood as opposed to realism that motivated him to explore the true nature of reality; in other words, he was ultimately driven by an impulse toward idealism by ontological premises even though he had developed powerful arguments epistemological arguments for idealism.

The identification of idealism with spiritualism, thus again an ontological interpretation of idealism, is most explicit in the works of John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart (1866–1925). His earliest work, “The Further Determination of the Absolute” (first published as a pamphlet in 1893, then as Chapter IX of Studies in Hegelian Cosmology [1901] and in Philosophical Studies [1934]), starts with the following proclamation:

The progress of an idealistic philosophy may, from some points of view, be divided into three stages. The problem of the first is to prove that reality is not exclusively matter. The problem of the second is to prove that reality is exclusively spirit. The problem of the third is to determine what is the fundamental nature of spirit. (1901 [1934: 210 f.])

And the last of his writings published in his lifetime (“An Ontological Idealism”) starts with the confession, explicitly employing the same terminology that we have used here: “Ontologically I am an Idealist, since I believe that all that exists is spiritual” (1924 [1934: 273]). He takes spirit to be the sum total of individual spirits or selves connected by the relation of love and bases this conviction on the claim that only this conception of what ultimate reality consists in allows us to overcome unavoidable contradictions connected with all other attempts to reconcile unity and diversity as the distinguishing marks of reality. Harmony between unity and diversity can be established only on the basis of an all-encompassing relation of love between all the characteristic elements of reality, which in turn presupposes thinking of ultimate reality as a community of spirits or as Spirit. These—as McTaggart himself admits (1924 [1934: 271 f.])—rather mystical-sounding assertions, which he adhered to all his life, he tries to back up by a number of different considerations. In his earliest writing he relies heavily on views held by Bradley to the effect that we have to accept that contradictions are a criterion for non-reality. However, he does not employ this criterion as a logical maxim but transforms it into an ontological principle according to which everything that prevents harmony cannot be real. In his last work, his attempt to present an argument for his ontological idealism is based mainly on (1) mereological considerations concerning the structure of substances which aim to show that only spirits can claim the status of a substance, and on (2) his theory of time, the unreality of which he famously had proven in his magnum opus The Nature of Existence (1921/27). In the first volume of this work he attempts to prove by a priori reasoning (NE §43) that all that really exists are substances. Substances according to McTaggart are infinitely divisible and therefore cannot have simple parts. Between substances and their individual features there obtains a relation of determining correspondence such that each feature determines and is determined by all the other. Given these a priori characteristics of what can exist the task McTaggart tackles in the second volume is to

consider various characteristics as to which our experience gives us … a prima facie suggestion that they are possessed either by all that exists, or by some existent things (NE §295)

and to ask

  1. “which of these characteristics can really be possessed by what is existent” and
  2. “of those which are found to be possible characteristics of the existent, whether any of them can be known to be actual characteristics of it” (NE §295).

This double task cannot be settled by a priori means but has to be approached by starting from empirical assumptions based on experience. If one has to acknowledge that the ways we are bound to conceive of all these experiential or phenomenal characteristics lead to contradictions then these characteristics cannot be true of reality. McTaggart’s strategy here is strongly reminiscent of Bradley’s procedure to downgrade many phenomena to appearances and to deny them the status of constitutive elements of reality. The empirically given characteristics McTaggart discusses primarily are (a) time, (b) matter, (c) sensa, (d) spirit and (e) cogitation. As to (a) time he denies that “anything existent [can] possess the characteristic of being in time” (NE §303) where time is understood as an ordering relation between events. He distinguishes between two ways of ordering in time. The first gives rise to what he calls the “A-series” according to which every state of affairs (event, thing) is either past or present or future. The second, the so-called “B-series”, relates transitively and asymmetrically states of affairs in terms of earlier and later (cf. NE §306). He claims that the A-series is more fundamental than the B-series because only the A-series can account for change (NE §317) and goes on to demonstrate that (a) the A-series and the B-series contradict each other in the sense that they belong together though they are incompatible (cf. NE §333) and that (b) the (more fundamental) A-series leads to time determinations of a state of affairs that are contradictory. The result:

We conclude that the distinctions of past, present and future are essential to time, and that, if the distinctions are never true of reality, then no reality is in time. (NE §324)

Though never true of reality these distinctions are not empty because according to McTaggart they have to be taken as appearances of a third series, the C-series, “a series which is not a time series, but under certain conditions appears to us to be one”. This C-series “does actually exist in every case in which there is the appearance of a time-series” (NE §347). McTaggart thinks of the C-series (at least in The Nature of Existence) as an “Inclusion Series” (NE §575)

whose members are connected by the relations “inclusive of” and “inclusive in”, so that of any two terms one will be inclusive of the other, and the other will be included in it. (NE §575)

Concerning (b) matter which he characterizes as “something which possesses the primary qualities” (NE §355) he also wants to prove that it does not exist (NE §364). This is so because all that exists are substances that have to be infinitely divisible. Matter, however,

cannot be divided into parts of parts to infinity either in respect of its spatial dimensions, or of that dimension which appears as temporal. And matter, as usually defines, and as we have defined it, has no other dimensions. … And therefore it cannot exist. (NE §362)

The existence of matter can also not be inferred on the basis of the prima facie existence of what I perceive “by means of the sense organs of our bodies”, i.e., of what he calls “sensa” (NE §373), because it is erroneous to believe that matter as the presumed outside cause of a sensum has the same qualities as a sensum and thus has to exist (NE §365). He conjectures that if there are outside causes of sensa they must be substances which are “of a spiritual nature” (NE §371). When it comes to (c) sensa McTaggart holds that one has to distinguish between two classes of percepta, those perceived by introspection (mental states, spiritual data) and those that are given by means of sense organs (sensa). The latter do not really exist, they just lead to the illusion that they exist. This is so because of a confusion between a perception that is part of the percipient and therefore spiritual or mental in character and what is perceived, i.e., the object of a perception or the perceptum (NE §373). However, a perceptum as a sensum cannot, according to McTaggart, have parts within parts to infinity and thus cannot really exist because what exists has no simple parts (cf. 355). Having disposed of matter and sensa this way, he then discusses the ontological status of (d) spirit or spirituality. He declares that “the quality of spirituality … is the quality of having content, all of which is the content of one or more selves” (NE §381) and states that “nothing can have this quality except substances, and so nothing but substances are spiritual” and exist or are real (ibid.). A self or an I he takes to be a simple quality of a substance which is known to me to be myself by direct perception, i.e., is known by acquaintance, not by description. The distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description he explicitly takes up from Russell (NE §382). He then surmises that it is very likely that the I, i.e., the substance that possesses the quality of being a self, persists through time because “I perceive myself as persisting through time, or the real series which appears as a time-series” (NE §395). He also holds that selves are conscious without having to be self-conscious (NE §397) and that no experience is possible “which is not part of a self” (NE §400) though it cannot belong to more than one self (NE §401). He concludes:

As all the content of spirit falls within some self, and none of it falls within more than one self, it follows that all existent selves form a set of parts of that whole which consists of all existent spirits. (NE §404)

Although written more than twenty years after G. E. Moore’s “The Refutation of Idealism” (see below) and without mentioning him at all, McTaggart thus arrives at the exact opposite to the conclusion that Moore defended. Regarding (e) cogitations which comprise perceptions, awarenesses of characteristics, judgments, assumptions, imaginings, only perceptions can form an infinite series required for existence (NE §406). Perception he characterizes as awareness of a substance as having such and such qualities (NE §407). The outcome he wants to have reached so far is this:

… spirit, unlike matter and sense, can really exist. But it can do so only if it contains no parts except perceptions and groups of perceptions. (NE §426)

All these considerations as to the character or the nature of time, matter, sensa, spirit and cogitations are meant to establish two results. The first is “that nothing which is spiritual is also “material or sensal” (sic) [although this result] leaves it possible that what is really spiritual may appear as being material or sensal” (NE §431). The second is McTaggart’s version of idealism:

No substance has material or sensal qualities, and all reality is spirit. This conclusion I propose … to call by the name of Idealism (NE §432)

in an ontological sense though, as he remarks, the terms “Spiritualism” or “Psychism” might be “intrinsically better” to characterize his point of view (NE §432). It is interesting to note that McTaggart does not believe that his metaphysical (ontological) spiritual idealism excludes a realistic stance in epistemology. This is so because he characterizes epistemological realism as a position that is based on a correspondence theory of truth according to which a belief is true if it corresponds to a fact. Because everything that is real is a fact and (according to McTaggart) nothing is unreal (although it may not exist), all beliefs about something are beliefs about facts and consequently about something that is epistemologically real. Although this concept of epistemological realism is vague, it suggests that McTaggart thought of idealism not primarily in opposition to realism but much more in terms of a doctrine that is opposed to materialism, that is, as an ontological rather than epistemological doctrine. However, since McTaggart makes clear that since matter and mind are the only candidates for genuine substantiality of which we know, and thus that while only mind or spirit satisfies the ontological conditions for substantiality, for all we know there might be some other alternative, so his argument for idealism is not conclusive. His argument is predominantly ontological, but does presuppose one crucial epistemological premise.

Idealism was also a prominent mode of philosophy in the United States during the late nineteenth century, alongside pragmatism, but while pragmatism remained prominent throughout the twentieth century, whether under that name or not, the reputation of idealism was permanently damaged by a movement toward “realism” early in the century (which also attacked pragmatism, although without the same effect). Earlier in the nineteenth century, the popular essayist Ralph Waldo Emerson, the most philosophical of the New England “Transcendentalists”, had struck many idealist themes, and after the Civil War a school of “St. Louis Hegelians” emerged, whose efforts were primarily exegetical. But the leading American idealist was Josiah Royce (1855–1916). Deeply influenced by Charles Sanders Peirce, particularly the lectures that Peirce gave in Cambridge in 1898, Royce incorporated aspects of Peirce’s pragmatism into his version of idealism, giving an idealist spin to Peirce’s conception of truth as what would be known at the end of inquiry were that ever to be reached. But Royce’s argument always remained that epistemology must ultimately lead to what he himself called metaphysical idealism.

A prolific author who published fifteen books before his early death at sixty, Royce launched his defense of idealism in his first book, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy (1885). In this work he introduced his first novel argument, for idealism, what he called the argument from error. Royce’s claim is that skepticism begins with insistence upon the possibility of error, but that recognition of that possibility presupposes not just that there is “absolute truth” (1885: 385) but that in some sense we have to know that absolute truth, or at least some aspect of it, in order to have an object even for our erroneous claims, thus that we must have some access to a “higher inclusive thought” even to make an erroneous knowledge claim. In his words,

Either then there is no error, or else judgments are true and false only in reference to a higher inclusive thought, which they presuppose, and which must, in the last analysis, be assumed as Infinite and all-inclusive. (1885: 393)

Royce holds that we must have some sort of apprehension of the “higher inclusive thought” in order to be able even to make our errors, and then that the growth of human knowledge over time consists in increasing apprehension of this all-inclusive truth without any limit being prescribed by our subordinate status. This is the epistemological optimism that pervades all Royce’s work and his subsequent debate with Bradley.

