Sortals

First published Thu Feb 9, 2006; substantive revision Tue Apr 17, 2007

Many philosophers believe that the category of sortals is a philosophically important one, or at least they believe that most philosophers believe that. However, the concept is less clear and more criticized than is generally recognized. There is variation, in whether ‘sortal’ is applied to linguistic items, e.g., predicates or words, abstract entities, e.g., universals or properties, or psychological entities, e.g., concepts. There is also variation, mostly unnoticed, in how ‘sortal’ is defined. Much of the disagreement is probably masked by the fact that there is agreement on some examples, so ‘tiger’ (or the associated concept or universal) is a sortal and ‘water’ is not.

In the least interesting (and uncontroversial) sense, an expression is a sortal if and only if it takes numerical modifiers. Thus ‘ice cube’ is a sortal because the adjectives associated with it are numerical—we say "two ice cubes", but ‘water’ is not a sortal since the usual modifiers are mass terms, i.e., we ask for "two cups of water". Or in slightly different terms, we ask "How many ice cubes do you want?" but "How much water do you want?" Of course we can often make sense of ‘how many’ questions about non-sortals if a suitable measure is understood. Thus "How many coffees would you like?" is really understood as "How many cups …?" Many words have two distinct though related meanings, one of which is sortal and one of which is not. For example, we can ask both "How many chickens do you want?" and "How much chicken do you want?" This linguistic distinction is often called the "count noun/mass noun" distinction by both philosophers and linguists. Although in many cases the distinction matches with more philosophical distinctions about the kind of item the noun refers to, the distinction is a linguistic one. For example, ‘furniture’ is a mass noun even though all of the things it is true of are also referred to by count nouns such as ‘table’ or ‘chair’. And words vary across languages; ‘spaghetti’ is a mass noun in English, but is the plural of the count noun ‘spaghetto’ in Italian.

In a more significant sense, the sortal/nonsortal distinction is widely believed by philosophers to mark a metaphysically important difference. However, the distinction is characterized in at least six different ways. A sortal:

  1. gives a criterion for counting the items of that kind
  2. gives a criterion of identity and non-identity among items of that kind
  3. gives a criterion for the continued existence of an item of that kind
  4. answers the question "what is it?" for things of that kind
  5. specifies the essence of things of that kind
  6. does not apply to parts of things of that kind

The first two are closely connected, since counting objects involves questions about which objects are and are not identical. The last is connected to the first two since if proper parts of an object of that kind are themselves of that kind, then it is not clear that one can count things of that kind. The other three are closely connected since specifying the essence of a thing is a good way of answering the question "What is it?", and if a characteristic is part of the essence then an object cannot lack that without ceasing to exist. The third provides a connection between the first two and 3-5, since whether something exists at a time is often relevant for counting either at a time or across times.

It is easy to see that the first pair apply more broadly than the next three. ‘Kitten’ provides criteria of identity and counting, but does not specify an essence, is not required for continued existence (i.e., a kitten does not cease to exist when it reaches maturity) and does not answer the "What is it?" question in the way philosophers have in mind.. The standard terminology for concepts like ‘kitten’ which apply during a certain phase of an object's existence is "phase sortal" (Wiggins 1967) while expressions such as "red table" are usually said to be ‘restricted sortals’. The remaining sortals are sometimes called ‘substance sortals’ (Wiggins 1967) "pure sortals" (Hale and Wright 2001, 386ff) or sometimes simply and confusingly ‘sortals’.

The concepts of a ‘sortal’ are closely connected with issues about identity, persistence and change. For example, debate continues over Locke's claim that two things of the same sort cannot occupy exactly the same spatial region. An apparent counterexample is that of a statue and the material which composes it. One defense of Locke's principle against this alleged counterexample is that these are not the same sort of thing so it does not violate the principle; another is to identify the statue and material, sustaining the principle by a different route. Both of these lines have been developed, and criticized. This article reviews the history of the concept(s) of a sortal and how they came to be thought important in the mid 20th century, analyzes the six differing ways of defining "sortal", reviews ‘logics of sortals’ and concludes by attempting to summarize and evaluate the importance of the distinction(s).


