Presentism

First published Mon Jan 22, 2018

Presentism is the view that only present things exist (Hinchliff 1996: 123; Crisp 2004: 15; Markosian 2004: 47–48). So understood, presentism is an ontological doctrine; it’s a view about what exists (what there is), absolutely and unrestrictedly. The view is the subject of extensive discussion in the literature, with much of it focused on the problems that presentism allegedly faces. Thus, much of the literature that frames the development of presentism has grown up either in formulating objections to the view (e.g., Sider 2001: 11–52), or in response to such objections (e.g., Bigelow 1996; Markosian 2004), with exceptions to this largely coming via the ways in which presentism is motivated. This entry mirrors the structure of that literature, for the most part. Here’s the plan for what follows. We begin with a more detailed sketch of presentism, its commitments and motivations. Then we move to consider several concerns that have been raised for presentists. We use these to illustrate both the breadth and severity of the challenges that presentism faces, as well as the range of different versions of presentism developed to help meet these challenges.

1. What is Presentism?

As a bare ontological thesis, presentism can be understood as P:

  • (P)Only present things exist.

P is a claim about what there is, absolutely and unrestrictedly. As a description of presentism, it’s both orthodox and minimal. To flesh it out, the view is often contrasted with two other ontological theses: an opposing view of time, eternalism (“past, present, and future things exist”), and an analogical view in modality, actualism (“only actual things exist”) (see, e.g., Adams 1986: 321; Hinchliff 1996: 123–4; Sider 1999: 326, 2001: 11–12; Noonan 2013: 219–20). Theodore Sider, for instance, neatly articulates this apparent orthodoxy:

Presentism is the doctrine that only the present is real. … A presentist thinks that everything is present; more generally, that, necessarily, it is always true that everything is (then) present.

Presentism is the temporal analogue of the modal doctrine of actualism, according to which everything is actual. The opposite view in the philosophy of modality is possibilism, according to which nonactual things exist; its temporal analogue is eternalism, according to which there are such things as merely past and merely future entities. (1999: 325–6)

Presentists and eternalists make competing claims about temporal ontology. According to presentism, only present things exist. According to eternalism, past and future things, such as dinosaurs and human outposts on Mars, exist as well. These are theories about what there is, just like actualism, possibilism, Platonism, nominalism, Meinongianism, idealism, materialism, theism, atheism… (2006: 75)

Presentists and the rest thus disagree about what exists. When confronted with W.V. Quine’s (1948) three Anglo-Saxon monosyllables—“What is there?”—presentists have a simple and distinctive reply: “Only what’s present”. Non-presentists demur. Eternalists say that there are past and future things too. Growing block theorists (“no-futurists”) say that there are past and present things, but no future things. On the orthodox picture, what’s distinctive about presentism is determined primarily by the distinct set of claims made about temporal ontology.

The ontological doctrine, P, requires supplementation. Consider, for example, a possible world, w, at which the growing block theory of time is true. At the first moment of w, P is true. There exists only the first moment and that moment is present; there are no other moments, and so the past hasn’t yet come to exist. Later on, it will become clear that w isn’t a presentist world, even though it seems initially to satisfy P: at the first moment, only present things exist. For this reason, when being more forthcoming with a definition of their view, moving beyond mere slogan, presentism might more perspicuously be rendered as a view that is always true, if true at all (Crisp 2003: 215, 2004: 19, fn.6, 2007: 107, n.1). So, presentism amounts to the claim that:

  • (PA) Always, only present things exist.

Along the modal dimension, presentism might be thought of as a view that is necessarily true, if true at all (e.g., Hestevold & Carter 2002: 499; Markosian 2004: 47, fn.1; Ingram 2016: 2868). Thus:

  • (PAN)Necessarily, it’s always the case that, only present things exist.

However, although presentists sometimes make this move, there’s very little discussion in the literature as to whether PAN is preferable to PA and, if so, what would justify that preference. In what follows, reflecting that lack of discussion, we remain neutral on which of PA or PAN is preferred. We follow the wider literature in typically stating presentism as P, rather than PA, though we take it that something at least as strong as PA is intended.

More modifications may be required. First, strictly speaking, on this characterization, presentism is a thesis that denies the existence of atemporal or timeless entities, that is, entities that aren’t present (but aren’t past or future either). This appears to rule out the existence of abstract entities. [See the entry on abstract objects.] And this may be a step too far for some presentists. Hence, we might be pressed to modify PA and restrict it to concrete objects. We’re not forced to make that move, however, since PA only rules out abstracta qua timeless entities. Presentism is compatible with the existence of abstracta, so long as such entities exist now (exist within time). In any case, timeless abstracta are inconsistent with PA, but (as is clear) this needn’t be of too much concern. It is unclear how much would be lost from the core of presentism if we coupled PA to timeless abstracta.

Second, presentism isn’t merely the thesis that only present things exist. This isn’t the full extent of the position. Without qualification, P is consistent with the view that reality is “static” (or “frozen”) and that time doesn’t really pass. But reality isn’t that way; our reality is “dynamic”. Hence, a full and proper account of presentism requires more detail. Typically, presentism is thought to include the additional claim that various things have existed and that others will exist: Julius Caesar, Marie Curie, and Amelia Earhart all existed, but exist no longer; and, though we exist, alongside Taylor Swift, Donald Trump, and you (dear reader), all of us will cease to exist at some future time(s), to be replaced by other things, each of which will go out of existence in their turn. Thus, presentism commits us to there being a change in what exists over time, a change in what’s present. And, frequently (although not exclusively), presentists describe this change in terms of temporal passage—the passing of time—or, at least, as closely related to it. So, presentism can be understood as the following conjunction:

  • (PC) (i) Only present things exist,
    &
    (ii) What’s present changes.

For those who state presentism explicitly in this way, see Price (2011: 277), Miller (2013: 346), and Leininger (2015: 726), amongst others.

Further, since presentism marks a difference between the present, on one hand, and the past and future, on the other, it’s typical (although, again, not universal) to see presentism described as a version of the “A theory” of time (e.g., Craig 2000; Zimmerman 2008; Deasy 2017). Here we understand the “A theory” as something like the union of the following two theses: there are genuine, fundamental or “irreducible” properties of at least some of past, present and future (i.e., so-called “A qualities” or “A properties”); and, time passes (see the entry on time, esp. §5). For recent explorations of presentism without the A theory (or, without A qualities), see Rasmussen (2012) and Tallant (2012).

Thus far, our focus has been on saying what presentism is. And, as we see it, we’ve reported faithfully what’s said typically about the view in the contemporary literature. But the recent history of the view, presentism in the earlier parts of the 20th century, is a little less clear. As far as we know, Robert Adams is the first to use the name “presentism” in print (in 1986), though he implies that he isn’t the first to name it—he writes:

[a] reduction is offered by a view that is sometimes called “presentism” by analogy with “actualism”. (1986: 321)

Before 1986, matters are unclear. Many (rightly) point to Arthur Prior as an important and historically significant adherent of presentism. We agree that Prior endorses the presentist’s ontological thesis, P—he writes:

the present simply is the real considered in relation to two species of unreality, namely the past and the future. (1970: 245)

But we think that it’s less obvious that Prior’s complete view on time is presentism, as above (see e.g., Fine 1977, Butterfield 1983 and Le Poidevin 1991: 36–40). [For detail on Prior’s life and work, see the entry on Arthur Prior.] There are others after Prior, but before Adams (1986) or Hinchliff (1988), who also appear to endorse P, such as Richard Routley (1980). Similarly, we take no stand here on whether such philosophers are presentists.

This concludes our opening sketch. Presentism is the view that only present things exist and what’s present changes (i.e., things change, time passes); and, it’s an A theory of time. Now, why believe it?