This account does not yet make clear why Royce thought that epistemology must lead to ontological idealism; that becomes clearer in his subsequent works. Royce’s next major statement of his idealism came in The Spirit of Modern Philosophy (1892). The second part of the book more fully develops Royce’s own arguments for idealism. Here Royce gives a clear definition of his conception of idealism and adds to the previous argument from error a second argument, from meaning. The core of this argument is that the intended object of an expression or thought must itself be conceived or understood in some way, so that we always mean what are in some sense our own ideas, although of course at any particular moment we hardly know or understand everything about the object to which we refer; that is why the idea that is the ultimate object of reference may be much greater than the idea that refers. In Royce’s words,

The self that is doubting or asserting, or that is even feeling its private ignorance about an object, and that still, even in consequence of all this, is meaning, is aiming at such an object, is in essence identical with the self for which this object exists in its complete and consciously known truth. (1892: 370–1)

By means of this argument, any restriction of Royce’s position to a purely epistemological one is eliminated: the possibility of meaning requires an identity between what means and what is meant, and since anything might be meant, anything at all must in some way be identical with what means, subjects and their ideas and expressions, even though that identity can hardly be absolute, and the ordinary conscious subject may seem very different and more limited than the “one Self” (1892: 373) that underlies the appearances of both ordinary subjects and ordinary objects.

Royce develops an even more systematic argument for an idealism that is both epistemological and ontological in his magnum opus, the two volumes of his 1899–1900 Gifford lectures published as The World and the Individual. As the title suggests, a major theme of this work is explicating in detail the relationship between underlying reality and ordinary individual, conscious human selves. In this book, Royce expounds his idealism as the last of the four possible “conceptions of being”. The first is the “realistic conception of Being”, which is defined by the conception of being as completely independent of thought, so that whatever is true of it is true quite independently of what may be thought about it. The second conception of being is the mystical conception. As the defining notion of the realist conception was independence, the defining notion of mysticism is the opposite, namely immediacy, the idea that thought and its object must be one. The third conception of being, which Royce sometimes calls the theory of “validity”, is that “To be real now means, primarily, to be valid, to be true, to be in essence the standard for ideas” (I:202). This conception of being tries to retain realism’s recognition of independence through the thought that “some of my ideas are already, and apart from my private experience, valid, true, well-grounded” (I:204) and mysticism’s identification of subject and object through the thought that reality is itself possible experience, but adds structure to the now unified realms of thought and being instead of eliminating structure.

The fourth conception of being is a fuller development of the conception of meaning that Royce had introduced in The Spirit of Modern Philosophy (1892). He now links meaning to purpose, and his thought is that the meaning of a term is an intended purpose, a problem to be solved, for example a mathematical problem to be solved or object to be constructed, and that in using a term the user already has some approach to solving the problem in mind but the full solution remains to be developed, may never be fully developed in the life of a particular individual, but is in some sense already included in the larger thought that constitutes reality. Reaching back to both Hegel and Kant, Royce conceives of the progress of knowledge as making the meaning of our ideas more determinate. In this he is also influenced by Peirce, and his notion of meaning is clearly a version of Peirce’s approach to truth, on which a proposition is true if it would be affirmed at the final stage of human inquiry, with the difference that while for Peirce the final stage of human enquiry is essentially a regulative ideal without ontological commitment, for Royce, the comprehensive meaning in which all ideas would be fully determinate is actually thought, although by a sort of super-self, not by any particular finite human self or even by all the selves thinking at any one time. Royce makes the transition from thought to being by stating that

In its wholeness the world of Being is the world of individually expressed meanings, an individual life, consisting of the individual embodiments of the wills represented by all finite ideas. (1892: I:341–2)

Royce’s arguments for idealism collectively, which in many ways return to the basic form of modern idealism pioneered by Green, whose Prolegomena had been published just a couple of years before Royce’s own career began, illustrate the pressure that often forced a move from epistemology to an idealist ontology. The epistemological argument begins with the insight that our knowledge in some way or another always reflects the structure of our own consciousness and thought. But the difference between what any particular individual believes or even knows at any particular time and what may be true and be known as a whole, at a time or over time, is too great to ignore, and must be resolved. But once it has been assumed that thought or mind itself is the proper object of knowledge, the only way to do this is to make a contrast between individual thought and some sort of supra-individual thought. At the outset of modern idealism, in Berkeley, that takes the form of the infinite mind, God, contrasted to individual, human minds; in later forms, such as those of Green and Royce, the supra-individual mind is not always identified with God, but plays the same role. In the cases of both Green and Royce, the union of epistemology and ontology also provided the basis for a moral idealism based on an insistence upon the underlying commonality of individual human selves in the larger self that Royce called the Absolute. But we will not be able to trace that line of thought here, and will instead conclude with the suggestion that many subsequent philosophers drew back from the full-blooded idealism offered by Green, Bradley, McTaggart, and Royce in favor of what was supposed to be an ontological realism, but which nevertheless continued to harbor at least epistemological grounds for idealism. This might seem a surprising claim, since the immediate response both to the British idealists and to Royce in the U.S. came from philosophers who identified themselves as realists. A case in point would be Bertrand Russell.

Before we turn to Russell, however, we will pause for a look at Charles Sanders Peirce (1839–1914), who, as already suggested, was a considerable influence on the later work of Royce. Whereas Royce was convinced that epistemology must ultimately lead to metaphysical idealism, Peirce was led in his philosophical development from metaphysical realism to metaphysical idealism while supporting all the way what has here been characterized as an epistemological ground for idealism. Peirce, definitely the most original American philosopher of his era, was the son of a famous Harvard mathematician. He was a fired from a teaching post at Johns Hopkins because he had the temerity to begin residence with the woman who would become his second wife before his divorce from his first wife had been finalized, and was never able to get another academic position. He thus had to spend much of his career as an employee of United States Coast and Geodetic Survey, and then lived his final years in independent but dire circumstances, supported in part by subscription lecture series that William James arranged for him to give in Cambridge. Although he was highly recognized and even supported by many of his academically much more successful philosophical contemporaries, among them Royce and James, and although he produced an impressive amount of writing (the Peirce Edition Project that is in charge of publishing his writings will, if ever finished, contain more than twenty volumes) he never succeeded in elaborating his ideas in book form. Instead he published most of his work in intellectual and learned journals (Proceedings der American Academy of Arts and Sciences, Journal of Speculative Philosophy, The Nation, Popular Science, The Monist, The Open Court) and encyclopedias (Baldwin’s The Century Dictionary and Cyclopedia). There are also quite a number of manuscripts he wrote for different lecture series but never published. They comprise the early Harvard lectures on The Logic of Science (1865) and the early Lowell Lectures on the same topic (1866) as well as the Cambridge Lectures on Reasoning and the Logic of Things (1898) and the later Harvard lectures on Pragmatism (1903).

Peirce’s metaphysical view are intimately connected with his claim “that logic is the science of representations in general, whether mental or material” (Chronological Edition = CE 1.169) and with his stipulations concerning the structure and status of what he calls “representation”. In his early writings, while trying to answer the question as to the grounds of the objective validity of synthetic inferences (a question which he takes to be at the center of Kant’s theoretical philosophy), he develops a notion of representation according to which

[A] representation is anything which is supposed to stand for another and which might express that other to a mind which truly could understand it. (CE 1.257)

This characterization of a representation is supposed to make the representation “mind-independent”, so to speak:

instead of being restricted to something within the mind, [the representation] is extended to things which do not even address the mind. (CE 1.323)

Peirce might have come to this conception of a representation by relying on a phenomenological analysis of what he takes to be constitutive of every experience. For him

experience has three determinations—three different references to a substratum or substrata, lying behind it and determining it. (CE 1.168)

This is so because every experience is determined (1) by an external object, (2) by our soul and (3) by “the idea of a universal mind” (an “archetypal idea”). Within representations he distinguishes in the early writings between a copy (“a representation whose agreement with its object depends merely upon sameness of predicates”, CE 1.257), a sign (“a representation whose reference to its object is fixed by convention”, CE 1.257) and a symbol (“a representation whose correspondence with its object is of the same immaterial kind as a sign but is founded nevertheless in its very nature” CE 1.323). Later he changed the terminology and used instead of “copy” and “sign” the terms “Icon” and “Index”, which led to his better known distinction between Icon, Index and Symbol as different kinds of representations. Each of these different kinds is determined by a difference in its way of denoting and/or connoting its object while all of them share the characteristics of having to have (1) a relation to an object (2) under a specific form (e.g., similarity, by convention) and (3) a relation to an interpretant, i.e., to a “consciousness” (cf. CE 1.272 f.). From his analysis of the nature of a representation Peirce draws the metaphysical conclusion that “[w]hatever is is a representation” (CE 1.324) or “all is representation” (CE 1.326). He arrives at this conclusion in a somewhat obscure way that seems to be based on the conviction that everything there is represents itself or is a representation of itself under an interpretation. Peirce does not immediately recognize his position as a form of idealism. Rather, because representations are neutral with respect to their status of being material or mental he can think of material objects as representations whose interpretant is either the representation itself or some (non-human) consciousness for which the representation can function as a symbol, and he can think of mental items like general terms or concepts as universals that exist “out there” in a world that comprises next to copies and conventional signs what he calls ideas (cf. CE 1.168). However, it is obvious that this view commits Peirce to a position that implies the (metaphysical) reality of universals, a position he explicitly and happily endorses (cf. CE 1.358 ff.). And the very fact that every representation has both a denotative and a connotative function makes the basic epistemological premise for idealism, namely the necessary isomorphism between knowledge and the known, an element of his view.

