The Pragmatic Theory of Truth

First published Thu Mar 21, 2019

Pragmatic theories of truth are usually associated either with C.S. Peirce’s proposal that true beliefs will be accepted “at the end of inquiry” or with William James’ proposal that truth be defined in terms of utility. More broadly, however, pragmatic theories of truth focus on the connection between truth and epistemic practices, notably practices of inquiry and assertion. Depending on the particular pragmatic theory, true statements might be those that are useful to believe, that are the result of inquiry, that have withstood ongoing examination, that meet a standard of warranted assertibility, or that represent norms of assertoric discourse. Like other theories of truth (e.g., coherence and deflationary theories) pragmatic theories of truth are often put forward as an alternative to correspondence theories of truth. Unlike correspondence theories, which tend to see truth as a static relation between a truth-bearer and a truth-maker, pragmatic theories of truth tend to view truth as a function of the practices people engage in, and the commitments people make, when they solve problems, make assertions, or conduct scientific inquiry. More broadly, pragmatic theories tend to emphasize the significant role the concept of truth plays across a range of disciplines and discourses: not just scientific and fact-stating discourse but also ethical, legal, and political discourse as well.

Pragmatic theories of truth have the effect of shifting attention away from what makes a statement true and toward what people mean or do in describing a statement as true. While sharing many of the impulses behind deflationary theories of truth (in particular, the idea that truth is not a substantial property), pragmatic theories also tend to view truth as more than just a useful tool for making generalizations. Pragmatic theories of truth thus emphasize the broader practical and performative dimensions of truth-talk, stressing the role truth plays in shaping certain kinds of discourse. These practical dimensions, according to pragmatic theories, are essential to understanding the concept of truth.

As these references to pragmatic theories (in the plural) would suggest, over the years a number of different approaches have been classified as “pragmatic”. This points to a degree of ambiguity that has been present since the earliest formulations of the pragmatic theory of truth: for example, the difference between Peirce’s (1878 [1986: 273]) claim that truth is “the opinion which is fated to be ultimately agreed to by all who investigate” and James’ (1907 [1975: 106]) claim that truth “is only the expedient in the way of our thinking”. Since then the situation has arguably gotten worse, not better. The often-significant differences between various pragmatic theories of truth can make it difficult to determine their shared commitments (if any), while also making it difficult to critique these theories overall. Issues with one version may not apply to other versions, which means that pragmatic theories of truth may well present more of a moving target than do other theories of truth. While few today would equate truth with expedience or utility (as James often seems to do) there remains the question of what the pragmatic theory of truth stands for and how it is related to other theories. Still, pragmatic theories of truth continue to be put forward and defended, often as serious alternatives to more widely accepted theories of truth

1. History of the Pragmatic Theory of Truth

The history of the pragmatic theory of truth is tied to the history of classical American pragmatism. According to the standard account, C.S. Peirce gets credit for first proposing a pragmatic theory of truth, William James is responsible for popularizing the pragmatic theory, and John Dewey subsequently reframed truth in terms of warranted assertibility (for this reading of Dewey see Burgess & Burgess 2011: 4). More specifically, Peirce is associated with the idea that true beliefs are those that will withstand future scrutiny; James with the idea that true beliefs are dependable and useful; Dewey with the idea that truth is a property of well-verified claims (or “judgments”).

1.1 Peirce’s Pragmatic Theory of Truth

The American philosopher, logician and scientist Charles Sanders Peirce (1839–1914) is generally recognized for first proposing a “pragmatic” theory of truth. Peirce’s pragmatic theory of truth is a byproduct of his pragmatic theory of meaning. In a frequently-quoted passage in “How to Make Our Ideas Clear” (1878), Peirce writes that, in order to pin down the meaning of a concept, we must:

Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of these effects is the whole of our conception of the object. (1878 [1986: 266])

The meaning of the concept of “truth” then boils down to the “practical bearings” of using this term: that is, of describing a belief as true. What, then, is the practical difference of describing a belief as “true” as opposed to any number of other positive attributes such as “creative”, “clever”, or “well-justified”? Peirce’s answer to this question is that true beliefs eventually gain general acceptance by withstanding future inquiry. (Inquiry, for Peirce, is the process that takes us from a state of doubt to a state of stable belief.) This gives us the pragmatic meaning of truth and leads Peirce to conclude, in another frequently-quoted passage, that:

All the followers of science are fully persuaded that the processes of investigation, if only pushed far enough, will give one certain solution to every question to which they can be applied.…The opinion which is fated to be ultimately agreed to by all who investigate, is what we mean by the truth. (1878 [1986: 273])

Peirce realized that his reference to “fate” could be easily misinterpreted. In a less-frequently quoted footnote to this passage he writes that “fate” is not meant in a “superstitious” sense but rather as “that which is sure to come true, and can nohow be avoided” (1878 [1986: 273]). Over time Peirce moderated his position, referring less to fate and unanimous agreement and more to scientific investigation and general consensus (Misak 2004). The result is an account that views truth as what would be the result of scientific inquiry, if scientific inquiry were allowed to go on indefinitely. In 1901 Peirce writes that:

Truth is that concordance of an abstract statement with the ideal limit towards which endless investigation would tend to bring scientific belief. (1901a [1935: 5.565])

Consequently, truth does not depend on actual unanimity or an actual end to inquiry:

If Truth consists in satisfaction, it cannot be any actual satisfaction, but must be the satisfaction which would ultimately be found if the inquiry were pushed to its ultimate and indefeasible issue. (1908 [1935: 6.485], emphasis in original)

As these references to inquiry and investigation make clear, Peirce’s concern is with how we come to have and hold the opinions we do. Some beliefs may in fact be very durable but would not stand up to inquiry and investigation (this is true of many cognitive biases, such as the Dunning-Kruger effect where people remain blissfully unaware of their own incompetence). For Peirce, a true belief is not simply one we will hold onto obstinately. Rather, a true belief is one that has and will continue to hold up to sustained inquiry. In the practical terms Peirce prefers, this means that to have a true belief is to have a belief that is dependable in the face of all future challenges. Moreover, to describe a belief as true is to point to this dependability, to signal the belief’s scientific bona fides, and to endorse it as a basis for action.

