Adam de Wodeham

First published Wed Mar 21, 2012; substantive revision Sat Jul 6, 2019

Adam of Wodeham (c. 1295–1358) was one of the most significant philosophers and theologians working at Oxford in the second quarter of the fourteenth century. A student of Ockham, Wodeham is best known for his theory of the complexe significabile and his distinctively English approach to questions of philosophical theology. His philosophy and theology were influential throughout the late medieval and early modern periods.

1. Life

Adam Wodeham [Goddam/Woodham] (c. 1295–1358) was born near Southampton. He entered the Franciscan order at a young age. Wodeham’s earliest philosophical education was at the Franciscan studium in London where he first studied under Walter Chatton (c. 1317–1321) and then William of Ockham (1320–1324). During this period of intense study, Wodeham collaborated with Ockham on his massive Summa logicae, editing it and preparing it for publication. After Ockham departed for Avignon in the summer of 1324, Wodeham was sent to Oxford to complete his studies. At Oxford he attended the sentential lectures of Richard FitzRalph (1328–1329), and subsequently qualified to read the Sentences.

Wodeham lectured on the Sentences of Peter Lombard at the London convent sometime in the 1320s, although his earliest lecture notes have not survived. He later lectured at the provincial school in Norwich sometime in the late 1320s, a work that is now referred to as the Lectura secunda [LS]. Finally, Wodeham delivered the Oxford lectures (referred to as the Ordinatio Oxoniensis [OO]) between 1332 and 1334 (Streveler and Tachau 1995, 22–23, n. 61). According to Thomas de Eccleston (Eccleston 1951, 57), Wodeham was the 61st lector at Oxford, Greyfriars. As is the case with many medieval philosophers, little is known about his latter life after he completed is education. He apparently traveled to Basel in 1339, survived the plague in 1348–49, and died at the Franciscan convent at Babwell in 1358 (Courtenay 1978, 181).

2. Writings

The extant writings of Adam Wodeham include: his two commentaries on the Sentences of Peter Lombard (the Lectura and the Ordinatio); a prologue to William of Ockham’s Summa logicae; a short quaestio on the continuum; a longer Tractatus de indivisibilibus; the Tractatus alphabeticus, and perhaps the 51st chapter of part I of Ockham’s Summa logicae and the last question of book IV of the same author’s Reportatio.

Adam Wodeham’s most significant philosophical and theological works are his two commentaries on the Sentences. The Lectura (c. 1320s) is the earlier of the two works and is a loose commentary on the first 26 distinctions of the first book of the Lombard’s Sentences. The single manuscript of the Lectura (Cambridge, Gonville and Caius, Ms 281 (674), ff. 105–250) has been published in a modern critical edition (Gál and Wood 1990). The Ordinatio (1332–34), Wodeham’s most mature extant work, is a more expansive commentary, treating all four books of the Lombard’s Sentences and extensively re-writing and re-organizing the first 26 distinctions of the first book. A critical edition of the Ordinatio is available at the Scholastic Commentaries and Texts Archive.

The shorter works of Wodeham comprise several collaborations with his teacher William of Ockham. These include Wodeham’s brief introduction to Ockham’s Summa logicae, which has been edited in the critical edition. Further, Courtenay argues that Wodeham is probably the disciple who wrote the 51st chapter of part I of Ockham’s Summa logicae (Courtenay 1978, 34). Both of these short works were written between 1320 and 1324, as Wodeham collaborated with the Venerable Inceptor. Finally, Gedeon Gál also noted that in one of the manuscripts of Ockham’s Reportatio (Milan, Ambros. 281 inf., fol. 69rb) on book IV of the Sentences, a marginal notation attributes the final question of the work to Wodeham (Courtenay 1978, 34, fn. 61).

Wodeham’s shorter works also include two tracts on the continuum written against the indivisibilists or atomists and the Tractatus alphabeticus. The shorter work on the continuum (Murdoch and Synan 1966, 212–288), consisting of a single quaestio, is an early redaction of the longer work, the Tractatus de indivisibilibus (Wood 1988). Both of the works were probably written between 1323 and 1331 (Wood 1998, 16). The Tractatus alphabeticus considers the latitude of forms and was written around 1333 (Wood 374).

Finally, the lost works of Adam Wodeham include Biblical commentaries on the Canticum canticorum and the first book of Ecclesiasticus. And, based on historical and textual evidence, it is generally held that Wodeham wrote a set of Determinationes, some of which were probably included in the Tractatus de indivisibilibus.

3. Position in the History of Philosophy

Adam Wodeham’s place in the history of philosophy remains difficult to appreciate because of two related problems, here referred to as: (1) the historiographical problem; and (2) the textual problem. Historiographically, the field of medieval philosophy has been plagued by various narrative accounts of the twelfth through fifteenth centuries that characterize the period in which Wodeham flourished as an age in which fideism, skepticism and scholastic decadence ruled the day (Inglis, 1998). This basic historiographical approach to the late medieval period has recently come under serious attack and scrutiny by specialists working in the field, but a balanced picture of the philosophers and theologians working during this period remains in its infancy. Second, an accurate understanding of Adam Wodeham’s place within the history of philosophy is handicapped by the lack of critical editions for Adam Wodeham, his immediate contemporaries, and numerous medieval philosophers and theologians working in the late fourteenth and fifteenth centuries. Regarding Wodeham, it is important to recognize that a critical edition of any complete text of Wodeham was not available until recently (Wood 1988; Gál and Wood 1990). Further, as already noted, an edition of Wodeham’s most mature and complete work, the Ordinatio, is only now underway. As such, the place of Adam Wodeham within the history of medieval thought is difficult to trace at present, and William Courtenay’s important study remains the most relevant point of reference (Courtenay, 1978).

Based on the work of Courtenay, the first references to Wodeham’s place within medieval thought must begin by considering his socii (or contemporary sententiarii). Wodeham lectured on the Sentences at Oxford in 1332–1334, and contemporaneous with his lectures there were other bachelors lecturing on the Sentences (baccalarius sententiarius) in the various other convents or theological schools (Courtenay 1978, 89). Understanding who these bachelors are is important because they often engaged with each other’s work. In the case of Adam Wodeham the list of socii includes: Monachus Niger (Benedictine), Robert Holcot OP, William Crathorn OP, Roger Gosford OP, Edmund Grafton OFM, Hugh Grafton OESA, William Chiterne OFM, William Skelton: Mertonian, Richard of Radford, and an unnamed Carmelite (Courtenay 1978, 89–111).

Beyond his immediate socii, Wodeham’s influence between 1334 and 1346 is evident in England, Paris and Cologne. English theologians, between 1334 and 1350, often do not cite contemporaries by name. That said, there is substantial evidence that Wodeham’s contemporaries took his thought seriously. During these decades, Courtenay lists the following English theologians as making either implicit or explicit reference to Adam Wodeham’s lecturae: Thomas Bradwardine (Mertonian), Robert of Halifax OFM, Roger Roseth OFM and Thomas Buckingham (Mertonian) (Courtenay 1978, 116–123). In contrast to the English authors discussed above, the Parisian authors between 1342 and 1345 were much more willing to cite a contemporary author (Courtenay 1978, 123). Thus, in this period almost all of the Parisian theologians commenting on the Sentences cite Wodeham: Gregory of Rimini OESA, Alphonsus Vargas OESA and John of Mirecourt (Cistercian). These authors exhibit a strong knowledge of Wodeham and all had some access to the Oxford (Ordinatio) redaction of Wodeham’s work (Courtenay 1978, 132). In particular one should note Gregory of Rimini’s extensive knowledge of the thought of Wodeham. The spread of Ockham’s philosophical and theological thought into Germany (both directly and indirectly through the study of Wodeham) took place between 1335 and 1350 and is evident in Cologne. This is perhaps due to the fact that Wodeham traveled to Basel in the summer of 1339 bringing with him a copy of his Ordinatio (Courtenay 1978, 133 and 181). How long Wodeham remained in Germany, or where he traveled, remains unknown. But, it is significant that in Cologne, sometime before 1348, one theologian lectured on the Sentences secundum Adam (Courtenay 1978, 133). This and other evidence suggest that Wodeham was being studied seriously in Cologne before 1348.