Whereas in his earlier writings Peirce is very explicit about the metaphysical/ontological implications of his representational position, he is reluctant to go into metaphysical discussions in his later writings, where he is primarily concerned with formulating and defending his conception of Pragmatism. Instead he urges that his Pragmatism is not a metaphysical doctrine and is in fact metaphysically neutral. In a draft of a popular article on Pragmatism (1907), never published in his lifetime, he writes

that pragmatism is, in itself, no doctrine of metaphysics, no attempt to determine any truth of things. It is merely a method of ascertaining the meanings of hard words and of abstract concepts. (The Essential Peirce = EP 2.400)

He proclaims, most unambiguously in his Harvard lectures on Pragmatism (1903), that one can establish Pragmatism as a methodological maxim on the basis of epistemological (in later years: semiotic) considerations that have to start from a phenomenological analysis of experience. To provide this analysis is the task of what he calls Phenomenology (used explicitly in allusion to Hegel, cf. EP 2.143 f.) which is in Peirce’s taxonomy the first of the main branches of philosophy because on it rest what he takes to be the other branches of philosophy, i.e., normative science and metaphysics (cf. EP 2.146 f.). Phenomenology is the discipline

whose task is to make out what are the elements of appearance that present themselves to us every hour and every minute whether we are pursuing earnest investigations, or are undergoing the strangest vicissitudes of experience, or are dreamily listening to the tales of Scheherazade. (EP 2.147)

According to Peirce, phenomenological considerations, i.e., considerations spelled out in the Phenomenology, show that in whatever can be experienced there are at least two distinct series of categories involved that make this experience possible. Some of them are universal, i.e., are constitutive of every phenomenon, others particular, i.e., belong to a phenomenon if looked at under a specific aspect (cf. EP 2.148) like its quantitative, qualitative, relational etc. determinations. As universal categories he identifies three which he names Firstness/Category the First/First, Secondness/Category the Second/Second, and Thirdness/Category the Third/Third respectively. He defines them thus:

Category the First is the Idea of that which is such as it is regardless of anything else. That is to say, it is a Quality of Feeling. Category the Second is the Idea of that which is such as it is as being Second to some First, regardless of anything else and in particular regardless of any law, although it may conform to a law. That is to say, it is Reaction as an element of the Phenomenon. Category the Third is the Idea of that which is such as it is as being a Third, or Medium, between a Second and its First. That is to say, it is Representation as an element of the Phenomenon. (EP 2.160)

These definitions are meant to capture what is essential to every phenomenon. They are interpreted in more familiar terms by Peirce as attributing to every phenomenon the characteristics of presentness or immediacy (Firstness), struggle or resistance (Secondness) and what may be described as general openness to conceptual interpretation (Thirdness) as fundamental and irreducible features. Peirce is ready to credit Hegel with a similar view (“I consider Hegel’s three stages as being, roughly speaking, the correct list of Universal Categories”, EP 2.148). However, he criticizes Hegel for mistakenly not allowing these categories to be independent of each other. He believes that the reason for this failure on Hegel’s part lies in his being

possessed with the idea that the Absolute is One. … Consequently, he wishes to make out that the three categories have not their several independent and irrefutable standings in thought. Firstness and Secondness must somehow be aufgehoben. (EP 2.177)

Although this criticism might be justified from a Peircean phenomenological point of view it poses at the same time a problem for him because he now has to give an account of how the professed independence of his universal categories can be integrated into his general representational picture of reality, a picture according to which everything that is real has to have the character of Thirdness and therefore is somehow related to everything else in virtue of its interpretative or representational character, i.e., in virtue of its status as an interpretant.

It looks as if Peirce in his later years (after ca. 1905) tried to solve this problem by giving his phenomenological claims a metaphysical underpinning. For him metaphysics is that part of philosophy that gives an account of the results of what philosophy in the form of Phenomenology and as a normative science has accomplished. Here Peirce exploits the fundamental idealist premise that there is a necessary isomorphism between thought and being: according to him,

[m]etaphysics consists in the results of the absolute acceptance of logical principles not merely as regulatively valid, but as truths of being. Accordingly, it is to be assumed that the universe has an explanation, the function of which, like that of every logical explanation, is to unify its observed variety. It follows that the root of all being is One; and so far as different subjects have a common character they partake of an identical being. This, or something like this, is the monadic clause of the law. Second, drawing a general induction from all observed facts, we find all realization of existence lies in opposition, such as attractions, repulsions, visibilities, and centres of potentiality generally…. This is, or is a part of, a dyadic clause of the law. Under the third clause, we have, as a deduction from the principle that thought is the mirror of being, the law that the end of being and highest reality is the living impersonation of the idea that evolution generates. (CP 1.487)

The term “law” in this characterization is equivalent to what he terms “regularity” “in the universe of representations” (cf. CP 1.480). The specific version of metaphysics he is advocating shows up in his writings in the shape of what he calls his doctrine of Synechism. He defines Synechism as

that tendency of philosophical thought which insists upon the idea of continuity as of prime importance in philosophy and, in particular, upon the necessity of hypotheses involving true continuity. (Collected Papers = CP 6.169)

This synechistic doctrine, he declares,

gives room for explanations of many facts which without it are absolutely and hopelessly inexplicable; and further that it carries along with it the following doctrines: first, a logical realism of the most pronounced type; second, objective idealism; third, tychism, with its consequent thorough-going evolutionism. We also notice that the doctrine presents no hindrances to spiritual influences, such as some philosophies are felt to do. (CP 6.163)

Tychism “or the doctrine that absolute chance is a factor of the universe” (CP 6.201) he takes to be an essential element of synechistic philosophy because it

must give birth to an evolutionary cosmology, in which all the regularities of nature and of mind are regarded as products of growth, and to a Schelling-fashioned idealism which holds matter to be mere specialized and partially deadened mind. (CP 5.102)

He is committed to objective idealism as well as to logical realism because of his view that (to use a phrase favored very much by Bradley) “in the end” everything there is is a representation. It is within this synechistic framework based on tychism that, according to Peirce, the independence of Firstness and Secondness can be shown to be a necessary condition for Thirdness. This is so because continuity (which he identifies with Thirdness) and chance (as the organizing principle of evolution) could not be accounted for if there were no independence of the three universal categories. He is very explicit about this connection between his metaphysical and his representational views when he writes:

Permit me further to say that I object to having my metaphysical system as a whole called Tychism. For although tychism does enter into it, it only enters as subsidiary to that which is really, as I regard it, the characteristic of my doctrine, namely, that I chiefly insist upon continuity, or Thirdness, and, in order to secure to Thirdness its really commanding function, I find it indispensable fully [to] recognize that it is a third, and that Firstness, or chance, and Secondness, or Brute reaction, are other elements, without the independence of which Thirdness would not have anything upon which to operate. Accordingly, I like to call my theory Synechism, because it rests on the study of continuity. (CP 6.202)

In virtue of the robust idealistic elements contained in his synechism it is safe to say that Peirce’s final philosophy exhibits all the traits that are characteristic of metaphysical idealism prevalent in Anglo-American philosophy at the turn of the twentieth century.

9. The Fate of Idealism in the Twentieth Century

Both epistemological and ontological idealism came under massive attack in Britain at the turn of the twentieth century by George Edward Moore (1873–1958) and Bertrand Russell (1872–1970), while in the United States Royce’s position was attacked by a school of younger “New Realists”, to some extent inspired by his life-long interlocutor William James, who included E.B. Holt and his younger Harvard colleague Ralph Barton Perry, and later Roy Wood Sellars (the father of Wilfrid Sellars, who later moved back to a form of Kantianism), and Arthur Lovejoy. Both Moore and Russell had more of an enduring influence on the course of analytic philosophy than did the American New Realists, but also reveal the continuing impulse to idealism in spite of their own efforts, so we will focus on them. Both of them take idealism to be spiritualism in the spirit of Berkeley and Bradley (neither of them mentions their own Cambridge tutor McTaggart!), i.e., they think of idealism as a position characterized by the claim that the universe (Moore) or whatever exists or whatever can be known to exist (Russell) is spiritual (Moore) or in some sense mental (Russell). Although their attack was so influential that even more than a hundred years later, any acknowledgment of idealistic tendencies is viewed in the English-speaking world with reservation, it is by no means obvious that they actually thought they had disproved idealism. On the contrary, neither Moore nor Russell claimed to have demonstrated that the universe or what exists or can be known to exist is not spiritual or mental. All that they take themselves to have shown is that there are no good philosophical (in contradistinction to, e.g., theological or psychological) arguments available to support such a claim. Moore especially is very explicit about this point. He devotes the first five pages of his famous piece from 1903, “The Refutation of Idealism”, to assuring the reader over and over that

I do not suppose that anything I shall say has the smallest tendency to prove that reality is not spiritual. … Reality may be spiritual, for all I know; and I devoutly hope it is. … It is, therefore, only with idealistic arguments that I am concerned; … I shall have proved that Idealists have no reason whatever for their conclusion. (Philosophical Studies, pp. 2 f.)

And Russell in his The Problems of Philosophy (1912), in a similar vein, warns the reader, after emphasizing the strangeness of an idealistic position from a common sense point of view:

[I]f there were good reasons to regard them [viz. physical objects] as mental, we could not legitimately reject this opinion merely because it strikes us as strange. (1912 [1974: 38])

Moore and Russell found two main arguments for idealism to be fallacious. The first concerns Berkeley’s idealistic principle that being consists in being perceived, the second the converse claim, attributed to Bradley, that thought entails being. Their criticism of the first as well as their rebuttal of the second argument stems from certain convictions they share as to the nature of knowledge. The assault on Berkeley is staged by Moore most extensively in “The Refutation of Idealism” (1903). Here he holds that if there is an argument to prove the idealistic claim that the universe is spiritual (1903: 433) then this reasoning must rely either at the beginning or at some point later in the argument on the premise esse est percipi:

I believe that every argument ever used to show that reality is spiritual has inferred this (validly or invalidly) from “esse is percipere” as one of its premisses; and that this again has never been pretended to be proved except by use of the premiss that esse is percipi. (1903: 437)

According to Moore the proposition esse is percipi “does at least assert that whatever is, is experienced” (1903: 437) which is meant in turn to assert

that wherever you have x [esse] you also have percipi; that whatever has the property x also has the property that it is experienced. (1903: 440)

After a lengthy analysis of this proposition he points out that the conception of the connection between an experience and what is experienced that the idealist is entertaining has tenuous consequences that give rise to the question:

if we never experience anything but what is not an inseparable aspect of that experience, how can we infer that anything whatever, let alone everything is an inseparable aspect of any experience? (1903: 451)

An inference to such a conclusion cannot be justified. He concludes that in order to avoid an idealistic position one is better off to endorse a view according to which

I am as directly aware of the existence of material things in space as of my own sensations, and what I am aware of with regard to each is exactly the same—namely that in one case the material thing, and in the other case my sensation does really exist (1903: 453)

This line of reasoning, remarkably similar to what Kant had argued in the Fourth Antinomy in the first edition of the Critique of Pure Reason but rejected as an inadequate refutation of idealism in the second edition, was picked up in an abbreviated form by Russell ten years later in the chapter on idealism in his The Problems of Philosophy, while the attack on Bradley, although foreshadowed in Russell’s Problems, is spelled out rather lengthily (and a bit nastily) by Moore in “The Conception of Reality” from 1917–18. Their main objection against the two idealistic arguments seems to be that they rely on unjustly presupposing that the mental act of relating to an object (perceiving, thinking, knowing, experiencing) is a necessary condition for the existence of this object. The fallacy involved here consists in failing to make “the distinction between act and object in our apprehending of things”, as Russell (1912 [1974: 42]) puts it, or, in Moore’s terminology of The Refutation, in wrongfully identifying the content of “consciousness” with its object (1912 [1974: 19 ff.]). As soon as this identification is given up and that distinction is made it is at least an open question whether things exist independently of the mind, and idealism insofar it neglects this distinction and holds fast to that identification is refuted because based on an invalid argument.