1. The concept of a sortal before 1900

Many philosophers have claimed that the notion of a sortal is the same notion as developed by Aristotle under the label "secondary substance" in several of his writings. However, that concept is both complex and controversial (see Cohen 2003, Furth 1988) and we will not pursue the connection. The first use of the term "sortal" is in Locke's 1690 Essay Concerning Human Understanding. (Locke 1975)

But it being evident, that things are ranked under Names into sorts or Species…the Essence of each Genus, or Sort, comes to be nothing but that abstract Idea, which the General, or Sortal (if I may have leave so to call it, from Sort, as I do General from Genus) Name stands for. And this we shall find to be that, which the word Essence imports, in its most familiar use. (Locke, Bk.III, Ch.III, 15)

Locke goes on to distinguish between real essences, which are mostly hidden from us and determined by nature, and nominal essences, which we (somewhat) arbitrarily construct. It is ironic that in the discussion of sortals Locke and Aristotle are cited as the two historical sources, when in fact one of the main points of Locke's Essay was to argue against Aristotelian essentialism. (Uzgalis 2005)

The other pre-twentieth century author who is frequently cited as an antecedent of contemporary discussions is Frege. In Frege (1884) he makes the point that in counting things, we need to know what kind of thing we are counting. For example, something can be counted as one thing, a deck of cards, or as fifty two cards. Frege was perhaps the first to use the phrase (which is translated as) ‘criterion of identity’. There is disagreement about whether Frege intended his remarks to apply to all kinds of identity as Dummett (1973) argues, or only to numbers as Lowe (1989b) argues, but Dummett's is the more common interpretation.

Wright (1983) argues that one of Frege's most important contributions was emphasizing that numbers are objects and that this is intimately connected to Frege's claim that "natural number" is a sortal. Wright is aware of the difficulties in characterizing sortals which we will explore below, but remarks that "…whether or not it is ultimately rigorously explicable, the intuitive notion of a sortal concept is clear enough for our immediate purpose."(4) We will return to these issues in Section 3.4

2. Counting and criteria of identity

2.1 Counting and criteria of identity

As indicated in the introduction, there is a grammatical distinction, and at least six ways of drawing a philosophical sortal/non-sortal distinction, and while many philosophers may believe the latter coincide, we shall argue that they do not. The grammatical distinction is the one which stipulates that an expression G is a sortal if and only if phrases of the sort "There are two Gs …" are grammatical, and if the appropriate grammatical form of question is "How many Gs …?" rather than "How much G …?". Thus we ask "How many tables are in the room?", and expect an answer of the form "There are three tables.", in contrast to the question "How much wood is in the room?" for which an appropriate response would be "There are 3 cubic feet of wood in the room."

This distinction is fairly precise, but there is disagreement about its significance. Sentences such as "There are two red things on the shelf" are clearly grammatical, but there is disagreement about whether "red thing" is a sortal. Many philosophers such as Hirsch and Wiggins think not because, they claim you cannot count red things; but others think that we can count red things, although the only two possible correct answers are ‘zero’ and ‘infinity’. If nothing red is present there are no red things, and if some red thing is present then so is the top half of it and the bottom half of it. And the top and bottom of each half, ad infinitum.

The expression ‘sortal’ reappeared on the philosophical stage in the 1950s and 1960s in lectures and in the written work of Strawson (1959), Quine (1960), Geach (1962), and Wiggins (1967) and variations on the word entered the mainstream philosophical vocabulary. Because philosophers give talks and circulate manuscripts with their ideas for years—sometimes decades—before publication, the dates of the main publications of the protagonists concerning sortals do not necessarily reflect the historical priorities and influences. The most accurate simple summary is that the ideas of Geach, Strawson and Quine co-evolved and that Wiggins' writings attempted to build on a foundation laid by those predecessors. The widespread use of the term ‘sortal’ clearly derives from Strawson, but readers should note that there are important differences among these authors.

For a start, Strawson applies ‘sortal’ to universals, Quine to predicates and Wiggins to concepts. Geach did not use the word ‘sortal’ but most commentators identify his notion of a ‘substantival expression’ with ‘sortal’ in the other writers. Although Geach seems closest to Quine, since ‘expression’ seems to be a linguistic notion, Geach generalizes his results across languages in ways that Quine would not find agreeable. These differences in usage among the four authors may or may not be important, if, for example, there are simple direct relations among concepts, universals and expressions. But there are other differences which certainly are important.