In the aftermath of the Parisian condemnations of Nicholas of Autrecourt in 1346 and John of Mirecourt in 1347, one may expect that the influence of Wodeham would have waned in subsequent years. But, Courtenay argues that the citations of Wodeham throughout this turbulent period demonstrate that this was not the case (Courtenay 1978, 135). Evidence of Parisian masters engaging the thought of Wodeham in the years after 1347 is evident in the works of: Peter Ceffons O.Cist. and Hugolino Malabrancha of Oriveto OESA.

In the final four decades of the fourteenth century there is an increase in the citations of the moderni as evidenced in the extant commentaries. The list of commentaries that cite Wodeham includes: the anonymous author of ms. Vat. Lat. 986, John Hiltalingen of Basel OESA, James of Eltville O.Cist, Conrad of Ebrach O.Cist., Pierre d’Ailly, Henry Totting of Oyta, John of Wasia, Henry of Langenstein, Nicholas of Dinkelsbühl, Peter of Candia, John Brammart O.C., Peter Plaoul, and Marsilius of Inghen. This period of medieval philosophy remains understudied, but it is clear that there was a strong interest in Wodeham at the close of the fourteenth century. Further evidence of this is found in Henry Totting of Oyta’s Abbreviato of Adam Wodeham’s Ordinatio produced between 1373 and 1378 (Courtenay 1978, 147). Oyta’s Abbreviato of Wodeham was influential in the fifteenth century, as is clear from the number of extant manuscripts spread throughout Europe.

The influence of Wodeham’s thought in the fifteenth and early sixteenth centuries is a chapter of medieval philosophy and theology that has yet to be written. There are citations of Wodeham in the works of Arnold of Sehnsen O.C., Peter Reicher/Pirchenward, John Capreolus, Gabriel Biel and John Mair (Major), although the evidence at this point has yet to be analyzed in detail (Courtenay 1978, 150–156). What is certain is that Wodeham remained important for philosophers and theologians in the long fifteenth century, and John Mair eventually, in the sixteenth century, published an edition of Oyta’s Abbreviato. This has been both positive and negative for Wodeham studies: positive, as Wodeham has remained available to those who do not have access to the manuscript tradition; and negative as it has meant that scholars often read and cite an inferior text that significantly abbreviates the original work. More attention should be given to the influence of Wodeham in this period.

4. Psychology and Cognition

To the present day a significant part of Wodeham scholarship has been focused on his philosophy of mind and the sequence of events from sense impression to complex scientific judgment. Modern scholarship’s focus here is partly due to the fact that this was a clear area of interest for Wodeham, to which he devoted significant energy. But it is also a reflection of the availability of texts; the contracted nature of the Lectura secunda has focused the efforts of scholarship on book I and issues of cognition. In the following section, we will try to give an overview of the general consensus and debates of modern scholarship on the process of cognition as it is currently found in the Lectura secunda.

4.1 Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition

Wodeham turns first to the question of intuitive and abstractive cognition: two concepts developed by John Duns Scotus and William of Ockham. But while they identify the parallel notions of intuitive and abstractive cognition proper to the sensitive and intellective souls respectively, Wodeham distinguishes himself from his predecessors by insisting that this parallel reduplication is redundant and violates the principle of parsimony.

Regarding intuitive cognition Wodeham begins by stating that: “every act of science naturally caused presupposes evidence of some proposition or of the thing signified through the proposition. Science (or a scientific act of assent) is caused by the mediation of this evidence” (LS I:9, ll. 44–46).

The question is: what is the source of this evidence? The assumption is that an evident proposition arises from, or is formulated from, certain types of simple evident apprehensions, namely, intuitive apprehensions. Wodeham, then asks: does the intellect require an intuitive apprehension distinct from the act of sensation?

The definition of intuitive apprehension states that such an apprehension must be sufficient for the intellect to make a judgment about the existence of the object. Given this definition Wodeham wonders why a second act of intuitive apprehension, beyond the apprehension of sensation, is necessary in order for the intellect to make this judgment. The fact that the present object in question has been “sensed” ought to be sufficient for the intellect to feel confident that such an object exists.

Wodeham’s position is distinctive because he denies what was a traditional distinction for Scotus and Ockham, namely, a distinction between the sensitive and intellective soul (a real distinction in the case of Ockham and a formal distinction in the case of Scotus). For Wodeham, the assumption of two separate acts of intuition mandates that a human being have either two souls or that the human has one soul and also another vital power, separate from that soul. But, drawing on the authority of Augustine, Wodeham identifies the notion of two souls as a heresy to be avoided. Another option is to think that the sensitive soul is not really a soul at all, but rather a power distinct and separate from the one human soul. But this too is unacceptable. To be a true sensitive potency, Wodeham insists that it must be a living form (viva forma); if it were not, it would not be able to receive “living” or vital acts, among which apprehensive and appetitive acts are numbered. But if one admits that the sensitive power remains a “living form”, then two souls are once more introduced into the single human being. This, at least, is the case for Wodeham, who holds that to be a “soul” is to be a “living form” (LS I:11, ll. 44–55). Thus, Wodeham is adamant that there can only be one soul in the single human being, and the intuitive act of sensation alone is sufficient for the simple apprehension “presupposed” by an “evident assent” (LS I:9, ll. 44–48). However, by denying this distinction, Wodeham must be willing to say that, strictly speaking, the “intellect senses” because it is the same intellectual soul that both senses and thinks. This was an unsavory consequence for a thinker like Ockham, but one that Wodeham was fully willing to accept (Wood 1990, 21*; LS I:14–15, ll.1–49).

Despite disagreeing with Scotus and Ockham on the nature of the intellective and the sensitive soul, Wodeham affirms the formal definition of intuition originally given by Scotus. This definition is formulated in the third conclusion of the second question of the prologue to the Lectura Secunda: “the incomplex act, which is able to cause evident assent about a contingent truth of a present object, and which naturally requires the existence and presence of that object, is intuitive knowledge” (LS I, 37, ll. 69–72). The presence of the object is required and not just its existence because intuitive cognition requires the object to function as an efficient cause. The object, however, cannot function as an efficient cause unless it is also present to the knower (LS I:45–46, ll. 40–44).

With this definition Wodeham is also rejecting an important and controversial part of Ockham’s definition of intuitive knowledge. For Ockham, not only was an intuitive knowledge able to produce an affirmative judgment of the existence of an extant object, but it was also able to affirm the non-existence of a non-extant object. By insisting on the criteria of a present object for any kind of intuitive knowledge, Wodeham denies that an intuition of a non-extant, non-present object is possible. Here Wodeham offers an illustrative example. He remarks that sometimes we can judge that something does not exist as a consequence of having a positive intuition. He gives the example of intuitively seeing the dead body of Socrates and knowing that Socrates does not exist. While acknowledging that such an example might be the inspiration behind Ockham’s controversial claim about an intuitive knowledge of non-existents, he points out that in this example, we do not have an intuitive knowledge of the same thing about which we are making a judgment. Rather we are making an inference from our intuitive knowledge of (and a judgment about) the existence of the dead body of Socrates (LS I:38–39, ll. 4–15).

The difference, then, between intuitive knowledge and abstractive knowledge is again taken from Scotus. Here, in Wodeham’s sixth conclusion, of the second question, the difference is attributable, not to diverse objects of knowledge, but to the attitude that one can take towards that object with respect to existence (LS I:45, ll. 22–26). Unlike intuitive knowledge, abstractive knowledge does not require the existence or presence of the object to be known. However, in this case “what is known” is indifferent to the existence of that object and no judgment about that object’s existence can be made.

4.2 Skepticism and Aureoli

Wodeham’s decision to identify the difference between intuitive and abstractive knowledge with the presence or absence of an object, as Scotus and Ockham did, meant that he shared with these two thinkers a common opponent, namely Peter Aureoli. In response to Scotus’s definition of intuitive knowledge Aureoli identified several experiences wherein a person appears to have a sensitive intuition of a non-present object. Such experiences, according to Aureoli, were the consequence of lingering sensitive images that remain even after an object is no longer present. Such lingering images (sometimes called esse perspectivum or esse apparens) were used to explain all sorts of visual anomalies that do not correspond to reality. Such experiences were enough for Aureoli to define intuitive knowledge, not as the direct grasp of a present object, but as direct knowledge (as opposed to knowledge arrived at through a discursive reasoning process). Rega Wood explains:

Abstract and intuitive cognition were distinguished by the manner in which their objects were presented. The objects of abstract cognition appeared in a quasi-imaginary mode (quasi modo imaginario et absente); intuitive cognition was direct rather than discursive, and it conveyed the impression that its objects existed and were actually present (Wood 1982, 216).