Whether this line of criticism of idealistic positions is indeed successful might be controversial, and even if it strikes home against Berkeley the charge that they simply conflate knowledge and object hardly seems to do justice to the elaborate arguments of the late nineteenth-century idealists. However, if one is convinced of the correctness of this criticism (as no doubt Moore and Russell were) then it makes way for interesting new perspectives in epistemology and metaphysics. This is so because if this criticism is taken to be successful it permits us to explore the possibility of a theory of knowledge that starts from the assumptions (a) that objects exist independently of us and (b) that to know an object means to be immediately related to the object as it is in itself (i.e., as it is undistorted by and independent from any mental activity). Both Moore and Russell can be understood to have embarked on this exploration in the course of which they came to conceive a position which is aptly called by Peter Hylton “Platonic Atomism” (2013: 329).

The basic idea of this Platonic atomism seems to be the following: Knowledge consists in standing in an immediate relation to an independent individual object (assumption b). This immediate relation to individual objects is best known under Russell’s term “acquaintance”. If, by stipulation, knowledge is ultimately knowledge “by acquaintance”, then knowledge is restricted to knowledge of individual objects. Knowledge basically is knowledge of something or non-propositional knowledge. However, although this rather frugal conception of knowledge might be sufficient to give an account of the possibility of non-propositional knowledge, it is not that easy to see how such a conception can give a sensible explanation of propositional knowledge, i.e., of knowledge that something is so-and-so. Moore and Russell seem to have been acutely aware of this difficulty as is documented in their very explicit efforts to avoid it. It might have been their different reactions to this difficulty which in the years to come led them to proceed on diverging routes in philosophy. As is easy to imagine, there are two obvious reactions to the problem of propositional knowledge provided that assumption (b) is agreed upon. The first is to claim that propositions (Moore prefers the term “judgment” in this context) are individual objects with which the subject is acquainted (if he or she claims to know that something is so-and-so). The second is to broaden the concept of knowledge by not restricting knowledge to knowledge by acquaintance but to allow for other forms of knowledge as well. The first reaction apparently was the reaction of Moore and is formulated most prominently in his early piece “The Nature of Judgment” (1899), while the second can be attributed to Russell and is documented most vividly in his The Problems of Philosophy.

According to Moore a proposition is composed out of concepts. If we are to be acquainted with propositions we have to take their elements, i.e., concepts, to have independent existence (because of assumption a). Moore points out:

… we have approached the nature of a proposition or judgment. A proposition is composed not of words, nor yet of thoughts, but of concepts. Concepts are possible objects of thought; but that is no definition of them. It merely states that they may come into relation with a thinker; and in order that they may do anything, they must already be something. It is indifferent to their nature whether anyone thinks them or not. They are incapable of change; and the relation into which they enter with the knowing subject implies no action or reaction. It is a unique relation which can begin to cease with a change in the subject; but the concept is neither cause nor effect of such a change. The occurrence of the relation has, no doubt, its causes and effects, but these are to be found only in the subject. (1899: para. 9)

Moore is well aware that this analysis of the nature of a proposition leads to some version of what could be called “conceptual realism”, according to which that what is “really” real are concepts because they are the ultimate objects of acquaintance. He explicitly states:

It would seem, in fact, …that a proposition is nothing other than a complex concept. The difference between a concept and a proposition, in virtue of which the latter alone can be called true or false, would seem to lie merely in the simplicity of the former. A proposition is a synthesis of concepts; and, just as concepts are themselves immutably what they are, so they stand in infinite relations to one another equally immutable. A proposition is constituted by any number of concepts, together with a specific relation between them; and according to the nature of this relation the proposition may be either true or false. What kind of relation makes a proposition true, what false, cannot be further defined, but must be immediately recognized (1899: para. 12)

Moore also is very well aware that his view of the nature of concepts commits him to the claim that the world insofar as it is an object of propositional knowledge consists of concepts because these are the only things one can be acquainted with if acquaintance is a condition of knowledge. Thus he writes:

It seems necessary, then, to regard the world as formed of concepts. These are the only objects of knowledge. They cannot be regarded fundamentally as abstractions either from things or from ideas; since both alike can, if anything is to be true of them, composed of nothing but concepts. A thing becomes intelligible first when it is analyzed into its constituent concepts. The material diversity of things, which is generally taken as starting-point, is only derived; and the identity of the concept, in several different things, which appears on that assumption as the problem of philosophy, will now, if it instead be taken as the starting-point, render the derivation easy. Two things are then seen to be differentiated by the different relations in which their common concepts stand to other concepts. The opposition of concepts to existents disappears, since an existent is seen to be nothing but a concept or complex of concepts standing in a unique relation to the concept of existence. (1899: para. 16).

Moore confesses that “I am fully aware of how paradoxical this theory must appear, and even how contemptible” (1899: para. 14). And indeed one wonders whether such an account does not raise more problems than it answers. Fortunately we do not have to be concerned with this question here. However, if we ask whether Moore’s theory really manages to avoid idealism, it is hard not to conclude that its metaphysical commitments are precisely a form of idealism, even if he has been led to his theory by an attempt to maintain epistemological realism! After all, to claim that only concepts are real, that they have a mode of being outside of space and time, that they are non-physical and completely unaffected by any activity of a thinking subject, does not sound very different from statements that can rightly be attributed to, e.g., Hegel, or even ultimately Plato, and that are meant to assert idealism. The main difference in this case is that Moore’s conception of what a concept is has virtually nothing to do with what Hegel means by “concept”, but this does not suffice to establish ontological anti-idealism. Although Moore might avoid identifying concepts with the mental states of subjects by his insistence upon the metaphysical independence of concepts, he comes dangerously close to the point where the difference between ontological idealism and ontological realism vanishes and this distinction becomes a question of terminology.

Russell chooses a different path in the attempt to somehow reconcile the idea that knowledge has to be understood as a relation of acquaintance with objects with the phenomenon of propositional knowledge. He is more flexible both with respect to kinds of knowledge and with respect to kinds of objects with which we can be acquainted than Moore is. First of all, he distinguishes between knowledge of things and knowledge of truths. He recognizes two kinds of knowledge of things: knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description. Knowledge by acquaintance obtains whenever

we have acquaintance with anything of which we are directly aware, without the intermediary of any process of inference or any knowledge of truths. (1912 [1974: 46])

Knowledge by (definite) description obtains

when we know that it [i.e., the object] is “the so-and-so”, i.e., when we know that there is one object, and no more, having a certain property. (1912 [1974: 53])

The relation between these two kinds of knowledge is the following:

[K]nowledge concerning what is known by description is ultimately reducible to knowledge concerning what is known by acquaintance. (1912 [1974: 58])

Knowledge of truths is distinguished from these two kinds of knowledge of things. Knowledge of truths consists in pieces of knowledge that although they cannot be proven by experience are such that we nevertheless “see” their truth (1912 [1974: 74]). Examples of truths that can be known this way are logical principles, the principle of induction, and everything we know a priori. This taxonomy of kinds of knowledge, Russell believes, can account both for the possibility of non-propositional and propositional knowledge and at the same time retain the claim as to the primacy of the acquaintance-relation for knowledge.

The obvious question now is: if all knowledge is ultimately based on acquaintance, what is it we can be acquainted with, i.e., what are the legitimate objects of acquaintance? Because, according to Russell, the acquaintance relation is a relation to individual things this question translates into “what are the individual things we can be acquainted with?” Russell’s answer to this question is that there are exactly two kinds of things we can be acquainted with, namely particulars, i.e., things that exist, and universals, i.e., things that subsist (cf. 1912 [1974: 100]). Particulars comprise sense-data, thoughts, feelings, desires and memories of “things which have been data either of the outer senses or of the inner sense” (1912 [1974: 51]). Universals are

opposed to the particular things that are given in sensation. We speak of whatever is given in sensation, or is of the same nature as things given in sensation, as a particular; by opposition to this, a universal will be anything which may be shared by many particulars. (1912 [1974: 93])

Universals are conceptual entities: “These entities are such as can be named by parts of speech which are not substantives; they are such entities as qualities or relations” (1912 [1974: 90]). Because universals and particulars alike are possible objects of acquaintance both have to be real. However, according to Russell they are real in a different sense. Particulars have existence in time whereas universals have timeless being. The first ones exist, the other subsist. They form two different worlds in that the world of particulars consists of items that are “fleeting, vague, without sharp boundaries” whereas the world of universals “is unchangeable, rigid, exact” (1912 [1974: 100]).

This rough outline of Russell’s epistemic universe is meant to emphasize only those aspects of his position that are of relevance for an assessment of idealistic tendencies in his approach to knowledge. As in the case of Moore it is tempting to interpret his commitment to a timeless world of universals as pointing if not to an endorsement at least to a toleration of a position that is difficult to distinguish from some version of an ontological idealism. But again one has to acknowledge that such a verdict is not very significant because one could as well describe this position as a version of ontological realism. It just depends on what is claimed to be the distinctive feature of idealism. If idealism is a position characterized by taking for granted the reality of conceptual entities that are not mind-dependent then both Moore and Russell endorse it. If idealism is meant to be a position which takes conceptual items to be mind-dependent, that is, dependent on particular minds, then both are realists with respect to concepts. However, it is hard to see how Russell can avoid the epistemological path to idealism given his views about physical objects. This is so because of his sense-datum theory, according to which what is immediately present to us, i.e., what we are acquainted with when we are acquainted with particulars, are just sense-data and not objects in the sense of individual things with qualities standing in relations to each other. For him “among the objects with which we are acquainted are not included physical objects (as opposed to sense-data)” (1912 [1974: 52]). Physical objects are constructions we form out of sense-data together with some descriptive devices, and only with respect to these constructions can we have knowledge by description, i.e., propositional knowledge. If idealism is understood (as has been done here) as involving the claim that what we take to be objects of knowledge are heavily dependent on some activity of the knowing subject, then the very idea of an object as a construction guarantees the endorsement of idealism. Thus, in contrast to their self-proclaimed revolt against the idealism of Berkeley and Bradley, the positions of both Moore and Russell are by no means free of traits that connect them rather closely to well known currents in modern idealism; and these features, above all the supposition that knowers may be immediately presented with some sorts of informational atoms, whether properties, sense-data, or whatever, but that all further knowledge, or all knowledge beyond immediate acquaintance, involves constructive activities of the mind, are common throughout a great deal of recent philosophy.

