Philo of Alexandria

First published Mon Feb 5, 2018; substantive revision Tue Aug 16, 2022

Philo of Alexandria is a Jewish thinker who lived in Alexandria in the first half of the first century BCE (Hadas Lebel 2012). Whether he really was a philosopher is a question still debated at length. At the beginning of the Roman Empire, especially for the Stoics and the Cynics, the fundamental task of a philosopher was the construction of his own self (Foucault 2001). A man who sought to improve himself had to first regulate his own nature, controlling his passions and emotions and eliminating any gap between theory and practice. He was thus supposed to approach the perfection of a god. To the exact contrary of this attitude, Philo’s purpose was to prove the oudeneia, the ontological nothingness of human beings. In his opinion, the only way to have real existence was to admit that one is nothing without the help of God, who is the source of freedom, logos (reason) and consciousness. He aimed to be the best possible servant of the Revelation and of the text that forms God’s Word. He accepted contradiction as a normal means of expression, which serves as a possible explanation for the disordered impression of his treatises. He was, however, neither ignorant nor confused; rather, he consciously deconstructed the rationalist patterns of Greek thought, which in his opinion served to affirm the primacy of the self. He did not want to get rid of logos but rather to place it clearly within the unique perspective of divine transcendence. Though he felt great admiration for Plato (Reydams-Schils 2008), his transcendence was not exactly Platonic, but rather of a God both absolutely unknowable yet very close to mankind. Nikiprowetzky (1977) inaugurated a new era in Philonian studies by affirming the centrality of the Law in the Philo’s thought. In this perspective, philosophy was the servant of Revelation, a way to lend his exegesis a more universal impact by drawing upon the categories of Greek logos One of the purposes of our presentation will be to give a plausible evaluation of the many images and interpretations of Philo that we find in Philonian scholarship.

1. The Man and His Work

1.1 Philo Alexandrinus

It is impossible to give precise dates for Philo’s birth. The consensus is that he lived between the end of the first century BCE and the middle of the first century CE, during a period of acute agitation and interethnic tensions in Alexandria. The Romans, with their universal ambitions, had replaced the Macedonians, leaving to the Greeks only the pride of their identity and some fiscal advantages. The Greeks in turn pretended to be the only citizens of the city of Alexandria, refusing citizenship to the Jews with very few exceptions, among which was Alexander the Alabarch (tax collector), Philo’s brother (Bloch 2021, Siegert 2021). Alexander’s son, in turn, became one of the famous apostates in the history of Judaism, becoming prefect of Egypt in 66–69 CE and serving as Emperor Titus’ second-in-command at the siege of Jerusalem in 70 CE. The history of the apostate within his family was certainly a problem for Philo, who tried to raise the issue with his nephew in the (De providentia 2 and in the De animalibus. Though he never specified his own political status, Philo was likely a citizen of this prestigious city. Finally, the native Egyptians were despised by both Greeks and Jews. The Egyptians didn’t all remain passive, however; Manetho (Stern 1974, texts n.19–21), an Egyptian priest, wrote a parody of the Exodus, transforming the liberation of Israel into the ignominious expulsion of a disabled and dishonest people. This topos won great favor among Greek intellectuals like Philo’s contemporary, Apion, against whom Flavius Josephus wrote his famous apology of the Jewish people. This tension erupted into the Alexandria riots of 38 CE, the first major pogrom in the history of Jewish people, leading in turn to the installation of a ghetto, murders, tortures, humiliations, and mockeries of Agrippa I, the king of Judaea (van der Horst 2003). We must keep all this in mind in order not to imagine Philo merely as a scholar burrowed away in the Great Library, nor as a rabbi lecturing peacefully in the synagogues. In Spec. 3.1, he wistfully remembers a time when he could devote himself to study and contemplation, probably before the disasters of 38 CE:

There was a time when I had leisure for philosophy and for the contemplation of the universe and its contents, when I made its spirit my own in all its beauty and loveliness and true blessedness, when my constant companions were divine themes and verities, when I rejoiced with a joy that never cloyed or sated.

But just after, he evokes the violent envy of those who plunged him “in[to] the ocean of civil cares”, likely an allusion to the many difficulties created by the hostility of Greeks and Egyptians (Spec. 3.1). Even before this violence, however, the environment he faced was a hostile and resentful one. Philo considered the Egyptians, his “ultimate other” (Niehoff 2001), the most disgusting of polytheists because of their zoolatry. He was full of reverence and fear toward the Romans, or at least pretends as such in his two books on the pogrom of 38 CE: the In Flaccum, which is against the Roman prefect in Alexandria at the moment of the pogrom, and the Legatio (Smallwood 1961) in which he narrates his own experience of the embassy sent to the Emperor Caligula by the Jews of Alexandria after the riot. Recently Niehoff stressed the idea that Roman culture had become an important element of Philo’s identity (Niehoff 2018). Nevertheless, he was first and foremost a Jew of the Septuagint, the Greek translation of the Bible (ca 270 BCE). That is to say, however distinctive his views, he was a sincerely pious Jew. He knew very little Hebrew, though he went to Jerusalem to pray and offer sacrifices in the Temple (Prov. 2.107), and he thought that the Bible written in Greek was perfectly equivalent to the Hebrew one (Mos. 2.40). His paideia or Greek education was excellent, both in philosophy and the liberal arts, as he says in Congr. 79–80:

For instance when first I was incited by the goads of philosophy to desire her I consorted in early youth with one of her handmaids, Grammar, and all that I begat by her, writing, reading and study of the writings of the poets, I dedicated to her mistress.

By this period in Alexandria, the spirit of mutual comprehension that marked the beginning of the Ptolemaic epoch (ca 332 BCE–30 BCE) had faded away. In his own person, Philo brought together two elements that the Greek elite now held to be incompatible: paideia, Greek education, and Judaism. He studied and commented on the Bible in the synagogues, which he describes as “schools of virtue”. His understanding of rhetoric was not merely theoretical. He was probably a great orator. The addressees of his treatises were foremost the Jews, both believers and unbelievers. He may have had a second, much more hypothetical, audience in mind as well: Greek philosophers and intellectuals more generally. However, to the best of our knowledge, this latter group paid scant attention to Philo’s writings. In the fragments of Greek and Roman writers carefully collected by Menahem Stern (1974), we find two kinds of Greek reactions towards Judaism. In the earlier period, they received some sympathy from philosophers; Theophrastus, the main disciple of Aristotle, writes in a famous fragment that Jews are “philosophers by race”, saying about them:

they converse with each other about the deity, and at night-time they make observations of the stars, gazing at them and calling on God by prayer. (quoted in Diodorus Siculus, Bibliotheca Historica, 40.3.1–3)

From the end of the second century BCE, however, many philosophers were active propagandists for antisemitism.[1] One might have expected that Stoicism, with its cosmopolitism and rational humanism, would have avoided this kind of attitude. In fact, as we can see in Posidonius, Seneca, or Chaeremon, Stoic antisemitism was a product not of racism, but of an erroneous understanding of rationalism and universalism. For these men, the Jews were a very superstitious nation, blemished by strange habits and strong animosity towards foreigners. Except for the case of Varro, the Roman scholar of the first century BCE who appreciated Jews for their refusal of images (Lehmann 1997), it would be impossible to give an example of a Greek or Latin text of this period showing sympathy or even interest toward the Jews. This was a condition of which Philo could not have been ignorant. In the background of his life and of his work lay an antisemitism growing more and more violent. In contrast to Flavius, who decades later wrote the Against Apion in order to refute Greek antisemitism, Philo seems to have preferred to extol the virtues of Judaism than to fight against the adversaries of Jews, as we can see in the extant fragments of his Hypotetica.

1.2 His works

Philo’s work does not form a well-organized corpus. During Philo’s time, the work was larger than the corpus we now have. The relation of Philo to the Hebrew exegetical traditions of his time is an important and controversial question. One of the major paradoxes for his posterity is that his work was ignored by Jews and saved by Christians, some of whom thought that he was himself a Christian (Runia 2009). In 233 CE the entire corpus was brought to Caesarea, a city that became the main center of its transmission, though some papyri suggest the circulation of at least some of his treatises in Egypt. The more or less generally accepted classification is that of Massebiau (1889), completed by Cohn (1899). It is divided into five principal categories:

  • Allegorical commentaries (39 treatises)
  • Twelve treatises of exposition of the law (12 treatises)
  • Questions and answers on Genesis and Exodus (6 treatises)
  • Four historical and apologetic treatises (4 treatises)
  • Five philosophical treatises

No definite chronology of the works was established until the very recent book of Niehoff (2018). Philo gives very few hints regarding his process of composition, offering only a few remarks about the structure and divisions of his treatises. Regarding the strange fact that these Greek treatises bear Latin titles, Monique Alexandre (1997) conducted a complete study in which she examines a complex philological process from Antiquity to the nineteenth century through the humanists of the Renaissance and their immediate successors.

2. Philosophy, Philosophers, and Rhetoric

2.1 Philosophical works

On the meaning of philosophy for Philo, see see the supplement on The Meanings of Philosophy in Philo of Alexandria. His five philosophical works are De providentia 1 and 2, De animalibus, De aeternitate and Quod omnis probus. The two latter works are the only ones for which we have Greek texts. With the exception of a few rare references to the Bible, these texts could well have been written by a pagan philosopher. This is why some scholars thought they were products of Philo’s paideia, his classical Greek education. Today, there is a tendency to believe that Philo’s extant texts were written near the end of his life. If this is the case, the reason for writing, in the atmosphere of great cultural and political rivalry of the epoch, could have been to demonstrate that a Jew was as able to compose a philosophy as “pure” as any Greek. In any case, the most discussed problem today is the skepticism regarding the authenticity of the De aeternitate, the treatise in which we find the most explicit references to philosophy and philosophers. Since Runia’s seminal article in 1981, a majority of scholars seems to have distanced themselves from thinking the text is inauthentic. For Runia, there is no contradiction in the fact that Philo goes against the biblical tradition and defends the eternity of the world not only in the future but also in the past. The second part of Philo’s treatise, now lost, would have contained the refutation of this unorthodox—at least from a Jewish point of view—thesis. It is probable that Philo, who seems to have had good knowledge of skeptical methods, was trained to argue both pro and contra of a thesis, a dialectical technique of which the De aeternitate is probably the best illustration. We will return to the question of the authenticity in the supplemenary document About the De aeternitate and the De providentia.