In short, this meant that a direct grasp of a lingering appearance or esse apparens, even after the object was no longer present, could count as intuitive knowledge.

For those who came after Aureoli, his definition and his notion of esse apparens raised a host of skeptical concerns. If sensation produces an esse apparens, the intellect must also produce a similar object, something Peter Aureoli called esse intentionale. And if intuitive knowledge is a direct knowledge of either the esse apparens or the esse intentionale, and not of the object itself, from where does the certainty come by which one can firmly and confidently state that “this thing exists”? Aureoli’s esse apparens opened up the possibility of an experience, wherein what appears to be present, might actually not be present or even in existence.

Ockham’s answer to Aureoli’s insistence on the need for an esse apparens to explain certain strange and misleading phenomena was to relocate the source of the error. The error does not come from the impression of some non-existent object. On the contrary, the naturally produced intuitive cognition does not lie. Instead, as Wood paraphrases Ockham, “error arises when the observer infers a proposition which does not follow formally from his perceptions” (Wood 1982, 224). Ockham calls the intuition of those appearances that cause apparitions “imperfect intuitive cognition”. In such cases, the immediate judgment of the intellect is not “that the object represented exists”, but “that the object was impressed” (and, it would seem, that this impression exists). The intellect errs, then, when it assents to what the “imperfect” intuition does not warrant.

A central concern with Ockham’s account, raised by Walter Chatton and responded to by Wodeham, was the character of these apparition causing “after-images”. For Ockham, the after images were not caused by the object, but by a lingering impression distinct from the object or impression-causing species. For Chatton, it could not be overlooked that these after-images appeared as if they were the object, not as if they were some left-over impression caused by the object. Thus, he argued that the after-images are caused by the lingering of the representative species of the object, even after the object is no longer present. Chatton was therefore willing to admit that intuition of a non-present object was possible, as long as its representative species lingered.

On this issue Wodeham takes sides with Ockham against Chatton. He expressly attacks Chatton’s description of the lingering species as having a likeness sufficient to cause the observer to believe in the existence of the original object. Wood writes of Wodeham’s position:

In after-images only the remains of the form or species caused by the first act of perception are seen. But the belief that the principal object is seen when after-images are present is not caused by the first vision or even by the remains of the species imprinted during vision. It is caused by strong imagination which leads the observer to judge falsely that what he sees in an after-image is the same as what he saw when the principal object was presented (Wood 1982, 228).

In short, against Chatton, Wodeham defends an Ockham-like position, suggesting that the source of error is not the intuitive cognition of something not actually there, but the fact that the intellect chooses to make a judgment about the existence of something other than what was intuited. In many ways, the case is similar to that inference made about Socrates’ non-existence, when Socrates’ dead body is intuitively grasped. The inference made from one intuitive cognition is not always correct, even if the intuition itself remains reliable.

4.3 Three Degrees of Evidence

What then does all this mean for the question of certitude and the possibility of building a genuine and trustworthy science based on these foundational impressions received from the natural world? Wodeham defended the reliability of our immediate simple apprehensions, but he also admitted the possibility that the imagination can severely distort these impressions such that we are inclined to assent to what the simple apprehension itself does not warrant.

Wodeham discusses the question of evidence for a proposition which can be built from these initial apprehensions in the sixth question of the prologue. He says that the idea of “complex evidence” can be understood in two ways: either as referring to the apprehension of an evident proposition itself or to the so-called “evident judgment” which has been caused by this evident proposition.

What Wodeham means by an evident proposition is complicated and requires that we have a clear sense of the distinction between apprehension and judgment, which are for Wodeham two distinct and separate acts. An evident proposition for Wodeham can be of three kinds. The first and lowest degree of evidence is identified with the apprehension of the proposition (or what it signifies). Wodeham uses as his example the proposition, “a stick submerged in water is broken”. The apprehension of this state of affairs has all the trappings of an evident proposition, to such an extent that it inclines us to perform the separate act of producing an affirmative judgment. Nevertheless, this type of proposition is one that can still be false, despite the fact that it has all the appearance of truth. This lingering possibility, however, allows the intellect to suspend its judgment on the basis of other experiences or reasons. Distinctive of such propositions is their contingent nature. Though they can appear true, it remains possible that they are false.

The second degree of certainty associated with evident propositions is exemplified by a proposition that not only appears certain and inclines the judgment to assent, but is also a proposition that cannot fail to signify correctly. According to Wodeham all propositions of this type are categorical and necessary. And, he distinguishes them from those contingent types of propositions which may have every appearance of being true but yet may turn out to be false (LS II:163, ll.17–20).

Finally, Wodeham distinguishes this second type of evident proposition from a third type of proposition which is also categorical and necessary. This third type of proposition is the highest degree of evidence, because, not only can it not fail to appear and be true, but it also cannot be doubted. That is, it not only inclines to assent, but necessitates the intellect to assent. For Wodeham, this is distinct from the second and less-evident type of proposition. While this second type cannot fail to be true, it nevertheless can still be doubted owing to the fact that other conflicting propositions also appear to be true. The third type cannot be doubted in this way, no matter what other propositions appear to be true. If other evident propositions are genuinely in conflict with (i.e., are inconsistent with) the proposition in question, those propositions cannot be evident in the highest degree. But nor can these conflicting propositions be evident in the second highest degree since the second and third types are both supposed to be necessary. Therefore they cannot actually be in conflict, though it is still possible that they may appear to be in conflict. For Wodeham, propositions of the third and highest type can be known in themselves and are necessarily per se nota (LS I:164, 36).

4.4 Evident Judgments

If this is how we can understand an evident proposition, what then constitutes an evident judgment? Again, a judgment, for Wodeham, is sharply distinguished from the distinct act of apprehension or the mental proposition. It amounts to a mental nod of approval to the correspondence between the apprehended proposition and the reality signified. (See LS I, prol., d. 6, § 20, I:176–178.) Clearly, the first two types of propositions do not provide us with absolute certainty. These propositions have all the appearance of truth, but the judgment that follows from them cannot be called evident as long as doubt remains, even if the judgment in question is correct.

When it comes then to a truly evident judgment, propositions which are per se nota can cause evident judgments because the truth of those propositions can in no way be doubted. However, besides propositions per se nota there are certain mechanisms through which originally dubitable propositions can come to be evident in the third degree, thereby necessitating assent and causing a truly evident judgment.

The most obvious mechanism is the demonstrative syllogism, which leads us finally to Wodeham’s conception of a science and the immediate object of this act of assent. In article two of question one, he discusses whether a scientific act of knowing (the evident assent given to the conclusion of a syllogism) has as its immediate object “that which is signified by only one proposition, i.e., the conclusion” or “that which is signified by the conclusion and the premises joined together at the same time through a syllogism” (LS I:199, ll. 5–11). Wodeham’s conclusion is decidedly in favor of the latter; namely, in order for a previously dubitable proposition to be elevated to the third degree of evidence, whereby the intellect is necessitated to assent, it must acquire that evidence from the force of the syllogism as whole. The conclusion by itself is not per se nota. Thus, for a truly evident judgment to take place, a single evident proposition cannot be its cause, rather all three propositions of the syllogism must be taken together in order for the concluding proposition to have the evidence it needs to not only appear true, but to compel the mind’s assent (LS I:199–208). This requirement that scientific assent be given to the syllogism as a whole (and cannot be sustained if one of the premises is forgotten) is a position that will be explicitly opposed by the later Parisian reader of Wodeham, Gregory of Rimini (Lectura, I, Prol., q. 3, a. 1, Trapp I:107ff).

4.5 The Complexe Significabile

If there is a topic that has dominated Wodeham scholarship, it is the complexe significabile or alternatively, that which is signifiable in a complex way, i.e., through a proposition. This mysterious entity was intended by Wodeham to function both as the immediate object of propositional knowledge and as a genuine via media between two extreme theories regarding the object of knowledge offered by his contemporaries. Representing one extreme was William of Ockham, who was thought by Wodeham to identify the terms of a proposition as the actual object. This is sometimes referred to as the anti-realist position. On the other hand there was Walter Chatton, who argued that the object of propositional knowledge was the actual entity signified by the subject term of the proposition. Wodeham, in turn, rejected both these positions and stated that the object of science was an actual state of affairs which could only be signified through a complex or a proposition. Questions and puzzles have continued to linger regarding the exact ontological status of these states-of-affairs. While insisting that they have some real ontological weight, they do not fit nicely under either of the Aristotelian categories of real being, substance or accident. Thus, within an Aristotelian framework, it is difficult to articulate exactly how or in what way the complexe significabile is actually real.