2. Motivating Presentism

The most frequently cited reason given for endorsing presentism—or, at least, treating it as worthy of serious critical consideration—trades upon some variant of the claim that it’s the “intuitive” or “common sense” view of time (e.g., Bigelow 1996: 36; Sider 2001: 11; Markosian 2004: 48; De Clercq 2006: 386; Tallant 2009b: 407). Many friends agree, and more than a few foes concede, that there’s something compelling about the idea that present things really exist, whilst past and future things don’t exist. Some who look to defend presentism will rest there with the bare claim that presentism is intuitive (etc.) and that this gives us reason to think that it’s true.

One way to proceed is to extend this idea. Begin with the intuition that there’s something special about the present—something distinctive. This seems attractive enough. But how might we capture it in our metaphysical model of time? One way to do it is to assert that present things are the only things that exist, that is, to endorse the presentist’s ontic thesis. Certainly, this marks the present as distinctive. And, to the extent that we wish to capture and preserve the idea that the present is “special” (in some sense), so presentism fares well against this measure. But, of course, any model that privileges the present in some way will fare well against the same measure. So, for this argument to fully motivate presentism, further argument must be given for thinking that these other rival views don’t come up to scratch.

Another way to motivate presentism is via appeal to experience. To borrow a famous example, consider a headache (e.g., Zimmerman 1998: 212). If a headache exists, it hurts. It can’t exist and fail to hurt. Now, suppose that we endorse the existence of the past (and deny presentism). Past headaches exist. But they don’t hurt (at least, so goes the claim). If headaches from hangovers last year hurt us, neither author would be in a position to write this, so severe would be the pain. Since headaches must hurt, if they exist—it’s part of their essence to do so—past headaches cannot exist. This goes for the future headaches as well. Thus, presentism is true. (For the classic statement of the “thank goodness that’s over” argument, in favor of A theories of time, see A.N. Prior 1959. The wider literature is voluminous. Representative recent works include: Suhler & Callender 2012, Hoerl 2015, and Pearson forthcoming.)

There are different examples that draw on our experience of pain and our attitude towards it. Consider again a past headache and compare it to a (possible) future headache, something that may result from over enthusiastic behavior in the bar this evening. A future headache is something that worries us. It influences our behavior. We seek to avoid it. We may even fear it. By contrast, we feel differently about a past headache (and past pains, generally). We don’t fear past pains. They don’t worry us in quite the same way. One explanation for this is that a past pain doesn’t exist. And whilst a future pain doesn’t exist either, we know that it will do so if we behave in such-and-such a way. It’s the potential for that headache to exist (to come into being) that causes us to modify our behavior. We wish to avoid that state. But if we think that past and future things exist, we cannot appeal to the explanation just given, for if the past headache exists, presumably we should fear it or worry about it, just as we should if a future headache exists.

Last, but not least, we might motivate presentism by appealing to ontological parsimony (e.g., Bourne 2006: 68–69). Suppose that we endorse something like “Ockham’s razor”, viz. the principle that one shouldn’t multiply entities beyond necessity (see the entry on simplicity, esp. §2). By asserting that only present things exist, by not positing the existence of any non-present things, the presentist’s ontology is more parsimonious than the ontology of their opponents (growing block theorists posit the existence of past and present things, eternalists posit the existence of past, present, and future things, etc.). All things being equal, we have at least a defeasible preference for presentism over its rivals, if we have a taste for ontological desert landscapes.

There are a number of complications with this way of motivating presentism. For one thing, although it’s typical (in metaphysics) to see appeals to parsimony in cases where one view is more “qualitatively” parsimonious than its rivals, that is, cases where a view posits fewer kinds of thing than opposing views, it’s far less typical to see appeals in cases where one view is merely more “quantitatively” parsimonious than rivals, that is, cases where a view posits fewer things than another. The fact that appeals to quantitative parsimony are less typical reflects a general attitude that the only ontological parsimony that one ought to respect is qualitative parsimony. As David Lewis famously puts it:

I subscribe to the general view that qualitative parsimony is good in a philosophical or empirical hypothesis; but I recognize no presumption whatever in favor of quantitative parsimony (1973: 87)

Now, it seems that if presentism is to be motivated by appeal to parsimony, then it must be motivated by appeal to considerations of quantitative parsimony. Presentism and eternalism don’t disagree about the kinds of things that exist. Both presentists and non-presentists tend to agree on the metaphysical kinds (or “ontological categories”) that exist. What they disagree about is the temporal location of the things that exist. Presentism states that everything exists at the present time; eternalism states that there are things that exist at other times. If presentism is to be motivated in this way then we must justify a preference for quantitative parsimony in this case in the face of the orthodoxy that Lewis expresses. (See Tallant 2013b for an attempt to deliver this sort of argument for presentism.)

At the outset, we noted that presentism has been formulated, developed, and modified in response to a range of objections. In what remains of this entry, we consider what we take to be the most prominent and well-developed of these objections and explain how presentists have tried to respond (§§3–8).

3. Definitional Concerns

Consider the following minimal statement of presentism, viz. the ontological thesis, P:

  • (P) Only present things exist.

There is a concern with P, understood as a statement of presentism, arguing that the use of the verb “exist” is ambiguous in a problematic way. The idea is that, once P is disambiguated properly, presentism is either trivially true (but consistent with some non-presentist views) or else false. P admits of three apparently distinct readings:

  • (P1) Only present things exist now.
  • (P2) Only present things have existed, exist now, or will exist.
  • (P3) Only present things exist simpliciter.

The highlighted portions indicate a putative disambiguation of “exist”. Opponents insist that these are the only available readings of P and press the following argument:

  • (1) Presentism is P1, P2, or P3.
  • (2) The claim “only present things exist now” (P1) is trivial.
  • (3) The claim “only present things have existed, exist now, or will exist” (P2) is false
  • (4) The claim “only present things exist simpliciter” (P3) is false.
  • (5) Therefore, presentism is either trivial or false.

For statements of this argument, see Crisp (2004: 17) and Ludlow (2004: 22). For discussion of the (so-called) “sceptical” challenge, in a variety of forms, see Merricks (1995: 523, 1999: 421–2), Zimmerman (1998: 209–10), Lombard (1999: 254–5, 2010), Sider (1999: 325–7, 2006), Callender (2000: S588–90), Rea (2003), Meyer (2005, 2013), Savitt (2006), Stoneham (2009), Mozersky (2011: 122–5), Torrengo (2012, 2016), Miller (2013: 348–51), Tallant (2014) and Deng (forthcoming).

The argument (1)–(5) is valid. But why think that it’s sound? Well, premise (2) is clearly true. The claim that “only present things exist now” amounts to the claim that “only presently existing things presently exist”. Whilst we shouldn’t disagree with this claim, it’s a mere triviality and cannot be used to advance a distinctive position in the philosophy of time. Moreover, P1 is consistent with the existence of non-present things, contrary to the spirit of presentism. For example, Marie Curie isn’t a present entity—she doesn’t exist now—but she can exist (in the past) without contradicting P1. Hence, P1 isn’t an adequate statement of presentism, regardless of its status as a truism.

What about premises (3) and (4)? The standard justification for (3) is that P2 is false because it’s open to counterexamples. The standard justification for (4) is that P3 collapses into P2. Both are controversial. We take each in turn.

3.1 Counterexamples to P2

The claim that we explore here is that: “only present things have existed, exist now, or will exist” (P2) is false because some non-present things have existed. For example, Marie Curie isn’t a present thing, but she has existed. This appears to be a counterexample to P2.

One might reply here that P2 isn’t false (for the reason just given) because there are no non-present entities—presentists don’t think that there is something, Curie, that exists and isn’t present. To work through the details here, it’s important to start talking about what presentists accept in the domain of their most unrestricted quantifiers. That is, P2 isn’t false because there are no non-present entities in the relevant domain of quantification. Suppose that we read P2 in the following way: “for any x, if x has existed, exists now, or will exist, then x is present”. And, following Thomas Crisp (2004), presentists may read the quantifier “for any…” as “for any… within time” (depending on views about the existence of timeless entities). If we shift to this reading, it’s no longer obvious that P2 is false. It’s true that there once was an entity, Marie Curie, who doesn’t exist at all anymore. But it’s not clear that Curie must be within the relevant domain of quantification simply in virtue of having once existed. So, if we read P2 as “for any x (within time), if x has existed, exists now, or will exist, then x is present”—and we deny that there are any non-present entities—then P2 isn’t false (cf. Crisp 2004: 18–20). And, if P2 isn’t false, then premise (3) is false and the argument is unsound.

