Medieval Theories of Relations

First published Tue May 29, 2001; substantive revision Sat May 11, 2024

The purpose of this entry is to provide a systematic introduction to medieval views about the nature and ontological status of relations. Given the current state of our knowledge of medieval philosophy, especially with regard to relations, it is not possible to discuss all the nuances of even the best-known medieval philosophers’ views. In what follows, therefore, we shall restrict our aim to identifying and describing (a) the main types of position that were developed during the Middle Ages, and (b) the most important considerations that shaped their development. Along the way, however, we shall have occasion to examine in detail certain aspects of the views of important representatives of all the main medieval positions, including Peter Abelard (1079–1142), Gilbert of Poitiers (1085–1154), Albert the Great (1200–1280), Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274), John Duns Scotus (1265–1308), Henry Harclay (1270–1317), Peter Auriol (1280–1322), and William Ockham (1285–1347).

1. Introduction

All theorizing about relations in the Middle Ages begins with Aristotle’s short treatise, the Categories. Due to historical circumstances, this Aristotelian text was one of the very few pieces of ancient Greek philosophy available in the Latin west between the seventh and twelfth centuries, and the only one to contain a systematic philosophical treatment of relations. In the Categories, Aristotle identifies relations as one of the ten highest kinds or categories (one of the so-called summa genera), and he devotes an entire chapter—the seventh chapter of the treatise—to distinguishing its members from those of the other categories (most notably, substance, quantity, and quality).[1] On the standard medieval interpretation of this chapter, Aristotle is attempting to characterize relations at least partly on the basis of semantic or logical considerations—that is, on the basis of the differences between statements containing relational (or ‘relative’) terms and those containing only non-relational (or ‘absolute’) terms. As we shall see, this approach to characterizing relations helps to shape the way medieval philosophers understand them, and gives rise to the common medieval distinction between relations merely according to speech (relationes secundum dici) and relations according to being (relationes secundum esse).

In addition to defending a particular characterization of relations in the Categories, Aristotle also suggests a general model or paradigm for analyzing what we shall call ‘relational situations’—that is, the situations or states of affairs that explain the truth of genuinely relational statements. According to this Categories model, whenever two (or more) substances are related, this is to be explained by certain monadic properties or accidents inhering in the relata.[2] Thus, if Socrates is similar to Theaetetus (i.e., resembles him with respect to some quality),[3] this is not to be explained by an entity to which Socrates and Theaetetus are somehow jointly attached (namely, the dyadic or two-place property, being-similar-to). On the contrary, it is to be explained by a pair of accidents, one of which inheres in Socrates and relates him to Theaetetus, and the other of which inheres in Theaetetus and relates him to Socrates.[4]

This Aristotelian model exercises enormous influence during the Middle Ages, and until at least the fourteenth century, medieval philosophers develop their own analysis of relational situations in terms of it. In this context, the most important medieval debates concern the precise nature of the properties or accidents that relate particular substances. Some philosophers, such as Peter Abelard and William Ockham, adopt a form of reductionism, according to which the properties in question are accidents falling under categories other than relation. Thus, according to Abelard and Ockham, when Socrates is similar to Theaetetus, this is to be explained in terms of particular qualities, say, their respective colors. Other philosophers, however, such as Albert the Great and John Duns Scotus, reject this form of reductionism, maintaining instead that relations are accidents of a sui generis type. Thus, according to Albert and Scotus, when Socrates is similar to Theaetetus, this is to be explained by a pair of accidents whose members are distinct from, and irreducible to, their respective colors.

Although the analysis of relational situations that Aristotle suggests in the Categories is perfectly general, it is clear from his later writings that he does not think that all relational situations conform to it. Thus, in the Metaphysics he claims that there are relational situations (such as Simmias’s thinking about Socrates) in which substances are related not in virtue of a pair of accidents, but rather in virtue of a single accident possessed by just one of the substances. “An object of thought [e.g., Socrates]” he says at one point “is said to be related because something else [e.g., Simmias] is related to it”.[5] And his point just appears to be that some relational situations are grounded in a single property or accident of a single relatum.

Aristotle’s Metaphysics did not become available to philosophers in the Latin west until the mid-twelfth century, and it did not circulate widely before the thirteenth. Nonetheless, philosophers throughout the medieval period denied that all relational situations conform to the Categories paradigm. Unlike Aristotle, however, the basis of the medievals’ denial was largely theological in nature. Considerations associated with the doctrine of creation, for example, led them to accept relational situations in which two (or more) substances are related by a single property or accident. And considerations associated with the Christian doctrine of the Trinity forced them to admit that, in certain relational situations, even substances themselves can qualify as relations.[6] Prior to the fourteenth century, however, these sorts of situations were regarded as special cases, rare exceptions to a general rule. Indeed, prior to this time, most philosophers worked hard to show that even these sorts of situations conform, at least to some extent, to the paradigm of the Categories. This effort, as we shall see, helps to explain the pervasiveness in late medieval philosophy of the distinction between so-called real relations (relationes reales) and mere relations of reason (relationes rationis).

As the above remarks suggest, the fourteenth century marks an important turning point in the medieval discussion of relations. After this point, there is a noticeable shift away from the Categories paradigm, with the result that many philosophers come to regard those situations in which substances are related by virtue of their accidents as the exception rather than the rule. Part of the explanation is due, perhaps, to a gradual waning of Aristotle’s influence, but part of it is also due to substantive doctrinal changes. By the fourteenth century, it is common to deny the existence of any real distinction between substances and most of their accidents, and hence philosophers are increasingly willing to say that substances themselves provide the ontological grounding for relational situations. Again, due to important semantic innovations around the same time, and the subsequent emergence of late-medieval nominalism, philosophers also begin to depart from the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations. Thus, instead of thinking of relations as the items responsible for relating two or more substances, they now begin to think of them as items existing only in the mind—that is, as mere beings of reason or concepts. With respect to both of these developments, as we shall see, Ockham is an important transitional figure.

2. Aristotelian Background

Although Aristotle discusses relations at various places in his work, his discussion in the Categories is the most important for understanding the development of medieval theories of relations. Part of the reason, as we have already indicated, is historical: until the twelfth century, the Categories is the medievals’ sole direct source for Aristotle’s views about relations. But part of the reason is more theoretical: in the Categories Aristotle develops a basic account of relations that is presupposed by his other discussions. Thus, even when some of these other discussions become available—discussions such as those in the Physics and Metaphysics—medieval philosophers continue to interpret them in light of their understanding of the Categories.

Aristotle’s discussion in the Categories influences the development of medieval views about relations in several discernible ways. First of all, it introduces the basic framework and terminology that comes to dominate all medieval theorizing about relations. Second, and perhaps most importantly, it articulates the main claims in response to which medieval philosophers develop their own views, including each of the following: (1) relations are the items that relate substances, (2) the items that relate substances are accidents, and (3) no substance is a relation.

Finally, the details of Aristotle’s discussion in the Categories, especially in chapter 7, give rise to a number of important medieval debates, as well as the traditional distinction between relations merely according to speech (relationes secundum dici) and relations according to being (relationes secundum esse). In order to understand the development of medieval views about relations, therefore, we must begin with some account of Aristotle’s discussion in the Categories.

2.1 Framework and Terminology of the Categories

Throughout the Categories Aristotle assumes that relations comprise one of the accidental categories, and hence that they must be understood as items inhering in particular substances. This helps to explain why, unlike contemporary philosophers, who speak of relations as holding between two or more things, Aristotle prefers to speak of them as inhering in one thing and somehow pointing toward (pros) another. Indeed, Aristotle’s preferred name for relations is just ‘things toward something’ (ta pros ti).

During the Middle Ages, it is customary for philosophers to refer to relations not only by Aristotle’s term, ‘toward something’ (or ad aliquid, the verbatim Latin equivalent of pros ti), but also by two others as well: ‘relative’ (relativum) and ‘relation’ (relatio). In the early Middle Ages, philosophers often move freely among these terms without paying much attention to their various senses.[7] Over time, however, they come to emphasize their differences, sometimes giving elaborate explanations as to why one must be regarded as more appropriate than the others. To give just one example, consider the following passage from Albert the Great:

Now the most general genus in the arrangement of this predicable is toward something (ad aliquid), or relative (relativum), or less properly speaking, relation (relatio), as some people say. But it must be recognized that the most general genus is signified most clearly by the name ‘toward something’, which is a preposition together with [the term] ‘something’ in [the accusative] case. For this name conveys the two things that are in a relative, namely: [i] diversity, which the preposition indicates through its taking an object (transitionem), and [ii] the direction of the comparison, which the accusative case indicates when something is called ‘toward something’. (Liber de praedicamentis, 225b.)

Whatever their disagreements about the appropriateness of these terms, it was generally agreed that the terms ‘toward something’ and ‘relative’ are related to the term ‘relation’ in the way that a concrete term (such as ‘white’) is related to its abstract counterpart (such as ‘whiteness’).

Since ‘relation’ is the term most familiar to us, in what follows we shall rely on it whenever possible. It is important to recognize, however, that the medievals introduce a host of other abstract terms more or less synonymous with ‘relation’ (relatio) but whose connotations they often regard as more informative than any of those discussed so far. A partial list of such terms includes:

  • ‘Comparison’ (comparatio), which has psychological overtones, and so is often (though not exclusively) used by conceptualists;
  • ‘Outward-looking-ness’ (respectus), which draws on a visual metaphor to suggest that relations are that in virtue of which a substance ‘looks out toward something’ (respicit ad aliquid);
  • ‘Disposition’ (habitudo) or ‘relative disposition’ (habitudo relativa), which suggests that relations account for the way a thing ‘holds itself toward something’ (se habere ad aliquid);
  • ‘Order’ (ordo), ‘ordering’ (ordinatio), and ‘directionality’ or ‘toward-ness’ (aditas), which are used to indicate that relations account for the order or structure we find in the world.[8]

Although Aristotle makes scattered remarks about relations throughout the Categories, it is only in chapter 7 that he singles them out for detailed independent consideration. Thus, in order to complete our survey of the relevant Aristotelian background, we need to consider briefly how this chapter was commonly understood by medieval philosophers.