The legacy of the complexe significabile has a somewhat involved history. We can find several examples of its use and discussion throughout the fourteenth, fifteenth and sixteenth centuries. However, for many years the idea was thought to originate with Gregory of Rimini. Modern scholarship slowly discovered, albeit not immediately, that this particular terminology was original to Wodeham and only later adopted by Rimini. (The idea, however, has many precursors evident in earlier debates over terms like dicta or enuntiabilia. See Klima 1993; Nuchelmans 1973; Bermon 2007.) The most frequently cited misattribution in modern scholarship has been Hubert Elie’s “Le complexe significabile” (Elie 1936). In the following generation, Gedeon Gàl (Gàl 1977) discovered that Wodeham was actually the author of this idea. Gàl edited the first modern edition of the Lectura Secunda dist. 1, q. 1, the traditional point of entry into Wodeham’s thought on the matter. Since Gàl’s article, several studies have followed: Nuchelmans (1980), Tachau (1987), Grassi (1990), Zupko (1994–1997), Karger (1995), and Brower-Toland (2007). A frequent part of the contemporary discussion involves distinguishing the genuine doctrine of Adam Wodeham from later versions. Gàl’s initial characterization of Rimini’s position as a “mutilation” of Wodeham’s position has exerted its influence over the subsequent scholarship (cf. Nuchelmans, and esp. Zupko). Most complaints stem from the idea that Rimini gives too much ontological weight to this mysterious entity or at least lacks the nuance of Wodeham, exposing the doctrine to objections that could not be addressed to Wodeham himself (cf. Zupko 1994–1997). Brower-Toland has recently challenged this traditional reading. She suggests the “radical nature of Wodeham’s claims” have largely gone unrecognized, and that his complexe significabile represents a significant “ontological addition” to the Aristotelian substance-accident framework (Brower-Toland 2007:600n7, 638–640).

5. Philosophical Theology

5.1 Proofs of God’s Existence

Wodeham’s approach to philosophical theology begins with a traditional attempt to determine whether or not God’s existence can be philosophically and demonstratively proved.

In both the Lectura secunda and the Ordinatio his strategy is structured by two proofs. The first is taken from and explicitly attributed to Scotus. Of the Scotist proof, Wodeham remarks that it seems very persuasive and more evident than any reason that can be brought against it. The second argument appears to be original to Wodeham.

The first proof taken from John Duns Scotus is found both in his Ordinatio and De Primo Principio. The argument follows from an initial disjunctive premise: there is either some first uncaused cause or there is not. If the former, Scotus and Wodeham argue that it is obvious that this is God. If the latter is chosen then unacceptable consequences follow. The most notable is that there would be an infinite series of caused causes without a terminating point. Two reasons are offered for why such an infinite series is impossible. The first is that, the whole of all “essentially ordered” causes must have a cause, but if the cause of this multitude comes from the totality of caused causes, then this cause will be the cause of itself, which is impossible. The second reason that an infinite series of causes will not work is this would require that there are an infinite amount of causes acting at the same time. This requirement is built into Wodeham’s (and Scotus’s) conception of essentially ordered causes—which Wodeham later sharply distinguishes from a series of accidentally ordered causes.

Wodeham offers a second proof for the existence of God. Regarding this proof he states that it is sufficient to incline the intellect to assent, but he also acknowledges that it is still able to be doubted by “shameful adversaries” (LS II:121; OO I, d. 2, a. 1). According to Wodeham’s description of different types of evidence, it is clear that this “proof” is not able to compel a truly evident judgment because the proof remains open to doubt and thus only reaches the second degree of evidence.

The proof begins from another disjunctive proposition inspired by Anselm’s Proslogion. Either there is some most noble being about which no more noble thing is able to be thought, or there is no such most noble thing. Wodeham remarks that one possible consequence that might follow is that there would be an infinite succession of more noble things, thus permitting an infinity of beings. This conclusion, he says, is unpleasant to the mind; that is, the intellect is not able to admit an infinity of beings without “grumbling” (murmere). For this option at least, it is clear that the intellect can incline us to assent that God exists, but it is still possible to doubt it, which is the distinguishing mark of the second degree of evidence. The other alternative is that there must be some most noble thing actually existing (in actu existens), even though this is not the most noble thing possible. Wodeham finds this alternative opposed by the most evident of reasons—something akin to Anselm’s ontological argument: whatever is actually existing (existens in actu) is de facto more noble than what is not in existence. Thus, it is nonsensical to speak of something more noble, which is only potentially existing (LS II:121, ll.13–15).

5.2 Proof of God’s Unicity

From the philosophical proof of the existence of the highest being, not always demonstrative, but evident in at least the second degree, Wodeham turns to the question of whether there is one highest being or many. The question found in Lectura, I, q. 1, a. 3, and the Ordinatio I, d. 2, a. 2 is posed in an ambiguous way. It asks whether it is evidently probable that something absolutely uncausable is only one in number. The question is ambiguous because it is not immediately clear whether Wodeham’s intention is to show that there is only one God or if he intends to evaluate the relative degrees of evidence of the existing proofs of God’s unicity or multiplicity.

As the question progresses, it appears that Wodeham is primarily interested in evaluating the evidence of both pro and con arguments. Wodeham juxtaposes arguments of Scotus against counter arguments of Ockham in order to argue that the unicity of God cannot be demonstrably proven. Ultimately, he argues that its seems that natural reason is not able to prove evidently the numerical unity of God (LS II:144). He argues for the inconclusiveness of several arguments including: the argument that proceeds from the belief that there cannot be several total causes of the same effect (LS II:144); that there cannot be more than one necessary being (LS II:159); and that there cannot be more than one final cause (OO I, q. 2, a. 2, dubium 5). In the end, Wodeham is not interested in denying that there is only one God, but he simply wants to show that the relatively strong arguments for God’s unicity do not reach the third and highest degree of evidence.

Even when it comes to the specific unity of God, which is granted only a brief discussion in the Lectura secunda and is left out of the Ordinatio altogether, Wodeham shows some hesitation. He writes: “I say that the argument of Scotus given above is probably able to be persuasive” (LS II: 171). Thus he again shows that even though it is his own opinion that God is specifically one, it is possible for doubt to continue to linger.

5.3 Philosophy and the Trinity

Adam Wodeham’s trinitarian theology is developed in the Lectura (d. 2, d. 3 q. 5; d. 7; dd. 9–16; dd. 18–21; dd. 23–26) and the Ordinatio I, d. 3; d. 33 qq. 1–9. The two accounts, despite their various formal placements in the two works, are often identical (e.g., LS d. 11, q. un. and OO d. 33, q. 6). Wodeham, however, did substantially re-work his discussion of the imago Trinitatis (LS d. 3, q. 5; OO I, d. 3), focusing in the latter work on the writings of Richard FitzRalph instead of Richard Campsall. Further, in the closing discussion of distinction 2 of the Ordinatio, Wodeham tells his readers that the discussion of the Trinity will be collected into the numerous questions of distinction 33.

Wodeham’s trinitarian theology has received little attention from scholars. However, there are several notable exceptions. Hester Gelber offers an analysis of Ordinatio I, dd. 33, qq. 1–3, concerning the formal distinction and formal non-identity (q. 1) and the complex problem of trinitarian paralogisms (qq. 2–3) (Gelber 1974, 235–264, 629–648). Russell Friedman treats the relationship between Peter Auriol and Adam Wodeham in the Lectura secunda, d. 7 on the question: utrum potentia generandi possit communicari Filio (whether the power to generate can be communicated to the Son) (1997, 342–349). Olli Hallamaa considers Wodeham’s discussion of trinitarian paralogisms within the context of other fourteenth-century Franciscans (Hallamaa 2003). For our purposes Gelber’s and Hallamaa’s analyses of trinitarian paralogisms are the most relevant philosophically, as Wodeham debates the universality of Aristotelian logic with respect to the doctrine of the Trinity.

Like many of his Oxford contemporaries, Adam Wodeham was particularly concerned with solving the tension between Aristotelian logic and trinitarian theology. In the Lectura secunda, Wodeham did not address the problem in a substantial way (see LS III, 446–448), although in the Ordinatio he devotes a specific question to the problem of whether there is a “certain rule or art” through which one can solve trinitarian paralogisms (OO I, d. 33, q. 3).