By focusing on the practical dimension of having true beliefs, Peirce plays down the significance of more theoretical questions about the nature of truth. In particular, Peirce is skeptical that the correspondence theory of truth—roughly, the idea that true beliefs correspond to reality—has much useful to say about the concept of truth. The problem with the correspondence theory of truth, he argues, is that it is only “nominally” correct and hence “useless” (1906 [1998: 379, 380]) as far as describing truth’s practical value. In particular, the correspondence theory of truth sheds no light on what makes true beliefs valuable, the role of truth in the process of inquiry, or how best to go about discovering and defending true beliefs. For Peirce, the importance of truth rests not on a “transcendental” (1901a [1935: 5.572]) connection between beliefs on the one hand and reality on the other, but rather on the practical connection between doubt and belief, and the processes of inquiry that take us from the former to the latter:

If by truth and falsity you mean something not definable in terms of doubt and belief in any way, then you are talking of entities of whose existence you can know nothing, and which Ockham’s razor would clean shave off. Your problems would be greatly simplified, if, instead of saying that you want to know the “Truth”, you were simply to say that you want to attain a state of belief unassailable by doubt. (1905 [1998: 336])

For Peirce, a true belief is one that is indefeasible and unassailable—and indefeasible and unassailable for all the right reasons: namely, because it will stand up to all further inquiry and investigation. In other words,

if we were to reach a stage where we could no longer improve upon a belief, there is no point in withholding the title “true” from it. (Misak 2000: 101)

1.2 James’ Pragmatic Theory of Truth

Peirce’s contemporary, the psychologist and philosopher William James (1842–1910), gets credit for popularizing the pragmatic theory of truth. In a series of popular lectures and articles, James offers an account of truth that, like Peirce’s, is grounded in the practical role played by the concept of truth. James, too, stresses that truth represents a kind of satisfaction: true beliefs are satisfying beliefs, in some sense. Unlike Peirce, however, James suggests that true beliefs can be satisfying short of being indefeasible and unassailable: short, that is, of how they would stand up to ongoing inquiry and investigation. In the lectures published as Pragmatism: A New Name for Some Old Ways of Thinking (1907) James writes that:

Ideas…become true just in so far as they help us get into satisfactory relation with other parts of our experience, to summarize them and get about among them by conceptual short-cuts instead of following the interminable succession of particular phenomena. (1907 [1975: 34])

True ideas, James suggests, are like tools: they make us more efficient by helping us do what needs to be done. James adds to the previous quote by making the connection between truth and utility explicit:

Any idea upon which we can ride, so to speak; any idea that will carry us prosperously from any one part of our experience to any other part, linking things satisfactorily, working securely, simplifying, saving labor; is true for just so much, true in so far forth, true instrumentally. This is the ‘instrumental’ view of truth. (1907 [1975: 34])

While James, here, credits this view to John Dewey and F.C.S. Schiller, it is clearly a view he endorses as well. To understand truth, he argues, we must consider the pragmatic “cash-value” (1907 [1975: 97]) of having true beliefs and the practical difference of having true ideas. True beliefs, he suggests, are useful and dependable in ways that false beliefs are not:

you can say of it then either that “it is useful because it is true” or that “it is true because it is useful”. Both these phrases mean exactly the same thing. (1907 [1975: 98])

Passages such as this have cemented James’ reputation for equating truth with mere utility (something along the lines of: “< p > is true just in case it is useful to believe that p” [see Schmitt 1995: 78]). (James does offer the qualification “in the long run and on the whole of course” (1907 [1975: 106]) to indicate that truth is different from instant gratification, though he does not say how long the long run should be.) Such an account might be viewed as a watered-down version of Peirce’s account that substitutes “cash-value” or subjective satisfaction for indefeasibility and unassailability in the face of ongoing inquiry and investigation. Such an account might also be viewed as obviously wrong, given the undeniable existence of useless truths and useful falsehoods.

In the early twentieth century Peirce’s writings were not yet widely available. As a result, the pragmatic theory of truth was frequently identified with James’ account—and, as we will see, many philosophers did view it as obviously wrong. James, in turn, accused his critics of willful misunderstanding: that because he wrote in an accessible, engaging style his critics “have boggled at every word they could boggle at, and refused to take the spirit rather than the letter of our discourse” (1909 [1975: 99]). However, it is also the case that James tends to overlook or intentionally blur—it is hard to say which—the distinction between (a) giving an account of true ideas and (b) giving an account of the concept of truth. This means that, while James’ theory might give a psychologically realistic account of why we care about the truth (true ideas help us get things done) his theory fails to shed much light on what the concept of truth exactly is or on what makes an idea true. And, in fact, James often seems to encourage this reading. In the preface to The Meaning of Truth he doubles down by quoting many of his earlier claims and noting that “when the pragmatists speak of truth, they mean exclusively something about the ideas, namely their workableness” (1909 [1975: 6], emphasis added). James’ point seems to be this: from a practical standpoint, we use the concept of truth to signal our confidence in a particular idea or belief; a true belief is one that can be acted upon, that is dependable and that leads to predictable outcomes; any further speculation is a pointless distraction.

What then about the concept of truth? It often seems that James understands the concept of truth in terms of verification: thus, “true is the name for whatever idea starts the verification-process, useful is the name for its completed function in experience” (1907 [1975: 98]). And, more generally:

Truth for us is simply a collective name for verification-processes, just as health, wealth, strength, etc., are names for other processes connected with life, and also pursued because it pays to pursue them. (1907 [1975: 104])

James seems to claim that being verified is what makes an idea true, just as having a lot of money is what makes a person wealthy. To be true is to be verified:

Truth happens to an idea. It becomes true, is made true by events. Its verity is in fact an event, a process: the process namely of its verifying itself, its veri-fication. Its validity is the process of its valid-ation. (1907 [1975: 97], emphasis in original)

Like Peirce, James argues that a pragmatic account of truth is superior to a correspondence theory because it specifies, in concrete terms, what it means for an idea to correspond or “agree” with reality. For pragmatists, this agreement consists in being led “towards that reality and no other” in a way that yields “satisfaction as a result” (1909 [1975: 104]). By sometimes defining truth in terms of verification, and by unpacking the agreement of ideas and reality in pragmatic terms, James’ account attempts to both criticize and co-opt the correspondence theory of truth. It appears James wants to have his cake and eat it too.

1.3 Dewey’s Pragmatic Theory of Truth

John Dewey (1859–1952), the third figure from the golden era of classical American pragmatism, had surprisingly little to say about the concept of truth especially given his voluminous writings on other topics. On an anecdotal level, as many have observed, the index to his 527 page Logic: The Theory of Inquiry (1938 [2008]) has only one reference to “truth”, and that to a footnote mentioning Peirce. Otherwise the reader is advised to “See also assertibility”.

At first glance, Dewey’s account of truth looks like a combination of Peirce and James. Like Peirce, Dewey emphasizes the connection between truth and rigorous scientific inquiry; like James, Dewey views truth as the verified result of past inquiry rather than as the anticipated result of inquiry proceeding into an indefinite future. For example, in 1911 he writes that:

From the standpoint of scientific inquiry, truth indicates not just accepted beliefs, but beliefs accepted in virtue of a certain method.…To science, truth denotes verified beliefs, propositions that have emerged from a certain procedure of inquiry and testing. By that I mean that if a scientific man were asked to point to samples of what he meant by truth, he would pick…beliefs which were the outcome of the best technique of inquiry available in some particular field; and he would do this no matter what his conception of the Nature of Truth. (1911 [2008: 28])

Furthermore, like both Peirce and James, Dewey charges correspondence theories of truth with being unnecessarily obscure because these theories depend on an abstract (and unverifiable) relationship between a proposition and how things “really are” (1911 [2008: 34]). Finally, Dewey also offers a pragmatic reinterpretation of the correspondence theory that operationalizes the idea of correspondence:

Our definition of truth…uses correspondence as a mark of a meaning or proposition in exactly the same sense in which it is used everywhere else…as the parts of a machine correspond. (1911 [2008: 45])

Dewey has an expansive understanding of “science”. For Dewey, science emerges from and is continuous with everyday processes of trial and error—cooking and small-engine repair count as “scientific” on his account—which means he should not be taken too strictly when he equates truth with scientific verification. (Peirce and James also had expansive understandings of science.) Rather, Dewey’s point is that true propositions, when acted on, lead to the sort of predictable and dependable outcomes that are hallmarks of scientific verification, broadly construed. From a pragmatic standpoint, scientific verification boils down to the process of matching up expectations with outcomes, a process that gives us all the “correspondence” we could ask for.