2.2 Philosophers

2.2.1 Jewish philosophers

We have little information about Jewish intellectuals in the Hellenistic epoch. One of our main sources is the Sentences of Pseudo-Phocylides (Barclay 2007), most likely written in Alexandria by a Jew. They show an interesting mix of Jewish and Greek elements: an absence of attacks against polytheism, some popular Stoic themes, and a rather soft affirmation of the monotheistic faith. It is not easy, however, to date these Sentences. The most probable date would be somewhere between 30 BCE and 40 CE, but other dates are possible. Regardless, the Sentences provides an image of what could have been a Jewish openness towards pagan culture if relations were calmer. According to a well-attested tradition, some Jews posited that Plato had taken his inspiration from Moses, an idea that seems to have been popularized by Aristobulus of Paneas, a Jewish philosopher who lived in the first half of second century BCE. Philo, who lived in a more unstable period, employs this kind of assertion with prudence (Spec. 2.164–167). He himself sometimes alludes to his immediate predecessors, which is the topic of Goulet’s book (1987). Goulet’s central thesis is that the primary source of Philo’s allegories was a Jewish commentary that used Stoic methods of interpretation to attempt a wholly rationalist exegesis of the Bible devoid of any notion of transcendence. In fact, there is only one clear allusion to these phusiologoi, i.e., rationalist allegorists. It is likely that in Alexandria there were Jews who attempted to interpret the Bible as the Stoics had interpreted Homer (Niehoff 2011). It is unclear whether their interpretation was integrated into a comprehensive system of rationalism. The allegoric interpretation did not prevent Stoics from defending divination, a practice that was considered absurd by their opponents. One could add that this evolution towards a more religious cast of mind was not a distinctive characteristic of Philo, but rather a hallmark of the Middle-Platonist period as a whole.

2.2.2 Greek philosophers

Named references to philosophers in Philo’s work are rather rare, and often the cited names are not those that one would expect. For example, he never mentions Posidonius, one of the greatest names of Stoicism, who was the first to attempt a reconciliation of at least some Stoic and Platonic themes. There are reasons to think Philo read this Rhodian philosopher, but he is silent about Posidonius. One could surmise that his clearly anti-Jewish position was one possible reason for Philo’s silence. However, Philo is also silent regarding thinkers of the New Academy, Arcesilas and Carneades. He was clearly acquainted with these Academics, since there are some rather clear allusions in his work to their brand of skepticism. It is therefore curious that he gives the first version of the Skeptical tropes without any allusion to Aenesidemus, who developed them a century before. Leaving aside the contested De aeternitate, we notice that Philo fails to mention Aristotle even once. While Stoicism plays a leading though complex role in most Philonian treatises, we only find four allusions to Zeno, the founder of the doctrine. They are all in the Probus, a treatise with strong Stoic features. There is only a single mention of Epicurus, in Post. 2. Plato is mentioned twice each in the De opificio and the De uita contemplativa, and once in the Probus. Only three mentions of Socrates are found, but surprisingly, the presocratic thinkers are quoted much more than one would have thought: fourteen references to Pythagoras (with some uncertainties, since some of them are to be found in fragments), six to Heraclitus, and one each to Anaxagoras and Democritus. The De aeternitate is striking because Aristotle is mentioned four times. In this treatise, Philo cites a book written by the Pythagorean Ocellos of Lucania, who established the eternity of the world in a way that Philo seems to find satisfactory. This, notably, is the only time when he mentions a specific text and explicitly affirms having read it.

One might wonder whether there is a logic to Philo’s explicit references to philosophers.

Several elements point us toward a more complete understanding. First, Philo evidently prefers indirect allusions to direct citations. Philosophical concepts are necessary to the elaboration of exegesis, but too many precise mentions of philosophers would have presented Philo himself as subordinate not to the Word of God but to the doctrines of philosophers. He is still more silent about the great rabbis he would have certainly met in Alexandria and perhaps in Jerusalem. In his philosophical references, it is clear that he prefers to evoke the presocratic thinkers and the classical period of philosophy than the Hellenistic one. This is paradoxical since he was deeply marked by Hellenistic philosophy, which was the natural environment of his education. It must be added that his prose is also generally classical, reluctant to admit neologisms and technical vocabulary. He certainly wanted to appear in all areas a man of tradition.

2.2.3 “Barbarian” philosophers

Did Philo think that philosophy was a Greek monopoly, only shared with some Jews?

In recent years, the temptation has been great among some scholars to imagine that he had at least some knowledge of non-Greek thinkers such as Cicero and Seneca (Lévy 2021). The problem remains that we have no evidence of this hypothesis. Philo never evoked Roman philosophers, so we cannot pass beyond statements of probability. More generally, what can be said about Philo’s attitude towards “barbarian” wisdom can be summarized in three points:

  • Jewish wisdom surpasses all other wisdom, both Greek and barbarian, because it is the only one inspired by God. In Mos. 2.12, Philo makes no attempt to hide that when the Bible was first translated into Greek, the Word of God was considered by many an expression of barbarian wisdom. The Septuagint is implicitly presented as proof that the distinction between Greek and barbarian could be abolished, though for Greek civilization this distinction had great ontological weight.

  • Even Greek education, despite its exceptional prestige, is unable to provide access to the truth. A learned man according to the criterion of the paideia is no more able than anyone else to say what the world truly is.

  • Philo did not deny that barbarians were able to create sophisticated forms of sciences and culture. Despite his own contempt for the Egyptians, he stresses that Moses himself received an education in which Egyptian sciences were included. Furthermore, he argues that many barbarians, though untutored in philosophy, have a natural intuition of how to live in agreement with virtue. In Somn. 2.56, the Indian ascetics (“gymnosophists”) appear as the barbarian form of the Cynic life, lacking any form of luxury or material comfort, and in Probus 96, the letter of the ascetic Calanos to Alexander [now known to be fake] provides the best evidence that some barbarians could practice a perfectly philosophical life without ever having received a Greek education.

2.2.4 Philosophy and rhetoric

Through the many studies Manuel Alexandre Jr (1999) devoted to Philo’s rhetoric, we can more precisely gauge Philo’s position in this central debate within Greek culture: the conflict between philosophy and rhetoric, or better, between philosophers and rhetors. Philo displays a sound knowledge of rhetoric. His affinity with Platonism impelled him to address very harsh critics of the “lesser” rhetoric, that of sophists, who represent the opposite pole of his own thought (Filler 2016). Sophisteia, sophistry, is in Philo a frequent concept attached to a range of negative meanings. But, as in Plato (where Socrates opposes the idea of a greater rhetoric to Gorgias’ lesser rhetoric in the Phaedrus), in Philo we see the possibility of a positive use of rhetoric. For Philo, rhetoric is neither an activity nor an abstract ideal but a human reality, the nature of which is laid out in the Bible. Moses is the man who saw God in the Sinai, but he by himself would have been unable to speak to Pharaoh and persuade him to let his people go. Moses needed the presence of Aaron in order to obtain what he sought. Moses represents the metaphysical truth, Aaron its implementation in reality, akin to the two faces of logos: while the logos prophorikos is that of communication, the logos endiathetos is the internal world of thoughts, and each is impossible without the other. It can be added that Abraham is said by Philo (Mut. 66) to have been the “father of the sounds”, a strange expression that, alongside many similar allusions to music, shows that Philo was not the philosopher of sight alone. Another path of research is that of parrêsia, a complex term of political origin that appeared in the context of the Athenian democracy. In literary and philosophical texts, it means freedom of speech, frankness, and honesty. For Philo, however, parrêsia is neither a political ideal nor an individual achievement, but something given by God; and it must be used without harming relatives or friends.

3. Philo and Philosophical Schools

For us it is clear that Philo never had a philosophical affiliation. To say that he was a Pythagorean, a Platonist, or a Stoic would have been for him to admit that he sought truth in spaces outside the Bible. Was he an Eclectic (Mansfeld 1988)? The concept of eclecticism is a complicated one. If it means that Philo used different philosophers as sources of inspiration and expression in order to elaborate his work, this cannot be denied. On the other hand, if one means that he built a specific philosophical identity for himself by associating with different doctrines, that seems far from the truth. It would mean that he was in search of an autonomous ego, a perspective at odds with his denial of the possibility for an individual to exist truly on his own, i.e., without God’s help. More exactly, if Philo asserted his own individuality, it was in the free modification and criticism of all philosophical doctrines around him, sometimes using them as their creators would never have imagined possible.

3.1 Philo and Aristotelianism

As Roskam (2011: 35) underscored,

the period of Middle Platonism is particularly interesting because it is in this period that Aristotle begins to receive more and more attention in the circles of a systematised Platonism.

This does not mean that the rivalry between Platonists and Aristotelians was over, but rather that Aristotle, who seems to have been largely ignored by Neo-Academic philosophers during the Hellenistic period (but Weische 1961), emerged again as a reference and a point of discussion. Philo is full of praise towards the Stagirite in the De aeternitate, a puzzling text. He was himself a Creationist while Aristotle asserted the eternity of the world. This does not mean that his admiration was unbounded, especially if the original treatise had been in the form of an antilogy, a disputatio in utramque partem. Today, some scholars try to demonstrate that Aristotle, more than Plato, lay at the core of Philo’s thought (Bos 2009). It can be objected that the dogmatic Academic Antiochus of Ascalon (ca 140/130–60 BCE), a philosopher that Philo certainly had read, did much to intertwine Platonic, Stoic, and Aristotelian ideas (Sedley 2012). The influence of Antiochus on the Alexandrian philosophical milieu is a controversial question. Despite the efforts of Andronicus of Rhodes (first editor of the Aristotelian corpus) to organize the corpus, some of the texts used Aristotelian elements in a spirit quite different from what we now understand by Aristotelianism. This can shed light on our understanding of Philo’s Aristotelianism and on the comparison of his Aristotelian passages with the pseudo-Aristotelian ones, a point on which many have commented. Antiochus was not the only one to shift the borders between these doctrines. The Stoic Posidonius also played a role in Philo’s elaboration of an unorthodox form of Aristotelianism.

Even if one is persuaded of the authenticity of Philo’s Aristotelianism in the De aeternitate mundi, the compliments towards Aristotle at the beginning of the treatise are surprising and do not exactly fit within the traditional frame of a disputatio pro and contra. The most probable thesis was put in second position, as we can see in the Ciceronian antilogy on justice in the third book of the De re publica. Another ambiguity is that Aristotle is praised here for having referred to the visible God, while Philo says many times elsewhere that God is invisible. Of this oddity two contradictory interpretations may be given: either Philo means that Aristotle as a philosopher is what Israel is among the nations, the one able to see God, an etymology of which Philo is fond; or the reference to the “visible God”, without any reference to His essence, means that Aristotle is only able to see the visible aspects of Him. This would be an implicit criticism of the Stagirite’s incapacity to perceive God’s transcendental and divine Nature.

