Skepticism About Moral Responsibility

First published Thu Jan 18, 2018

Skepticism about moral responsibility, or what is more commonly referred to as moral responsibility skepticism, refers to a family of views that all take seriously the possibility that human beings are never morally responsible for their actions in a particular but pervasive sense. This sense is typically set apart by the notion of basic desert and is defined in terms of the control in action needed for an agent to be truly deserving of blame and praise. Some moral responsibility skeptics wholly reject this notion of moral responsibility because they believe it to be incoherent or impossible. Others maintain that, though possible, our best philosophical and scientific theories about the world provide strong and compelling reasons for adopting skepticism about moral responsibility. What all varieties of moral responsibility skepticism share, however, is the belief that the justification needed to ground basic desert moral responsibility and the practices associated with it—such as backward-looking praise and blame, punishment and reward (including retributive punishment), and the reactive attitudes of resentment and indignation—is not met. Versions of moral responsibility skepticism have historically been defended by Spinoza, Voltaire, Diderot, d’Holbach, Priestley, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, Clarence Darrow, B.F. Skinner, and Paul Edwards, and more recently by Galen Strawson, Derk Pereboom, Bruce Waller, Neil Levy, Tamler Sommers, and Gregg D. Caruso.

Critics of these views tend to focus both on the arguments for skepticism about moral responsibility and on the implications of such views. They worry that adopting such a view would have dire consequences for our interpersonal relationships, society, morality, meaning, and the law. They fear, for instance, that relinquishing belief in moral responsibility would undermine morality, leave us unable to adequately deal with criminal behavior, increase anti-social conduct, and destroy meaning in life. Optimistic skeptics, however, respond by arguing that life without free will and basic desert moral responsibility would not be as destructive as many people believe. These optimistic skeptics argue that prospects of finding meaning in life or of sustaining good interpersonal relationships, for instance, would not be threatened. They further maintain that morality and moral judgments would remain intact. And although retributivism and severe punishment, such as the death penalty, would be ruled out, they argue that the imposition of sanctions could serve purposes other than the punishment of the guilty—e.g., it can also be justified by its role in incapacitating, rehabilitating, and deterring offenders.

1. Moral Responsibility Skepticism and Basic Desert

To begin, it is important to first get clear on what type of moral responsibility is being doubted or denied by skeptics. Most moral responsibility skeptics maintain that our best philosophical and scientific theories about the world indicate that what we do and the way we are is ultimately the result of factors beyond our control, whether that be determinism, chance, or luck, and because of this agents are never morally responsible in the sense needed to justify certain kinds of desert-based judgments, attitudes, or treatments—such as resentment, indignation, moral anger, backward-looking blame, and retributive punishment. This is not to say that there are not other conceptions of responsibility that can be reconciled with determinism, chance, or luck. Nor is it to deny that there may be good reasons to maintain certain systems of punishment and reward. Rather, it is to insist that to hold people truly deserving of blame and praise, punishment and reward, would be to hold them responsible for the results of the morally arbitrary or for what is ultimately beyond their control, which is fundamentally unfair and unjust. Other skeptics defend the more moderate claim that in any particular case in which we may be tempted to judge that an agent is morally responsible in the desert-based sense, we lack the epistemic warrant to do so (e.g., Rosen 2004).

Derk Pereboom provides a very helpful definition of the kind of moral responsibility being doubted by skeptics, which he calls basic desert moral responsibility and defines as follows:

For an agent to be morally responsible for an action in this sense is for it to be hers in such a way that she would deserve to be blamed if she understood that it was morally wrong, and she would deserve to be praised if she understood that it was morally exemplary. The desert at issue here is basic in the sense that the agent would deserve to be blamed or praised just because she has performed the action, given an understanding of its moral status, and not, for example, merely by virtue of consequentialist or contractualist considerations. (2014a: 2)

Consistent with this definition, other moral responsibility skeptics have suggested that we understand basic desert moral responsibility in terms of whether it would ever be appropriate for a hypothetical divine all-knowing judge (who didn’t necessarily create the agents in question) to administer differing kinds of treatment (i.e., greater or lesser rewards or punishments) to human agents on the basis of actions that these agents performed during their lifetime (see Caruso & Morris 2017; cf. G. Strawson 1986, 1994). The purpose of invoking the notion of a divine judge in the afterlife is to instill the idea that any rewards or punishments issued after death will have no further utility—be it positive or negative. Any differences in treatment to agents (however slight) would therefore seem warranted only from a basic desert sense, and not a consequentialist perspective.

Most moral responsibility skeptics distinguish between consequentialist-based and desert-based approaches to blame and punishment (see, e.g., Nadelhoffer 2011; Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Morris, forthcoming; cf. Vargas 2012a, 2015 who rejects this distinction as too simplistic). Consequentialist-based approaches are forward-looking in the sense that agents are considered proper targets of reprobation or punishment for immoral actions on the grounds that such treatment will, say, prevent the agent (or other agents) from performing that type of action in the future. Desert-based responsibility, on the other hand, is considered to be backward-looking and retributivist in the sense that any punitive attitudes or treatments that are deemed appropriate responses for an immoral act/decision are warranted simply by virtue of the action/decision itself, irrespective of whatever good or bad results might follow from the punitive responses (see Morris, forthcoming). Understood this way, basic desert moral responsibility requires a kind of power or ability an agent must possess in order to justify certain kinds of desert-based judgments, attitudes, or treatments in response to decisions or actions the agent performed or failed to perform. These reactions would be justified on purely backward-looking grounds and would not appeal to consequentialist or forward-looking considerations, such as future protection, future reconciliation, or future moral formation. It is this kind of moral responsibility that is being denied by moral responsibility skeptics (e.g., Pereboom 2001, 2014a; G. Strawson 1986; N. Levy 2011; Waller 2011, 2014; Caruso 2012; Vilhauer 2009a,b, 2012; Sommers 2009; Focquaert, Glenn, & Raine forthcoming).

Importantly, moral responsibility skepticism, while doubting or denying basic desert moral responsibility, is consistent with agents being responsible in others senses. For instance, attributability responsibility is about actions or attitudes being properly attributable to, or reflective of, an agent’s self. That is, we are responsible for our actions in the attributability sense only when those actions reflect our identity as moral agents, i.e., when they are attributable to us. Since attributability makes no appeal to basic desert or backward-looking praise and blame, it remains independent of desert-based accountability (see Shoemaker 2011, 2015; Watson 1996; Eshleman 2014) and is consistent with moral responsibility skepticism.

The answerability sense of responsibility defended by Thomas Scanlon (1998) and Hilary Bok (1998) is also claimed by some skeptics to be consistent with the rejection of basic desert (see Pereboom 2012, 2014a; cf. Jeppsson 2016a). According to this conception of responsibility, someone is responsible for an action or attitude just in case it is connected to her capacity for evaluative judgment in a way that opens her up, in principle, to demands for justification from others (Scanlon 1998; Bok 1998; Pereboom 2014a). When we encounter apparently immoral behavior, for example, it is perfectly legitimate to ask the agent, “Why did you decide to do that?” or “Do you think it was the right thing to do?” If the reasons given in response to such questions are morally unsatisfactory, we regard it as justified to invite the agent to evaluate critically what her actions indicate about her intentions and character, to demand an apology, or request reform.

According to Derk Pereboom (2014a), a leading moral responsibility skeptic, engaging in such interactions is reasonable in light of the right of those harmed or threatened to protect themselves from immoral behavior and its consequences. In addition, we might have a stake in reconciliation with the wrong doer, and calling her to account in this way can function as a step toward realizing this objective. We also have an interest in her moral formation, and the address described functions as a stage in the process. On this forward-looking reading, answerability responsibility is grounded, not in basic desert, but in three non-desert invoking desiderata: future protection, future reconciliation, and future moral formation (see Pereboom 2014a).

Basic desert moral responsibility has also been distinguished from take charge responsibility (Waller 1989, 1990, 2004, 2011, 2014). Bruce Waller, for instance, has argued:

Just deserts and moral responsibility require a godlike power—the existential power of choosing ourselves, the godlike power of making ourselves from scratch, the divine capacity to be an uncaused cause—that we do not have” (2011: 40).

Yet, he maintains,

you [nevertheless] have take-charge responsibility for your own life, which is a responsibility you deeply value and enjoy exercising… (2011: 108).

Taking responsibility is distinguished from being morally responsible in that, if one takes responsibility for a particular outcome it does not follow that one is morally responsible for that outcome. One can take responsibility for many things, from the mundane to the vitally important. For example, one can take responsibility for teaching a course, organizing a conference, or throwing a birthday party. The responsibility taken, however, is profoundly different from the moral responsibility that would justify blame and punishment, praise and reward (Waller 2011: 105; Pereboom 2001: xxi).

While some philosophers may claim (or assume) that taking responsibility entails being morally responsible (e.g., Smilansky 2012), this seems to conflate a very important distinction. To take responsibility for, say, organizing a conference, is to agree to put forth the effort needed to achieve a certain set of goals or tasks—e.g., inviting speakers, putting out a CFP, reserving the space, etc. If the conference were to fail for reasons completely outside the control of the agent—say there was a major snowstorm that day and several of the speakers could not make it—it would remain a separate and open question whether the agent who took charge for organizing the conference was deserving of blame for the failure. For many, the intuition is rather strong that she is not, especially in cases where the reasons for failure are external to the agent (e.g., a snow storm, canceled flights, etc.). But skeptics would contend that the same remains true when the failure is due to the agent’s own flaws (e.g., their laziness) since in a naturalistic world devoid of miracles these too are the result of factors outside the control of the agent (e.g., determinism, chance, or luck).