Of course, whether one thinks that this kind of strategy is successful will likely depend upon how one understands the locution “for any x”. Not everyone is likely to be persuaded. For instance, Ulrich Meyer (2005: 214, 2013: 68–69), when advancing his own “sceptical” challenge to presentism, considers a statement of presentism that’s very similar to the reading of P2 offered by Crisp (2004), in which the statement of presentism is equivalent to the claim that “only present entities exist temporally”. (On the assumption that “x exists within time” and “x exists temporally” are the very same notion, the two statements are equivalent.) However, Meyer argues that it’s clear enough that Curie exists temporally. After all, she has existed! And what can “x exists temporally” (or “x exists”) mean if not, simply, “x has existed, exists now, or will exist”?

3.2 The Collapse of P3

Assuming that the likes of Meyer are correct (and that the likes of Crisp are not), what should we make of premise (4)? What should we make of the claim that: “only present entities exist simpliciter” (P3) is false because P3 collapses into P2 (and P2 is false)? Perhaps we can argue that P3 doesn’t collapse into P2, and that P3 represents a distinct way to state the presentist’s ontic thesis. A defender of P3 might argue that there’s a notion of “existence simpliciter” that’s intelligible, substantive and, importantly, distinct from the “tensed” (“temporal”) notion of existence that’s captured in P2 (i.e., “has existed, exists now, or will exist”).

Once again, there’s clear and sustained disagreement about the effectiveness of this strategy. Suppose that we can insist sensibly that there’s a notion of “existence simpliciter” that helps presentism to avoid the challenge that P3 collapses into P2. (If this is so, then our opponent can’t tell us, simply, that P3 is false if P2 is false.) Nevertheless, this raises the question as to what, precisely, is meant by “x exists simpliciter” and whether the new notion can be used to characterize presentism.

What does “x exists simpliciter” mean? In this context, Meyer (2005: 214–5) tells us that if x exists simpliciter, then x exists either in the actual world @, or else in some merely possible world. And, if x exists in @, then it exists in time, it exists temporally; x either has existed, exists now, or will exist. Thus, it seems that if we specify the meaning of “x exists simpliciter”, we must take it to mean either that x exists “outside time”, but somehow still in @, or else at some other world. But, perhaps controversially, Meyer (2005: 215) argues that neither of these ways of specifying the notion of “existence simpliciter” will give us a characterization of presentism, qua model of time. Presentism is a view about what exists in time; it’s not a thesis about what exists outside of time, nor is it a thesis about what exists at other possible worlds. (Recall, from the discussion of the implications of PA, above, that nothing exists outside time, for presentists; nothing exists that isn’t present. Hence, presentism concerns what exists within time since it implies that nothing exists without.)

It’s only fair to conclude this part of the discussion by noting that it’s unclear how far we should be moved by these considerations. For instance, Daniel Deasy (2017) is clear that he thinks very little of this objection. Deasy discusses the objection (to presentism, defined as “always, everything is present”), somewhat witheringly, as follows:

[Some argue along the following lines:] the quantifier in the traditional definition is either tensed or tenseless. If it is tensed then presentism is the obviously false thesis that always, everything is now present. If it is tenseless then presentism is the trivially true thesis that always, everything is, was, or will be present. … The problem with this argument is that the key premise—that the quantifier in the traditional definition is either tensed or tenseless—is false. The universal quantifier in the traditional definition (“everything”) should be read as expressing exactly the universal quantifier of classical first-order predicate logic … [The] traditional definition is intended to express a metaphysical thesis, and metaphysical theses ought to be expressed in the most metaphysically perspicuous—i.e., most “joint carving”—terms possible. Classical first-order predicate logic is a much better candidate for a language whose terms so cut than a natural language like English. Moreover, the standard quantifiers of classical first-order predicate logic are neither “tensed” nor “tenseless” (or at least, not in the sense of the above argument). … [Quantifiers] are not verbs, they are quantifiers … Therefore there is no good reason to think the quantifiers have either reading. (2017: 380–1)

However, presentists shouldn’t celebrate too early. They should remain cautious. Deasy goes on to raise an independent concern with how to define presentism. Echoing Timothy Williamson (2013: 24–25), Deasy objects that there’s no satisfactory way to spell out what’s meant by “is present” in the definition of presentism.

3.3 Existence Presentism

As we’ve seen, standard ways of characterizing presentism face an array of definitional worries. So let’s change tack for a moment. Presentism is the view that only present things exist. But it might seem natural to suppose there’s more to presentism than a claim about the extent of our ontological commitments. That is, presentism shouldn’t just be seen as a list of which objects exist (the present ones), but a claim about existence itself. Dean Zimmerman (1996), for example, characterizes presentism as the view that “to be present just is to be real or to exist” (1996: 117). When presentism is characterized in this way, we can label it “Existence Presentism”, following Jonathan Tallant (2014).

Trenton Merricks gives a more thorough expression of this picture, as follows:

[Standard] definitions, even though they get at something important, fail to get at what separates presentism most fundamentally from eternalism. … [Presentism] and eternalism differ most fundamentally with respect to the nature of time and, relatedly, with respect to what it is to exist at a time (and to have properties at a time). (2007: 119–20)

Presentists and eternalists alike say that those things that exist at the present time really do exist and, moreover, that properties had at the present time really are had. Thus one might think that, while presentism and eternalism part ways with respect to other times, they agree about the nature of the present time and, relatedly, agree about what it is to exist (and have properties) at the present time. But they do not agree about these things. Indeed, their differences with respect to the nature of, and existence at, the present time are as important as their differences with respect to the past and the future. (2007: 123)

[Presentists] insist that there are objects that exist at the present time (or, equivalently, that presently exist). Since they do not believe in a region called the “present time”, presentists cannot reduce existing at the present time to being located at that region. I think presentists should, instead, say that existing at the present time just is existing. Thus, given presentism, if something exists, then, obviously enough, it exists at the present time. So, given presentism, since everything exists, everything exists at the present time. This is what is right about the standard definitions of presentism. (2007: 125)

This way of characterizing presentism challenges the orthodoxy, sketched above (in §1), which takes the main difference between presentism and rival models (eternalism, etc.) to be their distinct ontological commitments. On this revised way of thinking, such ontological disagreements are a consequence of the view, rather than what’s truly distinctive about it. Instead, what’s crucial to presentism is a claim about the nature of what it is to exist. To exist is to be present.

How, if at all, does this way of thinking about presentism help with the definitional worries? Supposedly, this move helps us to identify a new kind of disagreement between presentists and non-presentists. Presentists can endorse an identity claim of the form “existing at the present time is identical to existing” and thus draw new battle lines. This identity claim is present tensed and it’s true now; it doesn’t face the same worries as the other statements of presentism (P1, P2, or P3). Nonetheless, the claim is distinctive; it’s not something to which eternalists can assent. Eternalists don’t agree that existing now is existing.

4. Cross-Temporal Relations

Prima facie, there are myriad “cross-temporal” relations. We admire Marie Curie; admiration is a relation. Yesterday’s rain caused today’s flood; causation is a relation. There are other kinds of relation, which we discuss below, such as directly referring and truth-making, which seem like they cross times (and as if they might cause special trouble for presentism). For now though we want to consider the point very generally. Presentism is not compatible with the existence of Marie Curie or yesterday’s rainfall; we presentism denies the existence of all past entities. Nonetheless, what we have here with admiration and causation seems to be a relation. It’s very natural and very reasonable to suppose that a relation can only be instantiated if all of its relata exist: x cannot stand in a relation R to y unless both x and y exist. If that’s right, then there’s an obvious worry. Presentism seems flat out incompatible with the existence of any and all cross-temporal relations. Something must give.