Dewey eventually came to believe that conventional philosophical terms such as “truth” and “knowledge” were burdened with so much baggage, and had become so fossilized, that it was difficult to grasp the practical role these terms had originally served. As a result, in his later writings Dewey largely avoids speaking of “truth” or “knowledge” while focusing instead on the functions played by these concepts. By his 1938 Logic: The Theory of Inquiry Dewey was speaking of “warranted assertibility” as the goal of inquiry, using this term in place of both “truth” and “knowledge” (1938 [2008: 15–16]). In 1941, in a response to Russell entitled “Propositions, Warranted Assertibility, and Truth”, he wrote that “warranted assertibility” is a “definition of the nature of knowledge in the honorific sense according to which only true beliefs are knowledge” (1941: 169). Here Dewey suggests that “warranted assertibility” is a better way of capturing the function of both knowledge and truth insofar as both are goals of inquiry. His point is that it makes little difference, pragmatically, whether we describe the goal of inquiry as “acquiring more knowledge”, “acquiring more truth”, or better yet, “making more warrantably assertible judgments”.

Because it focuses on truth’s function as a goal of inquiry, Dewey’s pragmatic account of truth has some unconventional features. To begin with, Dewey reserves the term “true” only for claims that are the product of controlled inquiry. This means that claims are not true before they are verified but that, rather, it is the process of verification that makes them true:

truth and falsity are properties only of that subject-matter which is the end, the close, of the inquiry by means of which it is reached. (1941: 176)

Second, Dewey insists that only “judgments”—not “propositions”—are properly viewed as truth-bearers. For Dewey, “propositions” are the proposals and working hypotheses that are used, via a process of inquiry, to generate conclusions and verified judgments. As such, propositions may be more or less relevant to the inquiry at hand but they are not, strictly speaking true or false (1941: 176). Rather, truth and falsity are reserved for “judgments” or “the settled outcome of inquiry” (1941: 175; 1938 [2008: 124]; Burke 1994): for claims, in other words, that are warrantedly assertible. Third, Dewey continues to argue that this pragmatic approach to truth is “the only one entitled to be called a correspondence theory of truth” (1941: 179) using terms nearly identical to those he used in 1911:

My own view takes correspondence in the operational sense…of answering, as a key answers to conditions imposed by a lock, or as two correspondents “answer” each other; or, in general, as a reply is an adequate answer to a question or criticism—; as, in short, a solution answers the requirements of a problem. (1941: 178)

Thanks to Russell (e.g., 1941: Ch. XXIII) and others, by 1941 Dewey was aware of the problems facing pragmatic accounts of truth. In response, we see him turning to the language of “warranted assertibility”, drawing a distinction between “propositions” and “judgments”, and grounding the concept of truth (or warranted assertibility) in scientific inquiry (Thayer 1947; Burke 1994). These adjustments were designed to extend, clarify, and improve on Peirce’s and James’ accounts. Whether they did so is an open question. Certainly many, such as Quine, concluded that Dewey was only sidestepping important questions about truth: that Dewey’s strategy was “simply to avoid the truth predicate and limp along with warranted belief” (Quine 2008: 165).

Peirce, James, and Dewey were not the only ones to propose or defend a pragmatic theory of truth in the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries. Others, such as F.C.S. Schiller (1864–1937), also put forward pragmatic theories (though Schiller’s view, which he called “humanism”, also attracted more than its share of critics, arguably for very good reasons). Pragmatic theories of truth also received the attention of prominent critics, including Russell (1909, 1910 [1994]), Moore (1908), Lovejoy (1908a,b) among others. Several of these criticisms will be considered later; suffice it to say that pragmatic theories of truth soon came under pressure that led to revisions and several successor approaches over the next hundred-plus years.

Historically Peirce, James, and Dewey had the greatest influence in setting the parameters for what makes a theory of truth pragmatic—this despite the sometimes significant differences between their respective accounts, and that over time they modified and clarified their positions in response to both criticism and over-enthusiastic praise. While this can make it difficult to pin down a single definition of what, historically, counted as a pragmatic theory of truth, there are some common themes that cut across each of their accounts. First, each account begins from a pragmatic analysis of the meaning of the truth predicate. On the assumption that describing a belief, claim, or judgment as “true” must make some kind of practical difference, each of these accounts attempts to describe what this difference is. Second, each account then connects truth specifically to processes of inquiry: to describe a claim as true is to say that it either has or will stand up to scrutiny. Third, each account rejects correspondence theories of truth as overly abstract, “transcendental”, or metaphysical. Or, more accurately, each attempts to redefine correspondence in pragmatic terms, as the agreement between a claim and a predicted outcome. While the exact accounts offered by Peirce, James, and Dewey found few defenders—by the mid-twentieth century pragmatic theories of truth were largely dormant—these themes did set a trajectory for future versions of the pragmatic theory of truth.

2. Neo-Pragmatic Theories of Truth

Pragmatic theories of truth enjoyed a resurgence in the last decades of the twentieth century. This resurgence was especially visible in debates between Hilary Putnam (1926–2016) and Richard Rorty (1931–2007) though broadly pragmatic ideas were defended by other philosophers as well (Bacon 2012: Ch. 4). (One example is Crispin Wright’s superassertibility theory (1992, 2001) which he claims is “as well equipped to express the aspiration for a developed pragmatist conception of truth as any other candidate” (2001: 781) though he does not accept the pragmatist label.) While these “neo-pragmatic” theories of truth sometimes resembled the classical pragmatic accounts of Peirce, James, or Dewey, they also differed significantly, often by framing the concept of truth in explicitly epistemic terms such as assertibility or by drawing on intervening developments in the field.

At the outset, neo-pragmatism was motivated by a renewed dissatisfaction with correspondence theories of truth and the metaphysical frameworks supporting them. Some neo-pragmatic theories of truth grew out of a rejection of metaphysical realism (e.g., Putnam 1981; for background see Khlentzos 2016). If metaphysical realism cannot be supported then this undermines a necessary condition for the correspondence theory of truth: namely, that there be a mind-independent reality to which propositions correspond. Other neo-pragmatic approaches emerged from a rejection of representationalism: if knowledge is not the mind representing objective reality—if we cannot make clear sense of how the mind could be a “mirror of nature” to use Rorty’s (1979) term—then we are also well-advised to give up thinking of truth in realist, correspondence terms. Despite these similar starting points, neo-pragmatic theories took several different and evolving forms over the final decades of the twentieth century.