2.2 Relations in Categories 7

Categories 7 opens rather abruptly with a definition of relations that Aristotle ultimately regards as unacceptable. According to this definition, which medieval philosophers attribute to Plato, relations are things “spoken of” in a certain way. Whether or not this definition is really Plato’s, it certainly appears to be well entrenched by Aristotle’s time, as is indicated by the fact that Aristotle says we are at least prepared to call something a relation just in case it satisfies the conditions specified by this definition:

We call the following sorts of things toward something: all those things said to be just what they are of or than something, or toward something in some other way (any other way whatsoever). Thus, what is larger is said to be what it is than another (it is said to be larger than something); and a double is said to be just what it is of another (it is said to be double of something); similarly with all other such cases. (Categories 7, 6a36–6b.)

As the medievals interpret it, this definition identifies relations in terms of the predicates by means of which they are signified. Medievals refer to the predicates in question as ‘relative terms’ (ad aliquid or relativa),[9] and understand them, roughly speaking, as those terms whose true predication requires a comparison to something other than the subject of which they are predicated. Thus, ‘taller’ (maius) counts as a relative term because when we assert of something that it is taller—that is, when we predicate the term ‘taller’ of it—we necessarily do so in comparison to something else. We don’t say merely that Simmias is taller; we say that he is taller than Socrates, or Theaetetus, or the average man. Similar remarks apply to ‘double’, as well as to all other relative terms. Borrowing on the medievals’ behalf the notation of first-order logic, we can make this characterization of relative terms precise by saying that a term F is relative just in case a predication of the form ‘Fx’ is more perspicuously represented as a predication of the form ‘Rxy’. (If a term is not relative, then the medievals say that it is absolute.)

The first or Platonic definition, therefore, characterizes relations as the items signified by relative terms—or what we would nowadays call ‘polyadic’ or ‘many-place predicates’. The medievals regard this characterization as initially promising, and often employ it in their writings. In the end, however, they think it must be rejected—or at least modified. For according to them, not everything we are prepared to call a relation actually is a relation. In rejecting the first or Platonic definition, the medievals take themselves to be following Aristotle himself, who rejects this definition on the grounds that it allows certain substances (namely, heads and hands) to qualify as relations. As Aristotle says later in chapter 7:

If the [first] definition of things toward something was adequately assigned, then it is exceedingly difficult, or impossible, to reach the conclusion that no substance is toward something. But if, on the other hand, it was not adequately assigned, and things toward something are rather [defined as] those things for which this is their very being: to be toward another in a certain way, then perhaps something may be said about the problem [of heads and hands]. (Categories 7, 8a29–35.)

Here Aristotle seems to be suggesting that some relative terms fail to signify genuine relations. Although terms such as ‘head’ and ‘hand’ clearly count as relative—since predications of the form ‘x is a head’ and ‘x is a hand’ are more perspicuously represented as of the form ‘x is a head of y’ and ‘x is a hand of y’—these terms signify parts of substances rather than relations. On the basis of these and other such examples, the medievals conclude that relations must be identified not with the items signified by relative terms, but rather with a proper subset of them.

Of course, this still leaves us with the question of how in general we are to distinguish genuine relations from the mere significata of relative terms. Here medieval philosophers think that Aristotle’s second definition—which we italicized in the passage quoted above—can be of some help. This definition, as it was commonly interpreted, highlights an important metaphysical or functional role that relations must play: in addition to being signified by relative terms, they are what actually serve to relate two (or more) things—or to put the point in slightly different terms, they are that in virtue of which such things are related. On this interpretation, Aristotle’s definition provides a clear explanation for why heads and hands fail to qualify as genuine relations. Although they are signified by relative terms, they do not relate anything. On the contrary, they are things standing in relations.

The distinction between what actually serves to relate things (i.e., genuine relations) and what merely stands in some relation (i.e., the relata of some relation) is often used by medieval philosophers to explain the difference between the two definitions in Categories 7. Whereas the first or Platonic definition includes both relations and relata (under relational descriptions), the second or Aristotelian definition includes only relations. This understanding of the difference between the two definitions provides the basis for a common medieval distinction between relations merely according to speech (relationes secundum dici) and relations according to being or nature (relations secundum esse). As Aquinas says, in a well-known passage of his Summa Theologiae:

Some relative terms—such as ‘master’ and ‘slave’, ‘father’ and ‘son’—are introduced to signify relative dispositions themselves (ipsas habitudines relativas); these terms express things relative secundum esse. But other relative terms—such as ‘mover’ and ‘moved’, ‘head’ and ‘headed’, and terms of this sort—are introduced to signify things on which certain relations follow; these terms express things relative secundum dici. (Summa Theologiae I, q. 13, a. 7, ad 1.)

Although medieval philosophers generally accept the distinction between relations secundum dici and relations secundum esse, and place heads and hands (and other body parts) in the former category, they sometimes disagree about the placement of certain other examples—most notably, knowledge and perception. Clearly, the names of these accidents are relative terms, since predications of the form ‘x is knowledge’ or ‘x is a perception’ are more perspicuously represented as of the form ‘x is knowledge of y’ and ‘x is a perception of y’. But should we characterize the accidents themselves as genuine relations (i.e., relations secundum esse)? Or should we rather say that they are qualities on which certain relations follow (i.e., relations secundum esse dici)? Near the end of Categories 7, Aristotle suggests an epistemic criterion that promises to resolve these questions. But because the criterion itself is difficult to understand, and there is no clear alternative to it, debate about these sorts of examples continues throughout the Middle Ages.

Categories 7 ends almost as abruptly as it began. Having defended his own preferred definition of relations, Aristotle leaves us with the following cautionary remarks:

It is perhaps hard to make firm statements on such questions without having examined them many times. Still, to have gone through the various difficulties is not unprofitable. (Categories 7, 8b22–24.)

Boethius, whose Latin translation is responsible for transmitting these words to the Middle Ages, takes Aristotle’s remarks here to be inviting further refinements and improvements on his own account:

Aristotle would never have said this if he were not prompting us to further reflection and to even greater exercise of subtlety. Because of his exhortation, we shall not hesitate in the least to raise [further] questions and offer [our own] solutions to them in other places. (In Categorias Aristotelis, 238.)

Like Boethius, medieval philosophers are happy to take up this invitation—and, indeed, as we shall see, to develop Aristotle’s account of relations in some striking and original ways of their own.

3. Relations in Medieval Philosophy

As we have seen, Aristotle begins his discussion of relations in the Categories with the assumption that relations are a certain type of accident, and then inquires after their proper characterization, eventually arriving at the view that they are a proper subset of the entities signified by relative terms—namely, all and only those that actually serve to relate two or more things. Medieval philosophers tend to reverse Aristotle’s approach, beginning where he ends. That is to say, they tend to start their discussion with the view that relations are entities that are both signified by relative terms and play a certain metaphysical role, and then proceed to ask about the precise nature and ontological status of these entities—in particular whether they must, in every case, be identified with Aristotelian accidents. There are at least two reasons for this reversal. First, the medievals see nothing in Aristotle’s preferred characterization of relations that requires relations to be accidents (or indeed, entities of any ontological type). Second, and perhaps more importantly, the medievals think that there are certain situations that require relations to be something other than accidents (more on this in Section 5 below).

3.1 The Rejection of Polyadic Properties

Although medieval philosophers generally regard Aristotle’s characterization of relations as ontologically neutral, there is one type of entity they standardly assume that relations could never be—namely, polyadic or many-place properties. For all their differences, the medievals tend to agree on the following point: polyadic properties cannot exist outside the mind.

Historians of philosophy sometimes speak as if the medievals could not even have possessed the concept of a polyadic property—as if conceiving of relations in this way only became possible in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries, with the advent of a formal logic of relations and multiple quantification (cf. Weinberg 1965, esp. 61–63). But this is surely mistaken. What such advances in logic made possible is not the concept of a polyadic property, but merely its representation within a formal system. Moreover, as we have already seen, the notion of a polyadic predicate, from which our own concept of a polyadic property is derived, corresponds exactly to the medieval notion of a relative term. And if that by itself weren’t enough, there is the fact that medievals habitually speak of relations in polyadic terms, explicitly comparing them to a road that runs between two cities (via), or to a palisade running between two watchtowers (inter-vallum) (cf., e.g., Albert the Great, Liber de praedicamentis, 241a-241b and Aquinas Summa Theologiae I, q. 28, a. 4, obj. 5). Nor do they take themselves to be original in this regard. On the contrary, they take themselves merely to be following a suggestion of Aristotle’s in the Physics, which itself just appears to be part-and-parcel of the common sense conception of relations (see Physics III, 202b11–15). As Peter Aurieol says at one point:

In the third book of his commentary on the Physics, comment twenty, the Commentator [=Averroes] says that a relation is a disposition (dispositio) existing between two things. But even apart from him it is clear that fatherhood is conceived of as if it were a kind of medium connecting a father with his son. And the same is true of other relations. (Scriptum super Primum Sententiarum, fols. 318va-b. See Henninger 1989, 153–4, n. 12, for the Latin text.)

In light of passages such as these, it is hard to take seriously the suggestion that the medievals—or indeed, any reflective beings—lack the concept of a polyadic property.

In addition to possessing this concept, there is evidence that at least some medieval philosophers also posit the existence of polyadic properties. In an important paper, Heine Hansen has argued that this is certainly true in the case of the thirteenth-century philosopher, Nicholas of Paris. (See Hansen 2012.) And further research may well turn up other medieval philosophers holding the same view. At present, however, Nicholas appears to be something of an anomolous case.[10]

Indeed, despite possessing the concept of a polyadic property, medieval philosophers are often explicit in their denial of anything in extramental reality exactly corresponding to such a concept. If we return to the passage just quoted from Auriol, we can see that, immediately after describing relations as a sort of ‘interval’ (intervallum), he proceeds to deny the existence of any such intervals in extramental reality.

