Henry Habberley Price

First published Sat Nov 4, 2023

Henry Habberley Price, who published as H. H. Price, was born in 1899. From 1935 to 1959 he was Wykeham Professor of Logic at Oxford University. Price was a major figure in his lifetime well-known especially for the “clarity and elegance of style”, which, according to Martha Kneale (1996: xix), make his works readable in spite of changing fashions in philosophy. Many people’s acquaintance nowadays with Price’s philosophical work derives from his being a target in Austin’s (1962) famous attack on the sense-datum theory. This restricted acquaintance with his output is one reason that Price has been ignored in recent philosophy.

Mainstream philosophy neglected him after the Second World War, perhaps partly because, when articulating his ideas, he mainly engaged with philosophers of the past, such as Locke and Hume. His thought was, however, valued by fellow philosophers such as Broad, Moore, Ayer, and generations of his students at Oxford, including Sellars, Armstrong, and Anscombe.

Although Price is seen mainly as a philosopher of perception, only two of his six books are about perception and he had a major influence, also publishing many articles, on a variety of topics, including some we cannot focus on here, e.g., our evidence of other minds (1938; 1930b: 195) and psychical research (1940c; 1953b; 1972; 1995; an interest he claims to share with Neo-Platonists [1968a: 447]). We can only provide a sketch of his rich contributions. After briefly sketching his life (§1), we discuss his philosophy’s general features (§2), contributions to the studies of perception (§3), properties (§5.1), recognition (§5), belief (§6), religious belief (§6.8), his revival and serious study of Hume (§4), and some remarkable anticipations (§7).

1. Life

Price was born on 17 May 1899 and died on 26 November 1984. He was born in Neath, a small, then industrial town in South Wales, and educated at the famous public school Winchester College, whose students are called Wykehamists. He studied Literae Humaniores (“Greats”, covering Ancient History, Ancient Literature, and Philosophy) at New College, Oxford, where the cleverest Wykehamists go, both colleges being founded by William of Wykeham in the fourteenth century. He had the perfect Wykehamist career: being Wykeham Professor of Logic from the remarkably young age of 35 in 1935 until his retirement in 1959 (Harrison 1993: 479). He had a very distinguished academic career (Quinton 1995a: 676; 1995b: 252), receiving many honours and prestigious invitations and was known as an excellent philosophy lecturer (Mitchell 2009: 45–46). He was a constructive philosopher, attempting constantly to develop approaches and not satisfied with the demolition of extant views. Famously, Price is credited with punching a hole in the isolation of Oxford philosophy in the inter-war period by discussing philosophy with Moore and Broad in Cambridge, especially on perception, and importing the new approach to philosophy developed there with, in Quinton’s (1995a: 675) words, “style, rigour, and authority” (see also 1995c: 708; Mabbott 1986: 78). He was extremely polite, usually trying to formulate the views of other philosophers and students, especially if he disagreed with them, in the best way possible (Price [1945: 2] discusses this in his balanced response to critics of clarificatory philosophy). For example, he finds some merit in the traditional imagistic model of thought (1951–1952; 1969). His impact on students was significant. Anscombe recalls, “of all the people I heard at Oxford, he was the one who excited my respect; the one I found worth listening to” (1981: viii; Mac Cumhaill & Wiseman 2022: 76f). He supervised several philosophers who went on to have distinguished careers themselves, including Wilfrid Sellars (for some reflections, see Sellars 1975: 285) and D.M. Armstrong.

2. Four General Features

There are at least four general features of Price’s approach to philosophy.

2.1 Following the Evidence of Experience

First, with any issue he simply aims to follow the evidence, wherever it leads. Thus, if the clear evidence is that there are sense-data with a certain character, then that must be accepted and incorporated into one’s theory of the world. And if the character of your experiences means that you cannot be a body then that must also be accepted. He arrives with few metaphysical prejudices.

However, Price’s understanding of evidence is revealing. For instance, his novel arguments against both materialism and Cartesian forms of dualism come down to their conflict with evidence “discovered by straightforward empirical methods” (1953b: 45), for such phenomena as unconscious processes, those he calls “supernormal cognition” (such as telepathy), and the divided self (especially 1953b: 43–47) (for discussion: Dilley 1995: xviif; Martin 2000: 222).

Also, the evidence relevant to philosophical questions goes beyond what the sciences tell us: Price famously claims (1953a: 2ff), employing a pattern of argument that he repeatedly uses (more examples below, e.g., §2.3), that, since our scientific beliefs depend on the beliefs that our experiences give us, the scientific picture of the world cannot undermine those basic beliefs, because unless we can rely on those basic beliefs we cannot rely on the science constructed on their basis (see also 1930a: 34–35). An important theme is to examine the experiences upon which our beliefs are based and to inquire into the ways they justify our beliefs. Evidence from experience is more important and basic for Price than scientific evidence.

Quinton (1973: 195) attributes Price’s argument’s influence as the source of the discredit of “scientifically-based reasoning” about perception, at least until Smart, Armstrong, and Pitcher reanimated such arguments in the 1960s (for discussion: Bradie 1976: 42ff). Price declares, from our perspective somewhat oddly, that the investigation into perception is not a question for science: science does not tell us what seeing and touching are, but merely what their causes are (1932: 2). Price contrasts physiological investigations, that is to say science, and “immanent or phenomenological” ones, which is to say philosophy (1932: 10; for discussion: Hamlyn 1961: 173, 178). Thus, philosophy uniquely contributes to knowledge and evidence via his type of phenomenological investigations; it is no mere handmaiden to science. He also articulates another role for philosophy independent of “the progress of empirical research”, where “great problems”, “puzzles”, are

dissolved, rather than solved, by dragging to light ambiguities, confusions, and unconscious preconceptions […and] by inventing a more flexible and less equivocal terminology. (1940b: 36; see also 1945: 4)

2.2 Empiricism

He does, however, reiterate a commitment to empiricism, arguing that it is “beneficial to mankind” and a “social phenomenon of great importance” (1940b: 8–9). By “empiricism”, he seems to mean two things:

First, if we understand a notion (or concept) then we should be able to recognise when it applies should the right experiences present themselves. Price (1953a: especially 78, 117, 136, 231, 260, 270, 355–358) extensively defends his view that understanding, concepts, and ideas themselves are recognitional capacities of “conscious creature[s], human or animal” (1959c: 483; for discussion: Burgener 1957: 157; Warnock [1995: 756] emphasises its centrality for Price). Price links this to the much-discussed slogan, which he accepts, that to understand a claim is to know what would be the case if it is true (1953a: 208–209; 1938: 442). A key contribution of his is that he thinks that this kind of knowledge incorporates a recognitional capacity.

But second, the test for a theory or conviction lies ultimately in how it engages with experience. Regarding religious belief, he recommends that you should try it out and see how the experience of doing so strikes you (1964c: 25–25; 1969: 455–488; see §6.8). He sums up the empiricist programme which he endorses thus:

to show that all ideas are ultimately cashable by impressions, that is by data which we are acquainted with in sense or introspection, or in any other sort of acquaintance there may be [such as, controversially, “mystical experience”]. (1940b: 11–12)

He also writes:

An empiricist is a man who says “it all comes down to ostensive definition in the end.” (1959c: 483)

Also, Hume and Locke are his two main philosophical heroes; see Kneale 1996: xix. In 1959 (1959c: 481), Price writes “I am really just an old-fashioned British empiricist” (agreeing with Burgener 1957), and “[Thinking and Experience, 1953a] protests against the transformation of the empiricist epistemology into a linguistic epistemology”.

2.3 Commonsense

Third, Price defends the authority of commonsense as “the starting-point of all philosophy” (1930b: 202), extending Moore’s (1925) defence (see 1930b: 198f), generally using it as a methodological touchstone. He frequently objects to criticism of common thinking from science: because science relies on ordinary thinking and experience, such criticisms undermine themselves (e.g., 1930b: 198; 1932: chapter 2). He also identifies this “fallacy” in anti-commonsense, genetic debunking arguments and Bergsonian arguments that commonsense is practically biased (1930a: 34–35). Furthermore, Price tends to say that our cognitive practices and nature simply have to be accepted for what they are. Of paramount importance is the existence of what he calls the “inner life”, involving toothaches, dreams, and mental images (1959c: 481–482; 1964c: 7; 1969: 295; he cites this as one of Wittgenstein’s 1953 main themes, too; see also Kneale 1994: xvii). According to him, the contemporary attack on the “inner life” has “gone a long way towards a kind of “dehumanisation” of man” (1959c: 482).

Finally, commonsense guides which topics he focuses on. For instance, his famous discussion of the metaphysics of properties focuses on Aristotelian universals in things (in rebus) rather than Platonic universals anterior to things (ante rem) not because he thinks the latter is unimportant but because “it is more remote from common sense and our ordinary everyday habits of thought” (1953a: 10; this responds to Findlay’s 1954: 71 criticism).

2.4 Metaphysical Neutrality

Fourth, despite his major contributions to metaphysics, Price often maintains metaphysical neutrality. For instance, he provides the most worked-out and discussed account of resemblance nominalism in the literature (1953a: chapter 1), but ultimately stays neutral about whether realism about (Aristotelian) universals (1953a: 10–14) is true. §5.1 discusses this extensively. He is also metaphysically neutral about the nature of sense-data. Generally, his metaphysical neutralism takes this form: First, he finds that the empirical evidence points us to the existence of such things as sense-data, mental phenomena (including psychical phenomena), concepts, dispositions to recognise concepts, etc. However, second, the empirical evidence does not adjudicate between whether sense-data are physical, mental, or neither, or whether our recognitional dispositions track resemblances or universals, etc. So, he neither affirms nor denies any of these metaphysical accounts.

Also, Price (1940a) articulates two forms of Neo-Humeanism about external objects which are essentially neutralist; see §§4.3–4.4 below.

To be clear: he is no across-the-board metaphysical neutralist. For instance, unlike his positivist colleagues (e.g., Ayer), he doesn’t think that metaphysics is nonsense. He is very critical of declarations of nonsense (1939 [1995: 26]; 1945: 30–31). He defends positive ontological and metaphysical positions, e.g., the ontological reality of sense-data and of dispositions, when his evidence allows him to. But when his evidence is inconclusive, he stays neutral.

