Roderick Chisholm

First published Mon Dec 8, 2008; substantive revision Fri Feb 13, 2015

Roderick Milton Chisholm is widely regarded as one of the most creative, productive, and influential American philosophers of the 20th Century. Chisholm worked in epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, philosophy of language, philosophy of mind, and other areas. His work constitutes a grand philosophical system somewhat in the manner of Leibniz or Descartes. Chisholm continually refined — and sometimes utterly revised — his views. He was a prolific writer. The bibliography of his written work in [LLP] contains citations of 320 items, including journal articles, reviews, and books. His work in epistemology alone would probably guarantee his position as an outstanding figure in American philosophy. Yet he made major contributions in several areas of metaphysics and ethics as well. As a result, it would be impossible to give a comprehensive account of Chisholm's system in a brief article. Thus, in this article we attempt to present no more than a sketch of some of Chisholm's most distinctive and important views. We do not claim to present his “final, authoritative view” in any area. Nor do we discuss the critical secondary literature concerning his views.

1. Biographical

Chisholm was born in North Attleboro, Massachusetts in 1916. As an undergraduate, he studied philosophy at Brown University where he worked with a number of distinguished philosophers including C. J. Ducasse and R. M. Blake. He received his Ph.D. from Harvard University in 1942. At Harvard, Chisholm worked mainly with C. I. Lewis and Donald C. Williams. Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore visited Harvard during Chisholm's time there and each of them evidently played an important role in Chisholm's development as a philosopher.

After serving in the Army (primarily as a psychological tester) and getting married, Chisholm was employed briefly as a lecturer at the Barnes Foundation in Pennsylvania. An amusing account of Chisholm's experience at the Barnes Foundation can be found in Chisholm's intellectual autobiography in [LLP]. He then returned to Brown as an assistant professor. He remained at Brown for the rest of his long career (aside from periods as visiting professor at Harvard, Graz, Princeton, Chicago, Massachusetts, Salzburg, and several other places). He was Editor of Philosophy and Phenomenological Research from 1980 until 1986. He was then Associate Editor until the time of his death.

As a result of his dealings with Russell and Moore, Chisholm became aware of the work of Brentano and Meinong. His interest in these philosophers eventually led to correspondence with Austrian philosophers and visits to Graz. Several of Chisholm's publications, perhaps especially “Sentences about Believing” and [B&IV], helped to make some of Brentano's leading ideas familiar to American philosophers. In 1972 Chisholm was awarded an honorary doctorate at Graz. He was intrigued to discover that it would now be correct to address him as “Professor Doktor Doktor h. c. Roderick M. Chisholm.”

Chisholm was a tremendously successful teacher of philosophy. His courses, both at the undergraduate level and at the graduate, were always packed with enthusiastic students and colleagues. In spite of his great distinction, he was modest and amusing in the classroom. He enjoyed engaging in animated critical discussion with students, and encouraged his students to present their questions and objections. In many cases these questions led to revisions of the doctrines Chisholm had presented. He was always pleased to receive good criticism, and showed enormous creativity in producing revisions in his attempts to overcome the problems. In his autobiography, Chisholm mentions how delighted he was to have had such eager “refuters” in his classes at Brown as well as at other places where he visited. For a touching discussion of Chisholm's teaching style, see Taylor (1975) .

Chisholm directed about 59 doctoral dissertations, thus making him perhaps the third most prolific producer of philosophy PhDs in American history. Many of his students went on to have distinguished careers of their own. If we consider the class containing Chisholm's students and the students of those students, it becomes obvious that through his teaching, Chisholm influenced a remarkable number of philosophers. In addition, many of Chisholm's colleagues and friends turned their attention to Chisholm's work.

Chisholm published an extraordinary number of journal articles and reviews. A short discussion of some of the most important of these is included below in Section 13. He also edited, co-edited, and translated several works of others. Among the most important of the books written by Chisholm are: Perceiving: A Philosophical Study [PPS], Theory of Knowledge ([TK1], [TK2], and [TK3] for first, second, and third editions), Person and Object: A Metaphysical Study [P&O], The First Person: An Essay on Reference and Intentionality [FP], The Foundations of Knowing [FK], Brentano and Intrinsic Value [B&IV], On Metaphysics [OM], and A Realistic Theory of Categories: An Essay on Ontology [RTC].

Chisholm received a remarkable array of academic honors and awards. He was a Fellow of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, President of the Eastern Division of the American Philosophical Association, President of the Metaphysical Society of America, and a member of many other distinguished councils and boards. He presented important lectures at Oxford, London, Stanford, and elsewhere. A volume of the Library of Living Philosophers is devoted to his work.

Among the books devoted to Chisholm are Analysis and Metaphysics (Lehrer 1975) [A&M], Roderick M. Chisholm (Bogdan 1986) [RMCp], Essays on the Philosophy of Roderick M. Chisholm (Sosa 1979) [EPRMC], and The Philosophy of Roderick M. Chisholm (Hahn 1997) [LLP]. A special issue of the journal Metaphilosophy devoted entirely to Chisholm's work was published in October of 2003.

Chisholm died in Providence, Rhode Island, in January of 1999. Memorial Minutes on Chisholm written by Ernest Sosa appeared in the Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association in May of 1999. Chisholm's intellectual autobiography can be found in “My Philosophical Development” in [LLP]. An earlier version of his intellectual autobiography appears as the “Self-Profile” in [RMCp]. Some readers may be amused by Fred Feldman's Banquet Address from the Chisholm Memorial Conference held at Brown in November, 2000 and available online (see Other Internet Resources).

2. Philosophical Method

Chisholm wrote and taught in a distinctive style that inspired his readers and students. His characteristic methodology was to begin his discussion of a philosophical issue by identifying a few key questions and citing pre-analytic data that an adequate theory should accommodate. In many cases his work began in the Aristotelian fashion with a set of “aporia” or puzzles. He sought to develop a theory that would be adequate to the puzzles. He formulated his theories by first introducing a small number of primitive or unanalyzed terms and then constructing an often elaborate system of definitions and principles all built on these primitives. The final principles and definitions were intended to provide the basis for solutions to the puzzles with which he began. The clarity and elegance of the systems were remarkable, though in some cases critics worried that the primitive concepts were for one reason or another suspect. Chisholm encouraged readers and students to criticize his systems by proposing counterexamples and objections. They were eager to do so, and Chisholm took great joy in revising and improving upon his views in the light of their comments.

Chisholm was well known for his penchant for formulating definitions and subsequently revising them in the light of counterexamples. The authors of the Philosophical Lexicon (see Other Internet Resources) took note of this and accordingly introduced a new technical term of their own:

chisholm, v. To make repeated small alterations in a definition or example. “He started with definition (d.8) and kept chisholming away at it until he ended up with (d.8′′′′′′′′).”

3. Epistemology I — Epistemic Terms, Principles, Foundationalism

Chisholm is perhaps best known for his work in epistemology. Though the details of formulation steadily changed, Chisholm's fundamental position in epistemology remained constant. Chisholm took it as a starting point for his epistemological theorizing that we do have knowledge of the external world. In addition, Chisholm accepted further anti-skeptical doctrines concerning knowledge by memory of the past, and a priori knowledge of some necessary truths. He did not assume that he could refute skepticism. Rather, he understood the central project of epistemology to be the project of showing in detail how it is possible for us to have quite a lot of the knowledge that, in our reflective moments, we take ourselves to have. In adopting this stance, he seems to have been influenced by Moore as well as some of his teachers at Brown and Harvard.

Perhaps the most distinctive element of Chisholm's theory of knowledge is a set of tightly linked epistemic principles. These serve to display the relation between directly evident foundational knowledge and indirectly evident beliefs about the external world, the past, and other matters about which we can have knowledge. In his doctoral dissertation, Chisholm made his earliest attempt to formulate a set of such principles. [PPS] contains a more sophisticated system of principles. In the three editions of [TK] Chisholm presented even more carefully worked out sets of proposed epistemic principles.

When he stated these principles, Chisholm made use of several terms of epistemic appraisal. He appreciated the importance of explaining precisely what each of these terms means. He also appreciated the importance of explaining precisely how they are related. In an effort to explain all this, Chisholm started with a single primitive epistemic concept — this is the concept of greater reasonability, which relates the holding of one propositional attitude toward some proposition with the holding some other propositional attitude toward some proposition. In his discussion of this concept, he pointed out that holding an attitude (belief, denial, withholding) in one proposition could be more reasonable for a certain subject than holding some attitude (belief, denial, withholding) in another proposition. And then, making use of this fundamental epistemic concept (as well as the concepts of belief, refraining and negation), Chisholm defined the concepts of certainty, being evident, being beyond reasonable doubt, being acceptable, and so on.