Strawson made no mention of Locke, Aristotle or Frege in the context of introducing the expression ‘sortal universal’ in Individuals in 1959. "A sortal universal supplies a principle for distinguishing and counting individual particulars which it collects. (1959, 168)

Strawson had two main projects in Individuals. The first was to show that material bodies and persons occupy a central position among particulars and that items in these two categories are basic to our conceptual scheme. The second was to "establish and explain the connexion between the idea of a particular in general and that of an object of reference or logical subject." (11-12) Sortal universals are central to this second task because, according to Strawson, reference to particulars occurs by using expressions that are associated with sortal universals.

Strawson combines the first two characterstics of sortals listed above:

  1. gives a criterion for counting the items of that kind
  2. gives a criterion of identity and non-identity among items of that kind

It is not difficult to see why someone would identify these requirements. In order to know that there are two Gs in a region S, it is necessary and sufficient to know that

There is an x which is in S and has G, a y which is in S and has G and is not identical to x, and for any z, if z is a G which is in S then z is identical with either x or y.

The phrase ‘criterion of identity’ seems to mean a criterion which gives a necessary and sufficient condition for identity. In many cases, however, a somewhat weaker condition suffices for counting. Thus to conclude that there are exactly two Gs in region S, all that is required is a sufficient condition for x and y to be distinct, and a sufficient condition for z to be identical with x or y. In the case of physical objects, it may be that being at the same location at the same time is sufficient for identity, and being in entirely separate locations at the same time is sufficient for distinctness. In many circumstances, these will suffice to count Gs, but it is far short of providing answers about partially overlapping Gs, and provides no guidance about identity across time. So often we may be able to count Gs without having a criterion of identity in the strong sense.

One of the unclarities of the phrase ‘criterion of identity’ is that it is never spelled out what the criterion is to be applied to. For example, is it a criterion to be applied to names of objects or to perceptual representations of objects or to the objects themselves? It is also unclear how strictly we are to understand ‘criterion’. In "Entity and identity" (published in 1976 and reprinted in Strawson 1997) Strawson proposed being quite strict, limiting the phrase ‘criterion of identity’ to cases where there either is an explicitly statable necessary and sufficient condition that does not use the identity relation, or one where the identity relation is only applied to constitutent parts of the objects. This can be done for numbers and sets, but probably not for any kind of concrete objects. In 1997, he retracted that proposal in favor of the looser (and still undefined) general philosophical use of the term. (1997, 2-3)

For example, Wiggins understands the counting criterion very strictly so one instance where there is not a determinate answer to a question leads him to reject the counting criterion. At the other end of the spectrum, Griffin only requires that

A term ‘A’ is a sortal iff there can be cases in which ‘A’ provides, without further conceptual decision, and without borrowing other principles of individuation, principles adequate for counting As. (Griffin, 43)

Since most philosophers who invoke the distinction want to reject ‘thing’, ‘object’ and ‘entity’ as non-sortals, Griffin's suggestion is inadequate, or at least is a shift to a different concept with the same label. The question ‘How many things/objects/entity are in the space S?", where S is an empty space has the determinate answer ‘zero’, so all of these terms pass the Griffin standard. One could attempt to amend the criterion by requiring that there can be cases which satisfy the above criteria and where there is at least one A. However, this fails to delineate the right cases, because there are sortals such as ‘unicorn’ and ‘square circle’ which have no instances. (These points, and the observation that some of the various distinctions diverge, were first made in Feldman (1973) but have not been widely noted.)

2.2 Identity at a time and identity across time

We have been discussing the difference between (1) and (2), but there is a further complication in that (2) might be subdivided into the two claims:

2a. A sortal provides a criterion of identity for things at a time

2b. A sortal provides a criterion of identity for things at different times.

That these can diverge should be obvious to philosophers because of the much discussed case of the ship of Theseus. Theseus gradually replaced parts of his ship until he had eventually replaced the entire ship. Philosophers embellish the story by having someone following Theseus and acquiring the abandoned parts and reassembling them into a ship exactly like the original and composed of the same material. The sortal ‘ship’ clearly provides us with enough of a criterion to say that at the end of the story there are two ships, but philosophical literature is full of disparate attempts to argue which of them is identical with the original.

Wiggins remarks (in the preface to Wiggins 2001) that it is unclear whether Wiggins 2001 is a new version of, and thus the same book as Wiggins 1980, but goes on to say that it is "…a not a question of importance—the matter of a joke that will fail nobody who wants to make it…" (2001, ix).

