Theoretical Terms in Science

First published Mon Feb 25, 2013; substantive revision Thu Jul 20, 2017

A simple explanation of theoreticity says that a term is theoretical if and only if it refers to nonobservational entities. Paradigmatic examples of such entities are electrons, neutrinos, gravitational forces, genes etc. There is yet another explanation of theoreticity: a theoretical term is one whose meaning becomes determined through the axioms of a scientific theory. The meaning of the term ‘force’, for example, is seen to be determined by Newton’s laws of motion and further laws about special forces, such as the law of gravitation. Theoreticity is a property that is commonly applied to both expressions in the language of science, and referents and concepts of such expressions. Objects, relations and functions as well as concepts thereof may thus qualify as theoretical in a derived sense.

Several semantics have been devised that aim to explain how a scientific theory contributes to the interpretation of its theoretical terms and as such determines what they mean and how they are understood. All of these semantics assume the respective theory to be given in an axiomatic fashion. Yet, theoretical terms are also recognizable in scientific theories which have as yet resisted a satisfying axiomatization. This is due to the fact that these theories contain general propositions that have the logical form of universal axioms.

Theoretical terms pertain to a number of topics in the philosophy of science. A fully fledged semantics of such terms commonly involves a statement about scientific realism and its alternatives. Such a semantics, moreover, may involve an account of how observation is related to theory in science. All formal accounts of theoretical terms deny the analytic-synthetic distinction to be applicable to the axioms of a scientific theory. The recognition of theoretical terms in the language of science by Carnap thus amounts to a rejection of an essential tenet of early logical empiricism and positivism, viz., the demonstration that all empirically significant sentences are translatable into an observation language. The present article explains the principal distinction between observational and theoretical terms, discusses important criticisms and refinements of this distinction and investigates two problems concerning the semantics of theoretical terms. Finally, the major formal accounts of this semantics are expounded.

1. Two Criteria of Theoreticity

1.1 Reference to Nonobservable Entities and Properties

As just explained, a theoretical term may simply be understood as an expression that refers to nonobservable entities or properties. Theoreticity, on this understanding, is the negation of observabilty. This explanation of theoreticity thus rests on an antecedent understanding of observability. What makes an entity or property observable? As Carnap (1966: ch. 23) has pointed out, a philosopher understands the notion of observability in a narrower sense than a physicist. For a philosopher, a property is observable if it can be ‘directly perceived by the senses’. Hence, such properties as ‘blue’, ‘hard’ and ‘colder than’ are paradigmatic examples of observable properties in the philosopher’s understanding of observability. The physicist, by contrast, would also count quantitative magnitudes that can be measured in a ‘relatively simple, direct way’ as observable. Hence, the physicist views such quantities as temperature, pressure and intensity of electric current as observable.

The notion of direct perception is spelled out by Carnap (1966: ch. 23) by two conditions. Direct perception means, first, perception unaided by technical instruments and, second, that the perception is unaided by inferences. These two conditions are obviously not satisfied for the measurement of quantities like temperature and pressure. For the philosopher, only spatial positions of liquids and pointers are observed when these quantities are measured. To an even higher degree, we are unable to observe electrons, molecules, gravitational forces and genes on this narrow understanding of observability. Hence, expressions referring to such entities qualify as theoretical.

In sum, a property or object is observable (in the philosopher’s sense) if it can be perceived directly, where directness of observation precludes the use of technical artifacts and inferences. Notably, Carnap (1936/37: 455; 1966: 226) did not think his explanation of the distinction to be sufficiently precise to result in a sharp line between observational and theoretical terms. He rather views the theory-observation distinction as being introduced into a ‘continuum of degrees of observability’ by choice. Prominent criticisms of the theory-observation distinction will be discussed in Section 2.1.

1.2 Semantic Dependence upon a Scientific Theory

The above explanation of theoreticity may be felt unsatisfactory as it determines the property of being theoretical only via negation of the property of being observable (Putnam 1962). This explanation does not indicate any specific connection between the semantics of theoretical terms and corresponding scientific theories. There is, however, also a direct characterization of theoreticity that complements the criterion of non-observability: an expression is theoretical if and only if its meaning is determined through the axioms of a scientific theory. This explanation rests on what has come to be referred to as the contextual theory of meaning, which says that the meaning of a scientific term depends, in some way or other, on how this term is incorporated into a scientific theory.

Why adopt the contextual theory of meaning for scientific terms? Suppose the notion of meaning is understood along the lines of the Fregean notion of sense. The sense of a term be understood as that what determines its reference (cf. Church 1956: 6n). It is, furthermore, a reasonable requirement that a semantic theory must account for our understanding of the sense and, hence, our methods of determining the extension of scientific terms (cf. Dummett 1991: 340). For a large number of scientific terms these methods rest upon axioms of one or more scientific theories. There is no way of determining the force function in classical mechanics without using some axiom of this theory. Familiar methods make use of Newton’s second law of motion, Hooke’s law, the law of gravitation etc. Likewise, virtually all methods of measuring temperature rest upon laws of thermodynamics. Take measurement by a gas thermometer which is based on the ideal gas law. The laws of scientific theories are thus essential to our methods of determining the extension of scientific terms. The contextual theory of meaning, therefore, makes intelligible how students in a scientific discipline and scientists grasp the meaning, or sense, of scientific terms. On this account, understanding the sense of a term means knowing how to determine its referent, or extension, at least in part.

The contextual theory of meaning can be traced back at least to the work of Duhem. His demonstration that a scientific hypothesis in physics cannot be tested in isolation from its theoretical context is joined with and motivated by semantic considerations, according to which it is physical theories that give meaning to the specific concepts of physics (Duhem 1906: 183). Poincaré (1902: 90) literally claims that certain scientific propositions acquire meaning only by virtue of the adoption of certain conventions. Perhaps the most prominent and explicit formulation of the contextual theory of meaning is to be found in Feyerabend’s landmark “Explanation, Reduction, and Empiricism” (1962: 88):

For just as the meaning of a term is not an intrinsic property but is dependent upon the way in which the term has been incorporated into a theory, in the very same manner the content of a whole theory (and thereby again the meaning of the descriptive terms which it contains) depends upon the way in which it is incorporated into both the set of its empirical consequences and the set of all the alternatives which are being discussed at a given time: once the contextual theory of meaning has been adopted, there is no reason to confine its application to a single theory, especially as the boundaries of such a language or of such a theory are almost never well defined.

The accounts of a contextual theory of meaning in the works of Duhem, Poincaré and Feyerabend are informal insofar as they do not crystallize into a corresponding formal semantics for scientific terms. Such a crystallization is brought about by some of the formal accounts of theoretical terms to be expounded in Section 4.

The view that meaning is bestowed upon a theoretical term through the axioms of a scientific theory implies that only axiomatized or axiomatizable scientific theories contain theoretical terms. In fact, all formal accounts of the semantics of theoretical terms are devised to apply to axiomatic scientific theories. This is due, in part, to the fact that physics has dominated the philosophy of science for a long time. One must wonder, therefore, whether there are any theoretical terms in, for example, evolutionary biology which has as yet resisted complete axiomatization. Arguably, there are. Even though evolutionary biology has not yet been axiomatized, we can recognize general propositions therein that are essential to determining certain concepts of this theory. Consider the following two propositions. (i) Two DNA sequences are homologous if and only if they have a common ancestor sequence. (ii) There is an inverse correlation between the number of mutations necessary to transform one DNA-sequence \(S_1\) into another \(S_2\) and the likelihood that \(S_1\) and \(S_2\) are homologous. Notably, these two propositions are used to determine, among other methods, relations of homology in evolutionary biology. The majority of general propositions in scientific theories other than those of physics, however, have instances that fail to be true. (Some philosophers of science have argued that this so even for a large number of axioms in physics [Cartwright 1983]). Formal semantics of theoretical terms in scientific theories with default axioms are presently being developed.