2. Arguments for Moral Responsibility Skepticism

Now that we understand the kind of moral responsibility being doubted or denied by skeptics, we can examine the arguments for moral responsibility skepticism. Traditionally, the concept of moral responsibility has been closely connected to the problem of free will. In fact, many contemporary philosophers simply define free will in terms of the control in action needed for moral responsibility (though an epistemic condition for moral responsibility is generally also added)—see, for example, Pereboom (2001, 2014a), G. Strawson (1986, 1994), Campbell (1957), Clarke (2005a), N. Levy (2011), Richards (2000), Caruso (2012), Nahmias (2012), Mele (2006), Sommers (2007b, 2009), Vargas (2013), Wolf (2011), Vilhauer (2009a), Callender (2010). According to these theorists, the concepts of free will and moral responsibility stand or fall together. And while there are a few notable exceptions to defining free will in this way—namely John Martin Fischer’s semi-compatibilism (Fischer & Ravizza 1998; Fischer 2007) and Bruce Waller’s reverse semi-compatibilism (2015)—even these philosophers nevertheless acknowledge that moral responsibility, as an independent concept, can be threatened by the same kind of concerns as free will (e.g., determinism, indeterminism, chance, and luck). I will examine each of these threats in turn.

2.1 Hard Determinism

Causal determinism, as it is commonly understood, is roughly the thesis that every event or action, including human action, is the inevitable result of preceding events and actions and the laws of nature. The traditional problem of free will and determinism comes in trying to reconcile our intuitive sense of free will with the idea that impersonal forces over which we have no ultimate control may causally determine our choices and actions. [I should note that a related problem arises with regard to God’s foreknowledge (see the entry on foreknowledge and free will).] In the past, the standard view advancing moral responsibility skepticism was hard determinism: the view that causal determinism is true, and incompatible with free will and moral responsibility—either because it precludes the ability to do otherwise (leeway incompatibilism) or because it is inconsistent with one’s being the “ultimate source” of action (source incompatibilism). For hard determinists, libertarian free will is simply impossible because human actions are part of a fully deterministic world and compatibilism amounts to a “quagmire of evasion” (James 1884; see the entry on arguments for Incompatibilism).

Hard determinism had its classic statement in the time when Newtonian physics reigned (see, Spinoza 1677 [1985]; d’Holbach 1770), but it has very few defenders today—largely because the standard interpretation of quantum mechanics has been taken by many to undermine, or at least throw into doubt, the thesis of universal determinism. This is not to say that determinism has been refuted or falsified by modern physics, because it has not. Determinism still has its modern defenders (e.g., Honderich 1988, 2002) and the final interpretation of physics is not yet in (see, for example, the entry on Bohmian mechanics). It is also important to keep in mind that even if we allow some indeterminacy to exist at the microlevel of our existence—the level studied by quantum mechanics—there would still likely remain determinism-where-it-matters (Honderich 2002: 5). That is,

At the ordinary level of choices and actions, and even ordinary electrochemical activity in our brains, causal laws govern what happens. It’s all cause and effect in what you might call real life. (Honderich 2002: 5)

Nonetheless, most contemporary skeptics tend to defend positions that are best seen as successors to traditional hard determinism.

2.2 Hard Incompatibilism

One of these positions is hard incompatibilism, which maintains that whatever the fundamental nature of reality, whether it is deterministic or indeterministic, we lack basic desert moral responsibility. Hard incompatibilism amounts to a rejection of both compatibilism and libertarianism. It maintains that the sort of free will required for basic desert moral responsibility is incompatible with causal determination by factors beyond the agent’s control and also with the kind of indeterminism in action required by the most plausible versions of libertarianism (see Pereboom 2001, 2014a).

The argument for hard incompatibilism can be sketched as follows: Against the view that free will is compatible with the causal determination of our actions by natural factors beyond our control (i.e., compatibilism), most hard incompatibilists maintain that there is no relevant difference between this prospect and our actions being causally determined by manipulators (e.g., Pereboom 2001, 2014a). [For additional arguments against compatibilism, see the entry on arguments for incompatibilism.] Against event-causal libertarianism, hard incompatibilists generally advance the “luck” or “disappearing agent” objection, according to which agents are left unable to settle whether a decision/action occurs and hence cannot have the control in action required for moral responsibility (Pereboom 2001, 2014a; 2017c; Waller 1990, 2011, N. Levy 2008, 2011; for non-skeptics who advance similar objections see Ekstrom 2000; Mele 1999a, 2017; Haji 2001). The same problem, they contend, arises for non-causal libertarian accounts since these too fail to provide agents with the control in action needed for basic desert (Pereboom 2014a). While agent-causal libertarianism could, in theory, supply this sort of control, hard incompatibilists argue that it cannot be reconciled with our best physical theories (Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Waller 2011; Harris 2012; cf. N. Levy 2011) and faces additional problems accounting for mental causation. Since this exhausts the options for views on which we have the sort of free will needed for basic desert moral responsibility, hard incompatibilists conclude that moral responsibility skepticism is the only remaining position.

Critics of hard incompatibilism include both compatibilists and libertarians. See, for example, the entries on compatibilism, incompatibilist (nondeterministic) theories of free will, and arguments for incompatibilism. I will here only briefly discuss one possible compatibilist reply—the attempt to block the conclusion of the manipulation argument, one of the main arguments employed by hard incompatibilists and other incompatibilists.

Most manipulation arguments introduce various science-fiction-like scenarios, or manipulation cases, aimed to show that agents who meet all the various compatibilist conditions for moral responsibility can nevertheless be subject to responsibility-undermining manipulation. These arguments further maintain that these manipulation cases resemble in the relevant ways agents in the normal (non-manipulated) deterministic case. They go on to conclude that if agents fail to be morally responsible in the manipulated cases they also fail to be morally responsible in the normal deterministic case (see Pereboom 1995, 2001, 2014a; Mele 2008; Todd 2013; for a less demanding version of the argument, one that aims to show only that the manipulation in question is mitigating with respect to moral responsibility, see Todd 2011).

Consider, for example, Pereboom’s famous “four-case” argument. The argument sets out three examples of actions that involve manipulation, the first of which features the most radical sort of manipulation consistent with all the leading compatibilist conditions, each progressively more like the fourth, which is an ordinary case of action causally determined in a natural way. The challenge is for the compatibilist to point out a relevant and principled difference between any two adjacent cases that would show why the agent might be morally responsible in the latter example but not the former. Here, for instance, is the second case:

Plum is just like an ordinary human being, except that a team of neuroscientists programmed him at the beginning on his life so that his reasoning is often but not always egoistic, and at times strongly so, with the intended consequence that in his current circumstances he is causally determined to engage in the egoistic reasons-responsive process of deliberation and to have the set of first and second-order desires that result in his decision to kill White. Plum has the general ability to regulate his actions by moral reasons, but in his circumstances, due to the strongly egoistic nature of his deliberative reasoning, he is causally determined to make his decision to kill. Yet he does not decide as he does because of an irresistible desire. (2014a: 77)

Is Plum morally responsible in the basic desert sense for killing White? Defenders of manipulation arguments say “no.” They further argue that there is no relevant difference between this case and mere causal determinism. By comparing this case to the other three cases—the final case being just like the above except that natural deterministic causes have taken the place of the neuroscientists—Pereboom and others argue that it is simply irrelevant whether Plum’s psychological states ultimately trace back to intentional agents or non-intentional causes. What does matter, and what is responsibility-undermining, is that in all four cases the agent’s actions are ultimately the result of factors beyond their control.

In response, compatibilists adopt either hard-line or soft-line replies (see McKenna 2008). Hard-line replies grant that there is no relevant difference between agents in the various manipulated scenarios and ordinary (non-manipulated) agents in deterministic settings, rather they attack the intuition that agents are not morally responsible in the manipulated cases. They maintain that as long as the various compatibilist conditions for moral responsibility are satisfied, manipulated agents are just as free and morally responsible as determined agents—despite what might be our initial intuition. Soft-line replies, on the other hand, try to differentiate between the various cases. They search for relevant differences between the cases, differences that would account for why manipulated agents are not free and morally responsible, but non-manipulated and causally determined agents are. There are, however, problems with both types of replies.

The main worry people have with the hard-line approach is that it conflicts too deeply with our intuitions about the relevant class of manipulation cases (Capes, forthcoming). Many people find it highly implausible that someone like Plum could be morally responsible in the basic desert sense for his behavior given how the behavior came about (cf. Fischer 2011, 2014; McKenna 2008, 2014, 2017; Sartorio 2016; Tierney 2013, 2014; Capes 2013; Haji & Cuypers 2006). The main worry with the soft-line approach, on the other hand, is that any difference identified as the relevant one between manipulated agents and ordinary determined agents may be a difference that applies only to current manipulation cases but not future cases. For example, most extant manipulation cases involve external agents who act as intentional manipulators, whereas this is missing in the normal case of natural determinism. Proponents of soft-line replies might therefore be tempted to point to this as the relevant difference. Setting aside for the moment the potential question-begging nature of this move, the reply also suffers from the fact that new manipulation arguments have recently been devised that avoid external agents altogether.

A similar problem confronts soft-line replies that point to responsibility-conferring conditions not specified in a particular manipulation case (Lycan 1987; Baker 2006; Feltz 2012; Murray & Lombrozo 2017). That is, even if one could point to a relevant difference between an agent in an extant manipulation case and an agent in the naturally-determined case, this may only serve as an invitation for proponents of the manipulation argument to revise the vignette on which their argument is based so that the agent now satisfies the relevant condition on which the soft-liner insists (Capes, forthcoming). The challenge, then, for defenders of the soft-line approach is to show that there is some kind of requirement for free action and moral responsibility that can be satisfied by agents in deterministic settings but which cannot (in principle) be satisfied by agents in manipulation cases. [For a recent attempt at satisfying this challenge, see Deery and Nahmias (2017); for a reply, see Capes (forthcoming).]