When defending sense-data, Price (1932: 19–20) stresses what he calls the neutrality of the admissions of sense-data in his sense. There is no immediate commitment to their persistence conditions, their privacy or publicity, the kind of entity they are, nor to their origins: the nature of sense-data is not given to us. Understanding them for instance as “sensible species” (some Scholastics), “impressions” (Hume), or “sensa” (Broad) begs the question, for they bring in the assumption that their nature is physical, mental, or neither, respectively (see also Murray 1933: 507f). Thus, he characteristically neither accepts nor denies any of these further metaphysical assumptions: they go beyond what he takes to be the evidence. Price (1927: 110) also compares not being immediately aware of the nature of sense-data with not being immediately aware of physical objects. This neutrality-until-further-examination regarding “sense-data” in effect places Price close to Moore’s (1903; 1957[1965]) way of introducing sense-data (see also Lean 1953: 2–3; Bauer 1967: 8–9; Crane 2000: 175–177). In summary, Price puts it thus:

So far as the main theme of this book goes, it really does not matter how we answer them [… i.e. the questions about] the nature of sense-data. (1932: 104)

Despite this metaphysical neutrality about the nature of sense-data, he is not ontologically neutral. He argues that sense-data are what are given to us and what are sensed in perceptual experiences, which we obviously have: we simply have to accept their existence. And, they have whatever nature they must have to play the role in experience that they do, a role that allows them (a) to be related to the material things which we suppose are in the world, and (b) to enable our consciousness of those material things.

However, even his metaphysical neutrality is not complete: it does not extend to denying metaphysical features that are phenomenogically given (recall §2.1); for instance, it is to misunderstand visual sense-data to take them to be two-dimensional: “It is a plain phenomenological fact that visual fields have the property of depth” (1954a: vii–viii; for discussion: Jackson 1977: 102; Crane 1992a: 15; Baldwin 1992: 183–184; Martin 1992: 198). Price’s metaphysical neutralism, however, doesn’t underplay metaphysical speculation’s importance for philosophy and science: he writes,

If people accuse us of being speculative and even “metaphysical” we must refuse to be frightened. We must postulate unverifiable entities and processes if we cannot get on without them. The task of philosophical deflation, of removing unnecessary metaphysical entities, comes at the end of a science’s progress, not at the beginning; if such writers as Hume and Mach and the modern Logical Positivists had lived in the early seventeenth century, Physics would never have got itself started. (1939 [1995: 26])

3. Perception

Price’s fame rests most on his views on perception, expressed in his first book Perception (1932) and many articles (1924; 1926a; 1926b; 1927; 1928; 1941; 1943–1944; 1951; 1952a; 1952b; 1956; 1959a; 1959b; 1960; 1964a). In his most cited passage, he writes, “when I see a tomato there is much that I can doubt. … but that something is red and round then and there I cannot doubt” (1932: 3; Robinson 1994: 32 calls this an expression of the “Phenomenal Principle”; see also Martin’s (2000: 218ff) “Actualism”; for discussion: Crane 2000: 176–177; Raleigh 2009: 64–65; Fish 2010: 5; O’Shea 2007: 109–110; Johnston 2018: 175f; Locatelli 2014: 147f). I cannot, according to Price, doubt that there is present to my consciousness at that time a genuinely red thing with a certain shape; it is just obvious and “quite plain that I am acquainted with an actual instance of [here: redness]” (1932: 63; for discussion: Snowdon 1992: 73). This thing is (directly) sensed by me, given to me, and he calls it a sense-datum (this is called the “sense-datum inference” by Chisholm 1963: 102; O’Shea 2007: 141 argues that Price along with Russell relies on an “act/object” model of sensory cognition here; however, see Price 1969: 363–365 on the act-object distinction).

Price claims immediately that our core beliefs about the world depend on our visual and tactual experiences which have the just-characterised structure. However, he is at pains to say both (i) what he does not take to be indubitable (1932: 3–4; 1924: 20–24) and (ii) that “our data, the undeniable facts with which he must begin, are never mere sense-data” (1924: 24), for they also involve non-sensuous data. He has sometimes been credited with the view that our knowledge of sense-data and their features is indubitable—for instance, Grossmann (1990: 113–114) criticises Price here by arguing that we can indeed be mistaken about the properties of our impressions, something revealed by closer inspection. However, Price insists (e.g., 1924: 21) that one may make “mistakes of detail”, e.g., whether a sense-datum is uniformly one shade of red, but one cannot mistake a colour for a sound or a smell.

The famous tomato-passage’s crucial move is that at least some of the genuine properties the given item has are obvious to us. This allows us to fix further properties of the sense-data in light of what we can determine about the external world.

Price (1932: ch. 2) identifies two theoretical goals for sense-data theories. It is clear that for a subject to have the complex beliefs about the material world that we have, the subject must do more than simply sense or be acquainted with sense-data. Further mental processes which he calls “perceptual consciousness” (1932: 25) are required. One task is to describe fully what the components of perceptual consciousness are; another is to say what it is for a sense-datum to “belong to” a material object, “belonging to” being what Price, following Moore (Price 1932: vi), calls the relation between a material object and a sense-datum when sensing that sense-datum counts as perceiving that material object.

3.1 Criticisms of Theories of Sense-Data: Naïve Realism

Price defines and criticises a theory he calls “Naïve Realism”, so-called because it is a “natural” place to start, not because this is what naïve or ordinary people think (1932: 26). This Naïve Realism has two sides: First, perceptual consciousness, in Price’s sense, is equivalent to knowledge that there is a material object to which the current sense-datum belongs. Second, for a sense-datum (which is visual or tactual) to belong to an object is for it to be part of the surface of the object. (The centrality in this debate of the notion of a surface comes from Moore’s discussion, e.g., 1942: 649–659.)

Price proposes two versions of what he calls the Argument from Illusion (1932: 27): one Phenomenological and the other, Causal. The first is Price’s version of the traditional argument, based on its familiar examples of illusion. The second is an argument aiming to show that visual and tactual sense-data exist only if there are processes occurring in the subject (say, neural processes), which means that, since the surfaces themselves (and the objects to which they belong) exist, whatever is going on in the subject, they cannot be the same thing as the sense-datum. He proposes that the causal argument is unpersuasive, but the phenomenological one works. (For further discussion: 1956; also Hamlyn 1970: 147ff; Crane 2005: §1.2.)

3.2 Austin on Price: seeing versus what one can doubt & the Theory of Appearing

In his famous book Sense and Sensibilia (1962), Austin focuses on Price’s argument for sense-data almost exclusively as presented in (1932: chs. 1–2), though this discussion plays only a minor role next to Ayer, the book’s real anti-hero (Snowdon 2014: 167 queries Austin’s motivations here; Rowe 2023: ch. 25). Although the current consensus seems to be that Austin’s criticisms of Price were successful (e.g., Hamlyn 1970: 148; though, e.g., Harris 1987: 70 remarks that Austin misrepresents Price and Ayer), this is not true when Austin shifts his focus to perceptual knowledge.

Austin says:

Price is more seriously interested than is Ayer in the actual facts about perception, and pays more attention to them—but still, it is worth noticing that, after raising the initial question, “What is it to see something?”, his very next sentence runs, “When I see a tomato there is much that I can doubt”. This suggests that he too is really interested, not so much in what seeing is, as in what one can’t doubt. (1962: 104–5)

Austin overlooks Price’s most important point here, which is that he is certain that what is given to him is something red, that is, something with that property. Price’s interest here is what the real character of the component of experience is, and his remark does not reveal his more general interest in doubt and certainty. Price needs some genuine feature so that in the light of what he can also know about the surrounding objects he can argue that the given items are not surfaces of external things. The main problem with Price’s claim is that he has no good response to the counter-proposal that all he can really be certain of is that the presented thing looks red. Despite talking about what he can doubt, Price’s main concern is what seeing involves.

He does elsewhere respond to what he calls the Theory of Appearing (1932: 61–65; for discussion: Langsam 1997: 36; Murray 1933: 508–513), which he takes to be a modification of naïve realism, and which in effect says that when we see the tomato it is not certain that there is a red thing, but it is merely certain that there appears to be a red thing. Clearly, this suggestion undermines the central argument from illusion, since the external object can also count as appearing to be red; so no non-identity claim can be generated (1932: 62).

Price’s main response is that either “X looks red” means “X presents a red sense-datum” in which case there is a red sense-datum (1932: 63; 1964a: 15ff), or, “derivatively” (1964a: 15), it means something like “I am inclined to think that X is red” or “there is some probability (though not certainty) that X is red” or is used to avoid being accused of being mistaken if X isn’t red, in which cases it does not capture an experiential fact (1932: 62–65; 1964a: 12–15). The obvious problem with this objection is why those are the only alternative ways to understand looks judgements. However, see 1952a: passim, where he discusses appearing further, Quinton’s (1952: 238–246) detailed criticisms, and Grossmann’s (1965: 35–38) sympathetic use of Price’s response.

3.3 Criticisms of the Causal Theory

Price (1932: ch. 4) scrutinises the so-called Causal theory which he thinks of as more or less equivalent to traditional representationalism. Price’s initial statement of the theory is:

a sense-datum belongs to an object O if O causes that sense-datum, and
perceptual consciousness is, fundamentally, an inference from effect to cause.

To make (2) consistent with our sense that in ordinary circumstances we do not arrive at our convictions about the environment by inference, Price reads it as claiming that originally we form our convictions by such causal inferences, but after that, dispositions are generated which make the process automatic (1932: 68f). Price (1932: 70f) also proposes that (1) be replaced by the more complex analysis of “belonging” by being a “varying or differential” causal condition, meaning that a perceiver’s visual sense-data would be different if these causal conditions were different, in contrast to their standing causal conditions (e.g., there being a source of light and an eye in a certain state) which are perhaps “necessary to all the visual sense-data alike, [but] do not wholly determine any of them” (1932: 70f; for discussion: Jackson 1977: 168). Famously, Grice (1961: 142ff) criticises the more complex analysis, requiring instead that the perceived object contributes to the occurrence of the sense-datum (1961: 143; see also Kim 1977: 612; Sosa 2015: 11–13).

Price himself moves quickly from (1) and concentrates on the revised version of (2). He allows that it is reasonable to infer that there are unsensed causes of our sense-data (1932: 70–74), but what is the character of those causes? Can a backward causal argument reveal that? In answer, Price formulates five methods of argument that can be developed. In outline, the methods isolate types of independence in features of the given to ground inferences about the degrees of independence in their postulated causes. Price’s critical response is to suggest that the most such backward arguments can establish is the existence of “Non-sensible” (1932: 74) somethings-or-other with a plurality of aspects.

3.4 Perceptual Consciousness: Perceptual Acceptance

Price (1932: ch. 6) discusses what he calls “perceptual consciousness”, that is, what the perceiver takes to be there. His example is when a perceiver takes in that there is a tree in front of them. Price’s method is to describe as accurately as he can the component in perception that he calls perceptual acceptance. His project is a phenomenological analysis (Passmore [1957: 255] ties Price’s work with Husserl’s). Acceptance does not count as knowledge, since it can be present when the percipient is mistaken, as when a drunk hallucinates a large pink rabbit that frightens him. It isn’t belief either but perhaps the “absence of disbelief” (1932: 142), since, according to him (following Cook Wilson; for discussion: Passmore 1957: 254–255), beliefs are a state of mind which must be arrived at by inference from evidence that the subject recognises is less than conclusive. Price says that there is no inference or weighing of evidence in basic perceptual consciousness. Both these claims, that it cannot be knowledge or belief, rest on questionable assumptions.

