First published Mon Sep 19, 2016

Śāntideva (late 7th to mid-8th century CE) was a Buddhist monk, philosopher, and poet whose reflections on the overall structure of Buddhist moral commitments reach a level of generality and theoretical power that is hard to find elsewhere in Indian thought. His writings were immensely influential in the development of the Tibetan religious tradition. Though Śāntideva repeatedly denied that he had said anything original, his two major works may nevertheless represent the single most significant contribution of the Buddhist tradition to the global enterprise of ethical theory. And some of Śāntideva’s poetic passages exhibit an emotional and rhetorical power that gives them a claim to be included among the greatest achievements of world literature.

1. Biography: History and Legends

There is very little historically reliable information available about the life of Śāntideva. The Tibetan historians Butön and Taranātha tell us that Śāntideva was a prince from Saurāṣṭra, a western coastal region that now forms part of the Indian state of Gujarat. But royal birth was a standard feature of Indian Buddhist hagiographies, possibly because the historical Buddha himself was the son of a rāja, so there is some reason to be skeptical of this aspect of his biography.

Scholars of Indian history before the second millennium are often frustrated by our lack of reliable and precise chronological information; and so it is for the dates of Śāntideva. One crucial piece of information we do have is that another Indian author, Śāntarakṣita, quotes a passage from Śāntideva in a text that must have been composed by 763 CE. We may conclude that Śāntideva must have lived and written before that date, and so that his life would likely have occurred in the late seventh to the mid-eighth centuries CE. This was a period during which Buddhism was still quite popular in North India, but had entered a phase of decline from which it would not be able to recover. Nevertheless, highly original and valuable intellectual and spiritual developments continued to occur within the Buddhist tradition at this time.

Two major works are unanimously attributed to Śāntideva. The most widely read is his great philosophical poem, the Bodhicaryāvatāra (often abbreviated as BCA). This text immensely popular in Tibet; His Holiness the Dalai Lama describes it as his favorite religious work, and numerous Tibetan religious rituals quote from, or are influenced by, the BCA. Moreover, the work appears to have had a significant impact on the now-extinct Buddhist tradition of Indonesia. The BCA has been translated into several modern languages, including Chinese, Danish, Dutch, English, German, Hindi, Newari, and Spanish, for a total of at least twenty-seven contemporary translations (as surveyed by Gómez 1999: 4–5). Of the English translations, Wallace and Wallace (1997) is notable for its accuracy and precision and Crosby and Skilton (1995, henceforth C&S) for its beauty and clarity.

Less famous than the BCA, but almost as valuable and intellectually rich, is the Śikṣā-samuccaya (henceforth ŚS), an anthology of quotations from the Mahāyāna sūtras with commentary by Śāntideva. This text contains a number of passages of ethical and philosophical interest in Śāntideva’s own voice, as well as numerous beautiful and moving poems and a wide variety of scriptural materials drawn from over a hundred sūtras. The ŚS contains instructions for how to behave while begging for food and while doing work assignments in the monastery; it is thus an important witness to the daily life of Indian Buddhist monks in the first millennium CE. Textual scholars have often relied on the ŚS as a crucial source, as it preserves passages in Sanskrit from dozens of sūtras that have been lost in their original language and are preserved, if at all, only in translation into such languages as Tibetan and Chinese. The ŚS was translated into Chinese, but appears not to have been read very often in that language; its main influence was in Tibet. There are two complete translations of the ŚS into English (Bendall & Rouse 1922, and in SS-G), as well as a very precise and careful translation limited to the verses by Śāntideva that appear in the text (Harrison 2013).

Two major versions of the BCA exist and were known in Tibet, one much shorter than the other. It was the longer version, of about a thousand verses, that was regarded as canonical in Tibet (see Butön 2013: 259); this longer version is the one most often cited and translated today. Some highly respected scholars (including Harrison in his 2007) argue that the shorter version of about seven hundred verses, sometimes known as the Bodhisattva-caryāvatāra or BsCA, was written first, followed by the ŚS. Later on, someone, probably Śāntideva himself but possibly another author, added the additional verses to form the BCA as we know it now. This chronology makes sense and is supported by some evidence, but we may never know for sure whether it is correct.

Śāntideva’s two works have quite different structures. The BCA is organized into chapters and verses, and will be cited accordingly here: so BCA III.24 is the twenty-fourth verse of the third chapter. The ŚS also contains many verses, including twenty-seven “root verses” that express important themes of the book, and numerous others composed by Śāntideva or quoted from sources; but these verses are scattered unevenly through a quite long prose text. The now-standard way to cite passages from the ŚS uses page numbers from the nearly complete Sanskrit manuscript discovered by Bendall; so a passage found at ŚS 36 would be one that was originally found on page 36 of that manuscript. Vaidya’s edition of the Sanskrit ŚS provides the reader with these standard page numbers, and so do both complete English translations.

The BCA is associated with a famous legend of Śāntideva’s life, recounted by Butön (2013: 258–259) and often retold in Tibetan religious contexts. According to this account, the master Śāntideva was a student monk at the great monastic university of Nālandā, whose ruins can still be seen in the modern Indian state of Bihar. Unfortunately, to all outward appearances, Śāntideva was not putting any effort into the central activities expected of Nālandā’s students: the study and recitation of Buddhist religious and philosophical texts. He came to be known as a bhusuku, a kind of Sanskrit acronym derived from words meaning “eat”, “sleep”, and “defecate”—as that was all anyone had seen him do.

In an attempt to encourage their apparently lazy student to return to his proper path, some of the monks in authority at Nālandā decided to teach him a lesson. They assigned him to recite a text at an upcoming religious festival; and, just to humiliate him even more, built him an elaborate throne from which to speak.

On the day of the festival, Śāntideva ascended the throne and asked the audience whether they would like to hear something old or something new; or in other words, whether he should recite something he had memorized, or an original composition of his own. Perhaps in amusement, the monks asked for something new, and Śāntideva began the first-ever recitation of the BCA. No doubt the audience would have been surprised to hear their lazy fellow-student present one of the greatest works of poetry ever composed in the Sanskrit language. During the recitation, while seated in meditation posture, the master began to levitate above the throne. At the recitation of verse IX.34, he vanished, and the remainder of the text was recited by a disembodied voice from the sky. IX.34 reads:

When neither entity nor nonentity remains before the mind, since there is no other mode of operation, grasping no objects, it becomes tranquil.

But what would it mean to be in a state in which “neither entity nor nonentity remains before the mind”, and why should this state, often associated with the term “emptiness” (Sanskrit śūnyatā), be a highly valued goal of spiritual practice? These are remarkably difficult questions; the next section offers the reader some preliminary groundwork that may help in engaging with them. Before we can even begin to try to understand emptiness, though, we must examine the key Buddhist teaching of no self.

