Philosophy of Technology

First published Fri Feb 20, 2009; substantive revision Mon Mar 6, 2023

If philosophy is the attempt “to understand how things in the broadest possible sense of the term hang together in the broadest possible sense of the term”, as Sellars (1962) put it, philosophy should not ignore technology. It is largely by technology that contemporary society hangs together. It is hugely important not only as an economic force but also as a cultural force. Indeed during the last two centuries, when it gradually emerged as a discipline, philosophy of technology has mostly been concerned with the meaning of technology for, and its impact on, society and culture, rather than with technology itself. Mitcham (1994) calls this type of philosophy of technology “humanities philosophy of technology” because it accepts “the primacy of the humanities over technologies” and is continuous with the overall perspective of the humanities (and some of the social sciences). Only recently a branch of the philosophy of technology has developed that is concerned with technology itself and that aims to understand both the practice of designing and creating artifacts (in a wide sense, including artificial processes and systems) and the nature of the things so created. This latter branch of the philosophy of technology seeks continuity with the philosophy of science and with several other fields in the analytic tradition in modern philosophy, such as the philosophy of action and decision-making, rather than with the humanities and social science.

The entry starts with a brief historical overview, then continues with a presentation of the themes on which modern analytic philosophy of technology focuses. This is followed by a discussion of the societal and ethical aspects of technology, in which some of the concerns of humanities philosophy of technology are addressed. This twofold presentation takes into consideration the development of technology as the outcome of a process originating within and guided by the practice of engineering, by standards on which only limited societal control is exercised, as well as the consequences for society of the implementation of the technology so created, which result from processes upon which only limited control can be exercised.

1. Historical Developments

1.1 The Greeks

Philosophical reflection on technology is about as old as philosophy itself. Our oldest testimony is from ancient Greece. There are four prominent themes. One early theme is the thesis that technology learns from or imitates nature (Plato, Laws X 899a ff.). According to Democritus, for example, house-building and weaving were first invented by imitating swallows and spiders building their nests and nets, respectively (Diels 1903 and Freeman 1948: 154). Perhaps the oldest extant source for the exemplary role of nature is Heraclitus (Diels 1903 and Freeman 1948: 112). Aristotle referred to this tradition by repeating Democritus’ examples, but he did not maintain that technology can only imitate nature: “generally technè in some cases completes what nature cannot bring to a finish, and in others imitates nature” (Physics II.8, 199a15; see also Physics II.2, and see Schummer 2001 and this encyclopedia’s entry on episteme and techne for discussion).

A second theme is the thesis that there is a fundamental ontological distinction between natural things and artifacts. According to Aristotle (Physics II.1), the former have their principles of generation and motion inside, whereas the latter, insofar as they are artifacts, are generated only by outward causes, namely human aims and forms in the human soul. Natural products (animals and their parts, plants, and the four elements) move, grow, change, and reproduce themselves by inner final causes; they are driven by purposes of nature. Artifacts, on the other hand, cannot reproduce themselves. Without human care and intervention, they vanish after some time by losing their artificial forms and decomposing into (natural) materials. For instance, if a wooden bed is buried, it decomposes to earth or changes back into its botanical nature by putting forth a shoot.

The thesis that there is a fundamental difference between man-made products and natural substances has had a long-lasting influence. In the Middle Ages, Avicenna criticized alchemy on the ground that it can never produce ‘genuine’ substances (Briffault 1930: 147). Even today, some still maintain that there is a difference between, for example, natural and synthetic vitamin C. The modern discussion of this theme is taken up in Section 2.5.

Aristotle’s doctrine of the four causes—material, formal, efficient and final—can be regarded as a third early contribution to the philosophy of technology. Aristotle explained this doctrine by referring to technical artifacts such as houses and statues (Physics II.3). The four causes are still very much present in modern discussions related to the metaphysics of artifacts. Discussions of the notion of function, for example, focus on its inherent teleological or ‘final’ character and the difficulties this presents to its use in biology. And the notorious case of the ship of Theseus—see this encyclopedia’s entries on material constitution, identity over time, relative identity, and sortals—was introduced in modern philosophy by Hobbes as showing a conflict between unity of matter and unity of form as principles of individuation. This conflict is seen by many as characteristic of artifacts. David Wiggins (1980: 89) takes it even to be the defining characteristic of artifacts.

A fourth point that deserves mentioning is the extensive employment of technological images by Plato and Aristotle. In his Timaeus, Plato described the world as the work of an Artisan, the Demiurge. His account of the details of creation is full of images drawn from carpentry, weaving, ceramics, metallurgy, and agricultural technology. Aristotle used comparisons drawn from the arts and crafts to illustrate how final causes are at work in natural processes. Despite their negative appreciation of the life led by artisans, who they considered too much occupied by the concerns of their profession and the need to earn a living to qualify as free individuals, both Plato and Aristotle found technological imagery indispensable for expressing their belief in the rational design of the universe (Lloyd 1973: 61).

1.2 Later Developments; Humanities Philosophy of Technology

Although there was much technological progress in the Roman empire and during the Middle Ages, philosophical reflection on technology did not grow at a corresponding rate. Comprehensive works such as Vitruvius’ De architectura (first century BC) and Agricola’s De re metallica (1556) paid much attention to practical aspects of technology but little to philosophy.

In the realm of scholastic philosophy, there was an emergent appreciation for the mechanical arts. They were generally considered to be born of—and limited to—the mimicry of nature. This view was challenged when alchemy was introduced in the Latin West around the mid-twelfth century. Some alchemical writers such as Roger Bacon were willing to argue that human art, even if learned by imitating natural processes, could successfully reproduce natural products or even surpass them (Newman 2004). The result was a philosophy of technology in which human art was raised to a level of appreciation not found in other writings until the Renaissance. However, the last three decades of the thirteenth century witnessed an increasingly hostile attitude by religious authorities toward alchemy that culminated eventually in the denunciation Contra alchymistas, written by the inquisitor Nicholas Eymeric in 1396 (Newman 2004).

The Renaissance led to a greater appreciation of human beings and their creative efforts, including technology. As a result, philosophical reflection on technology and its impact on society increased. Francis Bacon is generally regarded as the first modern author to put forward such reflection. His view, expressed in his fantasy New Atlantis (1627), was overwhelmingly positive. This positive attitude lasted well into the nineteenth century, incorporating the first half-century of the industrial revolution. Karl Marx, for example, did not condemn the steam engine or the spinning mill for the vices of the bourgeois mode of production; he believed that ongoing technological innovation allowed for the necessary steps toward the more blissful stages of socialism and communism of the future. A discussion of different views on the role of technology in Marx’s theory of historical development can be found in Bimber 1990. See Van der Pot 1985 [1994/2004] for an extensive historical overview of appreciations of the development of technology generally.

A turning point in the appreciation of technology as a socio-cultural phenomenon is marked by Samuel Butler’s Erewhon (1872), written under the influence of the Industrial Revolution, and Darwin’s On the Origin of Species (1859). Butler’s book gave an account of a fictional country where all machines are banned and the possession of a machine or the attempt to build one is a capital crime. The people of this country had become convinced by an argument that ongoing technical improvements are likely to lead to a ‘race’ of machines that will replace mankind as the dominant species on earth. This introduced a theme that has remained influential in the perception of technology ever since.

During the last quarter of the nineteenth century and most of the twentieth century a critical attitude predominated in philosophical reflection on technology. The representatives of this attitude were, overwhelmingly, schooled in the humanities or the social sciences and had virtually no first-hand knowledge of engineering practice. Whereas Bacon wrote extensively on the method of science and conducted physical experiments himself, Butler, being a clergyman, lacked such first-hand knowledge. Ernst Kapp, who was the first to use the term ‘philosophy of technology’ in his book Eine Philosophie der Technik (1877 [2018]), was a philologist and historian. Most of the authors who wrote critically about technology and its socio-cultural role during the twentieth century were philosophers of a general outlook, such as Martin Heidegger (1954 [1977]), Hans Jonas (1979 [1984]), Arnold Gehlen (1957 [1980]), Günther Anders (1956), and Andrew Feenberg (1999). Others had a background in one of the other humanities or in social science, such as literary criticism and social research in the case of Lewis Mumford (1934), law in the case of Jacques Ellul (1954 [1964]), political science in the case of Langdon Winner (1977, 1980, 1983) and literary studies in the case of Albert Borgmann (1984). The form of philosophy of technology constituted by the writings of these and others has been called by Carl Mitcham (1994) “humanities philosophy of technology”, because it takes its point of departure from the humanities and the social sciences rather than from the practices of science and engineering, and it approaches technology accepting “the primacy of the humanities over technologies” (1994: 39), since technology originates from the goals and values of humans.

Humanities philosophers of technology tend to take the phenomenon of technology itself largely for granted; they treat it as a ‘black box’, a given, a unitary, monolithic, inescapable phenomenon. Their interest is not so much to analyze and understand this phenomenon itself but to grasp its relations to morality (Jonas, Gehlen), politics (Winner), the structure of society (Mumford), human culture (Ellul), the human condition (Hannah Arendt), or metaphysics (Heidegger). In this, these philosophers are almost all openly critical of technology: all things considered, they tend to have a negative judgment of the way technology has affected human society and culture, or at least they single out for consideration the negative effects of technology on human society and culture. This does not necessarily mean that technology itself is pointed out as the principal cause of these negative developments. In the case of Heidegger, in particular, the paramount position of technology in modern society is rather a symptom of something more fundamental, namely a wrongheaded attitude towards Being which has been on the rise for almost 25 centuries. It is therefore questionable whether Heidegger should be considered as a philosopher of technology, although within the humanities view he is considered to be among the most important ones. Much the same could be said about Arendt, in particular her discussion of technology in The Human Condition (1958), although her position in the canon of humanities philosophy of technology is not as prominent as is Heidegger’s.