The problem of trinitarian paralogisms arises when one considers certain syllogisms regarding the Trinity. God, according to Church teaching, is one simple divine essence and three distinct divine persons (Father, Son and Holy Spirit). And, when some valid syllogisms are formulated according to Aristotelian rules, paradoxes arise in which both premises are true and the conclusion is false. For example:

This divine essence is the Father Haec essentia divina est Pater
This divine essence is the Son Haec essentia divina est Filius
Therefore, the Son is the Father Ergo Filius est Pater.

In this valid expository syllogism, both of the premises are true according to Church teaching, but the conclusion is false. The theologians of the first half of the fourteenth century developed two strategies when confronting such syllogisms. First, some theologians denied the universality of Aristotelian logic outside of the natural order. This approach, which remained in the minority, can be found in the author of the Centiloquium theologicum (OPh VII, § 56–59, 469–472) and in Robert Holcot’s commentary on the Sentences (Holcot 1518, q. 5) (albeit Holcot’s position changes in other parts of his corpus, cf. Gelber 1974). In his commentary, Holcot remains ambiguous about his eventual solution, although he writes that there are two logics: the logic of faith (logica fidei) and the logic of the natural order (logica naturalis). Second, and more moderately, most theologians insisted that Aristotelian logic is universal—thus, valid in both the natural and supernatural realms—but that the trinitarian syllogisms in question are not valid syllogisms, despite their seemingly valid form. This approach was shared by William of Ockham and Adam Wodeham.

Adam Wodeham, in the first two questions of distinction 33, surveys the traditional methods of solving the problem of trinitarian paralogisms (Gelber 1974, 235–253), and in the third question finally offers his own response. It is not possible to recount all of Wodeham’s methods for addressing such paralogisms, but it is useful to consider the following syllogism:

Every divine essence is the Father Omnis essentia divina est Pater
Every divine essence is the Son Omnis essentia divina est Filius
Therefore, the Son is the Father Ergo Filius est Pater.

In the above case, the two premises are universal. As such, the syllogism should be governed by “all or none”: meaning that, with respect to a given subject and predicate, what is said of all (dici de omni) of the subject (essence) must also be said of the predicate (Father) (OO I, d. 33, q. 3, a. 2). In the above argument, there is a fallacy of the figure of speech because not everything said of the divine essence is predicable to the Father, because the term divine essence (subject) supposits for the Son and Holy Spirit while the term Father (predicate) does not. Thus, the premise is not sufficiently universal and violates the rules of a valid expository syllogism (Gelber 1974, 255–256). This is one of Wodeham’s methods for addressing trinitarian paralogisms, and effectively captures his basic method and approach to such problems. Further, it helps elucidate Wodeham’s broader approach to the role of Aristotelian logic within theology and his characteristically “analytic” approach to questions of philosophical theology.

6. Natural Philosophy

Adam Wodeham’s Tractatus de indivisibilibus and Tractatus alphabeticus establish him as one of the leading representatives of the theologia Anglicana. This group of thinkers, including the Oxford Calculators, was heavily influenced by natural philosophy and its implications for a range of philosophical and theological problems. Wodeham’s discussion of the continuum and the latitude of forms demonstrates his place within this philosophical tradition.

6.1 The Continuum

Adam Wodeham, like many of his English contemporaries in the first decades of the fourteenth century, was embroiled in the debate over divisibilism and indivisibilism (atomism). Following William of Ockham, Adam Wodeham was a divisibilist who argued in his Tractatus de indivisibilibus against philosophical atomism (indivisibilism). Wodeham cites extensively from the writings of divisibilists and indivisibilists, such that his Tractatus de indivisibilibus is a rich source for tracing the history of this long and complex debate (Wood 1988, 14).

Aristotle, in the sixth book of the Physics, develops several arguments against the idea that continua are composed of atoms or indivisibles. The majority of medieval philosophers accepted Aristotle’s position, but by the end of the thirteenth century there developed a minority opinion that supported indivisibilism. The most famous proponents of indivisibilism were Robert Grosseteste (d. 1253), Henry Harclay (d. 1317), Walter Chatton (d. 1343), Gerard Odon (d. 1349), William Crathorn (fl. 1330s) and Nicholas Bonet (d. 1360). The divisibilists/indivisibilist debate in the fourteenth century was concerned with the philosophical status of space and time. Spacial-temporal reality, according to the traditional Aristotelian view, was infinitely divisible. Thus, authors like Thomas Bradwardine and Adam Wodeham follow Aristotle and Averroes in defending the view that the continuum is composed of divisible parts without end, and not of atoms. This view (divisibilism) is the one defended by Adam Wodeham in his magisterial Tractatus de indivisibilibus.

In response to the classical divisibilist position supported by Aristotle, the indivisibilists held that there were “indivisibles” which constituted the composition of temporal and spatial continua, e.g., temporal instants and lines respectively. Such “indivisibles”, in the early 14th century, were understood to be an extended and simple ontological unit, but not physical atoms per se. It is helpful here to consider briefly an indivisibilist account, before turning to the divisibilism of Wodeham.

Henry Harclay and Walter Chatton are two relatively well known medieval philosophers who supported indivisibilism. Thinkers such as Harclay and Chatton argued, in response to Aristotle, for the possibility that a continuum is composed of indivisibles. The individual components, or indivisibles, were generally held to be extensionless regardless of whether or not the individual thinker understood there to be an infinite (Harclay) or finite (Chatton) number of indivisibles in a given continuum. But, as is well know, such indivisibilists accounts were generally so defensive in their posture—arguing for the mere possibility of indivisibles—that it is difficult to ascertain the broader philosophical motivations which grounded such arguments. John Murdoch argues that there are perhaps two motives that can be gleamed for the texts: (1) indivisibles may have been useful as a method of accounting for the motion of angels; or (2) indivisibles may have been useful when addressing the inequality of infinites (Murdoch 1982, 576–577). Although, he notes that such motivations are mentioned only in passing and that a broader motivation could have simply been that “the analysis of Aristotle’s arguments against indivisibilism uncovered loopholes in them” (Murdoch 1982, 577).

The Tractatus de indivisibilibus consists of five questions and it is instructive to consider the content briefly.

  1. In the first question, containing three articles, Wodeham considers whether or not forms, or extended continua, are composed of indivisibles. In the first article Wodeham develops twelve arguments against the indivisibilists, anticipates responses to those arguments, and rejects them (TI 35–93). In the second article, he considers twelve arguments, from Henry Harclay and Walter Chatton, in support of the thesis that forms are composed of indivisibles (TI 93–101). And, in the third article, Wodeham responds to the arguments of Harclay and Chatton (TI 103–121). This first article comprises about a third of the work, and the first article in particular contains many of Wodeham’s most significant arguments.
  2. In the second question, Wodeham treats the problem of whether or not extended forms or objects are composed of indivisibles. In response, Wodeham (following Ockham) argues in the first article against the existence of points, lines or surfaces (TI 123–139). And, as with the previous question, the second and third articles consider arguments in defense of indivisibles and responses to those arguments (TI 139–163).
  3. The third question entertains seven doubts relating to the divisibilist position. In the first four doubts Wodeham treats Zeno’s famous paradoxes (as reported by Aristotle in his Physics VI) (TI 165–183), and in the last three doubts he treats more contemporary arguments (TI 183–211).
  4. The fourth question considers whether or not a continuum is infinitely divisible. Thus, if a continuum can be divided, why cannot it be infinitely divided? To this question Wodeham provides an argument that a continuum cannot be divided (a. 1) (TI 213–225) and an argument to the contrary (a. 2) (TI 225–235).
  5. The final question considers whether or not there are more parts, of the same proportion, in a larger continuum than in a smaller one. In three articles, Wodeham considers an argument for the claim that there are more respective parts in a larger continuum (a. 1) (TI 239–247), objections to this argument (a. 2) (TI 247–261), and finally replies to the objections (a. 3) (TI 261–273).

In the second doubt of question 3 (LT 171–175; ¶13–20), as noted above, Wodeham considers the argument of Zeno (recorded in Aristotle’s Physics) against those who argue that motion is compatible with the divisibility of a continuum. This particular argument, familiar to all students of ancient philosophy, is exemplary both of Wodeham’s historical approach to the questions posed by the continuum and his own method of argumentation. Thus, it is instructive to consider the argument in some detail. Wodeham records Zeno’s argument as:

If every continuum is infinitely divisible, then every movable object traversing any space will reach the middle of that [space] before the end, and consequently it will reach the middle of the second half before reading [the end] of the completing [part] of that half, and then [it will reach] the middle of that next fourth [before] its completing [part]. Therefore if such halves are infinite proportional [parts], and if it does not happen that [a moveable object] traverses infinitely many [parts] in a finite time, then it is impossible that any space be traversed in a finite time. And consequently, it is impossible that anything move locally (LT 172–173; ¶14).