O’Shea (2007: 210) takes Price to be relating “(non-propositional) sensing and (propositional) perceiving” here. Martin (2000: 210) claims that Price’s perceptual acceptance is what he calls “the intentionality of perceptual experience” and takes Price explicitly to consider it a “belief-like state of mind”. Butchvarov (1979: 93) calls Price’s perceptual consciousness, “singling out in perception of a material thing, which may but need not exist”.

Price’s analysis attempts to capture the nature of very basic perceptual acceptance: as subjects’ experiences grow this sets up in the subjects dispositions for the sensing of a certain type of sense-datum to produce acceptance of much more complex claims as to what is there. These dispositions represent part of the subject learning about the world. Price is claiming that these are simply acceptances with richer content.

Price argues that acceptance is not the generation of a bodily disposition relating to the environment, for it is also related to an ability to report what is there, not simply to adopt a behavioural response—nor is it reducible to an emotional response (1932: 156ff). Rather, acceptance is a basic attitude, involving concepts, which our psychological nature endows us with (1932: 168f). His work on perception doesn’t explain what it is for these states to involve concepts, nor what this explains: we are simply set up to form attitudes when undergoing sensings of sense-data, though he holds that the most basic concepts involved in acceptance are innate and not derived from experience. However, later (1953a), he develops a theory of concepts as recognitional capacities, which suggests that perceptual acceptance involves a recognitional capacity developed by perceiving and derived from experience.

3.5 Less Basic Forms of Perceptual Consciousness & the Principle of Confirmability

Price (1932: ch. 7) discusses less basic forms of perceptual consciousness, roughly, ones which occur after more worldly experiences. Consider a subject who has looked around a tree sensing a sequence of sense-data. In these circumstances the subject has what Price calls a settled conviction about the existence and character of the tree. This is not mere acceptance but a new attitude which has survived challenges and counts as rational belief, passing Cook Wilson’s conditions that Price relied on when arguing that the initial cases are not cases of belief. Then he asks: How can simple sensings of sense-data validate this new attitude? His response: gathering the relevant experiences simply does count as a rational confirmation of the claims in question. This yields Price’s Principle of Confirmability:

Clearly we shall have to say that the existence of a particular visual or tactual sense-datum is prima facie evidence (1) for the existence of a material thing such that this sense-datum belongs to it, (2) for the possession by this thing of a front surface of a certain general sort. (1932: 185)

To Price, this principle is evident, not derivable from anything more basic, but equally not refutable by any considerations (for discussion: Lemos 2004: 136–137). Crucially, although our experiences confirm the claims about the material objects around us, they don’t yield knowledge that there are material objects: the confirmation doesn’t amount to absolute certainty. However, we do have knowledge that these experiences are confirmatory ones. We cannot ask for more than that.

3.6 Price’s Theory of Sense-Data & their Relations

Price (1932: ch. 8) analyses “belonging to”, the phrase he uses for the relation between a sense-datum s which is sensed and an object M where sensing s amounts to perceiving M. Here and now you are seeing a screen and you are sensing a sense-datum which therefore “belongs to” the screen. He seems initially to want an analysis of what is involved in a sense-datum (the sensed one) being a member of a group of sense-data which has a relation to M. We are to envisage, say, walking towards a table and what the evolving sequence of sense-data would be. Very roughly, there would be what Price calls a gradual transformation in the successive sense-data “in respect of colour, shape, size, and position in the field of view” (1932: 208). His central insight is that, as we might put it, moving towards and around the object M, certain groups of sense-data constitute a three-dimensional solid shape (1932: 217–229).

But how are material things that occupy the spatial world related to this system of families of sense-data (1932: ch. 9)? First, Price rejects phenomenalism, which identifies material things with these families (1932: 275–282). His basic objection is that material things occupy space and are present, often doing things, such as reflecting light or deflecting air, etc. But according to phenomenalism, all the presence of the family comes down to is that sense-data would be sensed if things were different. Clearly this sort of fact cannot itself deflect light rays. Price, therefore, has to recognise “two distinct” entities (1932: 293). There is the “family” of actual and obtainable sense-data and the physical object. Price claims that we are ignorant of the intrinsic nature of the physical objects themselves and have to conceptualise them as bearers of causal powers (1932: 294–300; also 1927: 110). A table, for instance, is a “family [viz. of sensibilia] together with the physical object which is coincident with it” (1932: 301). His analysis of when a sense-datum s belongs to an external object M is this:

s is a member of a family of sense-data F,
there is a physical occupant O with which F is coincident,
M consists of F and O in conjunction.

It is unclear exactly what “coincidence” strictly means. For instance, O and F, according to Price (1932: 252), cannot have the same position in space for the sense in which F has a position in space is radically different from the sense in which O does.

Finally, when considering the causal origins of sense-data, Price contrasts (i) “vertical” causation, the causal process of sense-data genesis, with (ii) “horizontal” causation, other causal interactions between things in the world. Price claims that our basic knowledge of objects does not depend on or presuppose our belief in vertical causation. Rather, we attain knowledge of vertical causation from already established knowledge of objects (1932: 311–313 sketches this knowledge-acquisition). He considers this an objection to the causal theory of perception. But it is so only if that theory is defined as requiring that our basic, worldly knowledge is based on causal reasoning, which need not be coupled with a causal model of perception.

Price also argues that phenomenalism cannot accommodate real vertical causation by physical objects as they understand them. Idealists and phenomenalists, however, would generally agree and look for other explanations of experience (e.g., God). The real causal generators in the external world are, Price argues, not the complex two-component things, which he previously (1932: ch. 8) claimed corresponded to our conception of material things, but, rather, are the real physical occupants with their causal powers. He writes: “sense-data are causally dependent on the states and the changes of physical occupants” (1932: 319). Price avoids confronting the natural question as to where this leaves the idea that material things cannot be identified with the physical occupants, since, it now seems, everything that an external thing does will be done by the physical occupant.

Price ends up with a form of dualism, with physical occupants and things of another sort which house sense-data occurrences, whose nature is radically under-described. For he claims that the events which are the occurrences of sense-data cannot themselves be events in the physical occupants. So, strikingly, he defends a conception of objects as two-sided compounds of a physical occupant of space with causal properties and a family of sensibilia.

3.7 Possible Criticisms: Sellars against the Given

Many under the influence of Sellars might object to Price’s notion of the given. Price belongs with the group of British philosophers whom Sellars (1956 [1997]) discusses, along with Ayer, Ryle, and earlier Empiricists. But Sellars, who was a pupil of Price (see, e.g., Crane 2013: 246; deVries 2005: 4–5; Triplett 2023: 1), doesn’t single out Price for criticism, instead positively appealing to Price in other contexts (e.g., Price’s [1953a: 73] understanding of abstract thinking, “thinking in absence” [1956 [1997: 65]], and Price [1953a: 185–187] on the “thermometer view” [1956 [1997: 66]]). Overall, Sellars doesn’t clearly oppose Price’s notion of the given. Most recently, Triplett (2023: 6) argues that (a) Sellars’ argument doesn’t touch Price’s sense-datum theory, as Sellars relies on understanding sensing as entailing propositional knowledge; (b), nor does Hicks’s (2020: 12) reconstruction of Sellars’ argument, according to which sensing requires conceptualisation, since Price explicitly understands sensing as a direct acquaintance with sense-data. See also Triplett 2014; Crane 2013: 229, 246; O’Shea (2007: 109–111, 112–113) argues that Price (1932: 7) anticipates Sellars’s objections against the given.

His (1969: 50–71) later developments of knowledge-by-acquaintance take it to be knowledge of items, say a place, a person, or something abstract like a poem, which we ascribe in the form “S knows X” (1969: 47–63). Such knowledge requires two things (1969: 55):

  1. the subject has encountered the item X (“first-handedness”), and
  2. the subject has familiarised themselves through their encounters with X (familiarity).

Price then argues that we are not acquainted with sense-data or experiences (1969: 57–60), because, being so fleeting, subjects cannot familiarise themselves with them (1969: 58f). Whether this undermines the support for Price’s being a target of Sellars’ (1956 [1997]) criticism is debatable. What are basic and given (though after 1960 he no longer uses these words) are ordinary persisting objects and their properties, known through acquaintance, that is, in a first-hand, familiarised way. (In 1932: 63, however, he follows other sense-data theorists in rejecting this: “I am not acquainted with an actual instance of tableness”, thus not with actual tables; see also 1927: 110). This acquaintance is more fundamental than knowledge from sense-data and grounds knowledge-by-description, on pain of the latter “not deserv[ing] the name of knowledge, not even of reasonable belief … [and] hav[ing] no relation to reality” (1969: 68; Price [1936: passim] similarly attacks the coherence theory of truth; for discussion: Kneale 1996: vi; Robinson 1972: passim criticises Price’s notion of corrigibility).

Price’s (1932) assumptions about the given and the analysis of sense-data he derives from them are now controversial. Much of Price’s discussion of sense-data amounts to speculation about how we develop our understanding of the world and its contents, where the real check on that speculation, pace his attitude towards appeals to science (1932: 2; §2.1 above), comes from developmental psychology and its empirical study of the emergence of our world-directed thoughts.

Price (1964a) is often ignored and indirectly addresses some of Austin’s (1962) criticisms. Price (1952a) extensively discusses seeming; for discussion: Quinton (1952). Other discussions of Price on perception include Murray 1933 and Bauer 1967.

4. Building on Hume

Another major contribution is Price’s close, sympathetic engagement with David Hume’s theoretical philosophy, especially on our belief in the external world (1940a) as presented in (Hume 1739–1740: I, iv, 2 “Of Scepticism with regard to the Senses”), which Price calls “the most brilliant thing [Hume] ever wrote” (1940b: 16), necessary connections and induction (1940b: 16ff), Hume’s empiricism and its significance (1940b), his analysis of belief (1969: ch. 7), and comparisons between Hume’s and Buddhist no-substance views of the self (1953b: 30; 1959c: 485). Price states (1940a: 2–3) that he’ll treat Hume as he would a contemporary, though he discusses him more than he does anyone else.

4.1 Two Similarities and a Difference with Hume

Price shares Hume’s conception of two things. First, both hold that (a) experience presents us, or acquaints us, with perceptions, impressions, or sensibilia (ignoring Hume’s scepticism about the self); and (b) our belief in an external world amounts to regarding those presented sensibilia as the real external objects or as constituents of external objects. In effect, both reject an understanding of our belief in an external world as a belief in objects as causes of our perceptions, as lying behind them and not part of the world of experience. That is, they both reject the two-world model with a world of presented experience and another world of spatial external objects. However, recall, Price accepts that there are physical occupants distinct from sense-data or families of them which vertically cause our sense-data. Price gives no hint at how (i) his own earlier positive, sense-data theory of perception relates to (ii) his engagement with Hume’s theory (though Church [1943: 317–318] and Laing [1941: 317] make comparisons).