To be sure, the work of these founding figures of humanities philosophy of technology has been taken further by a second and third generation of scholars—in particular the work of Heidegger remains an important source of inspiration—but who in doing so have adopted a more neutral rather than overall negative view of technology and its meaning for human life and culture. Notable examples are Ihde (1979, 1993) and Verbeek (2000 [2005]).

In its development, humanities philosophy of technology continues to be influenced not so much by developments in philosophy (e.g., philosophy of science, philosophy of action, philosophy of mind) but by developments in the social sciences and humanities. Although, for example, Ihde and those who take their point of departure with him, position their work as phenomenologist or postphenomenologist, there does not seem to be much interest in either the past or the present of this diffuse notion in philosophy, and in particular not much interest in the far from easy question to what extent Heidegger can be considered a phenomenologist. Of particular significance has been the emergence of ‘Science and Technology Studies’ (STS) in the 1980s, which studies from a broad social-scientific perspective how social, political, and cultural values affect scientific research and technological innovation, and how these in turn affect society, politics, and culture. We discuss authors from humanities philosophy of technology in Section 3 on ‘Ethical and Social Aspects of Technology’, but do not present separately and in detail the wide variety of views existing in this field. For a detailed treatment Mitcham’s 1994 book still provides an excellent overview. A recent coverage of humanities philosophy of technology is available in Coeckelbergh’s (2020a) textbook. Olsen, Selinger and Riis (2008) and Vallor (2022) offer wide-ranging collections of contributions; Scharff and Dusek (2003 [2014]) and Kaplan (2004 [2009]) present comprehensive anthologies of texts from this tradition.

1.3 A Basic Ambiguity in the Meaning of Technology

Mitcham contrasts ‘humanities philosophy of technology’ to ‘engineering philosophy of technology’, where the latter refers to philosophical views developed by engineers or technologists as “attempts … to elaborate a technological philosophy” (1994: 17). Mitcham discusses only a handful of people as engineering philosophers of technology: Ernst Kapp, Peter Engelmeier, Friedrich Dessauer, and much more briefly Jacques Lafitte, Gilbert Simondon, Hendrik van Riessen, Juan David García Bacca, R. Buckminster Fuller and Mario Bunge. The label ‘engineering philosophy of technology’ raises serious questions: many of the persons discussed hardly classify as engineers or technologists. It is also not very clear how the notion of ‘a technological philosophy’ should be understood. As philosophers, these authors seem all to be rather isolated figures, whose work shows little overlap and who seem to be sharing mainly the absence of a ‘working relation’ with established philosophical disciplines. It is not so clear what sorts of questions and concerns underlie the notion of ‘engineering philosophy of technology’. A larger role for systematic philosophy could bring it quite close to some examples of humanities philosophy of technology, for instance the work of Jacques Ellul, where the analyses would be rather similar and the remaining differences would be ones of attitude or appreciation.

In the next section we discuss in more detail a form of philosophy of technology that we consider to occupy, currently, the position of alternative to the humanities philosophy of technology. It emerged in the 1960s and gained momentum in the past twenty to twenty-five years. This form of the philosophy of technology, which may be called ‘analytic’, is not primarily concerned with the relations between technology and society but with technology itself. It expressly does not look upon technology as a ‘black box’ but as a phenomenon that should be studied in detail. It does not regard technology as such as a practice but as something grounded in a practice, basically the practice of engineering. It analyses this practice, its goals, its concepts and its methods, and it relates its findings to various themes from philosophy.

In seeing technology as grounded in a practice sustained by engineers, similar to the way philosophy of science focuses on the practice of science as sustained by scientists, analytic philosophy of technology could be thought to amount to the philosophy of engineering. Indeed many of the issues related to design, discussed below in Sections 2.3 and 2.4, could be singled out as forming the subject matter of a philosophy of engineering. The metaphysical issues discussed in Section 2.5 could not, however, and analytic philosophy of technology is therefore significantly broader than philosophy of engineering. The very title of Philosophy of Technology and Engineering Sciences (Meijers 2009), an extensive up-to-date overview, which contains contributions to all of the topics treated in the next section, suggests that technology and engineering do not coincide, but the book does not specifically address what distinguishes technology from engineering and how they are related. In fact, the existence of humanities philosophy of technology and analytic philosophy of technology next to one another reflects a basic ambiguity in the notion of technology that the philosophical work that has been going on has hardly succeeded in clarifying.

Technology can be said to have two aspects or dimensions, which can be referred to as instrumentality and productivity. Instrumentality covers the totality of human endeavours to control their lives and their environments by interfering with the world in an instrumental way, by using things in a purposeful and clever way. Productivity covers the totality of human endeavours to bring into existence new things through which certain things can be realized in a controlled and clever way. For the study of the dimension of instrumentality, it is in principle irrelevant whether the things that are made use of in controlling our lives and environments have been produced by us first; if we somehow could rely on natural objects to always be available to serve our purposes, the analysis of instrumentality and its consequences for how we live our lives would not necessarily be affected. Likewise, for the analysis of what is involved in the making of artifacts, and how the notion of artifact and of something new being brought into existence are to be understood, it is to a large extent irrelevant how human life, culture and society are changed as a result of the artifacts that are in fact produced. Notwithstanding its fundamental character, the ambiguity noted here seems hardly to be confronted directly in the literature. It is addressed by Lawson (2008, 2017) and by Franssen and Koller (2016).

Humanities philosophy of technology has been interested predominantly in the instrumentality dimension, whereas analytic philosophy of technology has focused on the productivity dimension. But technology as one of the basic phenomena of modern society, if not the most basic one, clearly is constituted by the processes centering on and involving both dimensions. It has proved difficult, however, to come to an overarching approach in which the interaction between these two dimensions of technology are adequately dealt with—no doubt partly due to the great differences in philosophical orientation and methodology associated with the two traditions and their separate foci. To improve this situation is arguably the most urgent challenge that the field of philosophy of technology as a whole is facing, since the continuation of the two orientations leading their separate lives threatens its unity and coherence as a discipline in the first place. Indeed, during the past ten to fifteen years the philosophy of engineering has established itself as a subdiscipline within the philosophy of technology, for which a comprehensive handbook was edited recently by Michelfelder and Doorn (2021).

After presenting the major issues of philosophical relevance in technology and engineering that are studied by analytic philosophers of technology in the next section, we discuss the problems and challenges that technology poses for the society in which it is practiced in the third and final section.

2. Analytic Philosophy of Technology

2.1 Introduction: Science and Technology’s Different Relations to Philosophy

It may come as a surprise to those new to the topic that the fields of philosophy of science and philosophy of technology show such great differences, given that few practices in our society are as closely related as science and engineering. Experimental science is nowadays crucially dependent on technology for the realization of its research set-ups and for gathering and analyzing data. The phenomena that modern science seeks to study could never be discovered without producing them through technology.

Theoretical research within technology has come to be often indistinguishable from theoretical research in science, making engineering science largely continuous with ‘ordinary’ or ‘pure’ science. This is a relatively recent development, which started around the middle of the nineteenth century, and is responsible for great differences between modern technology and traditional, craft-like techniques. The educational training that aspiring scientists and engineers receive starts off being largely identical and only gradually diverges into a science or an engineering curriculum. Ever since the scientific revolution of the seventeenth century, characterized by its two major innovations, the experimental method and the mathematical articulation of scientific theories, philosophical reflection on science has focused on the method by which scientific knowledge is generated, on the reasons for thinking scientific theories to be true, or approximately true, and on the nature of evidence and the reasons for accepting one theory and rejecting another. Hardly ever have philosophers of science posed questions that did not have the community of scientists, their concerns, their aims, their intuitions, their arguments and choices, as a major target. In contrast it is only recently that the philosophy of technology has discovered the community of engineers.

It might be claimed that it is up to the philosophy of technology, and not the philosophy of science, to target first of all the impact of technology—and with it science—on society and culture, because science affects society only through being applied as technology. This, however, will not do. Right from the start of the scientific revolution, science affected human culture and thought fundamentally and directly, not with a detour through technology, and the same is true for later developments such as relativity, atomic physics and quantum mechanics, the theory of evolution, genetics, biochemistry, and the increasingly dominating scientific world view overall. All the same philosophers of science for a long time gave the impression that they left questions addressing the normative, social and cultural aspects of science gladly to other philosophical disciplines, or to historical studies. This has changed only during the past few decades, by scholars either focusing on these issues from the start (e.g. Longino 1990, 2002) or shifting their focus toward them (e.g. Kitcher 2001, 2011).