2. Metaphysics: No Self and Emptiness

The most central and most original intellectual discovery of the early Buddhist tradition was that we do not need to posit a substantial self in order to explain the world of our ordinary experience. Instead, Buddhist philosophers hold that we can arrive at much more defensible and much more fruitful accounts by exploring ways to understand the world of our experience as a product of impersonal and subpersonal causal processes. Śāntideva’s writings are full of passages, including many quotations from earlier sources, that shed light on the nature and implications of this insight, as well as the still more profound teaching of emptiness. Indeed, according to Śāntideva and his sources, a direct, intuitive understanding of the absence of any self has the power to set us free from cyclic existence. At ŚS 242, he offers this quotation from the Mysteries of the Tathāgata Sūtra:

For example, Śāntamati, if the root of a tree is cut, all the branches, leaves, and flowers dry up. In just the same way, Śāntamati, if you pacify the false view of a real self, all reactive emotions are pacified.

As articulated in early Buddhist texts and in the philosophical works belonging to the Abhidharma traditions of the Way of the Disciples (Sanskrit Śrāvaka-yāna), the teaching of no self depends on a crucial distinction between conventional truth and ultimate truth. Those entities that exist ultimately have an existence that is robustly metaphysically objective, whereas things at the conventional level are said to exist as a result of a process of conceptual construction. On some interpretations of this distinction in the Abhidharma context, conventional things do not exist at all; instead, it is merely convenient in practice to pretend that they do (see Goodman 2005). According to the Buddhist tradition, in order for something to exist at the ultimate level, it would have to be findable under analysis: that is, careful philosophical examination would have to be able to find a clear and defensible explanation of how it exists. If conceived of as existing over and above their parts, composite entities fail this test; when analyzed, they disappear, as we can give no satisfactory account of how they relate to their parts. So according to the Abhidharma, the only entities that could exist ultimately would have to be utterly simple, having no spatial parts and existing for only one single instant of time. The world that we experience is the product of the collective causal activity of immense numbers of these tiny, simple entities. These claims apply even to what we regard as our own actions, choices and decisions (for further explanation, see Siderits 2007: ch. 3 and ch. 6).

This picture is quite different from how we ordinarily understand human life and agency; the ŚS contains several passages intended to help us come to grips with what a world of impersonal causation would be like. An especially illuminating analogy can be found at ŚS 262:

I have taught the aspects of action,
But no agent exists in the ten directions.
It’s just like when trees, agitated by the wind,
Produce fire:
The wind and the trees do not think,
“We should generate this fire.”
However, fire arises.
The performance of action is similar.

A helpful sketch of the overall picture at work in these texts can be found at ŚS 238:

Compounded things proceed by means
Of causes and conditions,
Mutual causality and dependent arising;
Foolish people don’t realize this.
For example, by the power of effort,
Muñja grass and balbaja grass can be woven together into a rope;
A water-wheel turns, but
The individual parts can’t turn by themselves.
In the same way, all the aspects of being
Exist in dependence on the combination of the others;
From the most distant past to the farthest future,
One of these existing by itself is not apprehended. (SS-G: 230)

The Tibetan ŚS quotes at 226 a passage from the Rice Sheaf Sūtra that offers an interesting analogy that responds to the perennial question of how rebirth could be possible when there is no self. Many people, when confronted with the teaching of no self, ask how we could possibly understand the process of rebirth if there is nothing that travels from this life to the next. But as the sūtra points out, the moon can be reflected in still water, even though the moon does not travel down to the earth. In the same way, a causal process of dependent arising can lead to a kind of continuity from one life to another, even though there is no real, substantial thing that travels from this body into the next. Another analogy intended to make a similar point is found at 239:

Although a seal produces a seal impression,
We don’t apprehend that the seal transmigrates.
It isn’t there [in the impression,] but nor are they wholly different.
In the same way, composite things are not annihilated and not eternal.

Though Śāntideva devotes considerable effort to expounding the reductionist views of the Abhidharma tradition, he does not regard them as the final word in Buddhist philosophy. We can see this especially in Chapter IX of the BCA, which engages with philosophical disagreements between Buddhists and non-Buddhists and between different schools of thought within the Buddhist tradition. This chapter is so formidably technical, and so terse and compressed, as to be open to a range of different interpretations; at places it is almost impenetrable. One thing at least is very clear: the views expressed fall within the Madhyamaka or Middle Way School, a philosophical tradition founded by Nāgārjuna that has been prestigious and influential in China and utterly dominant in Tibet. The teachings of the Madhyamaka pose notorious and formidable difficulties of interpretation; fortunately, much valuable scholarship has recently become available that is of great help in delineating the range of plausible interpretations and the considerations that can be advanced to support them. (See especially Siderits and Katsura (trans.) 2013; Westerhoff 2009; Garfield 2015: ch. 3; Arnold 2012: ch. 6.)

The core claim of Madhyamaka is generally acknowledged to be that nothing in the universe has any svabhāva. This Sanskrit term has a complex cluster of meanings that make it extraordinarily difficult to translate. Many scholars have now adopted the translation “intrinsic nature” for svabhāva, but it has also been rendered at various times as “essence”, “substance”, “own-being”, and “intrinsic existence”, among many other attempts. If something had svabhāva, then it would be possible fully to understand that thing’s nature as it is in itself, independently of any relations it might bear to anything else, and independently of the conceptual or linguistic activities of sentient beings. Following Nāgārjuna, though, Mādhyamika teachers argued that nothing could possibly have svabhāva as just described. If something did have svabhāva, it would be permanent, unchanging, and independent; and Buddhists argue that nothing in the world has these qualities. Instead, everything that arises in our experience, or could so arise, is impermanent, constantly changing, dependent on causes and conditions, and understood within a conceptual framework. We cannot say or think how or what anything is except by making overt or covert reference to other things; nor can anything be how or what it is except in relation to other things. Thus, everything is empty of intrinsic nature. In the Madhyamaka, this claim is taken to be equivalent to the statement that nothing can exist at the ultimate level of truth; instead, everything that exists, arises or happens does so at the conventional level. Conventional existence, on this view, is actually the only kind of existence that anything has, and the only kind that anything could have.

Drawing on the Perfection of Wisdom sūtras, Mādhyamika authors offered various analogies to try to illustrate what it is like for things to lack any intrinsic nature. Of these, probably the most helpful and illuminating is the analogy of a mirage, found, for instance, at ŚS 256. In drawing out this analogy, the first thing to notice is that a mirage is something that exists. Someone who simply denied reports that, on hot days, roads sometimes appear to be covered with pools of water, thus entirely rejecting the existence of mirages, would thereby hold a mistaken view. Similarly, according to the Madhyamaka view, ordinary conventional things, including shoes and ships and sealing-wax, actually do exist. On the other hand, a mirage is deceptive: the way in which it exists is not the same as the way in which it appears to exist. Similarly, the objects of our everyday experience appear to us to exist by way of intrinsic nature, while in fact they exist conventionally. Moreover, a mirage arises from causes and conditions; just so, ordinary conventional things arise from causes and conditions. Finally, and more controversially, a mirage is something that exists only from a certain point of view. In the same way—although not all interpreters of Madhyamaka would accept this way of putting it—ordinary things exist only from the perspective of particular conceptual schemes, and not in a robustly objective way, not “from their own side”.