It appears that a single thing, which must be imagined as some sort of interval (intervallum) existing between two things, cannot exist in extramental reality, but only in the intellect. [This appears to be the case] not only because nature does not produce such intervals, but also because a medium or interval of this sort does not appear to be in either of the two things [it relates] as in a subject, but rather between them where it is clear that there is nothing which can serve as its subject. (Scriptum super Primum Sententiarum, fols. 318va-b.)

As this passage helps to make clear, the root of the standard medieval objection to polyadic properties is ontological in nature, stemming from a particular conception of subjects and attributes. Following Aristotle, the medievals divide extramental beings into substances and accidents, a division which they take to be both exclusive and exhaustive (since it is given in terms of a contradictory pair of properties, namely, being in a subject vs. not being in a subject) (Cf. Categories 1, 1a20–1b6). Now in the case of substances, it is perhaps clear that they are not polyadic in nature. But medievals typically think the same is also true of their accidents. Thus, as Aquinas says at one point in his Sentences commentary, in response to the question whether it is possible for “numerically one and the same relation” to belong to belong to two subjects at a time: “No, this cannot be, for one accident cannot belong to two subjects” (In Sent. I, d. 27, q. 1, a. 1, ad 2).

Although the medievals’ objection to polyadic properties stems in large part from ontological considerations, they also offer other reasons for rejecting them. Sometimes these involve considerations of theoretical parsimony. As Ockham is so fond of saying: “It is futile to do with more [entities] what can be done with fewer”.[11] Other times, however, these reasons involve phenomenological or epistemological considerations. Albert the Great, for example, objects to polyadic properties on the grounds that we are not presented in experience with anything but individuals and their so-called absolute attributes—that is, substances and their quantities and qualities.[12]

3.2 Anti-Realism about Relations

The rejection of polyadic properties might seem to commit medievals to a form of anti-realism about relations—that is, to the view that relations exist only in the mind. This was, in fact, the position of Peter Auriol. If there are no polyadic properties or ‘intervals’, he assumes, then there is nothing in extramental reality to correspond to our relational concepts. But in that case, he says, “a relation cannot be posited except in apprehension alone”.[13]

Given the current state of medieval research, it is difficult to know how widespread this (or any other) form of anti-realism was during the Middle Ages. Shortly after Auriol’s death, certain aspects of his anti-realism appear to have met with considerable success. Ockham and his followers, for example, accept Auriol’s view that relations exist only in the mind as concepts or beings of reason (entia rationis), though unlike Auriol, as we shall see, they think this is compatible with saying that things are related independently of the activity of the mind. And we can find echoes of the same sort of view in the writings of early modern philosophers.[14]

Prior to the fourteenth century, however, it is difficult to identify any unambiguous representatives of anti-realism, at least in the Latin West.[15] Albert the Great claims to find something akin to Auriol’s argument in the writings of Alfarabi (d. 950) and Avicenna (d. 1037), but he does not say whether either of these figures actually endorses it or merely presents it for consideration (See Liber de praedicamentis, 222b-223a). Again, Aquinas suggests that a similar view can be found in the writings of Gilbert of Poitiers and his followers, the so-called Porretani, but his suggestion is controversial, and in any case Aquinas reports that Gilbert later retracted the view in the face of theological controversy (Cf. Summa Theologiae I, q. 28, a. 2, corpus; cf. also Veckley 1965, 28–9). Unless further research alters the current picture, therefore, it would appear that, although anti-realism may have had something of a foothold in the Arabic speaking world, most notably among the members of a group of orthodox Muslim theologians known as the Mutakallimūn, in its more radical forms it was always a minority position in the Latin West.[16]

3.3 Realism without Polyadic Properties

If we take anti-realism to be the view that (a) nothing in extramental reality corresponds to our relational concepts and (b) nothing is related independently of the activity of the mind, it is not hard to see why most medieval philosophers would reject it. Like most of us, they recognize the utter implausibility of saying that facts like Simmias’s being taller than Socrates are somehow dependent on the activity of the mind.[17] Indeed, as they often point out, this sort of anti-realism is inconsistent with even such basic facts as the real structure of the universe, the existence of real composition, causality, spatial proximity, or even the objectivity of mathematical knowledge. Speaking for the majority, Ockham says in his Ordinatio:

The intellect does nothing to bring it about that the universe is one, or that a whole is composed [of its parts], or that causes in spatial proximity [to patients actually] cause [their effects], or that a triangle has three [angles], etc. … any more than [the intellect] brings it about that Socrates is white or that fire is hot or water cold. (Ordinatio I, d. 30, q. 1 in Opera Theologica iv, 316–317. Cf. also Scotus, Ordinatio II, d. 1, q. 5, n. 224 in Opera Omnia; Aquinas, De potentia, q. 7, a. 9.)

In addition to such common sense considerations, the medievals also identify various philosophical and theological grounds for opposing anti-realism about relations. Here we shall mention just two. First, it is hard to see how such anti-realism is to be squared with the standard interpretation of the Aristotelian categories. “For nothing is placed in a category” as Aquinas says “unless it is something existing outside the soul” (De potentia, q. 7, a. 9). Again, this sort of anti-realism seems incompatible with the orthodox Christian view of the Trinity. Indeed, it is precisely for this reason that the existence of real relations in God is affirmed at the Council of Rheims in 1148, and that shortly thereafter it becomes customary to say that the denial of this entails a form of heresy known as Sabellianism (Cf., e.g., Aquinas, Summa Theologiae I, q. 28, a. 1 and De potentia q. 8, a.1).

But of course, all of this raises a question. How is it that medieval philosophers maintain a form of realism about relations while at the time rejecting the existence of polyadic properties? In particular, what do they say about arguments such as Auriol’s, which in effect deny the coherence of realism without polyadic properties? Here it is useful to consider the work of Albert the Great. Although he writes a generation before Auriol, he explicitly addresses this sort of argument, and the reply he offers appears to be perfectly standard.

According to Albert, the problem with arguments of the sort Auriol gives is that they rely on a questionable assumption, namely: if there are no real polyadic forms or properties, then there is nothing in extramental reality to correspond to our relational concepts. This assumption would be true, he suggests, if our conceptual framework displayed an exact isomorphism to the structure of the world. But it does not, and hence there is no reason in principle why a polyadic concept cannot have something non-polyadic corresponding to it.[18] In making this sort of reply, Albert aligns himself with a medieval tradition of rejecting the view that for every distinct type of concept there is a distinct type of entity. This view is often associated in medieval philosophy with Plato and his followers, and by the time of Ockham it is regarded, somewhat hyperbolically, as the source or root (radix) of the greatest errors in philosophy. “To multiply beings according to the multiplicity of terms” Ockham says “is erroneous and leads far away from the truth” (Summa Logica I, c. 51 in Opera Philosophica i, 171; cf. Loux, 1974, 171).

For most medieval philosophers, then, the question is not whether there are any things in extramental reality corresponding to our relational concepts, but what these things are like in themselves. Having ruled out the possibility of their being polyadic, however, the medievals don’t leave themselves with many options. Indeed, because they accept a broadly Aristotelian ontology, they have no choice but to identify relations with either individual substances or their monadic properties.

As we noted earlier, philosophers throughout the medieval period are attracted to the view suggested by Aristotle’s Categories that relations (or the items corresponding to our relational concepts) are accidents. Of course, as we also noted, the medievals cannot take this view to be perfectly general, since they also admit cases, especially theological ones, which involve relations but no accidents. But even so, until the fourteenth century, this view is taken to apply so widely that it functions as a kind of paradigm for thinking about relational situations. Thus, if a predication of the form ‘aRb’ is true, it is generally assumed that what makes it true is a pair of individuals, a and b, and a pair of accidents, F and G. As we shall see in the next section, it is within the context of this paradigmatic analysis of relational situations that one of the most hotly disputed and intractable debates of all the Middle Ages arises.

4. Paradigmatic Relational Situations

In his commentary on the Categories, Boethius highlights an interesting feature of Aristotle’s discussion of relations. Whenever Aristotle refers to the category of relations, he always does so in the plural (‘things toward something’), thereby departing from his usual practice of referring to categories in the singular (‘substance’, ‘quantity’, ‘quality’, etc.). This certainly reinforces the paradigmatic analysis of relational situations, which requires relations to come in pairs. But Boethius thinks there is a further reason why Aristotle refers to the category in this way—namely, because its members are unique in that they cannot be understood to exist by themselves:

Things toward something [or relations] cannot be grasped by the intellect by themselves or individually, so that we could say that things toward something exist individually. Whatever is known regarding the nature of a relation must be considered together with something else. For example, when I speak of a master, this by itself means nothing if there is no slave. The naming of one relative immediately brings with it another thing toward something. (In Categorias Aristotelis, 217.)

Following Boethius, medieval philosophers often take Aristotle’s use of the plural to indicate that the category of relations must be at least conceived of as containing pairs of correlatives or converse relational accidents (see, e.g., Abelard, Logica ‘ingredientibus’, 80–95; and Albert the Great, Liber de praedicamentis, 22). As we shall see, this point becomes important for their understanding of those relational situations that do not conform to the paradigm analysis of the Categories.

For now, however, let us focus on the those relational situations that do conform to the paradigm. As the medievals recognize, there are a number of questions that can be raised about the relations they involve—call them ‘paradigmatic relations’. What sort of monadic properties or accidents are they, and how are we to understand them? As it turns out, there are only two main positions one can take. For convenience, we shall refer to them, respectively, as ‘reductive realism’ and ‘non-reductive realism’.