The above is but one example of the difficulties inherent to the interpretation of Aristotelian elements in Philo’s corpus, at least regarding cosmological and metaphysical problems. Things are perhaps clearer concerning Aristotle’s influence on Philo’s ethics. The term mesotès (middle way), which has special importance in Aristotelian ethics, is used by Philo once, in Migr. 147. In this passage, the Alexandrine argues that the “royal road” is the middle way. But this assertion is not an unrestricted sign of approval of Aristotle’s ethics. In the desert, there is no way at all—and the desert was the exact place where Israel received the Revelation and achieved its liberty. The middle way may play a positive role in reining in debauchery, but for Philo, it has no absolute value. In Leg. 3.20, Laban asks Jacob why he fled instead of remaining faithful to the doctrine that recognizes the goods of the body and external possessions. Here is evidence of Philo’s refusal to accept Aristotle’s doctrine of the three kinds of goods. In Det. 8, it is said that corporeal and external goods are assets in name only, and in Somn. 2.9, he criticizes those who upheld the tripartition of human goods and contrasts them with those for whom virtue was the only good. To summarize, Philo could occasionally borrow some elements of Peripatetic doctrine, but he never believed them to be an expression of higher truth. He reveals a particular sort of coherence with regard to Aristotelianism: it consists in demonstrating through exegesis that Aristotle’s prudent philosophy could not entirely coincide with the Bible’s spiritual wisdom.

3.2 Stoicism

Philo was probably the non-Stoic thinker who most frequently drew upon both Stoic themes and vocabulary. Many scholars have noticed the strong influence of Stoicism on Philo, and he is described frequently as a Platonizing Stoic. However, matters are a bit more complex. Given his Jewish faith, he couldn’t refuse the Stoic conception of a perfectly organized world in which mankind had a privileged status among all other living creatures. One can add that the specific vocabulary of Stoicism had become a kind of lingua franca of intellectual discourse, used even by those who had no special affinity with the Stoics. At the same time, Philo was aware that the Stoic refusal of transcendence created an unbridgeable gap between his own spiritual identity and Stoicism. There is a huge debt of Philo towards Stoicism, but at the same time, he could claim to have repaid this debt by bringing Stoicism in the direction of truth. Philo never says exactly the same things as the Stoics. Despite their apparent similarities, there always remains a difference–sometimes barely perceptible, but always highly significant—between his doctrines and those of the Stoics. These differences can be distributed into four categories:

  • Doctrinal differences: for the Stoics, logos was equally reason (individual and universal), nature, and God, while for Philo, logos is not ultimate reality but merely what we can see and understand of God, who is Himself very far from human comprehension (Calabi 2008). In Stoicism, logos is God; in Philo it corresponds to his specific doctrine of the dunameis, the powers of God who created the world and governs it.

  • An inverse relation between the individual and the universal: for Stoic philosophers, natural law is the logos in its function of commanding what must be done or avoided. No particular human law corresponds with the natural law, though Cicero tried to demonstrate that Roman religious law could coincide at least partly with the law of nature. In Philo’s thought, the Torah is described as containing many elements of natural law, and its claims to universality were concretized in the Greek of the Septuagint.

  • The refusal of essential Stoic concepts: Philo only uses the word sunkatathesis twice in his entire corpus, a key term defining the human ability to accept or refuse information given by the senses and the capacity to transform decisions into action. He uses sometimes oikeiôsis, another Stoic keyword, but never with the meaning the Stoics lent to this concept. In brief, Stoic oikeiôsis expresses the idea that Nature gives to every living being from birth an indication of what its supreme purpose in life will be. In the case of mankind, things are a little more complex. The first impulse is, as in the case of all animals, the impulse to survive, but after this comes the impulse toward a rational life, a privilege that human beings alone share with God. All this was unacceptable to Philo, both the idea that human beings could at their birth be submitted to the same law as animals, and the definition of telos, the supreme human good (Besnier 1999), as the capacity of making choices in accordance with nature. It must be added that Philo only uses the term “prokoptôn” (a progressing in ethics) as an exegetic tool. This absence can be interpreted as an argument against the thesis of a late conversion to stoIcism (Lévy 2021 vs Niehoff 2018).

  • Substitutions and additions: It has been correctly observed that psychology, and especially psychology of the passions (Weisser 2021), is one of the fields in which Stoic influence is most visible in the Philonian corpus (Reydams Schils 2008). It is perfectly true that he employs many Stoic elements in his psychological commentaries, but in contrast to Chrysippean monistic doctrine, Philo never insists that the soul could be exclusively rational. Philo’s own stance is to invoke a Platonic dualism when arguing that the soul is exiled in the body and consequently in the world, and invoke Stoic psychological descriptions when describing the multiplicity of mental activities. Because he used these two levels—one metaphysical and ethical, the other descriptive and functionalist—he could give the impression of having avoided the contradictions between the two doctrines.

3.3 From Scepticism to Pythagorean Platonism

Bréhier, a great French name in Philonian studies, wrote that Philo’s thoughts aligned much closer to Platonism than to Skepticism (Bréhier 1908 [1925: 214]). That assertion is characteristic of an epoch in which these two doctrines were considered to be radically different. More recent studies have demonstrated that things are much more complex. Middle Platonist philosophers like Plutarch, Favorinus, or Alcinoos integrated many elements of Skepticism to their dogmas (Bonazzi 2007), especially in order to undermine Hellenistic naturalism and redirect attention to an idea of transcendence. Philo himself knew the existence of two kinds of Skepticism: New Academic and Neopyrrhonian (Lévy 2008). The former school seems to have disappeared as a structured institution by his lifetime. The latter came to prominence in the middle of the first century BCE, with Enesidemus criticizing New Academic philosophers, and especially those of his age, on the grounds that they had conceded far too much to Stoic dogma. Philo seems to have paid little attention to New Academic sceptics, but was acquainted at least with some of their principal doctrines. By contrast, he is the first to have used the tropes, i.e., the system of Sceptic arguments, elaborated by Enesidemus, which remained for centuries a kind of manifesto of Skepticism. At the beginning of the twentieth century and for many years after, scholars paid great attention to the passage of the De ebrietate where Philo uses these tropes. Today, however, it is commonplace to say that the connection was a weak one, and that Philo had his own interests instead. Of course he did, but Sextus Empircus himself, now considered the most reliable source, had his own interests as well as being a physician, and it is rash at least to neglect the Philonian testimony, closer to Enesidemus from both a geographical and chronological point of view. Philo uses Sceptic methods to demonstrate that even with the aid of education, the paideia of which he was so proud, human beings are unable to find the truth. Skepticism thus appears as the best means to awaken mankind to its oudeneia and to open the path toward transcendence.

“Was Philo a Middle Platonist?” is the title David Runia gave to one of his articles (1993). There is at least one point of consensus among the scholars, i.e., that Philo’s Platonism accurately reflected the Platonist interpretations circulating in Alexandria at the time. Very useful comparisons have been made with Eudorus, a contemporary and compatriot, and with Plutarch. It is most probable that Pythagoreanism played a great role in Philo’s development of negative theology; it certainly did so in his doctrine of the first principle. At the same time, Philo makes extensive use of Plato as well despite the difficulty of reconciling this doctrine with more classical Platonic themes. The presence of the Timaeus in the De opificio mundi is massive, as demonstrated by Runia (2001). Philo’s many allusions to the theme of “assimilation to God” prove how conscious he was of the difference between Stoic immanence and Platonic transcendence. At the core of Stoic ethics lay the concept of oikeiôsis, which required both adaptation to Nature and absolute obedience to her guidance. The word oikeiôsis derives from oikos, meaning house. The goal of a Stoic’s life was to know every hidden recess of “Nature’s house” and to dwell respectfully therein. On the contrary, for Middle Platonists who were readers and commentators of the Theaetetus, the goal was to depart from nature, a dwelling of sensations and injustice, in order to become as similar as possible to God. Another major theme that Philo shares with other Middle Platonists is that of Ideas as divine thoughts, one of the features of Imperial Platonism (Dillon 1996). Unlike Plato in the Timaeus, Philo does not assert that the Ideas are exterior to the Creator. For him God is, through his logos, the only active cause. The world of the Ideas, the noètos kosmos, is that of God’s thoughts. Despite many nuances, variations, and even contradictions, there is in Philo the same triple structure common to many Middle Platonic texts: the God/Demiurge, the first principle; the Ideas and powers by which God acts on matter; and matter itself. However, it must be added that in Philo everything is both similar and different. His God is not the Demiurge; he does not define powers and Ideas with reference to mathematical principles, though arithmology is quite present in his commentaries; and his conception of matter, despite many allusions to the philosophical doctrine of the dyad (the formless and unlimited base), has deep Biblical roots.

It may be useful at this point to address the question of Pythagorean influence on Philo. In Probus 2, he speaks of the “holiest sect” of the Pythagoreans, a highly admiring expression. In fact, the quite numerous mentions of this “sect” in his treatises are a confirmation of his fascination for it. He admires Pythagorean elitism (Probus 2), and sees in the ban against pronouncing their Master’s name something akin to the Jewish idea of divine ineffability (QG 1.99). He explicitly mentions twice Pythagorean sources: in Aet. 2, where he says, as we have seen, that he read a treatise of Ocellus; and in Opif. 100, there is a complex passage about the number seven, likened by the Pythagoreans to Zeus, the “Director and Ruler of all things”. In QG 2.12, arithmology is explicitly evoked as a Pythagorean science. Nevertheless, his allusions to Pythagorean themes are often vague and merit further analysis. As an example, Philo is often willing to use adjectives by which Pythagoreans characterized the dyad but reluctant to use the word itself. And when he does so, he clarifies in a very personal manner that “the monad is the image of the first Cause” and the dyad that of “the matter passive and indivisible” (Spec. 3.180). Monad and dyad serve Philo as exegetical tools, not actual substitutes for the narrative of Creation in the Bible. It is as if the imperative not to coincide exactly with Greek philosophical doctrine was for Philo an obligation of identity.

3.4 Epicureanism

Evidently, Philo felt no sympathy towards Epicureanism (Lévy, Ranocchia 2008), an exclusively materialistic doctrine which denied the existence of Providence and defined pleasure both as the first motivator of human actions and as the supreme good. As if this was not enough, Epicureans also described gods as taking human form, which was for Philo an indisputable case of idolatry. Nevertheless, his attitude towards Epicureanism is at times more complex than one might expect. In the first instance, his condemnation of Epicureanism is clear. In the same sentence at Post. 2, he castigates Epicurean impiety alongside Egyptian atheism. In De providentia as well we find strong elements of a refutation of Epicurean denial of Providence. And in Aet. 6–8, he draws a clear contrast between Epicureans who believe in the genesis and dissolution of worlds created by the chance of atomic collisions, and the Stoics, who despite being materialists themselves, claim that the world is single and governed by Reason. In addition, atomism becomes an allegorical instrument in the splendid exegesis of Moses killing the Egyptian (Fug. 148), where this episode becomes the symbol of the confrontation between the doctrines of unity and of extreme fragmentation. The Egyptian, who symbolizes pleasure, is buried in the sand, symbol of atoms. Nothing in all this is truly unexpected. More surprising, however, is the inclusion of the most complete exposition of the Epicurean version of oikeiôsis in Opif. 161, the doctrine of first adaptation to nature, probably of Stoic origin but also adopted by other schools. Moreover, despite many appearances, Philo does not consider pleasure an absolute evil. For him, it has a place in the divine program of Creation since it plays an essential role in procreation. The error lay with those who would transform a relative good into a perfect one.