Many arguments were been advanced by Nāgārjuna, as well as by later Buddhist writers, for the claim that there is no intrinsic nature; many of these arguments, including most of those found in Śāntideva’s works, are thoroughly and sympathetically discussed in modern secondary sources such as Westerhoff 2009. In his presentation of emptiness in chapter 14 of the ŚS, though, Śāntideva devotes considerable space to an argument that has been quite prominent in the Tibetan tradition but is not usually foregrounded in Western interpretations of Madhyamaka. A representative instance of this argument can be found at ŚS 248:

Here, Your Majesty, when the internal fire element arises, it doesn’t come from anywhere. When it ceases, it doesn’t go anywhere. It doesn’t exist, then it exists; and having existed, it disappears again, because it has no intrinsic nature. (SS-G: 237–238)

This argument may lose some of its credibility in our eyes due to the prescientific forms in which Śāntideva presents it. However, similar arguments can be constructed entirely in terms of a contemporary scientific worldview. For example, we could argue that, when gaseous hydrogen and oxygen react to form water, the liquid state of the resulting water doesn’t come from anywhere. And when that water freezes and becomes ice, its liquid state doesn’t go anywhere. So liquidity has no intrinsic nature.

When presented as a meditative exercise to appropriately prepared students, this reasoning can produce striking results. Whether it is a cogent philosophical argument is an other question. The argument evidently depends on suppressed premises, but it’s not entirely clear what these are supposed to be. More philosophical work on this form of Madhyamaka reasoning could be very helpful.

Though they share a common denial that anything has intrinsic nature, Madhyamaka philosophers differ in their views about various other philosophical issues; indeed, some within this tradition hold that the goal of practice is to have no views at all. Within the overall framework of Madhyamaka, Tibetan scholars generally classify Śāntideva as belonging to the Middle Way Reductio School (Skt. Prāsaṅgika-madhyamaka, Tib. dbu ma thal ‘gyur pa) of Buddhapālita and Candrakīrti. This form of Madhyamaka is opposed to the Middle Way Autonomous School (Skt. Svātantrika-madhyamaka, Tib. dbu ma rang rgyud pa). Some modern writers have viewed this doxographical identification with skepticism, noting that Śāntideva takes no explicit position on the issues of argumentative and logical methodology that, they believe, were the core questions at issue between Candrakīrti and Bhāvaviveka. Indeed, these Indian masters would not have used the terms Prāsaṅgika and Svātantrika to describe themselves, and some scholars have questioned the extent to which Tibetan doxographical categories can helpfully illuminate Indian philosophical discussions, as opposed to oversimplifying or distorting them.

One of the most influential, and controversial, passages in the BCA is verse IX.139 (Vaidya 1988: 272–73; C&S: 129). The great Tibetan philosopher Tsong kha pa cited this passage as a crucial Indic precedent for the doctrine of “identifying the object of negation”, which plays a central role in his reading of Madhyamaka (Tsong kha pa, GT: 126). But modern scholars disagree about whether the verse really does express a form of that doctrine, or whether the intended meaning was something else entirely.

In several places, Śāntideva devotes considerable attention to arguing, contrary to what would seem to be obvious common sense, that there is no real thing that I can call “my body”. Arguments to this effect can be found both in BCA IX and in the long series of verses that concludes the ŚS. These are the verses that Bendall and Rouse wrongly identified as quotations from the Mysteries of the Tathāgata Sūtra, and that Harrison discovered to have been composed by Śāntideva himself (see Harrison 2007).

Śāntideva poses a dilemma for anyone who claims that the body is a substantially existing entity. If the body is thought of a physical object that has a specific visible form, then such a body does not last for an entire lifetime, since the shape and appearance of the body change dramatically between early childhood and old age. On the other hand, if the body is understood to be something more abstract that remains constant through these visible changes, then we can’t point to it, and it is not able to play the role in our self-understanding that we normally expect the body to play. Neither view can provide us with a real entity that both withstands analysis and is suitable to be the object of our ordinary, attached attitude. As we will see, this reasoning plays an important role in Śāntideva’s views about how to live; these will be our next topic of discussion.

3. Ethics and Ethical Theory

3.1 General Considerations

As a Mahāyāna Buddhist, Śāntideva advises practitioners to adopt the Awakening Mind (Sanskrit bodhicitta), the altruistic intention to become a Buddha and then remain in cyclic existence for the benefit of others until all sentient beings have been saved from suffering. Someone who adopts the Awakening Mind is thereafter known as a bodhisattva, a being in the process of waking up. Śāntideva expresses his own commitment to the Awakening Mind in a justly famous verse, BCA X.55: “As long as space abides and as long as the world abides, so long may I abide, destroying the sufferings of the world”. The whole of BCA III focuses on the Awakening Mind from two points of view. First, the chapter expresses thoughts and sentiments that might be experienced by someone who was taking up the Awakening Mind for the first time. The second, shorter portion of BCA III is a soaring evocation of the value and importance of this quality of the mind and heart. This chapter contains some of the finest Buddhist poetry ever written:

III. 27. As a blind man might find a jewel in heaps of rubbish, so too this Awakening Mind has somehow appeared in me.

28. This is the elixir of life, born to end death in the world. This is the inexhaustible treasure, alleviating poverty in the world.

29. This is the supreme medicine, curing the sickness of the world, a tree of shelter for weary creatures staggering along the road of existence;

30. The causeway to cross over bad rebirths, open to all who travel. It is the rising moon of the mind, mitigating the defilements of the world.

31. It is the brilliant sun, dispelling the mist of ignorance from the world. It is the fresh butter risen up from churning the milk of the true Dharma.

32. For the caravan of humanity traveling the road of existence, hungry for the enjoyment of happiness, this is a feast of happiness offered as refreshment to all who approach.

33ab. Today I summon the world to Buddhahood and, meanwhile, to happiness. (translation slightly altered from C&S: 22)

For Śāntideva, as for other Mahāyāna Buddhists, the spiritual path that is shaped and motivated by the Awakening Mind involves the cultivation of six crucial qualities or virtues known as the Perfections (or perhaps “Transcendences”, Sanskrit pāramitā). This well-known list has great importance for Śāntideva, as it provides the main structural framework for the organization of the BCA; members of the list also occur in the titles of four of the chapters of the ŚS. The six perfections are:

  1. The Perfection of Generosity (dāna-pāramitā)
  2. The Perfection of Moral Discipline (śīla-pāramitā)
  3. The Perfection of Patient Endurance (kṣānti-pāramitā)
  4. The Perfection of Perseverance (vīrya-pāramitā)
  5. The Perfection of Meditative Stability (dhyāna-pāramitā)
  6. The Perfection of wisdom (prajñā-pāramitā)

Śāntideva regards generosity as having a crucial role in the bodhisattva path, and his interpretation of generosity is quite demanding and rigorous, as indeed is the case for many of our premodern Buddhist sources. He extols the transcendent generosity of those bodhisattvas of the past who were willing to sacrifice parts of their own body, even at grave risk to their own lives, in order to relieve the suffering of others and advance their own spiritual development. According to Śāntideva, though, the true perfection of generosity is a mental attitude that consists in the renunciation of the very idea of owning anything. At ŚS 18–19, he quotes the Vows of Individual Liberation for Bodhisattvas as teaching that “a bodhisattva thinks of everything as belonging to someone else, and doesn’t own anything. Why? Because ownership is fear” (SS-G: 22; and see BCA V.10).

