First published Sat Feb 8, 1997; substantive revision Thu Apr 5, 2018

There is wide agreement that a term is vague to the extent that it has borderline cases. This makes the notion of a borderline case crucial in accounts of vagueness. I shall concentrate on an historical characterization of borderline cases that most commentators would accept. Vagueness will then be contrasted with ambiguity and generality. This will clarify the nature of the philosophical challenge posed by vagueness. I will then discuss some rival theories of vagueness with an emphasis on many-valued logic, supervaluationism and contextualism. I will conclude with the issue of whether all vagueness is linguistic.

1. Inquiry Resistance

If you cut one head off of a two headed man, have you decapitated him? What is the maximum height of a short man? When does a fertilized egg develop into a person?

These questions are impossible to answer because they involve absolute borderline cases. In the vast majority of cases, the unknowability of a borderline statement is only relative to a given means of settling the issue (Sorensen 2001, chapter 1). For instance, a boy may count as a borderline case of ‘obese’ because people cannot tell whether he is obese just by looking at him. A curious mother could try to settle the matter by calculating her son’s body mass index. The formula is to divide his weight (in kilograms) by the square of his height (in meters). If the value exceeds 30, this test counts him as obese. The calculation will itself leave some borderline cases. The mother could then use a weight-for-height chart. These charts are not entirely decisive because they do not reflect the ratio of fat to muscle, whether the child has large bones, and so on. The boy will only count as an absolute borderline case of ‘obese’ if no possible method of inquiry could settle whether he is obese. When we reach this stage, we start to suspect that our uncertainty is due to the concept of obesity rather than to our limited means of testing for obesity.

Absolute borderline cases are targeted by Charles Sander Peirce’s entry for ‘vague’ in the 1902 Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology:

A proposition is vague when there are possible states of things concerning which it is intrinsically uncertain whether, had they been contemplated by the speaker, he would have regarded them as excluded or allowed by the proposition. By intrinsically uncertain we mean not uncertain in consequence of any ignorance of the interpreter, but because the speaker’s habits of language were indeterminate. (Peirce 1902, 748)

In the case of relative borderline cases, the question is clear but our means for answering it are incomplete. In the case of absolute borderline cases, there is incompleteness in the question itself.

When a term is applied to one of its absolute borderline cases the result is a statement that resists all attempts to settle whether it is true or false. No amount of conceptual analysis or empirical inquiry can settle whether removing one head from a two headed man counts as decapitating him. We could give the appearance of settling the matter by stipulating that ‘decapitate’ means ‘remove a head’ (as opposed to ‘make headless’ or ‘remove the head’ or ‘remove the most important head’). But that would amount to changing the topic to an issue that merely sounds the same as decapitation.

Vagueness is standardly defined as the possession of borderline cases. For example, ‘tall’ is vague because a man who is 1.8 meters in height is neither clearly tall nor clearly non-tall. No amount of conceptual analysis or empirical investigation can settle whether a 1.8 meter man is tall. Borderline cases are inquiry resistant.

Where does the tail of a snake begin? When posed as a rhetorical question, the speaker is hinting that there is no definite answer. But the tail can be located by tracing down from the snake’s rib cage. A false attribution of indeterminacy will lead to the premature abandonment of inquiry. The risk of futile inquiry into questions that cannot be answered must be balanced against the risk of abandoning questions that are actually answerable.

Inquiry resistance typically recurses. For in addition to the unclarity of the borderline case, there is normally unclarity as to where the unclarity begins. Twilight governs times that are borderline between day and night. But our uncertainty as to when twilight begins, shows there must be borderline cases of borderline cases of ‘day’. Consequently, ‘borderline case’ has borderline cases. This higher order vagueness seems to show that ‘vague’ is vague (Hu 2017).

The vagueness of ‘vague’ would have two important consequences. First, Gottlob Frege could no longer coherently characterize vague predicates as incoherent. For his accusation uses ‘vague’. Frege’s ideal of precision is itself vague because ‘precise’ is the complement of ‘vague’.

Second, the vagueness of ‘vague’ dooms efforts to avoid a sharp line between true and false with a buffer zone that is neither true nor false. If the line is not drawn between the true and the false, then it will be between the true and the intermediate state. Introducing further intermediates just delays the inevitable.

This motivates second thoughts about second order vagueness. Instead of continuing to treat higher order vagueness as an insight, several philosophers repudiate higher order vagueness as an illusion (Wright 2010). They deny that there is an open-ended iteration of borderline status. They find it telling that speakers do not go around talking about borderline borderline cases and borderline borderline borderline cases and so forth (Raffman 2005, 23).

Defenders of higher order vagueness say that ordinary speakers avoid iterating ‘borderline’ for the same reason they avoid iterating ‘million’ or ‘know’. The iterations are confusing but perfectly meaningful. ‘Borderline’ behaves just like a vague predicate. For instance, ‘borderline’ can be embedded in a sorites argument. Defenders of higher order vagueness have also tried to clinch the case with particular specimens such as borderline hermaphrodites (reasoning that these individuals are borderline borderline males) (Sorensen 2010).