According to reductive realism, which is the simplest or most ontologically parsimonious form of realism without polyadic properties, paradigmatic relations are to be identified with ordinary, non-relational accidents. Thus, if Simmias is taller than Socrates, this is to be explained by their respective heights, which fall under the category of quantity. Again, if Socrates is similar (say, in color) to Theaetetus, this is to be explained by Socrates’s and Theaetetus’s particular colors, which fall under the category of quality. And so on for other paradigmatic relations.

According to non-reductive realism, by contrast, paradigmatic relations are to be identified not with ordinary, non-relational accidents, but rather with accidents of a sui generis type. Thus, if Simmias is taller than Socrates, this is to be explained by appealing to a pair of sui generis accidents that are distinct from, but nonetheless necessitated by, Simmias’s and Socrates’s heights. Again, Socrates’s similarity to Theaetetus is to be explained not by their respective colors, but by a pair of sui generis accidents necessitated by them. And so on for the relations involved in other paradigmatic relational situations.

In the medieval discussion of relations, it is this difference—the difference between reductive and non-reductive realism—that constitutes the greatest divide among philosophers, and representatives of both positions can be found throughout the medieval period. Peter Abelard (d. 1142) and Albert the Great (d. 1280) are, perhaps, the clearest representatives of reductive and non-reductive realism, respectively, in the early and high Middle Ages, whereas William Ockham (d. 1347) and John Duns Scotus (d. 1308) are well-known representatives of these positions in the later Middle Ages. Again, some philosophers appear to have held different positions at different stages of their career. Henry Harclay (d. 1317), for example, began his career as a staunch defender of Scotus’s non-reductive realism, but by the end of it gravitated towards a position that is much closer to, and in many ways anticipates, Ockham’s specific form of reductive realism.[19]

Beginning in the mid-thirteenth century, the debate between reductive and non-reductive realists is often carried out in the context of the discussion whether relations are identical to their foundations. (This is the context, for example, in which Scotus and Ockham develop their positions.) By the mid-thirteenth century, moreover, it is customary to admit at least a conceptual distinction between relations and the non-relational accidents in virtue of which these relations hold. The relevant non-relational accidents come to be referred to as the ‘grounds’ or ‘foundations’ of relations (fundamenta), since their possession is thought to necessitate the holding of relations. Hence, in this context, the important question is whether the distinction between relations and their foundations is merely conceptual.

We might expect that reductive realists would always answer this question in the affirmative, whereas non-reductive realists would always answer it in the negative. It turns out, however, this is not the case. For reasons to be explained below, there are some reductive realists who, in spite of rejecting that relations comprise a sui generis type of monadic property, nonetheless maintain that relations are in an important sense really distinct from their foundations. In light of this complication, we shall continue to cast the medieval debate about the nature of paradigmatic relations in terms of reductive and non-reductive realism rather than in terms of the identity or real distinctness of relations and their foundations.

4.1 Reductive Realism without Polyadic Properties

As mentioned above, on the simplest or most ontologically parsimonious form of realism without polyadic properties, what we are calling ‘reductive realism’, paradigmatic relations are identified with ordinary, non-relational monadic properties or accidents. Now we might expect this form of realism to appeal to anyone committed to realism without polyadic properties. After all, failure to reduce such relations to such accidents threatens to make them mysterious. If paradigmatic relations are monadic properties, but not ordinary, non-relational accidents, then how are we to understand them?

Considerations of intelligibility certainly play a role in the debate between medieval reductive and non-reductive realists. As we shall see, non-reductive realists typically recognize that the chief difficulty for their view lies in specifying the precise nature of the sui generis monadic properties to which they appeal. More often than not, however, reductive realists object to non-reductivists on grounds of theoretical parsimony. This is certainly true in the case of Abelard and Ockham, whom we earlier identified as reductive realists. In the case of Abelard, such considerations are not explicitly formulated, though they are part-and-parcel of his general approach to metaphysics and philosophy of language.[20] In the case of Ockham, by contrast, the appeal to parsimony is much more explicit, often taking the form of what has come to be known as Ockham’s razor: “Plurality should not be assumed without necessity” (Ordinatio I, d. 30, q. 2 in Opera Theologica iv, 322).

Another consideration that plays an important role in the debate between reductive and non-reductive realists has to do with the proper interpretation of authoritative texts. Since medieval philosophers develop their theories of relations in the course of reflecting on Aristotle’s Categories, they often present their views as the one actually suggested (or even required) by the text itself. Abelard, for example, suggests that his reductive theory is a direct consequence of Aristotle’s second definition of relations. Thus, when Aristotle characterizes relations in Categories 7 as “those things for which this is their very being: being toward something in a certain way,” Abelard argues that this should be interpreted to mean that relations are items that make other things to be relatives. Just as certain attributes (say, being red, juicy, and sweet) make their subjects good, so too, he suggests, certain accidents (such as being-six-feet-tall and five-feet-ten) relate their subjects (See Logica ‘ingredientibus’, 216–17. For further discussion, see Brower 1998).

Textual considerations and direct appeals to Aristotle’s authority play a much bigger role in early medieval debates than they do in the high and later Middle Ages, when literal commentary was no longer the dominant form of philosophical literature. Nonetheless, these sorts of considerations continue to be important throughout the Middle Ages. Even Ockham, in his Summa logicae, addresses the issue of whether Aristotle should be interpreted as holding some form of non-reductive realism:

There are many theologians of this opinion, and at one time even I believed it to have been Aristotle’s opinion. Now, however, it seems to me that the contrary opinion follows from his principles. (Summa logicae I, c. 49 in Opera Philosophica i, 154. Cf. Henninger 1989, 120.)

One final argument used by reductive realists to motivate their position is worth mentioning here. This argument has to do with the nature of relational change. Almost all medievals accept the intuitively plausible view that things can acquire (and lose) relations without undergoing any real (as opposed to merely Cambridge) change. Thus, Socrates can come to be shorter than Simmias solely in virtue of a change in Simmias’s height.[21] As reductive realists such as Ockham often point out, this fact about relational change admits of a ready explanation on their position, since Socrates’s relation is nothing over and above Simmias’s and Socrates’s heights, the latter of which never changes. By contrast, the same fact appears to pose a serious challenge for the non-reductive realist. For if Socrates’s relation is something distinct from Simmias’s and Socrates’s heights, then apparently Socrates must acquire something new when Simmias’s height increases. But then, contrary to the original intuition, the non-reductive realist must say that Socrates undergoes a real change after all.

These considerations are not the only ones that reductive realists appeal to, but they are among the most important for understanding their position, and we shall rely on them in what follows to motivate and clarify the alternative position of the non-reductive realists.[22]

Before leaving the topic of reductive realism, we need to take account of a slight complication. In our discussion to this point, we have been speaking as if reductive realists always intend to identify individual paradigmatic relations such as tallness or shortness with pairs of monadic properties taken jointly. We have done this because, at least initially, this seems to be the most natural way to understand their position. After all, it is not Simmias’s height taken by itself that necessitates his being taller than anyone; it is only his height taken together with that of another, say, Socrates. And yet, despite the naturalness of this way of construing reductive realism, it is not the way its proponents typically understand it.[23] On the contrary, instead of identifying relations such as tallness or shortness with pairs of monadic properties taken jointly, reductive realists typically identify them with the individual members of such pairs. Thus, if Simmias is taller than Socrates, it is only Simmias’s height that is identified with Simmias’s tallness (and hence said to correspond to the concept ‘taller than’), whereas Socrates’s height is identified with Socrates’s shortness (and hence said to correspond to the concept ‘shorter than’). But how is this possible, especially if the properties in question are supposed to be just ordinary heights?

Reductive realists recognize the worry here, as well as the initial attraction of identifying relations with pairs of accidents taken jointly. As evidence, consider the following passage from one of Henry Harclay’s later works. Here Henry not only entertains the suggestion that relations could be identified with pairs of monadic properties, but draws on a common medieval view about number to make it plausible:

A relation is clearly a reality distinct from one foundation, but not a reality distinct from both foundations. For when one white thing [such as Simmias] is posited and then another white thing [such as Socrates] is posited, there is a relation beginning at that point. Thus, the similarity is not a [single] whiteness, but two whitenesses existing at once. Indeed, the two whitenesses can be sufficient to constitute a single species in the genus of relation. Just as two discrete unities of whatever magnitude are sufficient for producing a single species of number, so too the same thing holds for the case at hand. Again, just as plurality or multitude is not a reality different from the constituents of the plurality or multitude, neither is the similarity [of the white things] different [from their whitenesses]. (“Utrum Dei,” n. 46)[24]

Despite Henry’s attraction to this sort of view, he feels compelled to reject it on the grounds that it leads to certain absurdities. Drawing on Avicenna for support, he says:

Avicenna argues against this on the basis of relations involving inferiority and superiority, for it is clearer in those cases than it is for other relations, such as those involving equals. For fatherhood is in the father alone and not in the son … and the same thing holds of sonship. Therefore one must hold that there are two relations [here]. And in this case it is clear that the relation is not the same reality as [the two] foundations because the relation is not in everything in which the foundation of the relatum is. This is the case, too, for relations involving equals, even if it is not as clear. (“Utrum Dei,” n. 46)

Henry’s worry here can be expressed as follows. If a relation such as fatherhood is identified with a pair of accidents, then it will follow that fatherhood is partly in the son (since the pair is such that one of its members is in the son). But this is absurd. Fatherhood is an asymmetrical relation (or as Harclay prefers to put it, a relation involving superiority and inferiority). That is to say, fatherhood is such that if an individual a has it in respect of another individual, b, then b cannot have fatherhood in respect of a. But according to Harclay, this is tantamount to saying that “fatherhood is in the father alone and not in the son”. And of course he doesn’t think the point is restricted to fatherhood. On the contrary, it also holds true of all relations, including symmetrical relations or “those involving equals, even if it is not as clear” (“Utrum Dei,” n. 47).