In [TK1] (22), Chisholm proposed these definitions of some central terms of epistemic appraisal:

p is reasonable for S at t =df believing p is more reasonable for S at t than withholding p.

p is acceptable for S at t =df withholding p is not more reasonable for S at t than believing p.

p is evident for S at t =df (i) p is reasonable for S at t, and (ii) there is no proposition q such that it is more reasonable for S to believe q at t than it is for S to believe p.

Chisholm maintained that there are logical relations among these concepts. Thus, for example, he said that if something is evident, then it is (at least) reasonable. A key necessary condition for knowing a proposition, according to Chisholm, was that the proposition be evident. In some of his early works, Chisholm analyzed knowledge as evident true belief. In subsequent works he modified this in response to the Gettier problem.

Chapter 3 of [TK1] provides a good illustration of Chisholm's way of using these terms of epistemic appraisal in the statement of his epistemic principles. In that chapter, he presents a set of nine epistemic principles. The first of these concerns “self-presenting states”. These are states such as belief, hope, fear and other propositional attitudes, as well as phenomenal states of being appeared to in various ways, as well as states of intending or undertaking to do something. The principle is:

(A) If there is a “self-presenting state” such that S is in that state, then it is evident to S that he is in that state.

Principle (A) would play a central role in a proposed explanation of the possibility of a certain form of introspective knowledge. For example, it would figure in an explanation of how it is possible for a person to know that it now seems to him that he is seeing a doorknob. By itself, (A) has no implications for knowledge of the external world.

Subsequent principles purport to explain further sorts of knowledge. Principle (B) says:

(B) If S believes he perceives something to have a property F, then the proposition that he does perceive something to have F, as well as the proposition that something has F is reasonable for S. ([TK1], 45)

(B) applies only in cases in which S thinks he is seeing, or smelling, or in some other way perceiving something to have F; it does not imply that in such conditions there actually is something that has F, or that it is evident to S that there is something that has F. It implies merely that it is reasonable for S to believe this. Since reasonability is not a sufficiently strong epistemic condition for knowledge, this would not explain how knowledge of the external world is possible. But the next principle may seem to explain this.

(C) If there is a sensible characteristic F such that S believes that he perceives something to have F, then it is evident to S that he is perceiving something to have F, and that there is something that has F. ([TK1], 47)

Principle (C) applies only in cases where F is a sensible characteristic. This would be a feature that is appropriate to one of the senses, or a common sensible. But even when so restricted, (C) seems to be a very strong principle, for it seems to imply that some of our beliefs about objects in the external world are evident — and this would be sufficient for knowledge according to the analysis of knowledge that Chisholm accepted at the time.

However, on the next page Chisholm expresses some serious reservations about (C). He mentions an analogy to statements of prima facie obligation. Such obligations can be overridden. These later remarks suggest that Chisholm had intended (C) to be understood as a principle of merely prima facie evidence. Apparently, then, the real principle is:

(C′) If there is a sensible characteristic F such that S believes that he perceives something to have F, and this belief does not occur as part of some overriding wider situation, then it is evident to S that he is perceiving something to have F, and that there is something that has F.

Principle (C′) is considerably less bold than principle (C). This can be seen if we reflect on what would count as a counterexample to (C). Consider a case in which a person knows perfectly well that he has just taken some hallucinogenic drugs. Suppose he knows the typical effects of these drugs. Suppose he has good reason to believe that there are no unicorns, but now he believes that he is perceiving something to be a unicorn.

Principle (C) seems to imply that it is evident to him that there is a unicorn. Principle (C′) does not have this implication. The fact that the appearance occurs within this wider context defeats its prima facie epistemic status. Although (C′) is less bold than (C), it does help to explain how we can have knowledge of the sensible characteristics of external objects.

Then come three principles about memory:

(D) If S believes he remembers having perceived something to have F, then the proposition that he does remember having perceived something to have F, as well as the proposition that he did perceive that something had F, and the proposition that something was F, is acceptable for S.

(E) If F is a sensible characteristic, and S believes he remembers having perceived something to have F, then the proposition that he does remember having perceived something to have F, as well as the proposition that he did perceive that something had F, and the proposition that something was F, is reasonable for S.

(F) If there is a self presenting state P such that S believes he remembers having been in P, then the proposition that he was in P, as well as the proposition that he was in P, is one that is reasonable for S.

None of these principles would explain how we can have knowledge of the past, for none of these principles implies that beliefs about the past can rise to the status of being evident — and according to Chisholm a person can know a fact only if it is evident for him.

Chisholm wanted to say that we can have knowledge of things beyond those we “see with our own eyes”. These would include things that are confirmed by the evidence of our senses. As a step toward achieving this, he has a principle about such things. The principle makes use of the concept of the empirically acceptable. To find what's empirically acceptable for S, just consider all those propositions that get a rating of acceptable (or higher) by the aforementioned principles. Those are empirically acceptable for S at t. Chisholm does not define confirmation, but assumes we understand it.

(G) If h is confirmed by the set of all things empirically acceptable for S at t, then h is acceptable for S at t. ([TK1], 53)

But note that this raises such things up to the level of acceptability only. This is still not enough for knowledge.

Consider a set of propositions that are logically consistent and independent. No member is entailed by any combination of the others; no member is such that its negation is entailed by any combination of the others. Suppose each member is confirmed by the combination of all the others. Then that set is “concurrent”.

(H) If h is a member of a concurrent set of acceptable propositions for S at t, then h is reasonable for S at t.

Principle (H) serves to raise the epistemic status of acceptable propositions. When they are members of concurrent sets, such propositions become reasonable. This is a coherentist element in Chisholm's foundationalism in [TK1]. But it is still not quite sufficient for knowledge of the external world. For that, Chisholm finally introduces:

(I) If S believes at t that he perceives something to be F, and h is the proposition that there is something having the property F, and h is a member of a set of concurrent propositions each of which is acceptable for S, then h is evident to S at t.

So now we can see how, according to Chisholm at the time of [TK1], knowledge of the external world is possible. Let's take the proposition that there is a doorknob here. How can I know that? Suppose I am looking at, smelling, feeling, and remembering the doorknob. Then via (B) lots of such propositions are reasonable for me. Suppose these all confirm the proposition, d, that there is a doorknob here. Then via (G), d is acceptable. Suppose all of these together with d form a concurrent set. Then via (H), d is reasonable. Suppose I think I am seeing the doorknob, and the proposition that there is a doorknob is a member of a concurrent set of acceptable propositions. Then it is evident to me that there is a doorknob here. If it's true, then I know it. If all these conditions are satisfied, I have knowledge of the external world.

Critics may complain that this set of principles is incomplete and sketchy. (Indeed, in spite of the principles about memory, nothing in this system even purports to explain how someone could have knowledge of the past.) Chisholm has given us no more than a sketch of a possible answer to the question of how empirical knowledge is possible. But it reveals the foundational, coherentist, Chisholmian epistemic principle-ist structure of his thought. All later variants retain these features. What is most distinctive about these principles is that they are not instances of more general logical principles and Chisholm does not claim that they are true in virtue of any facts about causal connections or reliability. They are presented as fundamental epistemological facts.

4. Epistemology II — Other Epistemological Doctrines.

According to Chisholm, epistemology consists of Socratic inquiry into the questions “What can we know?” and “What are the criteria of knowledge?” He thought that a puzzle faces anyone who attempts to answer these questions. It appears that to answer the first question, one needs a criterion to distinguish between things that are known and things that are not known. That is, one needs an answer to the second question. But to have an answer to the second question, he thought, one needs a list of the things one knows so that one can identify the features that distinguish knowledge from its opposite. That is, one needs an answer to the first question. Lacking such an answer, Chisholm feared, one would not be in a position to be confident that any proposed criterion of knowledge was correct. Chisholm calls those who think that they have an answer to the second question that they can use to answer the first “methodists” and those who think that they have an answer to the first question that they can use to answer the second “particularists.” Chisholm himself was a particularist, yet he claimed that he had no argument to offer against methodism or against the view that neither question could be answered without a prior answer to the other. In a number of places he said that the problem of the criterion could be answered only by begging the question.