2. Comparison with Ambiguity and Generality

‘Tall’ is relative. A 1.8 meter pygmy is tall for a pygmy but a 1.8 meter Masai is not tall for a Masai. Although relativization disambiguates, it does not eliminate borderline cases. There are shorter pygmies who are borderline tall for a pygmy and taller Masai who are borderline tall for a Masai. The direct bearers of vagueness are a word’s full disambiguations such as ‘tall for an eighteenth century French man’. Words are only vague indirectly, by virtue of having a sense that is vague. In contrast, an ambiguous word bears its ambiguity directly—simply in virtue of having multiple meanings.

This contrast between vagueness and ambiguity is obscured by the fact that most words are both vague and ambiguous. ‘Child’ is ambiguous between ‘offspring’ and ‘immature offspring’. The latter reading of ‘child’ is vague because there are borderline cases of immature offspring. The contrast is further complicated by the fact that most words are also general. For instance, ‘child’ covers both boys and girls.

Ambiguity and vagueness also contrast with respect to the speaker’s discretion. If a word is ambiguous, the speaker can resolve the ambiguity without departing from literal usage. For instance, he can declare that he meant ‘child’ to express the concept of an immature offspring. If a word is vague, the speaker cannot resolve the borderline case. For instance, the speaker cannot make ‘child’ literally mean anyone under eighteen just by intending it. That concept is not, as it were, on the menu corresponding to ‘child’. He would be understood as taking a special liberty with the term to suit a special purpose. Acknowledging departure from ordinary usage would relieve him of the obligation to defend the sharp cut-off.

When the movie director Alfred Hitchcock mused ‘All actors are children’ he was taking liberties with clear negative cases of ‘child’ rather than its borderline cases. The aptness of his generalization is not judged by its literal truth-value (because it is obviously untrue). Likewise, we do not judge precisifications of borderline cases by their truth-values (because they are obviously not ascertainable as true or false). We instead judge precisifications by their simplicity, conservativeness, and fruitfulness. A precisification that draws the line across the borderline cases conserves more paradigm usage than one that draws the line across clear cases. But conservatism is just one desideratum among many. Sometimes the best balance is achieved at the cost of turning former positive cases into negative cases.

Once we shift from literal to figurative usage, we gain fictive control over our entire vocabulary—not just vague words. When a travel agent says ‘France is a hexagon’, we do not infer that she has committed the geometrical error of classifying France as a six sided polygon. We instead interpret the travel agent as speaking figuratively, as meaning that France is shaped like a hexagon. Similarly, when the travel agent says ‘Reno is the biggest little city’, we do not interpret her as overlooking the vagueness of ‘little city’. Just as she uses the obvious falsehood of ‘France is a hexagon’ to signal a metaphor, she uses the obvious indeterminacy of ‘Reno is the biggest little city’ to signal hyperbole.

Given that speakers lack any literal discretion over vague terms, we ought not to chide them for indecisiveness. Where there is no decision to be made, there is no scope for vice.

Speakers would have literal discretion if statements applying a predicate to its borderline cases were just permissible variations in linguistic usage. For instance, Crispin Wright and Stewart Shapiro say a competent speaker can faultlessly classify the borderline case as a positive instance while another competent speaker can faultlessly classify the case as a negative instance.

For the sake of comparison, consider discretion between alternative spellings. Professor Letterman uses ‘judgment’ instead of ‘judgement’ because he wants to promote the principle that a silent E signals a long vowel. He still has fond memories of Tom Lehrer’s 1971 children’s song “Silent E”:

Who can turn a can into a cane?
Who can turn a pan into a pane?
It’s not too hard to see,
It’s Silent E.

Who can turn a cub into a cube?
Who can turn a tub into a tube?
It’s elementary
For Silent E.

Professor Letterman disapproves of those who add the misleading E but concedes that ‘judgement’ is a permissible spelling; he does not penalize his students for misspelling when they make their hard-hearted choice of ‘judgement’. Indeed, like other professors, he scolds students if they fail to stick with the same spelling throughout the composition. Choose but stick to your choice!

Professor Letterman’s assertion ‘The word for my favorite mental act is spelled j-u-d-g-m-e-n-t’ is robust with respect to the news that it is also spelled j-u-d-g-e-m-e-n-t. He would continue to assert it. He can conjoin the original assertion with information about the alternative: ‘The word for my favorite mental act is spelled j-u-d-g-m-e-n-t and is also spelled j-u-d-g-e-m-e-n-t’. In contrast, Professor Letterman’s assertion that ‘Martha is a woman’ is not robust with respect to the news that Martha is a borderline case of ‘woman’ (say, Letterman learns Martha is younger than she looks). The new information would lead Letterman to retract his assertion in favor of a hedged remark such as ‘Martha might be a woman and Martha might not be a woman’. Professor Letterman’s loss of confidence is hard to explain if the information about her borderline status were simply news of a different but permissible way of describing her. Discoveries of notational variants do not warrant changes in former beliefs.

News of borderline status has an evidential character. Loss of clarity brings loss of warrant. If you do not lower your confidence, you are open to the charge of dogmatism. To concede that Martha is a borderline case of ‘woman’ is to concede that you do not know that she is a woman. That is why debates can be dissolved by showing that the dispute is over a borderline case. The debaters should be agnostic if they are dealing with a borderline case. They do not have a license to form beliefs beyond their evidence.