But if relations are not to be identified with pairs of accidents, how can reductive realists think of them in terms of ordinary, non-relational accidents? After all, the only other option seems to be identifying them with ordinary accidents taken individually—which as we have seen is problematic. An ordinary accident such as Simmias’s height cannot necessitate Simmias’s being taller than anyone. Indeed, it was precisely this point that led us to conclude that ‘relative-making’ is a description best reserved for pairs of accidents taken jointly.

Note, however, that it is open to the reductive realist to respond by saying that, although Simmias’s height is not by itself relative-making, it is nonetheless potentially relative-making. In that case, however, the reductive realist can insist that in the presence of another height, such as Socrates’s, it becomes actually relative-making—that is to say, it comes actually to relate Simmias to Socrates. This suggests a third option for reductive realists: to maintain that relations are to be identified with ordinary, non-relational accidents in certain circumstances.

In fact, it is this last sort of view that most reductive realists during the medieval period actually hold. Indeed, as we are interpreting Harclay, this is precisely the view he goes on to develop in the discussion we have been following.[25] Simmias’s being taller than Socrates is to be identified, on his view, not with Simmias’s height tout court, but with Simmias’s height in certain circumstances—including the circumstance that Socrates is five-feet-ten.[26] To put Harclay’s view in a slightly different way, which will help to bring out its semantic consequences, we might say that in a world in which Simmias exists by himself a predication of the form ‘Simmias is taller than Socrates’ will be false, and hence nothing will correspond to the relational term ‘taller than’. But in a world in which Simmias is six-feet-tall while Socrates is five-feet-ten, a predication of the same form will be true, and in this world there will be something corresponding to ‘taller’, namely, Simmias’s height. In such a world, medieval philosophers would say that ‘taller’ primarily signifies Simmias’s height, but indirectly signifies or connotes the height of Socrates.[27]

As it turns out, it is not only reductive realists, but non-reductive realists as well that speak of relations as accidents of single subjects—that is, of Simmias’s tallness as something belonging only to him, of Socrates’s shortness as something belonging only to him, and so on for all other particular relations. In light of what has just been said, therefore, we can clarify our understanding of the paradigmatic analysis of relational situations. As indicated earlier, this analysis requires that when a predication of the form ‘aRb’ is true, what makes it true is a pair of individuals, a and b, and a pair of monadic properties or accidents, F and G. Reductive realists, as we have just seen, identify F and G with ordinary categorial accidents, whereas non-reductive realists identify them with accidents of sui generis type. But however we construe the nature of these accidents, both reductive and non-reductive realists deny that it is the pair of accidents—that is, F and G taken jointly—that corresponds to our relational concepts. On the contrary, they say, F directly corresponds to one of our relational concepts, whereas G directly corresponds to its converse. Thus, when Simmias is taller than Socrates, reductivists and non-reductivists are agreed that it is an accident of Simmias that directly corresponds to (or as they would prefer to say, is primarily signified by) the concept ‘taller than’, and an accident of Socrates that is primarily signified by the concept ‘shorter than’. To the extent they disagree, therefore, their disagreement concerns only whether the accidents primarily signified by relational concepts can also be signified by ordinary non-relational concepts (and if so, precisely how and under what circumstances).

With these clarifications in mind, let us turn now to the considerations that led some medieval philosophers to reject reductive realism in favor of some form of non-reductivism.

4.2 Non-Reductive Realism without Polyadic Properties

Of all the considerations favoring non-reductive realism, perhaps none is more compelling than the intuition that relations have a different nature or “quiddity” from that of ordinary categorial accidents. As we have seen, medieval philosophers recognize that predications involving relative terms (such as ‘x is taller’) are incomplete in a way that monadic or absolute predications (such as ‘x is white’) are not. They also recognize, moreover, that unlike absolute terms relative terms come in pairs or sets. Every relative term has a correlative, and the meaning of the one (say, ‘taller’) cannot be understood in isolation from the meaning of the other (‘shorter’). These facts about relative terms and predication are often thought to show that their significata have a distinct nature or quiddity from the ordinary, absolute accidents that serve as their foundations. Here again it is useful to quote Harclay:

Avicenna (Metaphysics III, the chapter on relation) says that a relation has its own quiddity distinct from the quiddity of its foundation. Therefore it is a distinct reality. Moreover, in the Categories Aristotle says that the being associated with relatives is being-toward-something-else (ad aliud se habere). But it is not the case that the being of a foundation is being-toward-something-else. Therefore they are not the same. (“Utrum Dei,” n. 43.)

Reductive realists can, of course, explain the uniqueness of relative terms and predications without introducing relations over and above their foundations. For they can always (a) assert that relative terms are associated with concepts whose content is distinct from that of any non-relational or absolute concepts, and yet (b) insist that this is all that is required to explain the peculiar nature of relative terms and predications. Even so, the question remains: If Simmias’s being taller than Socrates is nothing ontologically over and above Simmias’s and Socrates’s heights, why do we represent it as if it were? At this point, it would seem that reductive realists have no choice but to appeal to our psychological make-up. We simply do (or at least can) represent one and the same situation in two very different ways. As Ockham says in one of his Quodlibetal questions, using a slightly different example:

Socrates is similar to Plato by the very fact that Socrates is white and Plato is white … Yet, despite this, the intellect can express these many absolute things by means of concepts in diverse ways: in one way, by means of an absolute concept, as when one says simply ‘Socrates is white’ or ‘Plato is white’; in a second way, by means of a relative concept, as when one says ‘Socrates is similar to Plato with respect to whiteness’. (Quodl. VI, q. 25 in Opera Theologica ix, 679.)

Even if one does not find this sort of appeal to psychology implausible, the non-reductive realists would seem to have a more satisfying reply to our original question. For they can say that the reason we represent relational situations as distinct from non-relational situation is because they are distinct. Indeed, non-reductive realists can add that the logical incompleteness of predicates such as ‘taller’ (and its correlative, ‘shorter’) calls our attention to precisely what makes these situations distinct—namely, the sui generis accidents that are possessed by Simmias and Socrates in addition to their respective heights.

Now as most non-reductive realists recognize, there is a difficulty posed by their position—namely, that of giving a perspicuous account of the nature of paradigmatic relations or relational accidents. But they often attribute this difficulty to the fact that the nature in question is sui generis. As Albert the Great says, when he turns to the discussion of relations in his commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics:

It is difficult for us to speak about [the category of] toward something or relation because it has a nature and being altogether different from the genera of being which have been considered so far [namely, substance, quantity, and quality]. (Metaphysica, 266a.)

Given that non-reductivists construe the nature of paradigmatic relations as sui generis, it is not surprising that they feel the need to resort to metaphors to describe it. Albert himself appeals most often to a visual metaphor of outward-looking-ness (respectus), and describes individual relations as that in virtue of which a subject “looks out toward another” (respicit ad aliud). Other philosophers, rely on other metaphors and variously describe the nature of relations as a kind of directionality or toward-ness (aditas), as a type of disposition or way of holding oneself (habitudo or relativa habitudo), or again as the source or principle of structure and order (ordinatio).[28]

Of all these metaphors, the ones involving directionality—or intentionality—are likely to be the most helpful to us. For there are contemporary philosophers who characterize intentionality, not in terms of a polyadic or many-place property, but as a sui generis type of monadic property.[29] According to these philosophers, intentionality is a property whose intrinsic nature is such that, when it is exemplified by a subject in appropriate circumstances, which include the presence of an appropriate object, it relates its subject to the object in question—in particular, it relates the subject to it as thinker to object thought. This analogy is useful because non-reductive realists typically regard intentionality as a special case (or type) of relation. According to them, all paradigmatic relations (or at least all those that qualify as sui generis accidents) are properties whose intrinsic nature is such that their exemplification in the appropriate circumstances will relate their subjects to something else. It is just that in certain cases, these properties relate their subjects specifically as thinkers to objects thought.

In the end, therefore, it would appear that the non-reductive realists do have something to say in response to the reductivists’ worries about the mysterious nature of relations and their appeals to considerations of theoretical parsimony. But what about the phenomenon of relational change?

As we said earlier, medieval philosophers share the intuition that the acquisition (or loss) of relations can occur without any real change on the part of their subject. To explain this intuition, some non-reductivists think it is enough to say that a relation can be acquired (or lost) without its subject undergoing any real change with respect to its absolute accidents. Thus, the example of Socrates’s coming to be shorter than Simmias is sometimes glossed by saying that, with respect to absolute accidents, it is true that Socrates comes to be shorter than Simmias solely in virtue of a real change in Simmias. Nonetheless, if we consider Socrates’s relative accidents as well, such non-reductivists will say that Socrates has, in fact, undergone a real ‘relative’ change—that is, a real change with respect to one of his relations. [30]

But non-reductivists need not take this line. Some, more sympathetic to the reductive realist position on relational change, take cases like that involving Simmias and Socrates as an opportunity to further clarify the nature of relations. Albert the Great, for example, argues that relational accidents are so closely tied to their foundations that they are acquired along with them (cf. Metaphysica, 266b-267a, ad 1 and Brower 2001). Thus, if Socrates comes into existence in a world all by himself at a height of five-feet-ten-inches-tall, not only will he possess a certain quantity (namely, his height), but also, in virtue of it, he will possess a sui generis relational accident. Obviously, in such a world, the relational accident will not actually relate Socrates to anyone or anything (since there’s nothing for it to relate him to)—though it will explain his being potentially related to other things. Suppose, however, that Simmias now comes into existence in this world at six-feet-tall. In that case, Socrates’s relational accident will come actually to relate him to Simmias as shorter. Even so, Albert insists, Socrates himself will not have undergone any real change, relative or absolute. Not surprisingly these sorts of consideration lead Albert to distinguish sharply between relational accidents and relations (which are just relational accidents in certain circumstances), and to suggest that strictly speaking we should think of the relevant Aristotelian category as comprised, not of relations, but of relational accidents. These same considerations also help to explain why, in referring to the members of this category, Albert prefers the concrete terms ‘toward something’ (ad aliquid) and ‘relative’ (relativum) to the abstract term ‘relation’ (relatio)—for relational accidents are ‘toward something’ or outwardly directed even if they are not actually relating their subject to anything. (Metaphysica, 267a, ad. 3.)[31]