A final epistemological doctrine for which Chisholm is particularly well-known is internalism. Chisholm characterized internalism in the following way: ‘The internalist assumes that, merely by reflecting upon his own conscious state, he can formulate a set of epistemic principles that will enable him to find out, with respect to any possible belief he has, whether he is justified in having that belief. The epistemic principles that he formulates are principles that one may come upon and apply merely by sitting in one's armchair, so to speak, and without calling for any outside assistance. In a word, one need only consider one's own state of mind’ [TK3: 76]. A crucial implication of this doctrine is that people whose conscious states are alike must be justified in believing the same propositions. Also present in the quoted passage is a related theme concerning the autonomy of epistemology. Chisholm held that epistemologists did not need the assistance of the empirical sciences in answering their purely epistemological questions. In advancing these doctrines, Chisholm took issue with the externalist and naturalistic theories, such as the causal theory and reliabilism, that gained favor with many epistemologists toward the end of Chisholm's career.

5. Metaphysics I — The Nature of Persons

Throughout his career, Chisholm thought and wrote about the metaphysics of persons. His book, Person and Object, contains an extended discussion of the topic and the claims he makes there provide a good illustration of his views about persons. Chisholm maintained that a fully satisfactory metaphysics of persons would have to accommodate certain bits of preanalytic data, or else explain how they can be false. He took these bits of data to be “innocent until proven guilty”. Among these is the notion that persons are genuine objects, and not merely logical fictions. Talk about persons must be taken seriously, and not as a mere figure of speech. Chisholm mentioned further data (which he presented in the first person): (1) I have various beliefs, feelings, desires, attitudes; (2) I have a body; (3) I am intentionally bringing about various things that I could have refrained from bringing about. He went on to affirm past-tense versions of (1)–(3): at various times in the past I had certain other beliefs, etc. Chisholm emphasized a kind of “unity of consciousness” thesis according to which the contemporaneous psychological facts pertain to one and the same thing. Additionally, he thought he was entitled (at least until strong evidence to the contrary is provided) to assume that there is one thing that has beliefs, and also has a body, and also engages in intentional action.

Chisholm argued that many of the alternative conceptions of persons did not conform to the preanalytic data. One prominent alternative is the so-called “Bundle Theory”, which illustrates a strikingly different conception of persons. On this view, there is no thinker of my thoughts, no “owner” of my body, and no doer of my deeds. Instead, there is just a “bundle of perceptions”. The locus classicus of this view is a well-known passage in Hume's Treatise where he says:

For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I never can catch myself at any time without a perception, and never can observe any thing but the perception. When my perceptions are removed for any time, as by sound sleep; so long am I insensible of myself, and may truly be said not to exist. (Treatise of Human Nature

Chisholm points out that this view is in sharp conflict with the preanalytic data since, if taken seriously, it implies that there is nothing that is having the perceptions, or feeling the pains and pleasures. He goes on to claim that Hume's argument for the Bundle Theory is based on a bit of evidence that presupposes (contrary to the theory) that there is an object that is doing the perceiving, and thinking the thoughts. Chisholm points out that Hume mentions occasions on which he enters into what he calls himself; Hume says that on these occasions he stumbles on some particular perception; he says that he never notices anything other than the perceptions. Who or what is this thing that is doing all this entering and stumbling and failing to notice? Is it some single thing? Does it persist through the time of entering and stumbling and failing to notice? If it does, then it is the very thing whose existence Hume seems to be concerned to reject.

Certain forms of materialism have been endorsed by many philosophers. According to some of these theories, each person is to be identified with his or her body. The body is the bearer of both physical and mental properties. The person persists so long as his or her body persists. Chisholm, however, was always uneasy about such theories. One of his most distinctive lines of objection involves the use of some metaphysical distinctions. Consider a ship that persists through successive replacements of parts. First one plank is replaced, then another, until after some time many of the ship's original parts are no longer present. Chisholm describes the situation by saying that at each time that the ship exists, it exists in virtue of the fact that a certain collection of parts exists then. The collection of parts that exists at a moment is an “ens per se” — it exists in its own right; but the ship is an “ens per alio” — it exists in virtue of the fact that some other things exist. Different collections of parts do duty for, or stand in for, the ship at different times. In some cases, a thing has a property at a time in virtue of facts about happenings at other times. Thus, for example, a person might be a widow at a certain time, but that's because of marriages and deaths that happened earlier. Other properties are not in this way "rooted" in facts about other times. With respect to properties that are not rooted outside the times they are had, Chisholm makes an interesting claim about a difference between things that exist in their own right and things that exist in virtue of others. The ship (an ens per alio) has properties at times in virtue of the fact that its stand ins (entia per se) have those properties at those times.

A famous old argument reveals something important about the identity of the ship through time. Suppose a ship (call it “Theseus 1”) was constituted by a certain collection of parts at a certain time long ago. Suppose the parts in that collection were gradually replaced by newer parts. Eventually we find ourselves with a ship (“Theseus 2”) that is the result of all this gradual replacement. It is the apparent “ descendant ” of Theseus 1. Suppose, however, that the cast-off parts were all saved and eventually were reassembled so as to constitute a ship (call it “Theseus 3”). Suppose Theseus 3 contains all and only the parts that constituted the original ship Theseus 1 at the outset. Since Theseus 3 is part-for-part indiscernible from Theseus 1, there is an inclination to identify Theseus 3 with Theseus 1. But since Theseus 2 emerged from Theseus 1 by a series of individually minor replacements, there is also an inclination to identify Theseus 2 with Theseus 1. We cannot consistently give in to both of these inclinations since it is obvious that Theseus 2 is distinct from Theseus 3. Chisholm suggests that the facts in the world leave this somewhat indeterminate. If a case like this were to arise in the real world, we would leave it to the courts to make a determination of which ship is the legitimate successor to the original. If the courts decide that Theseus 2 is the “real” descendant of Theseus 1, then we will have to accept this conclusion for all practical purposes.

When a thing — like the persisting Ship of Theseus — is a logical construction out of more fundamental entities, questions of identity through time become somewhat conventional. Thus Theseus 2 can be identical with Theseus 1 only in a “loose and popular” sense of ‘identical’. In the “strict and philosophical” sense a collection of parts, C1, can be identical with a collection of parts, C2, only if C1 and C2 contain exactly the same parts. In this strict sense, Theseus 2 is not identical with Theseus 1.

At least some of what has been said about the Ship of Theseus holds also for human bodies. Old parts are steadily being replaced by new ones. After a period of time the body may contain little of the stuff that originally constituted it. As a result, the body of an old person may be said to be identical to the childish body with which he started only in the loose and popular sense. This has implications for materialism.

If some typical form of materialism is true, then each person is his or her body. The implication is that an old person may be said to be identical to himself as a child only in a loose and popular sense. If we take this sort of materialism seriously, we will have to say that no person strictly persists through any change of parts. Chisholm finds this incredible. He recalls an argument attributed to C. S. Peirce: suppose you are about to undergo surgery. Suppose you are told that you can save a lot of money by taking the surgery without anesthesia. Instead, you will be given amnesia-inducing drugs that will make you forget the pain afterwards. Still you might be uneasy, since you might fear that the man undergoing the painful surgery will be you. Chisholm then continues:

Suppose that others come to you — friends, relatives, judges, clergymen — and they offer the following advice and assurance. “Have no fear,” they will say. “Take the cheaper operation and we will take care of everything. We will lay down the convention that the man on the table is not you, Jones, but is Smith.” What ought to be obvious to you, it seems to me, is that the laying down of this convention should have no effect at all upon your decision. For you may still ask, “But won't that person be I?” and, it seems to me, the question has an answer. ([P&O]: 111)

Chisholm's Peircean argument has considerable intuitive force. It surely seems to many of us that our persistence through time is not simply a matter of convention. No matter what the courts decide, either the person undergoing the painful surgery will be you, or he won't be you. If this intuition is right, then materialism of the imagined kind is false. For materialism implies that you are an ens per alio, a logical construction. Yet each of us takes himself or herself to be an ens per se.

In several places (e.g., 1991, 168), Chisholm hinted at a modal argument against materialism. He noted that he himself could survive the loss of his hand. Thus, he has this modal property: being such that it is possible for him to exist without the hand that he actually has. But Chisholm contended that his body was identical with the particular collection of human bodily parts that then constituted his body. That collection of parts could not survive the loss of Chisholm's hand. If Chisholm's hand were annihilated, that collection would cease to exist. Thus the collection of parts does not have the property of being such that it is possible for it to exist without the hand that Chisholm actually had. One application of Leibniz's Law implies that Chisholm is not the collection of parts that then constituted his body. The argument clearly presupposes the doctrine of mereological essentialism, according to which if a compound thing W has a certain part P, then W cannot exist without having P as a part.