2.3 Impossibility of Ultimate Responsibility

Another argument for moral responsibility skepticism, one that makes no appeal at all to determinism or indeterminism, was first introduced by Friedrich Nietzsche (1886 [1992]) and later revived and fleshed out by Galen Strawson (1994, 2011). This argument maintains that free will and ultimate moral responsibility are incoherent concepts, since to be free in the sense required for ultimate moral responsibility we would have to be causa sui (or “cause of oneself”) and this is impossible. Nietzsche, for example, writes:

The causa sui is the best self-contradiction that has been conceived so far; it is a sort of rape and perversion of logic. But the extravagant pride of man has managed to entangle itself profoundly and frightfully with just this nonsense. The desire for “freedom of the will” in the superlative metaphysical sense, which still holds sway, unfortunately, in the minds of the half-educated; the desire to bear the entire and ultimate responsibility for one’s actions oneself, and to absolve God, the world, ancestors, chance, and society involves nothing less than to be precisely this causa sui and, with more than Baron Munchhausen’s audacity, to pull oneself up into existence by the hair, out of the swamps of nothingness. (1886 [1992] sec. 21)

Galen Strawson makes a similar case for the impossibility of moral responsibility with his so-called Basic Argument (1986, 1994, 2011). The central argument can be summarized as follows:

  1. Nothing can be causa sui—nothing can be the cause of itself.
  2. In order to be truly or ultimately morally responsible for one’s actions one would have to be causa sui, at least in certain crucial mental respects.
  3. Therefore, no one can be truly or ultimately morally responsible.

The expanded version of the argument runs as follows (Strawson 2011):

  1. Interested in free action, we’re particularly interested in actions performed for a reason (as opposed to reflex actions or mindlessly habitual actions).
  2. When one acts for a reason, what one does is a function of how one is, mentally speaking.
  3. So if one is to be truly responsible for how one acts, one must be truly responsible for how one is, mentally speaking—at least in certain respects.
  4. But to be truly responsible for how one is, in any mental respect, one must have brought it about that one is the way one is, in that respect. And it’s not merely that one must have caused oneself to be the way one is, in that respect. One must also have consciously and explicitly chosen to be the way one is, in that respect, and one must have succeeded in bringing it about that one is that way.
  5. But one can’t really be said to choose, in a conscious, reasoned, fashion, to be the way one is in any respect at all, unless one already exists, mentally speaking, already equipped with some principles of choice, “P1”—preferences, values, ideals—in the light of which one chooses how to be.
  6. But then to be truly responsible, on account of having chosen to be the way one is, in certain mental respects, one must be truly responsible for one’s having the principles of choice P1 in the light of which one chose how to be.
  7. But for this to be so one must have chosen P1, in a reasoned, conscious, intentional fashion.
  8. But for this to be so one must already have had some principles of choice P2, in the light of which one chose P1.
  9. And so on. Here we are setting out on a regress that we cannot stop. True self-determination is impossible because it requires the actual completion of an infinite series of choices of principles of choice.
  10. So true moral responsibility is impossible, because it requires true self-determination, as noted in (3).

This argument trades on some strong and commonsense intuitions. It’s intuitive to think that one is initially the way one is as a result of heredity and early experience—and it’s undeniable that these are factors for which one cannot be held in any way responsible (morally or otherwise). Yet, it also makes sense to think that one cannot at any later stage of life hope to accede to true or ultimate moral responsibility for the way one is by trying to change the way one already is as a result of one’s genetic inheritance and previous experience, since both the particular way in which one is moved to try to change oneself, and the degree of one’s success in one’s attempt to change, will be determined by how one already is as a result of one’s genetic inheritance and previous experience. And any further changes that one can bring about only after one has brought about certain initial changes will in turn be determined, via the initial changes, by one’s genetic inheritance and previous experience. Such is Strawson’s argument for the impossibility of moral responsibility.

While this argument is simple, eloquent, and rather intuitive, it has been widely criticized by compatibilists and libertarians alike (see, e.g., Hurley 2000; Clarke 2005a; Bernstein 2005; Fischer 2006; Kane 2000; Coates 2017; for replies see Istvan 2011; Parks 2009). Some critics question Strawson’s notion of ultimate responsibility, which he defines as

responsibility of such a kind that, if we have it, then it makes sense to suppose that it could be just to punish some of us with (eternal) torment in hell and reward others with (eternal) bliss in heaven. (2011: 43)

Others critics challenge the claim that in order to be responsible for one’s actions, one has to be the cause of oneself. In the opposite direction, others try to escape from the regress of the argument by making sense of the possibility of self-creation (Bernstein 2005; see also Kane 1996; Lemos 2015; Roskies 2012). Others still attack the claim that if what one does when one acts for a reason is to be up to one, then how one is mentally, in some respect, must be up to one (Clarke 2005a). Finally, some simply suggest that accounts of free action are often meant to be accounts of precisely how it can be that, even if it is not up to an agent how she is mentally, her action can still be up to her, she can still have a choice about whether she performs the action, even when she acts for reasons (Mele 1995: 221–27).

Defenders of the Basic Argument have attempted to counter these objections in a number of ways. Some respond by arguing, contra Fischer (2006), that the Basic Argument does not rely on the premise that an agent can be responsible for an action only if she is responsible for every factor contributing to that action (see Istvan 2011). Others argue, in response to Mele (1995) and Clarke (2005a), that it is highly counterintuitive to believe that an agent can be morally responsible for an action when no factor contributing to that action is up to that agent (Istvan 2011). In response to the suggestion that certain versions of agent-causal libertarianism can immunize the agent to the Basic Argument (see Clarke 2005a), they argue that such accounts actually fail to do so (Istvan 2011). Lastly, some defenders of the Basic Argument recast the argument in a form that eliminates certain problems associated with Strawson’s original version and offer additional thought experiments to bolster its underlying assumptions (see Parks 2009).

2.4 Luck

Another argument that maintains that regardless of the causal structure of the universe we lack free will and moral responsibility holds that free will and basic desert moral responsibility are incompatible with the pervasiveness of luck (see N. Levy 2009a, 2011; cf. Haji 2016). This argument is intended not only as an objection to event-causal libertarianism, as the luck objection is, but extends to compatibilism as well. At the heart of the argument is the following dilemma: either actions are subject to present luck (luck around the time of the action), or they are subject to what Thomas Nagel (1979) influentially named constitutive luck (luck that causes relevant properties of agents, such as their desires, beliefs, and circumstances), or both (N. Levy 2011). Either way, luck undermines moral responsibility since it undermines responsibility-level control. This is what Neil Levy calls the Luck Pincer and it can be summarized as follows (Levy 2011: 84–97; as summarized in Hartman 2017: 43):

Universal Luck Premise: Every morally significant act is either constitutively lucky, presently lucky, or both.

Responsibility Negation Premise: Constitutive and present luck each negate moral responsibility.

Conclusion: An agent is not morally responsible for any morally significant acts.

Let us examine the argument in more detail, focusing first on what exactly is meant by “luck.”

While there are several competing accounts of “luck” in the literature, the Luck Pincer is couched in terms of a modal account (N. Levy 2011; cf. Pritchard 2005, 2014; Driver 2012; Hales 2015, 2016; Latus 2000, 2003; Hartman 2017; Zimmerman 1987, 2002, 2009; Coffman 2015; see also entry on moral luck). The modal account, as developed by Levy (2011), defines luck by way of possible worlds without reference to indeterminism or determinism, and it classifies luck as either chancy or not chancy. An agent’s being chancy lucky is defined as follows:

An event or state of affairs occurring in the actual world is chancy lucky for an agent if (i) that event or state of affairs is significant for that agent; (ii) the agent lacks direct control over the event or state of affairs; and (iii) that event or state of affairs fails to occur in many nearby possible worlds; the proportion of nearby worlds that is large enough for the event to be chancy lucky is inverse to the significance of the event for the agent. (N. Levy 2011: 36)

On the other hand:

An event or state of affairs occurring in the actual world that affects an agent’s psychological traits or dispositions is non-chancy lucky for an agent if (i) that event or state of affairs is significant for that agent; (ii) the agent lacks direct control over that event or state of affairs; (iii) events or states of affairs of that kind vary across the relevant reference group, and…in a large enough proportion of cases that event or state of affairs fails to occur or be instantiated in the reference group in the way in which it occurred or was instantiated in the actual case. (N. Levy 2011: 36)

Note that the first two conditions are the same for an agent’s being chancy and non-chancy lucky—i.e., (i) significance, and (ii) lack of direct control. And we can say that an event is significant for an agent if she cares about the event and it can have either good or bad significance for her (N. Levy 2011: 13). It may, for instance, be chancy whether I have an odd or even number of hairs on my head at 12 noon, but it would be strange to say that this is a matter of luck since we generally reserve the appellation “luck” for events that matter (N. Levy 2011: 13)—i.e., we do not generally speak of entirely trivial events as lucky (i.e., as good or bad for an agent). With regard to the second condition, we can say that an agent has direct control over an event if the agent is able (with high probability) to bring it about by intentionally performing a basic action and if the agent realizes that this is the case (N. Levy 2011: 19; cf. Coffman 2007).

To help understand how the third condition differs in the two definitions—i.e., the modal condition (chancy luck) and the uncommon instantiation condition (non-chancy luck)—lets consider some examples. A paradigmatic example of a chancy lucky event is Louis’s winning the lottery. This is because (i) he lacks direct control over winning the lottery since there is no basic action that he can perform to bring it about, (ii) the event of his winning the lottery is also at least minimally significant, and (iii)—the modal condition—in most close possible worlds with a small divergence from the actual world, Louis does not win. On the other hand, Elaini may be non-chancy lucky for being a genius with a high IQ in comparison with her peers (Hartman 2017: 44–46). This is because (i) Elaini lacks direct control over being a genius, (ii) it is significant for her, and (iii)—the uncommon instantiation condition—being a genius is not commonly instantiated in that reference group (assuming, of course, that most of her actual peers are not geniuses).