Recently, the distinction has been noted. For example, Merricks (1998) argues that there are no criteria of identity over time. He takes ‘criteria’ fairly strongly in that he rules out some potential criteria as circular, and his conclusion is that any attempt that does not smuggle in identity in some guise will fail to be necessary or sufficient. He carefully distinguishes things that provide evidence for identity or non-identity from criteria. Zimmerman (1998) attempts to provide a criterion of identity for material objects in terms of their constitutent parts.

2.3 Criteria of identity and Leibniz' law

It is a triviality of logic, The Indiscernibility of Identicals, that if two things are identical, i.e., they are the same thing, then they share all of their properties. The converse, The Identity of Indiscernibles, says that if two things share all of their properties then they are identical, i.e., the same thing. This is often called "Leibniz' law". If ‘property’ is understood sufficiently liberally, then the principle is certainly true. b has the property of ‘being identical to b’, and if c also has that property then b = c.

One way of understanding the phrase ‘criterion of identity’ and the claims about sortals and identity is the following:

For any sortal F there is a set of properties φ such that if b and c both are F, then if b and c agree on all of the properties in φ then b = c.

Some attempts to give content to the phrase ‘criterion of identity’ can be understood in this framework. Black (1952) argues that purely internal properties of objects do not suffice; his example is a universe with two spheres which share all of their internal properties, i.e., are the same color, weight, composition, etc. Whether a philosophically interesting and defensible specification of such a set of properties is possible is, in our opinion, an open question; and one which may have different answers for different kinds of sortals. In another direction, Brody 1980 takes the two identity and indiscernibility principles as jointly definitive of identity and consequently argues that no further criteria of identity are required.

3. Identity under a sortal

3.1 Is identity relative?

One of the novel claims in Geach's Reference and Generality was that identity is relative in the strong sense that b and c might be the same F, but not the same G. Geach used the expression ‘substantival’ to characterize the kinds of term F and G are. His ‘substantival’ coincides in many cases with sortals as understood by others, but cannot be entirely the same since he cites ‘gold’ as an example of a substantival, in fact:

we can speak of the same gold as being first a statue and then a great number of coins, but "How many golds?" does not make sense. Thus ‘gold’ is a substantival term, though we cannot use it for counting. (64)

One of the examples he gives is that b might be the same river as c, but not the same water. If some bronze is made into first one statue, then a different one, then the two statues are not the same statue but are the same bronze.

Quine (1964) was critical of Geach's solution to these puzzles and defended the view that there is only one unqualified sense of identity. In each of the problem cases, his strategy was to try to show that one of the statements of the form "same G as" is not a true identity statement. So in the statue example, he might deny that the bronze is identical to the statue and thus the two statements are about different objects. For later stages in the debate between Quine and Geach, see Noonan 2004, Section 3.

Almost all of Geach's examples can with some plausibility be treated by distinguishing more carefully between objects of reference or distinguishing constitution from identity. Thus one might say that the bronze at different times constitutes the two statues but is not identical with them. Whether constitution really is or isn't identity is a matter of continuing debate; for articulations of the two sides see Johnston (1992) and Noonan (1993).

The one example that does not readily lend itself to these approaches is the problem of the Christian Trinity. According to this doctrine, God the father, Jesus and the Holy Spirit are three persons but one God or one substance. Thus they provide an alleged example where b and c are distinct persons but the same substance. We will not enter the debate, which is been conducted for over a millennium, as to whether this doctrine is coherent, but refer the reader to a modern discussion in Cartwright 1987. It is certainly accurate to say that all of Geach's examples are contested.

3.2 Substance Sortals

Wiggins (1967, 1980, 2001) took a line in opposition to both Geach and Quine. Unlike Quine, he argued that identity must always be identity under a sortal, but he disagreed with Geach by attempting to show that two sortals cannot produce conflicting results. His formal argument is as follows:

i. b is the same F as c Assumption
ii. b and c are both G Assumption
iii. if b and c are the same F,
then they have all of the same properties
Leibniz' Law
iv. b is the same G as b Reflexivity
v. b has the property of being the same G as b from iv
vi. c has the property of being the same G as b from iii and v
vii. b is the same G as c from vi

While this is correct, it is contentious whether iii is acceptable. Leibniz' law in its usual formulation says

if b = c, then b and c have all of the same properties

So to invoke Leibniz' law as a justification of iii presupposes that ‘b is the same F as c’ entails ‘b = c’, and that is precisely what Geach denies, or rather, Geach denies that b = c has any sense except relativized to a sortal. Wiggins is aware that Geach denies the principle, but provides the argument as a way of focussing where the disagreement lies.