Their biggest difference concerns the “vulgar” belief that presented sense-data are persisting, external spatial objects. Hume’s whole theory can be described as an error theory. Price rejects Hume’s arguments for this (e.g., §4.3 below). The two resemblances, this difference, and his real admiration for Hume guide Price’s discussion.

4.2 Hume on Belief about the External World

Officially, Hume’s (1739–1740: I, iv, 2) question is “What causes induce us to believe in the existence of bodies?”. Price suggests that Hume should have asked another question:

The question which he actually tries to answer … would come to something like this: given what characteristics of sense-impressions do we assert material-object propositions?

About this question Price says:

Now this is not a psychological question at all, nor is it a causal question. It belongs to the inquiry which is now called “philosophical analysis”. It is a question about the meaning of material-object words and material-object sentences, and about the rules of their use. (1940a: 15)

In understanding Hume’s question thus, Price situates Hume’s philosophical discussion in debates about the possibility of reducing talk about material objects to talk about sense-impressions (or sense-data). As we saw, Price himself notably contributed to this debate. However, reading Hume this way more or less guarantees that there can be no error of the sort Hume seems to allege, since the experiences in response to which we make our judgements are being built into the analysis of their meaning.

Price credits Hume for asking: Why doesn’t

the interrupted and fragmentary character of human sense-experience … every drowsy nod … shake the opinion of us all that matter has a continued existence? (1940a: 20)

Price agrees with Hume that our perceptions are “interrupted”, but clarifies this as a discontinuity in their character, and not that they are strictly interrupted, except by periods of sleep or unconsciousness. Price further agrees, with reservations (1940a: 22–31), that this is not the result of our impressions, given their silence about what is there in unsensed periods, nor of reasons. Hume’s explanation is that the belief results from our imagination in conjunction with the character of our sense-impressions. Hume characterises the important aspects of our impressions as constancy and coherence, which Price discusses in detail (1940a: chapter 3; see Penelhum 1975: 67ff). Price argues, initially, that Hume’s conception of the notion of identity, which is central to his discussion, is fundamentally confused. The construction that Hume is meant to describe is the postulation of a sequence of unsensed sensibile forming a series with the sensed ones. In developing this, Price initially goes along with the contrast between coherence and constancy. The cases that Hume envisages when talking about constancy are based on what Price calls “gap-indifference” (1940a: 60–62). A schematic representation of this is the sequence in a subject’s experience of the following sort: A1, A2, … (gap) … A5, A6, where A stands for the same type of experience. For example, the subject looks at a clock for two seconds, looks away, and then looks again at the same clock. Price agrees that this sort of sequence prompts the subject to postulate the occurrence of A3 and A4 (although unsensed). But he points out that we can also talk of gap-indifference if the gappy sequence is not monotonous, but is a gappy reproduction of variegated familiar series, such as A1B1C1D1, consisting, say, of A2, …, D2, in which case the subject postulates B2 and C2. In this way Price brings both constancy and coherence under the term “gap-indifference”.

Do the postulated un-sensed sensibilia in the reconstruction of our conception of the world exist (1940a: ch. 4)? Hume’s official view is “no”. “Experiments” such as giving oneself double-vision by pressing an eyeball supposedly show this. But, Price argues, these “experiments” don’t show that there is causal dependence of the existence of the current sensibile, or therefore any others, on the nervous system of the subject. But, further, since according to Hume there are no such things as eyeballs, fingers, or nervous systems, he cannot even accept the data his arguments appeal to.

Price concedes that Hume’s argument can be interpreted differently.

One route Price (1940a: 125–133) discusses is to agree that there are the sequences of un-sensed sensibilia imaginatively postulated by the ordinary person, but sometimes there are also sensed sensibilia sufficiently close in character to some members of the un-sensed series to count as the sensing of some of them.

4.3 Neo-Humeanism: The As-if Theory

Price offers two general approaches to neo-Humeans. The first he calls the “As-If” Theory (1940a: ch. 5; also 1930b: 192–195). The central idea is that a judgement of the form “it is as if p” can be true even if “p” is not true. One could say of a man who looked very tired, “he is as if he had trained for two hours”, even if he had not. For material object discourse, the proposal becomes: if someone says, “There is a table”, they are to be treated as saying “My current sensibilia is as if there is a table”.

In Price’s view, Hume tried but failed to show that “there is a table” is false. Hume, being an empiricist, should have held that there is no way to determine whether (or not) there is a table, which Price says is equivalent to claiming that the words “There is a table” are “meaningless” (1940a: 143). So the theory should be that although “there is a table” is strictly meaningless, the claim “it is as if there is a table” is not meaningless, and is, according to the as-if theory, what our statement “there is a table” in effect means. One might wonder how a meaningless sentence can be embedded in a meaningful complex sentence, but Price clarifies this: “meaningless” simply means “not confirmable or disconfirmable” (1940a: 148–150).

According to this account, our ordinary thought about the surrounding world amounts to the following: We sense various sensibilia, which given our imaginative propensities makes us envisage continuous and varied streams of unsensed sensibilia which would amount to the presence of objects. And we describe things in terms of it being as if these streams occurred although we are not committing to their actually having occurred. This practice allows us to anticipate future experiences.

He interestingly argues that the as-if approach has advantages over phenomenalism (1940a: 177–192). First, phenomenalism treats the presence of an object as the truth of a counterfactual conditional, whereas in ordinary thought the presence of an object amounts to a thing’s real existence (1940a: 177ff). On the as-if approach, when someone understands a material object claim they envisage the sequences of sensibilia their experiences lead them to think of. Price thinks this fits ordinary thought better. It builds into ordinary understanding an envisaging of more than counterfactual conditionals. However, the whole point of calling it “as-if”-envisaging is to treat ordinary talk non-seriously. Where that leaves the supposed advantage is unclear.

4.4 Neo-Humeanism: The Expressive Theory

Price develops another Neo-Humean theory he calls the Expressive Theory (1940a: 193ff), according to him similar to F.P. Ramsey’s (1929: 241ff) suggestion that causal laws are not statements but rules for framing predictions. It proposes that statements apparently about the external world (e.g., “there is a table over there”) are not actually truth-apt, but “expression[s] of certain sorts of mental processes. So far, they are more like exclamations than they are like statements” (1940a: 194). If I say “this sense-datum is red” I am making a statement characterising the sense-datum. But if I say “this ball is red”, employing the external object category ball, I am merely giving expression to my imaginative construction or postulation of an indefinite number of sensibilia. These are not sensed, but would amount to the presence of a ball if they did exist. My experiences also prompt me to put them into a model constructed by me to “coordinate” my experiences.

Price (1940a: 228) extensively discusses Hume mainly to develop a theory somewhat along these austere, Neo-Humean lines hoping to leave the general problems of philosophy “in a more nearly soluble state than we received them” (ibid.). Hofstadter (1941: 612f) criticises Hume and Price’s Neo-Humeanisms as embracing an error theory about unsensed sensibilia and for being unable to analyse dispositions. However, Price (1943: 331–334) later defends a way of interpreting Hume (against A. H. Smith 1943: ch. 1) on which “it is perfectly conceivable that there may be unsensed sensibilia” (1943: 334), though “conclusive empirical arguments” show, also according to Hume (1739–1740: 211), that “all our perceptions are dependent on our organs”.

4.5 Hume on Induction

Price (1940b) takes Hume’s discovery of the problem of induction to be “Hume’s greatest service to Philosophy […and…] one of the most important advances in the whole history of thought” (1940b: 30). On Price’s (1940b: 17–31) helpful, detailed analysis, the problem is, for instance, not that induction seems to be “an irrational process” (like committing logical fallacies is) but a “non-rational” one (like sleeping) (1940b: 31). Price interprets Hume’s “more constructive solution of the problem” (1940b: 31) as the articulation of a sense of reasonableness, a criterion of “just reasoning”, an inductive sense “over and above the principles of deductive inference enunciated by Formal Logic” (1940b: 35). Asking why it is sensible or reasonable to generalise and predict in an inductive way is to ask an important though “meaningless question” or “not a question at all” (1940b: 34). This reading of Hume is echoed later in Strawson’s (1952: 256ff) famous “analytic solution” (Snowdon 2009: §8.4). According to Price, this dissolution fits well with ordinary thinking about reasonableness (1940b: 36; and §2.3 above). However, Price (1969: ch. 7, 176ff; also 1940b: 29) argues that Hume’s conception of induction is too narrow, since it holds only for “the causal sort of constant conjunction” (1969: 176); induction is relevant also in other contexts.

4.6 Hume’s Theory of Belief

Price (1969: ch. 7) extensively discusses Hume’s theory of belief, the solution to Hume’s new problem about belief (1969: 160), which asks: “What is belief?”, and “How do we distinguish belief from disbelief and merely entertaining a proposition without belief or disbelief?” Price does not relate Hume’s problem to its natural background, Locke and Berkeley’s ideational models of understanding. For Price, Hume’s central point is that when entertaining a belief, which amounts to having a structure of ideas, we entertain the very same ideas as when we simply consider the claim without believing it; so belief cannot consist in the addition of an extra idea (1969: 160–161).

Hume’s proposal is, famously, that talk of “belief” stands for the presence of the ideas being more lively or vivacious. Further, Hume’s view is that the terms “solidity” and “steadiness” enable us to focus on the special “feel” of believed thoughts, produced by an impression with its own high degree of vivacity. On his picture, the impression’s high “vivacity” creates the ideas’ vivacity by being based on the experience of constant conjunction establishing evidence of a causal link between the present impression’s content and the idea in the belief.

Price criticises Hume for supposing that the link must be causal. If I see a tree I shall believe that it has roots, but not because the tree causes the roots, but because trees have roots as their parts (see also §4.5). Price sees another severe limitation: Hume’s account does not fit belief in generalisations themselves. If seeing some water makes me think of the law that water freezes at 0°C, that is not because the sight of water is linked to seeing it freeze at that temperature. And, his model of belief-formation does not apply to beliefs formed by inference.

4.7 Freedom and Assent: Hume versus Descartes

Finally, Price (1969: 22, 26, 41, 221–240) defends his own well-known views about our degree of freedom in relation to assent by studying Hume (1739–1740: Appendix) and Descartes’ disagreement (1641: Meditation 4). Hume’s official view is that belief is independent of the will and something over which we have no mastery. In contrast, Descartes maintains that judgements are acts of the will. Price thinks it is obvious that we cannot simply decide to believe something (1969: 225ff, 238), but we can decide to investigate a question and decide what type of evidence to scrutinise, meaning that we might deliberately incline ourselves to think a certain way.