At one extreme some neo-pragmatic theories of truth seemed to endorse relativism about truth (whether and in what sense they did remains a point of contention). This view was closely associated with influential work by Richard Rorty (1982, 1991a,b). The rejection of representationalism and the correspondence theory of truth led to the conclusion that inquiry is best viewed as aiming at agreement or “solidarity”, not knowledge or truth as these terms are traditionally understood. This had the radical consequence of suggesting that truth is no more than “what our peers will, ceteris paribus, let us get away with saying” (Rorty 1979: 176; Rorty [2010a: 45] admits this phrase is provocative) or just “an expression of commendation” (Rorty 1991a: 23). Not surprisingly, many found this position deeply problematic since it appears to relativize truth to whatever one’s audience will accept (Baghramian 2004: 147). A related concern is that this position also seems to conflate truth with justification, suggesting that if a claim meets contextual standards of acceptability then it also counts as true (Gutting 2003). Rorty for one often admitted as much, noting that he tended to “swing back and forth between trying to reduce truth to justification and propounding some form of minimalism about truth” (1998: 21).

A possible response to the accusation of relativism is to claim that this neo-pragmatic approach does not aim to be a full-fledged theory of truth. Perhaps truth is actually a rather light-weight concept and does not need the heavy metaphysical lifting implied by putting forward a “theory”. If the goal is not to describe what truth is but rather to describe how “truth” is used, then these uses are fairly straightforward: among other things, to make generalizations (“everything you said is true”), to commend (“so true!”), and to caution (“what you said is justified, but it might not be true”) (Rorty 1998: 22; 2000: 4). None of these uses requires that we embark on a possibly fruitless hunt for the conditions that make a proposition true, or for a proper definition or theory of truth. If truth is “indefinable” (Rorty 2010b: 391) then this account cannot be definition or theory of truth, relativist or otherwise.

This approach differs in some noteworthy ways from earlier pragmatic accounts of truth. For one thing it is able to draw on, and draw parallels with, a range of well-developed non-correspondence theories of truth that begin (and sometimes end) by stressing the fundamental equivalence of “S is p” and “‘S is p’ is true”. These theories, including disquotationalism, deflationism, and minimalism, simply were not available to earlier pragmatists (though Peirce does at times discuss the underlying notions). Furthermore, while Peirce and Dewey, for example, were proponents of scientific inquiry and scientific processes of verification, on this neo-pragmatic approach science is no more objective or rational than other disciplines: as Rorty put it, “the only sense in which science is exemplary is that it is a model of human solidarity” (1991b: 39). Finally, on this approach Peirce, James, and Dewey simply did not go far enough: they failed to recognize the radical implications of their accounts of truth, or else failed to convey these implications adequately. In turn much of the critical response to this kind of neo-pragmatism is that it goes too far by treating truth merely as a sign of commendation (plus a few other functions). In other words, this type of neo-pragmatism goes to unpragmatic extremes (e.g., Haack 1998; also the exchange in Rorty & Price 2010).

A less extreme version of neo-pragmatism attempts to preserve truth’s objectivity and independence while still rejecting metaphysical realism. This version was most closely associated with Hilary Putnam, though Putnam’s views changed over time (see Hildebrand 2003 for an overview of Putnam’s evolution). While this approach frames truth in epistemic terms—primarily in terms of justification and verification—it amplifies these terms to ensure that truth is more than mere consensus. For example, this approach might identify “being true with being warrantedly assertible under ideal conditions” (Putnam 2012b: 220). More specifically, it might demand “that truth is independent of justification here and now, but not independent of all justification” (Putnam 1981: 56).

Rather than play up assertibility before one’s peers or contemporaries, this neo-pragmatic approach frames truth in terms of ideal warranted assertibility: namely, warranted assertibility in the long run and before all audiences, or at least before all well-informed audiences. Not only does this sound much less relativist but it also bears a strong resemblance to Peirce’s and Dewey’s accounts (though Putnam, for one, resisted the comparison: “my admiration for the classical pragmatists does not extend to any of the different theories of truth that Peirce, James, and Dewey advanced” [2012c: 70]).

To repeat, this neo-pragmatic approach is designed to avoid the problems facing correspondence theories of truth while still preserving truth’s objectivity. In the 1980s this view was associated with Putnam’s broader program of “internal realism”: the idea that “what objects does the world consist of? is a question that it only makes sense to ask within a theory or description” (Putnam 1981: 49, emphasis in original). Internal realism was designed as an alternative to metaphysical realism that dispensed with achieving an external “God’s Eye Point of View” while still preserving truth’s objectivity, albeit internal to a given theory. (For additional criticisms of metaphysical realism see Khlentzos 2016.) In the mid-1990s Putnam’s views shifted toward what he called “natural realism” (1999; for a critical discussion of Putnam’s changing views see Wright 2000). This shift came about in part because of problems with defining truth in epistemic terms such as ideal warranted assertibility. One problem is that it is difficult to see how one can verify either what these ideal conditions are or whether they have been met: one might attempt to do so by taking an external “god’s eye view”, which would be inconsistent with internal realism, or one might come to this determination from within one’s current theory, which would be circular and relativistic. (As Putnam put it, “to talk of epistemically ‘ideal’ connections must either be understood outside the framework of internal realism or it too must be understood in a solipsistic manner ” (2012d: 79–80).) Since neither option seems promising this does not bode well for internal realism or for any account of truth closely associated with it.

If internal realism cannot be sustained then a possible fallback position is “natural realism”—the view “that the objects of (normal ‘veridical’) perception are ‘external’ things, and, more generally, aspects of ‘external’ reality” (Putnam 1999: 10)—which leads to a reconciliation of sorts with the correspondence theory of truth. A natural realism suggests “that true empirical statements correspond to states of affairs that actually obtain” (Putnam 2012a: 97), though this does not commit one to a correspondence theory of truth across the board. Natural realism leaves open the possibility that not all true statements “correspond” to a state of affairs, and even those that do (such as empirical statements) do not always correspond in the same way (Putnam 2012c: 68–69; 2012a: 98). While not a ringing endorsement of the correspondence theory of truth, at least as traditionally understood, this neo-pragmatic approach is not a flat-out rejection either.

Viewing truth in terms of ideal warranted assertibility has obvious pragmatic overtones of Peirce and Dewey. Viewing truth in terms of a commitment to natural realism is not so clearly pragmatic though some parallels still exist. Because natural realism allows for different types of truth-conditions—some but not all statements are true in virtue of correspondence—it is compatible with the truth-aptness of normative discourse: just because ethical statements, for example, do not correspond in an obvious way to ethical state of affairs is no reason to deny that they can be true (Putnam 2002). In addition, like earlier pragmatic theories of truth, this neo-pragmatic approach redefines correspondence: in this case, by taking a pluralist approach to the correspondence relation itself (Goodman 2013).