We saw earlier that the sortals that interest Wiggins, the substance sortals, are a proper subset of the ones Strawson is concerned with. Substance sortals are contrasted with phase sortals; the latter only apply to some temporal segment of the existence of an object, e.g., kitten or tadpole. Substance sortals are also contrasted with restricted sortals, e.g., red table. Wiggins has a detailed theory of the structure of substance sortals, arguing that if any two substance sortals overlap, then either one is a restriction of the other or both are restrictions of some other sortal.

This appears to rule out ‘carnivore’, since both some plants and some animals are carnivorous. This would probably not disturb Wiggins, since he already denies that ‘animal’ is a substance sortal.

It is not to be denied that the words ‘this animal’ suffice to express a rough and ready identification in ordinary contexts of what things are. But this is because ‘animal’ so easily takes on an individuative force from a context and/or some other sortal predicate that is ready to hand. But the designation ‘this animal’ is complemented in all sorts of different ways. In itself it determines no single principle of individuation. (2001, 129)

We said earlier that in contrast with Strawson, Wiggins is concerned primarily with the narrower class of substance sortals. But if we read his account carefully, it emerges that in the end individuation rests with an even smaller class which he calls ‘ultimate’ sortals.

By an ultimate sortal I men a sortal which either itself restricts no other sortal or else has a sense which both yields necessary and sufficient conditions of persistence for the kind it defines and is such that this sense can be clearly fixed and fully explained without reference to any other sortal which restricts it. (1967, 32)

…I shall call xs ultimate sortal concept … the sortal concept which is individuative of x and restricts no other sortal concept. (1980, 65)

The idea is that ‘cat’ and ‘dog’ may both be individuated by the same criterion, so the fundamental criterion is not only associated with them but with a number of other substance sortals that fall under the same ultimate sortal. We know from Wiggins' remarks that ‘animal’ is not a sortal that the ultimate sortal for ‘cat’ and ‘dog’ is somewhere in the hierarchy above those concepts but below ‘animal’. Surprising, given the centrality of this notion, Wiggins nowhere gives an example of what he regards as an ultimate sortal. (At 1980, 123, he does speculate inconclusively that ‘man’ might be the ultimate sortal for Julius Caesar.)

Without more specificity about when principles of individuation are the same and different, the foundation of Wiggins' account is murky. For example, we don't have enough information to determine whether some middle level term such as ‘mammal’ is an ultimate sortal or not.

There are also other problems. Wiggins recognizes his account of individuation of biological kinds in terms of ‘characteristic forms of activity’ does not transfer well to prototypical artifacts. He tries to meet this concern by giving an analysis in terms of function for artifacts such as clocks. However, he seems to assume that there are not problematic intermediate cases between natural kinds and pure artifacts. Many kinds of things, e.g., rivers and lakes, can be either natural or artificial. Or partly artificial as when a river is dredged or a lake enlarged. He provides no account of how these kinds of items are individuated.

Moreover, in his own favorite cases of biology, he remarks

Almost everything that has been said so far has been mainly directed at words standing for the various species of natural substances. The account could be extended and adapted without overwhelming difficulty to predicates of genera, wherever these were still determinate enough to be autonomously individuative. (2001, 86)

Unfortunately, his own favorite examples, ‘elm’ borrowed from Putnam (1976) and ‘frog’ are not terms for species. ‘Elm’ is a genus and ‘frog’ an order. In fact, a quick consultation with a good dictionary will reveal that most biological terms are expressions for some classification above the level of species. Since Wiggins is cautious about extending his account to genera, he may have very few substance sortals by his account.