Like Albert, Aquinas too suggests that there is a close connection between relational accidents and their foundations. Following Albert’s terminology, he suggests that in virtue of possessing a specific height or quantity, an individual such as Socrates is potentially equal to all those who have the same height, and potentially unequal to—that is, potentially shorter or taller than—all those with a different height (In V Phys., lect. 3, n. 8). Like Albert, moreover, Aquinas says that such an individual can come to be actually equal (or unequal) to another solely in virtue of a change in that other, and concludes from this that relations must be in their foundations as in a root (in radice) (In V Phys., lect. 3, n. 8). On some interpretations, Aquinas’s metaphor can be explicated by saying that although relations and their foundations differ formally—that is, involve different accidental forms or properties—nonetheless their act of being (esse) is the same. Thus, when Socrates comes to be shorter than Simmias as a result of Simmias’s growth, Socrates does not undergo a change properly speaking, since he does not acquire any new act of being. Rather, the “old” act of being of his height (sometimes referred to as the ‘esse-in’ of the relation) merely acquires a new determination (sometimes referred to as the ‘esse-ad’ of the relation), in this case to Simmias.[32]

We have seen enough to appreciate the main ontological differences that divide reductive and non-reductive realists, and even some of the differences that divide non-reductivists among themselves. As we indicated earlier, in the later Middle Ages these differences tend to emerge in the context of the debate over whether relations are identical with their foundations. As we also indicated, however, we have to be careful not to assume that how philosophers answer this question provides an infallible guide to their positions. For although reductivists typically affirm that relations are identical to their foundations, and non-reductivists typically deny it, there are some reductivists who side, at least verbally, with the non-reductivists on this question. Thus, the later Harclay, as we are interpreting him, is a reductive realist—he not only rejects the existence of sui generis relational properties, but maintains that in paradigmatic relational situations, substances are related by their ordinary, non-relational accidents. Nonetheless, Harclay denies that relations are identical with their foundations, since he thinks this would amount to saying that relations can be straightforwardly identified either with ordinary accidents taken by themselves or with pairs of such accidents taken jointly.

Again, as we shall point out in the next section, a number of later medieval reductivists, including Ockham, eventually come to reject the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations as items that relate substances in favor of the view that relations are items existing only in the mind (as concepts). As we shall see, this does not mean that Ockham and others deny that there are extramental grounds for our relational concepts or even that things can be related by their foundations independently of the mind. On the contrary, it means only that, unlike their predecessors, they refuse to call anything a relation merely because it grounds a relational concept. The fact that these reductivists regard relations as concepts, however, explains why they too are unwilling to identity relations with their foundations: for the relevant foundations, according to these philosophers, are ordinary, extramental accidents, and obviously no concept (or act of the mind) could be identical with them.

Finally, it must be noted that even the notions of identity and real distinction come to be the subject of controversy during the high and later Middle Ages, and this too has the result of complicating the debate over whether relations are identical to their foundations.[33] For all these reasons, therefore, we must be careful not to identify too closely the debate between reductive and non-reductive realists with the debate over whether relations are identical to their foundations.

5. Non-Paradigmatic Relational Situations

So far we have been focusing only on the medieval discussion of paradigmatic relational situations—that is, relational situations conforming to the analysis suggested in Aristotle’s Categories. But as we indicated earlier, it is clear from some of Aristotle’s later works, most notably the Metaphysics, that he thinks not all relational situations can be made to conform to it. Thus, in Metaphysics V, he suggests that there are some relational situations in which substances are related, not by a pair of accidents, but by a single accident belonging to just one of them. Here he cites the example of intentional relations: if Simmias is thinking about Socrates, this is to be explained in terms of nothing but Simmias, Socrates, and an accident of Simmias. For the sake of convenience, we shall hereafter refer to relational situations that do not conform to the Categories paradigm as ‘non-paradigmatic relational situations’.

Although medieval philosophers did not have direct access to Aristotle’s Metaphysics until the mid-twelfth century, they did feel pressure from other, largely theological sources to admit something like his non-paradigmatic relational situations. The standard medieval conception of deity, for example, requires that God is an absolutely perfect being, possessing no accidents whatsoever. But this conception makes it difficult to explain how God can enter into relational situations. Indeed, as Augustine points out in book V of his De Trinitate, there is a special difficulty for those want to combine this conception with the Christian doctrine of creation. For this doctrine would seem to require that God first lacks, and then acquires a contingent or accidental relation—namely, that of being creator. But then does it not also require that in creating the universe God underwent a real change? And what about the claim that there are no accidents in God?

Augustine’s solution, which is adopted by medieval philosophers generally, is to say that when God acquires a new relation, this is to be explained in terms of properties or accidents of something other than God. Thus, in the case of creation Augustine says:

Even though [God’s substance] begins to be [truly] spoken of [as related to a creature] at some time, still nothing is to be understood as having happened to the divine substance itself, but only to the creature in relation to whom it is spoken of.[34]

On the basis of theological considerations, therefore, Augustine is led to something like Aristotle’s non-paradigmatic relational situations. What makes it true that God is related to his creatures is nothing but God, the creatures, and a monadic property or accident of the latter.

Interestingly, Augustine does not think that the case of God is unique, but also suggests that there are non-theological cases in which things are related solely in virtue of the properties or accidents of other things. Thus, a coin, he says can increase or decrease in value solely in virtue of the intentional states of human beings.[35] Boethius, in a treatise also known as De Trinitate, discusses the same sorts of issues, and in the course of doing so adds yet another non-theological example—a variation of which comes to be the standard medieval example of non-paradigmatic relational situations. Consider a man who walks up beside another man (or beside stationary column, as the standard medieval variation has it). In this sort of case, says Boethius, the latter comes to be to the right of the man, but solely in virtue of a property of the man.[36]

Thus, even before medieval philosophers had direct access to Aristotle’s Metaphysics they were led to acknowledge the existence of the same type of relational situations mentioned there. Of course, once the relevant texts of Aristotle became available, the medievals worked hard to connect their discussions with these texts. Indeed, when the issue of God’s relation to his creatures is taken up in the thirteenth century—an issue that becomes one of the foci of medieval discussions of relations generally—medieval philosophers often made direct appeals to Aristotle’s discussion in Metaphysics V.[37]

5.1 Relations of Reason

So far, then, we have seen that medieval philosophers are committed to recognizing at least one type of non-paradigmatic relational situation—namely, those involving a pair of substances and a single accident inhering in just one them. As we might expect, medieval philosophers disagree about the precise nature of the accidents involved in these situations—with reductive realists identifying them with ordinary, non-relational accidents, and non-reductive realists identifying them with accidents of a sui generis type.

For our purposes, however, what is most interesting about this type of relational situation has to do with complication it presents for reductivists and non-reductivists alike. In paradigmatic relational situations, there is always a distinct property or accident corresponding to each member of the relevant pair of converse relational concepts. Thus, when Simmias is taller than Socrates, there is one accident corresponding to the concept ‘taller than’ (namely, an accident of Simmias) and another accident corresponding to the concept ‘shorter than’ (namely, an accident of Socrates). But now consider a situation such as Simmias’s thinking about Socrates (or God’s being related to a creature)—that is, a situation where two substances are related by a property or accident inhering in only one of the relata. What is to be said about the relationship between the relevant properties and concepts in situations of this sort?

Initially, we might expect medievals to respond to this by saying that, in such situations, the single accident responsible for relating both subjects corresponds to both members of the relevant pair of relational concepts. Thus, if Simmias is thinking about Socrates, a quality of Simmias corresponds to both the concepts ‘thinking of’ and ‘thought about’. The problem with this suggestion, however, is that it leads to the same sort of difficulties we encountered earlier for identifying relations with pairs of accidents taken jointly. Socrates’s being thought about appears to be something inhering in Socrates and Socrates alone. But if we identify this relation with an accident of Simmias, then we shall have to say that Socrates’s being thought about does not exist in Socrates after all, but rather exists only in Simmias. Although medievals do allow for cases of extrinsic denomination—that is, cases where a property or accident of one thing is predicated of something else—they typically do not allow for this in the case of relations. That is to say, they typically regard relations as intrinsic to the subjects of which their corresponding terms or concepts are predicated.[38] Evidently, therefore, the relevant accident of Simmias can correspond to the concept ‘thinking of’, but not to the concept ‘thought about’. But, then, we still need to know what corresponds to this latter concept.

Now perhaps it will be suggested that, in the absence of any property or accident of Socrates to correspond to the concept ‘thought about’, Socrates himself can serve as the correspondent. In that case, however, we should have to admit that an individual substance is a relation (since, as we have seen, whatever corresponds to a relational concept and plays the relevant metaphysical role qualifies as a relation). But such an admission goes against deep-seated intuitions deriving from the Categories. As we have seen, Aristotle not only assumes that relations are accidents in the Categories, but intentionally characterizes them in such a way as to exclude substances from this category. But then we still lack a solution to our problem. If there is no property or accident of Socrates to correspond to the concept ‘thought about’, and neither Socrates nor a property of anything else can correspond to it, what if anything can?