Śāntideva’s understanding of the Perfection of Patient Endurance, as discussed in BCA VI and in ch. 10 of the ŚS, is of great philosophical interest. Like many Buddhists, Śāntideva rejects the common-sense view that anger is often an appropriate response to the failings and transgressions of others. Instead, he holds several radical theses about anger: that anger is gravely spiritually and psychologically damaging to the one who succumbs to it; that anger always involves certain conceptual mistakes; and that it is therefore urgent to counteract anger through meditative exercises. Śāntideva’s clear and uncompromising advocacy of the elimination of anger has been fruitfully compared to the views of certain Hellenistic philosophers (see, e.g., Gowans 2010). His reasons for thinking that anger necessarily involves conceptual error will be briefly explained below.

In her monograph on the ŚS, Suzanne Mrozik has emphasized the somatic dimension of that text’s normative perspective. For Buddhists such as Śāntideva, moral excellence must be attained through rigorous practices of bodily discipline. Some of these belong to monastic etiquette and training; others are forms of mindfulness of body; and others are aspects of meditation practice. Moreover, sūtra texts quoted by Śāntideva claim that Buddhist devotional practices and the preservation of moral discipline will lead to an attractive, healthy and beautiful body. Mrozik sees much potential in these teachings, which emphasize aspects of moral practice that modern writers often overlook. Yet we might be concerned that a literal reading of Śāntideva’s views about the causes of physical attractiveness could lead healthy and handsome people to a quite unwarranted sense of superiority, while licensing contempt for, or even discrimination against, the ugly or the disabled.

As Barbra Clayton has shown, the description of the bodhisattva’s way of life in the ŚS features an interesting perspective on the role of puṇya, “goodness” or “good karma”. Early Buddhist texts appear to take the view that the Saint (Sanskrit arhat) stops creating karmic traces, whether good or bad, as a result of her experience of liberation. These karmic traces function to project happy or unhappy future experiences in cyclic existence; and a Saint, who is free of cyclic existence, must therefore have left goodness behind, along with the vile actions that lead to misery. Śāntideva, on the other hand, sees even quite advanced bodhisattvas as committed to the ongoing cultivation of goodness, not for their own sake, but in order to transfer it to other sentient beings and thereby sustain their progress towards spiritual maturity (see Clayton 2006: 76–88).

Another feature of Śāntideva’s presentation of Buddhist ethics that is not commonly encountered in similar texts is the emphasis he places in the ŚS on the interdependent and mutually supportive nature of the various Buddhist virtues. So, for example, he writes at ŚS 289 that “you should undertake to increase goodness through effort, intention, and compassion, which stabilize each other”. And at ŚS 121 we find a passage, also in Śāntideva’s own voice, that could be rendered: “Moral discipline and stable attention reinforce each other. The two together make it possible to embrace experience completely” (see SS-G: 119 and 273).

The fact that Śāntideva sees the various Buddhist virtues as mutually supportive may help to explain why he devotes so little theoretical attention to resolving conflicts between different Buddhist values. If they all work together and reinforce each other, such conflicts would be merely theoretical and would have little practical importance.

3.2 From Metaphysics to Ethics

As Amod Lele has pointed out (Lele 2015,) there are at least four significant passages in the BCA in which Śāntideva attempts to draw normative conclusions from descriptive, philosophical premises: that is, to argue from an account of how things actually are to conclusions about how we should feel and how we should live. The arguments identified by Lele are, first, that because our actions and decisions arise from causes, we should practice patient endurance and abandon the irrational emotion of anger (BCA VI.22–49); second, that because there is no body over and above its parts, we should abandon lust and change how we think about protecting the body (BCA VIII.40–83); third, that because there is no substantial self, we should care as much about others’ well-being as we do about the things we ourselves value (BCA VIII.90–109); and finally, that because everything is empty, we should let go of all forms of attachment (various passages in BCA IX).

The first of these arguments is embedded in a passage now seen by many scholars as the most sophisticated and well-developed discussion in the entirety of premodern Indian literature of what we know today as the problem of free will. The three verses that are perhaps most crucial to this passage are:

VI.25. Whatever transgressions (aparādha) and vile actions (pāpa) there are, all arise through the power of conditioning factors, while there is nothing that arises independently.

VI.31. In this way everything is dependent upon something else. Even that thing upon which each is dependent is not independent. Since, like a magical display, phenomena do not initiate activity, at what does one get angry like this?

VI.33. Therefore, even if one sees a friend or an enemy behaving badly, one can reflect that there are specific conditioning factors that determine this, and thereby remain happy. (translation slightly modified from C&S: 52–53)

Though some main features of this argument are clear enough, there are different ways to understand its conclusion. On one interpretation, Śāntideva thinks that anger is always cognitively inappropriate because he holds a version of what we call hard determinism or hard incompatibilism (a view defended in Goodman 2002 and in ch. 8 of Goodman 2009). On this first reading, Śāntideva thinks that an accurate understanding of how our behavior is caused excludes the possibility of basic desert, in which it would be morally fitting or appropriate to inflict hard treatment on someone solely because of their past actions. The rejection of basic desert, though, is still compatible with the idea that it could sometimes be appropriate to criticize or punish someone in order to bring about good consequences. (For a powerful and sophisticated exposition of this kind of perspective, see Pereboom 2001.)

A second interpretation, advanced by Mark Siderits, attributes to Śāntideva a special form of compatibilism known as “Buddhist paleocompatibilism” (see, e.g., Siderits 2013). Siderits holds that the hard incompatibilist position is incorrect because it illegitimately moves back and forth between the conventional and ultimate levels of truth. Though there is no agency whatsoever at the ultimate level, a kind of free will could still be possible in the context of conventional truth; and on this view, conventional free will could still justify many of our practices of assigning blame and responsibility.

The crux of the disagreement between the two interpretations concerns verse VI.32:

If it is argued that to resist anger is inappropriate, for “who is it that resists what?”, our view is that it is appropriate: since there is dependent origination there can be cessation of suffering. (C&S: 53)

On the paleocompatibilist reading, Śāntideva in this verse takes back important elements of the view that he appears to present in verses VI.22–31, shifting his position to retain elements of autonomous agency as part of the worldview of a practicing bodhisattva. On the hard incompatibilist reading, this verse responds to an objection against Śāntideva’s position without abandoning or even qualifying the main argument. The claim that there is no autonomy of the type that would generate basic desert, it can be argued, is perfectly compatible with the claim that it would be better for me to resist anger whenever it arises (see Goodman 2016).