To these three conditions, we can now also add the distinction between present luck and constitutive luck. We can say that an agent’s decision is the result of present luck if a circumstantial factor outside of the agent’s control at or near the time of action significantly influences the decision. Such circumstantial factors could include the agent’s mood, what reasons happen to come to her, situational features of the environment, and the like. For instance:

Our mood may influence what occurs to us, and what weight we give to the considerations that do cross our mind…Our attention may wander at just the wrong moment or just the right one, or our deliberation may be primed by chance features of our environment. (N. Levy 2009a: 245; see also 2011: 90)

In contrast, we can say that an agent’s decision is the result of constitutive luck if that decision is partially settled by her dispositional endowment, which is outside of her control (N. Levy 2011: 87). Finally, while present luck is limited to cases of chancy luck, constitutive luck can be a subspecies of both chancy and non-chancy luck since it can refer to a disposition that an agent possesses in either a chancy or a non-chancy way (N. Levy 2011: 87).

With these definitions in place we can now return to the Luck Pincer and see how libertarian and compatibilist accounts fare against it. Libertarian accounts famously face the problem of explaining how a decision or action can be free, given the libertarian demand for indeterminacy immediately prior to directly free action. Moral responsibility skeptics and compatibilists alike have long argued that such indeterminacy makes the action unacceptably chancy, in a way that is responsibility-undermining (see, e.g., N. Levy 2009a, 2011; Mele 1999a,b, 2006; Haji 2002, 2004, 2005, 2014; van Inwagen 2000; Pereboom 2001, 2014a; for some replies see Kane 1999; Clarke 2005b; Mele 2017). And it is argued that this applies to both event-causal and agent-causal versions of libertarianism (see Mele 2006; Haji 2004, 2016; N. Levy 2011). The kind of luck that is problematic here is present chancy luck, since the agent’s putatively “free” decision is chancy (i.e., the same decision would fail to occur in many nearby possible worlds), significant, and the circumstantial factor outside of the agent’s control (i.e., the indeterminate event(s)) occurs just prior to the decision.

Peter van Inwagen (2000) makes vivid the lack of control a libertarian agent has over genuinely undetermined events by considering what would happen if God rolled back the relevant stretch of history to some point prior to an undetermined event and then allowed it to unfold once more (N. Levy 2009a: 238). Since events would not unfold in the same way on the replay as they did the first time round, since these are genuinely undetermined, and nothing the agent does (or is) can ensure which undetermined possibility is realized, the outcome of this sequence (in this case the agent’s decision) is a matter of luck. Such luck, skeptics argue, is responsibility-undermining.

Compatibilist accounts of moral responsibility, on the other hand, are vulnerable to their own powerful luck objection (N. Levy 2009a, 2011; Haji 2003, 2016; cf. Vargas 2012b). We can divide compatibilist accounts into two main categories: historical and non-historical. Historical accounts are sensitive to the manner in which an agent comes to be the kind of person they are, in the circumstances in which they find themselves (see Mele 1995, 2006; Fischer & Ravizza 1998). If an agent, for instance, decides to donate a large sum of money to Oxfam, historical accounts of moral responsibility hold that it is important how the agent came to have such a generous nature and make the decision they did—for example, did the agent have a normal history and acquire the disposition to generosity naturally, or did a team of neuroscientists (say) engineer them to have a generous nature? Non-historical accounts, on the other hand, maintain that moral responsibility depends instead on non-historical factors—like whether an agent identifies with his/her own desires (Frankfurt 1971) or the quality of an agent’s will (Scanlon 1998).

The main problem with historical accounts is that they cannot satisfactorily explain how agents can take responsibility for their constitutive luck. The problem here is analogous to the problem raised by manipulation arguments (N. Levy 2009a, 2011). Manipulated agents are the victims of (very bad) luck: the manipulation is significant for them, they lack control over its (non-) occurrence, and it is chancy, in as much as there are nearby possible worlds in which the manipulation does not occur (N. Levy 2009a: 242). The problem of constitutive luck is similar in that an agent’s endowments—i.e., traits and dispositions—likewise result from factors beyond the agent’s control, are significant, and either chancy or non-chancy lucky. A historical compatibilist could respond, as they often do to manipulations cases, that as long as an agent takes responsibility for her endowments, dispositions, and values, over time she will become morally responsible for them. The problem with this reply, however, is that the series of actions through which agents shape and modify their endowments, dispositions, and values are themselves significantly subject to present luck—and, as Levy puts it, “we cannot undo the effects of luck with more luck” (2009a: 244). Hence, the very actions to which history-sensitive compatibilists point, the actions whereby agents take responsibility for their endowment, either express that endowment (when they are explained by constitutive luck) or reflect the agent’s present luck, or both (see N. Levy 2009a: 247, 2011).

If this argument is correct, present luck is not only a problem for libertarianism it is also a problem for historical compatibilism. And while present luck may be a bigger problem for libertarians, since they require the occurrence of undetermined events in the causal chain leading to free action, the problem it creates for historical compatibilists is nonetheless significant. With compatibilism, we need to assess the implications of present luck in conjunction with the implications of constitutive luck. When we do, we see that though it might often be the case that the role played by present luck in the decisions and actions of compatibilist agents is relatively small, it is the agent’s endowment—directly, or as modified by the effects of present luck, or both—which explains why this is so (N. Levy 2009a: 248). An agent’s pre-existing background of reasons, desires, attitudes, belief, and values—against which an agent deliberates—is the endowment from constitutive luck, inflected and modified, to be sure, but inflected and modified by decisions which either express constitutive luck, or which were not settled by the endowment, and therefore were subject to present luck (N. Levy 2009a: 248). Hence, the Luck Pincer: actions are either the product of constitutive luck, present luck, or both.

Non-historical accounts, on the other hand, run into serious difficulties of their own with the epistemic condition on control over action. The epistemic condition maintains that moral responsibility for an action requires that the agent understands that, and how, the action is sensitive to her behavior, as well as appreciation of the significance of that action or culpable ignorance of these facts (N. Levy 2011: ch.5; cf. Rosen 2003, 2004, 2008; Zimmerman 1997, 2009; Vargas 2005a). Because the epistemic condition on control is so demanding and itself subject to the Luck Pincer, non-historical accounts of compatibilism (as well as other accounts that may survive the above arguments) face a serious challenge (see N. Levy 2011, 2009b). Consider cases of non-culpable ignorance. Imagine, for instance, that a 16th century surgeon operates on a patient without washing his hands or sterilizing his equipment, and as a result his patient gets an infection and dies. The surgeon would not be blameworthy in this situation because he was non-culpably ignorant of the risks of non-sterilization, since germ theory was not established until much later. In this and other cases of non-culpable ignorance, the fact that agents are ignorant of the relevant details is frequently a matter of luck—either present luck or constitutive luck or both.

We can say that non-culpable ignorance is chancy lucky when an agent fails to know that p (where p is significant for her), lacks direct control over whether she knows that p, and in a large proportion of nearby possible worlds does know that p. Lets say I drop my daughter Maya off at a friend’s house for a play date. She has a peanut allergy and I forget to inform the other parent, Dolores, at the time of drop-off. When I get to the coffee shop, I realize this and immediately text Dolores about the allergy, but because I’m in a “dead zone” the message does not go through. Not having received my text, Dolores proceeds to give the kids a snack with peanut butter in it, resulting in Maya having a near-fatal reaction. Dolores’ non-culpable ignorance in this case is chancy lucky since in a large portion of nearby possible worlds she would have received the text. The 16th century surgeon example, on the other hand, is better seen as an example of non-chancy luck, since his ignorance is the result of bad luck inasmuch as beliefs about germs vary across agents in different historical periods (the relevant reference group here), rather than nearby possible worlds.

Since non-culpable ignorance is responsibility-undermining and much more common than philosophers typically think, it gives additional force to the Luck Pincer. Thanks to luck, distant or present, agents who perform wrongful actions typically lack freedom-level control over their actions because they fail to satisfy the epistemic condition on such control (N. Levy 2011: 115–16). In cases of unwitting wrongdoing, there often is no plausible candidate for a culpable benighting action that could ground blameworthiness (N. Levy 2011: 131). Furthermore, it is often the case that we cannot reasonably demand of agents that they do not act in ways that express their epistemic vices (N. Levy 2011: 126). When an agent does not see that she is managing her moral views badly, it would be unfair to blame her for doing wrong if she had no internal reasons for omitting her bad behavior. This is because, when an agent is managing her moral views badly from the point of view of objective morality, it is often the case that her subjective moral values and beliefs—which ex hypothesi she does not know are wrong—are governing herself in a perfectly rational and consistent way. Since these internal moral values and beliefs are themselves a matter of luck—either present, constitutive, or both—we once again arrive at the Luck Pincer. It would seem, then, that present luck, constitutive luck, or both, swallows all, and both libertarian and compatibilist accounts fail to preserve moral responsibility.

For some objections to the Luck Pincer, see Talbert (2013, 2016), Hartman (2017), Hales (2016). For a different argument based on luck for the conclusion that agents are far less morally blameworthy than we have hitherto presumed, see Haji (2016). For a compatibilism that is responsive to concerns of luck but that resists full-blown skepticism about free will and moral responsibility, see Paul Russell’s free will pessimism (2017).

2.5 Scientific Challenges to Moral Responsibility

In addition to these philosophical arguments, there have also been recent developments in the behavioral, cognitive, and neurosciences that have caused some to take moral responsibility skepticism seriously. Chief among them have been findings in neuroscience that putatively indicate that unconscious brain activity causally initiates action prior to the conscious awareness of the intention to act (see, e.g., Libet et al. 1983; Libet 1985, 1999; Soon et al. 2008; Wegner 2002) and recent findings in psychology and social psychology on automaticity, situationism, and the adaptive unconscious (see, e.g., Bargh 1997, 2008; Bargh & Chartrand 1999; Bargh & Ferguson 2000; T. Wilson 2002; Doris 2002).