It is at this point that the medieval notion of a relation of reason (relatio rationis) becomes relevant. Medieval philosophers often say that, even if there are relational situations involving only a single accident, nonetheless these situations must be conceived as if they involved a pair, one belonging to each of the related things (cf., e.g., Aquinas, De potentia q. 1, a. 1, ad 10). Like Boethius, the medievals accept the view that relations cannot be understood to exist by themselves or apart from their correlatives. At least conceptually, they say, relations always come in pairs. Thus, even if there is no real or extramental property in Socrates that accounts for his being thought about by Simmias, we must still conceive of this situation as if there were one and, as it were, project this property onto Socrates. Since such projections depend for their existence on the activity of the mind, medieval philosophers refer to them as beings of reason (entia rationis). And their suggestion is that we take these beings of reason to be the items corresponding to or signified by concepts such as ‘thought about’.

The notion of a being of reason, or more specifically the notion of a relation of reason, does not appear to have been invoked in the Latin West before the thirteenth century, when Aristotle’s Metaphysics and certain Muslim philosophical commentaries and treatises derived from it began to circulate widely. The notion of a relation of reason is not to be found explicitly in the works of Aristotle, though he does distinguish beings of reason in general from real beings (cf. Metaphysics IV, 1, esp. 1003a32–b11 and V, 7, esp. 1017a31–35). Even so, this notion is explicitly invoked by certain Muslim philosophers, most notably Avicenna (d. 1037), and it may well be that it makes its way into the Latin west through them.

However that may be, once the notion of a relation of reason is introduced in the Latin West, it becomes pervasive—so pervasive, in fact, that even philosophers, such as Ockham, who complain that such a notion is “not to be found in the writings of Aristotle” and that “‘relation of reason’ is not a philosophical term,” nevertheless feel compelled to give some account of it in order to preserve common usage.[39] The pervasiveness of this notion is explained at least partly by the fact that medieval philosophers think it can be used to clarify and explain a number of troublesome non-paradigmatic relational situations. For example, by the end of thirteenth century, most philosophers use it to explain the doctrine of creation, saying that creatures are related to God by a real relation, whereas God is related to them by a mere relation of reason (cf. Henninger 1989). Again, many use the notion to clarify certain cases of relational change. Thus, when a substance acquires a new relation without undergoing any real change this is often explained by saying that the substance acquired a mere relation of reason.[40] Finally, some medieval philosophers use relations of reason to identify a sense in which God can have accidents after all. Since relations of reason are mere projections (or properties a thing has by virtue of the activity of some mind), we can conceive of them as accidents in a broad sense—that is, as properties or features that a thing can both acquire and lose. But since the acquisition or loss of these properties does not require a subject to undergo any real change, some medievals claim that there is no reason in principle why even God should not have accidents of this sort.[41]

5.2 A Shifting Conception of Relations

The distinction between real relations and relations of reason has a number of important consequences for the development of medieval theories of relations. For one thing, it enables philosophers to introduce a number of refinements and distinctions within the category of relations. By the mid-thirteenth century, for example, it becomes common to say that the category of relations is unique in allowing mere beings of reason among the things signified by its terms. To quote from Aquinas who is representative in this regard:

The other genera introduce something in extramental reality just by virtue of what they are. Thus, quantity introduces something just by virtue of the fact that it is quantity. By contrast, relation alone is such that it does not introduce anything in extramental reality, just by virtue of what it is—for it does not predicate a something but a toward something. Hence we find certain relations that do not introduce anything in extramental reality, but only in reason. (De veritate, q. 1, a. 5, ad 15.)

Again, Aquinas and others appeal to this special feature of the category of relations (namely, that the things signified by its terms can either be real beings or mere beings of reason) to provide a systematic division of relations or pairs of correlatives into three different types, depending on whether their members are both real, both conceptual, or mixed (one real, one conceptual). To quote again from Aquinas:

It must be known that, since a relation requires two relata, there are three ways in which it can be something real or conceptual:

[1] Sometimes it is a mere being of reason on the part of both relata, namely, when the order or [relative] disposition cannot exist between things except in virtue of the apprehension of reason alone. For example, when we say that something is identical to itself. For in virtue of the fact that reason apprehends the one thing twice, it regards it as two; and in this way it apprehends a certain [relative] disposition of a thing to itself. And the same thing is true of all relations between being and non-being, which reason forms insofar as it apprehends a non-being as a certain relatum. Again, the same is true of all relations that follow upon the activity of reason, such as genus and species, and the like.

[2] Now there are other relations that are real as regards both relata, namely, whenever there is a [relative] disposition between two things in virtue of something really belonging to each of them—as is clear from all relations that follow on quantity, such as large and small, double and half, and things of this sort. For there is a quantity in both relata. And the same is true of relations that follow on action and passion, such as mover and movable, father and son, and the like.

[3] Sometimes, however, a relation is something real in one of the relata and a mere being of reason in the other. And this happens whenever the two relata do not belong to a single order. For example, sense perception and knowledge are related to things that are sensible and intelligible. But insofar as the latter are things existing in extramental reality, they are outside the order of sensible and intelligible being. And so there is a real relation in the knowledge and sense perception in virtue of the fact that they are [really] ordered to things that can be known or sensed. However, things [that can be known or sensed] are outside this sort of order [when] considered in themselves, and hence there is not really a relation in them to knowledge or sense perception. On the contrary, there is only a relation in them according to reason, insofar as the intellect apprehends them as terms of the relations of knowledge and sense perception. This is why the Philosopher says in Metaphysics V that they are spoken of relatively, not because they are related to other things, but because other things are related to them. Similarly, being to the right is not said of a column unless it is placed to the right of some animal. Hence a relation of this sort is not really in the column but in the animal. (Summa Theologiae I, q. 13, a. 7, corpus.)

In this passage, Aquinas contrasts the relations involved in paradigmatic relational situations—namely, relations of the second type—with the relations involved in two sorts of non-paradigmatic relational situation. We are already familiar with relations of the third or ‘mixed’ type from our discussion of creation and intentional relations. Moreover, we can see that Aquinas follows the common medieval practice of connecting relations of this type with both Aristotle’s discussion in the Metaphysics and the Boethius-inspired example of the column. We have yet, however, to encounter relations of the first type. These are relations comprised by pairs of properties or accidents both of whose members are beings of reason. As an example of this type of relation, Aquinas gives self-identity. When we conceive of a situation involving this sort of relation, he says, we conceive of it as if it involved two things (“a relation requires two relata” and hence “reason apprehends the one thing twice”), and also as if the two things were ordered to each other by a pair of properties (or “[relative] dispositions”). Obviously, however, there are not distinct things in extramental reality serving as the relata of the relation of self-identity, much less two properties by which such relata are related. Like many other medievals, therefore, Aquinas concludes that in this case the relations (or relative dispositions) are not real, but mere beings of reason.[42]

The claim that self-identity is a relation of reason might seem worrisome. For insofar as relations of reason depend for their existence on the activity of the mind, it would seem to follow that something’s being self-identical is mind dependent. But that is absurd.

Aquinas is aware of this sort of worry. In fact, in one of his disputed questions, he imagines a similar worry leading someone to doubt the view that even God’s relation to his creatures can be considered a relation of reason:

After all, if there were no created intellect in existence, God would still be Lord and Creator. But if there were no created intellect in existence, there would not be any beings of reason. Hence ‘Creator’, ‘Lord’, and terms of this sort, do not express relations of reason. (De potentia, q. 7, a. 11, obj. 4.)

This sort of worry about relations of reason helps to explain what is perhaps their most significant effect on the medieval discussion of relations—namely, a gradual shift away from the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations. On this characterization, as we saw earlier, relations are identified at least partly in terms of their metaphysical function—that is to say, they are identified as items that actually serve to relate things. But in order to maintain that things can be self-identical apart from the activity of any mind, while at the same time maintaining that self-identity is a relation of reason, medieval philosophers have little choice but to move away from the traditional characterization. And of course the same thing is true in the case of God’s relation to his creatures. Thus, as Aquinas says in reply to the abovementioned doubt:

A man is really (and not merely conceptually) identical to himself, even though his relation [of self-identity] is a being of reason. And the explanation for this is that the cause of his relation is real—namely, the unity of his substance, which our intellect considers under the aspect of a relation. In the same way, the power to compel subjects is really in God, and our intellect considers this power as ordered to the subjects because of the subjects’ order to God. It is for this reason that he is really said to be Lord, even though his relation is a mere being of reason. And for the same reason it is evident that he would be Lord [Creator, etc.] even if there were no created intellect in existence. (De potentia q. 7, a. 11, ad 3–5.)

In this passage, Aquinas makes it clear that in cases involving relations of reason—such as self-identity or God’s relation to the world—the relata are related, not by their relations (since these are mere beings of reason and hence dependent on the activity of the mind), but by what he refers to here as the cause of their relations.[43] Now, in the case of a man’s being self-identical, Aquinas says the cause is just “the unity of his substance,” where by this he seems to mean that what makes a man identical to himself is just the man himself. Again, in the case of God’s being Lord he says that the cause is “the power to compel subjects”. In the case of God, however, Aquinas does not think the power to compel subjects is distinct from its subject, namely, the divine nature. Hence, he maintains that what makes it true that God is Lord is nothing but God, his creatures, and some property or attribute of the creatures.