4. Major Philosophical Themes and Methods in Philo

4.1 Allegory

Philo’s name has almost become a byword for allegory (Sellin 2011). There are many arguments to defend this association, but it would be an error to affirm that he was merely an allegorist. In many passages he defines with precision what can be called his methodology of allegory. In Praem. 61–65, he says that there are secret meanings, reachable only with God’s help. He distinguishes three cases by which a secret meaning may be ascertained: (a) directly by divine illumination, or (b1) indirectly in the shadow of literal interpretation, and/or (b2) by allegorical interpretation. It must be added that he not only uses the word allegoria, but also uponoia, a Platonic term which by this time may have been somewhat archaic. The two terms are not exactly synonymous for him. In Opif. 157, he posits that Biblical tales are not the kind of myths in which poets and sophists rejoice but are in fact “indications of character types which invite allegorical interpretation through the explanation of hidden meanings”. Nevertheless, according to Philo, it is an error to exclude literal meanings. As he notes in Migr. 89–93,

there are some who, regarding laws in their literal sense in the light of symbols of matters belonging to the intellect, are over punctilious about the latter, while treating the former with easy-going neglect. Such men I for my part should blame for handling the matter in too easy and off-hand a manner: they ought to have given careful attention to both aims, to a more full and exact investigations of what is not seen and in what is seen to be stewards without reproach.

For him, allegory assumes importance when literal interpretation encounters difficulty, for example, when it suggests conclusions in contradiction with God’s absolute perfection. In Leg. 2.19, he does not hesitate to say that the creation of Eve from one of Adam’s ribs was a most improbable myth, if taken literally. It becomes likely only if one understands that “ribs” are in fact the powers of Adam’s mind. It has been amply demonstrated that Philo’s use of allegory was not born ex nihilo. For example, an allegorical interpretation of the garment of the high priest (Mos. 2.117) as a microcosmic reproduction of the universe is found in Wisdom of Solomon 18:24, probably written at the end of the first century BCE. This suggests a Jewish source. On the other hand, many examples evince Philo’s perfect knowledge of Greek allegories in the interpretation of Homeric and Hesiodic myths. He does not hesitate to evoke some of these by name. For example, speaking about the earth in Aet. 63, he says that she was rightly called Pandora, since she gives to living things all that is useful. In Greek dôron means a present. The allegorical interpretation is here based on etymology, as are those of the greatest Stoic allegorist of the imperial period, Cornutus. Researchers have recently shown great interest in Philo’s linguistic remarks. Most of the time, however, he adapts classical allegorical interpretations to a Jewish context. For example, in Conf. 170 he quotes Homer, Iliad 2.204–205, two verses in which the poet praises the power of a single man. Philo denies that this should be interpreted as a general principle of politics; under his own interpretation, it is instead a poetic reference to almighty God. In one of his most famous passages, Philo interprets the tale of Mambre, in Genesis 18:1–15, where Abraham receives three men he initially believed to be foreigners. The author reminds his readers (QG 4.2) that Homer, who in recounting Odysseus’ homecoming, says that gods often disguise themselves in order not to be immediately recognized by humans (Odyssey 17.483–487).

A central problem in Philo’s use of allegory is the nature of the debt he owes to those he calls fusikoi. Since he evokes them regarding the interpretation of some Biblical difficulties, they were most likely Jewish exegetes using Stoic methods in which, at least at that time, etymology played a strong role. For Long (1992), there is a big difference between Stoic “allegory”, based on etymological and, more generally, linguistic bases, and the allegories of Philo. Stoic allegoresis, he says,

was not an attempt like [Philo’s], to distinguish figurative from literal meaning, but an effort to normalize language and remove ambiguity according to their own understanding of the empirical world. (1992 [1996: 210])

In fact, the problem of the exact nature of Stoic allegoresis is controversial. It can be remarked that Philo’s allegory is not merely symbolic. Especially when mentioning the fusikoi, he himself draws upon etymology, for example, about Sara whose name in the Chaldean language (i.e., in Hebrew) means “the ruler” (Abr. 99), and for whom nothing is more dominant than virtue (80). If it is probable that in Alexandria at this time there were a great variety of allegorists blending literary, philosophical, and spiritual currents, then we can say that Philo was very skillful in drawing upon each of these. To this observation, let us add a Philonian conception of allegory that appears not to have interested later scholars: in his interpretation of one of Joseph’s dreams in Somn. 2.8, Philo states that he will follow the method of allegory which he calls a “wise architect”. This expression is a “hapax”, i.e., an isolated case. The best way to understand the meaning of this phrase is given by Plutarch when he says that Alexander, seeking the proper place for the Egyptian city destined to bear his name, had a vision (Life of Alexander 26). In it, Homer recites two verses for him in which he mentioned the island of Paros (Odyssey 4.354–55). Alexander declares to his friends that he will follow Homer’s advice since he was the wisest architect—an already well-known story in Alexandria to which Philo alludes in his own way. The difference between Philo’s reference to Alexander and Plutarch’s is itself interesting. In the latter case, Homer is not only the greatest poet but also the father of all science. In the former, it is not the poet but the exegete that unveils the meanings of dreams. And dreams sent by God always reveal something about the truth of the world.

4.2 Negative theology and Providence

Philo is also considered the founder of negative theology in the history of monotheistic faith. Given the association of his faith with contemporary forms of Skepticism, he was also the founder of at least a kind of fideism, i.e., a doctrine in which faith is the foundation of all essential truths. His apparent versatility in exegesis can give the impression that his only purpose is to make philosophical themes and words coincide with the text of Bible. However, though Philo is not as systematic as Plotinus, there is much more coherence in his physics and metaphysics than one might think. Even John Dillon, hardly an unconditional admirer of Philo, argues that “he follows a system in which the supreme principle is the One”, meaning not the God of philosophers but the personal God of Judaism (1977: 155). The problem of possible philosophical antecedents to Philo’s conception of an unknowable and ineffable God is a complex one. Such a hypothesis cannot be dismissed, but there is no clear evidence of its truth. In any case, negativity is, par excellence, the manner of speaking in the best way possible about God. It is not the only one; there is also the possibility of declaring His perfection and infinite glory. And metaphors, like those of monarchy, the sower, and the sun, are still different. But the uiae negationis, eminentiae (all that is good has its origin in God), and analogiae (there is a kind of analogy of being between Creator and creature), though perfectly compatible with each other, are only poor human means to suggest Him who can’t be seen, named, nor known. Nevertheless, one of the most interesting comparative means to evoke man’s relation to God is the vocabulary of mysteries, for example when Philo says in Cher. 49:

I myself was initiated under Moses the God-beloved into his great mysteries, yet when I saw the prophet Jeremiah and knew him to be not only himself enlightened, but a worthy minister of the holy secrets, I was not slow to become his disciple.

The comparison with the Eleusinian mysteries is so precise that Moses is often called “hierophantos”, initiated in the Sinai to mysteries most obscure. As it had held in Eleusis, Philo speaks of “little mysteries” and “great mysteries”, the former leading to liberation from passions, the latter from sensations. Many other elements, especially those of the sacred banquet, resonate with the theme of the mysteries. Many scholars suggested that Philo situated himself in the Platonic tradition of philosophically transposing the Eleusinian mysteries. In this perspective, the mystery is the allegoric method itself. However, one could object to this interpretation that the meaning of a metaphor is not monolithic. It depends in great part on the identity of the addressee, about which we know little. Indeed, there was at least one ambiguity: did Philo want to prove to hypothetic Greek readers that Eleusinian mysteries were shadowy images of the only true mysteries, the Jewish ones? Was he using a kind of spiritual lingua franca elaborated during the pluralistic honeymoon at the beginning of the Ptolemaic period? Still, no element of the mysteries’ lexicon could trace a shift with regard to the theme of the impossibility of knowing God.

Even the man who was the closest to God, Moses, could not see Him in the Sinai. God is “ineffable, inconceivable and incomprehensible” (Mut. 15). This means that without Revelation, it would be impossible to say anything about Him that bore relation with truth. At the same time, the absolute transcendence of God, as theorized by Philo, could have implied His perfect indifference to the world of matter, time, and sensibility. Yet, through His providence, God is present in the world He created. From a philosophical point of view, the problem of what Radice calls “the antinomy of transcendence and providence” played a great role even in the period before Middle Platonism (2009: 128). The return to Platonic transcendence was the major philosophical characteristic of Philo’s age. It is highly improbable, however, that philosophy had a determining role in shaping his faith and beliefs. More probable is that he perceived himself in the tradition of biblical translators, the Septuagint being so highly praised by him in the Vita Mosis. In a time when Egypt was Ptolemaic, these translations had both political and cultural purposes. In Philo’s time, the main center of Greek power was cultural. To comment upon the Bible with philosophical concepts was, in a certain way, to translate it into the language of the new cultural elite, the Roman as well as Greek. Regardless, the central idea was that the word of God had to be mediated to become accessible outside of Israel. From this point of view, mediation was a central Philonian concept, not only linguistically and culturally, but also ontologically: in Somn. 1.62, he says that God fulfilled His Word with His incorporeal powers.

One of the main Philonian concepts, power, is all the more complex given the varieties in Philo’s prose when discussing it (Termini 2000). These variations were probably a means to avoid the implication that these powers had an ontological autonomy. Their nature, rather, is merely linguistic and functionalist. The number of God’s power is not fixed and their relation to the logos is evoked vaguely or not at all. From a philosophical point of view, the genealogy of dunamis is incredibly rich since each great Greek philosopher used it with his own semantic specificity. In the Bible, God is omnipotent but there is no systematic presentation of His powers. Just before the apparition of Middle Platonism, dunamis was present in Stoic doctrine, but with a more reduced range of meaning. The question of Philo’s source(s) on this point is very controversial, but the general structure is quite clear. His two main powers are the “creative power” (theos) and “regal power” (kyrios) (Cher. 27–8). The beneficent and the legislative powers are subordinated to them, but in Spec. 1.45, Philo uses a Platonic metaphor to assert that God is surrounded by a great number of powers who are like His bodyguards. Before trying to specify the relation between these powers and the logos, it is necessary to add that dunamis is not only a metaphysical term. It bears a psychological meaning as well, for example at Opif. 67 when Philo evokes the division of the soul in a context both Aristotelian and Stoic. In Leg. 1.11, the division is more clearly Stoic, with its seven traditional parts (the five senses, reproduction and speech) but at the same time, Philo seems to adopt a dualistic position, distinguishing a rational and irrational part of the soul. The main problem, in human psychology as with the divine powers, lies in their relation to the logos.