The neuroscientific threat to moral responsibility originates with the pioneering work of Benjamin Libet and his colleagues. In their groundbreaking study on the neuroscience of movement, Libet et al. (1983) investigated the timing of brain processes and compared them to the timing of conscious will in relation to self-initiated voluntary acts. They found that the conscious intention to move (which they labeled W) came 200 milliseconds before the motor act, but 350-400 milliseconds after readiness potential (RP)—a ramp-like buildup of electrical activity that occurs in the brain and precedes actual movement. These findings lead Libet and others to conclude that the conscious intention or decision to move cannot be the true cause of action because it comes too late in the neuropsychological sequence (see Libet 1985, 1999; Wegner 2002; Soon et al. 2008; Pockett 2004; Obhi & Haggard 2004; Haggard & Eimer 1999; Roediger, Goode, & Zaromb 2008). For some scientific skeptics, these and other findings (e.g., Soon et al. 2008) suggest that the causal efficacy of the kind of willing required for free will and moral responsibility is an illusion (e.g., Wegner 2002).

There are, however, powerful objections to this interpretation of the neuroscientific findings. Some critics argue that there is no direct way to tell which conscious phenomena, if any, correspond to which neural events (Mele 2009). In particular, it is difficult to determine what the readiness potential corresponds to—is it, for instance, an intention formation or decision, or is it merely an urge of some sort? Al Mele (2009), for instance, has forcefully argued that the readiness potential (RP) that precedes action by a half-second or more need not be construed as the cause of the action but rather is best interpreted as the beginning of forming an intention to act. On this reading, conscious intentions can still be causes. Other critics have pointed to the “impossible demand” of Libet-like experiments (N. Levy 2005), or the unusual nature of its experimental design (Nahmias 2002, 2011), or to its irrelevance to moral responsibility (N. Levy 2014a), or to alternative explanations that are less threatening (Rosenthal 2002; Dennett 2003). These objections have led many contemporary philosophers (including many skeptics) to reject the neuroscientific argument for moral responsibility (see, e.g., Pereboom & Caruso forthcoming; N. Levy 2005, 2014a; Morris 2009).

There are, however, other scientific threats to moral responsibility besides those posed by neuroscience. Recent work in psychology and social psychology on automaticity, situationism, and the adaptive unconscious, for instance, has shown that the causes that move us are often less transparent to ourselves than we might assume—diverging in many cases from the conscious reasons we provide to explain and/or justify our actions (see, e.g., Nisbett & Wilson 1977; T. Wilson 2002; Doris 2002; Bargh 1997, 2008; Bargh & Chartrand 1999; Bargh & Ferguson 2000; Kahneman 2011). These findings reveal just how wide open our internal psychological processes are to the influence of external stimuli and events in our immediate environment, without knowledge or awareness of such influence. They also reveal the extent to which our decisions and behaviors are driven by implicit biases (see, e.g., Uhlmann & Cohen 2005; Greenwald, McGhee, & Schwartz 1998; Nosek et al. 2007) and other unconscious System-1 processes (Kahneman 2011). No longer is it believed that only “lower level” or “dumb” processes can be carried out non-consciously. We now know that the higher mental processes that have traditionally served as quintessential examples of ‘free will’—such as evaluation and judgment, reasoning and problem solving, and inter-personal behavior—can and often do occur in the absence of conscious choice and guidance (Bargh & Ferguson 2000; T. Wilson 2002; Kahneman 2011).

While these findings may not be enough on their own to establish global skepticism about moral responsibility, they represent a potential threat to our everyday folk understanding of ourselves as conscious, rational, responsible agents, since they indicate that the conscious mind exercises less control over our behavior than we have traditionally assumed. Even some compatibilists now admit that because of these findings “free will is at best an occasional phenomenon” (Baumeister 2008: 17; see also Nelkin 2005; Herdova 2016). This is an important concession because it acknowledges that the threat of shrinking agency (Nadelhoffer 2011) remains a serious one independent of the neuroscientific concerns discussed above. The deflationary view of consciousness which emerges from these empirical findings, including the fact that we often lack transparent awareness of our true motivational states, is potentially agency undermining and could shrink the realm of morally responsible action (see N. Levy 2014a; Nadelhoffer 2011; King & Carruthers 2012; Sie & Wouters 2010, Brink 2013; Caruso 2015a; cf. Vargas 2013; K. Levy 2015; McKenna & Warmke forthcoming; Ciurria 2013; Mele & Shepherd 2013). A major point of disagreement, however, is over whether consciousness is necessary for moral responsibility, and, if so, what role or function it must serve (cf. N. Levy 2014a; Shepherd 2012, 2015a,b,c; Searle 2000, 2001; Hodgson 2005, 2012; Sher 2009; Doris 2002, 2015; Nahmias 2002; Smith 2005, 2008; Sifferd 2016).

Lastly, independent of the two more specific concerns mentioned above, there is also the more general insight, more threatening to agent-causal libertarianism than compatibilism, that as the brain sciences progress and we better understand the mechanisms that undergird human behavior, the more it becomes obvious that we lack what some have called “soul control” (see Clark 2013). Naturalists about the mind argue that there is no longer any reason to believe in a non-physical self which controls action and is liberated from the deterministic laws of nature; a little uncaused causer capable of exercising counter-causal free will. While most contemporary philosophers, including most compatibilists, have long given up on the idea of soul control, eliminating such thinking from our folk psychological attitudes may not be so easy and may come at a cost for some. There is some evidence, for example, that we are “natural born” dualists (Bloom 2004) and that, at least in the United States, a majority of adults continue to believe in a non-physical soul that governs behavior (Demertzi et al. 2009; Fahrenberg & Cheetham 2000; World Values Survey 1991–2004; Riekki et al. 2013). To whatever extent, then, such dualistic thinking is present in our folk psychological attitudes about free will and moral responsibility (cf. Nadelhoffer 2014; Mele 2014), it is likely to come under pressure and require some revision as the brain sciences advance and this information reaches the general public (see, e.g., Greene & Cohen 2004). Of course, how and in what direction this revision will occur is an open empirical question—e.g., some may adopt a revisionism about free will and moral responsibility (à la Vargas 2005b, 2009, 2007, 2012a) while other may opt for a more eliminativist response (à la Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Waller 1990, 2011; Strawson 1986; Caruso 2015b).

[Note: While most anti-skeptical arguments focus on objections to the manipulation argument, the luck objection, the Basic Argument, the Luck Pincer, etc., some recent anti-skeptical arguments have also focused on the role of reference and alternative ways of thinking about free will and moral responsibility. See, for example, the arguments of Shaun Nichols (2013, 2015; Nichols et al. 2016) and Oisín Deery (2015) on reference and preservationism, Kelly McCormick (2013, 2016) on anchoring reference in the context of responsibility talk, and Manuel Vargas on preferring revisionism to eliminativism (2005b, 2009, 2007, 2012a).]

3. Implications of Moral Responsibility Skepticism

Turning now to the practical implications of moral responsibility skepticism, we can ask, what would happen if we came to accept this view? In recent years a small industry has grown up around precisely this question. Since disbelief in moral responsibility would clearly have profound consequences for our interpersonal relationships, society, morality, meaning, and the law, it’s important to question whether these consequences would be (on the whole) good or bad. Critics of moral responsibility skepticism fear that it would undermine morality, leave us unable to adequately deal with criminal behavior, increase anti-social conduct, and/or destroy meaning in life. Moral responsibility skeptics, on the other hand, offer up a number of different views—including illusionism (Smilansky 1999, 2000), disillusionism (Nadelhoffer 2011), and optimistic skepticism (e.g., Spinoza 1677 [1985]; Pereboom 1995, 2001, 2002b, 2009, 2011, 2013a, 2014a; Waller 1989, 1990, 2004, 2006, 2011, 2014; Sommers 2007a,b; Caruso forthcoming-b; N. Levy 2011; Vilhauer 2009a,b, 2012, 2013a,b; Milam 2016, 2017; Smuts 2014; Morris, forthcoming).

In recent years, empirical attempts have been made to test the practical implications of moral responsibility skepticism. One widely cited study found that diminishing belief in free will, which is ostensibly related to moral responsibility, caused participants to “cheat” more on a problem solving task (Vohs & Schooler 2008). Another study found that participants who were asked to read anti-free will prompts behaved more aggressively than participants exposed to neutral or pro-free will prompts (Baumeister, Masicampo, & DeWall 2009). Another indicates that reduction in belief in free will correlated with reduction in monitoring of errors (Rigoni, Pourtois, & Brass 2015). And two additional studies found that diminishing free will belief impairs learning from negative emotions (Stillman & Baumeister 2010) and causes participants to exhibit more negative attitudes toward out-group members (Zhao, Liu, Zhang, Shi, & Huang 2014). Such findings seem to suggest that diminished belief in free will and moral responsibility would indeed have negative consequences. Yet such a sweeping conclusion may be too hasty.

First, some have criticized these studies on philosophical and methodological grounds (see, e.g., Miles 2013; Caruso, forthcoming-b; Morris, forthcoming). The “cheating” study, for instance, has failed to replicate on a number of occasions (Carey & Roston 2015; Open Science Collaboration 2015; Zwaan 2013 [see Other Internet Resources]) and the passages used to prompt anti-free will belief have been criticized for not being representative of what most free will and moral responsibility skeptics claim (Morris, forthcoming). There is also the question of whether the negative effects tested in these studies indicate anything about the long-term consequences of moral responsibility skepticism. Most of these effects are short-lived and temporary. But as people become more acquainted with the skeptical perspective, and as they come to understand what it does and does not maintain, it remains possible that these effects would fade over time. Lastly, there is also a growing body of evidence in the opposite direction suggesting that certain positive effects may follow from free will and moral responsibility skepticism (Carey & Paulhus 2013; Nadelhoffer & Tocchetto 2013; Krueger et al. 2014; Shariff et al. 2014; Caspar et al. 2017).