A famous statement of this “argument from relations” is due to John Bigelow (1996). It goes as follows:

…in order for a relation to hold between two things, both of those two things will have to exist. Call this the principle that all relations are existence entailing. Add as a further premise the supposition that relations sometimes hold between a present thing and something else which is not present. The conclusion follows ineluctably, that some things exist which are not present. (1996: 37)

Bigelow suggests that this argument goes as far back as the Stoics and the Epicureans. Here we focus on contemporary iterations of the problem. For recent discussion of the problem, in a variety of forms, see Adams (1986: 321–8), Quine (1987: 197–8), Chisholm (1990a,b), Bigelow (1996), Sider (1999, 2001: 25–35), Craig (2000: 211–2), Davidson (2003), Markosian (2004), Crisp (2005), Brogaard (2006, 2013), De Clercq (2006), Torrengo (2006, 2010), Inman (2012), and Ciuni & Torrengo (2013). For a substantial, book-length treatment of the issue, see Torrengo (2008).

Quite generally, presentism can be defended via one of a few strategies to address this worry about “cross-time” relations. One option: to use presently existing entities to make sense of the relational claims. With our admiration of Marie Curie, for example, this amounts to saying that: when she existed, Curie instantiated various features and properties, those properties still exist, and it’s those present properties that we’re related to in admiration. Thus, it’s not Curie herself that we admire, but her perseverance, insight and brilliance. Of course, one important issue with this strategy is that it fails to respect the idea that it’s Curie herself that we admire, rather than mere properties that she exemplified. Alternatively, then, alongside defending presentism we might deny that some or all relations are “existence-entailing”. Thus, we can stand in the relation of admiration to Marie Curie herself, even though there’s no such entity as Curie. But here we would face the difficult task of denying the natural and reasonable supposition that a relation can only be instantiated if all of its relata exist. Presentists who go this route deny “serious presentism” and start down the road towards Meinongianism, a position which many find quite undesirable (see the entry on nonexistent objects, esp. §4). Serious presentism is the temporal analogue of “serious actualism”, the view that “necessarily, if x has F or bears R, then x exists” (see the entry on actualism, esp. §2.2). (We remain neutral on the question of whether presentism implies serious presentism, pace Bergmann 1999, Davidson 2000, and leave the “non-serious” option open to presentists.) There’s at least one more option open: to say that such seeming cases of relations aren’t, in fact, relational at all. Thus, rather than our admiration of Curie being a state that consists in Curie existing, our existing, and our bearing a relation to Curie, all that there is to such a state is our existing and instantiating a monadic property, admiring Marie Curie. Since the property is monadic, its instantiation requires only our existence.

Unsurprisingly, there are questions about the advisability of each strategy, in general, as well as about whether each can be pursued or applied sensibly in defense of presentism. Nonetheless, with the above general overview in hand, we now turn our attention to two philosophical problems that confront presentism: the problem of reference to non-present entities (§5) and the “truth-maker” problem (§6). Both are specific instances of our main objection, introduced above, and both present special problems for presentists. (The well-informed reader will note that we haven’t yet mentioned explicitly problems concerning quantification across times or metric tensed statements. We consider both as part of §6.)

5. Reference and Propositions

Let’s begin by noting that Socrates was a wise, snub-nosed philosopher, who happened to be Plato’s finest teacher. From this story, we can infer that “Socrates was wise” is true and, we might reasonably suppose, it expresses a (true) proposition, <Socrates was wise>. Similarly, we can take it that “Plato’s finest teacher was wise” is also true and it expresses a (true) proposition, <Plato’s finest teacher was wise>. [See the entry on propositions.]

Some preliminary observations. Both propositions exist; they are true and so they must exist in order to be true. (Assuming something like “serious actualism”, see above.) Equally, both propositions are about the very same individual, Socrates, though there’s a sense in which <Socrates was wise> is about Socrates more thoroughly (more intimately) than <Plato’s finest teacher was wise> is about him. Indeed, it seems that <Socrates was wise> is “directly” about Socrates, whereas <Plato’s finest teacher was wise> is only “indirectly” about him. <Socrates was wise> cannot fail to be about Socrates; it determines Socrates, the same individual, in all possible contexts. But, by contrast, <Plato’s finest teacher was wise> is about Socrates only accidentally, only in virtue of the contingent fact that Socrates was Plato’s finest teacher.

Further, note that the sentence “Socrates was wise”, which expresses <Socrates was wise>, contains a proper name (“Socrates”). And, suppose that this directly refers to Socrates. By contrast, “Plato’s finest teacher was wise”, which expresses <Plato’s finest teacher was wise>, contains a description (“Plato’s finest teacher”). We might suppose that this doesn’t directly refer to Socrates, nor does it determine him in all possible contexts. Consider, for example, the possible scenario in which Socrates never encountered Plato. In this context, Plato’s finest teacher would have been a distinct individual and the corresponding description “Plato’s finest teacher” would pick out that individual. As such, <Plato’s finest teacher was wise> would not be about Socrates and the truth of the proposition wouldn’t depend upon any facts about him. What unites both cases is reference; what divides them is the direct or indirect character of how the expressions refer. Typically, reference is construed as a relation that obtains between language and reality (between linguistic items and things in the world). [See the entry on reference.] And, again: for two things to be so related, both things (both relata) must exist.

In defending presentism we thus face a problem of direct reference with respect to merely past entities. (Although, on one reading, it’s merely an instance of the general problem of “cross-time relations”, introduced above, in §4.) It seems that we can and do refer successfully to entities that have existed and exist no longer, entities that don’t exist at all, given presentism. But, if this is so, then the past entities that we refer to (and which are related to our linguistic items) must exist, contrary to presentism. Presentists face a difficult choice. That is, they must reject one of the following four claims, which form an apparently inconsistent set: (i) we successfully refer to merely past entities, (ii) reference is a relation, (iii) for a relation to obtain, the relata must exist, and (iv) there are no merely past entities (i.e., past entities don’t exist). Presentists can’t deny (iv), since that amounts to a rejection of presentism. But it proves almost equally difficult to reject any of the other claims, given their independent plausibility.

5.1 Singular Propositions

Let’s move away from the issue of reference, specifically, and turn to the metaphysics of propositions. First, note that <Socrates was wise> is a “singular” proposition: a proposition that’s directly about some individual, Socrates, whereas <Plato’s finest teacher was wise> is a “particularised” proposition: a proposition that’s about Socrates, but not directly about them. [See the entry on singular propositions.] Frequently, propositions are taken to be complex metaphysical entities, entities with constituents and structure. [See the entry on structured propositions.] On this way of thinking, singular propositions are understood typically as constituted by individuals, specifically the individuals that they are (directly) about. Hence, a singular proposition about some, x, is constituted by x itself. By contrast, particularised propositions aren’t constituted by individuals, although they are structured entities with constituents. A particularised proposition about x isn’t constituted by x, but may be constituted by a property of x. On this view, <Socrates was wise>, for example, is constituted by Socrates himself, whereas <Plato’s finest teacher was wise> isn’t constituted by Socrates—but, perhaps, the proposition is constituted by some actual accidental property of Socrates, being the finest teacher of Plato or, indeed, having been the finest teacher of Plato. This way of thinking about (singular) propositions isn’t universal, but it’s part of a standard theory with many adherents (see Adams 1986; Williamson 2002; King 2007).

If propositions are complex (structured) entities with constituents, then they depend for their existence upon the existence of their propositional constituents. The way that such entities ontologically depend upon constituents is analogous to the way that sets depend upon their members. Consider, for example, {x}, x’s singleton set. {x} depends upon x for its existence. Typically, this is cashed out as follows: necessarily, {x} exists only if x exists; and, it’s not the case that x exists only if {x} exists. Similarly, we say: necessarily, some proposition P exists only if its (propositional) constituent c exist; and, it’s not the case that c exists only if P exists. [See the entry on ontological dependence.]