These two approaches—one tending toward relativism, the other tending toward realism—represented the two main currents in late twentieth century neo-pragmatism. Both approaches, at least initially, framed truth in terms of justification, verification, or assertibility, reflecting a debt to the earlier accounts of Peirce, James, and Dewey. Subsequently they evolved in opposite directions. The first approach, often associated with Rorty, flirts with relativism and implies that truth is not the important philosophical concept it has long been taken to be. Here, to take a neo-pragmatic stance toward truth is to recognize the relatively mundane functions this concept plays: to generalize, to commend, to caution and not much else. To ask for more, to ask for something “beyond the here and now”, only commits us to “the banal thought that we might be wrong” (Rorty 2010a: 45). The second neo-pragmatic approach, generally associated with Putnam, attempts to preserve truth’s objectivity and the important role it plays across scientific, mathematical, ethical, and political discourse. This could mean simply “that truth is independent of justification here and now” or “that to call a statement of any kind…true is to say that it has the sort of correctness appropriate to the kind of statement it is” (2012a: 97–98). On this account truth points to standards of correctness more rigorous than simply what our peers will let us get away with saying.

3. Truth as a Norm of Inquiry and Assertion

More recently—since roughly the turn of the twenty-first century—pragmatic theories of truth have focused on truth’s role as a norm of assertion or inquiry. These theories are sometimes referred to as “new pragmatic” theories to distinguish them from both classical and neo-pragmatic accounts (Misak 2007b; Hookway 2016). Like neo-pragmatic accounts, these theories often build on, or react to, positions besides the correspondence theory: for example, deflationary, minimal, and pluralistic theories of truth. Unlike some of the neo-pragmatic accounts discussed above, these theories give relativism a wide berth, avoid defining truth in terms of concepts such as warranted assertibility, and treat correspondence theories of truth with deep suspicion.

On these accounts truth plays a unique and necessary role in assertoric discourse (Price 1998, 2003, 2011; Misak 2000, 2007a, 2015): without the concept of truth there would be no difference between making assertions and, to use Frank Ramsey’s nice phrase, “comparing notes” (1925 [1990: 247]). Instead, truth provides the “convenient friction” that “makes our individual opinions engage with one another” (Price 2003: 169) and “is internally related to inquiry, reasons, and evidence” (Misak 2000: 73).

Like all pragmatic theories of truth, these “new” pragmatic accounts focus on the use and function of truth. However, while classical pragmatists were responding primarily to the correspondence theory of truth, new pragmatic theories also respond to contemporary disquotational, deflationary, and minimal theories of truth (Misak 1998, 2007a). As a result, new pragmatic accounts aim to show that there is more to truth than its disquotational and generalizing function (for a dissenting view see Freedman 2006). Specifically, this “more” is that the concept of truth also functions as a norm that places clear expectations on speakers and their assertions. In asserting something to be true, speakers take on an obligation to specify the consequences of their assertion, to consider how their assertions can be verified, and to offer reasons in support of their claims:

once we see that truth and assertion are intimately connected—once we see that to assert that p is true is to assert p—we can and must look to our practices of assertion and to the commitments incurred in them so as to say something more substantial about truth. (Misak 2007a: 70)

Truth is not just a goal of inquiry, as Dewey claimed, but actually a norm of inquiry that sets expectations for how inquirers conduct themselves.

More specifically, without the norm of truth assertoric discourse would be degraded almost beyond recognition. Without the norm of truth, speakers could be held accountable only for either insincerely asserting things they don’t themselves believe (thus violating the norm of “subjective assertibility”) or for asserting things they don’t have enough evidence for (thus violating the norm of “personal warranted assertibility”) (Price 2003: 173–174). The norm of truth is a condition for genuine disagreement between people who speak sincerely and with, from their own perspective, good enough reasons. It provides the “friction” we need to treat disagreements as genuinely needing resolution: otherwise, “differences of opinion would simply slide past one another” (Price 2003: 180–181). In sum, the concept of truth plays an essential role in making assertoric discourse possible, ensuring that assertions come with obligations and that conflicting assertions get attention. Without truth, it is no longer clear to what degree assertions would still be assertions, as opposed to impromptu speculations or musings. (Correspondence theories should find little reason to object: they too can recognize that truth functions as a norm. Of course, correspondence theorists will want to add that truth also requires correspondence to reality, a step “new” pragmatists will resisting taking.)

It is important that this account of truth is not a definition or theory of truth, at least in the narrow sense of specifying necessary and sufficient conditions for a proposition being true. (That is, there is no proposal along the lines of “S is true iff…”; though see Brown (2015: 69) for a Deweyan definition of truth and Heney (2015) for a Peircean response.) As opposed to some versions of neo-pragmatism, which viewed truth as “indefinable” in part because of its supposed simplicity and transparency, this approach avoids definitions because the concept of truth is implicated in a complex range of assertoric practices. Instead, this approach offers something closer to a “pragmatic elucidation” of truth that gives “an account of the role the concept plays in practical endeavors” (Misak 2007a: 68; see also Wiggins 2002: 317).

The proposal to treat truth as a norm of inquiry and assertion can be traced back to both classical and neo-pragmatist accounts. In one respect, this account can be viewed as adding on to neo-pragmatic theories that reduce truth to justification or “personal warranted assertibility”. In this respect, these newer pragmatic accounts are a response to the problems facing neo-pragmatism. In another respect, new pragmatic accounts can be seen as a return to the insights of classical pragmatists updated for a contemporary audience. For example, while Peirce wrote of beliefs being “fated” to be agreed upon at the “ideal limit” of inquiry—conditions that to critics sounded metaphysical and unverifiable—a better approach is to treat true beliefs as those “that would withstand doubt, were we to inquire as far as we fruitfully could on the matter” (Misak 2000: 49). On this account, to say that a belief is true is shorthand for saying that it “gets thing right” and “stands up and would continue to stand up to reasons and evidence” (Misak 2015: 263, 265). This pragmatic elucidation of the concept of truth attempts to capture both what speakers say and what they do when they describe a claim as true. In a narrow sense the meaning of truth—what speakers are saying when they use this word—is that true beliefs are indefeasible. However, in a broader sense the meaning of truth is also what speakers are doing when they use this word, with the proposal here that truth functions as a norm that is constitutive of assertoric discourse.

As we have seen, pragmatic accounts of truth focus on the function the concept plays: specifically, the practical difference made by having and using the concept of truth. Early pragmatic accounts tended to analyze this function in terms of the practical implications of labeling a belief as true: depending on the version, to say that a belief is true is to signal one’s confidence, or that the belief is widely accepted, or that it has been scientifically verified, or that it would be assertible under ideal circumstances, among other possible implications. These earlier accounts focus on the function of truth in conversational contexts or in the context of ongoing inquiries. The newer pragmatic theories discussed in this section take a broader approach to truth’s function, addressing its role not just in conversations and inquiries but in making certain kinds of conversations and inquiries possible in the first place. By viewing truth as a norm of assertion and inquiry, these more recent pragmatic theories make the function of truth independent of what individual speakers might imply in specific contexts. Truth is not just what is assertible or verifiable (under either ideal or non-ideal circumstances), but sets objective expectations for making assertions and engaging in inquiry. Unlike neo-pragmatists such as Rorty and Putnam, new pragmatists such as Misak and Price argue that truth plays a role entirely distinct from justification or warranted assertibility. This means that, without the concept of truth and the norm it represents, assertoric discourse (and inquiry in general) would dwindle into mere “comparing notes”.