2. Criticisms and Refinements of the Theory-Observation Distinction

2.1 Criticisms

The very idea of a clear-cut theory-observation distinction has received much criticism. First, with the help of sophisticated instruments, such as telescopes and electron microscopes, we are able to observe more and more entities, which had to be considered unobservable at a previous stage of scientific and technical evolution. Electrons and \(\alpha\)-particles which can be observed in a cloud chamber are a case in point (Achinstein 1965). Second, assume observability is understood as excluding the use of instruments. On this understanding, examples drawing on the use of cloud chambers and electron microscopes, which are adduced to criticize the theory-observation distinction, can be dealt with. However, we would then have to conclude that things being perceived with glasses are not observed either, which is counterintuitive (Maxwell 1962). Third, there are concepts applying to or being thought to apply to both macroscopic and submicroscopic particles. A case in point are spatial and temporal relations and the color concepts that play an important role in Newton’s corpuscle theory of light. Hence, there are clear-cut instances of observation concepts that apply to unobservable entities, which does not seem acceptable (cf. Putnam 1962).

These objections to the theory-observation distinction can be answered in a relatively straightforward manner from a Carnapian perspective. As explained in Section 1.1, Carnap (1936/37, 1966) was quite explicit that the philosopher’s sense of observation excludes the use of instruments. As for an observer wearing glasses, a proponent of the theory-observation distinction finds enough material in Carnap (1936/37: 455) to defend her position. Carnap is aware of the fact that color concepts are not observable ones for a color-blind person. He is thus prepared to relativize the distinction in question. In fact, Carnap’s most explicit explanation of observability defines this notion in such a way that it is relativized to an organism (1936/37: 454n).

Recall, moreover, that Carnap’s theory-observation distinction was not intended to do justice to our overall understanding of these notions. Hence, certain quotidian and scientific uses of ‘observation’, such as observation using glasses, may well be disregarded when this distinction is drawn as long as the distinction promises to be fruitful in the logical analysis of scientific theories. A closer look reveals that Carnap (1966: 226) agrees with critics of the logical empiricists’ agenda, such as Maxwell (1962) and Achinstein (1965), on there being no clear-cut theory-observation distinction (see also Carnap’s early (1936/37: 455) for a similar statement):

There is no question here of who [the physicist thinking that temperature is observable or the philosopher who disagrees, H. A.] is using the term ‘observable’ in the right or proper way. There is a continuum which starts with direct sensory observations and proceeds to enormously complex, indirect methods of observation. Obviously no sharp line can be drawn across this continuum; it is a matter of degree.

A bit more serious is Putnam’s (1962) objection drawing on the application of apparently clear-cut instances of observation concepts to submicroscopic particles. Here, Carnap would have to distinguish between color concepts applying to observable entities and related color concepts applying to unobservable ones. So, the formal language in which the logical analysis proceeds would have to contain a predicate ‘red\(_1\)’ applying to macroscopic objects and another one ‘red\(_2\)’ applying to submicroscopic ones. Again, such a move would be in line with the artificial, or ideal language philosophy that Carnap proclaimed (see Lutz (2012) for a sympathetic discussion of artificial language philosophy.)

There is another group of criticisms coming from the careful study of the history of science: Hanson (1958), Feyerabend (1962) and Kuhn (1962) aimed to show that observation concepts are theory-laden in a manner that makes their meaning theory-dependent. In Feyerabend’s (1978: 32) this contention takes on the formulation that all terms are theoretical. Hanson (1958: 18) thinks that Tycho and Kepler were (literally) ‘seeing’ different things when perceiving the sun rising because their astronomical background theories were different. Kuhn (1962) was more tentative when expounding his variant of the theory-ladenness of observation. In a discussion of the Sneed formalism of the structuralist school, he favored a theory-observation distinction that is relativized, first to a theory and second to an application of this theory (Kuhn 1976).

Virtually all formal accounts of theoretical terms in fact assume that those phenomena that a theory T is meant to account for can be described in terms whose semantics does not depend on T. The counter thesis that even the semantics of putative observation terms depends on a quotidian or scientific theory, therefore, attacks a core doctrine coming with the logical empiricists’ and subsequent work on theoretical terms. A thorough discussion and assessment of theory-ladenness of observation in the works of the great historians of science is beyond the scope of this entry. Bird (2004), Bogen (2012) and Oberheim and Hoyningen-Huene (2009) are entries in the present encyclopedia that address, among other things, this issue. Schurz (2013: ch. 2.9) defines a criterion of the theory independence of observation in terms of an ostensive learning experiment, and shows how such a criterion helps answer the challenges of theory-ladenness of observation.

2.2 Refinements

There is a simple, intuitive and influential proposal how to relativize the theory-observation distinction in a sensible way: a term t is theoretical with respect to a theory T, or for short, a T-term if and only if it is introduced by the theory T at a certain stage in the history of science. O-terms, by contrast, are those that were antecedently available and understood before T was set forth (Lewis 1970; cf. Hempel 1973). This proposal draws the theory-observation distinction in an apparently sharp way by means of relativizing that distinction to a particular theory. Needless to say, the proposal is in line with the contextual theory of meaning.

The distinction between T-terms and antecedently available ones has two particular merits. First, it circumvents the view that any sharp line between theoretical and observational terms is conventional and arbitrary. Second, it connects the theory-observation distinction with what seemed to have motivated that distinction in the first place, viz., the investigation how we come to understand the meaning of terms that appear to be meaningful in virtue of certain scientific theories.

A similar proposal of a relativized theory-observation distinction was made by Sneed in his seminal The Logical Structure of Mathematical Physics (1979: ch. II). Here is a somewhat simplified and more syntactic formulation of Sneed’s criterion of T-theoreticity:

Definition 1 (T-theoreticity)
A term t is theoretical with respect to the theory T, or for short, T-theoretical if and only if any method of determining the extension of t, or some part of that extension, rests on some axiom of T.

It remains to explain what it is for a method \(m\) of determining the extension of t to rest upon an axiom \(\phi\). This relation obtains if and only if the use of \(m\) depends on \(\phi\) being a true sentence. In other words, \(m\) rests upon \(\phi\) if and only if the hypothetical assumption of \(\phi\) being false or indeterminate would invalidate the use of \(m\) in the sense that we would be lacking the commonly presumed justification for using \(m\). The qualification ‘or some part of that extension’ has been introduced in the present definition because we cannot expect a single measurement method to determine the extension of a scientific quantity completely. T-non-theoreticity is the negation of T-theoreticity:

Definition 2 (T-non-theoreticity)
A term t is T-non-theoretical if and only if it is not T-theoretical.