Hume and Descartes, however, don’t dispute this possibility. Descartes affirms the freedom not to believe, given the chance of erroneous belief. Since we are free to remain agnostic, we are responsible for our errors, and not God, who is not a deceiver. On Price’s view, even if we cannot simply abandon a belief, such as one’s belief now that one is reading, we can “train ourselves” (1969: 225) over time to refrain from forming such beliefs. There are also abnormal subjects who form beliefs, e.g., that they are made of paper, or are surrounded by impostors. We are, thus, not impelled to form commonsensical beliefs (also 1930a: 26; 1930b: 193f). Finally, Price (1969: 239f) criticises Hume, the philosopher he most admired, for inconsistency. Hume stresses that beliefs are involuntary but also thinks that we can appreciate and respond to his sceptical arguments, if only for a short time.

5. Recognition

Price’s third main contribution is his ambitious analysis of thinking, specifically of how what Price calls “full concept application” emerges from its roots in experience (especially 1953a). Price’s answer, in brief, is that it emerges because the recipients of experience are intelligent. Price stresses an environmental condition for concept-formation: the presence of “recurrence” in our environment. Thus, there are lots of red things, worms, leaves, and so on. Price claims that without recurrence for us to encounter there could be no thought. Incessant novelty would block conceptual acquisition.

Price’s interesting claim is not obviously true. To be entitled to hold that single examples are not enough, Price must provide a theory of concept-formation.

5.1 Price’s Metaphysical Neutrality regarding Recurrence and Properties

How should recurrence be analysed (1953a: ch. 1)? One proposal is that recurrence consists in a universal (or characteristic) being present in different things. An alternative analysis invokes the notion of resemblance. Rather than saying red things have a universal in common it is proposed that red things resemble each other. In a rich discussion which is, besides his work on perception, probably his most influential, Price finds difficulties and strengths in both ways of speaking.

Most notably, on what Armstrong (1978: 15) calls Price’s “fully worked-out” analysis of resemblance nominalism, something is in the class of things with recurring feature F if it resembles a group of standard F-objects, exemplars, as closely as the exemplars resemble each other (1953a: 20–22). See also, e.g., Armstrong (1978: 46ff, 54f; 1989: 15, 17, 47f); Rodriguez-Pereyra (2002: ch. 7) describes Price’s “Aristocratic Resemblance Nominalism” (2002: 10) as the version which “current writers on the topic usually have in mind”; and Paseau (2015: 95) criticises resemblance theories for “the misleading connotation of subjectivity or anthropocentricism”. However, Price works out what he calls “The Philosophy of Resemblances”. He distinguishes this “ontological doctrine” as the “starting point for” “epistemological theories” such as nominalism, conceptualism, and imagism (1953a: 22–23). The ontological view he works out is thus not necessarily nominalist.

In his view, both analyses of recurrence are ultimately satisfactory but have inelegant aspects in certain contexts. We can employ either depending on which helps. Price distinguishes the views as two alternative ways of describing matters: sameness versus resemblance. This illustrates Price’s special sort of metaphysical neutralism (see also §2.4 above). The universals and resemblance languages are “two different (systematically different) terminologies, two systematically different ways of saying the same thing” (1953a: 30); Armstrong calls Price’s the “alternative languages view” (1978: 47; 1989: 139). For criticism, see Raphael (1954–55: §2) and Brandt (1954: 633). Notably, Price’s (1946) earlier Hertz lecture defends realism about universals against resemblance theories (Brandt 1954: 633; Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002: 125). It is an interesting, though unexplored, question how Price’s version of neutralism compares with apparently similar meta-ontological positions such as Carnap’s (1950).

Most importantly for him, Price frequently argues that his many distinctions and general approach to recognition and mental life overall are compatible with whichever view one takes on key metaphysical issues such as the natures of properties and of perception (Butchvarov 1998: 94–96 discusses this and highlights similarities with Strawson 1966: 47–48; 1985: ch. 4). For instance, when drawing the primary and secondary recognition distinction (see §5.3), he argues for this in detail (see 1953a: 55–74 [on properties], 50 [perception]; see also §2.4).

5.2 Conceptual Thinking and Recognition: Thinking in Absence and in Presence

Price (1953a: 33) credits Ryle’s (1949: ch. 2) famous discussion of know-how with making clear that intelligence, which grounds our conceptual capacities, also receives expression in action, even if not preceded by thought. To Price, though, the mode of intelligence that grounds thinking, the “fundamental intellectual process seems to be the experience of recognition” (1953a: 34–35). Conceptual thinking is a capacity which enables us to think of things in their absence, a phrase he was known for (see also §5.4; Sellars 1956 [1997: 65]). A requirement for reaching that level of thinking is the ability to think about them in their presence. He calls this recognition. He further claims, very implausibly from contemporary perspectives, that full concept-possession requires the capacity to recognise instances when encountered (1953a: 34–35). A genuine concept must be, in Price’s words, “cashable” (1953a: 35) in this way. Further, recognition does not require language; it doesn’t necessarily involve linguistic expression either privately or publicly. When one recognises one’s son one need not utter “Here’s my son” (see also Salmon 1986: 168). Also, learning a language requires learning to recognise that language’s words. This cannot rest on possessing language. Finally, recognition can be of characteristics or of individuals; the former is basic.

5.3 Secondary versus Primary Recognition

A key distinction in his theory is between (a) primary recognition, i.e. of a characteristic presented in experience, and (b) secondary recognition, i.e. of something beyond what is presented in experience (1953a: 44ff). His favourite examples are recognising an instance of red (primary), and recognising a lump of lead (secondary). Price claims that in recognising it as lead the subject goes beyond the characteristics she notices. Rather, she treats the presented features as signs (see §5.4 below; 1953a: ch. 4).

Obviously, secondary recognition can be mistaken. Price calls such mistakes, “errors of recognition” (1953a: ch. 3). Someone could take a grey lump to be lead even if it was not. But Price argues that it is different with primary recognition. A statement in response to a primary recognition might be erroneous, e.g., when using the wrong word. But if one notices a feature presented in experience and has an apparent memory of encountering it earlier, then one is recognising the feature, whether or not one had encountered it before. This argument’s two crucial assumptions are

that the presented feature fixes what it is recognised as, and since it is there, what it is recognised as cannot differ from it, and
the occurrence of recognition simply involves the apparent sense of familiarity, which is there whether or not it has been previously encountered.

(ii) is hard to accept.

5.4 Sign-Cognition

What Price calls “sign-cognition”, “cognition of the absent” (1953a: 95), is “the type of cognition in which something not immediately experienced is brought before the mind by means of a sign” (1953a: 88). Price thinks that it is crucial to explain what “being before the mind” amounts to here. For instance, a subject recognises that someone is at the door by hearing a knock—that someone is absent from the subject’s experience but brought before the mind by means of a sign, the knock.

Sign-cognition need not involve a linguistic response, nor the entertainment of an image of what is signified. But, the recognition often involves a generation of preparedness to act. If I recognise an unstable cyclist I recognise a possible accident and get ready to avoid it. So sometimes the recognition leads to actions that block what is recognised as likely. Price adds that there is something abstract about what is recognised. For example, if I recognise that rain is imminent the specific character of the actual rain is not signified. On the other hand what is recognised can be fairly specific—the action-readiness that is stimulated might also be specific and delicate. These differences are matters of degree. He adds too that there are differences in degree in how strong the sign is or is taken to be. If one hears thunder then that is a strong sign of earlier lightning, but hearing a police siren is a fairly weak sign of a local crime. It may just be a traffic accident call-out. Further, the temporal direction of what is signified can be the past, as with the lightning, the present, or the future. Price often discusses sign-recognition in animals (especially cats, leading Iris Murdoch [1940] to call him a “felinist”, see also Mac Cumhaill & Wiseman 2022: 78), calling it “the typical achievement of the animal mind” (1953a: 98) and reveals a genuine awareness of the behaviour of animals (e.g., animal vigilance, 1953a: 108)—this interest echoes Hume (1739–1740: III, xvi; 1748: sect. 9).

But what does it mean to talk of the signified feature as thought of? The adult case of recognition is based on the capacity to tell of presented cases whether (or not) they fall under a possessed concept. Price points out that this capacity can be possessed without being actualised and can be actualised to different degrees. He proposes that we should say of sign-recognition that the concept of the signified is partially actualised in the subject.

Roughly, this half-actualisation can be specified operationally, although Price expresses it differently. If I see smoke and take it as a sign of fire in the environment that means that my dispositions to behave are modified in a way that is conducive to encountering fire. Crucially this can happen in us (even though we do have the concept of “fire”) but it can happen in creatures without the concept. Price captures this change by talking of an increased vigilance for fire (1953a: 120f). This is what “having in mind” in such cases amounts to.

Price extensively relates sign-cognition also to logical notions, such as disjunction, conditionals, and negation (1953a: ch. 5; 1929 discusses negation further); of this discussion, Beck (1953: 560) says, “Psychologically this is the most subtle part of his [1953a] book”. Also, understanding thinking in this way, he argues, avoids presupposing other minds, blocking a common objection to communication’s being our best evidence for other minds (1938: 440ff).

5.5 Sign-cognition, Meaning, and Symbolisation

Price (especially 1953a: 144ff, 160ff) also made significant contributions to theorising about meaning.

First, he (1953a: 144ff) draws a distinction between two senses of “meaning”: (i) the “sign” sense and (ii) the “symbol” sense. The first is the sense in which we say that those clouds mean rain, and the second the sense in which the word “rain” means rain (see also 1938: 444). See also Grice 1957 and §7 below.

Second, he criticises (1953a: 160ff) the view that symbols are a special sort of sign (Ogden & Richards 1923: 23; Stebbing 1930: 11), the “Sign-Theory of Symbolization”. The natural link between sign and signified is established inductively. However, one might indicate that one wants a drink by mimicking drinking with one’s hand. According to Price, this works by resemblance, not by establishing an inductive correlation to wanting a drink, and thus is unlike the natural, inductively established way that black clouds signify rain—not all symbols are signs.

Third, Price’s general objection to the sign-theory of meaning is that it has latched onto something that corresponds to what a spectator of a linguistic act, or an interpreter, must engage with, but it completely ignores the point of view of the speaker (or writer). It focuses, as he says, on the consumer and not the producer of language (1953a: 198ff). As Price formulates the criticism he says that the sign-theory fails to give any account of the role of symbols (language) in what he calls “free thinking” (1953a: 200ff), that is thinking about things “in their absence”.

Fourth, Price points out that regarding someone’s saying that p as a sign that it is the case that p, something that sustains the effectiveness of communication and testimony, is quite different from regarding smoke as a sign of fire, in that it requires and depends on a rational speaker emitting the assertion. To talk simply of communication as a sign is to under-describe the nature of communication.