4. Common Features

Pragmatic theories of truth have evolved to where a variety of different approaches are described as “pragmatic”. These theories often disagree significantly with each other, making it difficult either to define pragmatic theories of truth in a simple and straightforward manner or to specify the necessary conditions that a pragmatic theory of truth must meet. As a result, one way to clarify what makes a theory of truth pragmatic is to say something about what pragmatic theories of truth are not. Given that pragmatic theories of truth have often been put forward in contrast to prevailing correspondence and other “substantive” theories of truth (Wyatt & Lynch, 2016), this suggests a common commitment shared by the pragmatic theories described above.

One way to differentiate pragmatic accounts from other theories of truth is to distinguish the several questions that have historically guided discussions of truth. While some have used decision trees to categorize different theories of truth (Lynch 2001a; Künne 2003), or have proposed family trees showing relations of influence and affinity (Haack 1978), another approach is to distinguish separate “projects” that examine different dimensions of the concept of truth (Kirkham 1992). (These projects also break into distinct subprojects; for a similar approach see Frapolli 1996.) On this last approach the first, “metaphysical”, project aims to identify the necessary and sufficient conditions for “what it is for a statement…to be true” (Kirkham 1992: 20; Wyatt & Lynch call this the “essence project” [2016: 324]). This project often takes the form of identifying what makes a statement true: e.g., correspondence to reality, or coherence with other beliefs, or the existence of a particular state of affairs. A second, “justification”, project attempts to specify “some characteristic, possessed by most true statements…by reference to which the probable truth or falsity of the statement can be judged” (Kirkham 1992: 20). This often takes the form of giving a criterion of truth that can be used to determine whether a given statement is true. Finally, the “speech-act” project addresses the question of “what are we doing when we make utterances” that “ascribe truth to some statement?” (Kirkham 1992: 28). Unfortunately, truth-theorists have not always been clear on which project they are pursuing, which can lead to confusion about what counts as a successful or complete theory of truth. It can also lead to truth-theorists talking past each other when they are pursuing distinct projects with different standards and criteria of success.

In these terms, pragmatic theories of truth are best viewed as pursuing the speech-act and justification projects. As noted above, pragmatic accounts of truth have often focused on how the concept of truth is used and what speakers are doing when describing statements as true: depending on the version, speakers may be commending a statement, signaling its scientific reliability, or committing themselves to giving reasons in its support. Likewise, pragmatic theories often focus on the criteria by which truth can be judged: again, depending on the version, this may involve linking truth to verifiability, assertibility, usefulness, or long-term durability. With regard to the speech-act and justification projects pragmatic theories of truth seem to be on solid ground, offering plausible proposals for addressing these projects. They are on much less solid ground when viewed as addressing the metaphysical project. As we will see, it is difficult to defend the idea, for example, that either utility, verifiability, or widespread acceptance are necessary and sufficient conditions for truth or are what make a statement true.

This would suggest that the opposition between pragmatic and correspondence theories of truth is partly a result of their pursuing different projects. From a pragmatic perspective, the problem with the correspondence theory is its pursuit of the metaphysical project that, as its name suggests, invites metaphysical speculation about the conditions which make sentences true—speculation that can distract from more central questions of how the truth predicate is used and how true beliefs are best recognized and acquired. (Pragmatic theories of truth are not alone in raising these concerns (David 2016).) From the standpoint of correspondence theories and other accounts that pursue the metaphysical project, pragmatic theories will likely seem incomplete, sidestepping the most important questions (Howat 2014). But from the standpoint of pragmatic theories, projects that pursue or prioritize the metaphysical project are deeply misguided and misleading.

This supports the following truism: a common feature of pragmatic theories of truth is that they focus on the practical function that the concept of truth plays. Thus, whether truth is a norm of inquiry (Misak), a way of signaling widespread acceptance (Rorty), stands for future dependability (Peirce), or designates the product of a process of inquiry (Dewey), among other things, pragmatic theories shed light on the concept of truth by examining the practices through which solutions to problems are framed, tested, asserted, and defended—and, ultimately, come to be called true. Pragmatic theories of truth can thus be viewed as making contributions to the speech-act and justification projects by focusing especially on the practices people engage in when they solve problems, make assertions, and conduct scientific inquiry. Of course, even though pragmatic theories of truth largely agree on which questions to address and in what order, this does not mean that they agree on the answers to these questions, or on how to best formulate the meaning and function of truth.

Another common commitment of pragmatic theories of truth—besides prioritizing the speech-act and justification projects—is that they do not restrict truth to certain topics or types of inquiry. That is, regardless of whether the topic is descriptive or normative, scientific or ethical, pragmatists tend to view it as an opportunity for genuine inquiry that incorporates truth-apt assertions. The truth-aptness of ethical and normative statements is a notable feature across a range of pragmatic approaches, including Peirce’s (at least in some of his moods, e.g., 1901b [1958: 8.158]), Dewey’s theory of valuation (1939), Putnam’s questioning of the fact-value dichotomy (2002), and Misak’s claim that “moral beliefs must be in principle responsive to evidence and argument” (2000: 94; for a dissenting view see Frega 2013). This broadly cognitivist attitude—that normative statements are truth-apt—is related to how pragmatic theories of truth de-emphasize the metaphysical project. As a result, from a pragmatic standpoint one of the problems with the correspondence theory of truth is that it can undermine the truth-aptness of normative claims. If, as the correspondence theory proposes, a necessary condition for the truth of a normative claim is the existence of a normative fact to which it corresponds, and if the existence of normative facts is difficult to account for (normative facts seem ontologically distinct from garden-variety physical facts), then this does not bode well for the truth-aptness of normative claims or the point of posing, and inquiring into, normative questions (Lynch 2009). If the correspondence theory of truth leads to skepticism about normative inquiry, then this is all the more reason, according to pragmatists, to sidestep the metaphysical project in favor of the speech-act and justification projects.