The concepts of classical particle mechanics (henceforth abbreviated by CPM) exemplify well the notions of T-theoreticity and T-non-theoreticity. As has been indicated above, all methods of determining the force acting upon a particle make use of some axiom of classical particle mechanics, such as Newton’s laws of motion or some law about special forces. Hence, force is CPM-theoretical. Measurement of spatial distances, by contrast, is possible without using axioms of CPM. Hence, the concept of spatial distance is CPM-non-theoretical. The concept of mass is less straightforward to classify as we can measure this concept using classical collision mechanics (CCM). Still, it was seen to be CPM-theoretical by the structuralists since CCM appeared reducible to CPM (Balzer et al. 1987: ch. 2).

Suppose for a term t once introduced by a scientific theory \(T_1\) novel methods of determination become established through another theory \(T_2\), where these methods do not depend on any axiom of \(T_1\). Then, t would neither qualify as \(T_1\)-theoretical nor as \(T_2\)-theoretical. It is preferable, in this situation, to relativize Definition 1 to theory-nets \(N\), i.e., compounds of several theories. Whether there are such cases has not yet been settled.

The original exposition of the theoreticity criterion by Sneed (1979) is a bit more involved as it makes use of set-theoretic predicates and intended applications, rather technical notions of what became later on labeled the structuralist approach to scientific theories. There has been a lively discussion, mainly but not exclusively within the structuralist school, how to express the relativized notion of theoreticity most properly (Balzer 1986; 1996). As noted above, Kuhn (1976) proposed a twofold relativization of theoreticity, viz., first to a scientific theory and second to applications of such theories.

Notably, Sneed’s criterion of T-theoreticity suggests a strategy that allows us to regain a global, non-relativized theory-observation distinction: simply take a term t to be theoretical if and only if it holds, for all methods \(m\) of determining its extension, that \(m\) rests upon some axiom of some theory T. A term t is non-theoretical, or observational, if and only if there are means of determining its extension, at least in part, that do not rest upon any axiom of any theory. This criterion is still relative to our present stage of explicit axiomatic theorizing but comes nonetheless closer to the original intention of Carnap’s theory-observation distinction, according to which observation is understood in the narrow sense of unaided perception.

3. Two Problems of Theoretical Terms

The problem of theoretical terms is a recurrent theme in the philosophy of science literature (Achinstein 1965; Sneed 1979: ch. II; Tuomela 1973: ch. V; Friedman 2011). Different shades of meaning have been associated with this problem. In its most comprehensive formulation, the problem of theoretical terms is to give a proper account of the meaning and reference of theoretical terms. There are at least two kinds of expression that pose a distinct problem of theoretical terms, respectively. First, unary predicates referring to theoretical entities, such as ‘electron’, ‘neutrino’ and ‘nucleotide’. Second, non-unary theoretical predicates, such as ‘homology’ in evolutionary biology and theoretical function expressions, such as ‘force’, ‘temperature’ and ‘intensity of the electromagnetic field’ in physics. Sneed’s problem of theoretical terms, as expounded in (1979: ch. II), concerns only the latter kind of expression. We shall now start surveying problems concerning the semantics of expressions for theoretical entities and then move on to expressions for theoretical relations and functions.

3.1 Theoretical Entities

A proper semantics for theoretical terms involves an account of reference and one of meaning and understanding. Reference fixing needs to be related to meaning as we want to answer the following question: how do we come to refer successfully to theoretical entities? This question calls for different answers depending on what particular conception of a theoretical entity is adopted. The issue of realism and its alternatives, therefore, comes into play at this point.

For the realist, theoretical entities exist independently from our theories about the world. Also, natural kinds that classify these entities exist independently from our theories (cf. Psillos 1999; Lewis 1984). The instrumentalist picture is commonly reported to account for theoretical entities in terms of mere fictions. The formalist variant of instrumentalism denies theoretical terms to have referents at all. Between these two extreme cases there is a number of intermediate positions.[1]

Carnap (1958; 1966: ch. 26) attempted to attain a metaphysically neutral position so as to avoid a commitment to or denial of scientific realism. In his account of the theoretical language of science, theoretical entities were conceived as mathematical ones that are related to observable events in certain determinate ways. An electron, for example, figures as a certain distribution of charge and mass in a four-dimensional manifold of real numbers, where charge and mass are mere real-valued functions. These functions and the four-dimensional manifold itself are to be related to observable events by means of universal axioms. Notably, Carnap would not have accepted a characterization of his view as antirealist or non-realist since he thought the metaphysical doctrine of realism to be void of content.

In sum, there are three major and competing characterizations of a theoretical entity in science that are in line with the common theoreticity criterion according to which such an entity is inaccessible by means of unaided perception. First, theoretical entities are characterized as mind and language independent. Second, theoretical entities are mind and language dependent in some way or other. Third, they are conceived as mathematical entities that are related to the observable world in certain determinate ways. We may thus distinguish between (i) a realist view, (ii) a collection of non-realist views and (iii) a Pythagorean view of theoretical entities.

Now, there are three major accounts of reference and meaning that have been used, implicitly or explicitly, for the semantics of theoretical terms: (i) the descriptivist picture, (ii) causal and causal-historical theories and (iii) hybrid ones that combine descriptivist ideas with causal elements (Reimer 2010). Accounts of reference and meaning other than these play no significant role in the philosophy of science. Hence, we need to survey at least nine combinations consisting, first, of an abstract characterization of the nature of a theoretical entity (realist, non-realist and Pythagorean), and, second, a particular account of reference (descriptivist, causal and hybrid). Some of these combinations are plainly inconsistent and, hence, can be dealt with very briefly. Let us start with the realist view of theoretical entities.

3.1.1 The realist view

The descriptivist picture is highly intuitive with regard to our understanding of expressions referring to theoretical entities on the realist view. According to this picture, an electron is a spatiotemporal entity with such and such a mass and such and such a charge. We detect and recognize electrons when identifying entities having these properties. The descriptivist explanation of meaning and reference makes use of theoretical functions, mass and electric charge in the present example. The semantics of theoretical entities, therefore, is connected with the semantics of theoretical relations and functions, which will be dealt with in the next subsection. It seems to hold, in general, that theoretical entities in the sciences are to be characterized in terms of theoretical functions and (non-unary) relations.

The descriptivist account, however, faces two particular problems with regard to the historic evolution of scientific theories. First, if descriptions of theoretical entities are constitutive of the meaning of corresponding unary predicates, one must wonder what the common core of understanding is that adherents of successive theories share and whether there is such a core at all. Were Rutherford and Bohr talking about the same type of entities when using the expression ‘electron’? Issues of incommensurability arise with the descriptivist picture (Psillos 1999: 280). A second problem arises when elements of the description of an entity given by a predecessor theory T are judged wrong from the viewpoint of the successor theory \(T'\). Then, on a strict reading of the descriptivist account, the corresponding theoretical term failed to refer in T. For if there is nothing that satisfies a description, the corresponding expression has no referent. This is a simple consequence of the theory of description by Russell in his famous “On Denoting” (1905). Hence, an account of weighting descriptions is needed in order to circumvent such failures of reference.