News of an alternative sense is like news of an alternative spelling; there is no evidential impact (except for meta-linguistic beliefs about the nature of words). Your assertion that ‘All bachelors are men’ is robust with respect to the news that ‘bachelor’ has an alternative sense in which it means a male seal. Assertions are not robust with respect to news of hidden generality. If a South African girl says ‘No elephant can be domesticated’ but is then taught that there is another species of elephant indigenous to Asia, then she will lose some confidence; maybe Asian elephants can be domesticated. News of hidden generality has evidential impact. When it comes to robustness, vagueness resembles generality more than vagueness resembles ambiguity.

Mathematical terms such as ‘prime number’ show that a term can be general without being vague. A term can also be vague without being general. Borderline cases of analytically empty predicates illustrate this possibility.

Generality is obviously useful. Often, lessons about a particular F can be projected to other Fs in virtue of their common F-ness. When a girl learns that her cat has a nictating membrane that protects its eyes, she rightly expects her neighbor’s cat also has a nictating membrane. Generality saves labor. When the girl says that she wants a toy rather than clothes, she narrows the range of acceptable gifts without going through the trouble of specifying a particular gift. The girl also balances values: a gift should be intrinsically desired and yet also be a surprise. If uncertain about which channel is the weather channel, she can hedge by describing the channel as ‘forty-something’. There is an inverse relationship between the contentfulness of a proposition and its probability: the more specific a claim, the less likely it is to be true. By gauging generality, we can make sensible trade-offs between truth and detail.

‘Vague’ has a sense which is synonymous with abnormal generality. This precipitates many equivocal explanations of vagueness. For instance, many commentators say that vagueness exists because broad categories ease the task of classification. If I can describe your sweater as red, then I do not need to ascertain whether it is scarlet. This freedom to use wide intervals obviously helps us to learn, teach, communicate, and remember. But so what? The problem is to explain the existence of borderline cases. Are they present because vagueness serves a function? Or are borderline cases side-effects of ordinary conversation—like echoes?

Every natural language is both vague and ambiguous. However, both features seem eliminable. Indeed, both are eliminated in miniature languages such as checkers notation, computer programming languages, and mathematical descriptions. Moreover, it seems that both vagueness and ambiguity ought to be minimized. ‘Vague’ and ‘ambiguous’ are pejorative terms. And they deserve their bad reputations. Think of all the automotive misery that has been prefaced by

Driver: Do I turn left?
Passenger: Right.

English can be lethal. Philosophers have long motivated appeals for an ideal language by pointing out how ambiguity creates the menace of equivocation:

No child should work.
Every person is a child of someone.
Therefore, no one should work.

Happily, we know how to criticize and correct all equivocations. Indeed, every natural language is self-disambiguating in the sense that each has all the resources needed to uniquely specify any reading one desires. Ambiguity is often the cause but rarely the object of philosophical rumination.

3. The Philosophical Challenge Posed by Vagueness

Vagueness, in contrast, precipitates a profound problem: the sorites paradox. For instance,

Base step: A one day old human being is a child.

Induction step: If an n day old human being is a child, then that human being is also a child when it is n + 1 days old.

Conclusion: Therefore, a 36,500 day old human being is a child.

The conclusion is false because a 100 year old man is clearly a non-child. Since the base step of the argument is also plainly true and the argument is valid by mathematical induction, we seem to have no choice but to reject the second premise.

George Boolos (1991) observes that we have an autonomous case against the induction step. In addition to implying plausible conditionals such as ‘If a 1 day old human being is a child, then that human being is also a child when it is 2 days old’, the induction step also implies ludicrous conditionals such as ‘If a 1 day old human being is a child, then that human being is also a child when it is 36,500 days old’.

Boolos is puzzled why we overlook these clear counterexamples. One explanation is that we tend to treat the induction step as a generic generalization such as ‘ People have ten toes’(Sorensen 2012). Whereas the formal generalization ‘All people have ten toes’ is refuted by people with eleven toes, the generic generalization tolerates exceptions.

This hypothesis is plausible for newcomers to the sorites paradox. But it is less plausible for those being tutored by Professor Boolos. He guides logic students to the correct interpretation of the induction step. When students drift to a generic reading, Boolos reminds them that induction step is a formal generalization.

Guided by Boolos’ firm hand, logic students drive a second stake into the heart of the sorites paradox. Yet the paradox seems far from dead. The negation of the second premise classically implies a sharp threshold for childhood. For it implies the existential generalization that there is a number n such that an n day old human being is a child but is no longer a child one day later.

Epistemicists accept this astonishing consequence. They think vagueness is a form of ignorance. Timothy Williamson (1994) traces the ignorance of the threshold for childhood to “margin for error” principles. If one knows that an n day old human being is a child, then that human being must also be a child when n + 1 days old. Otherwise, one is right by luck. Given that there is a threshold, we would be ignorant of its location.