As we have seen, pragmatic theories of truth take a variety of different forms. Despite these differences, and despite often being averse to being called a “theory”, pragmatic theories of truth do share some common features. To begin with, and unlike many theories of truth, these theories focus on the pragmatics of truth-talk: that is, they focus on how truth is used as an essential step toward an adequate understanding of the concept of truth (indeed, this come close to being an oxymoron). More specifically, pragmatic theories look to how truth is used in epistemic contexts where people make assertions, conduct inquiries, solve problems, and act on their beliefs. By prioritizing the speech-act and justification projects, pragmatic theories of truth attempt to ground the concept of truth in epistemic practices as opposed to the abstract relations between truth-bearers (such as propositions or statements) and truth-makers (such as states of affairs) appealed to by correspondence theories (MacBride 2018). Pragmatic theories also recognize that truth can play a fundamental role in shaping inquiry and assertoric discourse—for example, by functioning as a norm of these practices—even when it is not explicitly mentioned. In this respect pragmatic theories are less austere than deflationary theories which limit the use of truth to its generalizing and disquotational roles. And, finally, pragmatic theories of truth draw no limits, at least at the outset, to the types of statements, topics, and inquiries where truth may play a practical role. If it turns out that a given topic is not truth-apt, this is something that should be discovered as a characteristic of that subject matter, not something determined by having chosen one theory of truth or another (Capps 2017).

5. Critical Assessments

Pragmatic theories of truth have faced several objections since first being proposed. Some of these objections can be rather narrow, challenging a specific pragmatic account but not pragmatic theories in general (this is the case with objections raised by other pragmatic accounts). This section will look at more general objections: either objections that are especially common and persistent, or objections that pose a challenge to the basic assumptions underlying pragmatic theories more broadly.

5.1 Three Classic Objections and Responses

Some objections are as old as the pragmatic theory of truth itself. The following objections were raised in response to James’ account in particular. While James offered his own responses to many of these criticisms (see especially his 1909 [1975]), versions of these objections often apply to other and more recent pragmatic theories of truth (for further discussion see Haack 1976; Tiercelin 2014).

One classic and influential line of criticism is that, if the pragmatic theory of truth equates truth with utility, this definition is (obviously!) refuted by the existence of useful but false beliefs, on the one hand, and by the existence of true but useless beliefs on the other (Russell 1910 [1994] and Lovejoy 1908a,b). In short, there seems to be a clear and obvious difference between describing a belief as true and describing it as useful:

when we say that a belief is true, the thought we wish to convey is not the same thought as when we say that the belief furthers our purposes; thus “true” does not mean “furthering our purposes”. (Russell 1910 [1994: 98])

While this criticism is often aimed especially at James’ account of truth, it plausibly carries over to any pragmatic theory. So whether truth is defined in terms of utility, long-term durability or assertibility (etc.), it is still an open question whether a useful or durable or assertible belief is, in fact, really true. In other words, whatever concept a pragmatic theory uses to define truth, there is likely to be a difference between that concept and the concept of truth (e.g., Bacon 2014 questions the connection between truth and indefeasibility).

A second and related criticism builds on the first. Perhaps utility, long-term durability, and assertibility (etc.) should be viewed not as definitions but rather as criteria of truth, as yardsticks for distinguishing true beliefs from false ones. This seems initially plausible and might even serve as a reasonable response to the first objection above. Falling back on an earlier distinction, this would mean that appeals to utility, long-term durability, and assertibility (etc.) are best seen as answers to the justification and not the metaphysical project. However, without some account of what truth is, or what the necessary and sufficient conditions for truth are, any attempt to offer criteria of truth is arguably incomplete: we cannot have criteria of truth without first knowing what truth is. If so, then the justification project relies on and presupposes a successful resolution to the metaphysical project, the latter cannot be sidestepped or bracketed, and any theory which attempts to do so will give at best a partial account of truth (Creighton 1908; Stebbing 1914).

And a third objection builds on the second. Putting aside the question of whether pragmatic theories of truth adequately address the metaphysical project (or address it at all), there is also a problem with the criteria of truth they propose for addressing the justification project. Pragmatic theories of truth seem committed, in part, to bringing the concept of truth down to earth, to explaining truth in concrete, easily confirmable, terms rather than the abstract, metaphysical correspondence of propositions to truth-makers, for example. The problem is that assessing the usefulness (etc.) of a belief is no more clear-cut than assessing its truth: beliefs may be more or less useful, useful in different ways and for different purposes, or useful in the short- or long-run. Determining whether a belief is really useful is no easier, apparently, than determining whether it is really true: “it is so often harder to determine whether a belief is useful than whether it is true” (Russell 1910 [1994: 121]; also 1946: 817). Far from making the concept of truth more concrete, and the assessment of beliefs more straightforward, pragmatic theories of truth thus seem to leave the concept as opaque as ever.

These three objections have been around long enough that pragmatists have, at various times, proposed a variety of responses. One response to the first objection, that there is a clear difference between utility (etc.) and truth, is to deny that pragmatic approaches are aiming to define the concept of truth in the first place. It has been argued that pragmatic theories are not about finding a word or concept that can substitute for truth but that they are, rather, focused on tracing the implications of using this concept in practical contexts. This is what Misak (2000, 2007a) calls a “pragmatic elucidation”. Noting that it is “pointless” to offer a definition of truth, she concludes that “we ought to attempt to get leverage on the concept, or a fix on it, by exploring its connections with practice” (2007a: 69; see also Wiggins 2002). It is even possible that James—the main target of Russell and others—would agree with this response. As with Peirce, it often seems that James’ complaint is not with the correspondence theory of truth, per se, as with the assumption that the correspondence theory, by itself, says much interesting or important about the concept of truth. (For charitable interpretations of what James was attempting to say see Ayer 1968, Chisholm 1992, Bybee 1984, Cormier 2001, 2011, and Perkins 1952; for a reading that emphasizes Peirce’s commitment to correspondence idioms see Atkins 2010.)

This still leaves the second objection: that the metaphysical project of defining truth cannot be avoided by focusing instead on finding the criteria for truth (the “justification project”). To be sure, pragmatic theories of truth have often been framed as providing criteria for distinguishing true from false beliefs. The distinction between offering a definition as opposed to offering criteria would suggest that criteria are separate from, and largely inferior to, a definition of truth. However, one might question the underlying distinction: as Haack (1976) argues,

the pragmatists’ view of meaning is such that a dichotomy between definitions and criteria would have been entirely unacceptable to them. (1976: 236)

If meaning is related to use (as pragmatists generally claim) then explaining how a concept is used, and specifying criteria for recognizing that concept, may provide all one can reasonably expect from a theory of truth. Deflationists have often made a similar point though, as noted above, pragmatists tend to find deflationary accounts excessively austere.

Even so, there is still the issue that pragmatic criteria of truth (whatever they are) do not provide useful insight into the concept of truth. If this concern is valid, then pragmatic criteria, ironically, fail the pragmatic test of making a difference to our understanding of truth. This objection has some merit: for example, if a pragmatic criterion of truth is that true beliefs will stand up to indefinite inquiry then, while it is possible to have true beliefs, “we are never in a position to judge whether a belief is true or not” (Misak 2000: 57). In that case it is not clear what good it serves to have a pragmatic criterion of truth. Pragmatic theories of truth might try to sidestep this objection by stressing their commitment to both the justification and the speech-act project. While pragmatic approaches to the justification project spell out what truth means in conversational contexts—to call a statement true is to cite its usefulness, durability, etc.—pragmatic approaches to the speech-act project point to what speakers do in using the concept of truth. This has the benefit of showing how the concept of truth—operating as a norm of assertion, say—makes a real difference to our understanding of the conditions on assertoric discourse. Pragmatic theories of truth are, as a result, wise to pursue both the justification and the speech-act projects. By itself, pragmatic approaches to the justification project are likely to disappoint.