To trace the subterranean presence of at least epistemological idealism throughout the remainder of twentieth-century philosophy would exceed the brief for this entry. There is room here for just a few hints of how such an account would go. At Oxford, some influence of idealism continued until World War II in the person of Robin George Collingwood, who was influenced by Hegel and the Italian philosopher Benedetto Croce but was a very original thinker. Collingwood’s most characteristic position might be his claim that metaphysics is the study of the presuppositions of human knowledge, at various historical periods, rather than of independently existing entities; thus he might be considered as adopting a fundamental epistemological premise for idealism, although he does not seem to have drawn an ontological conclusion from it—perhaps as a practicing archaeologist as well as a philosopher, the physical world was just too real to him for that. In Germany, Neo-Kantianism, especially of the Marburg school, from Hermann Cohen to Ernst Cassirer, thus from the 1870s to the 1940s, stressed human conceptualization, in Cassirer’s case in the guise of “symbolic forms”, while trying to steer clear of traditional metaphysical questions; their position might thus also be considered a form of epistemological rather than ontological premise for but not outright acceptance of metaphysical idealism. Neo-Kantianism in turn influenced the broader stream of analytic philosophy through the person of Rudolf Carnap, whose Logical Construction of the World (1928) analyzes knowledge in terms of relations constructed on perceived similarities in qualities of objects, thus taking a subjectivist starting-point and then adding constructive activities of the mind to it—a form of epistemological idealism. Nelson Goodman’s Structure of Appearance (1951) undertook a similar project. Subsequent to the Logical Construction, Carnap distinguished between questions “internal” to a conceptual framework or system and “external” questions about which conceptual framework to adopt, which can be decided only on pragmatic or even aesthetic grounds, and this too might be considered a form of epistemological idealism. Thomas Kuhn’s famous conception of “paradigms” of science which are not automatically rejected because of refractory evidence but are given up only when an alternative paradigm comes to seem preferable can be seen as being in the Carnapian tradition, as can Hilary Putnam’s “internal realism” of the 1980s, and both these positions thus reflect some of the motives for epistemological idealism. Even W.V. Quine, who was a committed physicalist in the sense of believing that other sciences are in principle reducible to physics, nevertheless shared an aspect of idealist epistemology in his conception of the “web of belief”, that is, the idea that knowledge consists in a body of beliefs, from particular observation statements down to logical principles, which faces experience only as a whole and which can be modified at any point within it in order to accommodate refractory experience, as seems best. A similar idea was already to be found in Cassirer’s early work Substance and Function (1912), which points to the underlying impulse to epistemological idealism. Wilfrid Sellars’s conception of the “space of reasons”, taken up in Robert Brandom’s inferentialism, also reflects this impulse, although Sellars always considered himself, like his father, a scientific realist, and his most explicitly Kantian work, Science and Metaphysics (1968), gives what might be regarded as a pragmatist rather than idealist spin to Kant’s phenomena/noumena distinction, interpreting the noumenal as what would be known if science were complete, an idea clearly inspired by Charles Sanders Peirce rather than by Kant—although not completely different in spirit from Royce’s idea that the error of our particular beliefs can be understood only by comparison to a body of complete and completely true beliefs, not to some independent, non-belief reality. These are just a few examples of how some of the most prominent paradigms, to borrow Kuhn’s term, of analytic philosophy still reflect the impulse to epistemological idealism even though the name “idealism” was anathematized by Moore, Russell, and the New Realists.

However, one mid-twentieth century philosopher who had no qualms about identifying himself as an idealist was Brand Blanshard (1892–1987). The difference between Blanshard and many of the mid-twentieth century analytic philosophers is precisely that Blanshard accepted the assumption that there must be a necessary isomorphism between knowledge and its object, and so was not content to posit something real outside of the web of belief or space of reasons, but brought reality into the realm of thought.

Blanshard was an undergraduate at the University of Michigan, then won a Rhodes scholarship to Merton College, Oxford, where his tutor was H.W.B. Joseph and he also met Bradley, a lifelong research fellow at Merton. After earning an MA at Columbia, where he participated in a research project under John Dewey, and then World War I service in France, he completed his Oxford BA and then a PhD at Harvard under the supervision of C.I. Lewis—so he had a very diverse philosophical education. He taught at Swarthmore College from 1925 to 1944 and at Yale from 1944 until 1961. Remarkably, Blanshard was at different points in this career in the same department as each of the Sellarses—he was an undergraduate at Michigan when Roy Wood Sellars was a young teacher there, and was then Wilfrid Sellars’s colleague during the latter’s tenure at Yale from 1958 to 1963. There are affinities between his views and theirs, especially with Wilfrid Sellars’s conception of conceptually-informed perception; but they differ decidedly on the issue of idealism vs. material realism. Blanshard’s idealism was at full-strength in the two volumes of The Nature of Thought (1939), which was dedicated to the Oxford idealists H.H. Joachim and E.F. Carritt; many arguments remained the same but the inference to idealism was somewhat toned-down in his later trilogy, Reason and Goodness (1961), Reason and Analysis (1962), and Reason and Belief (1974).

The affinity with Wilfrid Sellars lies in Book I of The Nature of Thought, “Thought in Perception”, in which Blanshard argues that we always perceive something “as this rather than that”, thus that “the recognition of the universal and the placing it in relation to other universals” are always inseparable from perception (1939: volume I, p. 65). This recognition of the conceptually-infused character of perception, the position adopted by such Sellarsians as John McDowell (McDowell 1994) and currently known as “conceptualism”, does not by itself entail idealism. Rather, Blanshard’s idealism is on display in Volume II, Book III of his work, “The Movement of Reflection”, where he offers his theory of truth. Here he argues that coherence rather than correspondence is not only the “test” but also the “nature” of truth:

It is hard to see … how anyone could consistently take coherence as the test of truth unless he also took it as a character of reality. (1939: vol. II, p. 267)

Here Blanshard evinces the premise that knowledge must be isomorphic with the known that underlies many arguments for idealism. His next move, the characterization of coherence as a character of reality in terms of systematicity, seems sufficiently abstract to remain neutral about the ontology of reality. But he also argues that knowledge or thought must be part of a single system with its object, the world, (1939: vol. II, p. 292), which, since knowledge is incontrovertibly mental, pushes the whole system in that direction. His idealism becomes even clearer in his defense of the Bradleian doctrine that all relations are internal relations, and as such necessary relations, so that

These old sharp lines of mutual exclusion between essence, property, and accident are like the lines of a surveyor, of great convenience, no doubt, to ourselves, but misleading when taken as divisions marked out by nature. (1939: vol. II, p. 480)

and when he further asserts

(i) that all things are causally related, directly or indirectly; (ii) that being causally related involves being logically related. (1939: vol. II, p. 492)

This makes sense if the character of reality is ultimately either conceptual or mental in nature, subject to logical relations, and not purely physical, subject merely to causal relations. Blanshard’s statement that the “old sharp lines” between essence and accident are not so sharp after all might sound like W.V.O. Quine’s thesis that there is no sharp distinction between the analytic and the synthetic (Quine 1951), but while this leads Quine to treat all our beliefs as if they are synthetic, ultimately dependent upon our total response (the web of belief) to observation of external reality, Blanshard’s position is more that all our beliefs are ultimately analytic, that is, analyses of the conceptual structure of reality, or of reality as a conceptual structure. Blanshard concludes his lengthy argument with claims reminiscent of Hegel:

The aim of thought from its very beginning … was at understanding. The ideal of complete understanding would be achieved only when this system that rendered it necessary was not a system that itself was fragmentary and contingent, but one that was all-inclusive and so organized internally that every part was linked to every other by intelligible necessity… . If our account of the end is accepted, it will be found to throw light backward alone the whole course of the inquiry. For it presents the goal which thought, from its first stirrings in perception, has more or less unknowingly been seeking, the end potential in every idea, the whole implicitly at work at every stage in the movement of reflection, exercising its steady pressure against irrelevant excursions and toward the completion of fragmental knowledge into stable system. (1939: vol. II, p. 518)

Knowledge must be knowledge of necessary connections, and reality itself must be an intrinsically intelligible system of connections or internal relations. Blanshard’s combination of the premise of the necessary isomorphism of knowledge and the known with the doctrine of internal relations exemplifies both an epistemological and an ontological argument for idealism.

Since the work of Blanshard in the 1930s, very few Anglophone philosophers have attempted an explicit defense of idealism. Both John Foster, in The Case for Idealism (1982) and Timothy Sprigge in The Vindication of Absolute Idealism (1983) constructed defenses of what Foster defined by the three theses

(1) Ultimate contingent reality is wholly mental. (2) Ultimate contingent reality is wholly non-physical. (3) The physical world is the logical product of facts about human sense-experience (Foster 1982: 3)

and what Sprigge called “panpsychism”. In both cases their defenses were based on the epistemological premise that the object of perception is fully present in the act of perception; Sprigge added the argument that we must presuppose some noumenal ground for our phenomenal objects; but unlike Kant, who after he stripped things in themselves of their spatiality and/or temporality, insisted that we remain otherwise agnostic about their nature, Sprigge argued that

the noumenal backing or “in itself” of the physical by saying that it consists in innumerable mutually interacting centres of experience, or, what comes to the same, of pulses and flows of experience. (Sprigge 1983: 85)

In other words, the noumenal “backing” of the phenomenal is nothing but the sum total of actual and possible human experience, which Sprigge considers, in terms going back to Bradley, a “concrete universal”. One could argue that this confused the sum total of experience or thought about reality with reality itself, but Sprigge rejects that kind of distinction from the beginning of his argument; basically, he holds all knowledge to be knowledge by acquaintance, and what we have when we subsume any experience under a concept or universal is an immediate relation to part of a concrete universal—so all of reality is itself mental in nature.

These arguments have remained outliers, for analytical philosophy has been overwhelmingly influenced by the paradigm of the natural sciences, and often committed to some form of naturalism. Or so it would seem; however, as the examples of Green and Royce as well as earlier idealists such as Schelling make clear, there is no necessary incompatibility between idealism and some forms of naturalism. In particular, naturalism, especially broadly understood as a methodology rather than ontology, is not automatically committed to the kinds of realism, especially the naïve realism of assuming that our representations reproduce the physical constitution of external objects, that were initially opposed to idealism. One might even get the impression that in contemporary scientifically-oriented philosophy idealism is no longer considered a threat. The way in which in current discussions in the philosophy of mind some idealistic conceptions under the general name of “Panpsychism”, already used by Sprigge, are taken seriously (Thomas Nagel, David Chalmers) seems to be a good indicator of this tendency.

In so-called “continental” philosophy, we might suggest, the main alternative to the idealism of the nineteenth century and lingering tendencies to idealism in both Neo-Kantianism and Husserlian phenomenology has not been any straightforward form of realism, but rather the “life philosophy” (Lebensphilosophie) pioneered by Wilhelm Dilthey (1833–1916), then extensively developed by Martin Heidegger (1889–1976), and, without Heidegger’s political baggage, by the French philosopher Maurice Merleau-Ponty (1908–1961). The central idea of this approach to philosophy is that the starting-point of thought and knowledge is neither anything “subjective” like sense-data or ideas nor anything simply objective like the objects of science, but the lived experience of “being-in-the-world”, from which both the “subjective” such as sense-data and the “objective” such as objects theorized by science are abstractions or constructions made for specific purposes, but which should not be reified in any way that creates a problem of getting from one side to the other, let alone any possibility of reducing one side to the other and thus ending up with a choice between idealism and realism. Apart from all issues of style, and whether this has been clear to the two parties or not, perhaps the deepest reason for the on-going divide between “analytical” and “continental” philosophy is the on-going tension between the impulse to epistemological idealism and the attraction of the idea that “being-in-the-world” precedes the very distinction between subjective and objective. But then again, this underlying idea of the Heideggerian approach to philosophy may already be suggested in the work of Schelling, so perhaps the fundamental debate within twentieth-century philosophy has taken place within a framework itself inspired by a form of idealism, namely phenomenology. But this would be a long story, for another day.