Debate over the margin for error principle draws us deep into epistemology and modality (Yli-Vakkuri 2016). Some commentators switch focus to attitudes weaker than knowledge. According to Nicholas Smith (2008, 182) we cannot even guess that the threshold for baldness is the 400th hair. Hartry Field (2010, 203) denies that a rational man can fear that he has just passed the threshold into being old. Hope, speculation, and wonder do not require evidence but they do require understanding. So it is revealing that these attitudes have trouble getting a purchase on the threshold of oldness (or any other vague predicate). A simple explanation is that bare linguistic competence gives us knowledge that are no such thresholds. This accounts for the comical air of the epistemicist. Just as there is no conceptual room to worry that there is a natural number between sixty and sixty one, there is no conceptual room to worry that one has passed the threshold of oldness between one’s sixtieth and sixty first birthday.

An old epistemicist might reply: My piecemeal confidence that a given number is not the threshold for oldness does not agglomerate into collective confidence that there is no such number. If I bet against each number being the threshold, then I must have placed a losing bet somewhere. For if I won each bet then there was no opportunity for me to make the transition to oldness. My bookie could have made a “Dutch book” against me. He would have been entitled to payment without having to identify which bet I lost. Since probabilities may be extracted from hypothetical betting behavior, I must actually assign some small (normally negligible) probability to hypotheses identifying particular thresholds. So must you.

Stephen Schiffer (2003, 204) denies that classical probability calculations apply in vague contexts. Suppose Donald is borderline old and borderline bald. According to Schiffer we should be just as confident in the conjunction ‘Donald is old and bald’ as in either conjunct. Adding conjuncts does not reduce confidence because we have a “vague partial belief” rather than the standard belief assumed by mathematicians developing probability theory. Schiffer offers a calculus for this vagueness-related propositional attitude. He crafts the rules for vague partial belief to provide a psychological solution to the sorites paradox.

The project is complicated by the fact that vague partial beliefs interact with precise beliefs (MacFarlane 2010). Consider a statement that has a mixture of vague and precise conjuncts: ‘Donald is old and bald and has an even number of hairs’. Adding the extra precise conjunct should diminish confidence. Schiffer also needs to accommodate the fact that some speakers are undecided about whether the nature of the uncertainty involves vagueness. Even an idealized speaker may be unsure because there is vagueness about the borders between vagueness related uncertainty and other sorts of uncertainty.

Other commentators grant that it is logically possible that vague predicates have thresholds. They just think it would be a miracle: “It is logically possible that the words on this page will come to life and sort my socks. But I know enough about words to dismiss this as a serious possibility. So I am right to boggle at the possibility that our rough and ready terms such as ‘red’ could so sensitively classify objects.” Epistemicists counter that this bafflement rests on an over-estimate of the role of stipulation in meaning. Epistemicists say much meaning is acquired passively by default rather than actively by decision. If some boundaries are more eligible for reference than others, then the environment does the work.

Most philosophers doubt whether precise analytical tools fit vague arguments. H. G. Wells was amongst the first to suggest that we must moderate the application of logic:

Every species is vague, every term goes cloudy at its edges, and so in my way of thinking, relentless logic is only another name for stupidity—for a sort of intellectual pigheadedness. If you push a philosophical or metaphysical enquiry through a series of valid syllogisms—never committing any generally recognized fallacy—you nevertheless leave behind you at each step a certain rubbing and marginal loss of objective truth and you get deflections that are difficult to trace, at each phase in the process. Every species waggles about in its definition, every tool is a little loose in its handle, every scale has its individual.—First and Last Things (1908)

Many more believe that the problem is with logic itself rather than the manner in which it is applied. They favor solving the sorites paradox by replacing standard logic with an earthier deviant logic.

There is a desperately wide range of opinions as to how the revision of logic should be executed. Every form of deviant logic has been applied in the hope of resolving the sorites paradox.

4. Many-valued Logic

An early favorite was many-valued logic. On this approach, borderline statements are assigned truth-values that lie between full truth and full falsehood. Some logicians favor three truth-values, others prefer four or five. The most popular approach is to use an infinite number of truth-values represented by the real numbers between 0 (for full falsehood) and 1 (for full truth). This infinite spectrum of truth-values might be of service for a continuous sorites argument involving ‘small real number’ (Weber and Colyvan 2010).

Critics object that this proliferation of truth-values exacerbates the over-precision of classical logic. Instead of having just one artificially sharp line between the true and the false, the many-valued logician has infinitely many sharp lines such as that between statements with a truth of .323483925 and those with a higher truth-value. In Mark Sainsbury’s words, “… you do not improve a bad idea by iterating it.” (1996, 255)

A proponent of an infinite valued logic might reply to Sainsbury with an analogy. It is a bad idea to model a circle with a straight line. Using two lines is not much better, nor is there is much improvement using a three sided polygon (a triangle). But as we add more straight lines to the polygon (square, pentagon, hexagon, and so on) we make progress—by iterating the bad idea of modeling a circle with straight lines.

Indeed, it would be tempting to triumphantly conclude ‘The circle has been modeled as an infinitely sided polygon’. This victory declaration would itself need clarification. Has the circle been revealed to be an infinitely sided polygon? Have curved lines been replaced by straight lines? Have curved lines (and hence circles) been proven to not exist? A model can succeed without it being clear what has been achieved.