There is a major difference between the historical development of modern technology as compared to modern science which may at least partly explain this situation, which is that science emerged in the seventeenth century from philosophy itself. The answers that Galileo, Huygens, Newton, and others gave, by which they initiated the alliance of empiricism and mathematical description that is so characteristic of modern science, were answers to questions that had belonged to the core business of philosophy since antiquity. Science, therefore, kept the attention of philosophers. Philosophy of science can be seen as a transformation of epistemology in the light of the emergence of science. The foundational issues—the reality of atoms, the status of causality and probability, questions of space and time, the nature of the quantum world—that were so lively discussed during the end of the nineteenth and the beginning of the twentieth century are an illustration of this close relationship between scientists and philosophers. No such intimacy has ever existed between philosophers and engineers or technologists. Their worlds still barely touch. To be sure, a case can be made that, compared to the continuity existing between natural philosophy and science, a similar continuity exists between central questions in philosophy having to do with human action and practical rationality and the way technology approaches and systematizes the solution of practical problems. To investigate this connection may indeed be considered a major theme for philosophy of technology, and more is said on it in Sections 2.3 and 2.4. This continuity appears only by hindsight, however, and dimly, as the historical development is at most a slow convening of various strands of philosophical thinking on action and rationality, not a development into variety from a single origin. Significantly it is only the academic outsider Ellul who has, in his idiosyncratic way, recognized in technology the emergent single dominant way of answering all questions concerning human action, comparable to science as the single dominant way of answering all questions concerning human knowledge (Ellul 1954 [1964]). But Ellul was not so much interested in investigating this relationship as in emphasizing and denouncing the social and cultural consequences as he saw them. It is all the more important to point out that humanities philosophy of technology cannot be differentiated from analytic philosophy of technology by claiming that only the former is interested in the social context of technology. There are studies which are rooted in analytic philosophy of science but address in particular the relation of technology to society and culture, and equally the relevance of social relations to technological practices, without taking an evaluative stand with respect to technology; an example is Preston 2012.

2.2 The Relationship Between Technology and Science

The close relationship between the practices of engineering and science may easily keep the important differences between the technology and science from view. The predominant position of science in the philosophical field of vision made it difficult for philosophers to recognize that technology merits special attention for involving issues that do not emerge in science. This view resulting from this lack of recognition is often presented, perhaps somewhat dramatically, as coming down to a claim that technology is ‘merely’ applied science.

A questioning of the relation between science and technology was the central issue in one of the earliest discussions among analytic philosophers of technology. In 1966, in a special issue of the journal Technology and Culture, Henryk Skolimowski argued that technology is something quite different from science (Skolimowski 1966). As he phrased it, science concerns itself with what is, whereas technology concerns itself with what is to be. A few years later, in his well-known book The Sciences of the Artificial (1969), Herbert Simon emphasized this important distinction in almost the same words, stating that the scientist is concerned with how things are but the engineer with how things ought to be. Although it is difficult to imagine that earlier philosophers were blind to this difference in orientation, their inclination, in particular in the tradition of logical empiricism, to view knowledge as a system of statements may have led to a conviction that in technology no knowledge claims play a role that cannot also be found in science. The study of technology, therefore, was not expected to pose new challenges nor hold surprises regarding the interests of analytic philosophy.

In contrast, Mario Bunge (1966) defended the view that technology is applied science, but in a subtle way that does justice to the differences between science and technology. Bunge acknowledges that technology is about action, but an action heavily underpinned by theory—that is what distinguishes technology from the arts and crafts and puts it on a par with science. According to Bunge, theories in technology come in two types: substantive theories, which provide knowledge about the object of action, and operative theories, which are concerned with action itself. The substantive theories of technology are indeed largely applications of scientific theories. The operative theories, in contrast, are not preceded by scientific theories but are born in applied research itself. Still, as Bunge claims, operative theories show a dependence on science in that in such theories the method of science is employed. This includes such features as modeling and idealization, the use of theoretical concepts and abstractions, and the modification of theories by the absorption of empirical data through prediction and retrodiction.

In response to this discussion, Ian Jarvie (1966) proposed as important questions for a philosophy of technology what the epistemological status of technological statements is and how technological statements are to be demarcated from scientific statements. This suggests a thorough investigation of the various forms of knowledge occurring in either practice, in particular, since scientific knowledge has already been so extensively studied, of the forms of knowledge that are characteristic of technology and are lacking, or of much less prominence, in science. A distinction between ‘knowing that’—traditional propositional knowledge—and ‘knowing how’—non-articulated and even impossible-to-articulate knowledge—had been introduced by Gilbert Ryle (1949) in a different context. The notion of ‘knowing how’ was taken up by Michael Polanyi under the name of tacit knowledge and made a central characteristic of technology (Polanyi 1958); the current state of the philosophical discussion is presented in this encyclopedia’s entry on knowledge how. However, emphasizing too much the role of unarticulated knowledge, of ‘rules of thumb’ as they are often called, easily underplays the importance of rational methods in technology. An emphasis on tacit knowledge may also be ill-fit for distinguishing the practices of science and engineering because the role of tacit knowledge in science may well be more important than current philosophy of science acknowledges, for example in concluding causal relationships on the basis of empirical evidence. This was also an important theme in the writings of Thomas Kuhn on theory change in science (Kuhn 1962).

2.3 The Centrality of Design to Technology

To claim, with Skolimowski and Simon, that technology is about what is to be or what ought to be rather than what is may serve to distinguish it from science but will hardly make it understandable why so much philosophical reflection on technology has taken the form of socio-cultural critique. Technology is an ongoing attempt to bring the world closer to the way one wishes it to be. Whereas science aims to understand the world as it is, technology aims to change the world. These are abstractions, of course. For one, whose wishes concerning what the world should be like are realized in technology? Unlike scientists, who are often personally motivated in their attempts at describing and understanding the world, engineers are seen, not in the least by engineers themselves, as undertaking their attempts to change the world as a service to the public. The ideas on what is to be or what ought to be are seen as originating outside of technology itself; engineers then take it upon themselves to realize these ideas. This view is a major source for the widely spread picture of technology as being instrumental, as delivering instruments ordered from ‘elsewhere’, as means to ends specified outside of engineering, a picture that has served further to support the claim that technology is neutral with respect to values, discussed in Section 3.3.1. This view involves a considerable distortion of reality, however. Many engineers are intrinsically motivated to change the world, in particular the world as shaped by past technologies. As a result, much technological development is ‘technology-driven’.

To understand where technology ‘comes from’, what drives the innovation process, is of importance not only to those who are curious to understand the phenomenon of technology itself but also to those who are concerned about its role in society. Technology or engineering as a practice is concerned with the creation of artifacts and, of increasing importance, artifact-based services. The design process, the structured process leading toward that goal, forms the core of the practice of engineering. In the engineering literature, the design process is commonly represented as consisting of a series of translational steps; see for this, e.g., Suh 2001. At the start are the customer’s needs or wishes. In the first step these are translated into a list of functional requirements, which then define the design task an engineer, or a team of engineers, has to accomplish. The functional requirements specify as precisely as possible what the device to be designed must be able to do. This step is required because customers usually focus on just one or two features and are unable to articulate the requirements that are necessary to support the functionality they desire. In the second step, the functional requirements are translated into design specifications, which the exact physical parameters of crucial components by which the functional requirements are going to be met. The design parameters chosen to satisfy these requirements are combined and made more precise such that a blueprint of the device results. The blueprint contains all the details that must be known such that the final step to the process of manufacturing the device can take place. It is tempting to consider the blueprint as the end result of a design process, instead of a finished copy being this result. However, actual copies of a device are crucial for the purpose of prototyping and testing. Prototyping and testing presuppose that the sequence of steps making up the design process can and will often contain iterations, leading to revisions of the design parameters and/or the functional requirements. Even though, certainly for mass-produced items, the manufacture of a product for delivery to its customers or to the market comes after the closure of the design phase, the manufacturing process is often reflected in the functional requirements of a device, for example in putting restrictions on the number of different components of which the device consists. The complexity of a device will affect how difficult it will be to maintain or repair it, and ease of maintenance or low repair costs are often functional requirements. An important modern development is that the complete life cycle of an artifact is now considered to be the designing engineer’s concern, up till the final stages of the recycling and disposal of its components and materials, and the functional requirements of any device should reflect this. From this point of view, neither a blueprint nor a prototype can be considered the end product of engineering design.

The biggest idealization that this scheme of the design process contains is arguably located at the start. Only in a minority of cases does a design task originate in a customer need or wish for a particular artifact. First of all, as already suggested, many design tasks are defined by engineers themselves, for instance, by noticing something to be improved in existing products. Nevertheless design often starts with a problem pointed out by some societal agent, which engineers are then invited to solve. Many such problems, however, are ill-defined or wicked problems, meaning that it is not at all clear what the problem is exactly and what a solution to the problem would consist in. The ‘problem’ is a situation that people—not necessarily the people ‘in’ the situation—find unsatisfactory, but typically without being able to specify a situation that they find more satisfactory in other terms than as one in which the problem has been solved. In particular it is not obvious that a solution to the problem would consist in some artifact, or some artifactual system or process, being made available or installed. Engineering departments all over the world advertise that engineering is problem solving, and engineers easily seem confident that they are best qualified to solve a problem when they are asked to, whatever the nature of the problem. This has led to the phenomenon of a technological fix, the solution of a problem by a technical solution, that is, the delivery of an artifact or artifactual process, where it is questionable, to say the least, whether this solves the problem or whether it was the best way of handling the problem.

A candidate example of a technological fix for the problem of global warming would be the currently much debated option of injecting sulfate aerosols into the stratosphere to offset the warming effect of greenhouse gases such as carbon dioxide and methane. Such schemes of geoengineering would allow us to avoid facing the—in all likelihood painful—choices that will lead to a reduction of the emission of greenhouse gases into the atmosphere, but will at the same time allow the depletion of the Earth’s reservoir of fossil fuels to continue. See for a discussion of technological fixing, e.g., Volti 2009: 26–32. Given this situation, and its hazards, the notion of a problem and a taxonomy of problems deserve to receive more philosophical attention than they have hitherto received.