Among the numerous subsidiary arguments against the rationality of anger presented in BCA VI, one is especially noteworthy. Śāntideva holds that those who harm us are not autonomous, and so not responsible, because they are under control of irrational emotional reactions that overpower their ability to respond appropriately, and instead cause them to engage in actions destructive both to others and to themselves. So the most appropriate response to others’ transgressions is not to get angry at them, but to arouse the aspiration to develop in ourselves the ability to set others free from emotional reactivity and confusion. This argument would be quite influential among later Buddhists. Thus Tsong kha pa writes that

Although many reasonings are set forth in [the BCA], it is easy to be certain of this one, and it is a very powerful remedy for anger… so meditate repeatedly on this remedy. (GT: 161–62)

The second argument from metaphysics to ethics discussed by Lele draws on Śāntideva’s arguments that are intended to refute the real existence of the body. These are not offered merely to satisfy some form of pure intellectual curiosity; they are intended to have important motivational effects. Many people are proud of their bodies, and almost all adults have felt sexual attraction towards the bodies of some other people. Both the pride and the attraction, Śāntideva holds, can operate only when we ignore the insubstantial nature and disgusting character of our own and others’ bodies (see, e.g., BCA VIII.30–70; ŚS 231). Moreover, ordinary people understandably feel intensely protective of their own bodies, and this attitude often leads to morally questionable behavior. According to Śāntideva, if we clearly understand what the body is, we can transform our emotional relationship with it. This transformation involves coming to see the body as “like a machine, a mechanical construct of interconnected bones and muscles” (ŚS 231, SS-G: 225). Though it has no intrinsic value at all, the body is instrumentally useful as a means to support spiritual practice and to assist other sentient beings; as such, it makes sense to protect the body as long as it can play a useful role. And when it can no longer do so, it can still become food for carnivorous animals.

Considerable scholarly attention has recently focused on the third of Śāntideva’s arguments, from the absence of any self to the rationality of altruism. This argument was already explored in an insightful way by Luis Gómez in 1973, and became a major topic of discussion largely as a result of the criticisms directed at it by Paul Williams (see Williams 1998, Siderits 2000, and Williams 2000). The argument continues to attract both critics and defenders (see especially ch. 4, 6, and 8 of Cowherds 2016).

Commentators have tended to analyze the passage in question as having two major parts. The first part presents a simple, clear, inspiring, and yet at the same time, profoundly radical and unsettling argument for altruism:

VIII.94. I should dispel the suffering of others because it is suffering like my own suffering. I should help others too because of their nature as beings, which is like my own being.

95. When happiness is dear to me and others equally, what is so special about me that I strive after happiness only for myself?

96. When fear and suffering are disliked by me and others equally, what is so special about me that I protect myself and not the other? (translation slightly altered from C&S: 96)

This is a far more powerful argument than Mill’s failed “proof” of utilitarianism. In highlighting the fundamental and undeniable similarity between ourselves and everyone else, it calls us to broaden our concern and care without limit, and to recognize the moral call of suffering and need, wherever they might be found. It stands as a lasting challenge to all those who seek to limit the scope or curtail the demands of morality. This argument was so central to Śāntideva’s intellectual and religious project that he made it the very first of the root verses of the ŚS.

Yet, it seems, there is a possible answer available to the argument of BCA IX.94–96. I bear a special relation to my own future self, one that I do not bear to others. This is the relation of personal identity. Just as it is widely acknowledged that I have especially strong reason to benefit my friends, family members, students, or others to whom I bear special relations, the objection goes, why should I not have an especially strong prudential reason to benefit myself in the future, someone to whom I bear an even closer, simpler, and more fundamental relation?

The second part of the passage answers this objection with a line of reasoning now commonly known as the Ownerless Suffering Argument. This argument draws on the reductionist metaphysics of the Buddhist philosophical tradition known as the Abhidharma. Śāntideva writes:

IX.97. If I give them no protection because their suffering does not afflict me, why do I protect my body against future suffering when it does not afflict me?

99. If you think it is for the person who has the pain to guard against it, a pain in the foot is not of the hand, so why is the one protected by the other?

101. The continuum of consciousness, like a queue, and the combination of constituents, like an army, are not real. The person who experiences suffering does not exist. To whom will that suffering belong?

102. Without exception, no sufferings belong to anyone. They must be warded off simply because they are suffering. Why is any limitation put on this? (see C&S: 96–97)

In response to the objection that personal identity justifies special concern, Śāntideva simply denies that there is a real relation of personal identity. This denial is based on a long philosophical tradition within Buddhism, stretching back to its earliest days, of defenses and expositions of the doctrine of no self, the most important and distinctive of all Buddhist teachings. But Śāntideva employs that doctrine in what may well have been a novel way. It is quite common for Buddhist texts to assert that if we can realize experientially that there is no substantial self, this realization will cause us to be more altruistic. What Śāntideva argues here is that an intellectual understanding of the absence of any self can give us reason to affirm altruism as supremely rational and egoism as rationally untenable. In this respect, Śāntideva anticipates the central argument of Derek Parfit’s celebrated book Reasons and Persons (Parfit 1984; see especially ch. 14–15).

The fourth argument from metaphysics to ethics analyzed by Lele relies on the Madhyamaka view that, for Śāntideva, is the deepest expression of the Buddha’s message. This argument is in a way much simpler than the previous ones: It makes no sense to be attached to something that does not ultimately exist. But nothing at all exists ultimately. So it makes no sense to be attached to anything. As Śāntideva writes at BCA IX.150–51,

When all things are empty in this way, what can be received, what taken away?
Who can be honored or humiliated by whom?
From what can there be happiness or misery, what can be liked and what loathed?
What craving can there be? (C&S: 131; see Lele 2015: 32)

This profound reasoning could nevertheless be questioned. Once we understand that, as major Indian and Tibetan Mādhyamika authors are at pains to insist, being empty of intrinsic nature is compatible both with existence and with the capacity to perform a function (see Tsong kha pa, GT: ch. 14–15), is the argument still convincing? Many Western scholars have had their doubts. Nevertheless, the view that the ability to see the world of experience directly as empty will lead to the extinction of attachment and suffering in the practitioner’s mind is a core commitment of Mahāyāna Buddhism, and its truth or falsity is an empirical matter of the psychology of meditation that does not depend on the cogency of Śāntideva’s reasoning on the topic.

3.3 Consequentialist Elements and Interpretations

Several scholars have advanced consequentialist interpretations of the overall moral view expressed in Śāntideva’s works (see Siderits 2000; Clayton 2006: 112–18; Goodman 2008, 2009). One of the best pieces of textual evidence in favor of such interpretations occurs at ŚS 15, where Śāntideva writes in his own voice:

On this topic, for those who have taken the vow, a universal characteristic of downfalls will be stated, so that whenever they perceive anything that has that characteristic, they should abandon it, and so that they will not become confused by merely apparent downfalls, or things that merely appear not to be downfalls.

If a bodhisattva does not make a sincere, unwavering effort in thought, word, and deed to stop all the present and future pain and suffering of all sentient beings, and to bring about all present and future pleasure and happiness, or does not seek the collection of conditions for that, or does not strive to prevent what is opposed to that, or does not bring about small pain and suffering as a way of preventing great pain and suffering, or does not abandon a small benefit in order to accomplish a greater benefit, if he neglects to do these things even for a moment, he undergoes a downfall. (see SS-G: 17)

The intention of this passage is to present a general account of what constitutes a “downfall” (Sanskrit āpatti). The term āpatti has as its primary meaning a violation or breach of some morally significant commitment that an agent has undertaken in the past. In this context, the commitment in question is the bodhisattva vow, the aspiration to attain Awakening (Sanskrit bodhi) for the benefit of all sentient beings. So Śāntideva’s goal in this passage is to give a general, action-guiding characterization of what it would mean to violate the bodhisattva vow.