In effect, therefore, reflection on relations of reason brings about a shift away from the conception of relations as items that relate, and thus forces medieval philosophers to fall back on what they might otherwise have thought of as an equivalent characterization, namely, the view that relations are items corresponding to or signified by our genuinely relational concepts. Thus, even if self-identity or God’s relation to the world is a mere being of reason, and hence does not actually relate its subject to anything, nonetheless it can still be regarded as a relation on the grounds that it is signified by a relational concept. Now obviously this shift away from the traditional Aristotelian conception has the awkward consequence that things can be related even if their relations do not exist. Thus, Socrates can be identical to himself even if there is no self-identity, God can be Lord of creation even if his relation of Lordship does not exist, and more generally, a predication of the form ‘aRb’ can be true, even when no predication of form ‘R-ness exists’ is true. Of course, there is nothing ultimately incoherent about this consequence, provided we keep in mind that the relations in such cases are mere beings of reason. Nonetheless, accepting this consequence does force medieval philosophers to deny what at least initially appears to be a truth of reason, and at any rate is part of common sense—namely, that things are related by their relations.[44]

Some philosophers, such as Aquinas, assume that the departure from the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations is required only in non-paradigmatic relational situations. By the end of the Middle Ages, however, this sort of departure is so common and familiar that philosophers no longer feel the need to regard it as exceptional. Thus, Ockham eventually adopts a view according to which all relations depend for their existence on the activity of the mind. Indeed, things are so changed by the time of Ockham that he feels free not only to reject the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations, but also to modify the standard medieval alternative to it. On his preferred characterization, relations are the items corresponding, not to all of our relational concepts, but to just one of them—namely, the concept ‘relation’. As Ockham sees it, moreover, the concept ‘relation’ is a term of second intention—that is to say, a term to which only concepts correspond. Thus, even though Ockham insists that many predications of the form ‘aRb’ are true independently of the mind, he nonetheless maintains that properly speaking relations exist only in the mind as concepts.[45] This helps to explain why he often expresses his view using such otherwise unintelligible formulas as: “This white thing really is similar, even though similarity is not really in this white thing” (Quodl. VI, q. 22 in Opera Theologica ix, 669).

5.3 Relations as Substances

Although relations of reason force a shift away from the Aristotelian characterization of relations, it is important to recall that they were originally invoked to preserve the deep-seated Aristotelian conviction that no substance is a relation. As we have seen, it was to avoid saying that Socrates is signified by the concept ‘thought about’, when he is being thought about by Simmias, that medieval philosophers invoked the notion of a relation of reason: it is not Socrates, but a relation of reason, they say, that corresponds to the concept in question, and in this way avoid the consequence that a substance such as Socrates is a relation. And of course it was the same sort of invocation that enabled them to avoid saying that Socrates corresponds to the concept of ‘self-identical’ or that God corresponds to the concepts ‘Lord’ or ‘Creator’. Given the lengths to which medieval philosophers are willing to go, in situations such as these, to preserve the Aristotelian thesis that no substance is a relation, it is all the more surprising that there is at least one case—namely, the Christian doctrine of the Trinity—in which they are forced to admit that even it cannot be upheld.

According to Christian doctrine of the Trinity, God exists in three persons: Father, Son, and Holy Spirit. As this doctrine was typically understood during the Middle Ages, it implies not only that God possesses certain relations—such as fatherhood and sonship—but also that he possess them independently of the activity of any mind. As Aquinas says in his Summa Theologiae:

Someone is said to be a father only by virtue of his fatherhood, and someone is said to be a son only by virtue of his sonship. Therefore, if [the relations of] fatherhood and sonship are not really in God, it follows that God is not a Father or Son really, but merely according to a concept of the mind—which is the Sabellian heresy. (Summa Theologiae I, q. 28, a. 1, sed contra.)[46]

Now when the claim that there are real relations in God is combined with another doctrine that was ubiquitous in the Middle Ages, namely the doctrine of divine simplicity, the conclusion that God (and hence at least one substance) is a relation seems to follow necessarily. For as the doctrine of divine simplicity is typically understood, there is no real distinction to be drawn between God and any of his intrinsic or essential attributes. Thus, if God is good, he is identical to his goodness; if he is wise, he is identical to his wisdom. By parity of reasoning, therefore, if God is a father or son, he must be identical to his fatherhood and sonship. Again, Aquinas is perfectly representative in this regard:

Whatever is in God is his nature … It is thus clear that a relation really existing in God is identical to his nature according to reality, and does not differ from it except according to a concept of the mind. (Summa Theologiae I, q. 28, a. 2, corpus.)

With the doctrine of the Trinity, therefore, we arrive at what is perhaps the medievals’ greatest departure from Aristotle.

Some medievals, however, see the Trinity not as providing a counterexample to Aristotle’s thesis that no substance is a relation, but rather as calling our attention to a restriction on its range of applicability. Aquinas, for example, appears to think that the thesis was specifically formulated to apply only to the case of creatures (cf. Summa Theologiae I, q. 28, a. 2, corpus), and to some extent this is plausible, since obviously Aristotle was not thinking about theological examples such as the Trinity when he formulated it. Interestingly, however, other philosophers think that the thesis does not hold even in the case of all creatures. Thus, Gilbert of Poitiers (d. 1154), in a discussion of Boethius’s De hebdomadibus, suggests that creaturely goodness is a relation, indeed, just the relation of being created by God. On this interpretation, moreover, Gilbert takes this relation to be nothing over and above creatures themselves, so that in their case it is individual substances that correspond to the concept ‘created by’ and hence qualify as relations. Like Aquinas, however, Gilbert appears to think of these sorts of cases, not as providing counterexamples to Aristotle’s thesis, but rather as telling us something about the scope of its applicability. According to Gilbert, there is a distinction to be drawn between natural philosophy, which deals with natural things, and other areas of intellectual inquiry, including theology and ethics, which deal with a broader scope of things.[47] And Gilbert’s suggestion is that if we restrict our attention to natural philosophy, as no doubt Aristotle did, then like him we will be led to the conclusion that no substance is a relation.[48]

Although Gilbert and Aquinas work hard to preserve something like the Aristotelian thesis that no substance is a relation, at least in non-theological contexts, not all medieval philosophers feel the need to do so. In fact, as Middle Ages progress, there appears to be a gradual shift, even in non-theological contexts, towards allowing substances to be relations, or at least towards allowing them to be the primary significata of our relational concepts. Here again Ockham appears to be an important transitional figure. Thus, he breaks with tradition in allowing that even self-identity is a real relation, or at least “real … in the same way that similarity and equality are” (Quodl. V, q. 27 in Opera Theologica ix, 685). Indeed, on Ockham’s view, which becomes influential in the generations following him, it turns out that substances are signified by most of our relational concepts. Apart from some species of quality, Ockham thinks there is no real distinction to be drawn between substances and any of their accidents. According to him, therefore, relational situations do not typically involve anything more than individual substances.[49]

6. A Shifting of Paradigms

We are now in a position to appreciate the main types of views that medievals developed concerning the nature and ontological status of relations, as well as the main historical and dialectical considerations that helped to shape them. As we have seen, with the exception of thinkers such as Peter Auriol, medievals appear to have been drawn (almost to a person) to a form of realism about relations, one according to which at least some predications of the form ‘aRb’ are true independently of the mind. There is some disagreement as to the precise analysis of the situations that makes these sorts of predications true, but even here the medievals typically develop their views from within a common framework provided by Aristotle’s Categories: relational situations do not include anything corresponding to the notion of a polyadic property, but instead include only substances and their monadic properties or accidents. The main medieval disagreements, therefore, are best characterized as disagreements about the extent to which the proper analysis ought to conform to the paradigm suggested by the Categories. Prior to the fourteenth century, as we have seen, medievals tended to follow Aristotle in claiming that things are related by their accidents, and hence that relational situations typically involve not only pairs of substances, but pairs of monadic properties or accidents as well. As a result, one of the most pressing questions during this period concerns the precise nature of the accidents involved in relational situations. Reductive realists, as we have seen, identify them with ordinary, non-relational accidents such as quantities or qualities, whereas non-reductive realists identify them with monadic properties of a sui generis type.

With the advent of the fourteenth century, however, important changes begin to take place in the medieval discussion of relations. Philosophers and theologians continue, of course, to allow for situations in which substances are related by their accidents, and hence to worry about the precise nature of the accidents involved in these situations. But at this point there is a decided shift toward regarding such situations as exceptional. As we have seen, there was always strong theological pressure to allow for at least some departures from the Aristotelian paradigm. But what appears to have happened over time is that these departures come to seem less and less peculiar, and eventually to provide the basis for a new analysis of relational situations—one according to which substances themselves are the items responsible for relating. Around this same time, moreover, Ockham and his followers, most notably John Buridan, institute another sort of change, namely, a shift away from the traditional Aristotelian characterization of relations. Prior to the fourteenth century, philosophers and theologians typically assume that the term ‘relation’ signifies whatever it is in a relational situation that does the relating—though here again theological considerations force them to allow for certain exceptions. By the time of Ockham, however, we get a complete break with this standard characterization. Thus, whereas earlier philosophers and theologians would allow the term ‘relation’ to signify a being of reason only in certain cases, such as creation, Ockham and his followers maintain that ‘relation’ is a term of second intention, and so strictly speaking always signifies beings of reason. With Ockham, therefore, we have not only a complete severing of the connection between relations and those items in relational situations that actually do the relating, but also the advent of a new—and, we might add, fairly harmless—form of anti-realism.[50]

In the end, therefore, it is fair to say that the fourteenth century marks a shifting of medieval paradigms both with respect to the proper analysis of relational situations and with respect to the proper characterization of relations. It is important to add, however, that these shifts cannot be fully explained in terms of developments within the medieval discussion of relations, but are instead part-and-parcel of broader theoretical shifts in medieval accounts of the relationship between mind, language, and reality—shifts which are closely associated with the rise of late-medieval nominalism generally.[51]


[Note: This bibliography contains only items referred to in the notes and a few other selected items of interest. For a general introduction to some of the main historical and philosophical issues surrounding relations, see Heil 2009 and Marmodoro and Yates 2016. For discussion of specifically medieval theories, as well as further bibliographical references, see Brower 2016, Henninger 1989, Marenbon 2016, Olson 1987, Penner 2016, Schönberger 1994, and Weinberg 1965. For more contemporary defenses of the view we have been calling ‘realism without polyadic properties,’ see Campbell 1990, Fisk 1973, Mulligan 1998, Parsons 2008, and Schaffer 2010.]

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I am grateful to Gyula Klima, Lloyd Newton, Paul Studtmann, Jack Zupko, and especially Susan Brower-Toland for comments and suggestions on earlier versions of this article.

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