These wicked problems are often broadly social problems, which would best be met by some form of ‘social action’, which would result in people changing their behavior or acting differently in such a way that the problem would be mitigated or even disappear completely. In defense of the engineering view, it could perhaps be said that the repertoire of ‘proven’ forms of social action is meager. The temptation of technical fixes could be overcome—at least that is how an engineer might see it—by the inclusion of the social sciences in the systematic development and application of knowledge to the solution of human problems. This however, is a controversial view. Social engineering is to many a specter to be kept at as large a distance as possible instead of an ideal to be pursued. Karl Popper referred to acceptable forms of implementing social change as ‘piecemeal social engineering’ and contrasted it to the revolutionary but completely unfounded schemes advocated by, e.g., Marxism. In the entry on Karl Popper, however, his choice of words is called ‘rather unfortunate’. The notion of social engineering, and its cogency, deserves more attention that it is currently receiving.

An important input for the design process is scientific knowledge: knowledge about the behavior of components and the materials they are composed of in specific circumstances. This is the point where science is applied. However, much of this knowledge is not directly available from the sciences, since it often concerns extremely detailed behavior in very specific circumstances. This scientific knowledge is therefore often generated within technology, by the engineering sciences. But apart from this very specific scientific knowledge, engineering design involves various other sorts of knowledge. In his book What Engineers Know and How They Know It (Vincenti 1990), the aeronautical engineer Walter Vincenti gave a six-fold categorization of engineering design knowledge (leaving aside production and operation as the other two basic constituents of engineering practice). Vincenti distinguishes

  1. Fundamental design concepts, including primarily the operational principle and the normal configuration of a particular device;
  2. Criteria and specifications;
  3. Theoretical tools;
  4. Quantitative data;
  5. Practical considerations;
  6. Design instrumentalities.

The fourth category concerns the quantitative knowledge just referred to, and the third the theoretical tools used to acquire it. These two categories can be assumed to match Bunge’s notion of substantive technological theories. The status of the remaining four categories is much less clear, however, partly because they are less familiar, or not at all, from the well-explored context of science. Of these categories, Vincenti claims that they represent prescriptive forms of knowledge rather than descriptive ones. Here, the activity of design introduces an element of normativity, which is absent from scientific knowledge. Take such a basic notion as ‘operational principle’, which refers to the way in which the function of a device is realized, or, in short, how it works. This is still a purely descriptive notion. Subsequently, however, it plays a role in arguments that seek to prescribe a course of action to someone who has a goal that could be realized by the operation of such a device. At this stage, the issue changes from a descriptive to a prescriptive or normative one. An extensive discussion of the various kinds of knowledge relevant to technology is offered by Houkes (2009).

Although the notion of an operational principle—a term that seems to originate with Polanyi (1958)—is central to engineering design, no single clear-cut definition of it seems to exist. The issue of disentangling descriptive from prescriptive aspects in an analysis of technical actions and their constituents is therefore a task that has hardly begun. This task requires a clear view on the extent and scope of technology. If one follows Joseph Pitt in his book Thinking About Technology (1999) and defines technology broadly as ‘humanity at work’, then to distinguish between technical action and action in general becomes difficult, and the study of action in technology must absorb all descriptive and normative theories of action, including the theory of practical rationality, and much of theoretical economics in its wake. There have indeed been attempts at such an encompassing account of human action, for example Tadeusz Kotarbinski’s Praxiology (1965), but a perspective of such generality makes it difficult to arrive at results of sufficient depth. It would be a challenge for philosophy to specify the differences among action forms and the reasoning grounding them in, to single out three prominent fields of study, technology, organization and management, and economics.

A more restricted attempt at such an approach is Ilkka Niiniluoto’s (1993). According to Niiniluoto, the theoretical framework of technology as an activity that is concerned with what the world should be like rather than is, the framework that forms the counterpoint to the descriptive framework of science, is design science. The content of design science, the counterpoint to the theories and explanations that form the content of descriptive science, would then be formed by technical norms, statements of the form ‘If one wants to achieve X, one should do Y’. The notion of a technical norm derives from Georg Henrik von Wright’s Norm and Action (1963). Technical norms need to be distinguished from anankastic statements expressing natural necessity, of the form ‘If X is to be achieved, Y needs to be done’; the latter have a truth value but the former have not. Von Wright himself, however, wrote that he did not understand the mutual relations between these statements. Zwart, Franssen and Kroes (2018) present a detailed discussion. Ideas on what design science is and can and should be are evidently related to the broad problem area of practical rationality—see this encyclopedia’s entries on practical reason and instrumental rationality—and also to means-ends reasoning, discussed in the next section.

2.4 Methodological Issues: Design as Decision Making

Design is an activity that is subject to rational scrutiny but in which creativity is considered to play an important role as well. Since design is a form of action, a structured series of decisions to proceed in one way rather than another, the form of rationality that is relevant to it is practical rationality, the rationality incorporating the criteria on how to act, given particular circumstances. This suggests a clear division of labor between the part to be played by rational scrutiny and the part to be played by creativity. Theories of rational action generally conceive their problem situation as one involving a choice among various course of action open to the agent. Rationality then concerns the question how to decide among given options, whereas creativity concerns the generation of these options. This distinction is similar to the distinction between the context of justification and the context of discovery in science. The suggestion that is associated with this distinction, however, that rational scrutiny only applies in the context of justification, is difficult to uphold for technological design. If the initial creative phase of option generation is conducted sloppily, the result of the design task can hardly be satisfactory. Unlike the case of science, where the practical consequences of entertaining a particular theory are not taken into consideration, the context of discovery in technology is governed by severe constraints of time and money, and an analysis of the problem how best to proceed certainly seems in order. There has been little philosophical work done in this direction; an overview of the issues is given in Kroes, Franssen, and Bucciarelli (2009).

The ideas of Herbert Simon on bounded rationality (see, e.g., Simon 1982) are relevant here, since decisions on when to stop generating options and when to stop gathering information about these options and the consequences when they are adopted are crucial in decision making if informational overload and calculative intractability are to be avoided. However, it has proved difficult to further develop Simon’s ideas on bounded rationality since their conception in the 1950s. Another notion that is relevant here is means-ends reasoning. In order to be of any help here, theories of means-ends reasoning should then concern not just the evaluation of given means with respect to their ability to achieve given ends, but also the generation or construction of means for given ends. A comprehensive theory of means-ends reasoning, however, is not yet available; for a proposal on how to develop means-ends reasoning in the context of technical artifacts, see Hughes, Kroes, and Zwart 2007. In the practice of engineering, alternative proposals for the realization of particular functions are usually taken from ‘catalogs’ of existing and proven realizations. These catalogs are extended by ongoing research in technology rather than under the urge of particular design tasks.

When engineering design is conceived as a process of decision making, governed by considerations of practical rationality, the next step is to specify these considerations. Almost all theories of practical rationality conceive of it as a reasoning process where a match between beliefs and desires or goals is sought. The desires or goals are represented by their value or utility for the decision maker, and the decision maker’s problem is to choose an action that realizes a situation that, ideally, has maximal value or utility among all the situations that could be realized. If there is uncertainty concerning the situations that will be realized by a particular action, then the problem is conceived as aiming for maximal expected value or utility. Now the instrumental perspective on technology implies that the value that is at issue in the design process viewed as a process of rational decision making is not the value of the artifacts that are created. Those values are the domain of the users of the technology so created. They are supposed to be represented in the functional requirements defining the design task. Instead the value to be maximized is the extent to which a particular design meets the functional requirements defining the design task. It is in this sense that engineers share an overall perspective on engineering design as an exercise in optimization. But although optimization is a value-orientated notion, it is not itself perceived as a value driving engineering design.

The functional requirements that define most design problems do not prescribe explicitly what should be optimized; usually they set levels to be attained minimally. It is then up to the engineer to choose how far to go beyond meeting the requirements in this minimal sense. Efficiency, in energy consumption and use of materials first of all, is then often a prime value. Under the pressure of society, other values have come to be incorporated, in particular safety and, more recently, sustainability. Sometimes it is claimed that what engineers aim to maximize is just one factor, namely market success. Market success, however, can only be assessed after the fact. The engineer’s maximization effort will instead be directed at what are considered the predictors of market success. Meeting the functional requirements and being relatively efficient and safe are plausible candidates as such predictors, but additional methods, informed by market research, may introduce additional factors or may lead to a hierarchy among the factors.

Choosing the design option that maximally meets all the functional requirements (which may but need not originate with the prospective user) and all other considerations and criteria that are taken to be relevant, then becomes the practical decision-making problem to be solved in a particular engineering-design task. This creates several methodological problems. Most important of these is that the engineer is facing a multi-criteria decision problem. The various requirements come with their own operationalizations in terms of design parameters and measurement procedures for assessing their performance. This results in a number of rank orders or quantitative scales which represent the various options out of which a choice is to be made. The task is to come up with a final score in which all these results are ‘adequately’ represented, such that the option that scores best can be considered the optimal solution to the design problem. Engineers describe this situation as one where trade-offs have to be made: in judging the merit of one option relative to other options, a relative bad performance on one criterion can be balanced by a relatively good performance on another criterion. An important problem is whether a rational method for doing this can be formulated. It has been argued by Franssen (2005) that this problem is structurally similar to the well-known problem of social choice, for which Kenneth Arrow proved his notorious impossibility theorem in 1950. As a consequence, as long as we require from a solution method to this problem that it answers to some requirements that spell out its generality and rationality, no such solution method exists. In technical design, the role that individual voters play in situations of social choice is played by the various design criteria, which each have a say in what the resulting product comes to look like. This poses serious problems for the claims of engineers that their designs are optimal solutions in the sense of satisfying the totality of the design criteria best, since Arrow’s theorem implies that in most multi-criteria problems this notion of ‘optimal’ cannot be rigorously defined, just as in most multi-voter situations the notion of a best or even adequate representation of what the voters jointly want cannot be rigorously defined.