Presentism faces a problem about how to account for the existence of singular propositions about past entities. It seems that there are such propositions; recall that “Socrates was wise” expresses a true singular proposition, <Socrates was wise>, which must exist in order to be true. The problem arises given a standard treatment of singular propositions; that is, a proposition that’s directly about an individual x is constituted by x itself, and propositions depend for their existence upon the existence of their constituents. So, for example, <Socrates was wise> is constituted by Socrates himself and this proposition ontologically depends upon Socrates.

Here’s a deductively valid argument against presentism, based on the above considerations:

  • (1) If a proposition is true, then it exists.
  • (2) <Socrates was wise> is true.
  • (3) <Socrates was wise> exists. (1, 2)
  • (4) If a proposition exists and has constituents, then its constituents exist.
  • (5) Socrates is a constituent of <Socrates was wise>.
  • (6) Socrates exists. (3, 4, 5)
  • (7) If Socrates exists, then presentism is false.
  • (8) Presentism is false. (6, 7)

The argument is clearly valid. To defend presentism, we must deny one of the premises. But each premise appears independently plausible. (1) takes truth to be a monadic property, e.g., being true, and reflects a commitment to serious actualism: if P instantiates being true, then P exists. (2) takes propositions as truth-bearers (or “truth-value bearers”) and follows from the simple claim that there are truths about the past (more on this below, in §6). (4) takes propositions as complex entities and reflects a commitment to the principle that a complex depends for its existence upon things that constitute it. The remaining premises, (5) and (7), follow straightforwardly from the two metaphysical theses at issue, the standard view of propositions and presentism, respectively.

The most obvious line of response (if we wish to avoid rejecting too many plausible premises) is to deny some aspect of the standard view of propositions. Here we see a moderate and an extreme reply: a moderate suggests a modification of the standard view (e.g., Ingram 2016), an extremist suggests a total rejection of it (e.g., Merricks 2012). Moderates accept that propositions are structured entities with constituents, but urge that the propositional constituents are presently existing entities, and not any non-existent past entities. Extremists deny that propositions are structured entities and, instead, suggest a distinct treatment of propositions.

For another line of response, presentism might be modified à la Williamson (1998, 2002), who defends a view according to which past objects still exist, but are no longer concrete. We don’t take a stand on whether such a position deserves the epithet “presentism” and, further, we note that Williamson (2013: 20) explicitly states that he would prefer to see the debate between presentists and others recast in other terms, using a different methodology. Nonetheless, it is clear enough that if the existence of abstract-Socrates (who once was concrete but now is abstract) is compatible with presentism, then this would give the presentist a means to deny (7) and reject the argument given above.

For discussion of the above problem, in a variety of forms (i.e., concerning direct reference or singular propositions), see Adams (1986: 315–22), Fitch (1994), Markosian (2004), Merricks (2012: 64–67, 2015: 170–3), and Ingram (2016). There’s a modal analogue of this problem, facing actualism (roughly, the view that “only actual things exist”), and a rich literature accompanying it. For discussion of this problem, see Adams (1981), Plantinga (1983), Barcan Marcus (1985), Fine (1985), Davidson (2000), Merricks (2012: 64–71, 2015: 173–80), and Speaks (2012).

6. Truth and Truth-Making

A good deal of work on presentism in the philosophy of time concerns itself with truth. In the current context, the work in question focuses on whether (and, if so, how) presentism can account for the different kinds of true proposition that we endorse. Our primary focus will be on how to defend presentism whilst giving appropriate ontological explanations for the truth of true claims about merely past things (with the “truth-making” literature as the background). We also briefly address a related problem of truths about spans of time (sometimes treated as a separate issue concerning quantification over times).

Now we turn to one of the most discussed challenges to presentism in the contemporary debate: the (so-called) “truth-maker” objection to presentism. At first pass, this objection is another instance of the general problem of cross-temporal relations (§4), but there are reasons for thinking that concerns about truth-makers underwrite a special problem for presentists. This objection is treated as a significant problem for presentism by many, including but not limited to: Sider (2001: 35–42), Armstrong (2004: 145–50), Keller (2004), Crisp (2007), Cameron (2011), Sanson & Caplan (2010), Markosian (2013), and Tallant & Ingram (2015). For one general discussion of the problem, see Caplan & Sanson (2011). [See the entry on truthmakers for background.]

The truth-maker objection is presented as a tension between three independently plausible principles: (i) presentism, (ii) that there are (evidence-transcendent and objective) truths about the past, and (iii) truth-maker theory, the view that truths about the past are “made true” by some existent (see, e.g., Keller 2004: 85–87; Cameron 2011: 55–57; Tallant & Ingram 2015: 355, for this mode of presentation). Obviously, we cannot defend presentism and also abandon (i), and giving up on (ii) seems a steep price to pay. If there are no truths about the past, then it’s hard to make sense of the idea that things change from one moment to the next (or that time passes; see below, §7). That leaves us with (iii). Here, three options present themselves: locate the required “truth-makers”; deny that truths about the past require truth-makers; or, argue that truth-making isn’t the kind of relation that requires the existence of both relata. We consider these options in turn.

It’s worth noting, at the outset, that a version of the problem can be stated with the principle that “truth supervenes upon being” in place of truth-maker theory, (iii), as in Kierland & Monton (2007). But it’s far more common to raise this specific objection as a problem about a lack of truth-makers (rather than the lack of an appropriate “subvenient base”). And so it’s the “truth-maker” objection, in particular, upon which we focus our attention.

6.1 Locate the Truth-Makers

Truth-makers for truths about the past aren’t easy to find. We are searching for entities “in virtue of” which propositions about the past are true. For example, <Curie existed> is true in virtue of some entity, its “truth-maker”. But what plays the truth-making role? Schematically, two kinds of solution can be given here: (i) posit presently existing truth-makers, or (ii) posit truth-makers that exist “outside time”. This second option is open to presentists willing to countenance the existence of some atemporal entities (e.g., propositions, numbers, and so on). (Such a version of presentism would require a defense the idea that entities that exist outside of time do no violence to the claim that “only present things exist”.)

Presentism can be amended via the addition of atemporal truth-makers—truth-making entities that are, in a sense, “outside” time—see Bourne (2006) and Crisp (2007). This is “ersatz presentism”. Ersatz presentism is the claim that, for example, <Curie existed> is “made true” by an abstract time that represents how things were when Curie existed. (This is an “ersatz” abstract time, rather than a “genuine” concrete time.) One way to understand Ersatz presentism is as the view that there’s an abstract four-dimensional manifold of times that represents how things were, are now, and will be. This manifold is ordered by an ersatz B-theoretic “earlier than” relation and forms an ersatz B-series of times. Here, the truth-makers for truths about the past are abstract entities: the ersatz times. An ersatz time, T, represents how things were (at some past time) by some other ersatz time, T*, accurately representing how the concrete world is now, and by T bearing the “earlier than” relation (the “ersatz B-relation”) to T*.

Ersatz presentism is popular but the other position—the view that we should posit presently existing truth-makers—includes more variation. The most well-known version of this view is “Lucretianism” espoused by John Bigelow (1996). Lucretianism claims that <Curie existed> is made true by the world now instantiating a primitive past-tensed property (a “Lucretian” property) of having contained Marie Curie. Here the presently existing truth-maker is the present instantiation of the Lucretian property (having contained Curie) by the world. There are a range of other “property solutions”, alongside Lucretianism, which differ in important respects but which share a common core. For instance, see Keller (2004: 94–101) on a range of solutions, including one with indestructible atoms and their properties, Cameron (2011, 2013) on temporal distributional properties, McKinnon & Bigelow (2012) on tensing the instantiation tie, and Ingram (forthcoming) on uninstantiated thisnesses and their properties, amongst others.

Responses to the positions that posit presently existing truth-makers, such as Bigelow’s Lucretianism, along with the “Bigelow-style” property solutions (mentioned briefly), each seem to suffer from three distinct problems, perhaps only one of which afflicts the “ersatz presentist” proposal. We rehearse the problems facing presentism so-supplemented via these additional truth-makers.