As is well known, Kripke (1980) set forth a causal-historical account of reference as an alternative to the descriptivist picture. This account starts with an initial baptism that introduces a name and goes on with causal chains transmitting the reference of the name from speaker to speaker. In this picture, Aristotle is the man once baptized so; he might not have been the student of Plato or done any other thing commonly attributed to him. Kripke thought this picture to apply both to proper names and general terms. It is hardly indicated, however, how this picture works for expressions referring to theoretical entities (cf. Papineau 1996). Kripke’s story is particularly counterintuitive in view of the ahistorical manner of teaching in the natural sciences, wherein the original, historical introduction of a theoretical term plays a minor role in comparison to up-to-date textbook and journal explanations. Such explanations are clearly of the descriptivist type. The Kripkean causal story can be read as an account of reference fixing without being read as a story of grasping the meaning of theoretical terms. Reference, however, needs to be related to meaning so as to ensure that scientists know what they are talking about and are able to identify the entities under investigation. Notably, even for expressions of everyday language, the charge of not explaining meaning has been leveled against Krikpe’s causal-historical account (Reimer 2010). The same charge applies to Putnam’s (1975) causal account of reference and meaning, which Putnam himself abandoned in his 1980.

A purely causal or causal-historical account of reference does not seem a viable option for theoretical terms. More promising are hybrid accounts that combine descriptivist intuitions with causal elements. Such an account has been given by Psillos (1999: 296):

  1. A term t refers to an entity \(x\) if and only if \(x\) satisfies the core causal description associated with t.
  2. Two terms \(t'\) and t denote the same entity if and only if (a) their putative referents play the same causal role with respect to a network of phenomena; and (b) the core causal description of \(t'\) takes up the kind-constitutive properties of the core causal description associated with t.

This account has two particular merits. First, it is much closer to the way scientists understand and use theoretical terms than purely causal accounts. Because of this, it is not only an account of reference but also one of meaning for theoretical terms. In purely causal accounts, by contrast, there is a tendency to abandon the notion of meaning altogether. Second, it promises to ensure a more stable notion of reference than in purely descriptivist accounts of reference and meaning. Notably, the kind of causation that Psillos’s hybrid account refers to is different from the causal-historical chains that Kripke thought responsible for the transmission of reference among speakers. No further explanation, however, is given of what a kind-constitutive property is and how we are to recognize such a property. Psillos (1999: 288n) merely infers the existence of such properties from the assumption of there being natural kinds.

3.1.2 Non-realist views

Non-realist and antirealist semantics for theoretical terms are motivated by the presumption that the problem of theoretical terms has no satisfying realist solution. What does a non-realist semantics of theoretical terms look like? The view that theoretical entities are mere fictions often figures only in realist portrays of antirealism and is hardly seriously maintained by any philosopher of science in the twentieth century. Quine’s comparison of physical objects with the gods of Homer in his 1951 seems to be an exception. If one were to devise a formal or informal semantics for the view that theoretical entities are mere fictions, a purely descriptive account seems most promising. Such an account could in particular make heavy use of the Fregean notion of sense. For this notion was introduced, among other objectives, with the intent to explain our understanding of expressions like ‘Odysseus’ and ‘Pegasus’. One would have to admit, however, that sentences with names that lack a referent may well have a truth-value and as such deviate from Frege. Causal elements do not seem of much use in the fiction view of theoretical entities.

Formalist variants of instrumentalism are a more serious alternative to realist semantics than the fiction view of theoretical entities. Formalist views in the philosophy of mathematics are ones which aim to account for mathematical concepts and objects in terms of syntactic entities and operations thereupon within a calculus. Such views have been carried over to theoretical concepts and objects in the natural sciences, with the qualification that the observational part of the calculus is interpreted in such a way that its symbols refer to physical or phenomenal objects. Cognitive access to theoretical entities is thus explained in terms of our cognitive access to the symbols and rules of the calculus in the context of an antecedent understanding of the observation terms. Formalist ideas were sympathetically entertained by Hermann Weyl (1949). He was driven towards such ideas by adherence to Hilbert’s distinction between real and ideal elements and the corresponding distinction between real and ideal propositions (Hilbert 1926). Propositions of the observation language were construed as real ones in the sense of this Hilbertian distinction by Weyl, whereas theoretical propositions as ideal ones. The content of an ideal proposition is to be understood in terms of the (syntactic) consistency of the whole system consisting of ideal and real propositions being asserted. This is the defining property of an ideal proposition.

3.1.3 The Pythagorean view

We still need to discuss the view that theoretical entities are mathematical entities that are related to observable events in certain determinate ways. This theory is clearly of the descriptivist type, as we shall see more clearly when dealing with the formal account by Carnap in Section 4. No causal elements are needed in Carnap’s Pythagorean empiricism.

It is fair to characterize the Pythagorean view in general by saying that it shifts the problem of theoretical terms to the theory of meaning and reference for mathematical expressions. The question of how we are able to refer successfully to electrons is answered by the Pythagorean by pointing out that we are able to refer successfully to mathematical entities. Moreover, the Pythagorean explains, it is part of the notion of an electron that corresponding mathematical entities are connected to observable phenomena by means of axioms and inference rules. The empirical surplus of theoretical entities in comparison to “pure” mathematical entities is thus captured by axioms and inference rules that establish connections to empirical phenomena. Since mathematical entities do not, by themselves, have connections to observable phenomena, the question of truth and falsehood may not be put in a truth-conditional manner for those axioms that connect mathematical entities with phenomenal events (cf. Section 4.2). Carnap (1958), therefore, came to speak of postulates when referring to the axioms of a scientific theory.

How do we come to refer successfully to mathematical entities? This, of course, is a problem in the philosophy of mathematics. (For a classical paper that addresses this problem see Benacerraf (1973)). Carnap has not much to say about meaning and reference of mathematical expressions in his seminal “The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts” (1956) but discusses these issues in his “Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology” (1950). There he aims at establishing a metaphysically neutral position that avoids a commitment to Platonist, nominalist or formalist conceptions of mathematical objects. A proponent of the Pythagorean view other than Carnap is Hermann Weyl (1949). As for the cognition of mathematical entities, Weyl largely followed Hilbert’s formalism in his later work. Hence, there is a non-empty intersection between the Pythagorean view and the formalist view of theoretical entities. Unlike Carnap, Weyl did not characterize the interpretation of theoretical terms by means of model-theoretic notions.

3.2 Theoretical Functions and Relations

For theoretical functions and relations, a particular problem arises from the idea that a theoretical term is, by definition, semantically dependent upon a scientific theory. Let us recall the above explanation of T-theoreticity: a term t is T-theoretical if and only if any method of determining the extension of t, or some part of that extension, rests on some axiom of T. Let \(\phi\) be such an axiom and \(m\) be a corresponding method of determination. The present explanation of T-theoreticity, then, means that \(m\) is valid only on condition of \(\phi\) being true. The latter dependency holds because \(\phi\) is used either explicitly in calculations to determine t or in the calibration of measurement devices. Such devices, then, perform the calculation implicitly. A case in point is measurement of temperature by a gas thermometer. Such a device rests upon the law that changes of temperature result into proportional changes in the volume of gases.

Suppose now t is theoretical with respect to a theory T. Then it holds that in order to measure t, we need to assume the truth of some axiom \(\phi\) of T. Suppose, further, that t has occurrences in \(\phi\), as is standard in examples of T-theoreticity. From this it follows that, in standard truth-conditional semantics, the truth-value of \(\phi\) is dependent on the semantic value of t. This leads to the following epistemological problem: on the one hand, we need to know the extension of t in order to find out whether \(\phi\) is true. On the other hand, it is simply impossible to determine the extension of t without using \(\phi\) or some other axiom of T. This mutual dependency between the semantic values of \(\phi\) and t makes it difficult, if not even impossible, to have evidence for \(\phi\) being true in any of its applications (cf. Andreas 2008).