Finally, Price points out that someone can hear and understand an utterance without believing it, without treating it as a sign about the world. He suggests, in effect problematically for sign-theories, that understanding is more basic than expectation-generation.

5.6 The Imagist Theory of Occurrent Thinking

Another major focus is Price’s analysis and criticism of the Imagist Theory of (Occurrent) Thinking (e.g., Berkeley 1710; see 1953a: 234ff). Price deserves credit for opposing the tendency amongst philosophers of his time to underestimate the importance of images (Hamlyn [1984: 95] also remarks on Price’s seriousness regarding imagism). Price claims that images, especially visual images (1953a: 235–237), are employed in thinking, for instance by enabling us to calculate things, or remember things.

Price contrasts imagism as a theory of thinking with “verbalism”, the theory that we think in words. Price allows that we do think in words. Imagists claim, however, that this verbal thinking is secondary, and if it is to be contentful, it has to be cashable in images, whereas thinking in images does not require anything else to confer content on it. Price notes that strictly when someone thinks privately in words, they are employing images of words. But on his understanding, an imagist about thinking means by “images” non-verbal images and takes the basic components of thought to be “representative images” (1953a: 245; 1951–1952: 143).

He argues that we ordinarily think in absence, with non-instantiative particulars, that is, items which do not instantiate that which they enable us to think about (1953a: 253ff). He then affirms that images, in his sense, come closer to being instances of the concepts under which the topical objects fall than do words. They are, he says, “quasi-instantiative” (1953a: 255). Although Price is himself prepared to say this, it is hard to understand talk of closeness with regard to instantiation. Price helpfully suggests that such things as models and diagrams also more closely instantiate concepts than words do: they’re also “quasi-instantiative”. Price’s final criticism is this: imagists have no good reason to insist that thinking has to employ “quasi-instantiative” things. He says that thinking in words has content in virtue of links between the words and ostensive definitions of those words. These definitions ground recognitional capacities which get activated when experience presents the right sorts of particular. Price puts it this way:

my memory of what a crocodile is like is already operating in another way, because my word-producing and word-recognising capacity is firmly linked to it. (1953a: 263)

Thus, (A) occurrent thinking need not be carried by images, and (B) thinking in words is perfectly possible.

Price’s understanding of how thinking, when it is carried by images, works, is sketched in his answers to the traditional problems of resemblance.

There are no hard rules about how closely images (say of a crocodile) must resemble the thing thought about (the crocodile).
How do images fix content by resemblance when crocodile-images resemble not only crocodiles but also other reptiles, and green images of crocodiles resemble green?

Price replies that images can be used to focus on one thing rather than another by the presence of a word or a stimulating perception and being situated in a mental set (1953a: 268ff). To flesh this out, he (1953a: 273ff, 283–284, 296) mentions Hume’s proposal that some images are “present in power” though not “present in fact” (1739–1740: I, i, 7; also discussed here: 1959c: 483), that is, that the subject has a “multiform image-producing capacity” (1953a: 273), is disposed to produce a sequence of multiple images, say, of a crocodile, and not just one crocodile-image. These images fix what is focused upon with a word or thought, though sometimes a word, say “crocodile”, itself fixes the setting, the interpretation, and “which of these resemblances will be the psychologically effective one” (1953a: 269).

Price also addresses the traditional problem of generality, how image-based thinking can have general content. Price argues that it is an illusion that it is somehow easy in an image-based model of thinking to account for thoughts about individuals. One has an image of a face but which individual face is it an image of? Couldn’t another person have a face that resembles that image? Price thinks Hume makes some progress by postulating the availability of many other images. Price also allows that in some cases it may be possible to have generic images akin to composite images formed by superimposing lots of photographs. But in some cases of generality (e.g., the class of triangles) no such composite can be imagined. Price also allows indeterminate images, like Locke’s (1689) suggested abstract ideas, to sustain generality (1953a: 287–294). Real spatial entities cannot be indeterminate, but images may be in a realm where indeterminacy is possible. Such speculative proposals about image-realms are also central to his famous account of the afterlife on which the “Next world, if there is one, might be a world of mental images” (1953c: 3; 1968b: 3; 1972: ch. 6; for discussion: Badham 1976: 68, 133–146; Hick 1968: 110; Aldwinckle 1972: 97–99; Lewis 1973: 142; Ducasse 1961: 128; Ayers [1971: 397] defends Price against Penelhum’s [1970: 47–53] charge of solipsism).

For Price (1953a: 297), imagism’s “very serious defect” is its inability to account for logical thinking (e.g., with negation, disjunction, possibility/actuality, and quantification).

5.7 Price’s Dispositional Conceptualism

According to Price, symbolic thinking doesn’t exhaust the content of thought; he writes, “part of what we think is always symbolised, but not the whole of it … and often only a small part” (1953a: 308). For instance, when one searches for the right word, one is guided by content that is not yet symbolised. Also, thinking in time using a succession of symbols “overflows [the] symbols” (1953a: 309) and never involves the whole symbol-conveyed thought present at any time—the succession must be guided by something already there in full (1953a: 309–311).

The extra features of thought missing from symbol-presented content, Price argues (1953a: 302), are not captured by the so-called classical theory of many ancients and earlier moderns such as Locke and Kant, on which thinking is “the awareness or inspection of intelligible objects—universals, or concepts, or abstract ideas, or …. Subsistent propositions” (1953a: 302). In short, there is no phenomenological evidence for this when one is thinking.

The key is the right view of concepts. In brief, Price’s approach is “a dispositional version of Conceptualism” (1953a: 353), on which we talk of concept-manifestation in situations where certain dispositions are present or actualised or partly actualised. According to Price, then, concepts are neither the images one encounters in thinking nor the objects of thinking which we introspectively grasp in thinking. Rather, they are the dispositions (i) to recognise instances of the universals which on other accounts are equated with the concept itself or (ii) to recognise recurring resemblances.

A very thorough and fair critical discussion of Price’s theory of recognition and related issues is given in Broad 1954. Other critical but largely sympathetic discussions include L.W. Beck 1953; Findlay 1954; Malcolm 1954; L. 1954; Brandt 1954; Mundle 1954; Butchvarov 1979: 42, 79, 147, 258.

6. Belief

We now present some of Price’s significant contributions to the philosophical study of belief, including belief ascriptions (§6.1), the variety of beliefs (§6.6–6.8), their relations to other states such as knowledge (§6.1; 1969: chs. 1–3), the analysis of “one’s evidence for belief” (§6.2; 1969: ch. 4), especially from his 1960 Gifford Lectures, published as his magnum opus Belief (1969). Their backbone is his defence of the dispositional analysis of belief (§6.4), in his eyes the standard modern analysis, specifically against occurrentist analyses (e.g., Hume and Cook Wilson) (§6.3).

6.1 Knowledge & How it Illuminates Belief

We start with some general commitments about belief’s relationship to knowledge.

First, Price (1969: 30ff) takes belief-ascriptions to be performatory: when one says “I believe that p”, one is certifying to some extent the truth of p. The level of guarantee, however, is below that of knowledge claims, which he takes Austin to have shown to be performatory and convey a guarantee of truth. Price leaves it unclear whether publicly self-ascribed beliefs can count both as guarantees and as self-descriptions of one’s state of mind (e.g., as being that of belief).

Second, Price (1969: 42f) suggests that knowledge-ascriptions are normally dispositional, ascribing to subjects a condition explicable in counterfactual terms. He notes that we have ways of ascribing what is actually factual knowledge in indirect forms—for example, “S knows where A is”—but if such an ascription is to be true it requires that S knows that p where p is of the form “A is at place so and so” (1969: 49–50). A different kind of knowledge-ascription is “knowledge-by-acquaintance” (see §3.7), which he understands as knowledge of items, say a place or a person, which he takes to ground knowledge-by-description, meaning what we have been told in general terms. Knowledge-by-description is only genuine if we can relate the descriptions to what we can sense, the realm of acquaintance. Both Russell earlier and Strawson later developed in their own ways this link, though Price credits Jane Austen (1811: ch. 21) with drawing the distinction 100 years before Russell (1969: 63). Third, Price (1969: 50) follows Ryle: “know-how” ascriptions are in some sense practical and not reducible to factual claims.

Finally, Price (1969: ch. 3) defends a variant of the standard account of propositional knowledge: in many cases the condition for knowing that p is that the subject S believes with full certainty that p, and has conclusive reasons for thinking that p, and p is true. However, this analysis only applies where the conviction is generated by inference. Where S simply observes that p, e.g., that something is red or that she’s having a pain, no reasons or inference is involved. The analysis of knowledge in such cases, according to Price, cannot centre on belief. Thus, knowledge isn’t analysed in just one way. Earlier, Price (1930b: 200) claims that knowledge is a “direct” cognitive relation to its objects and is a “state where the distinction between sure and unsure does not arise at all”.

6.2 The Analysis of Belief: Some Preliminaries

Now, some preliminary stances regarding belief. First, Price endorses talk of degrees of belief (1969: 39–41). Second, in assessing the reasonableness of someone’s belief, the focus must be on the evidence that one possesses, not on the evidence available. According to Price, the notion of evidence suggests facts that are known, whereas people’s belief-formation can be guided by other beliefs they already have, whether accurate or not. Third, because standards for knowledge are high, when knowledge is unavailable, “mere” beliefs need to guide thought and action. Fourth, complex series of beliefs which support each other might be grounded outside themselves in at least four ways: (1) perception, (2) self-consciousness, (3) memory, and (4) testimony.

Price’s attitude to perception as a source of belief can be described as Moorean: the regress of the justification of belief is terminated by perceptual experiences and self-observation. Perception is simply a way to settle questions, whatever sceptical arguments might be offered.

Price argues that self-consciousness gives us evidence about ourselves: he writes, for example:

My evidence for believing that I am a timid person is […] the frequent experiences of fear which I have noticed in myself on many different sorts of occasions. (1969: 105)

He blocks scepticism about memory in ways familiar from §2: sceptical problems about memory can only be generated by relying on memory. A ground for scepticism will rely eventually on something delivered by memory. Say you seem to remember doing something. You’re told that you didn’t do it. Acknowledging this relies on your trusting someone else’s memory of what happened (1969: 106–111). Also, to draw a conclusion from premises, one generally relies on one’s memory of the premises. Thus, arguments against memory rely on memory, so are self-undermining (1930b: 195–196). (Bernecker 2008: 98–99 discusses and uses Price’s argument; for more on memory: Price 1936: 16–33; 1952c).

Price stresses how much of what each human being believes is grounded in testimony. However, Price argues that the following, widely accepted generalisation isn’t well-supported: “What there is said to be (or to have been) there is (or was) more often than not” (1969: 114). For it involves a clash in the ethics of belief (1969: ch. 11; 1954b: passim): (a) that it is wrong to believe things that are not supported, and (b) that we should trust others. Another approach he calls an “economic” justification takes the claim about others as corresponding to a rule (not a generalisation) to believe others unless one has a reason not to do so (1969: 124–126). Its justification is that unless one endorses the rule one forgoes the chance of learning about most parts—spatial and temporal—of the world.