First, note that any solution must ensure that the truth-makers deliver the “right results” with respect to what’s true about the past. To illustrate, consider the following natural progression of an object through time. Our story begins with a green banana. Time passes and the banana ripens. The banana is now yellow, but it was green. The world now instantiates the property having contained a green banana (or so says the Lucretian). So far, so good. But now consider the following progression, where the banana ripens and yet the world comes to instantiate a different Lucretian property. Here the world instantiates the property having contained a red banana, rather than having contained a green banana. This progression is problematic. Witness: in the scenario imagined, though it was the case that the world contained a green banana, <There was a green banana> is false; and, despite the world never having contained a red banana, <There was a red banana> is true. And, although the problematic progression doesn’t appear at all likely, the worry with these “property” responses to the truth-maker objection is that these kinds of progression appear possible, given the advertised metaphysic. If such progressions are possible, they present an objection to these presently existing entities in fact being the right kind of truth-makers for truths about the past (see, e.g., Tallant & Ingram 2012; Cameron 2013; and Leininger 2015, for discussion of this sort of challenge).

A second concern with “property solutions” stems from the worry that the kind of properties involved, for example, primitive tensed “Lucretian” properties, are wholly objectionable. Properties such as having contained dinosaurs seem, to many, to be “suspicious” or “dubious” entities—they are objectionable entities that shouldn’t be countenanced in a respectable metaphysic. They are dubious and objectionable because, in a sense that’s quite difficult to pin down, they point beyond their instances (their bearers). Thus, having contained dinosaurs is a property that “points beyond” how the world is now; it points beyond the intrinsic nature of its bearer, and “points” to how the world was; namely, containing dinosaurs. And, say the objectors, acceptable properties aren’t like that; respectable properties don’t point beyond (see, e.g., Sider 2001: 39–42; Crisp 2007: 93–98; Merricks 2007: 134–6; and Cameron 2011: 58–62, who each endorse versions of this challenge, but see Tallant 2013a who argues that all such challenges miss the mark in some way or other).

Another significant objection facing presentist attempts to solve the truth-maker objection is based on “aboutness” intuitions and their role in determining which entity (or entities) is an adequate truth-maker for a particular truth. The idea goes as follows. A truth (any truth) is about something. If a proposition is made true—if a proposition “owes its truth” to something in the world—then the thing in the world that makes the proposition true should be what the truth is about (Merricks 2007: 28–34). After all, <Taylor loves to sing>, for instance, is about Taylor and her love of singing. It would be altogether wrong for that proposition to be made true by the existence of anything other than Taylor and her love of singing. At least, so goes the thought.

However, all these “solutions” to the truth-maker objection share a common feature: the past entities that propositions about the past seem to be about don’t exist, given presentism. Marie Curie doesn’t exist, yet <Curie existed> is about Curie. There are no dinosaurs, yet <there were dinosaurs> is about them. Our “aboutness” intuitions tell us that propositions about the past should be made true by past entities, but they simply cannot be, given presentism. Whether the truth-makers we posit exist now, or exist outside time, the kind of entities that we posit won’t be up to the task. If we respect the aboutness constraint (on truth-maker theory), and cannot shake off this objection, we will likely be inclined to give up on solving the objection by attempting to locate the required truth-makers. (There are some exceptions. For example, Ingram forthcoming develops a Bigelow-style response and argues that the putative truth-makers, uninstantiated thisnesses, do satisfy aboutness intuitions.)

There’s time enough to mention briefly one additional complication. So far, we’ve focused on truths such as <Marie Curie existed> and <The banana was green>. But what about <Curie existed 100 years ago> or <The banana was green 3 days ago>? Both include a “metric”, a term that specifies a temporal interval or indicates some temporal distance. Now note that since <Curie existed> is true now, it will always be true hereafter. Interestingly, however, the same isn’t true for <Curie existed 100 years ago>. (Curie ceased to exist in 1934.) Hence, <Curie existed 100 years ago> will fail to be true in 2035.) The same rules for tensed truths don’t apply to metric tensed truths, so we must find some way of accommodating them. Even so, it seems that presentists can say similar things in the case of metric tensed truths as they do in the case of tensed truths. For example, take Bigelow’s Lucretianism and its putative truth-maker for <Curie existed>, viz. the present instantiation of a tensed (Lucretian) property of having contained Marie Curie by the world. With a fairly simple modification, this view can deal with <Curie existed 100 years ago>. All that’s required is metric tensed properties, such as the property of having contained Curie 100 years ago. This is the sort of property that’s now instantiated by the world (in 2017) but won’t be instantiated at some point in the future (such as in 2035). So, the challenge from metric tenses complicates matters but, at least on the surface, is far from insurmountable.

6.2 Deny the Need for Truth-Makers

Recall, the claims that generate the truth-maker objection: (i) presentism, (ii) there are truths about the past, and (iii) truth-maker theory. The strategy just discussed, viz. locating truth-makers for truths about the past, attempts to reconcile all three claims. But another strategy is to simply deny (iii), to assert that truths about the past don’t require truth-makers.

This way of approaching matters has been mooted (e.g., Tallant 2009b), but it hasn’t received a huge amount of support. This is due, at least in part, to the fact that it’s only a partial response. It’s all very well to deny that all truths require truth-makers, for instance, and so deny that truths about the past require truth-makers. It’s another thing altogether to explain what we should say instead about truths about the past. And surely something must be said, if we hope to account for their truth. We can’t say, simply, that truths about the past require no truth-makers and then say nothing more about what they require. And while we might look to replace a truth-maker theory with something less ontologically committing, presentists haven’t been forthcoming with an account of how truths get to be true, if not by some kind of truth-making account.

6.3 The Truth-Making Relation isn’t Existence-Entailing

All of this leads us to the final option that we will consider here. Namely, that the truth-maker relation isn’t existence-entailing. This kind of approach, described elsewhere as “nefarious” (contrasted with the “upstanding” project of locating truth-makers), uses the language of truth-making without positing any truth-makers for truths about the past. In presenting the nefarious strategy, we can treat it as something like the union of two theses: (1) truths about the past are expressed using primitive (and unanalysable) tense operators; and, (2) the tense operators don’t pick out a distinctive ontological category or aspect of reality. This sort of nefarious approach has been pursued recently by Tallant (2009a), Sanson & Caplan (2010), and Baia (2012), amongst others. The labels (“nefarious” and “upstanding”) are due to a recent discussion by Tallant & Ingram (2015).

To clarify: nefarious “cheats” (like Tallant) will say “<It was the case that p> is true, because it was the case that p”. Here, the “was” is primitive and unanalysable. Notice, also, that those adopting this position will agree that this “was” doesn’t pick out any ontology; it doesn’t help us to speak of any distinctive metaphysical category. To that extent, those in this “nefarious” camp, will agree that there are truths about the past, and will agree that how the world was makes true how things are, but they deny that the ensuing truth-maker “relation” (such as it is) between the past and the present (i.e., the true propositions) is existence-entailing. For some, that might simply be considered treacherous. How might presentists motivate the nefarious position?

One key motivation involves a comparison with the “upstanding” approaches and the first problem we raised for them, viz. getting the “right results” (discussed above). To be clear, if we think that there are truth-makers, then we must ensure that the truth-making entities get things right. That is, if the world contained a green banana, then it had always better be true, any time after the fact, that a truth-maker exists for <There was a green banana> (rather than, say, a truth-maker for <There was a red banana>, in the case where the world never contained a red banana). But notice, then, that this seems to imply some kind of “fixing” relation; how the world was (containing a green banana, not containing a red banana) serves to “fix” what truth-makers exist now. Fixing is, plausibly, a relation. And, if x fixes y then, intuitively, both x and y must exist; both relata of the fixing relation should exist. But, clearly, on the presentist picture, that’s not acceptable. Past things don’t exist and, in that case, the required “fixing” is a relation that isn’t existence-entailing; it doesn’t require the existence of both relata. And, if that’s right, then presentists may as well “cut out the middleman” (so to speak) and simply treat the truth-making relation as “non-existence-entailing” and so avoid any ontological inflation. Presentists don’t require ontological commitment to ersatz times, Lucretian properties, etc., to serve as truth-makers for truths about the past. They can do without.