A recent study by Shariff et al. (2014), for instance, found that people with weaker belief in free will endorsed less retributive attitudes regarding punishment of criminals, yet their consequentialist attitudes about punishment were unaffected. They also found that learning about the neural bases of human behavior, either through reading popular science articles or taking an undergraduate neuroscience course, similarly reduced people’s support for retributive punishment. The same connection between belief in free will and increased punitiveness has also been found in a number of other studies (see, e.g., Carey & Paulhus 2013; Clark et al. 2014; Aspinwall, Brown, & Tabery 2012; Pizarro, Uhlmann, & Salovey 2003). Additional studies have found that where belief in free will is strongest we find increased religiosity and increased commitment to a cluster of potentially dangerous political beliefs and attitudes such as Just World Belief and Right Wing Authoritarianism (see Carey & Paulhus 2013; Nadelhoffer & Tocchetto 2013). The belief in a just world, for instance, is the belief that we live in a world where people generally get what they deserve. But stronger commitment to just world belief is problematic since it correlates with the tendency to blame the victims of misfortunes for their own fate (see Lerner & Simmons 1966; Lerner 1965, 1980; Lerner & Miller 1978; Wagstaff 1983; Furnham & Gunter 1984; Furnham 2003; Harper & Manasse 1992; Montada 1998).

Given the mixed results of these empirical studies and the fact that they tell us very little about any long-term consequences of adopting the skeptical perspective, the real-life practical implications of moral responsibility skepticism remain an open question. Perhaps, as these studies indicate, it would have both good and bad consequences. In which case, the practical question would shift to the overall balance—i.e., whether, on the whole, the consequences would be good or bad. Or perhaps adopting the skeptical perspective would over time reduce or eliminate any initial negative reactions—i.e., after an initial adjustment period, people would come to terms with the new reality and their behavior would normalize. An illustrative analogy might be made here with similar concerns voiced in the past about disbelief in God. It was long argued (and perhaps still is argued in certain quarters of society) that if people were to come to disbelieve in God, the moral fiber of society would disintegrate and we would see a marked increase in anti-social behavior. These fears, however, have not materialized, as society has grown more secular over time.

The debate over the philosophical and practical implications of moral responsibility skepticism nevertheless continues, and there is even some debate among skeptics themselves.

3.1 Illusionism vs/ Disillusionism

Illusionism is the view that while we lack free will and moral responsibility, we should nonetheless promote belief in these notions since to disbelieve in moral responsibility would have dire consequences for society and ourselves (see Smilansky 1999, 2000, 2002, 2013). According to Saul Smilansky, one of the lead proponents of illusionism, most people not only believe in actual possibilities and the ability to transcend circumstances, but have

distinct and strong beliefs that libertarian free will is a condition for moral responsibility, which is in turn a condition for just reward and punishment (2000: 26–27; for more on the folk psychology of free will and moral responsibility, cf. Nichols & Knobe 2007; Nichols 2004; Deery et al. 2013; Sarkissian et al. 2010; Nahmias et al. 2005; Nahmias et al. 2007; Murray & Nahmias 2014).

Smilansky and other proponents of illusionism go on to argue that while our commonplace beliefs in free will and desert-entailing moral responsibility are illusions, if people were to accept this truth there would be wide-reaching negative intrapersonal and interpersonal consequences. It would be devastating, they warn, if we were to destroy such beliefs since the difficulties caused by “the absence of ultimate-level grounding” are likely to be great, generating “acute psychological discomfort” for many people and “threatening morality” (Smilansky 2000: 166). To avoid such deleterious social and personal consequences, and to prevent the unraveling of our moral fabric, illusionism contends that people should be allowed their positive illusion of free will and moral responsibility—i.e., we should not take these beliefs away from people, and for those of us who have already been disenchanted, we ought simply to keep the truth to ourselves.

In direct contrast to illusionism, is disillusionism: the view that to the extent that folk intuitions and beliefs about the nature of human cognition and moral responsibility are mistaken, philosophers and psychologists ought to do their part to educate the public—especially when their mistaken beliefs arguably fuel a number of unhealthy emotions and attitudes such as revenge, hatred, intolerance, lack of empathy, etc. (Nadelhoffer 2011: 184). Proponents of disillusionism typically point to the benefits of a world without moral responsibility. They cite the many instances in which moral responsibility practices are counterproductive from a practical and humanitarian standpoint—notably in how they stifle personal development, encourage punitive excess in criminal justice, and perpetuate social and economic inequalities (see Waller 2011; N. Levy 2012, 2015; Morris, forthcoming). They maintain that if we abandon moral responsibility “we can look more clearly at the causes and more deeply into the systems that shape individuals and their behavior” (Waller 2011: 287), and this will allow us to adopt more humane and effective interpersonal attitudes and approaches to education, criminal justice, and social policy.

A policy of disillusionism is present in the optimistic skepticisms of several leading moral responsibility skeptics (e.g., Spinoza, Pereboom, Waller, Levy, Caruso, Harris, Vilhauer, Milam, and Morris). These optimistic skeptics maintain that life without basic desert moral responsibility is not only possible, but also preferable. Prospects of finding meaning in life or sustaining good interpersonal relationships, for instance, would not be threatened (see Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Waller 2011; Sommers 2007a; Milam 2016, 2017). They further maintain that morality and moral judgments would remain intact (see Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Waller 1990, 2004). And although retributivism and severe punishment, such as the death penalty, would be ruled out, they argue that the imposition of sanctions could serves purposes other than the punishment of the guilty—e.g., it can also be justified by its role in incapacitating, rehabilitating, and deterring offenders (see Pereboom 2001, 2013b, 2014a; N. Levy 2012, 2015; Caruso 2016, 2017, forthcoming-a; Pereboom & Caruso forthcoming; Corrado 2013, forthcoming-a; Vilhauer 2013a,b; Focquaert, Glenn, Raine 2013, forthcoming; Murtagh 2013).

3.2 Reactive Attitudes

One concern people have with moral responsibility skepticism is that it would threaten our personal relationships and the fulfillment in life that they provide. P.F. Strawson (1962) famously argued that our justification for claims of blameworthiness and praiseworthiness is grounded in the system of human reactive attitudes, such as moral resentment, indignation, guilt, and gratitude. Strawson contends that because our moral responsibility practices are grounded in this way, the truth or falsity of causal determinism is not relevant to whether we justifiably hold each other and ourselves morally responsible. Moreover, if causal determinism were true and did threaten these attitudes, as some moral responsibility skeptics are apt to maintain, we would face instead the prospect of the cold and calculating objective attitude, a stance that relinquishes the reactive attitudes and treats individuals as objects to be manipulated and fixed for consequentialist ends. Strawson argues that adopting the objective attitude would rule out the possibility of the meaningful sorts of personal relationships we value (see also Wolf 1981, 1990). Summarizing the Strawsonian concern, then, we can say that adopting global skepticism about moral responsibility, assuming it was psychologically possible, would undermine expressions of our inter-personal reactive attitudes essential to good personal relationships, and would jeopardize our intra-personal reactive attitudes such as guilt and repentance, which are crucial to personal moral development.

Moral responsibility skeptics generally respond to this Strawsonian concern in two ways. One response argues that, contra Strawson, it is possible to adopt the objective attitude in a way that respects persons and does not hinder our personal relationships (Sommers 2007a). The second and more common response acknowledges that Strawson may be right about the objective attitude, but denies that skepticism about moral responsibility requires us to reject all the reactive attitudes (Pereboom 1995, 2001, 2014a; Waller 1990, 2006, 2011; Milam 2016). This latter approach maintains that the attitudes we most want to retain either are not undermined by moral responsibility skepticism because they do not have presuppositions that conflict with this view, or else they have alternatives that are not under threat. And what remains does not amount to Strawson’s objectivity of attitude and is sufficient to sustain the personal relationships we value.

Perhaps no one has done more to develop this second line of reply than Derk Pereboom (see 1995, 2001, 2002a,b, 2009, 2012, 2013a, 2014a). He argues, for instance, that while certain kinds of moral anger, such as resentment and indignation, would be undercut if moral responsibility skepticism is true, these attitudes are suboptimal relative to alternative attitudes available to us, such as moral concern, disappointment, sorrow, and resolve. The expression of these replacement attitudes can convey the same relevant information as moral anger but in a way that is less harmful and consistent with the denial of basic desert moral responsibility. Expression of resentment and indignation “often fails to contribute to the well being of those whom it is directed” and is “apt to have harmful effects” (Pereboom 2014a: 180). Moral anger frequently is intended to cause physical or emotional pain, and can give rise to “destructive resistance instead of reconciliation” (Pereboom 2014a: 180). As a result it has the potential to damage or destroy relationships. It also often leads to excessively punitive and counterproductive social practices and policies (see Waller 2011, 2014; Carey & Paulhus 2013; Nadelhoffer & Tocchetto 2013; Shariff et al. 2014). [For additional arguments against moral anger and the benefits of relinquishing it, see Flanagan (2016) and Nussbaum (2016).]

Guilt also appears to be one of the reactive attitudes imperiled by moral responsibility skepticism since it involves the supposition that one is blameworthy in the basic desert sense for an immoral action one has performed. Strawsonians fear that absent guilt we would not be motivated to moral improvement after acting badly, and we would be kept from reconciliation in impaired relationships. Furthermore, because guilt is undermined by the skeptical view, repentance is also ruled out, because feeling guilty is a prerequisite for a repentant attitude. It is unclear, though, whether guilt is really needed to perform the functions mentioned above. Suppose instead of guilt an agent acknowledges that she has acted immorally and she feels deep sorrow for what she has done, and as a result she is motivated to eradicate her disposition to behave in this bad way (see Waller 1990: 165–66). Such a reaction, skeptics contend, can secure the good that guilt can also secure, and it is wholly compatible with the skeptical perspective (see Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Waller 1990; cf. Bok 1998). Furthermore, since self-guilt can often be crippling and counterproductive for moral development, an approach that avoids guilt may actually be more successful in bring about the desired change in agents (Sommers 2007a).