In yet other places ([P&O], 104), Chisholm pursues another line of thought. Note for example that if a certain ship (an ens per alio) has a property such as the property of weighing so-and-so many pounds at a certain time, it has this property in virtue of the fact that the ens per se that constitutes it at that time actually has that property. The “stand-in” really has the property; the logical construction “borrows” the property from the stand-in. But Chisholm considers himself at a time when he has the property of hoping for rain. He asks whether he himself actually has that property, or whether instead he just borrows it from some stand-in. He dismisses this suggestion, saying that it ‘is not to be taken seriously’. If there are two things present (the persistent Chisholm and the temporary stand in), and each of them is hoping for rain, then surely it is Chisholm himself who more fundamentally has the property and his stand-in who has it derivatively. In this case, Chisholm himself must be an ens per se.

Perhaps persons are somehow simple entities. It might appear that they could be simple bodily substances — perhaps like extra-small versions of the Luz Bone mentioned by Leibniz (in Book II, Chapter xxvii of the New Essays). But Chisholm had defined ‘bodily substance’ as ‘substance with parts’. Thus on his view, there cannot be a simple bodily substances. So if the person is a simple substance, it must be simple and immaterial — a “monad” as Chisholm says.[1]

In “On the Simplicity of the Soul” (1991), Chisholm pursues this Leibnizian line. He identifies a sort of property that he characterizes as “qualitative”. Any such property would characterize substances (rather than other properties, or states, or abstract objects); it would be a property that could characterize a simple thing; it would be an internal (or, as some might prefer to say, “intrinsic”) property of anything it characterized -- thus a thing existing in isolation could have such a qualitative property. Chisholm says that the familiar mental properties that we know ourselves to have (e.g., the property of hoping for rain) are in this way qualitative. So we know that we have qualitative properties. But, as he says, we never know, with respect to any compound thing, that it has any such qualitative property. Thus, there is reason to doubt that we are compound things. We know ourselves to have properties of a kind such that we do not know, of any compound thing, that it has properties of that kind. It's not entirely clear that this argument establishes that people are not compound things. Perhaps it shows only that for all we know we might be simple entities.

6. Metaphysics II — Agency and the Free Will Problem

We like to think that we are sometimes morally responsible for some of the things we have done. It seems natural to suppose that if a person is morally responsible for something he has done, then he could have done otherwise. But there is a puzzle here. Precisely what do we mean when we say of a person who acted in a certain way that “he could have done otherwise”? Chisholm takes this as a fundamental question in the metaphysics of action. It seems to be his way of conceiving of the so-called “free will problem”. He discussed this topic in “Freedom and Action” (1966), “He Could Have Done Otherwise” (1967) and then again in [P&O] as well as in quite a few other papers. It would be very difficult to describe in detail all the twists and turns of Chisholm's constantly evolving views on this topic. Instead, we will focus on some of the more persistent and characteristically Chisholmian points.

Suppose a certain person in fact did not go to Boston this morning, but suppose it seems that he could have done so. We want to say that though he stayed in Providence, he could have done otherwise — he could have gone to Boston. Surely the statement that he could have done otherwise does not mean merely that it is logically possible that he did otherwise, for superhuman and miraculous bits of behavior are logically possible. But we don't want to say, of a person who failed to perform a miracle, that he could have done otherwise. Nor does our statement mean that it is epistemically possible that the person did otherwise. Suppose that this man was confined in Providence, and utterly incapable of getting to Boston on a certain morning. Suppose we know nothing about this confinement. We just know that he remained in Providence. Under these circumstances, while it is epistemically possible for us that he went to Boston, it would not be correct to say that he could have done so. His doing otherwise than staying in Providence was epistemically possible for us, but not possible for him in the way that bears on moral responsibility.

Some have said that ‘can’s are constitutionally iffy. On a simple version of this view, to say that someone could have done otherwise is just to say that if he had chosen to do otherwise, then he would have done otherwise. Chisholm points out ([P&O], 56–7) two reasons why this is wrong. First, suppose the person was capable of traveling in any direction and easily could have gone to Boston; but suppose in addition that he did not know the way to Boston. If he had chosen to go to Boston, he would have ended up in New London. Then it is correct to say that he could have gone to Boston, but incorrect to say that if he had chosen to go to Boston, he would have done so. Secondly, suppose the person is incapable of choosing to go to Boston. Maybe he is overwhelmed with fear of Boston. But if nothing else prevents the trip, it will be correct to say that if he had chosen to go to Boston, he would have gone, but it is incorrect to say that he could have gone to Boston.

Another account of ‘could have done otherwise’ makes use of the concept of sufficient antecedent causal condition. We might think that when we say that someone could have gone to Boston instead of staying in Providence, what we mean is merely that at some earlier time this morning, his trip to Boston was causally indeterminate — there was no sufficient causal condition either for his going to Boston or for his not going to Boston. Chisholm argues against this idea, too. Suppose another person was lying in wait in Chelmsford. Suppose this other person would have freely interfered with our man's travel plans if he had tried to get to Boston. Then it would not be correct to say that the man could have gone to Boston, but it would have been correct to say that there was no sufficient causal condition then in place that would have prevented the trip. The relevant sufficient causal condition would not have arisen until the person lying in wait in Chelmsford had freely interfered.

Thus we have a problem. What do we mean when we say that a person could have done otherwise? Chisholm begins by introducing some concepts that will serve as conceptual primitives in his account. The first of these is a concept that Chisholm calls “causal contribution”. If one event helps to bring about another, then we have one familiar sort of causal contribution. But in other cases it is not an event, but a person, who causally contributes to some event (1966, 284). A case (if there are any) in which a person causally contributes to some event would be described as an instance of “ agent causation ”. Chisholm claims that in an earlier era philosophers would have thought that agent causation is the familiar notion; they would have assumed that event causation is to be explained in terms of it. He recognized that at the time of his writing the priority relation between the concepts had probably reversed.

The second concept that Chisholm employs is the concept of undertaking or endeavoring. This is an irreducibly teleological concept. It introduces the notion of purpose, or aim. Chisholm makes use of this undefined expression: ‘S makes B happen in the endeavor to make A happen’. Suppose, for example, that a man dials a certain telephone number intending thereby to make a certain phone ring in Los Angeles. (Recall that Chisholm started working on this material back in the 1960s. Telephones had dials in those days.) Let Smith be the man; let B be the state of affairs that consists in Smith's dialing the phone; let A be the state of affairs that consists in the phone's ringing in Los Angeles. Then it would be correct to say, using Chisholm's undefined technical term, that Smith made B happen in the endeavor to make A happen.

From the fact that Smith thus endeavored to make the phone ring, it does not follow that phone actually rang. Maybe it was off the hook. Thus endeavor has a certain intentional aspect. Furthermore, assume that the telephone in Los Angeles is in fact the only purple phone in the Area Code. Even if Smith dialed in the endeavor to make that phone ring, it does not follow that he dialed in the endeavor to make the only purple phone in the Area Code ring. Maybe Smith didn't know the color of the phone; maybe he didn't care about making purple phones ring. So the concept of endeavor has a further intentional feature.

Chisholm then introduces an element of indeterminism: suppose that at a certain time there is no sufficient causal condition for a person to endeavor to bring about p; suppose in addition that there is then is no sufficient causal condition for him to fail to endeavor to bring about p. Then Chisholm wants to say that he is free to endeavor to make p happen.

In some such cases a person might be free to endeavor to bring about a certain state of affairs, and furthermore if he were to endeavor to bring it about, he would succeed. Such things are directly in a person's power. Chisholm notes that he is thus making the concept of power “constitutionally iffy”.

In other cases a person might not have a certain state of affairs directly in his power, but there might be a sequence of things, <p, q, r, s> such that he has p directly in his power, and if he were to bring about p, he would then have q directly in his power, and if … he would have s directly in his power. In such a case, the person has s indirectly in his power.

With these concepts in place, Chisholm is prepared to answer the question with which he started. Suppose again that a certain person did not travel to Boston this morning. To say that he could have done otherwise — that he could have traveled to Boston this morning — is just to say that as of this morning, going to Boston was either directly or indirectly in his power. Chisholm claims — with some plausibility — that this account of the meaning of ‘he could have done otherwise’ explicates what those who believe in freedom have in mind when they say that someone could have done otherwise. Furthermore, in virtue of various technicalities of the definitions, it apparently turns out that Chisholm's account of the meaning of ‘he could have done otherwise’ is adequate to all the cases that prove difficult for theories such as the ones surveyed above.