Is presentism out of the woods when it comes to the truth-maker objection? It’s far from clear. We may, for instance, retain the worry that a relation (any relation) must be existence-entailing and that what this shows is that we should give up on presentism (see, e.g., Baron 2013). And, even if we can solve the truth-maker objection, there’s a closely related concern that looks like it will raise further problems. (We discuss the related concern in what remains of this section.)

6.4 Truths about Spans of Time

It’s true that there have been seven English Kings called “Edward”. Is presentism compatible with that claim? How should we interpret the semantics? At no point in history were there all seven Kings; the Edwards weren’t contemporaneous. But, if the Edwards didn’t all exist together, then how can <There have been 7 English Kings called “Edward”> be true? Presentism faces a novel problem regarding truths about the past when such truths concern “spans” of time (see, e.g., Lewis 2004). After all, the natural reading is false: it was the case that “there are 7 English Kings called ‘Edward’”.

Two routes suggest themselves as plausible avenues to explore. The first is to try to make sense of talk of spans by using talk of individual times. Following the literature, call these “slice operators”. The idea, then, is that we say that

It WAS the case that [“<There is a King called Edward>, and it WAS the case that [<There is a King called Edward>, and….]]”

Somewhat loosely, we can describe this as analyzing the span in terms of the individual “slices” that would make it up, were such a thing as a “span” to exist.

There are many difficulties with this kind of approach. The most obvious challenge is that, in the above, the second iteration of our tense operator, “WAS” appears within the scope of the first. Thus, the attempted paraphrase of <There have been 7 English Kings called “Edward”> is a sentence of the form “there has been a king called ‘Edward’, and there had been a king called ‘Edward’…”. For one thing, however, suppose that there have been infinitely many entities in the past. Kings will not be a useful candidate here, so imagine instead that there have been infinitely many electrons. Hence, <There have been infinitely many electrons> is true. But this requires a construction with an infinite number of nested quantifiers and tense operators. This won’t do, for no such construction can be generated, despite the fact that we clearly can utter a sentence that expresses the relevant proposition, “there have been infinitely many electrons”.

Another important problem for the translation approach is that there seem to be cases in which the paraphrase is false and yet the paraphrased sentence is true. Consider a merely possible case in which some of the past Kings were instantaneous and simultaneous. (If this is too implausible in the case of Kings, given facts about royal succession, then swap the case for one involving fundamental physical particles which can be instantaneous and simultaneous.)

The second route sees us endorsing a primitive “span” operator, an operator that picks out temporal intervals rather than individual moments (cf. Lewis 2004: 12). Rather than try to analyze the span in terms of slices, this approach sees us just endorsing a span operator as a primitive piece of terminology. Berit Brogaard (2007) introduces this strategy very neatly, as follows:

Where the usual slice operators mean (as the eternalist would put it) “at some past (or future) moment”, a span operator means “at some past (or future) interval” ([Lewis] 2004: 12). Thus, where “it HAS been that” is the past-tense span operator, Lewis suggests that we translate “there have been two kings named Charles” as “it HAS been that (there are two kings named Charles)”. By eternalist lights, this means that “it is true of some interval in the past that there are two kings named Charles” ([Lewis] 2004: 12). The presentist, of course, cannot accept this translation, but must presumably treat span operators as primitives. (2007: 73)

There are also problems with this route. First, it seems that such span operators introduce ambiguities. Let’s introduce the span operator “HAS” as the operator “it has been the case that…” and consider a target sentence, “first it was raining and then the sun shone”. Then, suppose that we paraphrase this as: “HAS (it is raining and the sun is shining)”. This is problematically ambiguous. The paraphrase might mean that there has been an interval of time throughout which it has both been the case that the sun has shone and it has rained. Or, it might mean that there is an interval of time, throughout a sub-interval of which the sun shone and throughout another sub-interval of which it rained. Clearly, we want the latter; but with HAS, at least as stated, we have no means of differentiating the two. If the semantics of the span operator are ambiguous, then it doesn’t give us a sensible semantics for span-talk.

As should be clear, merely solving the truth-maker objection doesn’t automatically address this problem of spans. The truth-maker objection rests upon the fact that presentists apparently lack the ontological resources required to accommodate truth-making. The span objection rests upon the fact that, given presentism, it is far from clear how to provide an adequate regimentation of the semantics of ordinary language. Bringing together an adequate semantics as well as an adequate ontology is no easy task.

7. Temporal Passage

Next, we turn to an objection to presentism that concerns the idea that time really passes. The challenge, put simply, is presentism isn’t compatible with this feature of reality. This is a problem since presentism is a view that requires that reality is dynamic (i.e., not static) and that a change in what exists over time that’s usually described in terms of the passage of time. (For the purpose of this entry, we ignore general arguments to the conclusion that time doesn’t really pass and, instead, focus on specific challenges to presentism concerning passage.)

Why think that presentism isn’t compatible with temporal passage? Well, begin with the fact that, typically, the passage of time is expressed in the following terms: what’s future approaches the present, becoming less future, and what’s past recedes from the present, becoming more past. Prima facie, there’s a problem. What’s apparently required for the truth of this passage metaphor is inconsistent with presentism; the view that only present things exist. There’s nothing that is future and so nothing to approach the present. Nor is there anything that is past and so nothing to recede from the present. Hence, if we are to defend presentism then we have to suggest another way to interpret the claim that time really passes.

One way to reinterpret the claim is as follows: there’s change in what exists over time. Put another way: what’s present changes. But it’s unclear whether this solves the problem or shifts it down the road. What’s required in order to account for the claim that “what”s present changes’? One might reasonably suppose that in order to assert that what’s present changes, from one moment to the next, we require a difference in the character of successive moments. But there are no such successive moments, given presentism. There’s only the present moment and its contents.

In defense of presentism, we might insist that what exists now is sufficient to account for the difference in character of successive present moments. Some of the strategies used in reply to objections concerning cross-time relations and, in particular, the “truth-maker objection” (§§4–6) are useful here. Consider, for example, ersatz presentists who posit abstract times, that is, maximal consistent sets of tensed propositions that represent how things are, but also how things were and will be, when the time is present (when it’s “true”) (e.g., Markosian 2004; Bourne 2006; Crisp 2007). Ersatz presentism has the resources to assert that things really change (and so time really passes); there’s a difference between the character of successive moments, given the manifold of ersatz times. How things are, at the (concrete) present time, is different from how things were, as represented by an abstract time. Indeed, it seems that any version of presentism that posits presently existing entities to address worries about cross-time relations, for instance, as putative “ontological grounds” for truths about the past, can use such entities to establish that there’s a difference between successive moments without reifying any non-present things.

At this point, however, a new question arises. So understood, presentism is giving us the resources to ground time’s passing, at, and only at, the present time. That is, everything required to establish that things change from one moment to the next must be contained within a single moment, the present. But within such a version of presentism, what guarantees that things really change? Or, to approach the same point in a different way, what in the metaphysics guarantees that the present resources accurately reflect how things were—for example, why think that the ersatz manifold accurately represents the past—when there’s no connection to the past? Why can’t reality consist of a single “frozen” slice of concrete time, along with the various ersatz-times? If reality really is that way (what’s concrete never changes and we have nothing more than a frozen concrete instant against the backdrop of many ersatz times), then we still have no temporal passage. What the presentist must do is find some way of insisting that reality cannot be such; reality cannot include but a single concrete slice coupled to truth-makers for talk about the past and future, where those truthmakers cannot be said to guarantee that things really change (compare with the discussion of how truthmakers get the “right results” from §6).

8. Relativistic Physics

In preceding sections, we examined problems facing presentism that come from metaphysical quarters. In particular, we looked at a problem of “cross-temporal relations” (§4), and discussed two instances of that general problem, which pose special problems for presentism (§§5–6), before examining a related challenge concerning temporal passage. Now, though there are many worries for presentism that come from metaphysics, perhaps the most serious objection to presentism comes from physics. In particular, the special theory of relativity (“STR”) has been presented as in direct tension with presentism. [See the entry on being and becoming in modern physics.]