In doing so, Śāntideva offers a formulation with several striking similarities to a theory that has been hugely influential in the history of Western ethical thought, a theory now normally called “classical utilitarianism”. As articulated by a number of British writers in the nineteenth century, most notably Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill, and Henry Sidgwick, classical utilitarianism holds that the criterion of right action is based on the consequences of our actions for the happiness of sentient beings. Mill once formulated this view as holding

that actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain and the privation of pleasure. (Mill 2001 [1861]: 7)

In rationally evaluating different options on this basis, many utilitarians claim that we should aggregate all the different consequences of each action, weighting possibilities by the probability they will occur, and then maximize, choosing the action with the highest expected value for all those affected, counting everyone equally.

Similarly, for Śāntideva, we can evaluate our actions as regards their compatibility with the bodhisattva vow by asking whether they tend to relieve the suffering and promote the happiness of all sentient beings. Moreover, where there is a choice between bringing about a greater good or a lesser one, Śāntideva holds that the bodhisattva vow requires us to maximize, sacrificing the lesser good to achieve the greater one. And Śāntideva explicitly commits himself to what many contemporary authors find to be an objectionable feature of utilitarianism: namely, its demands on the individual agent. Bodhisattvas are to devote all their time and all their efforts to alleviating the suffering and promoting the happiness of the world; to neglect this imperative “even for a moment” is a moral failure for them.

If the quotation above from ŚS 15 really is an exposition of utilitarianism, it may be the very earliest clearly articulated statement of that view, preceding Jeremy Bentham by approximately a thousand years. Śāntideva was not the first consequentialist ethical theorist; that distinction may go to the Chinese philosopher Mozi. Yet there is not a single passage in Mozi’s writings that comes nearly as close to a statement of a mature form of utilitarianism as Śāntideva does in ŚS 15. This passage constitutes a remarkable, and long-neglected, intellectual achievement.

One concern that might be raised about the passage at ŚS 15 is that it is not quite as explicit as we would like about how to make tradeoffs between two distinct others. So if A has to choose whether to harm B in order to save C from some greater harm, how should A make this choice? Such a situation would seem to be an instance of “bring[ing] about small pain and suffering as a way of preventing great pain and suffering”; yet neither here nor anywhere else in his work does Śāntideva explicitly describe a choice that has this exact form. What he does do is consider tradeoffs between the wellbeing of the agent A and of some other person B; and what he says about these tradeoffs has an unambiguously consequentialist structure. This is especially clear in the case of the famous verse on the gift of the body, BCA V.87:

Therefore one should not relinquish one’s life for someone whose disposition to compassion is not as pure. But for someone whose disposition is comparable, one should relinquish it. That way, there is no overall loss. (C&S: 41–42; for discussion, see Ohnuma 2000, especially pp. 60–61)

Here Śāntideva, who repeatedly advocates extreme and frightening forms of self-sacrifice in contexts where such actions would make things better, teaches that such self-sacrifice is not required, and indeed, is not advisable, where it would fail to promote the good. What is more, there is at least one context in which Śāntideva argues that the bodhisattva is allowed to harm other sentient beings in order to support her own spiritual practice. This occurs in the discussion of meat-eating at ŚS 132–135. After quoting a passage that argues at length against the consumption of meat, Śāntideva cites and endorses the view of another source holding that “if it leads to a great benefit, there is no problem” (SS-G: 130). This will be true despite the harm done to the animal whose meat is eaten.

Numerous other passages in the BCA and the ŚS can be, and have been, read as providing additional evidence for consequentialism as a crucial commitment and, indeed, as a central message of these texts. Several of these concern the issue of when it is acceptable to infringe what would normally be binding rules of Buddhist moral discipline. Several important Mahāyāna texts that preceded Śāntideva, such as the Sūtra on Skillful Means (Tatz 1994) and Asaṅga’s Chapter on Moral Discipline (Tatz 1986), had explained that particular rules and precepts of moral discipline in the Mahāyāna were intended to be flexible, so that they could permissibly be broken under certain special circumstances without generating any unfavorable karmic consequences. Śāntideva appears to have reflected carefully on these teachings, developed their implications and explored their theoretical basis. His position on the flexibility of the rules is stated in full generality at BCA V.84: “Even what is proscribed is permitted for a compassionate person who sees it will be of benefit” (C&S: 41). In various passages scattered through the ŚS, Śāntideva explains how this general perspective works as regards a number of specific kinds of normally impermissible actions, such as theft (ŚS 133), sexual misconduct (ŚS 166–67), and giving people alcohol and weapons (ŚS 271). In each case, Śāntideva’s view is that when an action that is usually harmful occurs under special circumstances that will lead it to have good consequences, and when the agent has a sufficiently pure compassionate motivation to benefit others, it is permissible. Similar reasoning is found at ŚS 144–45, where Śāntideva examines the circumstances under which not giving something away is the appropriate choice for a bodhisattva; these are characterized in terms of the undesirable consequences that would result from the gift.

At ŚS 145–146, we find further evidence reinforcing the consequentialist interpretation of Śāntideva’s ethics:

As the bodhisattva Sārthavāha said in the Sūtra on Chanting the Dharma Together, “Blessed One, when a bodhisattva longs for Awakening first of all for all sentient beings, not for himself … this, Blessed One, is chanting the Dharma together.”

It is only by giving things up that his own welfare is accomplished. Nevertheless, for fear of losing benefits for sentient beings, he does not place his own burden on unworthy sentient beings. But where no benefits to sentient beings will be lost, what difference does it make if the welfare of the world is promoted by him or by somebody else?

Suppose that he fails to discard what is wholesome of his own in order to bring about what is wholesome for other bodhisattvas. Well, if he fears the suffering of the lower realms for himself, what others fear is also suffering. If he is indifferent, thinking “That suffering has nothing to do with me”, then as the sūtras say, he undergoes a downfall. (SS-G: 141)

According to this passage, bodhisattvas should focus their aspirations on the Awakening of all sentient beings, and should even be prepared to sacrifice their own virtues (“what is wholesome of his own”) to enable other practitioners to advance along their own paths to spiritual maturity. The core argument for doing so, that “what others fear is also suffering”, recalls the reasoning of BCA VIII.96.

Probably the most important aspect of this rich and complex passage is the rhetorical question it raises: “what difference does it make if the welfare of the world is promoted by him or by somebody else?” If we answer “no difference”, as Śāntideva seems to wish us to, then we may thereby be committed to a strong form of what philosophers call “agent-neutrality”. In Reasons and Persons, Parfit explains this concept as follows. If a normative theory gives different agents different moral aims, then it is an agent-relative theory. So, for example, many moral theories hold that parents have a special obligation to take care of their own children; such views would give each parent the aim that his or her own children flourish, and these aims would differ from one person to the next. A theory is agent-neutral in virtue of giving all agents the very same set of moral aims. So a theory that told everyone to adopt the sole aim that all children should flourish would be an agent-neutral theory.