But it is premature to dwell on the simile ‘Precision is to vagueness as straightness is to curvature’. The many-valued logician must first vindicate the analogy by providing details about how to calculate the truth-values of vague statements from the truth-values of their component statements.

Proponents of many-valued logic approach this obligation with great industry. Precise new rules are introduced to calculate the truth value of compound statements that contain statements with intermediate truth-values. For instance, the revised rule for conjunctions is to assign the conjunction the same truth-value as the conjunct with the lowest truth-value.

These rules are designed to yield all standard theorems when all the truth values are 1 and 0. In this sense, classical logic is a limiting case of many-valued logic. Classical logic is agreed to work fine in the area for which it was designed—mathematics.

Most theorems of standard logic break down when intermediate truth-values are involved. (An irregular minority, such as ‘If P, then P’, survive.) Even the classical contradiction ‘Donald is bald and it is not the case that he is bald’ receives a truth-value of .5 when ‘Donald is bald’ has a truth-value of .5. Many-valued logicians note that the error they are imputing to classical logic is often so small that classical logic can still be fruitfully applied. But they insist that the sorites paradox illustrates how tiny errors accumulate into a big error.

Critics of the many-valued approach complain that it botches phenomena such as hedging. If I regard you as a borderline case of ‘tall man’, I cannot sincerely assert that you are tall and I cannot sincerely assert that you are of average height. But I can assert the hedged claim ‘Either you are tall or of average height’. The many-valued rule for disjunction is to assign the whole statement the truth-value of its highest disjunct. Normally, the added disjunct in a hedged claim is not more plausible than the other disjuncts. Thus it cannot increase the degree of truth. Disappointingly, the proponent of many-valued logic cannot trace the increase of assertibility to an increase in the degree of truth.

Epistemicists explain the rise in assertibility by the increasing probability of truth. Since the addition of disjuncts can raise probability indefinitely, the epistemicists correctly predict that we can hedge our way to full assertibility. However, epistemicists do not have a monopoly on this prediction.

5. Supervaluationism

According to supervaluationists, borderline statements lack a truth-value. This neatly explains why it is universally impossible to know the truth-value of a borderline statement. Supervaluationists offer details about the nature of absolute borderline cases. Simple sentences about borderline cases lack a truth-value. Compounds of these statements can have a truth-value if they come out true regardless of how the statement is precisified. For instance, ‘Either Mr. Stoop is tall or it is not the case that Mr. Stoop is tall’ is true because it comes out true under all ways of sharpening ‘tall’. Thus the method of supervaluations allows one to retain all the theorems of standard logic while admitting “truth-value gaps”.

One may wonder whether this striking result is a genuine convergence with standard logic. Is the supervaluationist characterizing vague statements as propositions? Or is he merely pointing out that certain non-propositions have a structure isomorphic to logical theorems? (Some electrical circuits are isomorphic to tautologies but this does not make the circuits tautologies.) Kit Fine (1975, 282), and especially David Lewis (1982), characterize vagueness as hyper-ambiguity. Instead of there being one vague concept, there are many precise concepts that closely resemble each other. ‘Child’ can mean a human being at most one day old or mean a human being at most two days old or mean a human being at most three days old …. Thus the logic of vagueness is a logic for equivocators. Lewis’ idea is that ambiguous statements are true when they come out true under all disambiguations. But logicians normally require that a statement be disambiguated before logic is applied. The mere fact that an ambiguous statement comes out true under all its disambiguations does not show that the statement itself is true. Sentences which are actually disambiguated may have truth-values. But the best that can be said of those that merely could be disambiguated is that they would have had a truth-value had they been disambiguated (Tye 1989).

Supervaluationism will converge with classical logic only if each word of the supervaluated sentence is uniformly interpreted. For instance, ‘Either a carbon copy of Teddy Roosevelt’s signature is an autograph or it is not the case that a carbon copy of Teddy Roosevelt’s signature is an autograph’ comes out true only if ‘autograph’ is interpreted the same way in both disjuncts. Vague sentences resist mixed interpretations. However, mixed interpretations are permissible for ambiguous sentences. As Lewis himself notes in a criticism of relevance logic, ‘Scrooge walked along the bank on his way to the bank’ can receive a mixed disambiguation. When exterminators offer ‘non-toxic ant poison’, we charitably switch relativizations within the noun phrase: the substance is safe for human beings but deadly for ants.

Even if one agrees that supervaluationism converges with classical logic about theoremhood, they clearly differ in other respects. Supervaluationism requires rejection of inference rules such as contraposition, conditional proof and reductio ad absurdum (Williamson 1994, 151–152). In the eyes of the supervaluationist, a demonstration that a statement is not true does not guarantee that the statement is false.

The supervaluationist is also under pressure to reject semantic principles which are intimately associated with the application of logical laws. According to Alfred Tarski’s Convention T, a statement ‘S’ is true if and only if S. In other words, truth is disquotational. Supervaluationists say that being supertrue (being true under all precisifications) suffices for being true. But given Convention T, supertruth would then be disquotational. Since the supervaluationists accept the principle of excluded middle, they would be forced to say ‘P’ is supertrue or ‘Not P’ is supertrue (even if ‘P’ applies a predicate to a borderline case). This would imply that either ‘P’ is true or ‘Not P’ is true. (Williamson 1994, 162–163) And that would be a fatal loss of truth-value gaps for supervaluationism.