It seems that Philo did his utmost to make the relation between God and the logos as complex as possible (Calabi 2008). As an example of these difficulties, in Leg. 2.86, God is said to be the supreme genus and His logos the second one. Other things, Philo adds, only exist in speech and sometimes amount to mere nothingness. In the third book of the same treatise (Leg. 3.175–6), the logos is defined as the “ti”, i.e., the all-encompassing genus in the Stoic system. To explain this definition, Philo specifies that God’s logos is the supreme genus of everything that was born. From a philosophical point of view, if somebody remains in the world of immanence, he can refer to the universal logos, and only to him. But to see the logos as the ultimate expression of the absolute is for Philo an absolute impiety. In fact, the logos is only God’s shadow, His image, the instrument by which He created the world, or in a more anthropomorphic way, His “first-born son” or His deputy (Agr. 51). In Fug. 109, the logos is said to be “the Son of God and Sophia”. The Pythagorean-Platonic model of Creation acting on undefined matter is thus both preserved and richly transformed.

God is unity, and only unity. It is the logos which carries in itself the principle of contraries, mixing good and evil. This leads in turn to a distinction between ontology and methodology. Anyone who divinizes the world, seeing it as the most perfect expression of the logos, is deeply wrong, since he omits God, the truly supreme genus and the only one not to have been created. At the same time, the exegete of God’s word can occasionally lead to his commentary focusing on the logos, creating a false resemblance to Stoicism. However, the theologian is, mutatis mutandis, like the biologist who today chooses some cells to place under his microscope. This act, of course, does not imply that the biologist forgets the tissue of which these cells are a part. Similarly, Philo’s focus on logos should never suggest that he feels a temptation toward Stoicism. Themes and language of immanence are for him only a means to better understand the world created by God. When he praises the philosophers who recommend “living according to nature”, he uses a famous Stoic formula, but immediately after explains that this means “to follow God” (Migr. 128). For a Stoic, the two formulae were strictly synonymous. In Philo’s thought, the former is valid only if it is followed by a reference to God, who is transcendent by definition.

The intermediary status of the logos and the many nuances in the expression of its nature do not prevent Philo from providing a more or less systematic framework.

The logos, God’s organon in the creation of the world, is described in Opif. 20 as “the place of the Ideas”, a metaphoric expression since for Philo the intelligible world could not be contained in a place. While the demiurge contemplates the Ideas in order to create the World in the Timaeus, in the De opificio, God not only creates the Ideas but organizes them into an intelligible world. In Her. 119, the divine logos is said to be both sower and creator. The former word refers to a Stoic concept, that of spermatikoi logoi, defined as the rational patterns inherent in the principles of organization of the world, but which Philo preferred not to use with precision. The Quis heres is probably the treatise in which Philo’s reflection on the logos’ way of action is most complete, through the concept of logos divider (tomeus). In Stoicism, one of the main functions of the logos is to establish the principle of the idiôs poion, that is to say, the absolute specificity of each being in the world. In the Quis heres, perhaps under the influence of a Stoicized interpretation of the Timaeus, Philo explains how God created the four elements from undifferentiated matter, then individual beings, by mixing these elements together.

As was said rightly by Radice, the

philosophical doctrine of the powers… allowed Philo to maintain both the oneness of God despite His many names and epithets, and the transcendence of God despite His action on the world. (2009: 136)

4.4 The Law of Nature

The relation between the logos and the law of Nature is an interesting topic since it shows the different perspectives of Philo’s thought and Stoic doctrine despite their many similarities (Najman 1999). For the Stoics, the logos and the law of Nature are perfectly synonymous. In their definition, the law of Nature is the command of the logos as to what must be done and what avoided. Philo’s thought of the law is different. In Opif. 143, Philo alludes to man’s original ancestor as living in a world governed by a constitution, i.e., “the right reason of nature”, which is named with more appropriate title “ordinance”, a divine law according to which obligations and rights have been distributed to each creature. The vocabulary is Stoic, but with an interesting nuance: Philo speaks about “the right reason of nature” instead of “the law of nature”. This is perhaps more than a stylistic variation; instead, it may have served to reveal a distance with regard to the canonical doctrine of the law of Nature. This distance appears to be essential, despite many variations and occasional contradictions. First of all, while Stoic natural law is affirmed by Cicero to be “the same in Athens and in Rome”, but without any precise formulation, the Torah, specific law of the people of Israel, is posited by Philo to be unique, since it is both concrete and eternal. The law of Moses thus has an ambiguous status, since it is sometimes said to be the Natural Law itself, and sometimes an image, eikôn, of it. It is a controversial point whether the term “image” means an ontological degradation or a perfect identity of one with the other. Last but not least, Philo emphasizes the fact that before the Torah, the patriarchs were unwritten incarnations of the law of Nature. Admittedly, his task bordered on the impossible. He had to take into account both the historicity of the Torah and its eternity, its universality, and its institutional status as law of Israel. It is not impossible that he had in mind a model similar to the translation of the Torah into Greek. In the Vita Mosis, he emphasizes the fact that the Greek translation and the Hebrew (he says “Chaldean”) original are perfectly identical and equivalent. There is a plasticity of the law of Nature, at first incarnated by the patriarchs, then written; and a plasticity of the Torah, first in Hebrew, then in Greek. At the same time, their underlying function is always the same: defining a principle of ethical responsibility not exclusively from the rationality of the world but by reference to a personal God who chose Israel to incarnate and bear witness to this principle in its different forms.

4.5 Creation and anthropology

The De opificio was often defined as a Jewish version of the Timaeus (Sterling 1993). In this treatise, Philo proclaims, against Aristotelianism and Stoicism, that God is the unique Creator both of the models for the world and of the world itself. That does not prevent him from drawing upon patterns elaborated in the somewhat confused but rich period at the end of the first century BCE. The evaluation of the most common model of cosmological creation in the De opificio, that of an active power acting on unqualified matter, is difficult since Philo seems to affirm that God created the world ex nihilo in some passages. It is probable that there was no significant difference between unqualified matter and pure void for him. God’s first task—though Philo refuses to admit the historicity of Creation (Runia 2001: 156–162)—was acting as architect to elaborate His project, i.e., to structure the intelligible world, conceived as the model of the corporeal one and established in the logos. The chief contents of the incorporeal cosmos were heaven, an invisible earth, air and void, water, spirit, and light. After the creation of the firmament and of the earth, on the fourth day God proceeded to order the heaven and to adorn it with splendid heavenly bodies. The explanation of this fourth day is especially interesting given the following elements:

  • God has absolute liberty, and creates the less-important earth before the more-important celestial bodies.

  • He knows what the then non-existent human beings will think and wants to prevent them from thinking that the movement of the celestial bodies is the cause of everything. This could be called the Chaldean temptation, not without similarities to Stoicism, and is an obsessive fear of Philo’s.

  • At this point he begins an extensive section on Pythagorean arithmology, including a meditation on the perfection of the number four.

On the fifth day, God creates the living beings according to a scala naturae replete with Platonic, Aristotelian, and Stoic echoes. As has been remarked, there is a crucial difference between Plato and Philo on this point (Runia 2001: 213). While “the creational sequence” is descending in the former, in the Alexandrian exegetes—who aim to defend the Biblical account—it ascends. Between the fishes, which are the first created, and man, crown of Creation, are birds and land animals. The creation of man, on the sixth day, is for Philo an occasion to develop some of his main themes: the resemblance of the human being to God, based on the Platonic and Stoic idea that the intellect holds the same position in the human being that the Great Creator holds in the cosmos; the concept of the powers of God, introduced with his exegesis of the words, “let us make a human being after our image and likeness”. In fact, argues Philo, God needed no one to create the human being, but preferred that human sins not be attributed to Him. In addition, he cites the Platonic idea of contemplation leading to philosophy, a risky idea since it could lead to such a fascination with worldly things that the Creator would be forgotten and denied, as was the case with the Chaldeans. After a long arithmologic meditation on the hebdomad, the seventh day or Shabbat, Philo arrives at original sin. It is said that the first man (the name Adam is never evoked) was most excellent in his body as well as his soul. He lived in perfect harmony with nature, homeless, but the cosmos was his home and city, where he resided with complete safety. God ascribed to the first man the imposition of names, a philosophical theme with strong Platonic connotations. In the following paragraphs Philo explains his descent into wickedness by the creation of woman. The sentence “woman becomes for him the starting point of a blameworthy life” has aroused many criticisms of misogyny on Philo’s part. It would be absurd to deny that there are many offensive assertions regarding women in his work. Woman is the symbol of sensation, man that of reason. These problems are essential in that they deal with sexuality, ethics and ontology alike. Without trying to defend Philo systematically, one must however emphasize the first sentence of Opif. 151:

But since nothing is stable in the world of becoming, mortal beings necessarily undergo reverses and changes, the first human being too had to enjoy some ill fortune.

The word “necessarily” means that human responsibility is much more relative than absolute. The first man could not eternally have a perfect life in a world which was not the intelligible one. In Stoic doctrine, the similarity between the sage and God is a permanent one. Philo is much more cautious when saying at Opif. 151:

As long as he was single, he resembled God and the cosmos in his solitariness, receiving the delineations of his soul, not all of them but as many as a mortal constitution could contain.

Eve’s role was inscribed in Adam’s ontological instability. In Philo’s allegorical interpretation, defined not as a certainty but a conjecture, the serpent is the symbol of pleasure. It cannot be said, however, that pleasure is an absolute evil in Philo’s thought. It is necessary in the created world and it is said in Leg. 2.17 that the new born child makes use of it. The defenders of pleasure are not absolutely wrong when they say that offspring feel an affinity with it. Their error is not in defending pleasure but in transforming its auxiliary role into the alpha and omega of ethics. The moment of humankind’s fall is neither the triumph of evil, nor a victory of individual perversity, but rather the appearance of a contrast between the first man in his initial perfection and a world which, being created on the basis of the intelligible one, could not itself be perfect.

4.6 Soul and body

In a huge catalogue of philosophical opinions, which is of considerable interest, Philo begins by demonstrating how little we know about heaven, then arrives at the human being about whom he says that he/she has four parts: body, sensibility, speech, intellect (nous) (Somn. 1.25). He exposes all that we know about the first three, for example, that body has three dimensions and six ways of moving. But about the intellect, he says that it is absolutely unintelligible. Nothing is known about its nature, its way of arriving in the body, or its place. As with the place of heaven in the world, we are unable to say anything about it. But in contrast with this scientific and philosophical ignorance, the Bible gives its reader true information. The intellect is a divine emanation (Somn. 1.34, Genesis 2:7), and the human being is the one who received the privilege of worshipping God, the One Being. There are grounding elements of the problem: what must the human being do in the face of such problems? Philo’s answer is both philosophical and theological. She must, like Socrates or like Terah (father of Abraham) in the Torah, make a constant effort to have better self-knowledge. Socrates is the man who had no other philosophy than to know himself, while Terah is the very idea of knowing oneself. What does it mean to know oneself? Essentially, to have a clearer idea of one’s position with respect to God and His powers in order to have the means of becoming wiser, and therefore better. The human being has no other personal good than reason. The paradoxical aim of reason is to perceive the distance between God and His creation (Somn. 1.66) and so to understand how far He is from human comprehension.