We could, of course, use an alternative measurement method of t, say one resting upon an axiom \(\psi\) of T, to gain evidence for the axiom \(\phi\) being true in some selected instances. This move, however, only shifts the problem to applications of another axiom of T. For these applications the same type of difficulty arises, viz., mutual dependency of the semantic values of \(\psi\) and t. We are thus caught either in a vicious circle or in an infinite regress when attempting to gain evidence for the propriety of a single measurement of a theoretical term. Sneed (1979: ch. II) was the first to describe that particular difficulty in the present manner and termed it the problem of theoretical terms. Measurement of the force function in classical mechanics exemplifies this problem well. There is no method of measuring force that does not rest upon some law of classical mechanics. Likewise, it is impossible to measure temperature without using some law that depends upon either phenomenological or statistical thermodynamics.

Though its formulation is primarily epistemological, Sneed’s problem of theoretical terms has a semantic reading. Let the meaning of a term be identified with the methods of determining its extension, as in Section 1.2. Then we can say that our understanding of T-theoretical relations and functions originates from the axioms of the scientific theory T. In standard truth-conditional semantics, by contrast, one assumes that the truth-value of an axiom \(\phi\) is determined by the semantic values of those descriptive constants that have occurrences in \(\phi\). Among these constants, there are theoretical terms of T. Hence, it appears that standard truth-conditional semantics does not accord with the order of our grasping the meaning of theoretical terms. In the next section, we shall deal with indirect means of interpreting theoretical terms. These proved to be ways out of the present problem of theoretical terms.

4. Formal Accounts

A few notational conventions and preliminary considerations are necessary to explain the formal accounts of theoretical terms and their semantics. Essential to all of these accounts is the division of the set of descriptive symbols into a set \(V_o\) of observational and another set \(V_t\) of theoretical terms. (The descriptive symbols of a formal language are simply the non-logical ones.) A scientific theory thus be formulated in a language \(L(V_o,V_t)\). The division of the descriptive vocabulary gives rise to a related distinction between T- and C-axioms among the axioms of a scientific theory. The T-axioms contain only \(V_t\) symbols as descriptive ones, while the C-axioms contain both \(V_o\) and \(V_t\) symbols. The latter axioms establish a connection between the theoretical and the observational terms. TC designates the conjunction of T- and C-axioms and \(A(\TC)\) the set of these axioms. Let \(n_1 ,\ldots ,n_k\) be the elements of \(V_o\) and \(t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n\) the elements of \(V_t\). Then, TC is a proposition of the following type:

\[\tag{\(\TC\)} \TC(n_1 ,\ldots ,n_k, t_1 ,\ldots ,t_n)\]

As for the domain of interpretation of \(L(V_o,V_t)\), Ramsey (1929) assumes there to be only one for all descriptive symbols. Carnap (1956, 1958), by contrast, distinguishes between a domain of interpretation for observational terms and another for theoretical terms. Notably, the latter domain contains exclusively mathematical entities. Ketland (2004) has emphasized the importance of distinguishing between an observational and a theoretical domain of interpretation, where the latter is allowed to contain theoretical entities, such as electrons and protons.

TC is a first-order sentence in a large number of accounts, as in Ramsey’s seminal “Theories” (1929). Carnap (1956; 1958), however, works with higher-order logic to allow for the formulation of mathematical propositions and concepts.

4.1 The Ramsey Sentence

The Ramsey sentence of a theory TC in the language \(L(V_o,V_t)\) is obtained by the following two transformations of the conjunction of T- and C-axioms. First, replace all theoretical symbols in this conjunction by higher-order variables of appropriate type. Then, bind these variables by higher-order existential quantifiers. As result one obtains a higher-order sentence of the following form: \[\tag{\(\TC^R\)} \exists X_1 \ldots \exists X_n \TC(n_1 , \ldots ,n_k, X_1 , \ldots ,X_n)\]

where \(X_1 , \ldots ,X_n\) are higher-order variables. This sentence says that there is an extensional interpretation of the theoretical terms that verifies, together with an antecedently given interpretation of the observation language \(L(V_o)\), the axioms TC. The Ramsey sentence expresses an apparently weaker proposition than TC, at least in standard truth-conditional semantics. If one thinks that the Ramsey sentence expresses the proposition of a scientific theory more properly than TC, one holds the Ramsey view of scientific theories.

Why should one prefer the Ramsey view to the standard one? Ramsey ([1929] 1978: 120) himself seemed to have something like a contextual theory of meaning in mind when proposing the replacement of theoretical constants with appropriate higher-order variables:

Any additions to the theory, whether in the form of new axioms or particular assertions like \(\alpha(0, 3)\) are to be made within the scope of the original \(\alpha\), \(\beta\), \(\gamma\). They are not, therefore, strictly propositions by themselves just as the different sentences in a story beginning ‘Once upon a time’ have not complete meanings and so are not propositions by themselves.

\(\alpha\), \(\beta\), and \(\gamma\) figure in this explanation as theoretical terms to be replaced by higher-order variables. Ramsey goes on to suggest that the meaning of a theoretical sentence \(\phi\) is the difference between

  1. \((\TC \wedge A \wedge \phi)^R\)


  1. \((\TC \wedge A)^R\)

where \(A\) stands for the set of observation sentences being asserted and (...)\(^R\) for the operation of Ramsification, i.e., existentially generalizing on all theoretical terms. This proposal of expressing theoretical assertions clearly makes such assertions dependent upon the context of the theory TC. Ramsey ([1929] 1978: 124) thinks that a theoretical assertion \(\phi\) is not meaningful if no observational evidence can be found for either \(\phi\) or its negation. In this case there is no stock \(A\) of observation sentences such that (1) and (2) differ in truth-value.

Another important argument in favor of the Ramsey view was given later by Sneed (1979: ch. III). It is easy to show that Sneed’s problem of theoretical terms (which concerns relations and functions) does not arise in the first place on the Ramsey view. For by \(\TC^R\) it is only claimed that there are extensions of the theoretical terms satisfying each axiom of the set \(A(\TC)\) under a given interpretation of the observational language. No claim, however, is made by \(\TC^R\) as to whether or not the sentences of \(A(\TC)\) are true. Nonetheless, it can be shown that \(\TC^R\) and TC have the same observational consequences:

Proposition 1   For all \(L(V_o)\) sentences \(\phi\), \(\TC^R\) \(\vdash \phi\) if and only if \(\TC \vdash \phi\), where \(\vdash\) designates the relation of logical consequence in classical logic.

Hence, the Ramsey sentence cannot be true in case the original theory TC is not consistent with the observable facts. For a discussion of empirical adequacy and Ramsification see Ketland (2004).