Yet another problem for species as the model of sortals is that most philosophers of biology now agree that species don't have essences, though there is disagreement among them about the best way to characterize species (Ereshefsky 2002). Somewhat surprisingly, Wiggins himself presents some of the arguments why species don't have essences. He states that species is an

…insecure concept in plant-taxonomy, and threatened even in zoology by such phenomena as ring-species and the imperfect transitivity of the relation interbreeds in the wild with—the operational test of identity of species. (1967, 62)

3.3 Definitions of ‘sortal’

Returning to our distinctions of ways of characterizing sortals, we can begin by repeating the observation that the counting criteria include many more things as sortals than do 3-5:

  1. gives a criterion for the continued existence of an item of that kind
  2. answers the question "what is it?" for things of that kind
  3. specifies the essence of things of that kind

Unless the question is given a more specific technical sense, it would seem that "What is it?" is quite satisfactorily answered by sortals in the broad Strawsonian sense. "A kitten" or a "A red table" both seem reasonable, so without some redistricting (4) can diverge from (3). Evaluating (5) is very difficult since there is no consensus on whether kinds have essences (Quine would say ‘no') and there is no consensus among those who assert the existence of essences as to what they are. Brody (1980), Forbes (1985), Salmon (1981) and Wiggins (1967, 1980, 2001) all have developed theories of essences, the first three relying on possible worlds for the analysis and Wiggins not. For critical discussion of the first and last, see Mackie 1994, and for the other two Robertson, 1998, 2000.

In a different direction, Wiggins in his later writings gives examples to show that criteria of individuation and persistence are insufficient to count objects under a sortal, and thus some expressions meet conditions 3-5 but not 1-2.

…the concept crown gives a satisfactory way of answering identity-questions for crowns. But there is no universally applicable definite way of counting crowns. The Pope's crown is made of crowns. There is no definite answer, when the Pope is wearing his crown, to the question ‘how many crowns does he have on his head (1980, 73; 2001, 75)

In a footnote to the same pages, Wiggins gives a list of other examples of terms which permit individuation but not counting: "wave, volume of fluid, worm, garden, crystal, piece of string, word-token, machine." Wiggins continues by explaining that, on his view, his account does not disagree with Strawson's but corrects and enlarges it. (2001, 75) We find it puzzling that Wiggins dismisses ‘animal’ as a sortal but is willing to include ‘machine’ which seems at least as problematic.

3.4 Abstract sortals

Brown male German shepherd, German shepherd, dog, mammal, vertebrate and animal are all sortals by the counting and individuating criteria, but philosophers have been inclined to identify a most fundamental level among these, some opting for something like the species level, "dog" and others for the most inclusive, "animal". Similarly, prime number over 100, prime number, natural number, rational number and real number all appear to apply to 103, but there is a similar feeling that either natural number or real number are the ‘real’ sortals. However, there is no obvious or natural criterion that has been offered to delineate the appropriate level.

In the cases of non-mathematical abstract sortals, the grammatical trappings of sortals are present but individuation and counting criteria seem unclear. We can ask how many governments Italy has had since 1950, or how many books David Wiggins has written, but it is not evident that we have criteria for answering these definitively.

4. Sortal and individuative terms

Quine's terminology in this area differs from that of Strawson, Wiggins and Geach. In (1960) he uses the expression ‘term that divides its reference’, but in other writings (1969, 1981) he uses the expression ‘individuative word’. In footnote 1 of Quine 1960, p. 90 he says that his expression is equivalent to Strawson's ‘sortal’. Unfortunately, that cannot be exactly true since (1960, p. 91) Quine says that ‘object’ divides its reference, though we have seen ‘object’ is not a sortal by the criteria of Strawson or Wiggins.

Quine does not give an explicit criteria for determining when a term ‘divides its reference’, but some have been proposed on his behalf. Wallace (1965) discusses (though he has some reservations about endorsing) the following principle:

G divides its reference, iff it is never the case that if a is G, a can be divided into two parts which are G

While this characterizes ‘cat’ as a sortal and ‘object’ as a non-sortal, it also excludes some terms that are sortals by the counting criteria, e.g., garden hoses, rocks, piles of snow, sand dunes, amoeba and ice cubes.

An alternative he also discusses is the converse:

G divides its reference just in case whenever a and b are G, the result of putting a and b together is never G.

This will get the easy cases right, as above, but also fails on the same problematic list. (Most of these points were made in Feldman, 1973, where he also explores various other ways of modifying these principles).

The closest Quine comes to an explicit formulation of a characterization is in contrasting indivuative terms with mass terms:

So-called mass terms like ‘water’ , ‘footwear’ and ‘red’ have the semantical property of referring cumulatively: any sum of parts which are water is water. (1960, 91)

By ‘sum’ here he almost certainly means the mereological sum, not the result of physical juxtaposition. This would mean that ‘object’ and ‘space time region’ would not be sortals, but ‘spatio-temporally continuous object’ and ‘space-time region with volume less than x’ are sortals. These results may be consistent with Quine's views given that he has indicated that he accepts ‘object’, but they diverge from the Strawson-Wiggins intent.