Wodeham, who is a divisibilist, offers a response to Zeno’s “paradox” because it is necessary to avoid the reductio ad absurdum (i.e., there is no motion) posed by the claim that an infinitely divisible finite space is not traversable.

Wodeham begins by considering Averroes’s argument that Aristotle, in the Physics VI, contradicts the “words, not the substance, of Zeno’s discourse” (LT 173; ¶15). But, Wodeham does not agree with Averroes’s interpretation of Aristotle, and he defends Aristotle’s argument. Wodeham argues that Aristotle recognizes that Zeno’s argument “supposes falsely” that it is “not possible to traverse something infinite … in a finite time” (LT 173; ¶16), although he also correctly recognizes that there is more to be said in response to Zeno. Further, Wodeham argues that Aristotle recognized that there is an equivocation with respect to the term “infinite” as applied to a continuum of space or time: infinite can be understood with respect to “division”, or with respect to “infinite ends”. That is, the term infinite can refer to the infinite divisibility of a given finite continuum of space or time, or the term can refer to the fact that space or time extends without end or termination (LT 173; ¶17). Because of this equivocation, the phrase “a moveable object may traverse infinitely many things in a finite time” can be understood in two ways: either (1) as stating that a moveable object traverses infinitely many things that are extensively never terminated in a finite time; or (2) as stating that a moveable object traverse infinitely many non-equal things (that a given continuum is divided into) in a finite time (LT 173–175; ¶18). In the former sense the claim is false, in the latter sense it is true. And, in this way, Aristotle solves Zeno’s “paradox” to Wodeham’s satisfaction.

Finally, Wodeham analyzes William of Ockham’s interpretation—in the Expositio Physicorum (OP V, ll. 49–56)—of Averroes’s argument that Aristotle addresses the words and not the substance of Zeno’s argument. Wodeham, recording Ockham’s argument, implies that Ockham’s reading of Averroes is too “charitable”, concluding that “if [Averroes] did understand [the matter] in the manner expounded here, both his exposition and what he expounds are false” (LT 175; ¶175).

As demonstrated by this brief example, in the Tractatus de indivisibilibus Adam Wodeham engages at length with the ancient and medieval philosophical tradition. Further, throughout the work he quotes extensively from William of Ockham’s Exposition Physicorum and his Tractatus de quantitate. Wodeham also considers in detail the arguments of Henry Harclay and Walter Chatton, all of which provides a useful historical record of this heated debate. But, ultimately, the work remains a barrage of arguments against the indivisibilist, or atomist, position as defended in the early fourteenth century.

6.2 The Latitude of Forms

In his minor work, the Tractatus alphabeticus, Wodeham takes up the question of qualitative change and offers a position that is consistent with his overall opposition to atomism (cf. Wood 1990). According to Sylla, there were three dominant views of qualitative change that shaped the context of the discussion: the succession theory, the addition theory, and the admixture theory (Sylla 1973, 230–232). The succession and addition theory distinguish themselves from the admixture theory in that they are both committed to the fact that qualitative forms themselves do not change in degree. Rather it is the subject that changes in degree through the acquisition of a new qualitative form (cf. Sylla 1973, 232; Wood 1990, 375). Wodeham, in relative concord with the views of Ockham and FitzRalph and against the Mertonian Campsall and his usual nemesis Walter Chatton, argues against the admixture theory. He claims that it is impossible for one and the same quality to be changed while retaining its identity. As Wood says:

Addition and succession of forms theorists agree on this issue; in no sense is it true that the same form undergoes remission or intension…strictly speaking it is the subject, not the form, which becomes more white, more hot or more charitable. (Wood 1990, 375)

A helpful analog can be found in the case of numbers. When the number 9 is increased to 10, Wodeham understands the admixture theorist to be claiming that the same form has been intensified, but he wonders how this numerically identical form can really be said to retain its old identity now that it has been increased to 10 and is no longer 9.

While the succession and addition theorist are united in their opposition to any admixture, and while both believe that intension and remission occur in the subject and not in the qualitative form, they disagree about just how this intension and remission occurs. In the Tractatus alphabeticus, Wodeham shows himself to be numbered among the addition theorists. The key difference here is that the succession theorist believes that when a quality increases a new form of a given quality destroys and then replaces the old form. Wodeham and the addition theorist disagree. They hold that when qualitative change happens, a new form is indeed acquired, but it does not destroy the proceeding form. On the contrary, the new form takes in the preceding form as one of its parts. And here, the analogy of quantitative change is again helpful. When 9 increases to 10, the succession theorist argues that the old form of 9 is completely destroyed and replaced by an entirely new form, where no part of the old form of 9 contributes to the new form of 10. In opposition, the addition theorist argues that when a quality increases, this is analogous to the number 1 being added to 9, and through this addition, the new form of 10 is created. In this case, the old form of 9 has not been destroyed, but rather becomes a part of the new whole.

A critical underlying difference between the succession and addition theorists is the question over whether forms are indivisible or can be perpetually broken down into smaller parts. The succession theorist thinks forms are indivisible and do not contain parts (Sylla 1973, 231). But Adam Wodeham, in harmony with his general anti-atomists position, argues that forms can be infinitely divided. In this way, there is no trouble in saying that, through addition, a new form is created, which contains the old form as one of its parts.

7. Ethics

7.1 Moral Goodness

Since the Lectura secunda does not extend beyond book I, the moral philosophy of Adam Wodeham found in book IV of the Ordinatio has remained relatively unexamined. However, in 1981 Marilyn Adams and Rega Wood edited the tenth question of Book IV of the Ordinatio, providing us with a glimpse into Wodeham’s moral philosophy.

Question ten concentrates on the moral worth or goodness of an action. Here the philosophical debate is about whether the moral worth of action resides in the choice of the will alone (in the manner of Kant) or whether moral goodness can be ascribed to the performance of actions themselves, independent of the intention of the agent. Wodeham’s discussion is embedded in a larger Franciscan discussion, whose main players are Scotus and Walter Chatton on the one hand, and Ockham and Wodeham on the other.

The discussion is grounded in the distinction between purely internal acts (or volitional acts, acts within the power of the will) and external acts (or acts that can only be indirectly controlled by the will). In the case of the latter (an external act), the power of the will is not sufficient, and another source of power is needed. Scotus’s position, as understood by Wodeham, states that while an external act can only be good if it falls under the control of the will (cf. Adams and Wood 1981, 9), the external and indirectly controlled act can nevertheless contribute an additional moral goodness beyond the moral value accrued through the act of volition. The result is that while willing to do the right thing or bad thing is in itself praiseworthy or blameworthy, executing and performing that act can impute to the agent further praise or blame, depending on how well one performs the willed act (cf. Adams and Wood 1981, 9).

Wodeham, like Ockham, finds this position rather confusing. If someone performs a morally praiseworthy volition, but this volition is not able to be executed, the only reason for this failure of performance is some impotency within the agent. But Wodeham insists that no one should be damned for not doing what is not in their power to do (OO IV, 57–59, ll. 11–30; cf. Adams and Wood 1981, 14). Thus, no one can earn more merit for simply having the potency to perform the action that they willed meritoriously. Having or not having the potency to execute that volition does not fall under the free power of the agent, and, even for Scotus, only those acts that “are under the free power of the agent” are imputable acts (Adams and Wood 1981, 9 and 14).

7.2 Morality, the Will, and the Nature of Faith

For Walter Chatton, Ockham and Wodeham’s position on the amoral status of external acts leads to unsavory consequences. Among other things, Chatton is concerned about the implications of Wodeham’s position for the necessity of faith. Wodeham’s reply not only gives us a nice illustration of how his moral theory plays out in concrete instances, but also provides us with a helpful introduction to his position on the nature of belief and its connection to the will.

Chatton is concerned that if one holds a position similar to the one of Wodeham there will no longer be any need for faith or belief, but only the desire to believe. Chatton has this concern because, for him, the act of belief is not directly under the control of the will (cf; OO IV 36, ll. 20–23). Wodeham responds by starkly distinguishing between two kinds of faith. Infused faith, which appears to be a pure act of the will and acquired faith which is not a direct act of the will and is not required for salvation (OO IV 58, ll.13–14). Presumably, this act of acquired belief is an act of the intellect and a response to the relative evidence of a given proposition or an entire syllogism taken together (see above An Evident Judgment).