Famously, Price (1954b: 23) opposes the ethics of belief, arguing that any blame directed on people’s thoughts will have dire consequences, such as that “charity will almost disappear from the world” (for discussion: Wolterstorff 2005: 326). §4.7 above discusses his view that we cannot simply decide to believe something (1969: 225ff, 238). However, he defends, against Newman (1870: ch. 6), John Locke’s (1689: IV, chs. 14–16, 19) Ethics of Belief (1969: 130), which in short is that we should assent to a degree which corresponds to the strength of our evidence for the truth of the claim.

6.3 The Occurrence Analysis of Belief

Price’s central topic is his critique of the occurrence analysis of belief and his defence of the dispositional analysis.

Price proposes that the traditional occurrence analysis should be understood as focusing on what he calls “assent” (1969: 204ff), which can stand for an occurrence. But in order to assent to a proposition one must entertain it. So Price attempts to say something informative about entertaining.

Price belongs in the truth-conditional tradition which links understanding a proposition to knowing its truth-conditions, what it would be like for the proposition to be true, though, of course, without linking that to the Davidsonian idea of defining truth for propositions. Price distinguishes between knowing the truth-conditions and knowing how to verify or falsify the claim in question: we understand claims of which we cannot determine the truth (1969: 194). Price’s problem is this: knowing what the truth of a proposition involves is simply a dispositional condition and cannot consist in occurrently analysing those conditions—so what is involved occurrently in entertaining it? Price insightfully claims that it does not consist in mentally encountering either a pure contentful entity or an abstract possibility. His best answer is that the occurrence involves an experienced state of readiness to engage in analysing the truth-commitments of the proposition (1969: 200ff).

Further, entertaining a proposition p is necessary to be able to doubt, reject, or assert that p, as well as to have a conscious desire or aversion regarding p (1972: 38–39). Bernecker (2010: 236) claims that “entertaining” plays the same role for Price that “thought” plays in Descartes (1641 [1984: 17]), as an “ur-attitude that underlies all others”.

6.4 Price’s Dispositional Analysis of Belief

Most generally, Price’s (1969: 243–266, Series II, Lecture 1) dispositional analysis equates having a belief with the presence of a disposition. He thinks that it is obvious that many belief-ascriptions have a dispositional meaning. When we say of a sleeping person that she believes Rome was founded in 753 BC that does not ascribe any sort of occurrence or act. Occurrence theorists do not deny this, but claim that some belief-ascriptions ascribe occurrences, and that with dispositional ascriptions the outputs of the disposition are such occurrences; so the occurrence sense is more basic than the dispositional sense. Price’s sort of dispositional analysis has the following features.

First, disposition-ascriptions are equivalent to conditionals, and also can apply to a thing for a time, possibly very short, but possibly throughout the object’s existence.

Second, to pin down belief in terms of its characteristic outputs one should not focus simply on action-outcomes. Characteristically, beliefs can give rise to inaction, as when your belief that the radio is properly tuned means you leave doing anything about it. More interestingly, beliefs give rise to emotions or feelings (1969: 267ff). Your belief that there is a snake present generates fear, and a belief that suddenly seems to be false generates surprise (1969: 275ff).

Third, Price (1969: 280–285) defends the idea (against Kneale) that certain states of belief are ones in which something is felt.

Fourth, beliefs give rise to other beliefs. As he puts it: “We need beliefs because we need guidance not only in our actions but in our thoughts also” (1969: 291). Sometimes this generation of belief amounts to an experienced inference, in which case the subject making the inference must assent to the premises and also to the conclusion, occurrences which Price calls “inward and private” mental acts (1969: 295), but sometimes the inference is automatic and not “lived through” (1969: 293).

Price, thus, recommends that belief is recognised as a multiform disposition (1969: 294–296), in which inner acts of assent figure amongst the outputs of the disposition. This view inclusively incorporates what he sees as the insights of the traditional occurrence analysis and the dispositional approach. Price aims, as is typical of him, to bring out the best, as he sees it, in both sides. What he brings out most is that much needs to be done to fill out the dispositional analysis. (Salmon 1986: 168 compares Price’s dispositional view of belief with his own.)

6.5 Applications of the Dispositional Model

Price applies his dispositional model to various issues related to belief, such as the phenomenon of half-belief (1964b: 152ff; 1969: 305ff), Newman’s (1870) distinction between notional and real assent (1969: 315–348), and the puzzle of self-verifying beliefs (1969: 349–375), presented as a puzzle for the objectivity of truth.

Price accounts for half-beliefs with his dispositional model as cases where there are some elements in the normal, complex disposition which constitutes belief but others are absent. For example, maybe the tendency of the disposition to remain is weaker than it characteristically is, or the disposition to emotion might be prompted by certain sensory inputs, as in aesthetic contexts when watching a film or reading a book (1969: 307–308), without dispositions to act in certain ways.

The problem of self-verifying beliefs is that they seem to undermine the conviction that our beliefs are made true by states-of-affairs independent of our beliefs. Consider a competition in which one team’s members are convinced that they can win and this belief motivates them to persevere through difficulties and win. Their belief that they can win is made true by this very belief. Price’s solution is to claim that the belief’s role is to be part of a causal condition which produces the outcome; the truth of the belief is in this way an objective matter.

6.6 Moral Beliefs

Price argues that there are no moral beliefs properly speaking:

beliefs are things which are truth-apt, that is can be true or false, and
“moral judgements” are essentially expressions of the sentiment of approval or disapproval, something which cannot be true or false (1969: 398).

Ultimately, he prefers the “Attitudinarian Analysis” (1969: 379): “it seems to accord with [my] own moral experience” (1969: 380). When we express doubt about our moral judgements, for instance, that simply amounts to expressing uncertainty about the attitude, and not an uncertainty about a fact (1969: 383ff). However, on various points, he argues that

the difference between an “attitudinarian” analysis of moral judgements and an “objectivist” analysis, in which they are held to be true or false, is not quite so clear-cut as it looks. (1969: 399)

Further, he favours Hume and Hutcheson’s way of developing this analysis over R.M. Hare’s, which treats moral judgements as injunctions or imperatives (1969: 396, 418–420). He suggests that to make a moral remark to another is not like telling them what to do but is rather a matter of laying your attitude before them, as an invitation to feel the same. He also claims that simply adopting a universal rule unaccompanied by feelings of approval is not sufficient for having a moral attitude—it is more akin to merely internalising a rule. In fact, creatures without feeling cannot be creatures with moral attitudes (1969: 420–425).

Price aims to shrink the difference between ethical realism and ethical non-realism. Later, more sophisticated twentieth century efforts largely ignored Price’s interesting explorations.

6.7 Belief-In

Price was well-known especially amongst philosophers of religion for his discussion about whether “believe-in” reports are reducible to “believe-that” ascriptions (1964c; 1965; 1969: 426–454). Price argues that many are clearly equivalent (1969: 431–435). For example believing in the Loch Ness monster is believing that there is such a monster. But in other cases—such as believing in a friend, or in God—an important element is trust (and love) which involves a feeling; so the reduction cannot always work (1964c: 10–11; 1969: 449ff). Litzenburg (1967) directly responds to Price’s view, and Sleeper’s (1966) metaphysics of belief builds on Price’s account; for discussion: Mitchell 1971: 7ff, Malcolm 1964: 107ff.

6.8 Religious Belief

Finally, Price wrote influentially on (i) the nature of religious belief, and (ii) its conflict with science and empiricism (see §2.2 above; also 1953b; 1964c; 1969: Series 2, Lecture 10; 1972; among others). In 1953b and in “Religious Belief and Empiricist Philosophy” (1969), he engages especially with two recent developments: that religious claims such as “God exists” (i) are neither true nor false, being devoid of descriptive meaning; and (ii) should be interpreted as recommendations of lifestyles—say, to love thy neighbour—rather than as claims about transcendent entities (1953b: 3).

Price suggests the following. Religious “recommendations” advise us to adopt a certain worldview, putting it briefly, to live a loving life. Some sort of empirical test is available for the recommendation to live a loving life. We can try it or observe such attempts and see if it produces approval and what the recommenders think it will. Importantly, though, the recommended worldview and ways of life are committed to the assertion of certain propositions, without which they cannot even be understood (1953b: 7). For instance, the lifestyle recommendations of theistic religions (e.g., Christianity) require propositions about the real existence of a transcendent deity, human immortality, and generally a theistic theory of the universe (1953b: 4–6), and for non-theistic religions such as Buddhism, propositions about reincarnation and the non-existence of a substantial Ego (1953b: 6–7). Further, Price argues strongly that engaging in many of the religious practices (e.g., petitionary prayer) without these beliefs is intellectually dishonest. The wishful beliefs, say in God, are an essential part of the psychological techniques and practices of the religion (1972: 38–40). However, earlier (1964c: 18–19) he makes room for devotional practices which require merely an “as-if” attitude towards God (see §4.3).

Price is, thus, a realist about the interpretation of religious claims, in contrast to his contemporary, Braithwaite (1955). Price (1969: 476–488) aims to locate experiential evidence that bears on such claims and empirical tests of the realist religious hypotheses for earthbound creatures like us. If successful, empiricists should at least have no qualms about the meaningfulness of claims, say, about a transcendental god. The religious view is that we are capable of encountering God in devotional experience, such as prayer which involves a “real” rather than “notional” apprehension of God (see 1969: 318–319; Newman 1870)—in short, prayer allows us to be acquainted with God rather than to know about God by description—and via “super-sensory cognitive powers, an awareness of the Divine” (1953b: 31, also 11ff), though he claims in (1964c: 22–23) that it would be “presumptuous” of the ordinary religious person to think that they’ve achieved this. So to test it empirically we must, without prior belief in religion, try out devotional practice and see what experiences occur. He does not say what the experiential outcome will in general be, and he does not explore problems that might be raised about the interpretation of the resulting experiences. (Price’s acquaintance with an apparent religious experience is recounted by Hick 2002: 74–75.) He (1964c: 20–24) does describe, however, that it involves a personal relationship of faith, belief, and loving confidence in God, which isn’t propositional and involves a removal of the illusion that God is absent (1964d: 35). For discussion: Hartshorne 1964: 31. Price seems content to have linked religious claims to such empirical testing: he writes, “‘Try it and see for yourself’ is one way of formulating the empiricist principle” (1935: 331; 1964c: 24; 1969: 488; §2.2 above). Also, he argues (1953b: 37–54) that psychical research has “discovered” (1953b: 54) other forms of “supernormal cognition”. Although these discoveries do “nothing at all to establish [the sense of the Divine]” (1953b: 49), they “diminish or perhaps even … remove the chief obstacle[:] … the Materialistic conception of human nature” (1953b: 53; for favourable discussion see Russell 1954 [1999: 147–150]; see also §7 below).