Another reactive attitude that some think would be threatened by moral responsibility skepticism is gratitude. Gratitude arguably presupposes that the person to whom one is grateful is praiseworthy in the basic desert sense for a beneficial act (cf. Honderich 1988: 518–19). But even if this is so, certain aspects of gratitude would not be undercut, and these aspects would seem to provide what is required for the personal relationships we value (Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Sommers 2007a). Gratitude involves being thankful toward the person who has acted beneficially. This aspect of gratitude is in the clear—e.g., one can be thankful to a young child for some kindness without supposing that she is praiseworthy in the basic desert sense. And while gratitude also often involves joy as a response to what someone has done, skepticism about moral responsibility does not yield a challenge to being joyful and expressing joy when others act beneficially, so this too is in the clear.

Of course, some of the recommended transformations in emotional attitudes may not be possible for us. In certain situations refraining from resentment or moral anger may be beyond our power, and thus even the committed skeptic might not be able to make the change the skeptical view suggests. Yet, a committed skeptic need not eliminate these attitudes completely to accept the conclusion that agents are never deserving of praise and blame, she must attempt instead not to engage or entertain them (Sommers 2007a: 328; Russell 1992: 296). Shaun Nichols (2007), for example, invokes the distinction between narrow-profile emotional responses, e.g., local or immediate emotional reactions to situations, and wide-profile responses, which are not immediate and involve rational reflection (see also Pereboom 2014a). We might expect to be unable to appreciably reduce narrow-profile moral anger as an immediate reaction upon being deeply hurt in an intimate personal relationship. In wide-profile cases, however, diminishing or even eliminating moral anger is open—or, at least, we can disavow it in the sense of rejecting any force it may be assumed to have in justifying a harmful response to wrongdoing. This modification of moral anger, skeptics contend, might well be advantageous for our valuable personal relationships, and it has the potential to bring about the equanimity that Spinoza (1677 [1985]) thought skepticism about free will and moral responsibility, more generally, would secure (see Pereboom 2001, 2014a; cf. Russell 2004).

3.3 Morality

Since moral responsibility skepticism would require us to reject our ordinary view of ourselves as blameworthy and praiseworthy in the basic desert sense, critics also fear that it would undermine morality. Peter van Inwagen, for example, writes:

I have listened to philosophers who deny the existence of moral responsibility. I cannot take them seriously. I know a philosopher who has written a paper in which he denies the reality of moral responsibility. And yet this same philosopher, when certain of his books were stolen, said, “That was a shoddy thing to do!” But no one can consistently say that a certain act was a shoddy thing to do and say that its agent was not morally responsible when he performed it. (1983: 207)

Fellow libertarian C.A. Campbell agrees and asserts that denying moral responsibility would destroy “the reality of the moral life” (1957; quoted from Waller 2004: 427). The view that moral responsibility is required for morality is not limited, however, to libertarians. Susan Wolf also contends that if we deny moral responsibility, then we must

stop thinking in terms of what ought not to be. We would have to stop thinking in terms that would allow the possibility that some lives and projects are better than others. (1981: 386)

And compatibilist W.T. Stace flatly states, “it is certain that if there is no free will [and basic desert moral responsibility] there can be no morality” (1952). Similar remarks can be found throughout the literature—see, e.g., Copleston (1965: 488), Murphy (1988: 400), Hintz (1958), Rychlak (1979), Babbitt (1999: 88), and Smilansky (2000, 2005).

The notion, though, that moral responsibility is a necessary condition for morality may not be as clear as these philosophers contend and is directly challenged by most skeptics (see Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Waller 1989, 2004, 2011, 2014; Sommers 2007a; see also Haji 1998, 2002). First, it’s unclear what exactly these critics mean when they say that ‘morality’ would be undermined by moral responsibility skepticism. Are they claiming that axiological judgments about intrinsic good and evil, aretaic judgments concerning virtue, deontic judgments about moral obligations, right and wrong, etc. are all undermined? If so, that would be an extreme claim. Even if we came to hold that a serial killer was not blameworthy due, lets say, to a degenerative brain disease, skeptics contend that we could still justifiably agree that his actions are morally bad (Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Waller 2004, 2011). Judgments of moral goodness and badness need not require an agent who is blameworthy or praiseworthy, they simply require grounds by which we can differentiate between the two types of judgments. If one were a Calvinist, for example, they could point the transcendent moral law as a way to judge while simultaneously rejecting all moral responsibility (Waller 2004: 428). Less exalted moral systems, such as utilitarianism or Kantianism, provide alternative ways of grounding moral judgments. Of course, if one were to adopt a Kantian test of universalizability while rejecting the rest of Kant’s moral views (which do presuppose agents are morally responsible), it would hardly be an orthodox Kantian view. But, as several skeptics have noted, the denial of moral responsibility is not inconsistent with the principles of Kantian moral rationalism (see Waller 2004: 429; Vilhauer 2013a,b; Pereboom 2014a). It is arguable, then, that axiological judgments of moral goodness and badness would not be affected by moral responsibility skepticism (Haji 1998; Pereboom 2001, 2014a), and this may be sufficient for moral practice.

Nonetheless, critics might question that if determinism precluded basic desert blameworthiness, would it not also undercut judgments of moral obligation? Kant famously argued that “ought implies can,” and that if the moral law commands that we ought to perform some action, it “inescapably follows” that we must be capable of performing that action (1793 [1998: 94]; 1781 [1998]: A548/B576). And G.E. Moore, following Kant, argues that one “cannot say of anyone that he ought to do a certain thing, if it is a thing which it is physically impossible for him to do” (1922: 317). But if ‘ought’ implies ‘can,’ and if because determinism is true an agent could not have avoided acting badly, it would be false that she ought to have acted otherwise (see Nelkin 2011: 100–101; cf. Jeppsson 2016b). Furthermore, if an action is wrong for an agent just in case she is morally obligated not to perform it, determinism would also undermine judgments of moral wrongness (Haji 1998).

There are, however, a number of possible ways to respond to this criticism. One is to argue, as Waller (2004, 2011) does, that while the ‘ought implies ‘can’ principle (OIC for short) is widespread and deeply entrenched, it is nonetheless false (see also Sinnott-Armstrong 1984; Ryan 2003; Graham 2011). In fact, recent work in experimental philosophy suggests that the principle may not be as intuitive as philosophers think. Buckwalter and Turri (2015), Mizrahi (2015a,b), Chituc et al. (2016), Henne et al. (2016), and Turri (2017) have all run experiments testing ordinary “folk” intuitions about the link between moral requirements and abilities. They each independently found that commonsense morality rejects the OIC principle for moral requirements, and that judgments about moral obligations are made independently of considerations about ability. By contrast, they also found that judgments of blame were highly sensitive to considerations about ability, which suggests that commonsense morality might accept a “blame implies can” principle or that judgments of blame may play a modulatory role in judgments of obligation (see Buckwalter & Turri 2015; Chituc et al. 2016). These empirical findings support Waller’s claim that the OIC principle is a philosopher’s invention infected by mistaken assumptions about moral responsibility (cf. Kurthy & Lawford-Smith 2015; Kurthy et al. 2017; Cohen forthcoming; Graham 2011; Zimmerman 1996).

Another option for skeptics is to accept the OIC principle but adopt an axiological understanding of ‘ought’ and an epistemic reading of ‘ought implies can’ (Pereboom 2014a). On this reading of the principle, when we say that an agent ‘ought to x,’ we are simply making an axiological judgment about x and recommending that the agent perform x at some future time. When we say ‘ought implies can,’ on the other hand, we mean that it is epistemically open to the agent that she will develop the requisite motivation to x, and in this sense can perform x. Furthermore, the axiological and epistemic components are connected in that the recommendation made by the axiological judgment may itself contribute causally to producing the motivation (Pereboom 2014a: 140). Of course, this is not the ‘ought’ of obligation Kant and others may have had in mind, since given the assumption of determinism and that determinism precludes alternatives, when one tells an agent that she ought to refrain from performing an action of some type in the future, it’s not the ‘ought’ of specific action demand, but rather the ‘ought’ of axiological evaluation that is legitimately invoked (Pereboom 2014a: 141). Pereboom calls this the ‘ought’ of axiological recommendation (2014a: 141), and it should not be understood as presupposing a route actually assessable to an agent, via reasons for action, to her acting in some relevant way. All that is required for the legitimate use of ‘ought,’ on this account, is that one be unsure epistemically about whether such a route is accessible, and in most real-life cases this requirement is satisfied since we lack certainty about the future (cf. Nelkin 2014; for reply see Pereboom 2014b).

From the skeptical perspective, then, morality is not about backward-looking assessments of blameworthiness and praiseworthiness, since these are rejected. Rather, morality is forward-looking and functions by invoking the ‘ought’ of axiological recommendation, the epistemic sense of the notion of ‘can,’ and (at least in the case of Pereboom (2014a, 2017b)) a forward-looking notion of blame grounded in the goods of protection, reconciliation, and moral formation. While critics may fear this is still not enough since morality must be capable of grounding backward-looking judgments of blameworthiness and praiseworthiness, the skeptic’s conception of morality may nevertheless be sufficient for the vast majority of our moral practices. [Cf. Fischer 2004; Athanassoulis 2005; Edmundson 2007; Rosen 2004; Moya 2010; Morris 2015]

3.4 Criminal Punishment

One last practical concern about moral responsibility skepticism is that it is unable to adequately deal with criminal behavior and that the responses it would permit as justified are insufficient for acceptable social policy. This concern is fueled by two factors. The first is that one of the most prominent justifications for punishing criminals, retributivism, is incompatible with moral responsibility skepticism. The second concern is that alternative justifications that are not ruled out by the skeptical view per se face independent moral objections. Critics contend that these moral objections are decisive. Skeptics about moral responsibility, on the other hand, argue that non-retributive alternatives exist that are both ethically defensible and practically workable (see, e.g., Pereboom 2001, 2013b, 2014a; N. Levy 2012, 2015; Caruso 2016; Corrado 2001, 2013, 2014, 2017,, forthcoming-a,b; Vilhauer 2013a,b; Focquaert, Glenn, Raine 2013, forthcoming; Shaw 2011; Murtagh 2013).