Simon Saunders (2002) gives us a clear picture of how things supposedly stand with respect to presentism and STR, as follows:

According to presentism, all that is physically real is the present—a system of physical events all of which are simultaneous with each other. No other events are real. Precisely what this system of events may be, now, as I snap my fingers, may not be known to me; but there is a fact of the matter as to what it is, and it is a universal fact which embraces us all. It is an intersubjective reality—now, as a snap my fingers—and it is a reality which contains us only as an incidental part. But even if one knew all that there is to know, consistent with special relativity, one would not be able to say what this system of events might be. According to presentism, therefore, special relativity is radically deficient as a description of reality. It is blind to the sequencing of what is physically real. (2002: 279–80)

A quick and dirty reply on behalf of presentism is to suggest that metaphysics and science are, in some sense, demarcated disciplines. That is, the findings of physics are of no relevance to our best metaphysics (and vice versa). But this doesn’t seem to be a move that we should make. Both metaphysician and physicist are, surely, trying to uncover the structure of the world and to theorize about the nature of reality (fundamental or otherwise). To ignore one another is no way for protagonists to carry on, when both aim at the same basic goal. Of course, this means that we must say something in reply to Saunders and others, who raise the same sort of objection, for example, Putnam (1967), Stein (1968, 1970), Savitt (1994, 2000), Sider (2001: 42–52), and Wüthrich (2013). But what can be said?

Katherine Hawley (2006) suggests two routes: “Undermining” or “Counterargument” (we introduce each in turn). Suppose that, as seems to be the case in the debate concerning STR, we want to argue that some metaphysics, posited by science, is false. That is, the science, as it’s traditionally interpreted, delivers the “wrong” metaphysics. There are options (though, as Hawley notes, it seems likely that any genuine attempt to respond to the objection from relativity may require a little of each). First, “Undermining”:

This is the attempt to show that the scientific metaphysics is not involved in generating novel prediction, and thus that its appearance in a scientific theory does not give us reason to think it true. (2006: 463)

As Hawley notes, there’s a second step to Undermining, since merely establishing that the metaphysics implied by the traditional interpretation of a scientific hypothesis isn’t essential to the scientific theory, doesn’t establish that the metaphysics with which we would seek to replace the scientific metaphysics is preferable. We need to do more than show that the metaphysics implied by traditional interpretation and the metaphysics that we prefer are on a par. We need to show that the “metaphysically-supported” metaphysics is on a stronger footing than the “scientifically-supported” metaphysics.

Undermining is a strategy that a number of metaphysicians have plausibly looked to deploy, arguing that there are empirically equivalent theories that differ with respect to metaphysical commitments, but yield the same predictions. For instance, see Craig (2001) and Markosian (2004); Zimmerman (2011) explores a range of options.

Consider a case: if a rod, R, is traveling in direction d and is observed by an observer, O, who is stationary with respect to R, then R will appear to be length l. If, however, O is in motion with respect to R, moving toward it, then the length of R will appear, to O, to be less than l. There are two competing explanations we might give, a standard “space-time” interpretation, as well as a “neo-Lorentzian” interpretation. As Balashov & Janssen (2003) have it:

…the space-time interpretation and the neo-Lorentzian interpretation provide constructive theory explanations. In the space-time interpretation, the model is Minkowski space-time and length contraction is explained by showing that two observers who are in relative motion to one another and therefore use different sets of space-time axes disagree about which cross section of the “world-tube” of a physical system give the length of the system. In the neo-Lorentzian interpretation, length contraction is explained by a combination of dynamical effects of measurement. (2003: 331)

Now, to endorse this “Undermining” approach, we would have to say that the neo-Lorentzian account is preferable to the space-time account. And, problematically, that looks to be false. The problem is as follows. There’s an explanatory advantage to treating length contraction as explained by geometric features of space-time, rather than by a dynamically occurring process. This, as we see below, will require us to postulate an unexplained brute fact as to why length contraction and time dilation appear in laws governing all matter. Since unexplained coincidences, or treating certain facts as “brute”, is suboptimal (particularly when, as Balashov & Janssen argue (2003: 341–2), the space-time interpretation offers a better explanation—one that does not treat Lorentz invariance as brute or mysterious), so we ought to deny the neo-Lorentzian interpretation of relativity.

Let’s try to get a better sense of this. What’s the brute fact required of us? And why should we worry about it? Why should we think that the neo-Lorentzian theory, which is acknowledged to be empirically equivalent to STR (Balashov & Janssen 2003: 23; Callender 2008: 52–53), offers an inferior explanation of both length contraction and time dilation than does STR? Janssen (2002) puts the point as follows:

For Einstein, the Lorentz-transformed quantities are the correctly measured real quantities. In the final version of Lorentz’s theory, measurements never reveal the real quantities because all measurements are made with devices that are systematically distorted and improperly synchronized as a result of their and the observer’s motion through the ether. (2002: 429)

Thus, where for Lorentz, “Lorentz-invariance” is a product of a law governing the dynamical behavior of entities in motion, for Einstein, Lorentz-invariance is simply a product of the geometry of space-time. As Balashov & Janssen go on to argue:

Compare the status of Lorentz invariance in the two interpretations. In the former, Lorentz invariance reflects the structure of space-time posited by the theory. In the latter, Lorentz invariance is a property accidentally shared by all laws effectively governing systems in Newtonian space and time…In the neo-Lorentzian interpretation it is, in the final analysis, an unexplained coincidence that the laws effectively governing different sorts of matter all share the property of Lorentz invariance. (2003: 341)

So, here’s the detail of the objection. Lorentz’s theory was born of Newtonian mechanics and Maxwellian electrodynamics (Janssen 2002: 423): the latter incorporated electric and magnetic fields, but made no pronouncements at all concerning other forms of matter. Thus, although we can extend the Lorentzian theory to all laws governing matter, we have no reason to do so. It just happens to turn out that the laws governing matter all instantiate this property. Craig Callender (2008) makes the point clearly, as follows:

The matter fields are Lorentz invariant but the space-time is not. For this reason, all else being equal, one ought to prefer the Einstein Minkowski interpretation to the Lorentz interpretation. Positing otherwise unnecessary unobservable structure—absolute simultaneity—does violence to Ockham’s razor. (2008: 53)

Callender goes on to point out that once we grant that the Lorentz interpretation is logically consistent and empirically adequate, the question becomes, “[w]hat are a few lost explanatory virtues in contrast to _______ (fill in the blank with whatever tenses explain)?” (2008: 53). After all, we have to posit an unobservable frame of reference and we don’t, typically, posit unobservables without good reason. At the moment, we lack good reason, unless we think that the motivations for presentism (e.g., those described in §2) serve to persuade us that a neo-Lorentzian interpretation of the physics of space-time is preferable to the space-time interpretation. Undermining thus looks to be a difficult road to plough.

The second option that Hawley (2006) describes, “Counterargument”, is as follows:

This alternative to Undermining accepts that the scientific metaphysics is genuinely confirmed by the role it plays in generating empirical success, but claims that independent reasons to believe the traditional metaphysics outweigh this scientific support. (2006: 464)

Counterargument is bold in the extreme. It seems to require that we simply overturn the best physics on the basis of metaphysical arguments. Perhaps we could take this line (but it seems a very challenging route. The arguments for presentism (those stated in §2, for instance) look somewhat underpowered when it comes to delivering that result. The way in which counterarguers have typically tried to proceed, then, is by giving independent motivations for rejecting the special theory of relativity (both Crisp 2008 and Monton 2006 may be read as doing this). Nonetheless, the orthodoxy remains strongly opposed to this kind of approach.

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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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David Ingram <david.ingram@york.ac.uk>
Jonathan Tallant <Jonathan.tallant@nottingham.ac.uk>

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