With this distinction in place, Wodeham uses his moral theory to show that the act of acquired belief, described as the act of believing calmly (quiete) and presumably without intellectual hesitation or doubt, does not add any moral worth. This is the case since, as we have already seen, if one wishes to believe, but is prevented from doing so by a lack of power, the agent should not be held responsible for this lack of power. Reasons for such a lack of power include a melancholic disturbance, a passion, or sophism (OO IV 58, ll. 15–18). He further concludes, it is quite possible that the person who wishes to believe, but is not able to do so calmly (quiete), may be more morally praiseworthy than the person who intellectually believes “quietly” and is not beset by doubt. Intriguingly, he critiques Lombard at this point, saying:

If the Master means to say that in order to achieve salvation one must believe with something more than a perfect will, but must also have belief calmly (quiete), then he does think correctly … . (OO IV 58, ll. 26–29)


Primary Literature

  • Adam Wodeham. Super quattuor libros sententiarum: Abbreviatio. Henrici Totting de Oyta, John Major (ed.), Paris: P. le Preux, 1512.
  • –––. Lectura secunda, Gedeon Gál and Rega Wood (eds.), St. Bonaventure, NY: Franciscan Institute, 1990. [LS]
  • –––. Ordinatio, IV, q. 10, in Marilyn McCord Adams and Rega Wood, “Is to will it as bad as to do it?”, Franciscan Studies, 41 (1981): 30–60. [OO IV]
  • –––. Tractatus de indivisibilis, Rega Wood (ed.), Dortrecht: Kluwer, 1988. [TI]
  • –––. Tractatus alphabeticus, Codex Erfurt, Stadtsbibliothek, Amplon, Folio 133, ff. 134ra–145va.
  • Gregory of Rimini. Gregorii Ariminensis Lectura super primum et secundum Sententiarum, D. Trapp, V. Marcolino (eds.) (Spätmittelalter und Reformation Texte und Untersuchungen, volumes 6–11), Berlin/New York: De Gruyter, 1979–83. [Lectura]
  • John Duns Scotus. Opera Omnia, Carl Balic, et al. (eds.), Vatican City: Vatican Polyglot Press, 1950–.
  • Robert Holcot. In quatuor libros sententiarum quaestiones, Lyons, 1518. Reprinted Frankfurt: Minerva GMBH, 1967.
  • Thomas of Eccleston. Tractatus de adventu fratrum minorum in Angliam, A. G. Little (ed.), Manchester: Manchester University press, 1951.
  • William of Ockham. Opera Philosophica, Pilotheus Boehner, Gedeon Gál, Stephen Brown, et al. (eds.) Volumes I–VII. St. Bonaventure, N.Y.: Franciscan Institute Press, 1974–1988. [OP]
  • –––. Opera Theologica, Gedeon Gál, Stephen Brown, et al. (eds.), Volumes I–X. St. Bonaventure, N.Y.: Franciscan Institute Press, 1967–1986. [OT]