One difficulty, however, remains with the Ramsey view. It concerns the representation of deductive reasoning, for many logicians the primary objective of logic. Now, Ramsey ([1929] 1978: 121) thinks that the ‘incompleteness’ of theoretical assertions does not affect our reasoning. No formal account, however, is given that relates our deductive practice, in which abundant use of theoretical constants is made, to the existentially quantified variables in the Ramsey sentence. One thing we lack is a translation of theoretical sentences (other than the axioms) that is in keeping with the view that the meaning of a theoretical sentence \(\phi\) is the difference between \((\TC \wedge A \wedge \phi)^R\) and \((\TC \wedge A)^R\). As Ramsey observes, it would not be correct to take \((\TC \wedge A \wedge \phi)^R\) as a translation of a theoretical sentence \(\phi\) since both \((\TC \wedge A \wedge \phi)^R\) and \((\TC \wedge A \wedge \neg \phi)^R\) may well be true. Such a translation would not obey the laws of classical logic. These laws, however, are supposed to govern deductive reasoning in science. A proper semantics of theoretical terms must take the peculiarities of these terms into account without revising the rules and axioms of deduction in classical logic.

There thus remains the challenge of relating the apparent use of theoretical constants in deductive scientific reasoning to the Ramsey formulation of scientific theories. Carnap was well aware of this challenge and addressed it using a sentence that became labeled later on the Carnap sentence of a scientific theory (Carnap 1958; 1966: ch. 23):

\[ \tag{\(A_T\)} \TC^R \rightarrow \TC\]

This sentence is part of a proposal to draw the analytic-synthetic distinction at the global level of a scientific theory (as this distinction proved not to be applicable to single axioms): the analytic part of the theory is given by its Carnap sentence \(A_T\), whereas the synthetic part is identified with the theory’s Ramsey sentence in light of Proposition 1. Carnap (1958) wants \(A_T\) to be understood as follows: if the Ramsey sentence is true, then the theoretical terms be interpreted such that TC comes out true as well. So, on condition of \(\TC^R\) being true, we can recover the original formulation of the theory in which the theoretical terms occur as constants. For, obviously, TC is derivable from \(\TC^R\) and \(A_T\) using modus ponens.

From the viewpoint of standard truth-conditional semantics, however, this instruction to interpret the Carnap sentence appears arbitrary, if not even misguided. For in standard semantics, the Ramsey sentence may well be true without TC being so (cf. Ketland 2004). Hence, the Carnap sentence would not count as analytic, as Carnap intended. Carnap’s interpretation of \(A_T\) receives a sound foundation in his (1961) proposal to define theoretical terms using Hilbert’s epsilon operator, as we shall see in Section 4.3.

4.2 Indirect Interpretation

The notion of an indirect interpretation was introduced by Carnap in his Foundations of Logic and Mathematics (1939: ch. 23–24) with the intention of accounting for the semantics of theoretical terms in physics. It goes without saying that this notion is understood against the background of the notion of a direct interpretation. Carnap had the following distinction in mind. The interpretation of a descriptive symbol is direct if and only if (i) it is given by an assignment of an extension or an intension, and (ii) this assignment is made by expressions of the metalanguage. The interpretation of a descriptive symbol is indirect, by contrast, if and only if it is specified by one or several sentences of the object language, which then figure as axioms in the respective calculus. Here are two simple examples of a direct interpretation:

R’ designates the property of being rational.

A’ designates the property of being an animal.

The predicate ‘H’, by contrast, is interpreted in an indirect manner by a definition in the object language:

\[\forall x(Hx \leftrightarrow Rx \wedge Ax)\]

Interpretation of a symbol by a definition counts as one type of indirect interpretation. Another type is the interpretation of theoretical terms by the axioms of a scientific theory. Carnap (1939: 65) remains content with a merely syntactic explanation of indirect interpretation:

The calculus is first constructed floating in the air, so to speak; the construction begins at the top and then adds lower and lower levels. Finally, by the semantical rules, the lowest level is anchored at the solid ground of the observable facts. The laws, whether general or special, are not directly interpreted, but only the singular sentences.

The laws \(A(\TC)\) are thus simply adopted as axioms in the calculus without assuming any prior interpretation or reference to the world for theoretical terms. (A sentence \(\phi\) being an axiom of a calculus C means that \(\phi\) can be used in any formal derivation in C without being a member of the premises.) This account amounts to a formalist understanding of the theoretical language in science. It has two particular merits. First, it circumvents Sneed’s problem of theoretical terms since the axioms are not required to be true in the interpretation of the respective language that represents the facts of the theory-independent world. The need for assuming such an interpretation is simply denied. Second, the account is in line with the contextual theory meaning for theoretical terms as our understanding of such terms is explained in terms of the axioms of the respective scientific theories (cf. Section 1.2).

There are less formalist accounts of indirect interpretation in terms of explicit model-theoretic notions by Przelecki (1969: ch. 6) and Andreas (2010).[2] The latter account proves to formally work out ideas about theoretical terms in Carnap (1958). It emerged from an investigation into the similarities and dissimilarities between Carnapian postulates and definitions. Recall that Carnap viewed the axioms of a scientific theory as postulates since they contribute to the interpretation of theoretical terms. When explaining the Carnap sentence \(\TC^R \rightarrow \TC\), Carnap says that, if the Ramsey sentence is true, the theoretical terms are to be understood in accordance with some interpretation that satisfies TC. This is the sense in which we can say that Carnapian postulates contribute to the interpretation of theoretical terms in a manner akin to the interpretation of a defined term by the corresponding definition. Postulates and definitions alike impose a constraint on the admissible, or intended, interpretation of the complete language \(L(V)\), where \(V\) contains basic and indirectly interpreted terms.

Yet, the interpretation of theoretical terms by axioms of a scientific theory differs in several ways from that of a defined term by a definition. First, the introduction of theoretical terms may be joined with the introduction of another, theoretical domain of interpretation, in addition to the basic domain of interpretation in which observation terms are interpreted. Second, it must not be assumed that the interpretation of theoretical terms results in a unique determination of the extension of these terms. This is an implication of Carnap’s doctrine of partial interpretation (1958), as will become obvious by the end of this section. Third, axioms of a scientific theory are not conservative extensions of the observation language since they enable us to make predictions. Definitions, by contrast, must be conservative (cf. Gupta 2009). Taking these differences into account when observing the semantic similarities between definitions and Carnapian postulates suggests the following explanation: a set \(A(\TC)\) of axioms that interprets a set \(V_t\) of theoretical terms on the basis of a language \(L(V_o)\) imposes a constraint on the admissible, or intended, interpretations of the language \(L(V_o,V_t)\). An \(L(V_o,V_t)\) structure is admissible if and only if it (i) satisfies the axioms \(A(\TC)\) and (ii) extends the intended interpretation of \(L(V_o)\) to include an interpretation of the theoretical terms.

In more formal terms (Andreas 2010: 373; Przelecki 1969: ch. 6):

Definition 3 (Set \(\mathcal{S}\) of admissible structures)
Let \(\mathcal{A}_o\) designate the intended interpretation of the observation language. Further, \(\MOD(A(\TC))\) designates the set of \(L(V_o,V_t)\) structures that satisfy the axioms \(A(\TC)\). \(\EXT(\mathcal{A}_o,V_t,D_t)\) is the set of \(L(V_o,V_t)\) structures that extend \(\mathcal{A}_o\) to interpret the theoretical terms, where these terms are allowed to have argument positions being interpreted in a domain \(D_t\) of theoretical entities.