This result seems to except a crucial aspect of engineering activity from philosophical scrutiny, and it could be used to defend the opinion that engineering is at least partly an art, not a science. Instead of surrendering to the result, however, which has a significance that extends much beyond engineering and even beyond decision making in general, we should perhaps conclude instead that there is still a lot of work to be done on what might be termed, provisionally, ‘approximative’ forms of reasoning. One form of reasoning to be included here is Herbert Simon’s bounded rationality, plus the related notion of ‘satisficing’. Since their introduction in the 1950s (Simon 1957) these two terms have found wide usage, but we are still lacking a general theory of bounded rationality. It may be in the nature of forms of approximative reasoning such as bounded rationality that a general theory cannot be had, but even a systematic treatment from which such an insight could emerge seems to be lacking.

Another problem for the decision-making view of engineering design is that in modern technology almost all design is done by teams. Such teams are composed of experts from many different disciplines. Each discipline has its own theories, its own models of interdependencies, its own assessment criteria, and so forth, and the professionals belonging to these disciplines must be considered as inhabitants of different object worlds, as Louis Bucciarelli (1994) phrases it. The different team members are, therefore, likely to disagree on the relative rankings and evaluations of the various design options under discussion. Agreement on one option as the overall best one can here be even less arrived at by an algorithmic method exemplifying engineering rationality. Instead, models of social interaction, such as bargaining and strategic thinking, are relevant here. An example of such an approach to an (abstract) design problem is presented by Franssen and Bucciarelli (2004).

To look in this way at technological design as a decision-making process is to view it normatively from the point of view of practical or instrumental rationality. At the same time it is descriptive in that it is a description of how engineering methodology generally presents the issue how to solve design problems. From that somewhat higher perspective there is room for all kinds of normative questions that are not addressed here, such as whether the functional requirements defining a design problem can be seen as an adequate representation of the values of the prospective users of an artifact or a technology, or by which methods values such as safety and sustainability can best be elicited and represented in the design process. These issues will be taken up in Section 3.

2.5 Metaphysical Issues: The Status and Characteristics of Artifacts

Understanding the process of designing artifacts is the theme in philosophy of technology that most directly touches on the interests of engineering practice. This is hardly true for another issue of central concern to analytic philosophy of technology, which is the status and the character of artifacts. This is perhaps not unlike the situation in the philosophy of science, where working scientists seem also to be much less interested in investigating the status and character of models and theories than philosophers are.

Artifacts are man-made objects: they have an author (see Hilpinen 1992 and Hilpinen’s article artifact in this encyclopedia). The artifacts that are of relevance to technology are, additionally, made to serve a purpose. This excludes, within the set of all man-made objects, byproducts and waste products and equally, though controversially, works of art. Byproducts and waste products result from an intentional act to make something but just not precisely, although the author at work may be well aware of their creation. Works of art result from an intention directed at their creation (although in exceptional cases of conceptual art, this directedness may involve many intermediate steps) but it is contested whether artists include in their intentions concerning their work an intention that the work serves some purpose. Nevertheless, most philosophers of technology who discuss the metaphysics of artifacts exclude artworks from their analyses. A further discussion of this aspect belongs to the philosophy of art. An interesting general account which does not do so has been presented by Dipert (1993).

Technical artifacts, then, are made to serve some purpose, generally to be used for something or to act as a component in a larger artifact, which in its turn is either something to be used or again a component. Whether end product or component, an artifact is ‘for something’, and what it is for is called the artifact’s function. Several researchers have emphasized that an adequate description of artifacts must refer both to their status as tangible physical objects and to the intentions of the people engaged with them. Kroes and Meijers (2006) have dubbed this view “the dual nature of technical artifacts”; its most mature formulation is Kroes 2012. They suggest that the two aspects are ‘tied up’, so to speak, in the notion of artifact function. This gives rise to several problems. One, which will be passed over quickly because little philosophical work seems to have been done concerning it, is that structure and function mutually constrain each other, but the constraining is only partial. It is unclear whether a general account of this relation is possible and what problems need to be solved to arrive there. There may be interesting connections with the issue of multiple realizability in the philosophy of mind and with accounts of reduction in science; an example where this is explored is Mahner and Bunge 2001.

It is equally problematic whether a unified account of the notion of function as such is possible, but this issue has received considerably more philosophical attention. The notion of function is of paramount importance for characterizing artifacts, but the notion is used much more widely. The notion of an artifact’s function seems to refer necessarily to human intentions. Function is also a key concept in biology, however, where no intentionality plays a role, and it is a key concept in cognitive science and the philosophy of mind, where it is crucial in grounding intentionality in non-intentional, structural and physical properties. Up till now there is no accepted general account of function that covers both the intentionality-based notion of artifact function and the non-intentional notion of biological function—not to speak of other areas where the concept plays a role, such as the social sciences. The most comprehensive theory, that has the ambition to account for the biological notion, cognitive notion and the intentional notion, is Ruth Millikan’s 1984; for criticisms and replies, see Preston 1998, 2003; Millikan 1999; Vermaas & Houkes 2003; and Houkes & Vermaas 2010. The collection of essays edited by Ariew, Cummins and Perlman (2002) presents an introduction to the topic of characterizing the notion of function, although the emphasis is on biological functions. This emphasis remains very strong in the literature, as can be judged from the most recent critical overview (Garson 2016), which explicitly refrains from discussing artifact functions.

Against the view that, at least in the case of artifacts, the notion of function refers necessarily to intentionality, it could be argued that in discussing the functions of the components of a larger device, and the interrelations between these functions, the intentional ‘side’ of these functions is of secondary importance only. This, however, would be to ignore the possibility of the malfunctioning of such components. This notion seems to be definable only in terms of a mismatch between actual behavior and intended behavior. The notion of malfunction also sharpens an ambiguity in the general reference to intentions when characterizing technical artifacts. These artifacts usually engage many people, and the intentions of these people may not all pull in the same direction. A major distinction can be drawn between the intentions of the actual user of an artifact for a particular purpose and the intentions of the artifact’s designer. Since an artifact may be used for a purpose different from the one for which its designer intended it to be used, and since people may also use natural objects for some purpose or other, one is invited to allow that artifacts can have multiple functions, or to enforce a hierarchy among all relevant intentions in determining the function of an artifact, or to introduce a classification of functions in terms of the sorts of determining intentions. In the latter case, which is a sort of middle way between the two other options, one commonly distinguishes between the proper function of an artifact as the one intended by its designer and the accidental function of the artifact as the one given to it by some user on private considerations. Accidental use can become so common, however, that the original function drops out of memory.

Closely related to this issue to what extent use and design determine the function of an artifact is the problem of characterizing artifact kinds. It may seem that we use functions to classify artifacts: an object is a knife because it has the function of cutting, or more precisely, of enabling us to cut. On closer inspection, however, the link between function and kind-membership seems much less straightforward. The basic kinds in technology are, for example, ‘knife’, ‘aircraft’ and ‘piston’. The members of these kinds have been designed in order to be used to cut something with, to transport something through the air and to generate mechanical movement through thermodynamic expansion, respectively. However, one cannot create a particular kind of artifact just by designing something with the intention that it be used for some particular purpose: a member of the kind so created must actually be useful for that purpose. Despite innumerable design attempts and claims, the perpetual motion machine is not a kind of artifact. A kind like ‘knife’ is defined, therefore, not only by the intentions of the designers of its members that they each be useful for cutting but also by a shared operational principle known to these designers, and on which they based their design. This is, in a different setting, also defended by Thomasson, who in her characterization of what she in general calls an artifactual kind says that such a kind is defined by the designer’s intention to make something of that kind, by a substantive idea that the designer has of how this can be achieved, and by his or her largely successful achievement of it (Thomasson 2003, 2007). Qua sorts of kinds in which artifacts can be grouped, a distinction must therefore be made between a kind like ‘knife’ and a corresponding but different kind ‘cutter’. A ‘knife’ indicates a particular way a ‘cutter’ can be made. One can also cut, however, with a thread or line, a welding torch, a water jet, and undoubtedly by other sorts of means that have not yet been thought of. A ‘cutter’ would then refer to a truly functional kind. As such, it is subject to the conflict between use and design: one could mean by ‘cutter’ anything than can be used for cutting or anything that has been designed to be used for cutting, by the application of whatever operational principle, presently known or unknown.

This distinction between artifact kinds and functional kinds is relevant for the status of such kinds in comparison to other notions of kinds. Philosophy of science has emphasized that the concept of natural kind, such as exemplified by ‘water’ or ‘atom’, lies at the basis of science. On the other hand it is generally taken for granted that there are no regularities that all knives or airplanes or pistons answer to. This, however, is loosely based on considerations of multiple realizability that fully apply only to functional kinds, not to artifact kinds. Artifact kinds share an operational principle that gives them some commonality in physical features, and this commonality becomes stronger once a particular artifact kind is subdivided into narrower kinds. Since these kinds are specified in terms of physical and geometrical parameters, they are much closer to the natural kinds of science, in that they support law-like regularities; see for a defense of this position (Soavi 2009). A recent collection of essays that discuss the metaphysics of artifacts and artifact kinds is Franssen, Kroes, Reydon and Vermaas 2014.