At the beginning of the twenty-first century, however, idealism, understood as a philosophical program, may be sharing the fate of many other projects in the history of modern philosophy. Originally conceived in the middle of the eighteenth century as a real alternative to materialistic and naturalistic perspectives, it may now become sublated and integrated into views about the nature of reality that ignore metaphysical oppositions or epistemological questions connected with the assumption of the priority of mind over matter or the other way round. Instead the focus may be shifting to establishing a “neutral” view according to which “anything goes” (Feyerabend) as long as it does not contradict or at least is not incompatible with our favored metaphysical, epistemological and scientific (both natural and social) methods and practices.


All translations are by the authors unless otherwise noted.

Primary Literature

  • Baumgarten, Alexander Gottlieb, 1739, Metaphysics: A Critical Translation with Kant’s Elucidations, Selected Notes, and Related Materials, translated and edited by Courtney J. Fugate and John Hymers, London: Bloomsbury, 2013.
  • Beattie, James, 1776, Essays on the Nature and Immutability of Truth, On Poetry and Music, On Laughter, On the Utility of Classical Learning, Edinburgh: William Creech.
  • Berkeley, George, 1710, Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge. Reprinted in Berkeley Works: volume 2, 21–115. Citation by part then section number.
  • –––, 1948–1957, The Works of George Berkeley, edited by A. A. Luce and T. E. Jessop, 9 volumes, London and Edinburgh: Thomas Nelson and Sons.
  • Blanshard, Brand, 1939, The Nature of Thought, 2 vols, London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • –––, 1961, Reason and Goodness, New York: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1962, Reason and Analysis, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 1974, Reason and Belief, London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Bosanquet, Bernard, 1885, Knowledge and Reality, London: Kegan Paul, Trench and Trubner.
  • –––, 1888, Logic, or the Morphology of Knowledge, Oxford: Clarendon Press. Second edition, 1911.
  • –––, 1912, The Principle of Individuality and Value, London: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1913a, The Value and Destiny of the Individual, London: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1913b, The Distinction between Mind and its Objects, Manchester: Sherratt and Hughes.
  • Bradley, Francis Herbert, 1876, Ethical Studies, Oxford: Clarendon Press. Second edition, 1927.
  • –––, 1883, The Principles of Logic, Oxford: Clarendon Press. Second edition, 1922.
  • –––, 1893 [1897], Appearance and Reality: A Metaphysical Essay, Oxford: Clarendon Press; second edition, 1897.
  • –––, 1914, Essays on Truth and Reality, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1935, Collected Essays, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Caird, Edward, 1879, “Mr. Balfour on Transcendentalism”, Mind, old series, 4(13): 111–114. doi:10.1093/mind/os-4.13.111
  • –––, 1883, Hegel, Edinburgh: William Blackwood.
  • –––, 1889, The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant, 2 volumes, Glasgow: James Maclehose.
  • –––, 1892, Essays on Literature and Philosophy, 2 volumes, Glasgow: James Maclehose.
  • –––, 1893, The Evolution of Religion, Glasgow: James Maclehose.
  • –––, 1904, The Evolution of Theology in the Greek Philosophers, Glasgow: James Maclehose.
  • Carnap, Rudolf, 1928, Der logische Aufbau der Welt, Leipzig: Felix Meiner Verlag; translated as The Logical Structure of the World, Rolf A. George (trans.), second edition, LaSalle: Open Court, 2003.
  • Cassirer, Ernst, 1910–21, Substance and Function and Einstein’s Theory of Relativity, translated by William Curtis Swabey and Marie Collins Swabey, Chicago: Open Court, 1923.
  • –––, 1923–29, The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, translated by Ralph Manheim, 3 volumes, New Haven and London: Yale University Press, 1953–59.
  • Collier, Arthur, 1713 [1909], Clavis Universalis: Or, A New Inquiry after Truth, Being a Demonstration of the Non-Existence, or Impossibility, of an External World, London: Gosling. Reprinted Ethel Bowman (ed.), LaSalle: Open Court.
  • Collingwood, Robin George, 1924, Speculum Mentis, or The Map of Knowledge, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1933, An Essay on Philosophical Method, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1938, The Principles of Art, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1940, An Essay on Metaphysics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1942, The New Leviathan, revised edition, edited by David Boucher, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992
  • –––, 1945, The Idea of Nature, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1946, The Idea of History, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Descartes, René, c. 1628, Regulae ad directionem ingenii (Rules for the Direction of the Mind), unpublished in his lifetime. Translated and printed in his Philosophical Writings, 1: 7–78.
  • –––, 1637, Discours de la Méthode Pour bien conduire sa raison, et chercher la vérité dans les sciences (Discourse on the Method of Rightly Conducting One’s Reason and of Seeking Truth in the Sciences), Leiden. Translated and printed in his Philosophical Writings, 1: 109–176.
  • –––, 1641, Meditationes de Prima Philosophia, in qua Dei existentia et animæ immortalitas demonstratur (Meditations on First Philosophy), Paris. Translated and printed in his Philosophical Writings, 2: 1–61.
  • –––, 1644, Principia Philosophiae (Principles of Philosophy), Amsterdam: Elzevir. Translated and printed in his Philosophical Writings, 1: 177–292.
  • –––, 1985–91, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, edited by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny, 3 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Falckenberg, Richard, 1886, Geschichte der neueren philosophie von Nikolaus von Kues bis zur gegenwart, Leipzig: Veit; second edition, 1892.
  • Feder, Johann and Christian Garve, 1782, “Critik der reinen Vernunft Von Immanuel Kant”, Zugabe zu den Göttingischen Anzeigen von gelehrten Sachen, 3. St¨ck, 19 Januar 1782, pp. 40–8, translated in Sassen 2000, pp. 53–8.
  • Feyerabend, Paul, 1975, Against Method, Outline of an Anarchistic Theory of Knowledge, New York: Humanities Press.
  • Fichte, Johann Gottlieb, 1794/95, Grundlage der gesamten Wissenschaftslehre, GA 1,2. Leipzig, translated as Doctrine of Science or Foundations of the Science of Knowledge.
  • –––, 1797, Erste Einleitung in die Wissenschaftslehre. In: Philosophisches Journal. Band V, pp. 1–47. Augsburg.
  • –––, 1797, Zweite Einleitung in die Wissenschaftslehre. In: Philosophisches Journal. Band V, pp. 319–378; Band VI, pp. 1–40. Augsburg, translated as First and Second Introduction into the Doctrine of Science.
  • –––, [Werke] 1845–46, Johann Gottlieb Fichtes sämmtliche Werke, edited by Immanuel Hermann Fichte, Berlin: Veit. [Citation by volume and page number.]
  • –––, [GA] 1962–2012, Gesamtausgabe der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 42 vols., edited by Reinhard Lauth, Erich Fuchs, and Hans Gliwitzky, Stuttgart: Frommann-Holzboog. Cited as GA followed by series, volume and page number.
  • Foster, John, 1982, The Case for Idealism, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Garve, Christian, 1783, “Kritik der reinen Venunft, von Immanuel Kant,” Allgemeine deutsche Bibliothek, Anhang zu dem 37ten bus 52ten Bande, Zweite Abtheilung, pp. 838–62, translation in Sassen 2000, pp. 59–77.
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1951, Structure of Appearance, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Green, Thomas Hill, 1874, Introduction to Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature, reprinted in his Works, Volume I, pp. 1–371.
  • –––, 1883, Prolegomena to Ethics, Oxford: Clarendon Press. Fifth edition, 1907. [Green 1883 available online]
  • –––, 1885–88, Works of Thomas Hill Green, edited by R.L. Nettleship, 3 volumes, London: Longmans, Green, and Co.
  • –––, 1886, Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant; in Works, Volume II, pp. 1–155.
  • ––– 1886a, Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation, in Works, Volume II, pp. 335–553.
  • Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich, [Difference-Writing] 1801, Differenz des Fichteschen und Schellingschen Systems der Philosophie, Jena. Translated as The Difference between Fichte and Schelling’s System of Philosophy, H.S. Harris and Walter Cerf (trans), Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1977.
  • –––, 1802, Glauben und Wissen oder die Reflexionsphilosophie der Subjektivität (Faith and Knowledge), in Kritisches Journal der Philosophie (Critical journal of Philosophy), v. 2, pt. 1.
  • ––– 1802/03, Über die wissenschaftlichen Behandlungsarten des Naturrechts, seine Stelle in der praktischen Philosophie und sein Verhältnis zu den positive Reschtswissenschafte (On the Scientific Ways of Treating Natural Law, on its Place in Practical Philosophy, and its Relation to the Positive Sciences of Right, in Political Writings), Kritisches Journal der Philosophie, Schelling and Hegel (eds), December 1802 and May 1803.
  • –––, 1804/5, Jena Systemdraft II, in GW 7, 3–338.
  • –––, 1807, Phänomenologie des Geistes, Bamberg and Würzburg: Joseph Anton Goebbardt. Translated as Phenomenology of the Spirit, Arnold V. Miller (trans.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977.
  • –––, 1812, Wissenschaft der Logik, Nürnberg. Translated as Science of Logic, George di Giovanni (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010.
  • –––, 1817, Enzyklopädie der philosophischen Wissenschaften im Grundrisse (Enzyklopädie der philosophischen Wissenschaften im Grundrisse), Heidelberg; second edition 1827.
  • –––, 1833, Vorlesungen über die Geschichte der Philosophie (Lectures on the History of Philosophy), edited by Karl Ludwig Michelet, Berlin.
  • –––, [GW] 1968–, Gesammelte Werke, edited by the Rheinisch-Westfälischen Akademie der Wissenschaften. Hamburg: Felix Meiner Verlag. [Citation by volume and page number.]
  • Hobbes, Thomas, 1640, Elements of Law, Natural and Politic, edited by Ferdinand Toennies, 1889, London: Simpkin & Marshall. Cited by part.chapter.section.
  • –––, 1651, Leviathan, edited by Noel Malcolm, 3 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2012.
  • –––, 1655, De Corpore, in his Body, Man, and Citizen, edited by Richard S. Peters, New York: Collier Books, 1962.
  • Hume, David, 1739–40, A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by David Fate and Mary J. Norton, 2 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007. Cited by book, part, section, and, sometimes, paragraph.
  • –––, 1748, An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, edited by Tom L. Beauchamp, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000.
  • Jacobi, Friedrich Heinrich, 1787, David Hume über den Glauben, oder Idealismus und Realismus. Ein Gespräch, Breslau: Gottlieb Löwe. Translated as David Hume on Faith or Idealism and Realism: A Dialogue, in George di Giovanni (ed.), The Main Philosophical Writings and the Novel “Allwill”, Montréal: McGill-Queen’s University Press, 1994, 253–338.
  • Kant, Immanuel, 1770, De Mundi Sensibilis atque Intelligibilis Forma et Principiis (On the Forms and Principles of the Sensible and Intelligible Worlds), University of Königsberg.
  • –––, 1781/87, Kritik der reinen Vernunft, Riga. Translated as Critique of Pure Reason, translated by Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • –––, 1783, Prolegomena zu einer jeden künftigen Metaphysik, die als Wissenschaft wird auftreten können, Riga. Translated as Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics, Gary Hatfield (trans./ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997. Also in Kant 2002.