One essential element of Chisholm's view is the idea that there is a distinction between event causation and agent causation. In cases exclusively involving event causation, everything that causally contributes to an event is another event. In cases involving agent causation, among the things that causally contribute to an event is a person. In virtue of this feature, Chisholm's view is generally categorized as a form of libertarianism. Another essential element of his view is the idea that when a person acts freely, he does something for which there is no event or state or combination of events or states that is a sufficient causal condition for his doing it. (There is also no event or state that is a sufficient causal condition for his failing to do it, obviously.) In virtue of this feature of his view, it may be seen as incorporating an element of indeterminism.

7. Metaphysics III — The Ontology of Events, States of Affairs, and Facts

Consider the following list of kinds of things:

  1. Concrete, individual objects, or “substances”
  2. Properties, attributes, qualities, relations
  3. Times
  4. Places
  5. Propositions
  6. Concrete, individual events, or “happenings”
  7. Facts
  8. Sets

We can imagine a metaphysician making a grand claim about this list. He could say that there really are things in each of those eight categories. Furthermore, he could say, there is no redundancy in the list: there is nothing that belongs in more than one of the categories. Finally, this metaphysician could claim that the list is complete: everything that exists falls into one or another of the categories in the list. In this way our metaphysician would have endorsed a fairly robust ontological scheme.[2]

Throughout quite a long period of time, Chisholm would have maintained that the imagined ontological scheme violates Occam's Razor, since it affirms the existence of more fundamental kinds of things than we really need. More specifically, he would have thought that he could accomplish considerable pruning by replacing three of these proposed categories with a single new category — “states of affairs”. He thought he could explain all talk of propositions (category 5) by appeal to states of affairs of a certain sort. Similarly, he thought he could explain all talk of concrete events (category 6) by appeal to states of affairs of a different sort. Facts (category 7) would turn out to be nothing more than true propositions.

Underlying Chisholm's efforts here was a methodological view about ontological commitment. Suppose there is a certain statement that we take to be true; suppose that statement seems to require the existence of entities of a certain type. We then must admit entities of that type into our ontology unless we can find a way of paraphrasing the statement in such a way as to preserve our original meaning, but to avoid any implication of the existence of the entities in question. As Chisholm puts it:

… from the fact that a true sentence seems to commit us to a certain type of thing it does not follow that there is in fact that type of thing. For perhaps what the sentence tells us can be re-expressed in such a way that it no longer even seems to commit us to the type of thing in question. ([P&O], 116)

Thus, Chisholm undertook to provide paraphrases for sentences about concrete events, propositions, and facts. In each case, he provided a paraphrase that involved states of affairs (and some other items, such as times). But since the project turns crucially on various claims about states of affairs, Chisholm took special pains to explain precisely what he took a state of affairs to be.

As examples of states of affairs, Chisholm mentions such things as the author of Marmion being knighted and the author of Waverly being knighted. Chisholm takes these to be two different states of affairs; each of them existing necessarily; neither of them depending for its existence on the existence of any contingent thing. Thus, each of these states of affairs would exist even at a possible world in which there is no author of Marmion or Waverly. Furthermore, according to Chisholm, states of affairs may occur, obtain, or take place. They serve as the objects of such attitudes as belief, hope, and mere consideration. Some of them serve as causes and effects. In affirming the existence of states of affairs, Chisholm took himself to be aligned with Frege (who, according to Chisholm, used the term ‘Gedanke’ for entities of this sort).

Chisholm did not want to define states of affairs as things that can possibly occur, since he thought that some of them could not possibly occur. So he proposed instead to say that p is a state of affairs if and only if it is possible that there is someone who accepts p. Even if it's impossible for p to occur, it is still possible for there to be someone who accepts it. As Jaegwon Kim pointed out, there is something a bit odd about the fact that Chisholm attempted to define ‘state of affairs’ at all, since this is supposed to be a fundamental item in his ontology. Furthermore, as Kim also pointed out, the definition is of questionable value, since there is considerable disagreement about the nature of the items that we “accept”. Some take them to be sentences; others may take them to be mental items of some sort.[3] Chisholmian states of affairs are presumably intended to be neither linguistic nor psychological.

For Chisholm, entailment is not a merely logical notion. If p entails q, then not only does p logically imply q, it must also be the case, necessarily, that whoever accepts p also accepts q. Chisholm makes use of this distinctive “intentional” concept of entailment to explain the identity conditions of states of affairs. Where p and q are states of affairs, p is the same state of affairs as q if and only if p entails q and q entails p. This explains why Chisholm said that the state of affairs of the author of Marmion being knighted is distinct from the state of affairs of the author of Waverly being knighted, even if the author of Waverly happens to be the author of Marmion. So, for Chisholm, states of affairs are very fine-grained entities.

Consider the state of affairs that is expressed by the sentence ‘Someone is walking’. Chisholm wanted to say that this state of affairs occurs whenever someone walks, and fails to occur at times when no one is walking. Other states of affairs are not like this. For them, it is impossible to sometimes occur and sometimes fail to occur. Chisholm claims that this provides the opportunity for an ontological reduction. We can define a proposition as a state of affairs of this latter sort — it is impossible for there to be times when it occurs and other times when it does not occur. A true proposition is thus one that occurs; and a false proposition is one that does not occur. Chisholm thinks that we may understand the principles of logic to be about these propositions. By saying that a fact is a true proposition, Chisholm gains yet another ontological reduction ([P&O], 123).

Chisholm thought that in some cases it makes sense to speak of the location at which a state of affairs occurs. Suppose John walks in Chicago at a certain time. Then Chisholm would be willing to say that the state of affairs of John's walking occurs in Chicago and at that time. Furthermore, some states of affairs entail certain properties. The state of affairs of John's walking entails the property of walking because (i) if the state of affairs occurs, then something has the property of walking, and furthermore, whoever accepts the state of affairs believes that something has the property. This gives Chisholm the ammunition he needs to explain what an event is and thereby to effect another ontological reduction.

Among states of affairs, there are some that (i) occur, and (ii) are not propositions. Furthermore, among these states of affairs, some (iii) entail contingent intrinsic properties that may be exemplified only by individual things.[4] Chisholm says that an event is a state of affairs that satisfies all of these conditions. These are intended to play the role in Chisholm's ontology that concrete individual events play in the ontologies of philosophers who accept concrete events as fundamental entities.

This way of conceiving events yields certain (possibly surprising) results. For one, every event occurs. For another, events happen at times and places. Furthermore, as Chisholm sees it, when an event occurs, there must be some individual thing or things somehow participating in the occurrence of the event. These are the things that have the properties entailed by the event. The event is said to be “concretized” by those things. Finally, events may recur. John's walking occurs when and where John walks; it occurs only if John has the property of walking. It can occur on many different occasions and in many different places. It may be an effect of some causes, and it may be a cause of some effects. Chisholm goes on to discuss the role of events in perception, causation, and explanation.

He presents an ingenious system for counting events (“John was injured while taking his third walk of the day”) that makes use of the concepts of time, place, and concretization. Chisholm's efforts in this project were described by one of his philosophical opponents as “breathtaking” (Davidson 1970, 31).

We can see, then, that around the time of [P&O], Chisholm probably would have accepted an ontological scheme more like this:

  1. Concrete, individual objects, or “substances”
  2. Properties, attributes, qualities, relations
  3. Times
  4. Places
  5. States of affairs (some of which are event-like; some of which are proposition-like; and some of which are fact-like)
  6. Sets

As time went by, Chisholm became dissatisfied with this picture. One main source of difficulty, as he saw it, was the commitment to times. Furthermore, in spite of their utterly central place in this ontology, he began to feel uneasy about states of affairs. Some of his concern evidently arose as a result of conversations with his colleague Jaegwon Kim, who had developed a different theory of events. On Kim's theory, if we have a suitable object a, property F, and time t, and a has F at t, then there is an event, a's having F at t. An event is the having of a property by a thing at a time.

In his paper “Events without Times: An Essay in Ontology” (1990), Chisholm presented a new and even more sparse ontological scheme. As the title indicates, times were banished. Furthermore, states of affairs disappeared, replaced by the new category of states. A Chisholmian state is in some ways like a Kimian event. If we have a suitable contingently existing object, a, and we have a suitable property, F, then, if a actually has F, then there is the state a's being F. A state such as this is an event. If a doesn't have F, then there is no such state. There are no non-occurring states.