2.6 Other Topics

There is at least one additional technology-related topic that ought to be mentioned because it has created a good deal of analytic philosophical literature, namely Artificial Intelligence and related areas. A full discussion of this vast field is beyond the scope of this entry, however. Information is to be found in the entries on Turing machines, the Church-Turing thesis, computability and complexity, the Turing test, the Chinese room argument, the computational theory of mind, functionalism, multiple realizability, and the philosophy of computer science.

3. Ethical and Social Aspects of Technology

3.1 The Development of the Ethics of Technology

It was not until the twentieth century that the development of the ethics of technology as a systematic and more or less independent subdiscipline of philosophy started. This late development may seem surprising given the large impact that technology has had on society, especially since the industrial revolution.

A plausible reason for this late development of ethics of technology is the instrumental perspective on technology that was mentioned in Section 2.2. This perspective implies, basically, a positive ethical assessment of technology: technology increases the possibilities and capabilities of humans, which seems in general desirable. Of course, since antiquity, it has been recognized that the new capabilities may be put to bad use or lead to human hubris. Often, however, these undesirable consequences are attributed to the users of technology, rather than the technology itself, or its developers. This vision is known as the instrumental vision of technology resulting in the so-called neutrality thesis. The neutrality thesis holds that technology is a neutral instrument that can be put to good or bad use by its users. During the twentieth century, this neutrality thesis met with severe critique, most prominently by Heidegger and Ellul, who have been mentioned in this context in Section 2, but also by philosophers from the Frankfurt School, such as Horkheimer and Adorno (1947 [2002]), Marcuse (1964), and Habermas (1968 [1970]).

The scope and the agenda for ethics of technology to a large extent depend on how technology is conceptualized. The second half of the twentieth century has witnessed a richer variety of conceptualizations of technology that move beyond the conceptualization of technology as a neutral tool, as a world view or as a historical necessity. This includes conceptualizations of technology as a political phenomenon (Winner, Feenberg, Sclove), as a social activity (Latour, Callon, Bijker and others in the area of science and technology studies), as a cultural phenomenon (Ihde, Borgmann), as a professional activity (engineering ethics, e.g., Davis), and as a cognitive activity (Bunge, Vincenti). Despite this diversity, the development in the second half of the twentieth century is characterized by two general trends. One is a move away from technological determinism and the assumption that technology is a given self-contained phenomenon which develops autonomously to an emphasis on technological development being the result of choices (although not necessarily the intended result). The other is a move away from ethical reflection on technology as such to ethical reflection of specific technologies and to specific phases in the development of technology. Both trends together have resulted in an enormous increase in the number and scope of ethical questions that are asked about technology. The developments also imply that ethics of technology is to be adequately empirically informed, not only about the exact consequences of specific technologies but also about the actions of engineers and the process of technological development. This has also opened the way to the involvement of other disciplines in ethical reflections on technology, such as Science and Technology Studies (STS) and Technology Assessment (TA).

3.2 Approaches in the Ethics of Technology

Not only is the ethics of technology characterized by a diversity of approaches, it might even be doubted whether something like a subdiscipline of ethics of technology, in the sense of a community of scholars working on a common set of problems, exists. The scholars studying ethical issues in technology have diverse backgrounds (e.g., philosophy, STS, TA, law, political science, and STEM disciplines) and they do not always consider themselves (primarily) ethicists of technology. To give the reader an overview of the field, three basic approaches or strands that might be distinguished in the ethics of technology will be discussed.

3.2.1 Cultural and political approaches

Both cultural and political approaches build on the traditional philosophy and ethics of technology of the first half of the twentieth century. Whereas cultural approaches conceive of technology as a cultural phenomenon that influences our perception of the world, political approaches conceive of technology as a political phenomenon, i.e., as a phenomenon that is ruled by and embodies institutional power relations between people.

Cultural approaches are often phenomenological in nature or at least position themselves in relation to phenomenology as post-phenomenology. Examples of philosophers in this tradition are Don Ihde, Albert Borgmann, Peter-Paul Verbeek and Evan Selinger (e.g., Borgmann 1984; Ihde 1990; Verbeek 2000 [2005], 2011). The approaches are usually influenced by developments in STS, especially the idea that technologies contain a script that influences not only people’s perception of the world but also human behavior, and the idea of the absence of a fundamental distinction between humans and non-humans, including technological artifacts (Akrich 1992; Latour 1992, 1993; Ihde & Selinger 2003). The combination of both ideas has led some to claim that technology has (moral) agency, a claim that is discussed below in Section 3.3.1.

Political approaches to technology mostly go back to Marx, who assumed that the material structure of production in society, in which technology is obviously a major factor, determined the economic and social structure of that society. Similarly, Langdon Winner has argued that technologies can embody specific forms of power and authority (Winner 1980). According to him, some technologies are inherently normative in the sense that they require or are strongly compatible with certain social and political relations. Railroads, for example, seem to require a certain authoritative management structure. In other cases, technologies may be political due to the particular way they have been designed. Some political approaches to technology are inspired by (American) pragmatism and, to a lesser extent, discourse ethics. A number of philosophers, for example, have pleaded for a democratization of technological development and the inclusion of ordinary people in the shaping of technology (Winner 1983; Sclove 1995; Feenberg 1999). Such ideas are also echoed in recent interdisciplinary approaches, such as Responsible Research and Innovation (RRI), that aim at opening up the innovation process to a broader range of stakeholders and concerns (Owen et al. 2013).

Although political approaches have obviously ethical ramifications, many philosophers who initially adopted such approaches do not engage in explicit ethical reflection. Also in political philosophy, technology does not seem to have been taken up as an important topic. Nevertheless, particularly in relation to digital technologies such as social media, algorithms and more generally Artificial Intelligence (AI), a range of political themes has recently been discussed, such as threats to democracy (from e.g. social media), the power of Big Tech companies, and new forms of exploitation, domination and colonialism that may come with AI (e.g., Coeckelbergh 2022; Susskind 2022; Zuboff 2017; Adams 2021). An important emerging theme is also justice, which does not just encompass distributive justice (Rawls 1999), but also recognition justice (Fraser and Honneth 2003) and procedural justice. Questions about justice have not only been raised by digital technologies, but also by climate change and energy technologies, leading to the coinage of new notions like climate justice (Caney 2014) and energy justice (Jenkins et al. 2016).

3.2.2 Engineering ethics

Engineering ethics started off in the 1980s in the United States, merely as an educational effort. Engineering ethics is concerned with “the actions and decisions made by persons, individually or collectively, who belong to the profession of engineering” (Baum 1980: 1). According to this approach, engineering is a profession, in the same way as medicine is a profession.

Although there is no agreement on how a profession exactly should be defined, the following characteristics are often mentioned:

  • A profession relies on specialized knowledge and skills that require a long period of study;
  • The occupational group has a monopoly on the carrying out of the occupation;
  • The assessment of whether the professional work is carried out in a competent way is done by, and it is accepted that this can only be done by, professional peers;
  • A profession provides society with products, services or values that are useful or worthwhile for society, and is characterized by an ideal of serving society;
  • The daily practice of professional work is regulated by ethical standards, which are derived from or relate to the society-serving ideal of the profession.

Typical ethical issues that are discussed in engineering ethics are professional obligations of engineers as exemplified in, for example, codes of ethics of engineers, the role of engineers versus managers, competence, honesty, whistle-blowing, concern for safety and conflicts of interest (Davis 1998, 2005). Over the years, the scope of engineering ethics has been broadened. Whereas it initially often focused on decisions of individual engineers and on questions like whistle-blowing and loyalty, textbooks now also discuss the wider context in which such decisions are made and pay attention to for example, the so-called problem of many hands (van de Poel and Royakkers 2011; Peterson 2020) (see also section 3.3.2). Initially, the focus was often primarily on safety concerns and issues like competence and conflicts of interests, but nowadays also issues of sustainability, social justice, privacy, global issues and the role of technology in society are discussed (Harris, Pritchard, and Rabins 2014; Martin and Schinzinger 2022; Taebi 2021; Peterson 2020; van de Poel and Royakkers 2011).

3.2.3 Ethics of specific technologies

The last decades have witnessed an enormous increase in ethical inquiries into specific technologies. This may now be the largest of the three strands discussed, especially given the rapid growth in technology-specific ethical inquiries in the last two decades. One of the most visible new fields nowadays is digital ethics, which evolved from computer ethics (e.g., Moor 1985; Floridi 2010; Johnson 2009; Weckert 2007; van den Hoven & Weckert 2008), with more recently a focus on robotics, artificial intelligence, machine ethics, and the ethics of algorithms (Lin, Abney, & Jenkins 2017; Nucci & Santoni de Sio 2016; Mittelstadt et al. 2016; Bostrom & Yudkowsky 2014; Wallach & Allen 2009, Coeckelbergh 2020b). Other technologies like biotechnology have also spurred dedicated ethical investigations (e.g., Sherlock & Morrey 2002; P. Thompson 2007). More traditional fields like architecture and urban planning have also attracted specific ethical attention (Fox 2000). Nanotechnology and so-called converging technologies have led to the establishment of what is called nanoethics (Allhoff et al. 2007). Other examples are the ethics of nuclear deterrence (Finnis et al. 1988), nuclear energy (Taebi & Roeser 2015) and geoengineering (Christopher Preston 2016).