  • –––, 1790, Kritik der Urteilskraft. Translated as Critique of the Power of Judgment, Paul Guyer and Eric Matthews (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000..
  • –––, 1900–, Kants gesammelte Schriften, edited by the Royal Prussian (later German, then Berlin-Brandenburg) Academy of Sciences, 29 volumes, Berlin: Georg Reimer, later Walter de Gruyter.
  • –––, 2002, Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, edited by Henry E. Allison and Peter Heath, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • –––, 2005, Notes and Fragments, edited by Paul Guyer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, ca. 1680–84, “Primae Veritates” (Primary/First Truths), unpublished in his lifetime. Printed and translated in PPL: 267–271.
  • –––, 1686, Discours de métaphysique (Discourse on Metaphysics), unpublished in his lifetime. Printed and translated in PPL: 303–330.
  • –––, c. 1714, “La Monadologie” (The Monadology), unpublished at his death. Printed and translated in PPL: 643–653.
  • –––, [PPL] 1969, Philosophical Papers and Letters, edited by Leroy E. Loemker; second edition, Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Locke, John, 1690, An Essay concerning Human Understanding, edited by Peter H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975. Cited by book.chapter.section
  • McTaggart, John McTaggart Ellis, 1896, Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1901 [1934], “The Further Determination of the Absolute”, in McTaggart 1901: 252–292 (ch. IX). Reprinted in McTaggart 1934: 210–272 (ch. X).
  • –––, 1901, Studies in Hegelian Cosmology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Second edition, 1918.
  • –––, 1910, A Commentary on Hegel’s Logic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, [NE] 1921–7, The Nature of Existence, 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Sections 1–293 in volume 1; sections 294–913 in volume 2.
  • –––, 1924 [1934], “An Ontological Idealism”, in Contemporary British Philosophy (first series), J. H. Muirhead (ed.), London: Allen & Unwin, pp. 251–269. Reprinted in McTaggart 1934: 273–292 (ch. XI).
  • –––, 1934, Philosophical Studies, edited by S.V.Keeling, London. Arnold.
  • Malebranche, Nicolas, 1674–75, The Search after Truth, translated by Thomas M. Lennon and Paul J. Olscamp, Columbus, OH: Ohio State University Press, 1980.
  • –––, 1688, Dialogues on Metaphysics and Religion, edited by Nicholas Jolley and David Scott, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Moore, George Edward, 1899, “The Nature of Judgment”, Mind, new series, 8(2): 176–193. doi:10.1093/mind/VIII.2.176
  • –––, 1903, “The Refutation of Idealism”, Mind, new series 12(4): 433–453. doi:10.1093/mind/XII.4.433
  • –––, 1918, “The Conception of Reality”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 18(1): 101–120. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/18.1.101
  • –––, 1922, Philosophical Studies, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • –––, 1959, Philosophical Papers, London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • Nietzsche, Friedrich, 1882, Die fröhliche Wissenschaft, Chemnitz. Translated as The Gay Science, edited by Bernard Williams, translated by Josefine Nauckhoff, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • –––, 1887, Zur Genealogie der Moral: Eine Streitschrift, Leipzig. Translated as On the Genealogy of Morality, edited by Keith Ansell-Perason, translated by Carol Diethe, second edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.
  • –––, 1888–89, Ecce homo: Wie man wird, was man ist), unpublished manuscript.
  • –––, [KSA] 1980, Sämtliche Werke: Kritische Studienausgabe in 15 Bänden, edited by Giorgio Colli & Mazzino Montinari, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter. [Citation by volume number and fragment number(s).]
  • –––, [eKGWB], Digitale Kritische Gesamtausgabe Werke und Briefe, Paolo D’Iorio (ed.), Nietzsche Source, eKGWB BVN-1888, 1135.
  • Peirce, Charles Sanders, [CE] 1982, Writings of Charles S. Peirce. A Chronological Edition, Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press. Cited as CE, followed by volume and page number.
  • –––, [CP] 1931, Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, edited by Charles Hartshorne & Paul Weiss, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. Cited as CP, followed by volume and page number.
  • –––, [EP] 1992, The Essential Peirce, 2 volumes, edited by Peirce Edition Project. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press. Cited as EP, followed by volume and page number.
  • Reid, Thomas, 1785a, An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense, fourth edition; critical edition by Derek R. Brookes, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2000.
  • –––, 1785b, Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, critical edition by Derek R. Brookes, annotations by Derek R. Brookes and Knud Hakkonssen, University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2002.
  • Royce, Josiah, 1885, The Religious Aspect of Philosophy: A Critique of the Bases of Conduct and Faith, Boston: Houghton, Mifflin & Co. [Royce 1885 available online]
  • –––, 1892, The Spirit of Modern Philosophy: An Essay in the Form of Lectures, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company. [Royce 1892 available online]
  • –––, 1899–1901, The World and the Individual, First and Second Series, 2 volumes, New York: MacMillan.
  • –––, 1918, The Problem of Christianity, New York: MacMillan.
  • –––, 1919, Lectures on Modern Idealism, New Haven: Yale University Press
  • Russell, Bertrand, 1912 [1974], The Problems of Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Reprinted 1974.
  • Schelling, Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph, [IP] 1797 [1988],Ideen zu einer Philosophie der Natur als Einleitung in das Studium dieser Wissenschaft (Jena and Leipzig, Breitkopf und Härtel), in SW 1, 653 ff. Translated as Ideas for a Philosophy of Nature: as Introduction to the Study of this Science, Errol E. Harris and Peter Heath (trans), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988. Page numbers in citations from the translation.
  • –––, 1798, Von der Weltseele, eine Hypothese der höheren Physik zur Erklärung des allgemeinen Organismus (On the World Soul. An Hypothesis of Higher Physics for Explaining Universal Organism). Hamburg: Perthes. In: SW 1, 413 ff.
  • –––, 1800, System des transcendentalen Idealismus, Tübingen. Translated as System of Transcendental Idealism, Peter Heath (trans.), Charlottesville, VA: University of Virginia Press, 1978.
  • –––, [SW] 1856–61, Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph Schelling’s Sämmtliche Werke, edited by Karl F.A. Schelling, I Abtheilung (Volumes 1–10), II Abtheilung (Volumes 1–4), Stuttgart: Cotta. [Citation by volume and page number.]
  • Schopenhauer, Arthur, 1813, Ueber die vierfache Wurzel des Satzes vom zureichenden Grunde (On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason), doctoral dissertation, Jena.
  • –––, [WWR] 1819 [2010], Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung, Leipzig; translated as The World as Will and Representation, Judith Norman, Alaistair Welchman, and Christopher Janaway (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010. Page numbers in citations from the translation.
  • Spinoza, Baruch, 1677, Ethics, in The Collected Works of Spinoza (Volume I), edited and translated by Edwin Curley, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1985; see also Spinoza: Complete Works, translations by Samuel Shirley, edited by Michael L. Morgan, Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • Sprigge, T.L.S., 1983, The Vindication of Absolute Idealism, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press.
  • Wolff, Christian, 1751, Vernünftige Gedancken von Gott, der Welt, und der Seele des Menschen, auch allen Dingen überhaupt, Neue Auflage hin und wieder vermehret, Halle: Renger.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Allison, Henry E., 1983, Kant’s Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press. Second edition, 2004.
  • Altmann, Matthew C. (ed.), 2014, The Palgrave Handbook of German Idealism, Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Ameriks, Karl, 2000a, Kant and the Fate of Autonomy: Problems in the Appropriation of the Critical Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139173346
  • ––– (ed.), 2000b, The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CCOL0521651786
  • –––, 2012, Kant’s Elliptical Path, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199693689.001.0001
  • Anscombe, G. E. M., 1976, “The Question of Linguistic Idealism”, Acta Fennica Philosophica, 28: 188–215. Reprinted in her Collected Papers, Volume I: From Parmenides to Wittgenstein, Oxford: Blackwell, 1981, pp.112–33.
  • Barrett, Clifford, 1932, Contemporary Idealism in America, New York: Macmillan.
  • Baugh, Bruce, 2003, The French Hegel: From Surrealism to Postmodernism, London: Routledge.
  • Beiser, Frederick C., 1987, The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2002, German Idealism: The Struggle against Subjectivism, 1791–1801, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2014, Late German Idealism: Trendelenburg and Lotze, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199682959.001.0001
  • Boucher, David and Andrew Vincent, 2012, British Idealism: A Guide for the Perplexed, London: Continuum.
  • Boyle, Nicholas and Liz Dizley (eds), 2013, The Impact of Idealism: The Legacy of Post-Kantian German Thought, 4 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. See especially Volume I,
    • Volume 1: Philosophy and Natural Sciences, Karl Ameriks (volume ed.).
    • Volume 2: Historical, Social and Political Thought, John Walker (volume ed.)
    • Volume 3: Aesthetics and Literature, Christoph Jamme and Ian Cooper (volume eds)
    • Volume 4:Religion, Nicholas Adams (volume ed.)
  • Brandom, Robert B., 2000, Articulating Reasons: An Introduction to Inferentialism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2002, Tales of the Mighty Dead: Historical Essays in the Metaphysics of Intentionality, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2009, Reason in Philosophy: Animating Ideas, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2019, A Spirit of Trust: A Reading of Hegel’s Phenomenology, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Breazeale, Daniel, 2013, Thinking Through the “Wissenschaftslehre”: Themes from Fichte’s Early Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199233632.001.0001
  • Bubner, Rüdiger, 2003, The Innovations of Idealism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511498046
  • Butler, Judith, 1987, Subjects of Desire: Hegelian Reflections in Twentieth-Century France, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Campbell, Charles Arthur, 1931, Scepticism and Construction: Bradley’s Sceptical Principle as the Basis of Constructive Philosophy, London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • –––, 1938, “In Defence of Free-Will”, Glasgow inaugural lecture. Reprinted in his In Defence of Free-Will, with Other Essays, London: George Allen and Unwin, 1967.
  • –––, 1956, “Self-Activity and its Modes”, in Contemporary British Philosophy: Personal Statements, third series, H.D.Lewis (ed.), London: Macmillan, pp. 85–115.
  • Chalmers, David, 1996, The Conscious Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2013, Pansychism and Panprotopsychism, The Amherst Lecture in Philosophy 8: 1–35.
  • –––, 2019, “Idealism and the Mind-Body Problem”, in The Routledge Handbook of Pansychism, William Seager (ed.), London: Routledge, ch. 28.
  • Cunningham, G. Watts, 1933, The Idealistic Argument in Recent British and American Philosophy, New York: Century.
  • Davidson, Donald, 1984, “On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme”, in his Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, Oxford; Oxford University Press, pp. 183–98.