  1. If \(\MOD(A(\TC)) \cap \EXT(\mathcal{A}_o,V_t,D_t) \ne \varnothing\), then \(\mathcal{S} := \MOD(A(\TC)) \cap \EXT(\mathcal{A}_o,V_t,D_t)\);
  2. If \(\MOD(A(\TC)) \cap \EXT(\mathcal{A}_o,V_t,D_t) = \varnothing\), then \(\mathcal{S} := \EXT(\mathcal{A}_o,V_t,D_t)\).

Given there is a range of admissible, i.e., intended structures, the following truth-rules for theoretical sentences are intuitive:

Definition 4 (Truth-rules for theoretical sentences)
\(\nu : L(V_o,V_t) \rightarrow \{T, F, I\}.\)

  1. \(\nu(\phi) := T\) if and only if for all structures \(\mathcal{A} \in \mathcal{S}, \mathcal{A} \vDash \phi\);
  2. \(\nu(\phi) := F\) if and only if for all structures \(\mathcal{A} \in \mathcal{S}, \mathcal{A} \not\vDash \phi\);
  3. \(\nu(\phi) := I\) (indeterminate) if and only if there are structures \(\mathcal{A}_1, \mathcal{A}_2 \in \mathcal{S}\) such that \(\mathcal{A}_1 \vDash \phi\) but not \(\mathcal{A}_2 \vDash \phi\).

The idea lying behind these rules comes from supervaluation logic (van Fraassen 1969; Priest 2001: ch. 7). A sentence is true if and only if it is true in every admissible structure. It is false, by contrast, if and only if it is false in every admissible structure. And a sentence does not have a determinate truth-value if and only if it is true in, at least, one admissible structure and false in, at least, another structure that is also admissible.

A few properties of the present semantics are noteworthy. First, it accounts for Carnap’s idea that the axioms \(A(\TC)\) have a twofold function, viz., setting forth empirical claims and determining the meaning of theoretical terms (Carnap 1958). For, on the one hand, the truth-values of the axioms \(A(\TC)\) depend on empirical, observable facts. These axioms, on the other hand, determine the admissible interpretations of the theoretical terms. These two seemingly contradictory properties are combined by allowing the axioms \(A(\TC)\) to interpret theoretical terms only on condition of there being a structure that both extends the given interpretation of the observation language and that satisfies these axioms. If there is no such structure, the theoretical terms remain uninterpreted. This semantics, therefore, can be seen to formally work out the old contextual theory of meaning for theoretical terms.

Second, Sneed’s problem of theoretical terms (Section 3.2) does not arise in the present semantics since the formulation of this problem is bound to standard truth-conditional semantics. Third, it is closely related to the Ramsey view of scientific theories as the following biconditional holds:

Proposition 2 \(\TC^R\) if and only if for all \(\phi \in A(\TC), \nu(\phi) = T\).

Unlike the Ramsey account, however, the present one does not dispense with theoretical terms. It can be shown rather that allowing for a range of admissible interpretations as opposed to a single interpretation does not affect the validity of standard deductive reasoning (Andreas 2010). Hence, a distinctive merit of the indirect interpretation semantics of theoretical terms is that theoretical constants need not be recovered from the Ramsey sentence in the first place.

The label partial interpretation is more common in the literature to describe Carnap’s view that theoretical terms are interpreted by the axioms or postulates of a scientific theory (Suppe 1974: 86–95). The partial character of interpretation is retained in the present account since there is a range of admissible interpretations of the complete language \(L(V_o,V_t)\). This allows for the interpretation of theoretical terms to be strengthened by further postulates, just as Carnap demanded in his 1958 and 1961. To strengthen the interpretation of theoretical terms is to further constrain the range of admissible interpretations of \(L(V_o,V_t)\).

4.3 Direct Interpretation

Both the Ramsey view and the indirect interpretation semantics deviate from standard truth-conditional semantics at the level of theoretical terms and theoretical sentences. Such a deviation, however, was not felt to be necessary by all philosophers that have worked on theoretical concepts. Tuomela (1973: ch. V) defends a position that he calls semantic realism and that retains standard truth-conditional semantics. Hence, direct interpretation is assumed for theoretical terms by Tuomela. Yet, semantic realism for theoretical terms acknowledges there to be an epistemological distinction between observational and theoretical terms. Tuomela’s (1973: ch. I) criterion of the theory-observation distinction largely coincides with Sneed’s above expounded criterion. Since direct interpretation of theoretical terms amounts just to standard realist truth-conditions, there is no need for a further discussion here.

4.4 Defining Theoretical Terms

In Weyl 1949, Carnap 1958, Feyerabend 1962 and a number of further papers we can identify different formulations of the idea that the axioms of a scientific theory determine the meaning of theoretical terms without these axioms qualifying as proper definitions of theoretical terms. This idea has become almost constitutive of the very notion of a theoretical term in the philosophy of science. Lewis, however, wrote a paper with the title “How to Define Theoretical Terms” (1970). A closer look at the literature further reveals that the very idea of explicitly defining theoretical terms goes back to Carnap’s (1961) use of Hilbert’s epsilon operator in scientific theories. This operator is an indefinite description operator that was introduced by Hilbert to designate some object \(x\) that satisfies an open formula \(\phi\). So

\[\varepsilon x \phi(x)\]

designates some \(x\) satisfying \(\phi(x)\), where \(x\) is the only free variable of \(\phi\) (cf. Avigad and Zach 2002). Now, Carnap (1961: 161n) explicitly defines theoretical terms in two steps:

\[\tag{\(A_{T(0)}\)} \bar{t} = \varepsilon \bar{X} \TC(\bar{X}, n_1 ,\ldots ,n_k)\]

where \(\bar{X}\)is a sequence of higher-order variables and \(\bar{t}\) a corresponding instantiation. So, \(\bar{t}\) designates some sequence of relations and functions that satisfies TC, in the context of an antecedently given interpretation of \(V_o\). Once such a sequence has been defined via the epsilon-operator, the second step of the definition is straightforward:

\[ \tag{\(A_{T(i)}\)} t_i = \varepsilon x (\exists u_1 \ldots \exists u_n (\bar{t} = \langle u_1 ,\ldots ,u_n\rangle \wedge x = u_i)) \]

Carnap could show these definitions to imply the Carnap sentence \(A_T\). Hence, they allow for direct recovery of the theoretical terms for the purpose of deductive reasoning on condition of the Ramsey sentence being true.

Lewis (1970) introduced a number of modifications concerning both the language of the Carnap sentence and its interpretation in order to attain proper definitions of theoretical terms. First, theoretical terms are considered to refer to individuals as opposed to relations and functions. This move is made coherent by allowing the basic language \(L(V_o)\) to contain relations like ‘\(x\) has property \(y\)’. The basic, i.e., non-theoretical language is thus no observation language in this account. Yet, it serves as the basis for introducing theoretical terms. The set \(V_o\) of ‘O-terms’ is best described as our antecedently understood vocabulary.

Second, denotationless terms are dealt with along the lines of free logic by Dana Scott (1967). That means denotationless terms, such as an improper description, denote nothing in the domain of discourse. Atomic sentences containing denotationless terms are either true or false. Most notably, the free logic that Lewis refers to has it that an identity that contains a denotationless term on both sides is always true. If just one side of the identity formula has an occurrence of a denotationless term, this identity statement is false.