These classic objections to the pragmatic theory of truth raise several important points. For one thing, they make it clear that pragmatic theories of truth, or at least some historically prominent versions of it, do a poor job if viewed as providing a strict definition of truth. As Russell and others noted, defining truth in terms of utility or similar terms is open to obvious counter-examples. This does not bode well for pragmatic attempts to address the metaphysical project. As a result, pragmatic theories of truth have evolved often by focusing on the justification and speech-act projects instead. This is not to say that each of the above objections have been met. It is still an open question whether the metaphysical project can be avoided as many pragmatic theories attempt to do (e.g., Fox 2008 argues that epistemic accounts such as Putnam’s fail to explain the value of truth as well as more traditional approaches do). It is also an open question whether, as they evolve in response to these objections, pragmatic theories of truth invite new lines of criticism.

5.2 The Fundamental Objection

One long-standing and still ongoing objection is that pragmatic theories of truth are anti-realist and, as such, violate basic intuitions about the nature and meaning of truth: call this “the fundamental objection”. The source of this objection rests with the tendency of pragmatic theories of truth to treat truth epistemically, by focusing on verifiability, assertibility, and other related concepts. Some (see, e.g., Schmitt 1995; Nolt 2008) have argued that, by linking truth with verifiability or assertibility, pragmatic theories make truth too subjective and too dependent on our contingent ability to figure things out, as opposed to theories that, for example, appeal to objective facts as truth-makers. Others have argued that pragmatic theories cannot account for what Peirce called buried secrets: statements that would seem to be either true or false despite our inability to figure out which (see de Waal 1999, Howat 2013, and Talisse & Akin 2008 for discussions of this). For similar reasons, some have accused pragmatic theories of denying bivalence (Allen Hermanson 2001). Whatever form the objection takes, it raises a common concern: that pragmatic theories of truth are insufficiently realist, failing both to account for truth’s objectivity and to distinguish truth from the limitations of actual epistemic practice. What results, accordingly, is not a theory of truth, but rather a theory of justification, warranted assertibility, or some other epistemic concept.

This objection has persisted despite inspiring a range of responses. At one extreme some, such as Rorty, have largely conceded the point while attempting to defuse its force. As noted earlier, Rorty grants that truth is not objective in the traditional sense while also attempting to undercut the very distinction between objectivity and relativism. Others, such as Putnam, have argued against metaphysical realist intuitions (such as “the God’s Eye view” 1981: 55), while defending the idea of a more human-scale objectivity: “objectivity and rationality humanly speaking are what we have; they are better than nothing” (1981: 55). Another response is to claim that pragmatic accounts of truth are fully compatible with realism; any impression to the contrary is a result of confusing pragmatic “elucidations” of truth with more typical “definitions”. For example Peirce’s steadfast commitment to realism is perfectly compatible with his attempting to describe truth in terms of its practical role: hence, his notion of truth

is the ordinary notion, but he insists on this notion’s being philosophically characterized from the viewpoint of the practical first order investigator. (Hookway 2002: 319; see also Hookway 2012 and Legg 2014)

Even James claimed “my account of truth is realistic” (1909 [1975: 117]). Finally, others attempt to undercut the distinction between realism and antirealism though without making concessions to antirealism. Hildebrand argues for embracing a “practical starting point” (Hildebrand 2003: 185) as a way of going “beyond” the realism-antirealism debate (see also Fine 2007). Similarly, Price, while admitting that his theory might seem “fictionalist” about truth, argues that its bona fides are “impeccably pragmatist” (2003: 189) and, in fact, “deprive both sides of the realism-antirealism debate of conceptual resources on which the debate seems to depend” (2003: 188; but see Atkin 2015 for some caveats and Lynch 2015 for a pluralist amendment). Da Costa and French (2003) offer a formal account of pragmatic truth that, they argue, can benefit both sides of the realism-anti-realism debate (though they themselves prefer structural realism).

We find, in other words, an assortment of replies that run the gamut from embracing anti-realism to defending realism to attempting to undermine the realist-antirealist distinction itself. Evidently, there is no consensus among pragmatic theories of truth as to the best line of response against this objection. In a way, this should be no surprise: the objection boils down to the charge that pragmatic theories of truth are too epistemic, when it is precisely their commitment to epistemic concepts that characterizes pragmatic theories of truth. Responding to this objection may involve concessions and qualifications that compromise the pragmatic nature of these approaches. Or responding may mean showing how pragmatic accounts have certain practical benefits—but these benefits as well as their relative importance are themselves contentious topics. As a result, we should not expect this objection to be easily resolvable, if it can be resolved at all.

Despite being the target of significant criticism from nearly the moment of its birth, the pragmatic theory of truth has managed to survive and, at times, even flourish for over a century. Because the pragmatic theory of truth has come in several different versions, and because these versions often diverge significantly, it can be difficult to pin down and assess generally. Adding to the possible confusion, not all those identified as pragmatists have embraced a pragmatic theory of truth (e.g., Brandom 2011), while similar theories have been held by non-pragmatists (e.g., Dummett 1959; Wright 1992). Viewed more positively, pragmatic theories have evolved and matured to become more sophisticated and, perhaps, more plausible over time. With the benefit of hind-sight we can see how pragmatic theories of truth have stayed focused on the practical function that the concept of truth plays: first, the role truth plays within inquiry and assertoric discourse by, for example, signaling those statements that are especially useful, well-verified, durable, or indefeasible and, second, the role truth plays in shaping inquiry and assertoric discourse by providing a necessary goal or norm. (While pragmatic theories agree on the importance of focusing on truth’s practical function, they often disagree over what this practical function is.)

The pragmatic theory of truth began with Peirce raising the question of truth’s “practical bearings”. It is also possible to ask this question of the pragmatic theory of truth itself: what difference does this theory make? Or to put it in James’ terms, what is its “cash value”? One answer is that, by focusing on the practical function of the concept of truth, pragmatic theories highlight how this concept makes certain kinds of inquiry and discourse possible. In contrast, as Lynch (2009) notes, some accounts of truth make it difficult to see how certain claims are truth-apt:

consider propositions like two and two are four or torture is wrong. Under the assumption that truth is always and everywhere causal correspondence, it is a vexing question how these true thoughts can be true. (Lynch 2009: 34, emphasis in original)

If that is so, then pragmatic theories have the advantage of preserving the possibility and importance of various types of inquiry and discourse. While this does not guarantee that inquiry will always reach a satisfying or definite conclusion, this does suggest that pragmatic theories of truth do make a difference: in the spirit of Peirce’s “first rule of reason”, they “do not block the way of inquiry” (1898 [1992: 178]).


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[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I would like to thank David Hildebrand, Cheryl Misak, Sami Pihlström, and an anonymous reviewer for helpful comments and suggestions on this article. Additional comments and suggestions are obviously welcome.

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John Capps <>

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