To know oneself does not mean to have a perfect science of what a soul is. Philo knows all the suppositions elaborated by philosophers and he uses many of them, but without ever saying that he is in possession of knowledge of the soul. It has been rightly said that his purpose was not to build a scientific but a “religious psychology”. In this kind of psychology, it was not essential to know if a soul has seven components besides reason, as it is said by the Stoics, or three, like in the Platonic division, or if it contains, besides reason, nutritive and sensitive parts like in Aristotelianism. Here I’ll give a few examples of his varieties of uses. In Opif. 117, soul is compared to a puppet show, the seven puppets being manipulated by the hègemonikon, the central rational element. This metaphor strongly reminds us of the Stoic comparison with the octopus, but is also very different from this image. The octopus is a living unity, while the puppet master is essentially different from his puppets. The Stoic metaphor of the octopus is a monist one, but the Philonian image, inspired from Plato (Laws 644d), is strongly dualistic. The puppets are not even irrational beings as they are mere objects. But it is true that in Leg. 1.28, the image of the source and the stream could have been used by the most orthodox of the Stoics if separated from its context. In 1.29, Philo says that the intellect (nous, note that he does not use the Stoic word logos) is like a source going to the senses. There is, however, no contradiction in all this. In 1.30, Philo uses a strictly Stoic definition: the living being is characterized by representation and impulse. But when he arrives to the human being at 1.31, Stoicism is completed by a Biblical quotation (Genesis 2:7). A Stoic image is a good way to speak about living beings, but it is not enough when the narrative is about humans. That is why Philo often uses the distinction between rational and irrational beings with an opposition between the hègemonikon, unique and rational, and the other parts of soul, divided in seven and irrational. However, it must be added that in Philo, dualistic images do not imply the division of the soul. In Leg. 2.8, he asserts that sensation and passions are like parts and products of a unified soul. Such are the multi-layered levels of language Philo is capable of using at every page. For him, it is impossible to know what a human soul is, but it is not necessary to have this kind of knowledge in order to try to understand what the meaning of the word of the Lord is. To be conscious of her ignorance in the field of psychology, far from being an obstacle, actually helps to have a better perception of the limitations inherent to human nature. But this consciousness itself necessarily rises from the confrontation of the philosophical doctrines.

It would be an error to affirm that Philo despises and hates the body. Even if he is often very harsh towards it, he never forgets that when God created the first human being, He made him not only spiritually perfect, but also physically beautiful. He does not see any inconvenience in emphasizing the perfection of sensation or sexuality. It is said in Opif. 136 that the first human being was truly and really kalos kagathos, beautiful and good. It is strange to find in a Jewish biblical commentator the explicit expression of this Greek ideal of humanity. At the same time, it could mean that for Philo the Greek conception of this expression was an erroneous one, since it did not imply an immediate link with divine transcendence. God, Philo says, was a good technitès, both of the body and the soul. The beauty of the body is in Opif. 138 explained in specific Greek terms, symmetry, beauty of the flesh, and color. All these concepts can be found in Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics, but it does not mean that Philo uses them in the same way. In Philo, the body is not a principle of evil, though it can be used as an instrument of perversion when the human being focuses more on himself than on the powers of God. We find in Leg. 3.71, however, the assertion that the body is bad by nature, ponèron fusei. The meaning of the expression is perfectly clear, but it is also necessary to remember the context. Philo is commenting on Genesis 38:7, where it is said that God killed Er without any justified reason. According to Philo, “ER” means in Hebrew the flesh, the body which is a threat for the soul. But at the same time Philo specifies that to create the best things, God had to create less good things. This can lead to the conclusion that the ponèron fusei means not absolute but relative perversion since the body is necessary to demonstrate, by contrast, the beauty of soul. Creation is good by nature (fusei) and the body is an element of the Creation. The example of Issachar in Leg. 1.83 shows how necessary the body is for ethical progress. But at the same time, the knowledge of the body can be only phenomenological, while real research is ontological. This can explain Philo’s violent attacks on the body: it is a tomb (following the Platonic play on words comparing the body to a tomb), a nosèma (disease), a vase unable to contain its desire, and most frequently a burden of flesh. But all this verbal violence is addressed more to human error on the value of the body than to the body itself created by God.

5. Transcendental Ethics

5.1 From oikeiôsis to omoiôsis

One major intellectual revolution in the passage from the Hellenistic period to Middle Platonism was a relative abandoning of the concept of oikeiôsis (natural kinship) which, originating with the Stoics, became a foundation of ethics not only in Stoicism but also in Epicureanism and the late Aristotelianism of Antiochus of Ascalon. The Hellenistic period was that of a naturalism that only the sceptic Academy undertook to fight it. The great change brought by Middle Platonism was the irruption of transcendence which seemed to have been forgotten for at least two centuries. And in the case of Philo, transcendence was not only philosophical, but also religious, mainly that of the God of the Bible. Philo sometimes uses the term oikeiôsis, but never in the Stoic meaning, always with semantic transformations. He could not accept the idea, central in the dogma of oikeiôsis, that children as well as animals are the image of nature. His own description of the world of childhood is a frightening one, a description Sigmund Freud would not have spurned. For him the main ethical purpose is to become closer and closer to God, and so to be in a spiritual kinship with Him. At this point, Philonian oikeiôsis is not different from the Platonic omoiôsis. It is not, as in Stoicism, an initial impulse, indicating the path of nature, but the result of a pious asceticism, getting rid of desire and passionate impulses. It has been suggested that the resemblance to God did not have in Philo any concrete social or ethical consequences, but things are much more complex. He says in Decalogo 133 that murder is forbidden because of the common resemblance (omoiôsis) of all men to God, but it is true that he does not develop extensively the consequences of this omoiôsis. In Stoicism, there is a kind of family relationship between human beings, since they alone (among animals) share reason in a world which is itself exclusively rational. Philo puts great weight on the specific status of Israel as the only people able to see God, an etymology of which he is very fond. In Alexandria, anti-Semitic propagandists accused Jews of being a group unified through their hatred of other nations, and today in the scholarship, the problem of universalism in Philo is much discussed (Berthelot 2003). However, it is necessary to distinguish between the ontological level and the ethical level. Because of its specific relation with God, Israel is the priest of the Nations, for whom it prays and offers sacrifices (Abr. 98; Somn. 2.163; Mos. 2.133–135). At the same time, Philo never denied that non-Jews could reach wisdom. For him, as well as Jews, Greeks and Barbarians could be ascetics of wisdom. Jewish superiority lies in the unique capacity to articulate the three levels: human individual perfection, with the examples of the patriarchs and Moses; social perfection, that of a society ruled by the laws of Moses; and ontological specificity, due to a deep kinship with God.

5.2 From passions to virtue

Philo’s general vision of mankind is often pessimistic. In Ios. 30, he uses the Stoic metaphor of the world as a huge city, but a city ruled by violence and hatred. The main cause of this disaster is the reign of passion, a theme very often evoked in the philosophy of his time. In his exegesis of the Biblical passages relating to human errors, Philo uses many philosophical terms and metaphors. Sometimes, he uses a Platonizing description of passion, recalling the description of the winged team of horses in Phaedrus 253 c–e. At the same time, in many texts, he refers to the Stoic division of passions, with four bad passions (pathê): desire, fear, sadness, and pleasure, and three good passions, joy, caution, and will. But his use of this Stoic division is not strictly faithful to the original. In his allegorical interpretation of Det. 119–120, Philo contrasts bad and good passions, but he introduces hope and repentance, biblical virtues, among the latter. It was not simply a terminological change, but the sign of a deep ontological change. In Stoic doctrine, only the present exists. To be a sage means to understand that the past and the future have no real existence, but are mainly spaces of projection for passions. By introducing hope and repentance among good passions, Philo, without renouncing a complete, or at least as complete as possible, control of bad passions, opened a path going from psychology to transcendentalist ethics.

Philo, without giving a precise and irreversible definition of the nature of soul, recommends the radical excision of passions in Leg. 3.129, arguing that no moderation of them could be satisfactory. The model is a medical one of major surgery, which will also be used by Seneca. In the fight against passions, enkrateia (self-control) and karteria (endurance) play a decisive role. However, only the sage can live without any passion in Stoicism, and everyone knows that the Stoic sage is extremely rare in the history of mankind. It was impossible for Philo to admit that a human being could be perfect. However, it is said in Deus 67 that Moses aimed at the disappearance of the passions, but did he succeed in it? There are many similarities between Philo’s attitude towards passions and that of the Stoics, but there is also a fundamental difference. For him it is impossible to become free from passion without divine Grace. That does not mean that one has to become passive and wait for God’s intervention. Enkrateia and karteria are individual qualities that are encouraged by the rules of life included in the laws of Moses. However, even before the Law was given to Moses, faith was the condition sine qua non to escape the process of passion. When Abraham received the order to sacrifice his son, he obeyed without any emotion. “He admitted no swerving of body nor mind” (Abr. 175). His faith was so absolute that at no moment did he try to revolt. But there is yet another difference with Stoicism. In this doctrine, the sage cannot lose his perfection, and he remains always in his apatheia (perfect serenity) even if he has reflex reactions (propatheiai) of which his judgment is not responsible. On the contrary, at the death of Sarah, Abraham avoids the two attitudes considered erroneous by Philo. He did not grieve over-bitterly nor did he assume indifference (apatheia) as if nothing painful had occurred. On this occasion, the patriarch chose the metriopatheia, the middle way, which, in philosophy, corresponds to Aristotelian doctrine. Unlike the Stoics, Philo does not try to present apatheia as a kind of ethical heroism. Unlike the Peripatetics, he does not think that ethics always requires reasonable aims. He considers the human being able to transform bad passions into good ones and affirms that there are no natural limits to his perfectibility when he accepts to submit himself to the power of God.

5.3 Virtues, the paths to perfection

Most philosophical themes related to virtue are present in the Philonian treatises. The four traditional virtues (phronesis [prudence], sôphrosynè [temperance], andreia [courage], dikaiosunè [justice]) are completed through enkrateia which pertains more specifically to the Cynic-Stoic tradition as the science of that which appears in line with right reason. In Spec. 4.135, we find a different definition of the four cardinal virtues: eusebeia (piety, sanctity) is defined as “the queen of virtues”, and wisdom, temperance, and justice following. In the treatise De virtutibus, metanoia (repentance) and eugeneia (nobility) have special importance (Wilson 2010). The first concept, considered an unhappy passion by the Stoics, is the equivalent of the Jewish concept of teshuva. In Philo, it expresses the strong connection between theological and moral reflection. Eugeneia has nothing of a racist concept, since all those who are temperate and just are truly noble (Virt. 189). Abraham, son of a Chaldean astrologist, becomes the symbol of true nobility when he emigrated from polytheism to monotheism.