Within the American criminal justice system, the most prominent justification for criminal punishment is retributivism. This retributivist justification for punishment maintains that punishment of a wrongdoer is justified for the reason that she deserves something bad to happen to her just because she has knowingly done wrong—this could include pain, deprivation, or death. For the retributivist, it is the basic desert attached to the criminal’s immoral action alone that provides the justification for punishment (see, e.g., Moore 1997; Berman 2008, 2013). This means that the retributivist position is not reducible to consequentialist considerations nor in justifying punishment does it appeal to wider goods such as the safety of society or the moral improvement of those being punished. A number of sentencing guidelines in the U.S. have adopted desert as their distributive principle, and it is increasingly given deference in the “purposes” section of state criminal codes, where it can be the guiding principle in the interpretation and application of the code’s provisions (see Robinson 2008). Indeed, the American Law Institute recently revised the Model Penal Code so as to set desert as the official dominate principle for sentencing. And courts have identified desert as the guiding principle in a variety of contexts, as with the Supreme Court’s specifying retributivism as the “primary justification for the death penalty” (see Robinson 2008: 145–146; see also the entries on punishment; legal punishment; and retributive justice.)

While there may be independent reasons for rejecting retributivism, reasons that have nothing to do with free will and moral responsibility, it is clear that moral responsibility skepticism is incompatible with the retributive justification for punishment since it does away with the idea of basic desert. If agents do not deserve blame just because they have knowingly done wrong, neither do they deserve punishment just because they have knowingly done wrong (Pereboom 2014a). The challenge facing moral responsibility skepticism, then, is to explain how we can adequately deal with criminal behavior without the justification provided by retributivism and basic desert moral responsibility. While some critics contend this cannot be done, moral responsibility skeptics point out that there are several alternative ways of justifying criminal punishment (and dealing with criminal behavior more generally) that do not appeal to the notion of basic desert and are thus not threatened by the skeptical perspective. These include deterrence theories, moral education theories, punishment justified by the right to harm in self-defense, and incapacitation theories.

Deterrence theories are typically classified as a subspecies of consequentialist theories of punishment. Consequentialist theories attempt to justify punishment as the best means to achieving certain independently identifiable goods (see, e.g., Bentham 1823; J. Wilson 1983; Walker 1991; see also entry on Legal Punishment). While different consequentialist theories explain the final good or goods at which all our actions aim differently, the most plausible immediate good that a system of punishment can bring about is the reduction of crime. For this reason, consequentialist theories generally suggest that punishment can help to reduce crime by deterring, incapacitating, or reforming potential offenders. Deterrence theories, in particular, hold that punishment can serve the dual purposes of deterring future bad or illegal behavior in the individual (him or herself) who is punished, as well as deter others from similar acts (Ellis 2003, 2005; Hoskins 2011). Such theories are perfectly consistent with moral responsibility skepticism since they are forward-looking and make no appeal to notions of just deserts and blameworthiness.

The most common objection to consequentialist deterrence theories is that they would allow for manifestly unjust punishments. For example, excessively harsh punishment of the guilty or punishment of the innocent could in principle be justified if it were to effectively serve the aim of deterrence and crime reduction (see McCloskey 1957; Hart 1968; Nozick 1974; Ten 1987; Smilansky 1990; Primoratz 1999; Pereboom 2001, 2014a; Honderich 2006; Boonin 2008; Brooks 2012). This is sometimes called the use objection since it holds that consequentialist theories allow, at least in principle, for the use of persons to achieve certain desirable ends, in violation of the Kantian intuition that persons should be treated as ends-in-themselves. There are, however, a number of common responses to this objection. One is to argue that such ‘unjust’ punishments would be justified if they would really produce the best consequence (e.g., Smart 1973: 69–72; Bagaric & Amarasekara 2000; taken from Duff & Hoskins 2017). Another is to argue that in the real world it would be extremely unlikely that such punishment would ever be for the best, and even less likely that the state could be trusted to reliably pick out those rare cases in which they would be—thus the criminal justice system should adopt the view that such punishment is wrong and unjustifiable (see Rawls 1955; Hare 1981; paraphrased from Duff & Hoskins 2017). Finally, some reply that a richer or subtler account of the ends that the criminal law should serve will generate suitable protections against unjust punishments (see Braithwaite & Pettit 1990; Tadros 2011).

Another approach consistent with skepticism about moral responsibility is moral education theories. These theories typically maintain that punishment can be justified only if it benefits the person being punished. An analogy is sometimes drawn with the justification for punishing children—i.e., children are typically not punished to exact retribution, but rather to educate them morally. Jean Hampton, for instance, writes, “punishment should not be justified as a deserved evil, but rather as an attempt, by someone who cares, to improve a wayward person” (1984: 237). On Hampton’s moral education account, punishment is justified if and only if it gets the wrongdoer

to reflect on the moral reasons for [the law’s prohibition] so that he will make the decision to reject the prohibited action for moral reasons, rather than for the self-interested reason of avoiding pain. (1984: 212)

Critics, however, object on number of different grounds. Some point out that while moral education may be one plausible aim of punishment, it is not the “full and complete justification” Hampton (1984: 209) and others claim it to be (see Dagger 2011). Others argue that it is far from evident that punishing adult criminals is similarly likely to result in moral improvements (Pereboom 2001: 162–3; 2014a: 161). Children and adult criminals differ in significant respects—i.e., adult criminals, unlike children, typically understand the moral code accepted in their society, and children are generally more psychologically malleable than adults criminals are (Pereboom 2014a: 162; 2001: 163).

Whether or not moral education theories succumb to these objections (cf. Drucker 1986; Shook 2004; Shafer-Landau 1991; Dagger 2011), there is another non-retributive alternative available to moral responsibility skeptics: an incapacitation account based on the right of self-defense analogous to the justification for quarantine. This is the approach favored by Pereboom and Caruso, and it draws on a comparison between treatment of dangerous criminals and treatment of carriers of dangerous diseases (Pereboom 2001, 2013b, 2014a, 2017a; Caruso 2016, 2017, forthcoming-a; Pereboom & Caruso forthcoming). In its simplest form, it can be summarized as follows: (1) Moral responsibility skeptics claims that criminals are not morally responsible for their actions in the basic desert sense; (2) plainly, many carriers of dangerous diseases are not responsible in this or in any other sense for having contracted these diseases; (3) yet, we generally agree that it is sometimes permissible to quarantine them, and the justification for doing so is the right to self-protection and the prevention of harm to others; (4) for similar reasons, even if a dangerous criminal is not morally responsible for his crimes in the basic desert sense (perhaps because no one is ever in this way morally responsible) it could be as legitimate to incapacitate him as to quarantine the non-responsible carrier of a serious communicable disease.

This account differs from the previous ones in two important ways. First, although one might justify quarantine (in the case of disease) and incapacitation (in the case of dangerous criminals) on purely utilitarian or consequentialist grounds, Pereboom and Caruso resist this strategy. The incapacitation of dangerous criminals is instead justified on the ground of the right to harm in self defense and defense of others—a right that arguably has broader appeal than consequentialism. They contend that this justification makes the view more resilient to objections, especially the use-objection mentioned above (Pereboom 2017a). This is because, as it is illegitimate to treat carriers of a disease more harmfully than is necessary to neutralize the danger they pose, treating those with violent criminal tendencies more harshly than is required to protect society will be illegitimate as well. Furthermore, innocent people could not be incapacitated on this account since they pose no direct threat to others.

Second, the quarantine model places several constraints on the treatment of criminals (see Pereboom 2001, 2014a). First, as less dangerous diseases justify only preventative measures less restrictive than quarantine, so less dangerous criminal tendencies justify only more moderate restraints. In fact, for certain minor crimes perhaps only some degree of monitoring could be defended. Secondly, the incapacitation account that results from this analogy demands a degree of concern for the rehabilitation and well-being of the criminal that would alter much of current practice. Just as fairness recommends that we seek to cure the diseased we quarantine, so fairness would counsel that we attempt to rehabilitate the criminals we detain. If a criminal cannot be rehabilitated, and our safety requires his indefinite confinement, this account provides no justification for making his life more miserable than would be required to guard against the danger he poses. Finally, there are measures for preventing crime more generally, such as providing for adequate education and mental health care, which the moral responsibility skeptic can readily endorse. The public health-quarantine model proposed by Caruso, for instance, extends the quarantine analogy into the arena of public health and attempts to prioritize prevention and social justice. It calls for a shift away from the myopic focus on punishment and toward a more holistic approach to criminal behavior aimed at addressing the causal determinants of crime and the social injustices that give rise to crime. (For criticisms of the quarantine model, see Corrado 1996; Smilansky 2011, 2017; Lemos 2016; Tadros 2017).

Given the various non-retributive options available to moral responsibility skeptics—for additional options see Corrado (2001, 2013, 2014, 2017, forthcoming-a,b), Vilhauer (2013a,b), N. Levy (2012, 2015)—it would be hasty to conclude that the skeptical perspective leaves us unable to adequately deal with criminal behavior. It may even be the case, as many skeptics are apt to propose, that rejecting retributivism and basic desert would allow us to adopt practices and policies that are more humane and effective.


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I would like to thank Derk Pereboom, Neil Levy, Bruce Waller, Manuel Vargas, Ishtiyaque Haji, Joseph Campbell, and Paul Russell for helpful comments on an earlier draft.

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Gregg Caruso <>

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