Third, Lewis (1970) insists on a unique interpretation of theoretical terms, thus rejecting Carnap’s doctrine of partial interpretation. Carnap (1961) is most explicit about the indeterminacy that this doctrine implies. This indeterminacy of theoretical terms drives Carnap to using Hilbert’s \(\varepsilon\)-operator there, as just explained. For Lewis, by contrast, a theoretical term is denotationless if its interpretation is not uniquely determined by the Ramsey sentence. For a scientific theory to be true, it must have a unique interpretation.

Using these modifications, Lewis transforms the Carnap sentence into three Carnap-Lewis postulates, so to speak:

\[ \begin{align*} \tag{CL1} \exists y_1 &\ldots \exists y_n \forall x_1 \ldots \forall x_n \\ &(\TC(n_1 ,\ldots ,n_k, x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n) \leftrightarrow y_1 = x_1 \wedge \ldots \wedge y_n = x_n) \rightarrow \\ & \TC(n_1 ,\ldots ,n_k, t_1 ,\ldots ,t_k) \\ &\\ \tag{CL2} \,\,\neg \exists x_1 &\ldots \exists x_n \TC(n_1 ,\ldots ,n_k, x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n) \rightarrow \\ & \neg \exists x(x = t_1) \wedge \ldots \wedge \neg \exists x(x = t_n) \\ &\\ \tag{CL3} \exists x_1 &\ldots \exists x_n \TC(n_1 ,\ldots ,n_k, x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n) \wedge \mathord{}\\ &\neg \exists y_1 \ldots \exists y_n \forall x_1 \ldots \forall x_n \\ & (\TC(n_1 ,\ldots ,n_k, x_1 ,\ldots ,x_n) \leftrightarrow y_1 = x_1 \wedge \ldots \wedge y_n = x_n) \rightarrow \\ &\neg \exists x(x = t_1) \wedge \ldots \wedge \neg \exists x(x=t_n) \end{align*}\]

These postulates look more difficult than they actually are. CL1 says that, if TC has a unique realization, then it is realized by the entities named by \(t_1,\ldots,t_k\). Realization of a theory TC, in this formulation, means interpretation of the descriptive terms under which TC comes out true, where the interpretation of the \(V_o\) terms is antecedently given. So, CL1 is to be read as saying that the theoretical terms are to be understood as designating those entities that uniquely realize TC, in the context of an antecedently given interpretation of the \(V_o\) terms. CL2 says that, if the Ramsey sentence is false, the theoretical terms do not designate anything. To see this, recall that \(\neg \exists x(x=t_i)\) means, in free logic, that \(t_i\) is denotationless. In case the theory TC has multiple realizations, the theoretical terms are denotationless too. This is expressed by CL3.

CL1–CL3 are equivalent, in free logic, to a set of sentences that properly define the theoretical terms \(t_i (1 \le i \le n)\):

\[ \begin{align} \tag{\(D_i\)} t_i = \iota y_i \exists y_1 &\ldots \exists y_{i-1} \exists y_{i+1}\ldots \exists y_n \forall x_1 \ldots \forall x_n \\ &(\TC(n_1 , \ldots ,n_k, x_1 , \ldots ,x_n) \leftrightarrow \\ & y_1 = x_1 \wedge \ldots \wedge y_i = x_i \wedge \ldots \wedge y_n = x_n) \end{align} \]

\(t_i\) designates, according to this definition schema, the i-th component in that sequence of entities that uniquely realizes TC. If there is no such sequence, \(t_i (1 \le i \le n)\) is denotationless. Even so, the definitions of theoretical terms remain true if the complete language \(L(V_o,V_t)\) is interpreted in accordance with the postulates CL1–CL3, thanks to the use of free logic. Hence, all \(L(V_o,V_t)\) interpretations that extend the antecedently given interpretation of \(L(V_o)\) can be required to satisfy all definitions \(D_i\).

A few further properties of Lewis’s definitions of theoretical terms are noteworthy. First, they specify the interpretation of theoretical terms uniquely. This property is obvious for the case of unique realization of TC but holds as well for the other cases since assignment of no denotation counts as interpretation of a descriptive symbol in free logic. Second, it can be shown that these definitions do not allow for the derivation of any \(L(V_o)\) sentences except logical truths, just as the original Carnap sentence did. Lewis, therefore, in fact succeeds in defining theoretical terms. He does so without attempting to divide the axioms \(A(\TC)\) into definitions and synthetic claims about the spatiotemporal world.

The replacement of theoretical relation and function symbols with individual terms was judged counterintuitive by Papineau (1996). A reformulation, however, of Lewis’s definitions using second- or higher-order variables is not difficult to accomplish, as Schurz (2005) has shown. In this reformulation the problem arises that theoretical terms are usually not uniquely interpreted since our observational evidence is most of the time insufficient to determine the extension of theoretical relation and function symbols completely. Theoretical functions, such as temperature, pressure, electromagnetic force etc., are determined only for objects that have been subjected to appropriate measurements, however indirect. In view of this problem, Schurz (2005) suggests letting the higher-order quantifiers range only over those extensions that correspond to natural kind properties. This restriction renders the requirement of unique interpretation of theoretical terms plausible once again. Such a reading was also suggested by Psillos (1999: ch. 3) with reference to Lewis’s (1984) discussion of Putnam’s (1980) model-theoretic argument. In that paper, Lewis himself suggests the restriction of the interpretation of descriptive symbols to extensions corresponding to natural kind properties.

One final note on indirect interpretation is in order. Both Carnap (1961) and Lewis (1970) interpret theoretical terms indirectly simply because any definition is an instance of an indirect interpretation. For this reason, Sneed’s problem of theoretical terms (Section 3.2) does not arise. Yet, the pattern of Carnap’s and Lewis’s proposals conforms to the pattern of a definition in the narrow sense and not to the peculiar pattern of indirect interpretation that Carnap (1939) envisioned for the interpretation of theoretical terms. This is why the indirect interpretation semantics has been separated from the present discussion of defining theoretical terms.

5. Conclusion

The claim that there are scientific terms that are semantically dependent upon a scientific theory goes back to Duhem and Poincaré. Such terms came to be referred to as theoretical terms in twentieth century philosophy of science. Properties and entities that are observable in the sense of direct, unaided perception did not seem to depend on scientific theories as forces, electrons and nucleotides did. Hence, philosophers of science and logicians started to investigate the distinct semantics of theoretical terms. Various formal accounts resulted from these investigations, among which the Ramsey sentence by Ramsey (1929), Carnap’s notion of indirect interpretation (1939; 1958) and Lewis’s (1970) proposal of defining theoretical terms are the most prominent ones. Though not all philosophers of science understand the notion of a theoretical term in such way that semantic dependence upon a scientific theory is essential, this view prevails in the literature.

The theory-observation distinction has been attacked heavily and is presumably discredited by a large number of philosophers of science. Still, this distinction continues to permeate a number of important strands in the philosophy of science, such as scientific realism and its alternatives and the logical analysis of scientific theories. A case in point is the recent interest in the Ramsey account of scientific theories which emerged in the wake of Worral’s structural realism (cf. Ladyman 2009). We have seen, moreover, that the formal accounts of theoretical terms work well with a theory-observation distinction that is relativized to a particular theory. Critics of that distinction, by contrast, have commonly attacked a global and static division into theoretical and observational terms (Maxwell 1962; Achinstein 1965). Note finally that Carnap assigned no ontological significance to the theory-observation distinction in the sense that entities of the one type would be existent in a more genuine way than ones of the other.


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