One of the most interesting elements in the Philonian presentation of virtues is the understanding of matriarchs as allegorical symbols of virtues. Gender differences are a complex and interesting aspect of the Alexandrine’s thought. One cannot deny his misogyny, which, however, is not common since it is expressed through rather sophisticated semantic webs. Virtue is, on his view, masculine in its essence, since it is powerful and active. The realm of reason is masculine, “for nature is the law of men, and to follow nature is the mark of a strong and truly masculine reason” (Ebr. 54–5). Why, then, are women, the matriarchs, chosen as symbols of virtues? The answer given in Fug. 51 is that God used a feminine appearance so that even the most perfect human qualities would be imperfect. Each matriarch has her allegorical peculiarities. Sarah, for example, is said to have nothing to do with the world of women and to be born, like Athena, from the father of everything (Ebr. 60–1). At the same time, she unites with Abraham to give birth to Isaac, who is the allegory of joy, one of the three Stoic good passions (eupatheiai) which also include will (boulèsis) and caution (eulabeia).

In Stoicism, virtue, or human perfection, is the natural end (telos) of the programming of mankind by Providence. In Philo, things are more complex because of Original Sin. For the Stoics, there was no ontologisation of evil in a world which was entirely rational, and to become as perfect as God was not an absurd project. Philo lived in a period when most philosophers chose a more modest purpose: to become like God as far as possible by flying from the earthly sphere to the heavenly realm (Plato, Theaetetus 176 a–b). To live in the least imperfect way was the goal, a goal which had some similarities with the Stoic figure of the prokoptôn, the person making moral progress. Philo knew the different aspects of this figure and gave his own interpretation of it in Agr. 15. The striving towards a lesser imperfection could take three forms, a division with Platonic/Pythagorean origin but embodied by the example of the patriarchs. Abraham embodies the effort to know, in traveling from astrology to real comprehension of nature, then from the comprehension of nature to “the maker and father of the world”; Isaac symbolizes the happy nature, “the new race, superior to reason and truly divine” (Fug. 168); and Jacob, the struggle against senses and passions. Philo stresses the fact that each of these three types is present in the other two (Abr. 52–53). From a formal point of view, the relation among the three types is not fundamentally different from that of the virtues in the Stoic system which aims to reconcile the unity of the whole and the specificity of each element.

On the specificities of the character of Joseph in Hellenistic philosophy, see Niehoff (1992)

There is an element which differentiates Philo from his contemporary philosophers and rabbis: the absence of a master. It is impossible to find in his vast corpus the name of someone who initiated him to philosophy or to Biblical exegesis. Why this silence about his masters? One possible explanation is that for Philo, transmission is greater than the transmitters. He is consistent regarding this position when he speaks very little of himself. His main idea is that “the only good that is infallible and firm is faith in God” (Abr. 268). The human being can improve herself, and she can have a clear conscience (suneidêsis is a key word of Philo’s ethical vocabulary) of the ethical issues, but this does not allow her to assert her real existence.

5.4 Politics and contemplation

Almost all the details that we know of Philo’s life are in relation to his political activity. Though he himself has a clear preference for theoretical and mystical life, he played an important role in the Jewish community of Alexandria. This is one of the great paradoxes of his life. He thought that it was necessary to engage in political affairs before attempting the contemplative life, but the tragic situation of the Alexandrine community obliged him to commit to public life in order to defend his coreligionists. Nevertheless, he never considered politics a field without interest. His treatises are full of remarks about the origin of society, or about the functioning of human society. Stasis, violent sedition in the city, was one of his main concerns, certainly based on his own experience. He was perfectly aware of the Stoic doctrine of the social oikeiôsis, which affirmed that the whole of mankind was a natural community, arranged in concentric circles (family, nation, humankind as a whole). He did not deny the existence of kinship among human beings, even if “malignant covetousness” is always a source of hatred. He tried to give a concrete shape to the natural link by encouraging philanthropy and demanding humane treatment of slaves. He did not hesitate in advocating their emancipation. He even asserts that their emancipation “granted freedom to him who is naturally free” (Spec. 2.84). At the same time, he describes mankind as being deeply divided by passions, wars, and all kinds of violence. He has the same optimistic vision of human nature, at least in principle, as the Stoics, while he also adopted the pessimistic view of the Neo-Academic Carneades in his critique of Stoicism. One of his most original ideas to transcend this duality was that individual political regimes were “additions to the one natural regime” (Ios. 28–31). The dispersion of humanity and the strength of the passions have as consequence that harmonious coexistence of nations, though theoretically possible, is in reality impossible. Because there is, in politics, a permanent antagonism between individual passions and natural reason, the figure of the politician is himself varied and contradictory. Moses is not a politician, but at once the figure of the philosopher-king, the sage, the priest, and the prophet. Even before receiving the Law, he is the incarnation of the law (nomos empsychos), as were the patriarchs (Abr. 3–5). Joseph, the best politician, is not a constant object of Philo’s admiration. Even though a recent paper (Frazier 2002) tried to give evidence of a greater coherence between the two treatises, in the De Iosepho Joseph is described as a responsible and courageous man, while in the De somniis he is said to be mainly desperate for glory. For Philo, monotheism would imply the superiority of monarchy, but with the exception of Moses, most human beings are too weak and inconsistent to ensure stable monarchy. In fact, his political thought is profoundly influenced by the Hellenistic idea of anacyclôsis, the natural instability of the three elementary constitutions (monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy). The Greek historian Polybius had thought that a mixed constitution would be the guarantee against this instability, and he saw in the Roman constitution the paradigm of this stability. In a certain sense, for Philo, the city of Moses is the model of a new kind of constitution: it associates transcendence with law of nature, particularism and universalism, monarchy, aristocracy and democracy. Was it for him, as it said by Carlier (2008: 433) “un modèle concurrentiel à la civitas romana” (i.e., a competitive model to Rome)? Certainly it was for him a model of a different kind, a radically different kind of exemplarity. In this perspective, the famous and controversial passage about the Essenians (Probus 75–92) can be read as the demonstration that this model was not a utopian one.

For Cicero, who has many common points with Philo despite fundamental differences, the problem of the choice of life (theoretical, political, or mixed) is one of the most frequent themes of his philosophical reflection. For him, it was essentially a matter of personal choice. In the case of Philo, as it was underlined by Calabi (2011, 2013: 87), the commandment to observe the Sabbath establishes a structural organization of time, which must include at least a part of theoretical life. Philo stresses the fact that in all the Jewish communities Sabbath was a day for praying and also for devoting oneself to philosophy (Spec. 2.62), that is, the study of the Torah. Does the De uita contemplativa, with its long description of the life of the Therapeuts of Alexandria, mean that the theoretical life was for Philo the best kind of life, or only a philosopher’s dream? There are many declarations of Philo asserting the superiority of the theoretical life. At the same time, he does not imagine this life as an isolated one. To live in the desert does not necessarily mean to live alone. In fact, the desert is the place where the double aspect of virtue appears most clearly, which is reflection and action at the same time. This duality is once again a common point between Philo and the Stoics, but also an element of difference, because no Stoic showed the slightest interest for kind of life of the Therapeuts.

5.5 The sage, the divine man

The Quod omnis probus is one of the most puzzling Philonian treatises. Despite the fact that Eusebius included it in his catalogue of the works of Philo, the question of its authenticity was often discussed from the middle of the 19th century. The main arguments against its authenticity were the massive presence of Stoicism and the lack of any allegoric commentary. Biblical references are rare, only five quotations used for an apologetic purpose. From a philosophical point of view, it is not easy to understand how Philo, who was a major user of Stoic topoi, but always showing distance towards them, seems to have fully adopted the paradox of the perfect liberty of the sage, even when he is in a situation of slavery. Did Philo adopt the Stoic view that the sage embodies the perfection of human nature? And how could he reconcile this with the Jewish conception of a human being marked by Original Sin? More generally, between Stoicism affirming that the wise man is the equal of God and Plato proposing that man assimilate to God to the furthest extent possible, where did Philo stand? The first remark is that Philo does not consider Stoicism an autonomous thought in the Probus. According to Philo—if he really was the author of the treatise—Zeno, the creator of the Stoa, most likely found his doctrine of human liberty in the Bible, more precisely in Genesis 27:40, the story of two brothers, one moderate, the other shameless. Their father wanted the shameless to be the slave of the moderate one in order to improve the shameless one. The perfection of the sage in the Probus is always subordinated to that of God, who is infinitely superior. In Stoic doctrine, God is the logos, and that means that He and the human being have the same nature, perfect in the first case, perfectible in the second one. In Philo’s interpretation of the Bible, the distance between the two is infinite. Even if man is created in the image of God, the Philonian negative theology affirms that we know nothing about Him. Philo says in the Probus 20 that only he who has no other master than God is free. He adds that this man is also the master of other human beings, the deadly vicar of a Grand Immortal King. In Stoic doctrine, the Sage is the King and the next best human beings are his ministers. There is no mention of a mightier king. But how can Philo say that a human being is divine?

Litwa (2014) focuses on the deification of Moses. In conclusion, Litwa affirms that “Moses is deified by participating in the logos, the Mind of God, and Philo’s ‘second God’” (2014: 27). God is the King and God of gods, while Moses is only a god with regard to mankind. It can only be added that if the Sage embodies the exceptional fulfillment of the human nature in Stoicism, in Somn. 2.234, the perfect man is said to be neither of an ungenerated nature nor a mortal one. Not only the context of Middle Platonism but also the beginning of the deification of the princeps in the Roman empire can help understand why Philo so easily expressed the idea of the man-god, which seemed to be far from his own convictions.

6. Conclusion

Another long article would be necessary to address the Christian reception of Philo. Many books and articles provide precious information on this point (Van den Hoek 1988; Runia 1993, 2009; Sterling 1998). Philo’s thought was used by the Christian fathers in many different ways. Their attitude towards him ranged from the passionate interest of Origen to the accurate attention of Clemens to the somewhat stubborn and hostile attitude of Ambrose, who in many places plagiarizes Philo. Today, Philo is included in the modern categories of “Middle Platonism” and, still more recent, “Middle Judaism”. In his case these expressions are meaningful. He spent his life “in the middle of” antagonistic cultures, violent conflicts, and contrasting philosophical and religious theories. His main legacy in philosophy was the idea that in the face of many harsh human attitudes, there were two complementary ways of remaining free and lucid. The main model was for him, as it was constantly asserted by Nikiprowetzky, the flight, not exactly the Platonic flight of the Theaetetus, but that of Exodus, both a spatial, historical, and vertical flight, the most perfect example of the presence of Transcendence in the world. While the cause of Abraham’s flight was his rejection of idolatry, Moses’ project was far more ambitious: not only to escape from Egypt, but to build a nation by giving it the Word of God as a constitution. But it must be added that there was for Philo also a kind of Exodus of words. He gathers concepts and themes of philosophy to free them, i.e., to bring them into the light of the God of the Torah. Like Moses who knew all the foreign sciences, Philo learned almost everything of philosophy, not in order to be a professional philosopher, but to demonstrate that the truth the Greeks looked for was where they did not imagine it to be. Philo’s conception of oudeneia, the human nothingness, had nothing to do with nihilism. It was the affirmation of the centrality of God instead of the centrality of the self. One could say that this was theology much more than philosophy. But, at the same time, it would be an error to say that philosophy remained the same before and after Philo.