There are several things to note about these events:

First, Chisholm uses the terms ‘substrate’ and ‘content’ to indicate the object and property involved in an event. The substrate must be a contingently existing thing. The content must be a property that the substrate has contingently. Each event is said to have its substrate and content essentially. So if there was such an event as Plato's writing of the Republic, then that event essentially involved Plato and the property of writing the Republic. The event itself could not have occurred with a different substrate or content. Nor could it have failed to have its “categorial” property of being an event.

Second, since Chisholm has banished times from his ontology, there are no times in a Chisholmian state. In this respect, Chisholm's view differs from Kim's. This might seem to leave open the possibility that a Chisholmian state could occur for a while, then stop occurring, and then start occurring again. If a state could do such a thing, then states would be relevantly like the now-banished states of affairs. But Chisholm denies this possibility. He says that if he was reading earlier, then stopped reading, and then started reading again, we have two distinct states with Chisholm as substrate and reading as content. Since there are no “times” Chisholm is careful to avoid saying that what distinguishes these two states is their time of occurrence. When we say, informally, that an event recurs, all we mean is that its substrate has had its content before.

Third, by the time of “Events without Times”, Chisholm had become a presentist. He also was taking tense very seriously. To say that there is such a thing as x is equivalent to saying that there is such a thing as x now. On this view it would be wrong to say that there is such a thing as Socrates; equally, it would be wrong to say that Socrates is such that he formerly existed but no longer does. Nevertheless, Chisholm constructed ingenious (sometimes convoluted and unintuitive) paraphrases that enable us to say everything we need to say about Socrates and others no longer among us.

So the new ontological scheme looks more like this:

  1. Concrete, individual objects, or “substances”
  2. Properties, attributes, qualities, relations
  3. States; some of which are event-like
  4. Sets

[OM] contains a final summing up of Chisholm's metaphysical system. In [OM] Chisholm pares away still further. Among other things, he proposes to get rid of sets in favor of attributes.

8. Metaphysics IV — Brentano's Thesis

Consider the statement that John is thinking about a unicorn. This could be true even if no unicorn actually exists. But surely John is thinking about something. His mind is not simply a blank. Some philosophers have wanted to say in such a case that there is an object — in fact, a unicorn -- about which John is thinking, but that this object is one that has “intentional inexistence”. It exists merely as an object of thought. In Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, Brentano said that every psychical phenomenon is characterized by “intentional inexistence”. He went on to say that this intentional inexistence is “exclusively peculiar to psychical phenomena. No physical phenomenon shows anything similar”.

Brentano's Thesis not entirely clear, but its importance should be obvious. Suppose that every psychological fact somehow involves something with intentional inexistence (however precisely this is to be construed). Suppose that no physical fact involves a thing with intentional inexistence. Then it would follow that no psychological fact can be identified with a physical fact; one version of the psycho-physical identity theory would be false; physicalism of some popular varieties would be untenable.

Chisholm was fascinated by Brentano's Thesis. He published a series of papers on the topic, starting in 1952 and carrying on until at least 1981. In his papers Chisholm formulated precise versions of Brentano's thesis. Each paper provoked critical reaction from other philosophers. Since in some cases the criticisms were cogent, Chisholm was motivated to develop new and more ingenious versions of the Thesis.

Tracing all the different ways in which Chisholm attempted to formulate Brentano's Thesis would require a book-length discussion. Instead, we here focus on one illustrative example. In Chapter 11 of [PPS], Chisholm developed a version of Brentano's Thesis that turned on the notion of an intentional sentence. He identified three marks of intentionality. Any noncompound sentence that manifested one of these marks would be identified as an intentional sentence. The first mark of intentionality recalls Brentano's idea of intentional inexistence. Consider the sentence ‘John is thinking about the Loch Ness Monster’. Neither this sentence nor its negation entails either that the Monster exists or that it does not exist. Any such simple declarative sentence is intentional.

The second mark of intentionality is closely related, but involves whole propositional clauses rather than mere singular terms. Consider the sentence ‘John wonders whether there is a monster in Loch Ness.’ Neither this sentence nor its negation entails either that there is a monster in Loch Ness or that there is not such a monster. Any simple sentence that displays this feature is also intentional.

The third mark of intentionality involves the failure of substitutivity for coextensive singular terms. In fact Eisenhower was the man who would succeed Truman as President of the United States. However, from the fact that we knew that Eisenhower was in command of the Army, it does not follow that we knew that the man who would succeed Truman was in command of the Army.

These three marks of intentionality apply only to noncompound sentences. A compound sentence counts as intentional if and only if one of its components is intentional. Thus, ‘if Parsifal sought the Holy Grail, then he was a Christian’ is intentional because its antecedent is intentional. The antecedent carries the first mark of intentionality because neither it nor its negation entails either that the Holy Grail exists or that it does not exist.

Chisholm then says — somewhat cautiously — that a thesis “resembling that of Brentano” may be stated in this way: we can express all of our beliefs about physical phenomena without the use of intentional sentences; but when we describe psychological attitudes, then we must either use intentional sentences or else make use of other terms that are not needed for the description of physical phenomena. In his discussion, it appears that when Chisholm speaks of ‘terms that are not needed for the description of physical phenomena’ he has in mind terms that are ultimately definable only by the use of intentional sentences.

Chisholm recognizes that we sometimes use intentional sentences to describe nonpsychological facts. For example, consider the sentence ‘This weapon, suitably placed, is capable of making it be the case that Boston is destroyed.’ Neither that sentence nor its negation entails either that Boston is destroyed or that Boston is not destroyed. So it carries the second mark of intentionality. But it seems not to be psychological. Chisholm claims that we can rephrase the sentence nonintentionally: ‘If this weapon were suitably placed, then Boston would be destroyed.’ This is a compound sentence. Reflection will reveal that neither component carries any of the marks of intentionality. (The critic may wonder whether this reply is entirely satisfactory, since it may seem that the paraphrase does not mean precisely what the original meant.)

Another difficult class of sentences involves statements of probability. Consider this example cited by David Sanford: ‘It is not probable that Providence will be hit by a comet in the 21st Century’. Neither this sentence nor its negation entails either that Providence will be hit or that it won't be hit; thus the sentence carries the second mark of intentionality. Yet it seems to be nonpsychological.

At the time of [PPS] Chisholm already recognized that this formulation of Brentano's Thesis was problematic. He mentioned ‘sentences describing relations of comparison’ as a difficulty. Consider the sentence ‘This lizard looks something like the Loch Ness Monster’. Neither that sentence nor its negation entails either that the Loch Ness Monster exists or that it does not exist. Yet there seems to be nothing psychological about the statement that the lizard looks something like the Monster.

Over a period of more than thirty years, Chisholm formulated and reformulated Brentano's Thesis. Perhaps the most insightful discussion of his views and their connections can be found in David Sanford's ‘Chisholm on Brentano's Thesis’. In reply to that essay, Chisholm said, ‘Anyone who wants to understand what I have been up to in trying to formulate criteria of intentionality, should read Sanford's paper’ ([LLP], 215).

9. Metaphysics V — “Chisholm's Paradox”

Chisholm's paper “Identity through Possible Worlds: Some Questions” was the lead article in the first issue the new journal Noûs in 1967. In that article, Chisholm presented an argument that provoked a remarkable amount of discussion and debate. A variant of the argument was subsequently presented in Chisholm's “Parts as Essential to Their Wholes”, which was Chisholm's Presidential Address at the Metaphysical Society of America in 1973. This essay corresponds closely to Appendix B of [P&O]. The puzzles presented in those papers have come to be known as versions of “Chisholm's Paradox” (though it must be pointed out that the term ‘Chisholm's Paradox’ is also widely taken to refer to the problem about contrary to duty imperatives that is discussed below in Section 11).

Chisholm's target in the 1967 paper was a popular collection of views about the metaphysics of modality. Many philosophers — going back perhaps to Leibniz — seem to presuppose these views in their discussions of necessity and possibility. The central doctrine is that there are many possible worlds. The actual world is just one among them, distinguished by the fact that what happens here is what actually happens. To say that a statement is true is just to say that it is true at the actual world. To say that a statement is possible is just to say that it is true at some possible world. To say that a statement is necessary is just to say that it is true at every possible world. Thus we have an account of de dicto modality.