There is a final concern about the “ontological honesty” of the supervaluationist’s existential quantifier. As part of his solution to the sorites paradox, the supervaluationist will assert ‘There is a human being who was a child when n days old but not when n + 1 days old’. For this statement comes out true under all admissible precisifications of ‘child’. However, when pressed the supervaluationist will add an unofficial clarification: “Oh, of course I do not mean that there really is a sharp threshold for childhood.”

After the clarification, some wonder how supervaluationism differs from drastic metaphysical skepticism. In his nihilist days, Peter Unger (1979) admitted that it is useful to talk as if there are children. But he insisted that strictly speaking, vague terms such as ‘child’ cannot apply to anything. Unger was free to use supervaluationism as a theory to explain our ordinary discourse about children. (Unger instead used other resources to explain how we fruitfully apply empty predicates.) But once the dust had cleared and the precise rubble came into focus, Unger had to conclude that there are no children.

Officially, the supervaluationist rejects the induction step of the sorites argument. Unofficially, he seems to instead reject the base step of the sorites argument.

6. Subvaluationism

Supervaluationism is also haunted by a logical analogy. Whereas the supervaluationist analyzes borderline cases in terms of truth-value gaps the dialetheist analyzes them in terms of truth-value gluts. A glut is a proposition that is both true and false. The rule for assigning gluts is the mirror image of the rule for assigning gaps: A statement is true exactly if it comes out true on at least one precisification. The statement is false just if it comes out false on at least one precisification. So if the statement comes out true under one precisification and false under another precisification, the statement is both true and false.

To avoid triviality, the dialetheist must adopt a logic that stops two contradictory statements from jointly implying everything. The resulting “subvaluationism” is a dual of supervaluationism.

The spiritual father of subvaluationism is Georg Hegel. For Hegel, the basic kind of vagueness is conflict vagueness. The man at the threshold of your doorway is both inside your room and outside your room. Degree vagueness is just a special case of the conflict inherit in becoming. Any process requires a gradual manifestation of a contradiction inherit in the original state. At some stage, a metamorphosizing caterpillar is not a butterfly (by virtue of what it was) and a butterfly (by virtue of what it will be). Hegelians believed this dialectical conception of vagueness solved the sorites and demonstrated the inadequacy of classical logic. The Polish Marxist Georgi Plekhanov (1937) proposed a logic of contradiction to succeed classical logic (Hyde 2008, 93–5). One of his students, Henry Mehlberg (1958) went on to substitute gaps for gluts. The first version of supervaluationism is thus a synthesis, reconciling the thesis of classical logic with the anti-thesis posed by the logic of contradiction.

Viewed formally, there seems no more reason to prefer one departure from classical logic rather than the other. Since Western philosophers abominate contradiction, parity with dialetheism would diminish the great popularity of supervaluationism.

A Machiavellian epistemicist will welcome this battle between the gaps and the gluts. He roots for the weaker side. Although he does not want the subvaluationist to win, the Machiavellian epistemicist does want the subvaluationist to achieve mutual annihilation with his supervaluationist doppelgänger. His political calculation is: Gaps + Gluts = Bivalence.

Pablo Corberos (2011) has argued that subvaluationism provides a better treatment of higher order vagueness than supervaluationism. But for the most part, the subvaluationists (and their frenemies) have merely claimed subvaluationism to be at least as attractive as supervaluationism (Hyde and Colyvan 2008). This modest ambition seems prudent. After all, truth-value gaps have far more independent support from the history of philosophy (at least if confined to Western philosophy). Prior to the explosive growth of vagueness research after 1975, ordinary language philosophers amassed a panoramic battery of analyses suggesting that gaps are involved in presupposition, reference failure, fiction, future contingent propositions, performatives, and so on and so on. Supervaluationism rigorously consolidated these appeals to ordinary language.

Dialetheists characterize intolerance for contradiction as a shallow phenomenon, restricted to a twentieth Western academic milieu (maybe even now being eclipsed by the rise of China). Experimental philosophers have challenged the old appeals to ordinary language with empirical results suggesting that glutty talk is as readily stimulated by borderline cases as gappy talk (Alxatib and Pelletier 2011, Ripley 2011).

7. Contextualism

Just as contextualism in epistemology runs orthogonal to the familiar divisions amongst epistemologists (foundationalism, reliabilism, coherentism, etc.), there are contextualists of every persuasion amongst vagueness theorists. They develop an analogy between the sorites paradox and indexical sophistries such as:

1. Base step: The horizon is more than 1 meter away.

2. Induction step: If the horizon is more than n meters away, then it is more than n + 1 meters away.

3. Conclusion: The horizon is more than a billion meters away.

The horizon is where the earth meets the sky and is certainly less than a billion meters away. (The circumference of the earth is only forty million meters.) Yet when you travel toward the horizon to specify the n at which the induction step fails, your trip is as futile as the pursuit of the rainbow. You cannot reach the horizon because it shifts with your location.