Obviously the establishment of such new fields of ethical reflection is a response to social and technological developments. Still, the question can be asked whether the social demand is best met by establishing new fields of applied ethics. This issue is in fact regularly discussed as new fields emerge. Several authors have for example argued that there is no need for nanoethics because nanotechnology does not raise any really new ethical issues (e.g., McGinn 2010). The alleged absence of newness here is supported by the claim that the ethical issues raised by nanotechnology are a variation on, and sometimes an intensification of, existing ethical issues, but hardly really new, and by the claim that these issues can be dealt with the existing theories and concepts from moral philosophy. For an earlier, similar discussion concerning the supposed new character of ethical issues in computer engineering, see Tavani 2002.

The new fields of ethical reflection are often characterized as applied ethics, that is, as applications of theories, normative standards, concepts and methods developed in moral philosophy. For each of these elements, however, application is usually not straightforward but requires a further specification or revision. This is the case because general moral standards, concepts and methods are often not specific enough to be applicable in any direct sense to specific moral problems. ‘Application’ therefore often leads to new insights which might well result in the reformulation or at least refinement of existing normative standards, concepts and methods. In some cases, ethical issues in a specific field might require new standards, concepts or methods. Beauchamp and Childress for example have proposed a number of general ethical principles for biomedical ethics (Beauchamp & Childress 2001). These principles are more specific than general normative standards, but still so general and abstract that they apply to different issues in biomedical ethics. In computer ethics, existing moral concepts relating to for example privacy and ownership has been redefined and adapted to deal with issues which are typical for the computer age (Johnson 2003). An example is Nissenbaum’s proposal to understand privacy in terms of contextual integrity (Nissenbaum 2010). New fields of ethical application might also require new methods for, for example, discerning ethical issues that take into account relevant empirical facts about these fields, like the fact that technological research and development usually takes place in networks of people rather than by individuals (Zwart et al. 2006). Another more general issue that applies to many new technologies is how to deal with the uncertainties about (potential) social and ethical impacts that typically surround new emerging technologies. Brey’s (2012) proposal for an anticipatory ethics may be seen as a reply to this challenge. The issue of anticipation is also one of the central concerns in the more recent interdisciplinary field of Responsible Research and Innovation (RRI) (e.g., Owen et al. 2013).

Although different fields of ethical reflection on specific technologies might well raise their own philosophical and ethical issues, it can be questioned whether this justifies the development of separate subfields or even subdisciplines. One obvious argument might be that in order to say something ethically meaningful about new technologies, one needs specialized and detailed knowledge of a specific technology. Moreover such subfields allow interaction with relevant non-philosophical experts in for example law, psychology, economy, science and technology studies (STS) or technology assessment (TA), as well as the relevant STEM (Science, Technology, Engineering, Medicine) disciplines. On the other side, it could also be argued that a lot can be learned from interaction and discussion between ethicists specializing in different technologies, and a fruitful interaction with the two other strands discussed above (cultural and political approaches and engineering ethics). In particular more political approaches to technology can be complementary to approaches that focus on ethical issue of specific technologies (such as AI) by drawing attention to justice issues, power differences and the role of larger institutional and international contexts. Currently, such interaction in many cases seems absent, although there are of course exceptions.

3.3 Some Recurrent Themes in the Ethics of Technology

We now turn to the description of some specific themes in the ethics of technology. We focus on a number of general themes that provide an illustration of general issues in the ethics of technology and the way these are treated.

3.3.1 Neutrality versus moral agency

One important general theme in the ethics of technology is the question whether technology is value-laden. Some authors have maintained that technology is value-neutral, in the sense that technology is just a neutral means to an end, and accordingly can be put to good or bad use (e.g., Pitt 2000). This view might have some plausibility in as far as technology is considered to be just a bare physical structure. Most philosophers of technology, however, agree that technological development is a goal-oriented process and that technological artifacts by definition have certain functions, so that they can be used for certain goals but not, or far more difficulty or less effectively, for other goals. This conceptual connection between technological artifacts, functions and goals makes it hard to maintain that technology is value-neutral. Even if this point is granted, the value-ladenness of technology can be construed in a host of different ways. Some authors have maintained that technology can have moral agency. This claim suggests that technologies can autonomously and freely ‘act’ in a moral sense and can be held morally responsible for their actions.

The debate whether technologies can have moral agency started off in computer ethics (Bechtel 1985; Snapper 1985; Dennett 1997; Floridi & Sanders 2004) but has since broadened. Typically, the authors who claim that technologies (can) have moral agency often redefine the notion of agency or its connection to human will and freedom (e.g., Latour 1993; Floridi & Sanders 2004, Verbeek 2011). A disadvantage of this strategy is that it tends to blur the morally relevant distinctions between people and technological artifacts. More generally, the claim that technologies have moral agency sometimes seems to have become shorthand for claiming that technology is morally relevant. This, however, overlooks the fact technologies can be value-laden in other ways than by having moral agency (see, e.g., Johnson 2006; Radder 2009; Illies & Meijers 2009; Peterson & Spahn 2011; Miller 2020; Klenk 2021). One might, for example, claim that technology enables (or even invites) and constrains (or even inhibits) certain human actions and the attainment of certain human goals and therefore is to some extent value-laden, without claiming moral agency for technological artifacts. A good overview of the debate can be found in Kroes and Verbeek 2014.

The debate about moral agency and technology is now particularly salient with respect to the design of intelligent artificial agents. James Moor (2006) has distinguished between four ways in which artificial agents may be or become moral agents:

  1. Ethical impact agents are robots and computer systems that ethically impact their environment; this is probably true of all artificial agents.
  2. Implicit ethical agents are artificial agents that have been programmed to act according to certain values.
  3. Explicit ethical agents are machines that can represent ethical categories and that can ‘reason’ (in machine language) about these.
  4. Full ethical agents in addition also possess some characteristics we often consider crucial for human agency, like consciousness, free will and intentionality.

It might perhaps never be possible to technologically design full ethical agents, and if it were to become possible it might be questionable whether it is morally desirable to do so (Bostrom & Yudkowsky 2014; van Wynsberghe and Robbins 2019). As Wallach and Allen (2009) have pointed out, the main problem might not be to design artificial agents that can function autonomously and that can adapt themselves in interaction with the environment, but rather to build enough, and the right kind of, ethical sensitivity into such machines.

Apart from the question whether intelligent artificial agents can have moral agency, there are (broader) questions about their moral status; for example would they—and if so under what conditions—qualify as moral patients, to which humans have certain moral obligations. Traditionally, moral status is connected to consciousness, but a number of authors have proposed more minimal criteria for moral status, particularly for (social) robots. For example, Danaher (2020) has suggested that behaviouristic criteria might suffice whereas Coeckelbergh (2014) and Gunkel (2018) have suggested a relational approach. Mosakas (2021) has argued that such approaches do not ground moral status, and hence humans have no direct moral duties towards social robots (although they may still be morally relevant in other ways). Others have suggested that social robots sometimes may deceive us into believing they have certain cognitive and emotional capabilities (that may give them also moral status) while they have not (Sharkey and Sharkey 2021).

3.3.2 Responsibility

Responsibility has always been a central theme in the ethics of technology. The traditional philosophy and ethics of technology, however, tended to discuss responsibility in rather general terms and were rather pessimistic about the possibility of engineers to assume responsibility for the technologies they developed. Ellul, for example, has characterized engineers as the high priests of technology, who cherish technology but cannot steer it. Hans Jonas (1979 [1984]) has argued that technology requires an ethics in which responsibility is the central imperative because for the first time in history we are able to destroy the earth and humanity.

In engineering ethics, the responsibility of engineers is often discussed in relation to code of ethics that articulate specific responsibilities of engineers. Such codes of ethics stress three types of responsibilities of engineers: (1) conducting the profession with integrity and honesty and in a competent way, (2) responsibilities towards employers and clients and (3) responsibility towards the public and society. With respect to the latter, most US codes of ethics maintain that engineers ‘should hold paramount the safety, health and welfare of the public’.

As has been pointed out by several authors (Nissenbaum 1996; Johnson & Powers 2005; Swierstra & Jelsma 2006), it may be hard to pinpoint individual responsibility in engineering. The reason is that the conditions for the proper attribution of individual responsibility that have been discussed in the philosophical literature (like freedom to act, knowledge, and causality) are often not met by individual engineers. For example, engineers may feel compelled to act in a certain way due to hierarchical or market constraints, and negative consequences may be very hard or impossible to predict beforehand. The causality condition is often difficult to meet as well due to the long chain from research and development of a technology till its use and the many people involved in this chain. Davis (2012) nevertheless maintains that despite such difficulties individual engineers can and do take responsibility.

One issue that is at stake in this debate is the notion of responsibility. Davis (2012), and also for example Ladd (1991), argue for a notion of responsibility that focuses less on blame and stresses the forward-looking or virtuous character of assuming responsibility. But many others focus on backward-looking notions of responsibility that stress accountability, blameworthiness or liability. Zandvoort (2000), for example has pleaded for a notion of responsibility in engineering that is more like the legal notion of strict liability, in which the knowledge condition for responsibility is seriously weakened. Doorn (2012) compares three perspectives on responsibility ascription in engineering—a merit-based, a right-based and a consequentialist perspective—and argues that the consequentialist perspective, which applies a forward-looking notion of responsibility, is most powerful in influencing engineering practice.