Supplementary Documents


Primary Literature

Philo: Editions, translations and commentaries

The edition of reference is that of Leopald Cohn, Paulus Wendland and Siegfried Reiter, Philonis Alexandri opera quae supersunt, Berlin 1896–1915. It contains all the treatises in Greek (six volumes plus an index volume).

The editors of Philo in the Loeb Classical Library (LCL), F.H. Colson, J.W. Earp, Ralph Marcus and G.H. Whitaker, sought mainly to provide a quality English translation.

  • Philo in Ten Volumes, and Two Supplementary Volumes, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1929–1962,
    • vol. 1. On the creation (De Opificio Mundi);
      Allegorical interpretation (Legum Allegoriae) [LCL 226, Colson & Whitaker (tr.) 1929]
    • vol. 2. On the cherubim (De Cherubim);
      On the sacrifices of Abel and Cain (De Sacrificiis Abelis et Caini);
      The worse attacks the better (Quod Deterius Potiori insidiari solet);
      On the posterity and exile of Cain (De Posteritate Caini);
      On the giants (De Gigantibus) [LCL 227, Colson & Whitaker (tr.) 1929]
    • vol. 3. On the unchangeableness of God (Quod Deus sit immutabilis);
      On husbandry (De Agricultura);
      On Noah’s work as a planter (De Plantatione);
      On drunkenness (De Ebrietate);
      On sobriety (De Sobrietate) [LCL 247, Colson & Whitaker (tr.) 1930]
    • vol. 4. On the confusion of tongues (De Confusione Linguarum);
      On the migration of Abraham (De Migratione Abrahami);
      Who is the Heir (Quis Rerum Divinarum Heres);
      On the preliminary studies (De Congressu quaerendae Eruditionis gratia) [LCL 261, Colson & Whitaker (tr.) 1932]
    • vol. 5. On flight and finding (De Fuga et Inventione);
      On the change of Names (De Mutatione Nominum);
      On dreams (De Somniis) [LCL 275, Colson & Whitaker (tr.) 1934]
    • vol. 6. On Abraham (De Abrahamo);
      On Joseph (De Iosepho);
      Moses (De Vita Mosis) [LCL 289, Colson (tr.) 1935]
    • vol. 7. On the Decalogue (De Decalogo);
      On the Special Laws Books I–III (De Specialibus Legibus) [LCL 320, Colson (tr.) 1937]
    • vol. 8. On the Special Laws Book IV (De Specialibus Legibus);
      On the Virtues (De Virtutibus);
      On rewards and punishments (De Praemiis et Poenis) [LCL 341, Colson (tr.) 1939]
    • vol. 9. Every good man is free (Quod Omnis Probus Liber sit);
      On the contemplative life (De Vita Contemplativa);
      On the eternity of the world (De Aeternitate Mundi);
      Flaccus (In Flaccum);
      Hypothetica (Apologia pro Iudaeis);
      On Providence (De Providentia) [LCL 363, Colson (tr.) 1941]
    • vol. 10. On the embassy to Gaius (De Legatione ad Gaium);
      General index to Volumes 1–10 [LCL 379, Colson (tr.) 1962]
    • suppl. 1. Questions and answers on Genesis (Quaestiones et Solutiones in Genesis). [LCL 380, Marcus (tr.) 1953]
    • suppl. 2. Questions and answers on Exodus (Quaestiones et Solutiones in Exodum). General index to Supplements 1–2 [LCL 401, Marcus (tr.) 1953]

In the French edition, Les Œuvres de Philon d’Alexandrie, Paris 1961–1992, 36 vol, some volumes are only translations with a minimal introduction, while other ones contain an introductions and notes that can be extensive, Paris: Éditions du Cerf, sous la direction de R. Arnaldez, C. Mondésert, J. Pouilloux.  

  • Introduction générale, De opificio mundi, R. Arnaldez.   
  • 2. Legum allegoriae, C. Mondésert.   
  • 3. De cherubim, J. Gorez.   
  • 4.   De sacrificiis Abelis et Caini, A. Méasson.   
  • 5.   Quod deterius potiori insidiari soleat, I. Feuer.   
  • 6.   De posteritate Caini, R. Arnaldez.
  • 7–8.   De gigantibus. Quod Deus sit immutabilis, A. Mosès.   
  • 9.   De agricultura, J. Pouilloux.
  • 10.   De plantatione, J. Pouilloux.
  • 11–12.  De ebrietate. De sobrietate, J. Gorez.
  • 13.   De confusione linguarum, J.-G. Kahn.
  • 14.   De migratione Abrahami, J. Cazeaux.
  • 15.   Quis rerum divinarum heres sit, M. Harl.
  • 16.   De congressu eruditionis gratia, M. Alexandre.
  • 17.   De fuga et inventione, E. Starobinski-Safran.
  • 18.   De mutatione nominum, R. Arnaldez.
  • 19.   De somniis, P. Savinel.
  • 20.   De Abrahamo, J. Gorez.
  • 21.   De Iosepho, J. Laporte.
  • 22.   De vita Mosis, R. Arnaldez, C. Mondésert, J. Pouilloux, P. Savinel.
  • 23.   De Decalogo, V. Nikiprowetzky.
  • 24.   De specialibus legibus, Livres I–II, S. Daniel.
  • 25.   De specialibus legibus, Livres III–IV. A. Mosès.
  • 26.   De virtutibus, R. Arnaldez, A.-M. Vérilhac, M.-R. Servel, P. Delobre.
  • 27.   De praemiis et poenis. De exsecrationibus, A. Beckaert.
  • 28.   Quod omnis probus liber sit, M. Petit.
  • 29.   De vita contemplativa, F. Daumas et P. Miquel.
  • 30.   De aeternitate mundi, R. Arnaldez et J. Pouilloux.
  • 31.   In Flaccum, A. Pelletier.
  • 32.   Legatio ad Caium, A. Pelletier.
  • 33.   Quaestiones in Genesim et in Exodum. Fragmenta graeca, F. Petit.
  • 34 A.   Quaestiones in Genesim, I–II (e vers. armen.), C. Mercier.
  • 34 B.   Quaestiones in Genesim, III–IV (e vers. armen.), C. Mercier et F. Petit.
  • 34 C.   Quaestiones in Exodum, I–II (e vers. armen.), A. Terian.
  • 35.   De Providentia, I–II, M. Hadas-Lebel.
  • 36.   Alexander vel De animalibus.

In the “Philo of Alexandria Commentary Series” (PACS), edited by G.E. Sterling, in Brill and Scholars Press are published the following English translations with commentary:

  • On the Creation of the Cosmos According to Moses, PACS 1, David T. Runia (tr.), Leiden: Brill, 2001.
  • Philo’s Flaccus: The First Pogrom, PACS 2, Pieter Willem van der Horst (tr.), Leiden: Brill, 2003.
  • Philo of Alexandria: On Virtues, PACS 3, Walter T. Wilson (tr.), Leiden: Brill, 2011.
  • Philo of Alexandria: On Cultivation. Introduction, Translation and Commentary, PACS 4, Albert C. Geljon and David T. Runia (tr.), Leiden: Brill 2013.

A Spanish Translation, with introduction and notes, of the Philonian corpus, is edited under the responsibility of José Pablo Martín, by the Editorial Trotta in Madrid, under the title Filón de Alejandría: Obras Completas. Eight volumes are programmed in this series, five have been published, 2009–

Other isolated commentaries will be indicated in the following titles of the bibliography. Many interesting discussions can also be found in

  • [ANRW II.21.1] Haase Wolfgang (ed.), Hellenistisches Judentum in römischer Zeit. Philon und Josephus, (ANRW [Aufstieg und Niedergang der römischen Welt], II 21.1), Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1984.

The abbreviations of our article are those of the Studia Philonica Annual (see the supplementary document Abbreviations of the Philonian treatises). The translations are those of the Loeb Classical Library, except for De opificio (On the Creation), for which we adopted Runia’s translation.

Other primary literature

  • Cicero, circa 51 BCE, De re publica, 6 books, translated by Francis Barham as “Treatise on the Commonwealth”, in The Political Works of Marcus Tullius Cicero, volume 1, London: Edmund Spettigue, 1841. Elsewhere translated as “Treatise on the Republic”. [Treatise on the Commonwealth available online]
  • –––, circa 45 BCE [De finibus], De Finibus Bonorum et Malorum, (On the Ends of Goods and Evils), five books, translated in On Ends, Cicero vol. XVII, (LCL 40, H. Rackham (tr.)), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1914, second edition 1931. [De finibus available online]
  • –––, circa 45 BCE [Tusculans], Tusculanae Quaestiones (Tusculun Disputations), five books.
  • Diodorus Siculus, circa 60 BCE, Bibliotheca Historica (Historical Library), [Diodorus Siculus, books 33–40, available online]
  • Flavius Josephus, circa 100 CE, Against Apion, an English translation is by William Whiston, 1737, in The Genuine Works of Flavius Josephus the Jewish Historian, London. [Against Apion available online]
  • Plutarch, circa 100 CE, “Life of Alexander”, in The Parallel Lives, translated in LIves, Plutarch vol. VII, (LCL 99, Bernadotte Perrin (tr.)), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. [Life of Alexander available online]
  • Pseudo-Phocylides, circa 100 BCE–100 CE, Sentences, translated by Pieter W. van der Horst, The Sentences of Pseudo-Phocylides, (Studia in Veteris Testamenti Pseudepigrapha IV), Leiden: Brill, 1978.


  • Philo of Alexandria: An Annotated Bibliography 1937–1986, (Vigiliae Christianae, Supplements, 8), Roberto Radice and David T. Runia, Leiden: Brill, 1988.
  • Philo of Alexandria: An Annotated Bibliography 1987–1996, (Vigiliae Christianae, Supplements, 57), David T. Runia, Leiden: Brill, 2000.
  • Philo of Alexandria: An Annotated Bibliography 1997–2006 (Vigiliae Christianae, Supplements, 109), David T. Runia, Leiden: Brill, 2012.

Philo of Alexandria: An Annotated Bibliography 2007–2016 (Vigiliae Christianae, Supplements, 174), David T. Runia, Leiden: Brill, 2022. Philonian bibliography is provided annually in The Studia Philonica Annual published by the Society of Biblical Literature Atlanta.

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Other Internet Resources

  • Philo-dev, a digital repository hosts digital (machine-corrected) versions of public-domain editions of the works of Philo, by OpenGreekAndLatin at github.
  • Philo of Alexandria – Bibliography, hosted at the Yale Divinity School.


The author would like to thank Ada Browowski, Pr Phillip Mitsis and Lex Paulson, who helped to improve the English of the first versions of my text. Many thanks also to Prs David Konstan and David Runia for their useful remarks on so many points of this entry

Copyright © 2022 by
Carlos Lévy <>

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