On one typical construal, it is assumed that an individual who exists here at the actual world also exists at many other possible worlds. When we say that a certain individual actually has a certain property, we mean that he has that property at the actual world. To say that he possibly has that property is just to say that he has that property at some possible world. To say that he necessarily has that property is just to say that he has that property at every possible world where he exists at all. This gives us an account of de re modality. But it also generates questions.

Chisholm imagines that Adam and Noah exist here in the actual world, w1, and that each of them has his own collection of properties. He assumes (following Genesis 5) that Adam actually lives to the age of 930 years, whereas Noah lives to the age of 950 years. Chisholm asks us to imagine a nearby possible world in which Adam lives one more year, dying at age 931 instead of 930, and in which Noah lives one year less, dying at age 949 instead of 950. By imagining further similar one year alterations in life-span, we finally reach a possible world in which Adam lives to the age of 950 and Noah lives to the age of 930. Thus, in that world Adam and Noah have “swapped ages”. In that world Adam has the age that Noah has in w1, and Noah has the age that Adam has in w1.

Chisholm then continues by imagining a series of worlds in which Adam and Noah gradually swap letters in their names. This series ends with a world in which they have “swapped names” altogether. In that world, Adam is called ‘Noah’, and Noah is called ‘Adam’.[5] Going still further, Chisholm imagines a world, wn, in which Adam and Noah have swapped all their qualitative properties, so that in wn Adam has all the properties that Noah has in w1, and Noah has all the properties that Adam has in w1. Then Chisholm asks a series of tough questions:

Should we say of the Adam of wn that he is identical with the Noah of w1 and should we say of the Noah of wn that he is identical with the Adam of w1? In other words, is there an x such that x is Adam in w1 and x is Noah in wn, and is there a y such that y is Noah in w1 and y is Adam in wn? And how are we to decide? … aren't the two Adams, the two Noahs, and the two worlds indiscernible? Could God possibly have had a sufficient reason for creating w1 instead of wn? (21)

Chisholm extends the example. He points out that what has happened to Adam and Noah could happen to anyone. Let us say that a person's “role” in a world is defined by the set of qualitative properties he has there. We can say that a possible world, ws, is a “role swapping world” of the actual world, w1, just in case the roles being played in ws are precisely the same as the roles being played in w1, but at least some of those roles are being played in ws by someone other than the person who plays the role in w1. Role swapping worlds will therefore be indiscernible from each other and from the actual world except for the bare identities of the individuals playing the roles. Chisholm says:

… there may be good ground for the existentialist's angst; since, it would seem, God could have had no sufficient reason for choosing the world in which you play your present role instead of one in which you play mine. (21)

Chisholm's remarks strongly suggest that he takes these questions to indicate that there is something deeply problematic about the notion that the same individual can exist in different worlds with different qualitative properties. Once we accept this notion, we seem to be on a path that will eventually lead us to the conclusion that there are indefinitely many worlds each of which is qualitatively indiscernible from the real world, but differing from it only in the identities of the individuals playing the various roles. Such a plurality of worlds seems undetectable and pointless.

In “Parts as Essential to Their Wholes” (1973), Chisholm presents a structurally similar argument for a similar point. In this case, however, Chisholm's target is a doctrine that he calls ‘complete, unbridled mereological inessentialism’. This is the view that nothing has its parts essentially — anything that's made of parts could have been made of different parts.

Chisholm starts his argument by sketching some outlandish examples, but then he turns to a familiar case. He asks us to consider a pair of tables, x and y. Each table is made of smaller parts. Just as he did in the case of Adam and Noah, Chisholm imagines a series of small changes. Instead of gradual changes of properties, he here imagines gradual changes of parts. First, he describes a possible in world in which x and y have exchanged one small part. Then he describes further possible worlds in which more small parts are exchanged. At last we reach a possible world in which x and y have exchanged all their parts: everything that is actually a part of x has now become a part of y; and everything that is actually a part of y has now become a part of x.

It's not hard to see why Chisholm finds this example perplexing. For we have arrived at a world at which the table that is identified as x is composed of all and only the parts that in fact compose y; and the table that is identified as y is composed of all and only the parts that in fact compose x. Is this world in fact distinct from the actual world? What possible basis is there for saying that the table composed of the x parts is y? Why isn't that table x? It is partwise indiscernible from the actual x.

Chisholm concludes this discussion by saying that ‘these reflections, on the consequences of extreme mereological inessentialism, may suggest to us that some version of mereological essentialism must be true…’ (69). In the remaining pages of the paper Chisholm presents a view according to which extreme mereological essentialism is true — but only for what he calls “primary objects”. Ordinary or “vulgar” objects such as tables and ships are not primary objects. Each such vulgar object may be understood to be a gradually evolving sequence of primary objects. The vulgar object is constituted by different primary objects at different times. Vulgar objects can gain and lose parts across times and possible worlds. Mereological essentialism is not true for them.

Chisholm strongly suggests that he thinks that vulgar objects occupy a decidedly lower rung on the ontological ladder. In a discussion of an example involving a statue and a hunk of metal that temporarily constitutes it, he suggests that we might be content to say that the hunk of metal is a primary object and that this hunk of metal temporarily has the property of being statuesque. In the strict and philosophical sense, it would be acceptable to say that there really is no such thing as “the statue”. Yet another possible view would maintain that the statue is merely a mode of the hunk of metal. This too would diminish the ontological status of the statue, though it would not banish the statue entirely. This latter “modal” view is explicitly defended in Chisholm's 1986 “Self-Profile” in [RMCp].

Chisholm discussed these problems in a number of papers and chapters. He did not always defend precisely the same combination of views, but certain elements seemed to persist. He steadily maintained a commitment to mereological essentialism for ontologically fundamental physical objects; he tried in various ways to account for facts about persistence, enumeration, and reidentification of ordinary objects by appeal to what he took to be ontologically more fundamental facts about real “substances”. Chisholm's work on these topics was remarkably provocative. Some have suggested that David Lewis's development of counterpart theory was intended (among other things) to provide a metaphysical account of the structure of possible worlds that would avoid the strange implications that Chisholm described.

10. Ethics I — Intrinsic Value, Defeat, Theodicy

A reader starting out with [B&IV] for the first time might not anticipate how it is going to end. Indeed, even as the reader patiently works his way through definitions, principles, remarks about what Brentano might have said, etc., the eventual point remains in the background. Nevertheless, as becomes clear in the final pages, the book as a whole may be seen as one long argument for a distinctive solution to the problem of evil.

Chisholm starts by explicating some of Brentano's idiosyncratic metaphysical views. Soon, however, Chisholm turns to some central ethical doctrines. Perhaps the first among these involves the introduction of the concept of correctness. In the first instance, we think of certain judgments as being correct. Thus, for example, suppose it now seems to me that I am seeing something red. If I judge that I am now seeing something red, it will be clear to me that my judgment is correct. If another person judges that I am not seeing something red, it will be clear to me that his judgment is incorrect. A similar thing could happen in the case of a judgment to the effect that all squares are rectangles. If I make that judgment with full understanding of the concepts of squareness and rectangularity, it will be clear to me that my judgment is correct. Brentano evidently made use of this concept of correct judgment in an attempt to explain the notion of truth.

Chisholm claims that Brentano extended the application of the concept of correctness so that it would apply to emotions as well. On Chisholm's view, emotions are analogous to judgments in certain ways. Corresponding to the notion of affirmation or “positive judgment” we have the notion of love, or positive emotion. Corresponding to the notion of denial we have the notion of hatred, or negative emotion. In addition, there is the concept of preference. If I love one thing and hate another, then I prefer the one to the other. Similarly if I love one thing and am neutral about (neither loving nor hating) the other, then I prefer the one to the other. And if I am neutral about one thing and hate the other, then I prefer the one to the other. So we have the concept of preference as well.

Suppose I feel some pleasure. Suppose I love the fact that I am feeling that pleasure. Suppose my love of this pleasure is intrinsic — I love the pleasure “in and for itself”. If I reflect on this situation, I may recognize that my love is correct. This seems to mean, roughly, that I can see that it is appropriate, or fitting, for me to feel this strong pro-attitude toward this experience. The feeling of pleasure deserves, or merits, this sort of positive emotional reaction. If another person were to hate that pleasure, or were to feel an equally strong anti-attitude toward it “in and for itself”, his hatred would be incorrect. We can just see that a feeling of pleasure does not deserve this sort of negative emotional reaction.

Chisholm prefers to formulate these claims about the fittingness of certain emotional reactions to certain objects by appeal to a fundamental concept in his ethics. This is the concept of requirement. Instead of saying that it is correct, or fitting, to have a certain emotional reaction to a certain object, we can say that contemplation of that object requires that emotional reaction. With these concepts at our disposal, Chisholm suggests, we can define all the central concepts of ethics ([B&IV], 53).