All contextualists accuse the sorites monger of equivocating. In one sense, the meaning of ‘child’ is uniform; the context-invariant rule for using the term (its “character”) is constant. However, the set of things to which the term applies (its “content”) shifts with the context. In this respect, vague words resemble indexical terms such as: I, you, here, now, today, tomorrow. When a debtor tells his creditor on Monday ‘I will pay you back tomorrow’ and then repeats the sentence on Tuesday, there is a sense in which he has said the same thing (the character is the same) and a sense in which he has said something different (the content has shifted because ‘tomorrow’ now picks out Wednesday).

According to the contextualists, the rules governing the shifts prohibit us from interpreting any instance of the induction step as having a true antecedent and a false consequent. The very process of trying to refute the induction step changes the context so that the instance will not come out false. Indeed, contextualists typically emphasize that each instance is true. Assent is mandatory. Consequently, direct attacks on the induction step must fail. One is put in mind of Seneca’s admonition to his student Nero: “However many you put to death, you will never kill your successor.”

Hans Kamp, the founder of contextualism, maintained that the extension of vague words orbits the speaker’s store of conversational commitments. In a more psychological vein, Diana Raffman says changes in context trigger gestalt shifts between look-alike categories.

Stewart Shapiro integrates Kamp’s ideas with Friedrich Waismann’s concept of open texture. Shapiro thinks speakers have discretion over borderline cases because they are judgment dependent. They come out true in virtue of the speaker judging them to be true. Given that the audience does not resist, borderline cases of ‘child’ can be correctly described as children. The audience recognizes that other competent speakers could describe the borderline case differently. As Waismann lyricizes “Every description stretches, as it were, into a horizon of open possibilities: However far I go, I shall always carry this horizon with me.” (1968, 122)

American pragmaticism colors Delia Graff Fara’s contextualism. Consider dandelion farms. Why would someone grow weeds? The answer is that ‘weed’ is relative to interests. Dandelions are unwanted by lawn caretakers but are desired by farmers for food, wine, and medical uses. Fara thinks this interest relativity extends to all vague words. For instance, ‘child’ means a degree of immaturity that is significant to the speaker. Since the interests of the speaker shift, there is an opportunity for a shift in the extension of ‘child’. Fara is reluctant to describe herself as a contextualist because the context only has an indirect effect on the extension via the changes it makes to the speaker’s interest.

How strictly are we to take the comparison between vague words and indexical terms? Scott Soames (2002, 445) answers that all vague words literally are indexical.

This straightforward response is open to the objection that the sorites monger could stabilize reference. When the sorites monger relativizes ‘horizon’ to the northeast corner of the Empire State Building’s observation deck, he seems to generate a genuine sorites paradox that exploits the vagueness of ‘horizon’ (not its indexicality).

All natural languages have stabilizing pronouns, ellipsis, and other anaphoric devices. For instance, in ‘Jack is tired now and Jill is too’, the ‘too’ forces a uniform reading of ‘tired’. Jason Stanley suggests that the sorites monger employ the premise:

If that1 is a child then that2 is too, and if that2 is too, then that3 is too, and if that3 is too, then that4 is too, … and then thati is too.

Each ‘thatn’ refers to the nth element in a sequence of worsening examples of ‘child’. The meaning of ‘child’ is not shifting because the first occurrence of the term governs all the subsequent clauses (thanks to ‘too’). If vague terms were literally indexical, the sorites monger would have a strong reply. If vague terms only resemble indexicals, then the contextualist needs to develop the analogy in a way that circumvents Stanley’s counsel to the sorites monger.

The contextualist would also need to address a second technique for stabilizing the context. R. M. Sainsbury (2013) advises the sorites monger to present his premises in apparently random order. No pair of successive cases raises an alarm that similar cases are being treated differently. Unless the hearer has extraordinary memory, he will not feel pressured to adjust the context.

The contextualist must find enough shiftiness to block every sorites argument. Since vagueness seeps into every syntactic category, critics complain that contextualism exceeds the level of ambiguity countenanced by linguistics and psycholinguists.

Another concern is that some sorites arguments involve predicates that do not give us an opportunity to equivocate. Consider a sorites with a base step that starts from a number too large for us to think about. Or consider an inductive predicate that is too complex for us to reason with. One example is obtained by iterating ‘mother of’ a thousand times (Sorensen 2001, 33). This predicate could be embedded in a mind numbing sorites that would never generate context shifts.

Other unthinkable sorites arguments use predicates that can only be grasped by individuals in other possible worlds or by creatures with different types of minds than ours. More fancifully, there could be a vague predicate, such as Saul Kripke’s “killer yellow”, that instantly kills anyone who thinks about it. The basic problem is that contextualism is a psychologistic theory of the sorites. Arguments can exist without being propounded.

8. Is All Vagueness Linguistic?

Supervaluationists encourage the view that all vagueness is a matter of linguistic indecision: the reason why there are borderline cases is that we have not bothered to make up our minds.

The method of supervaluation allows us to assign truth-values prior to any decisions. Expressivists think this is a mistake akin to assigning truth-values to normative claims (MacFarlane 2016). They model vagueness as practical uncertainty as to whether to treat a borderline F as an F. The deliberator may accept the tautologies of classical logic as constraints governing competing plans for drawing lines. I can accept ‘Either Donald is bald or not’ without accepting either disjunct. An existentially quantified sentence can be accepted even when no instance is. A shrug of the shoulders signals readiness to go either way, not ignorance as to which possible world one inhabits. The supervaluationist tries to express this insight by expanding the conditions under which truth-values can be assigned. This the wrong medium for the message.