  • deVries, Willem A., 2009, “Getting beyond Idealism”, in Empiricism, Perceptual Knowledge, Normativity, and Realism: Essays on Wilfrid Sellars, Willem A. deVries (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 211–245.
  • Dicker, Georges, 2011, Berkeley’s Idealism: A Critical Examination, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195381467.001.0001
  • Dudley, Will, 2007, Understanding German Idealism, London: Acumen.
  • Dunham, Jeremy, Iain Hamilton Grant, and Sean Watson, 2011, Idealism: The History of a Philosophy, London: Acumen.
  • Ewing, Alfred Cyril, 1934, Idealism: a Critical Survey, London: Methuen.
  • –––, 1957, The Idealist Tradition: From Berkeley to Blanshard, Glencoe: The Free Press.
  • Findlay, John N., 1970, Ascent to the Absolute, London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • Fogelin, Robert J., 1985, Hume’s Skepticism in the “Treatise of Hume Nature”, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Foster, John, 1982, The Case for Idealism, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Förster, Eckart, 2011 [2013], 25 Jahre der Philosophie: eine systematische Rekonstruktion, Frankfurt am Main : Vittorio Klostermann. Translated as The Twenty-Five Years of Philosophy: a Systematic Reconstruction, Brady Bowman (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2013.
  • Garber, Daniel, and Beatrice Longuenesse (eds), 2008, Kant and the Early Moderns, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Gardner, Sebastian and Paul Franks, 2002, “From Kant to Post-Kantian German Idealism”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 76: 211–246. doi:10.1111/1467-8349.00096 and doi:10.1111/1467-8349.00097
  • Garrett, Don, 1997, Cognition and Commitment in Hume’s Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Goldschmidt, Tyron and Kenneth L. Pearce (eds.) 2017, Idealism: New Essays in Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Griffin, Nicholas, 1991, Russell’s Idealist Apprenticeship, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780198244530.001.0001
  • Guyer, Paul, 1983, “Kant’s Intentions in the Refutation of Idealism,” Philosophical Review 92: 329–83.
  • –––, 1987, Kant and the Claims of Knowledge, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511624766
  • –––, 2005, Kant’s System of Nature and Freedom: Selected Essays, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hammer, Espen (ed.), 2007, German Idealism: Contemporary Perspectives, London and New York: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203030837
  • Franks, Paul, 2005, All or Nothing: Systematicity, Transcendental Arguments, and Skepticism in German Idealism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Henrich, Dieter, 2003, Between Kant and Hegel: Lectures on German Idealism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Horstmann, Rolf-Peter, 1984, Ontologie und Relationen: Hegel, Bradley, Russell und die Kontroverse über interne und externe Beziehungen, Königstein: Athenäum.
  • –––, 1991, Die Grenzen der Vernunft: Eine Untersuchung zu Zielen und Motiven des Deutschen Idealismus, Frankfurt: Athenäum.
  • –––, 2008, “Fichtes anti-skeptisches Programm: Zu den Strategien der Wissenschaftslehren bis 1801/02”, in Internationales Jahrbuch des deutschen Idealismus 5: 47–89.
  • Hylton, Peter, 1990, Russell, Idealism, and the Emergence of Analytic Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/019824018X.001.0001
  • –––, 2013, “Idealism and the Origins of Analytic Philosophy”, in Boyle and Disley 2013: Vol. 1, pp. 323–346. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139626675.014
  • Jaeschke, Walter and Andreas Arndt, 2012, Die Klassischer Deutsche Philosophie nach Kant: System der reinen Vernunft und ihre Kritik 1785–1845, Munich: C.H. Beck.
  • Kemp Smith, Norman, 1924, Prolegomena to an Idealist Theory of Knowledge, London: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1941, The Philosophy of David Hume: A Critical Study of its Origins and Central Doctrines, London: Macmillan.
  • Köhnke, Klaus Christian, 1986 [1991], Entstehung und Aufstieg des Neukantianismu: die deutsche Universitätsphilosophie zwischen Idealismus und Postitivismus, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp. Translated as The Rise of Neo-Kantianism: German Academic Philosophy between Idealism and Positivism, R.J. Hollingdale (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Kuklick, Bruce, 1977, The Rise of American Philosophy: Cambridge, Massachusetts, 1860–1930, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • –––, 1985, Churchmen and Philosophers: From Jonathan Edwards to John Dewey, New Haven, CT: Yale University Press.
  • Kutschera, Franz v., 2006, Die Wege des Idealismus, Paderborn: Mentis.
  • Longuenesse, Béatrice, 1981 [2007], Hegel et la critique de la métaphysique: étude sur la doctrine de l’essence, Paris: Librairie philosophique J. Vrin. Translated as Hegel’s Critique of Metaphysics, Nicole J. Simek (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511487262
  • McDowell, John, 1994, Mind and World, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2009, Having the World in View: Essays on Kant, Hegel and Sellars, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Mander, W.J., 1997, “McTaggart’s Argument for Idealism”, Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 11(1): 53–72.
  • ––– (ed.), 2000, Anglo-American Idealism, 1865–1927, Westport, CT: Greenwood Press.
  • –––, 2011, British Idealism: A History, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199559299.001.0001
  • Mander, W.J. and Stamatoula Panagakou (eds), 2016, British Idealism and the Concept of the Self, London: Palgrave Macmillan. doi:10.1057/978-1-137-46671-6
  • Martin, Wayne, 1997, Idealism and Objectivity: Understanding Fichte’s Jena Project, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Moore, Adrian W., 2000, Points of View, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0198250622.001.0001
  • –––, 2011, The Evolution of Modern Metaphysics: Making Sense of Things, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139029223
  • Moyar, Dean (ed.), 2010, The Routledge Companion to Nineteenth Century Philosophy, London: Routledge. doi:10.4324/9780203856581
  • Muirhead, J. H., 1931, The Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy: Studies in the History of Idealism in England and America, London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • Myers, Gustavus, 1925, The History of American Idealism, New York: Boni and Liveright.
  • Nagel, Thomas, 1986, The View from Nowhere, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2012, Mind and Cosmos: Why the Materialist Neo-Darwinian Conception of Nature is Almost Certainly False, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nauern, F.-G., 1971, Revolution, Idealism, and Human Freedom: Schelling, Hölderlin, and Hegel and the Crisis of Early German Idealism, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Nicholson, Peter P., 1990, The Political Philosophy of the British Idealists: Selected Studies, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • O’Hear, Anthony (ed.), 1999, German Philosophy since Kant, (Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplements 44), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511524110
  • Pinkard, Terry P., 1994, Hegel’s Phenomenology: The Sociality of Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2002, German Philosophy 1760–1860: The Legacy of Idealism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511801846
  • Pippin, Robert B., 1989, Hegel’s Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-Consciousness, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511621109
  • –––, 1997, Idealism as Modernism: Hegelian Variations, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139172943
  • –––, 2019, Hegel’s Realm of Shadows: Logic and Metaphysics in the Science of Logic, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman, 1951, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” Philosophical Review 60: 20–43, reprinted in From a Logical Point of View, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1953.
  • Quinton, Anthony M., 1971, “Absolute Idealism”, Proceedings of the British Academy, 57: 303–29. [Quinton 1971 available online]
  • Redding, Paul, 2007, Analytic Philosophy and the Return of Hegelian Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511487620
  • –––, 2009, Continental Idealism: Leibniz to Nietzsche, London: Routledge.
  • Rescher, Nicholas, 1973, Conceptual Idealism, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • –––, 1987, Ethical Idealism, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • –––, 1991, Human Knowledge in Idealistic Perspective, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2005, Reason and Reality: Realism and Idealism in Pragmatic Perspective, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Rödl, Sebastian, 2018, Self-Consciousness and Objectivity: An Introduction to Absolute Idealism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Rogers, Dorothy, 2005, America’s First Women Philosophers: Transplanting Hegel 1860–1925, London: Continuum.
  • Rosen, Gideon, 1994, “Objectivity and Modern Idealism:What Is The Question?”, in Philosophy in Mind, Michaelis Michael and John O’Leary-Hawthorne (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, 277–319. doi:10.1007/978-94-011-1008-2_17
  • Sandkühler, Hans Jörg (ed.), 2005, Handbuch deutscher Idealismus, Stuttgart: J.B. Metzler.
  • Sassen, Brigitte (ed.), 2000, Kant’s Early Critics: The Empiricist Critique of the Theoretical Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid, 1963, Science, Perception, and Reality, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • –––, 1968, Science and Metaphysics: Variations on Kantian Themes, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • –––, 1997, Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind, Robert B. Brandom (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Sprigge, T.L.S., 2006, The God of Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/0199283044.001.0001
  • –––, 2011, The Importance of Subjectivity: Selected Essays in Metaphysics and Ethics, Leemon B. McHenry (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Stern, Robert, 1990, Hegel, Kant and the Structure of the Object, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2002, Routledge Philosophy GuideBook to Hegel and the “Phenomenology of Spirit”, London: Routledge. Second edition, 2013.
  • –––, 2009, Hegelian Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199239108.001.0001
  • Stroud, Barry, 1977, Hume, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Thomas, James, 1999, Intuition and Reality: A Study of the Attributes of Substance in the Absolute Idealism of Spinoza, Dartmouth: Ashgate.
  • Willmann, Otto, 1894–97, Geschichte des Idealismus, 3 volumes, Braunschweig: F. Vieweg.
  • Wood, Allen W., 1990, Hegel’s Ethical Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9781139172257

Other Internet Resources


The authors owe thanks to a group that met in Berlin in July, 2014, to discuss a draft of the original version of this entry, including Dina Emundts, Eckart Förster, Gunnar Hindrichs, Charles Larmore, Paul Redding, Robert Stern, and Tobias Rosefeldt; we owe special thanks to Larmore for his numerous and detailed comments on that draft and to Stern for his generous assistance with the bibliography. We also owe thanks to Justin Broackes for his participation in the seminar we gave at Brown University in Spring and Fall 2013 where we also discussed much of this material. This revised version owes thanks to the participants of another seminar we gave at Brown in Spring 2020 and to helpful comments by Allen Wood.

Copyright © 2021 by
Paul Guyer <>
Rolf-Peter Horstmann <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free