Secondary Literature

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, 1993, “Review: Lectura Secunda of Adam Wodeham,” The Philosophical Review, 102 (4): 588–594.
  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, and Rega Wood, 1981, “Is to will it as bad as to do it? The Fourteenth Century Debate,” Franciscan Studies, 41: 5–60.
  • Adriaenssen, H. T., 2017, “Peter Auriol on the Intuitive Cognition of Nonexistents. Revisiting the Charge of Skepticism in Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham,” Oxford Studies in Medieval Philosophy, 5: 151–180.
  • Beckmann, Jan P., 1993, “Adam Wodeham,” Lexikon für Theologie und Kirche, Freiburg.
  • –––, 1998, “Ockham, Ockhamismus, und Nominalismus: Spuren der Wirkungsgeschichte des Venerabilis Inceptors,” Franciscan Studies, 56: 77–95.
  • Bermon, Pascale, 2007, L’assentiment et son objet chez Gregoire de Rimini, Paris: Vrin.
  • Biard, Joël, 2004, “Les controverses sur l’objet du savoir et les ‘complexe significabilia’ à Paris au XIVe siècle,” in Quia inter doctores est magna dissensio. Les débats de philosophie naturelle à Paris au XIVe siècle, Stefano Caroti and Jean Celeyrett (eds.), Biblioteca di Nuncius—Studi e Testi, Firenze: Olschki, 1–31.
  • Bottin, F., 1982, La scienza degli occamisti, Rimini.
  • Brower-Toland, Susan, 2007, “Fact vs. Things: Adam Wodeham and the Later Medieval Debate about Objects of Judgment,” Review of Metaphysics, 60(3): 597–642.
  • Courtenay, William J., 1978, Adam Wodeham: an introduction to his life and writings, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2008, Ockham and Ockhamism: studies in the dissemination and impact of his thought, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 1975, “Ockhamism among the Augustinians: the case of Adam Wodeham,” Cassiciacum, 30: 267–275.
  • –––, 2004, “Wodeham, Adam (c. 1295–1358),” Oxford Dictionary of National Biography, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Friedman, Russell L., 1997, In Principio Erat Verbum: The Incorporation of Philosophical Psychology into Trinitarian Theology, 1250–1325, Ph.D. Dissertation, University of Iowa.
  • Gal, Gedeon, 1977, “Adam of Wodeham’s Question on the ‘Complexe Significabile’ as the Immediate Object of Scientific Knowledge,” Franciscan Studies, 37: 66–102.
  • Gelber, Hester Goodenough, 1983, Exploring the Boundaries of Reason: Three Questions on the Nature of God by Robert Holcot OP, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.
  • –––, 1974, Logic and the Trinity: a clash of values in scholastic thought, 1300–1335, University of Wisconsin: Ph.D. Dissertation.
  • Genest, Jean-François, 2003, “Aux origines d’une casuistique. La révélation des futurs contingents d’après la lecture de Richard FitzRalph sur les Sentences (II),” Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du moyen âge, 70: 317–346.
  • Grassi, Onorato, 1982, “Il problema della conoscenza di Dio nel commento alle Sentenze di Adam Wodeham (Prologo e q. 1),” Medioevo, 8: 43–136.
  • –––, 1986, Intuizione e significato: Adam Wodeham ed il problema della conoscenza nel XIV secolo, Milan: Editoriale Jaca.
  • Hallamaa, Olli, 2003, “Defending Common Rationality: Roger Roseth on Trinitarian Paralogisms,” Vivarium, 41(1): 84–119.
  • Inglis, John, 1998, Spheres of Philosophical Inquiry and the Historiography of Medieval Philosophy, Leiden: Brill.
  • Karger, Elizabeth, 2015, “Was Adam Wodeham an internalist or an externalist?” in G. Klima (ed.), Intentionality, Cognition and Mental Representation in Medieval Philosophy, New York: Fordham University Press, 186–203.
  • –––, 2004, “Ockham and Wodeham on Divine Deception as a skeptical hypothesis,” Vivarium, 42(2): 225–236.
  • –––, 2001, “Adam Wodeham on the Intentionality of Cognitions,” in Ancient and medieval theories of intentionality, Dominik Perler (ed.), Brill Academic Publishers, 283–300.
  • –––, 1995, “William of Ockham, Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham on the Objects of Knowledge and Belief,” Vivarium, 33(2): 171–196.
  • Keele, Rondo, 2003, “The So-Called ‘Res’ Theory of Walter Chatton,” Franciscan Studies, 61: 37–53.
  • Kennedy, Leonard A., 1990, “Early Fourteenth-Century Franciscans and Divine Absolute Power,” Franciscan Studies, 50: 197–233.
  • Kitanov, Severin Valentinov, 2006, Beatific Enjoyment in Scholastic Theology and Philosophy: 1240–1335, Ph.D. Dissertation, University of Helsinki.
  • –––, 2003, “Displeasure in Heaven, Pleasure in Hell: Four Franciscan Masters on the Relationship Between Love and Pleasure, and Hatred and Displeasure,” Traditio, 58: 284–340.
  • Klima, Gyula, 2017, “Thought-Transplants, Demons, and Modalities,” in F.J. Pelletier and M. Roques (eds.), The Language of Thought in Late Medieval Philosophy, Cham: Springer, 369–382.
  • Knuuttila, Simo, 2004, Emotions in Ancient and Medieval Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1997, “Positio impossibilis in Medieval Discussions of the Trinity,” in Vestigia, Imagines, Verba: Semiotics and Logic in Medieval Theological Texts (XIIth-XIVth Century) (Acts of the XIth Symposium on Medieval Logic and Semantics, San Marino, 24–28 May 1994), Costantino Marmo (ed.), Semiotic and Cognitive Studies, 4, Trunhout: Brepols, 277–288.
  • –––, 2004, “Wodeham Cognitive Theory of the Passions,” in Medieval Theories on Assertive and Non-Assertive Language (Acts of the 14th European Symposium on Medieval Logic and Semantics, Rome, June 11–15, 2002), Alfonso Maierú and Luisa Valente (eds.), Lessico Intellectuale Europeo, 97, Firenze: Olschki, 207–218.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, 1984, “Adam Wodeham’s anti-Aristotelian anti-atomism,” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 4: 381–398.
  • Lahey, Stephen, 2011, “Adam Wodeham,” Henrik Lagerlund (ed.), Encyclopedia of Medieval Philosophy, Dordrecht: Springer Netherlands, 20–24.
  • Lenz, Martin, 2001, “Adam de Wodeham und die Entdeckung des Sachverhalts,” in Umbrüche: Historische Wendepunkte der Philosophie von der Antike bis Antike bis zur Gegenwart. Festschrift für Kurt Flasch zu seinem 70, Geburtstag, Klaus Kahnert and Burkhard Mojsisch (eds.), Amsterdam. 99–116.
  • Little, A. G., 1892, The Grey Friars in Oxford, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Little, A. G., and F. Pelster, 1934, Oxford theology and theologians, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Murdoch, John E., 1982, “Infinity and Continuity,” in The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, Norman Kretzmann and Anthony Kenny (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 564–592.
  • Murdoch, John, and E. Synan, 1966, “Two Questions of the Continuum: Walter Chatton, OFM and Adam Wodeham, OFM,” Franciscan Studies, 26: 212–288.
  • Nuchelmans, Gabriel, 1973, Theoreis of the Proposition—Ancient and Medieval Conceptions of the Bearers of Truth and Falsity, Amsterdam-London: North Holland Publishing.
  • –––, 1980, “Adam Wodeham on the meaning of declarative sentences,” Historiographia Linguistica, 7: 177–186.
  • Perler, Dominik, 2006, “Intentionality and Action. Medieval Discussion on the Cognitive Capacities of Animals,” in Intellect and Imagination in Medieval Philosophy (Actes du XIe congrès international de philosophie médiévale de la Société Internationale pour l’Etude de la Philosophie Médiévale (S.I.E.P.M.), Porto, du 26 au 31 août 2002), Maria Cândida Pacheco and José F. Meirinhos (eds.), Société Internationale pour l’Etude de la Philosophie Médiévale: Rencontres de Philosophie Médiévale 11. Turnhout: Brepols, 73–98.
  • –––, 2008, “Seeing and Judging: Ockham and Wodeham on Sensory Cognition,” in Theories of Perception in Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy, Simo Knuuttila and Pekka Kärkkäinen (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, 151–169.
  • –––, 2002, Theorien der Intentionalität im Mittelalter, Frankfurt-am-Main: Klostermann.
  • Reina, Maria Elena, 1986, “Cognizione intuitive ed esperienza interior in Adamo Wodeham,” Rivista di Storia della Filiosofia, 41: 19–42, 211–244.
  • –––, 1986, “Un abbozzo di polemica sulla psicologia animale: Gregorio da Rimini contro Adamo Wodeham,” in L’Homme et son univers au Moyen Age (Actes du septième congrès international de philosophie médiévale, 30 août—4 septembre 1982), Christian Wenin (ed.), Philosophes Médiévaux 26–27, Louvain-La-Neuve: Éditions de l’Institut supérieur de philosophie, 598–609.
  • Schabel, Christopher, 2002, “Oxford Franciscans After Ockham: Walter Chatton and Adam Wodeham,” in Mediaeval Commentaries on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, Gillian Rosemary Evans (ed.), Leiden: Brill, 359–393.
  • Spade, Paul V., 1988, “Anselm and the background to Adam Wodeham’s theory of abstract and concrete terms,” Rivista di Storia della Filiosofia, 2: 261–271.
  • Sylla, Edith Dudley, 1973, “Medieval Concepts of the Latitude of Forms: The Oxford Calculators,” Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du moyen âge, 40: 223–283.
  • –––, 1998, “God and the Continuum in the Later Middle Ages: the Relations of Philosophy to Theology, Logic, and Mathematics,” in Was ist Philosophie im Mittelalter? (Akten des X. Internationalen Kongresses für mittelalterliche Philosophie der Société Internationale pour l’Etude de la Philosophie Médiévale, 25. bis 30. August 1997 in Erfurt), Jan A. Aertsen and Andreas Speer (ed.), Miscellanea Medievalia, 26, Berlin: De Gruyter, 791–797.
  • –––, 1998, “God, Indivisibles, and Logic in the Later Middle Ages: Adam Wodeham’s Response to Henry of Harclay,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology, 7(1): 69–87.
  • Tachau, Katherine, 1980, “Adam Wodeham On First and Second Intentions,” Cahiers de l’Institut du Moyen-Age grec et latin (Kobenhavns Universitet), 35: 29–55.
  • –––, 1995, Vision and Certitude in the Age of Ockham, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 1987, “Wodeham, Crathorn, and Holcot: The Development of the complexe significabile,” in Logos and Pragma: Essays on the Philosophy of Language in Honor of Professor Gabriel Nuchelmans, L. M. de Riijk and H. A. G. Braakhuis (eds.), Nijmegen. 161–187.
  • Tachau, Katherine, and Paul Streveller (eds.), 1995, Robert Holcot, Seeing the Future Clearly: Questions on Future Contingents, Studies and Texts 119, Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.
  • Weidemann, Hermann, 1991, “Sache, Satz und Sachverhalt: Zur Diskussion über das Objekt des Wissens im Spätmittelalter,” Vivarium, 29: 129–146.
  • White, Graham, 1993, “William of Ockham and Adam Wodeham,” Heythrop Journal, 34(3): 296–301.
  • Wood, Rega, 1982, “Adam Wodeham on Sensory Illusions with an Edition of Lectura Secunda, Prologus, Quaestio 3,” Traditio, 38: 213–252.
  • –––, 2003, “Adam of Wodeham,” Jorge J. E. Gracia and Timothy B. Noone (eds.), A Companion to Philosophy in the Middle Ages (Blackwell Companions to Philosophy 24), Oxford: Blackwell Publishers. 77–85.
  • –––, 1990, “Calculating Grace: the Debate About Latitude of Forms According to Adam De Wodeham,” in Knowledge and the Sciences in Medieval Philosophy, 2 (Proceedings of the Eighth International Congress of Medieval Philosophy, Helsinki, 24–29 August 1987), Simo Knuuttila, Reijo Työrinoja, and Sten Ebbesen (eds.), Publications of Luther-Agricola Society B19, Helsinki: Luther-Agricola Society, 373–391.
  • –––, 1989, “Epistemology and omnipotence: Ockham in Fourteenth-Century Philosophical Perspective,” In Popes, Teachers and Canon Law in the Middle Ages, S. Chodorow and J. Sweeney (eds.), Ithaca: Cornell University Press. 160–176.
  • –––, 1991, “The Wodeham Edition: Adam Wodeham’s Lectura Secunda,” Franciscan Studies, 51: 103–115.
  • Zupko, Jack, 1994–1997, “How It Played in the rue de Fouarre: The Reception of Adam Wodeham’s Theory of the Complexe Significabile in the Arts Faculty at Paris in the Mid-Fourteenth Century,” Franciscan Studies, 54: 211–225.
  • –––, 1993, “Nominalism Meets Indivisibilism,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology, 3: 158–185.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


We wish to thank Professor Simo Knuuttila, Dr. Olli Hallamaa and the Department of Systematic Theology of the University of Helsinki, Finland, where this article was written. Further, we thank the participants of the Adam de Wodeham Workshop (Helsinki, 2011) for reading a draft of this article and providing useful criticism. Finally, thanks are due to Gyula Klima for reading the draft on behalf of SEP and providing us with several important corrections which have been reflected in the final version.

Copyright © 2019 by
John T. Slotemaker <>
Jeffrey C. Witt <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free