In any event, Quine's view of the distinction is much more pragmatic than that of most other writers. For example, in explaining the distinction he says

The contrast lies in the terms and not in the stuff they name. …consider ‘shoe’, ‘pair of shoes’, and ‘footwear’: all three range over exactly the same stuff, and differ from one solely in that two of them divide their reference differently and the third not at all. (91)

Even this is perhaps dubious if we note that by the last criterion ‘object with mass more than 2 kgs’ is not an individuative term since the sum of any two such objects is another such object, whereas ‘object with mass less than 2 kgs’ fails the test since the sum of two such objects sometimes has mass over 2 kg. It is difficult to see any important respect in which the two expressions divide their reference differently.

An example given by Feldman can used to illustrate the somewhat capricious nature of the distinction and its language dependence. He claims that ‘five foot garden hose’ is an individuative term since no part of it is a five foot garden hose, but ‘garden hose’ is not individuative. The latter claim requires some qualification. If being a garden hose requires a coupling on one end and a nozzle on the other, then the halves of a garden hose are not garden hoses. If being a garden hose requires neither a nozzle nor coupling, then each half (indeed each n-th, up to some n) of a garden hose is a garden hose. If being a garden hose requires a coupling but not a nozzle, then one half of a garden hose is a garden hose but the other is not. Although the differences may be important to the gardener, it is difficult to see anything metaphysically deep here.

5. Sortals and logic

5.1 Sorts, sortals and logic

Some philosophers. perhaps most notably (Carnap 1951) have used a concept closely akin to sortals in formulating many-sorted logics. There is a technical point to be explained and a controversy to be discussed in relation to these.

Sometimes in applications of first order logic, i.e., when we are dealing at length with a specific class of interpretations the domain divides into intuitively disparate kinds of objects, e.g, people and numbers. In the usual formulation, one has predicates, e.g., Px and Nx which are true of those kinds of things respectively, and so one translates the English sentence "All numbers are odd" as (∀x)(NxOx) and "Some person is tall" as (∃x)(Px & Tx). In a many-sorted logic distinct variables are used for the different kinds of objects, perhaps m, n,… for numbers and p, q,… for people. In this language combinations of variables with predicates are sometimes restricted so that Nm and Tp are well-formed but Np and Tn are not. If one does not make this restriction then the notation is exactly equivalent to standard first order logic. A many-sorted language is expressively equivalent to a single sorted one which has additional predicates for the various sorts of things. (Cf Quine 1966)

From a purely technical point of view, one can introduce different kinds of variables to reflect any distinction one wants, e.g., there could distinctive styles of variables for even numbers as opposed to odd ones, or for left-handed people as opposed to right-handed. However, Carnap and others who advocated a many-sorted logic for reasons that were more ontological than pragmatic introduced different variables only for what they believed were metaphysically distinct kinds of entities, e.g., numbers, physical objects, sense data. In this respect, there is some parallel with ultimate sortals as discussed above although Carnap does not make an explicit connection with earlier writers.

A related use of many-sorted logic is to provide a kind of translation from second-order logic into a first-order logic. In thise case instead of having second-order quantification over sets (or properties), one stays with a first order language which is supplemented with a predicate true of all and only sets (or properties), a distinct style of variables for those entities, and with a two place relation of either membership or instantiation.

5.2 Logics of sortals

Standard logic treats all predicate expressions alike—the predicates can be interpreted as any subset of the domain of quantification. If any of the claims discussed above about sortals are correct, then the sortal predicates have more properties than do arbitrarily chosen predicates and a more sophisticated logical treatment might provide philosophical illumination. One obvious and agreed on principle is that in general the negation of a sortal predicate is not a sortal. This contrasts with the predicates of standard logic where if F is a predicate, so is ¬F, (not-F). This principle holds regardless of which interpretation of ‘sortal’ you take. Not only is ‘is not a cat’ not a substantive sortal (Wiggins), you cannot count the non-cats since they include dogs, table, molecules, etcetera. However, for two of the other logical operators, disjunction and conjunction, the situation seems more complex. The expressions ‘dog or cat’, ‘apple or orange’ and ‘fork or spoon’ all seem to be well-behaved with respect to counting and identifying; we can easily imagine a city ordinance forbidding homeowners to have more than four dogs or cats. On the other hand, ‘dog or natural number’ and ‘cat or clock’ seem to provide methods of counting but seem unnatural as sortals.