7. Remarkable Anticipations

We end by illustrating a very impressive feature of Price’s discussions: the degree to which he anticipates ideas that became a focus of considerable attention later.

In Quine and Davidson’s terminology, Price (1953a: ch. 7) is concerned with the possibility of translation and interpretation, although he does not speak that way. Here, Price has latched onto the idea that accurate language-acquisition depends on and requires that certain utterances dealing with observable matters must be true. He does not propose highly general principles, such as truth-maximisation for belief as a constraint on interpretation—indeed he is probably against such a general claim—but he appreciates the crucial role of truth in relation to observation sentences. He also stresses the idea that language-acquisition centrally depends on induction, an insight which any response to Wittgenstein’s rule-following discussion should acknowledge. What is surprising, looking back, is that these ideas in Price were not taken up, and his ideas played no role in later discussion. The explanation for this, we believe, is that his book was unfortunately often ignored.

Elsewhere, Price (1929: 98) says that it is unfortunate to call statements about oneself or one’s mental states “subjective” as they are, in his words, “as ‘objective’ as anything else, for they are realities existing in the world whether anyone thinks about them or not” (1929: 98). This anticipates reactions against Nagel (1974) and Jackson’s (1982: 130) attempts to capture our mental lives with what-it’s-like-ness talk and the subjective/objective distinction. He remarkably analyses “knowing what it is like for something to be red” (1969: 55) as a case of knowledge-by-acquaintance (see §3.7 above), with (1) first-handedness, and (2) familiarity, together yielding the capacity to recognise the colour when one encounters it elsewhere. He doesn’t seem to think that such knowledge brings in anything non-objective.

Interestingly, when applying his theory of recognition to recognising individuals, Price reveals that he thinks of persisting individuals as a succession of short-lived particulars, in effect what came to be called time-slices (1953a: 39).

Price’s (1953a: 144ff) distinction between the sign and symbol senses of meaning anticipates the same distinction in Grice (1957), famously labelled natural versus non-natural meaning, by four years looking at publication dates. However, Grice’s paper was written earlier than when it appeared. Neither Price nor Grice mentions the other in their accounts and there is no way to decide who influenced whom or whether they were independent.

According to Langsam (1997: 57), Price (1932: 31) anticipates but quickly rejects the disjunctivist conception of experience later defended by Hinton (1973), Snowdon (1981; 1990), and McDowell (1982). He rejects it because “there is no qualitative difference between normal [veridical] sense-data as such and abnormal [e.g., illusory] sense-data as such” (1932: 31; for discussion: Crane 2005: §1.2).

8. Legacy

Price was clearly a major figure during his life-time. Although his influence seems to have waned quickly after his death, it lived on via his major influence on and continued engagement from his students, some of whom themselves became major figures in philosophy, despite his being, in Warnock’s (1995: 717) words, “a shy, reclusive figure, belonging to no school or group and seeking no disciples”.


Works by Price


  • 1932, Perception, London: Methuen & Co.; reprinted, 1954, with a new preface responding to criticisms.
  • 1940a, Hume’s Theory of the External World, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1953a, Thinking and Experience, London: Hutchinson University Library; Chapter 1’s discussion of universals and resemblance is often anthologised, e.g., van Inwagen & Zimmerman 1998 [2008: chapter 6].
  • 1969, Belief: The Gifford Lectures Delivered at the University of Aberdeen in 1960, (Muirhead Library of Philosophy 1959–60), London: Allen & Unwin.
  • 1972, Essays in the Philosophy of Religion: Based on the Sarum Lectures, 1971, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1995, Philosophical Interactions with Parapsychology, Frank B. Dilley (ed.), London: Palgrave Macmillan. doi:10.1007/978-1-349-24108-8

Shorter Books

  • 1936, Truth and Corrigibility, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • 1953b, Some Aspects of the Conflict between Science & Religion, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Selected Articles

  • 1924, “Reality and Sensible Appearance”, Mind, 33(129): 20–43. doi:10.1093/mind/XXXIII.129.20
  • 1926a, “A Realist View of Illusion and Error”, The Monist, 36(2): 340–354. doi:10.5840/monist19263627
  • 1926b, “Symposium: The Nature of Sensible Appearances”, with G. Hicks, G. E. Moore, and L. S. Stebbing, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 6: 162–178. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/6.1.142
  • 1927, “Mill’s View of the External World”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 27: 109–140. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/27.1.109
  • 1928, “On The So-Called Space of Sight”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 28: 97–116. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/28.1.97
  • 1929, “Symposium: Negation”, with J. D. Mabbott and G. Ryle, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 9: 97–111. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/9.1.67
  • 1930a, “The Appeal to Common Sense (I)”, Philosophy, 5(17): 24–35. doi:10.1017/S0031819100010731
  • 1930b, “The Appeal to Common Sense (II)”, Philosophy, 5(18): 191–202. doi:10.1017/S0031819100013255
  • 1935, “Logical Positivism and Theology”, Philosophy, 10(39): 313–331. doi:10.1017/S0031819100016776
  • 1936, “Symposium: Memory-Knowledge”, with J. Laird and J. N. Wright, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 15: 16–33. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/15.1.16
  • 1938, “Our Evidence for the Existence of Other Minds”, Philosophy, 13(52): 425–456. doi:10.1017/S0031819100014200
  • 1939 [1995], “Haunting and the ‘Psychic Ether’ Hypothesis – I”, Proceedings of the Society for Psychical Research, 45(160), Presidential Address, 307–323; reprinted in Price 1995: 17–34.
  • 1940b, “The Permanent Significance of Hume’s Philosophy”, Philosophy, 15(57): 7–37. doi:10.1017/S0031819100035646
  • 1940c, “Some Philosophical Questions about Telepathy and Clairvoyance”, Philosophy, 15(60): 363–385. doi:10.1017/S0031819100036603
  • 1941, “Critical Notices: The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge by A.J. Ayers”, Mind, 50(199): 280–293. doi:10.1093/mind/L.199.280
  • 1943, “Critical Notices: A Treatise on Knowledge by A. H. Smith”, Mind, 52(208): 331–344. doi:10.1093/mind/LII.208.331
  • 1943–1944, “Touch and Organic Sensation: The Presidential Address”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 44: i–xxx. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/44.1.i
  • 1945, “The Inaugural Address: ‘Clarity Is Not Enough’”, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 19: 1–31. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/19.1.1
  • 1946, “Thinking and Representation (The Hertz Philosophical Lecture, read 6 February 1946)”, Proceedings of the British Academy, 32: 83–122.
  • 1951, “Critical Notice: Knowledge and Perception: Essays and Lectures by H.A. Prichard”, Mind, 60(237): 103–121. doi:10.1093/mind/LX.237.103
  • 1951–1952, “Image Thinking”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 52: 135–166. doi:10.1093/aristotelian/52.1.135
  • 1952a, “Seeming”, in “Symposium: ‘Sseming[sic]’”, with Karl Britton and A. Quinton, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 26: 215–234. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/26.1.195
  • 1952b, “New Books: Analysis of the Problem of Perception in British Empiricism by Justus Hartnack”, Mind, 60(240): 550–583.
  • 1952c, “Memory”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 2(9): 350–355. doi:10.2307/2216815
  • 1953c, “Survival and the Idea of ‘Another World’”, Proceedings of the Society for Psychical Research, 60: 1–25; reprinted in Price 1995: 237–262.
  • 1954a, “Preface to 1954 Reprint” of Perception (1932), pp. vii–ix.
  • 1954b, “The Inaugural Address: Belief and Will”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volumes, Volume 58, Belief and Will, 1–26. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/28.1.1
  • 1956, “The Argument from Illusion”, in H.D. Lewis (ed.), Contemporary British Philosophy, London: George Allen and Unwin, pp. 391–400.
  • 1959a, “The Nature and Status of Sense-Data in Broad’s Epistemology”, in P.A. Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of C.D. Broad, New York: Tudor Publishing Company, pp. 457–485.
  • 1959b, “Review: Perceiving: A Philosophical Study by Roderick Chisholm”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 10(38): 147–153. doi:10.1093/bjps/X.38.147
  • 1959c, “Comment on: ‘Price’s Theory of the Concept’”, The Review of Metaphysics, 12(3): 481–485.
  • 1960, “Sir Russell Brain on Modes of Apprehension”, The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 11(41): 71–76. doi:10.1093/bjps/XI.41.71
  • 1964a, “Appearing and Appearances”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 1(1): 3–19.
  • 1964b, “Symposium: Half-Belief”, with R. B. Braithwaite, Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 38: 149–174. doi:10.1093/aristoteliansupp/38.1.149
  • 1964c, “Faith and Belief”, in Hick 1964: 3–25. doi:10.1007/978-1-349-81670-5_1
  • 1964d, “Reply to Hartshorne”, in Hick 1964: 33–37. doi:10.1007/978-1-349-81670-5_2
  • 1965, “Belief ‘In’ and Belief ‘That’”, Religious Studies, October, 1(1): 5–27. doi:10.1017/S0034412500002304
  • 1968a, “The Problem of Life after Death”, Religious Studies, 3(2): 447–459. Reprinted in Price 1995: 220–236. doi:10.1017/S0034412500003140
  • 1968b, “Survival and the Idea of Another World”, in J.R. Smythies (ed.), Brain and Mind, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.

Secondary Literature

  • Aldwinckle, Russell Foster, 1972, Death in the Secular City: A Study of the Notion of Life after Death in Contemporary Theology and Philosophy, London: Allen & Unwin. doi:10.4324/9781003334484
  • Anscombe, G.E.M., 1981, “Introduction”, in her Metaphysics and the Philosophy of Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. vii–x.
  • Armstrong, David Malet, 1978, Nominalism & Realism: Universals & Scientific Realism Volume I, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1989, Universals: An Opinionated Introduction, Boulder/San Francisco/London: Westview Press.
  • Austen, Jane, 1811, Sense and Sensibility, London: Egerton.
  • Austin, J. L., 1962, Sense and Sensibilia, G. J. Warnock (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Ayers, Robert H., 1971, “Review: Survival and Disembodied Existence by Terence Penelhum”, The Modern Schoolman, 48(4): 395–398. doi:10.5840/schoolman1971484174
  • Badham, Paul, 1976, Christian Beliefs about Life after Death, (Library of Philosophy and Religion), London: Macmillan.
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The original draft of this entry was written by Paul Snowdon. After he passed away, the draft was substantially revised by Arthur Schipper. The editors are grateful to Paul Snowdon for his early work on this entry and to Katherine Snowdon for granting permission for us to build on that work with a new author.

Copyright © 2023 by
Arthur Schipper <schipper.philosophy@gmail.com>
Paul Snowdon

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