Notes to Reference

1. For more on the reference of mental states, see the entries on mental representation, causal theories of mental content, externalism about mental content, and teleological theories of mental content. For more on the reference of pictures, see the entry on Goodman’s aesthetics.

2. Searle (1983) claims that to construe reference-determining content as in all cases specifiable linguistically, is to misconstrue the nature of such content. Some such content may (for instance) be perceptually based, but not linguistically specifiable. See also Frege (1892).

3. For extensive discussion, see Soames (2002). See also the entry on rigid designators.

4. For a formal proof of the necessity of identity in quantified modal logic, see Marcus (1947).

5. See Evans (1973, 1982) for a number of additional cases which have proven vexatious for the committed causal theorist. Evans also sketches an important variation on the causal theory—one which focuses on the cause of the plurality of the speaker’s beliefs, rather than her acquisition of the name itself—which purportedly resolves most of these worries. For further developments of this general line of thought, see Dickie (2015).

6. See Rami (2014) for helpful discussion on these issues and an alternative formulation of the indexical view designed to deal with many of them.

7. A significant literature has sprouted up regarding this claim, centered on what has been called ‘the answering machine paradox’. For a recent overview, see Cohen and Michaelson (2013). See also the entry on indexicals for further discussion and references.

8. See, however, Gray (2014, 2015) and Jeshion (2015) for reason to think that such an account of name-bearing will not be fully adequate. It is also worth noting that the need to work out an adequate account of name-bearing stands as a particularly salient challenge for predicativists about proper names.

9. The terminology was introduced to the philosophy of language in MacKay (1968). The allusion is to some of Humpty Dumpty’s memorable comments in Lewis Carroll’s Through the Looking Glass regarding the degree of control he takes himself to exhibit over the meanings of the words that he utters.

10. This sort of view has also been fleshed-out and defended by, among others, Schiffer (1981) and Bach (1992).

11. See also King (2013) for a remarkably similar suggestion. For helpful discussion and criticism, see Speaks (2016, 2017), Unnsteinsson (forthcoming), and Radulescu (forthcoming).

12. A different sort of constraint on demonstrative reference has been developed in Neale (2004), Stokke (2010), and King (2014). Prescinding from various differences between these accounts, each of holds that referential success requires the referent either be recoverable or actually recovered by the listener (or an idealized version thereof). Little detail has been offered regarding the sorts of idealizations envisaged, however, making certain versions of this view rather difficult to evaluate.

13. Another challenge that the Russellian looks set to avoid has to do with descriptions that, intuitively, refer to nonexistent objects. Descriptions like ‘the sun god’ or ‘the protagonist of The Broken Earth trilogy’ don’t seem to refer to real objects, yet they are hardly meaningless. The Russellian can easily accommodate this by making use of her translation procedure, whereas the referentialist will have to offer some additional story regarding how these count as meaningful. Note that an analogous problem, the problem of empty names, also arises for Millians. For more on these issues, see the entry on nonexistent objects.

14. See Devitt (1997) and Reimer (1998) for an application of these ideas to the present context. For criticism, see Schoubye (2011).

15. See the entry on Quine for further discussion.

16. See also Lewis (1993) for a classic discussion of these matters and the entry on the problem of the many further elaboration of the options.

17. For deflationary accounts of reference see, for instance, Brandom (1994), Horwich (1998), and Field (2001).

Copyright © 2019 by
Eliot Michaelson <>
Marga Reimer

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