There is a different problem with conjunction (at least on the Wiggins account) having to do with conjunctions that are true of nothing. There is no prima facie problem with counting for expressions such as ‘cat which is a spider’, the result of the count is zero. But on Wiggins' approach that empty expression is a restriction of the ultimate sortals for ‘cat’ and ‘spider’, and thus the account would be committed to a single ultimate sortal of which ‘cat’ and ‘spider’ are restrictions. Thus on Wiggins' account some, but not all conjunctions of sortals are sortals.

Since there are various meanings associated with ‘sortal’, the logical development will depend on which conception of sortal is being formalized.

The first ‘sortal logic’ was developed in Stevenson 1975. Stevenson develops an account in which he says "We use ideas of Geach, Wallace and Wiggins, although we depart from each in certain respects" (186). Although the formalism follows Wallace in some respects, the main ideas seem to be those of Wiggins rather than Geach. Specifically, his theorem 3.4.5 affirms that for any sortals F, G, if b and c are the same F, and b is a G, then b and c are the same G, which is a denial of Geach's thesis of relativity of identity.

Two principles that Stevenson adopts following Wiggins are

  1. For every sortal F, either F is an ultimate sortal, or there is an ultimate sortal G such that F is a restriction of G
  2. If two sortals F and G intersect, i.e., they are both true of at least one object, then there is a common sortal H of which both F and G are restrictions.

Stevenson proves the formal consistency and completeness of his set of axioms. It should be noted that completeness here is with respect to the language used. Since this is a minor adaptation of standard logic, there is no treatment of tense or modality, and thus some essential elements of Wiggins' notion of sortal cannot be expressed, i.e., that if a sortal F applies to b at one time, then it applies to b at all times at which b exists, and that if a sortal F applies to b, then F necessarily applies to b.

Stevenson does not permit combinations of sortal expressions, presumably because there is no easy way to deal with disjunctions and conjunctions of sortals in his formulation. However, a slight complication of his language would suffice to handle the problem. He uses ‘uS’ for the ultimate sortal which governs sortal ‘S’. If instead he introduced a set of letters U′, U″, … for ultimate sortals, he could then superscript sortal expressions to indicate the ultimate sortal that governs them. He could then permit the disjunction of SU and TU since they are governed by the same ultimate sortal, but forbid the disjunction of SU and TU since they are governed by different ultimate sortals.

Cocchiarella (1977) presents a formal language, though no axioms or rules , for a logic of sortals which includes both tense and modal operators. His approach, like Wiggins, considers sortals to be concepts. Unlike Wiggins he gives a definition of ‘sortal concept’: as a socio-genetically developed cognitive ability or capacity to distinguish, count and collect or classify things (1997, 441). He disagrees with Wiggins on both of the principles (i) and (ii) above, arguing that while they may be true for natural kind terms, there are no reasons to believe that there are ultimate sortals of which various artifact sortals are restrictions, nor that every intersection of sortals must fall under an ultimate sortal. Cocchiarella's approach also goes beyond Stevenson's in that it involves second order logic, i.e., it includes quantification over sortal concepts.

Cocchiarella's ideas have been presented in more rigorous formal detail with axioms and consistency and completeness results for second order logic in Freund 2000, tense logic (2001) and modalities (2004). However, neither Cocchiarella nor Freund address the question how to treat logical combinations of sortals. In their formalisms, sortal expressions S can only occur as qualifications of quantifiers, as in ∃xS, which means that there is something which is S, or in the notation from Wiggins

b =S c

which means that b is the same S as c.

6. Concluding summary

A large number of thoughtful philosophers have believed that the category of sortal was philosophically significant and this is a strong indication that there is something important that they are attempting to mark and analyze. However, our dissection of the definitions and discussions suggest that there are numerous distinctions in question and that while these distinctions have significant overlap, they are not identical. It remains to be seen whether the sortal/non-sortal distinction marks one very important difference, or numerous less important distinctions that are related to one another.

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Aristotle, General Topics: metaphysics | change: and inconsistency | Frege, Gottlob | identity | identity: relative | logic and ontology | object | properties | species

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