Now a view that claims that it does not matter whether, say, Martha or Vivek promotes the welfare of the world, but only how much the welfare of the world is promoted, is an agent-neutral view, in that it gives both Martha and Vivek the same, common aim: that all sentient beings should enjoy the best lives possible. In terms of such a view, Martha should, for example, abandon an opportunity to produce a small benefit for others if she can, thereby, create the conditions for Vivek to bring about a greater benefit for others. This kind of agent-neutrality is a central element of most consequentialist views, and plays a crucial role in generating many of their most frequently discussed implications. So ŚS 145–46, and other passages in the texts that are suggestive of agent-neutrality, provide evidence in favor of reading Śāntideva as an early consequentialist theorist. And even if we were to conclude that Śāntideva’s normative perspective is not a form of consequentialism, if we also conclude that it is fully agent-neutral, that will be enough to guarantee that it has much in common with many Western consequentialist theories.

3.4 Non-Consequentialist Elements and Interpretations

While recognizing that Śāntideva’s views have many elements in common with consequentialism, and indeed, leaving open the possibility that the consequentialist interpretation may be correct, Gordon Davis has pointed out some potential worries for this form of interpretation, as well as elements of Śāntideva’s thought that might be understood as more similar to a Kantian view (Davis 2013). In particular, Davis points out that Śāntideva’s aspiration is to help all sentient beings attain Buddhahood, at which time they would all have attained a kind of equality. If Śāntideva assigns intrinsic value to equality, then he must not be a utilitarian, although he might still be some kind of consequentialist. Indeed, as Davis suggests, the idea of a world in which everyone has abandoned wrongdoing and its psychological causes in favor of the nonviolent community of equals could be compared to Kant’s Kingdom of Ends.

Damien Keown’s highly influential and important book The Nature of Buddhist Ethics (2001) advanced an interpretation of early Buddhism and of the Theravāda tradition based on a comparison with Aristotelian virtue ethics. Though Śāntideva differs dramatically from Aristotle in many ways, there can be no doubt that he is deeply concerned with the cultivation of character, and that he is much more interested than at least some Western utilitarians have been in the question of how we can become better people. Thus, the possibility of important similarities between Śāntideva’s thought and theories within the domain of virtue ethics should not be disregarded.

The most sophisticated critique of the consequentialist interpretation of Śāntideva’s ethics has been put forward by Stephen Harris (in his 2015). Harris accepts that Śāntideva puts impartial benevolence near the center of his normative perspective, and that the primacy of this motivation constitutes a resemblance with Western consequentialist views. He also agrees that Śāntideva’s views allow consequences to have some role in providing reasons for action. But this second similarity is quite weak, as most plausible ethical theories do regard consequences as having some practical significance. Aside from these claims, Harris questions whether we are in a position to ascribe any particular ethical theory, either consequentialist or otherwise, to Śāntideva. And he offers several reasons in support of his critique.

First, Śāntideva’s book is not just a work of philosophy; as all interpreters accept, it is also a meditation manual. This means that Śāntideva’s verses, even when they appear to be providing reasons for accepting a certain claim, can often be interpreted instead as providing us with instructions for a particular meditative practice that is intended to bring about an emotional shift in our consciousness. The statements that we entertain as part of such a practice do not need to be asserted as true, as part of a sober statement of philosophical tenets. We can wish for impossible things to happen during the cultivation of altruism (as in much of BCA X); and we can tell ourselves things that are false, suspending disbelief during a meditation session, in order to develop certain virtues. Since this is the case, we must be cautious about holding that Śāntideva is actually making assertions in any particular passage; instead, we should keep in mind that he may only be giving meditation instructions. Of course, as Harris points out, he might be doing both of these things at once; and if we can show that this is what he is doing, the passages would be just as good evidence for his ethical theory as they would be if they were not also meditation instructions.

A second reason Harris provides for doubting that we can know what kind of ethical theory to attribute to Śāntideva rests on the central role of the concept of upāya in Mahāyāna Buddhism in general, and in Śāntideva’s writings in particular (see Harris 2015: 253). Upāya, a Sanskrit word often translated as “skillful means” or “expedient means”, refers to an approach to teaching allegedly adopted by Buddhas and other highly advanced spiritual teachers towards those who have not yet reached the highest stages of their own spiritual paths. The idea is that the Buddhas don’t always tell such people the final truth; instead, they tell them whatever they need to hear at the time, including even falsehoods, if doing so will be the most effective way to support their progress towards spiritual maturity. But since this is the case, it may be difficult to know whether, in any given passage, Śāntideva is expressing what he takes to be the right view, or whether he is offering falsehoods that may nevertheless be helpful to some readers, depending on their own level of meditative practice and philosophical training. (For more on upāya, see, e.g., Pye 1978 [2003], cited by Harris 2015, and Goodman 2011.)

Yet another reason for concern about whether we can know the underlying theoretical structure of Śāntideva’s ethical thought results from what we could call (though Harris does not) the Fortunate Coincidence Thesis. By this phrase, I mean the view that our moral obligations and our prudential incentives always or almost always coincide if rightly understood. A particularly clear and striking form of the Fortunate Coincidence Thesis is expressed at BCA VIII.129:

All those who suffer in the world do so because of their desire for their own happiness. All those happy in the world are so because of their desire for the happiness of others. (C&S: 99; and see VII.42, and so on)

If this is true, it is wonderful news for those of us who want to be happy; but it may be a bit inconvenient for those of us who want to classify Buddhist ethical views. This is because the Fortunate Coincidence Thesis makes it difficult or impossible to pull apart the justificatory role of self-interest from that of what we owe to others. If these two perspectives give us the same answers across a wide range of cases, how can we tell which of them would take primacy, if they were to conflict? So as Harris points out, even what seem to us to be very demanding and lofty exhortations in Buddhist texts to practice extreme altruism might, in light of the Fortunate Coincidence Thesis, be justified at the foundational level by a eudaimonistic virtue ethics, or even by a form of rational egoism.

Obviously, a theory that is egoist at its foundations is in severe tension with the Ownerless Suffering Argument; and though it may be less obvious, there is an equally strong tension between that argument and a view that tells me to prioritize my own virtue over the cultivation of virtue in others. Harris does not think that this consideration is decisive, however, since he regards the Ownerless Suffering Argument as itself a mere upāya. It must be an upāya, Harris says, since it relies on the Abhidharma understanding of the doctrine of no self, whereas Śāntideva’s actual view belongs to a very different form of Buddhist philosophy, the Madhyamaka. It would follow that we cannot use the Ownerless Suffering Argument to ascertain what kind of ethical theory, if any, Śāntideva would actually be prepared to defend as a final account of what reasons we have.

In summary, though all participants in the discussion now seem to acknowledge that there are at least some important similarities between Śāntideva’s views and the theories of Western consequentialist ethicists, scholarly controversy continues about exactly how close these similarities are, and about how far the available textual evidence legitimately allows us to go in attributing to Śāntideva any particular views about the foundations of ethics.

4. Conclusion

The BCA and the ŚS contain some of the best poetry and some of the most accessible and powerful teachings on no-self and emptiness that the Indian Buddhist tradition ever produced. In several ways, these texts are unique. No other premodern text contains such interesting general reflections about how Buddhist teachings on how to live relate to each other and form a coherent whole. The Ownerless Suffering Argument has no exact parallel elsewhere in Indian literature. No other Indian text grappled with the problem of free will as carefully and as seriously as the BCA. And few, if any, Buddhist writers have ever been as skilled as Śāntideva at evoking a remarkable range of emotions in the reader. To advance his spiritual goals, he crafted passages that are remarkably effective, even today, at arousing disgust, fear, remorse, determination, altruism, generosity, lovingkindness, and compassion. For anyone who wishes to understand the philosophical teachings and spiritual aspirations of the mature Indian Mahāyāna Buddhist tradition, and to appreciate why these teachings were convincing and these aspirations compelling to many premodern Indians and Tibetans, there is no better source than the works of Śāntideva.