The expressivist is poised to explain how supervaluationism developed into the most respected theory of vagueness. Frege portrayed vagueness as a side-effect of laziness. But supervaluationists countered that indecision is functional. Instead of committing ourselves prematurely, we can fill in meanings as we go along in light of new information and interests. This conjecture is promising for the highly stipulative enterprise of promulgating and enforcing laws (Endicott 2000). Judges frequently seem to exercise and control discretion by means of vague language. Uncertainties about the scope of discretion may arise from higher order vagueness (Schauer 2016).

Discretion through gap-filling pleases those who regard adjudication as a creative process. It alarms those who think we should be judged by laws rather than men. The doctrine of discretion through indeterminacy has also been questioned on grounds that the source of the discretion is the generality of the legal terms rather than their vagueness (Poscher 2012).

Supervaluationists emphasize the distinction between words and objects. Objects themselves do not seem to be the sort of thing that can be general, ambiguous, or vague (Eklund 2011). From this perspective, Georg Hegel appears to commit a category mistake when he characterizes clouds as vague. Although we sometimes speak of clouds being ambiguous or even being general to a region, this does not entitle us to infer that there is metaphysical ambiguity or metaphysical generality.

Supervaluationists are here incorporating an orthodoxy dating back to Bertrand Russell’s seminal article “Vagueness” (1923). This consensus was re-affirmed by Michael Dummett (1975) and ritualistically re-avowed by subsequent commentators.

In 1978 Gareth Evans focused opposition to vague objects with a short proof modeled after Saul Kripke’s attack on contingent identity. If there is a vague object, then some statement of the form ‘a = b’ must be vague (where each of the flanking singular terms precisely designates that object). For the vagueness is allegedly due to the object rather than its representation. But any statement of form ‘a = a’ is definitely true. Consequently, a has the property of being definitely identical to a. Since a = b, then b must also have the property of being definitely identical to a. Therefore ‘a = b’ must be definitely true!

Evans agrees that there are vague identity statements in which one of the flanking terms is vague (just as Kripke agrees that there are contingent identity statements when one of the flanking terms is a flaccid designator). But then the vagueness is due to language, not the world.

Despite Evans’ impressive assault, there was a renewal of interest in vague objects in the 1980s. As a precedent for this revival, Peter van Inwagen (1990, 283) recalls that in the 1960s, there was a consensus that all necessity is linguistic. Most philosophers now take the possibility of essential properties seriously.

Some of the reasons are technical. Problems with Kripke’s refutation of contingent identity have structural parallels that affect Evans’ proof. Evans also relies on inferences that deviant logicians challenge (Parsons 2000).

In the absence of a decisive reductio ad absurdum, many logicians feel their role to be the liberal one of articulating the logical space for vague objects. There should be “Vague objects for those who want them” (Cowles and White 1991). Logic should be ontologically neutral.

Since epistemicists try to solve the sorites with little more than a resolute application of classical logic, they are methodologically committed to a partisan role for logic. Instead of looking for loopholes, we should accept the consequence (Williamson 2015).

Some non-enemies of vague objects also have an ambition to consolidate various species of indeterminacy (Barnes and Williams 2011). Talk of indeterminacy is found in quantum mechanics, analyses of the open future, fictional incompleteness, and the continuum hypothesis. Perhaps vagueness is just one face of indeterminacy.

This panoramic vision contrasts with the continuing resolution of many to tether vagueness to the sorites paradox (Eklund 2011). They fear that the clarity achieved by semantic ascent will be muddied by metaphysics.

But maybe the mud is already on the mountain top. Trenton Merricks (2001) claims that standard characterizations of linguistic vagueness rely on metaphysical vagueness. If ‘Donald is bald’ lacks a truth-value because there is no fact to make the statement true, then the shortage appears to be ontological.

The view that vagueness is always linguistic has been attacked from other directions. Consider the vagueness of maps (Varzi 2001). The vagueness is pictorial rather than discursive. So one cannot conclude that vagueness is linguistic merely from the premise that vagueness is representational.

Or consider vague instrumental music such as Claude Debussy’s “The Clouds”. Music has syntax but too little semantics to qualify as language. There is a little diffuse reference through devices such as musical quotation, leitmotifs, and homages. These referential devices are not precise. Therefore, some music is vague (Sorensen 2010). The strength and significance of this argument depends on the relationship between music and language. Under the musilanguage hypothesis, language and music branched off from a common “musilanguage” with language specializing in semantics and music specializing in the expression of emotion. This scenario makes it plausible that purely instrumental music could have remnants of semantic meaning.

Mental imagery also seems vague. When rising suddenly after a prolonged crouch, I “see stars before my eyes”. I can tell there are more than ten of these hallucinated lights but I cannot tell how many. Is this indeterminacy in thought to be reduced to indeterminacy in language? Why not vice versa? Language is an outgrowth of human psychology. Thus it seems natural to view language as merely an accessible intermediate bearer of vagueness.


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