The difficulty of attributing individual responsibility may lead to the Problem of Many Hands (PMH). The term was first coined by Dennis Thompson (1980) in an article about the responsibility of public officials. The term is used to describe problems with the ascription of individual responsibility in collective settings. Doorn (2010) has proposed a procedurals approach, based on Rawls’ reflective equilibrium model, to deal with the PMH; other ways of dealing with the PMH include the design of institutions that help to avoid it or an emphasis on virtuous behavior in organizations (van de Poel, Royakers, & Zwart 2015).

Whereas the PMH refers to the problem of attributing responsibility among a collective of human agents, technological developments have also made it possible to allocate tasks to self-learning and intelligent systems. Such systems may function and learn in ways that are hard to understand, predict and control for humans, leading to so-called ‘responsibility gaps’ (Matthias 2004). Since knowledge and control are usually seen as (essential) preconditions for responsibility, lack thereof may make it increasingly difficult to hold humans responsible for the actions and consequences of intelligent systems.

Initially, such responsibility gaps were mainly discussed in relation to autonomous weapon systems and self-driving cars (Sparrow 2007; Danaher 2016). As a possible solution, the notion of meaningful human control has been proposed as a precondition for the development and employment of such systems to ensure that human can retain control, and hence responsibility over these systems (Santoni de Sio and van den Hoven 2018). Nyholm (2018) has argued that many alleged cases of responsibility gaps are better understood in terms collaborative human-technology agency (with humans in a supervising role) rather than the technology taking over control. While responsibility gaps may not impossible, the more difficult issue may be to attribute responsibility to the various humans involved (which brings the PMH back on the table).

More recently, responsibility gaps have become a more general concern in relation to AI. Due to the advance of machine learning, AI systems may learn in ways that are hard, or almost impossible to understand for humans. Initially, the dominant notion of responsibility addressed in the literature on responsibility gaps was blameworthiness or culpability, but Santoni de Sio and Mecacci (2021) have recently proposed to distinguish between what they call culpability gaps, moral accountability gaps, public accountability gaps, and active responsibility gaps.

3.3.3 Design

In the last decades, increasingly attention is paid not only to ethical issues that arise during the use of a technology, but also during the design phase. An important consideration behind this development is the thought that during the design phase technologies, and their social consequences, are still malleable whereas during the use phase technologies are more or less given and negative social consequences may be harder to avoid or positive effects harder to achieve.

In computer ethics, an approach known as Value Sensitive Design (VSD) has been developed to explicitly address the ethical nature of design. VSD aims at integrating values of ethical importance in engineering design in a systematic way (Friedman & Hendry 2019). The approach combines conceptual, empirical and technical investigations. There is also a range of other approaches aimed at including values in design. ‘Design for X’ approaches in engineering aim at including instrumental values (like maintainability, reliability and costs) but they also include design for sustainability, inclusive design, and affective design (Holt & Barnes 2010). Inclusive design aims at making designs accessible to the whole population including, for example, handicapped people and the elderly (Erlandson 2008). Affective design aims at designs that evoke positive emotions with the users and so contributes to human well-being. Van de Hoven, Vermaas, and van de Poel 2015 gives a good overview of the state-of-the art of value sensitive design for various values and application domains.

If one tries to integrate values into design one may run into the problem of a conflict of values. The safest car is, due to its weight, not likely to be the most sustainability. Here safety and sustainability conflict in the design of cars. Traditional methods in which engineers deal with such conflicts and make trade-off between different requirements for design include cost-benefit analysis and multiple criteria analysis. Such methods are, however, beset with methodological problems like those discussed in Section 2.4 (Franssen 2005; Hansson 2007). Van de Poel (2009) discusses various alternatives for dealing with value conflicts in design including the setting of thresholds (satisficing), reasoning about values, innovation and diversity.

3.3.4 Technological risks

The risks of technology are one of the traditional ethical concerns in the ethics of technology. Risks raise not only ethical issues but other philosophical issues, such as epistemological and decision-theoretical issues as well (Roeser et al. 2012).

Risk is usually defined as the product of the probability of an undesirable event and the effect of that event, although there are also other definitions around (Hansson 2004b). In general it seems desirable to keep technological risks as small as possible. The larger the risk, the larger either the likeliness or the impact of an undesirable event is. Risk reduction therefore is an important goal in technological development and engineering codes of ethics often attribute a responsibility to engineers in reducing risks and designing safe products. Still, risk reduction is not always feasible or desirable. It is sometimes not feasible, because there are no absolutely safe products and technologies. But even if risk reduction is feasible it may not be acceptable from a moral point of view. Reducing risk often comes at a cost. Safer products may be more difficult to use, more expensive or less sustainable. So sooner or later, one is confronted with the question: what is safe enough? What makes a risk (un)acceptable?

The process of dealing with risks is often divided into three stages: risk assessment, risk evaluation and risk management. Of these, the second is most obviously ethically relevant. However, risk assessment already involves value judgments, for example about which risks should be assessed in the first place (Shrader-Frechette 1991). An important, and morally relevant, issue is also the degree of evidence that is needed to establish a risk. In establishing a risk on the basis of a body of empirical data one might make two kinds of mistakes. One can establish a risk when there is actually none (type I error) or one can mistakenly conclude that there is no risk while there actually is a risk (type II error). Science traditionally aims at avoiding type I errors. Several authors have argued that in the specific context of risk assessment it is often more important to avoid type II errors (Cranor 1990; Shrader-Frechette 1991). The reason for this is that risk assessment not just aims at establishing scientific truth but has a practical aim, i.e., to provide the knowledge on basis of which decisions can be made about whether it is desirable to reduce or avoid certain technological risks in order to protect users or the public.

Risk evaluation is carried out in a number of ways (see, e.g., Shrader-Frechette 1985). One possible approach is to judge the acceptability of risks by comparing them to other risks or to certain standards. One could, for example, compare technological risks with naturally occurring risks. This approach, however, runs the danger of committing a naturalistic fallacy: naturally occurring risks may (sometimes) be unavoidable but that does not necessarily make them morally acceptable. More generally, it is often dubious to judge the acceptability of the risk of technology A by comparing it to the risk of technology B if A and B are not alternatives in a decision (for this and other fallacies in reasoning about risks, see Hansson 2004a).

A second approach to risk evaluation is risk-cost benefit analysis, which is based on weighing the risks against the benefits of an activity. Different decision criteria can be applied if a (risk) cost benefit analysis is carried out (Kneese, Ben-David, and Schulze 1983). According to Hansson (2003: 306), usually the following criterion is applied:

… a risk is acceptable if and only if the total benefits that the exposure gives rise to outweigh the total risks, measured as the probability-weighted disutility of outcomes.

A third approach is to base risk acceptance on the consent of people who suffer the risks after they have been informed about these risks (informed consent). A problem of this approach is that technological risks usually affect a large number of people at once. Informed consent may therefore lead to a “society of stalemates” (Hansson 2003: 300).

Several authors have proposed alternatives to the traditional approaches of risk evaluation on the basis of philosophical and ethical arguments. Shrader-Frechette (1991) has proposed a number of reforms in risk assessment and evaluation procedures on the basis of a philosophical critique of current practices. Roeser (2012) argues for a role of emotions in judging the acceptability of risks. Hansson has proposed the following alternative principle for risk evaluation:

Exposure of a person to a risk is acceptable if and only if this exposure is part of an equitable social system of risk-taking that works to her advantage. (Hansson 2003: 305)

Hansson’s proposal introduces a number of moral considerations in risk evaluation that are traditionally not addressed or only marginally addressed. These are the consideration whether individuals profit from a risky activity and the consideration whether the distribution of risks and benefits is fair.

Questions about acceptable risk may also be framed in terms of risk imposition. The question is then under what conditions it is acceptable for some agent A to impose a risk on some other agent B. The criteria for acceptable risk imposition are in part similar to the ones discussed above. A risk imposition may, for example, be (more) acceptable if agent B gave their informed consent, or if the risky activity that generates the risk is beneficial for agent B. However, other considerations come in as well, like the relation between agent A and agent B. It might perhaps be acceptable for parents to impose certain risks on their children, while it would be improper for the government to impose such risks on children.

Risk impositions may particularly be problematic if they lead to domination or domination-like effects (Maheshwari and Nyholm 2022). Domination is here understood in the republican sense proposed by philosophers like Pettit (2012). Freedom from domination does not just require people to have different options to choose from, but also to be free from the (potential) arbitrary interference in the (availability of) these options by others. Non-domination thus requires that others do not have the power to arbitrary interfere with one’s options (whether that power is exercised or not). Risk imposition may lead to domination (or at least dominating-like effects) if agent A (the risk imposer) by imposing a risk on agent B (the risk bearer) can arbitrary affect the range of safe options available to agent B.

Some authors have criticized the focus on risks in the ethics of technology. One strand of criticism argues that we often lack the knowledge to reliably assess the risks of a new technology before it has come into use. We often do not know the probability that something might go wrong, and sometimes we even do not know, or at least not fully, what might go wrong and what possible negative consequences may be. To deal with this, some authors have proposed to conceive of the introduction of new technology in society as a social experiment and have urged to think about the conditions under which such experiments are morally acceptable (Martin & Schinzinger 2022; van de Poel 2016). Another strand of criticism states that the focus on risks has led to a reduction of the impacts of technology that are considered (Swierstra & te Molder 2012). Only impacts related to safety and health, which can be calculated as risks, are considered, whereas ‘soft’ impacts, for example of a social or psychological nature, are neglected, thereby impoverishing the moral evaluation of new technologies.


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