Works of Śāntideva

  • Bodhicaryāvatāra of Śāntideva with the Commentary Pañjikā of Prajñākaramati, first edition, P.L. Vaidya (ed.); second edition, Sridhar Tripathi (ed.), Darbhanga: Mithila Institute, 1988.
  • [C&S] The Bodhicaryāvatāra, Kate Crosby and Andrew Skilton (trans.), New York: Oxford World’s Classics, 1995.
  • A Guide to the Bodhisattva’s Way of Life (Bodhicaryāvatāra), Vesna A. Wallace and B. Alan Wallace (trans.), Ithaca: Snow Lion, 1997.
  • Śikṣā-samuccaya of Śāntideva, first edition, P.L. Vaidya (ed.); second edition, Sridhar Tripathi (ed.), Darbhanga: Mithila Institute, 1999.
  • Śikshā-samuccaya: A Compendium of Buddhist Doctrine, Cecil Bendall and W.H.D. Rouse (trans.), First published 1922; First Indian edition 1971. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • [SS-G] The Training Anthology of Śāntideva: A Translation of the Śikṣā-samuccaya, Charles Goodman (trans.), New York: Oxford University Press, 2016.
  • Harrison, Paul, 2013 [2009], “Verses by Śāntideva in the Śikṣāsamuccaya: A New English Translation”, in Evo ṣuyadi: Essays in Honor of Richard Salomon’s 65th Birthday (Bulletin of the Asia Institute 23), Carol Altman Bromberg, Timothy J. Lenz, and Jason Neelis (eds), pp. 87–103.

Other Sources

  • Arnold, Dan, 2012, Brains, Buddhas, and Believing: The Problem of Intentionality in Classical Buddhist and Cognitive-Scientific Philosophy of Mind, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Butön Rinchen Drup, 2013, Butön’s History of Buddhism in India and its Spread to Tibet, Lisa Stein and Ngawang Zangpo (trans.), Boston: Snow Lion.
  • Clayton, Barbra, 2006, Moral Theory in Śāntideva’s Śikṣāsamuccaya: Cultivating the fruits of virtue, New York: Routledge.
  • Cowherds, 2016, Moonpaths: Ethics and Emptiness, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Davis, Gordon, 2013, “Traces of Consequentialism and Non-Consequentialism in Bodhisattva Ethics”, Philosophy East and West, 63(2): 275–305. doi:10.1353/pew.2013.0015
  • Garfield, Jay, 2015, Engaging Buddhism: Why It Matters to Philosophy, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Gómez, Luis, 1973, “Emptiness and Moral Perfection”, Philosophy East and West, 23: 361–373.
  • –––, 1999, “The Way of the Translators: Three Recent Translations of Śāntideva’s Bodhicaryāvatāra”, Journal of Buddhist Literature, 1: 262–354. [preprint available online].
  • Goodman, Charles, 2002, “Resentment and Reality: Buddhism on Moral Responsibility”, American Philosophical Quarterly, 39(4): 359–72.
  • –––, 2005, “Vaibhāṣika Metaphoricalism”, Philosophy East and West, 55(3): 377–393. doi:10.1353/pew.2005.0022
  • –––, 2008, “Consequentialism, Agent-Neutrality, and Mahāyāna Ethics”, Philosophy East and West, 58(1): 17–35. doi:10.1353/pew.2008.0013
  • –––, 2009, Consequences of Compassion: An Interpretation and Defense of Buddhist Ethics, Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2011, “Paternalist Deception in the Lotus Sūtra: A Normative Assessment”, Journal of Buddhist Ethics, 18; [preprint available online].
  • –––, 2016, “Uses of the Illusion of Agency: Why Some Buddhists Should Believe in Free Will”, in Rick Repetti (ed.), Buddhist Perspectives on Free Will: Agentless Agency, New York: Routledge, pp. 34–44.
  • Gowans, Christopher, 2010, “Medical Analogies in Buddhist and Hellenistic Thought: Tranquillity and Anger”, Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement, 66: 11–33.
  • Harris, Stephen, 2015, “On the Classification of Śāntideva’s Ethics in the Bodhicaryāvatāra”, Philosophy East and West, 65(1): 249–275. doi:10.1353/pew.2015.0008
  • Harrison, Paul, 2007, “The Case of the Vanishing Poet: New Light on Śāntideva and the Śikṣā-samuccaya”, in K. Klaus and J.-U. Hartmann (eds), Indica et Tibetica: Festschrift für Michael Hahn, Zum 65. Geburtstag von Freunden und Schülern überreicht, pp. 215–48. Vienna.
  • Keown, Damien, 2001, The Nature of Buddhist Ethics, London: Macmillan.
  • Lele, Amod, 2015, “The Metaphysical Basis of Śāntideva’s Ethics”, Journal of Buddhist Ethics, 22. [preprint available online].
  • Mill, John Stuart, 2001 [1861], Utilitarianism, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Mrozik, Susanne, 2007, Virtuous Bodies: The Physical Dimensions of Morality in Buddhist Ethics, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ohnuma, Reiko, 2000, “Internal and External Opposition to the Bodhisattva’s Gift of his Body”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 28: 43–75.
  • Parfit, Derek, 1984, Reasons and Persons, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Pereboom, Derk, 2001, Living Without Free Will, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Pye, Michael, 1978 [2003], Skillful Means: A Concept in Mahāyāna Buddhism, New York: Routledge.
  • Siderits, Mark, 2000, “The Reality of Altruism: Reconstructing Śāntideva”, Philosophy East and West, 50(3): 412–424.
  • –––, 2007, Buddhism as Philosophy: An Introduction, Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • –––, 2013, “Buddhist Paleocompatibilism”, Philosophy East and West, 63(1): 73–87. doi:10.1353/pew.2013.0005
  • Siderits, Mark and Shōryū Katsura (trans.), 2013, Nāgārjuna’s Middle Way: Mūlamadhyamakakārikā, Boston: Wisdom Publications.
  • Tatz, Mark (trans.), 1986, Asaṅga’s Chapter on Ethics with the Commentary of Tsong-kha-pa, The Basic Path to Awakening, The Complete Bodhisattva, Lewiston, NY: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • ––– (trans.), 1994, The Skill in Means (Upāya-kauśalya) Sūtra, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Tsong kha pa, [GT], The Great Treatise on the Stages of the Path to Enlightenment, vol. 3. Lamrim Chenmo Translation Committee (trans.), Ithaca: Snow Lion, 2002.
  • Westerhoff, Jan, 2009, Nāgārjuna’s Madhyamaka: A Philosophical Introduction, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Williams, Paul, 1998, Altruism and Reality: Studies in the Philosophy of the Bodhicaryāvatāra, New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 2000, “Response to Mark Siderits’ Review”, Philosophy East and West, 50(3): 424–53.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2016 by
Charles Goodman <cgoodman@binghamton.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free