To say that one thing A is intrinsically better than another thing B, according to Chisholm, is just to say that, for any person, x, contemplation of just A and B by x requires that x prefer A to B. Consider the fact that there are stones. While of course we might be glad that there are stones in virtue of their usefulness, it would not be correct to love this state of affairs for its own sake. Mere contemplation of this state of affairs does not require either love or hate. It seems to be intrinsically neutral. An intrinsically good thing is one that is intrinsically better than a neutral thing; an intrinsically bad thing is one such that an intrinsically neutral thing is intrinsically better than it. Thus according to Chisholm we may define intrinsic goodness, badness, and neutrality entirely in terms of preference and requirement.

In some cases a complex state of affairs contains some good parts and some bad parts. We can assign positive numbers to the good parts and negative numbers to the bad parts in order to represent their respective amounts of intrinsic value. The intrinsic value of the whole state of affairs may just be the sum of the values of those parts. In such cases Chisholm would say that the positive value of the good parts is “balanced off” by the negative value of the bad parts.

In other cases the interaction among the parts is not in this way just a matter of summation. Chisholm asks us to compare two cases. In Case 1, I take pleasure in what I take to be Smith's pleasure. In Case 2, I take an equal amount of pleasure in what I take to be Jones's pain. So here we are comparing two instances of pleasure. Imagine that they are alike in what we may call the “raw amount” of pleasure involved. They differ in that one is pleasure in something good whereas the other is pleasure in something bad. Chisholm stipulates that the objects of these pleasures (Smith's pleasure and Jones's pain) are “intentional objects” — I take them to be happening, but I may be mistaken. Maybe they are just figments of my imagination.

Following Brentano (and Moore as well) Chisholm assumes that pleasure in the good is extra good, while pleasure in the bad is not so good. In these cases the value of the whole is either greater than, or less than, the sum of the values of the parts. (Since Jones's pain is an intentional object of my pleasure in Case 2, its actual occurrence is not entailed by the fact that I take pleasure in it; hence, according to Chisholm, it is not a “part” of the that larger state of affairs.) As a result, Case 1 is better than Case 2 in spite of the fact that Case 1 and Case 2 contain the same parts, with the same values. The difference in value arises because of the appropriateness of the object of pleasure in Case 1, and the corresponding inappropriateness of the object of the pleasure in Case 2.

Case 2 illustrates what Chisholm calls “the defeat of good”. Case 2 contains a good part and no bad part; but the value of the whole is less than the value of the good part. Somehow, the value of the good part has been defeated without being balanced off.

The defeat of evil would occur in a case in which some state of affairs contains a bad part that is worse than the whole, even though the whole does not contain any good part that balances off the evil of the bad part. Consider Case 3 in which I take pain in what I take to be my bad behavior. The badness of my pain may be mitigated by the fact that the object of this pain is something that requires that pain be taken in it — my own bad behavior. But it is possible that I am mistaken about my bad behavior; maybe it never really happened. Thus, Case 3 does not contain that bad behavior as an actual part. The state of affairs may have no good part to balance off the badness of my pain, and yet it may be, as a whole, not as bad as its worst part. (It may be neutral; or even good.)

In the final five pages of [B&IV], Chisholm turns to theodicy. He raises the question whether an omnipotent, omniscient, and benevolent deity could create a world that contains some things that are intrinsically evil. Standard theistic answers are quickly rejected. (1) We cannot claim that evil is just an illusion, for in the case of pain (for example) it is evident to the one who suffers it that it is genuinely evil. Nor can we say (2) that some evils are required as means to good. For if God is omnipotent, he could find a way to produce the good without making use of the evil means. (3) Some might say that God produces only “positive” states, such as experiences of pleasure. The evil in the world occurs in “negative” states, and these are not due to God's creative efforts. But Chisholm points out that the negation of a good state is neutral, not bad. Furthermore, the actual existence of pain is not a mere negation. It is as “positive” as the existence of pleasure. (4) Some have claimed that God gave us freedom, which we then misused. Thus, it's not God's fault that there is evil in this world. But this “free will defense” is quickly rejected. The problem is that if God is omnipotent, he could have created a different world in which we always freely choose to act in the better way. Surely there must be such a world; surely it must be better than the actual world in which we freely misbehave. Why didn't God actualize a world like that?

Chisholm then sketches his own solution to the problem of evil. He says ‘Some of the evil in the world is necessary for the enhancement of goodness. And the rest of the evil is defeated’ ([B&IV], 100). In a characteristically careful way, Chisholm does not assert that all the evil in this world is actually to be explained in this way. He restricts himself to suggesting that Brentano would have said such a thing, and that the conceptual machinery he has developed shows us how it is possible that the world could contain some evil even though the world was created by an omnipotent, omniscient, and benevolent god. Whether the evil in this world is in fact defeated is another question. Chisholm concludes by saying ‘The wise theodicist, I should think, would say that he doesn't know’ ([B&IV], 102).

11. Ethics II — Contrary to Duty Imperatives

One of Chisholm's most influential critical papers in ethics is “Contrary-to-Duty Imperatives and Deontic Logic”. A number of philosophers had noted the analogy between statements of necessity (e.g., ‘it's necessary that red things are colored.’) and statements of obligation (e.g., ‘it's obligatory that promises are kept.’) They also noted the structural similarities between the alethic modalities of necessity, possibility, and impossibility and the deontic modalities of obligation, permission, and prohibition. It's natural to think that alethic necessity can be understood as truth at all possible worlds. So, by analogy, some suggested systems of deontic logic in which obligation would be understood as truth at all morally perfect worlds. Statements of permission (and prohibition), would be taken to mean respectively truth at some (or no) morally perfect worlds. This generates a straightforward deontic logic.

Chisholm recognized, however, that any system based on those assumptions (and making use of the standard connectives) would be unable to express certain familiar and important facts. Among these is the fact that in many cases our moral obligations depend essentially upon our moral failings. For example, a person might have a moral obligation to apologize for some misbehavior — yet obviously he would not be apologizing in a morally perfect world, since in such a world he would not have misbehaved in the first place. Presumably, there are no apologies in a morally perfect world. If we let ‘O(Smith apologizes)’ express the idea that there is a moral obligation for Smith to apologize, then the imagined semantics would apparently be unable to account for the possibility that the statement could be true. Smith does not apologize for anything at any morally perfect world.

Chisholm sketched a situation in which a person, (we can call him ‘Smith’), had (a) an obligation to go to the aid of his neighbor, (we can call him ‘Jones’). Assuming that it would be best to notify Jones beforehand, Chisholm imagined that (b) Smith also had a conditional obligation to notify Jones in advance if he was going to come to his aid. On the other hand, (c) if he was going to fail to come to Jones's aid, then Smith's obligation would be to avoid telling him that he was coming to his aid. Finally, Chisholm assumed that (d) Smith was going to fail to come to Jones's aid.

There is nothing incoherent or even surprising about the situation Chisholm described, yet there seemed to be no adequate way to express these statements in any extant system of deontic logic. No matter how the obligation operators, material and formal conditionals, temporal restrictions, etc. were juggled, the formal-language sentences simply did not preserve the logical features of the familiar ordinary language sentences. Consider, for example, the following sentences:

(a1) O(Smith goes to the aid of Jones)

(b1) O(Smith goes to the aid of Jones → Smith tells Jones he is coming)

(c1) ~(Smith goes to the aid of Jones) → O(~Smith tells Jones he is coming)

(d1) ~(Smith goes to the aid of Jones).

Chisholm pointed out that in many extant systems of deontic logic, there is a general principle (“deontic detachment”) that would validate the inference from (a1) and (b1) to:

(e1) O(Smith tells Jones he is coming)

While (c1) and (d1) entail:

(f1) O(~Smith tells Jones he is coming)

The conjunction of (e1) and (f1) is a near contradiction, telling Smith that he both has an obligation to warn Jones, and also that he has an obligation not to warn Jones. If we assume that if you have an obligation to do something, then you don't have an obligation to avoid doing it, we can derive an outright contradiction. Other possible representations of the situation fail to preserve other logical features of the original sentences.

Perhaps Chisholm was thinking that this puzzle could be solved by appeal to a system of deontic logic based on the notion of requirement. Maybe he thought that a good way to represent the sentences in question would be to say (a) that Smith had a non-overridden requirement to go to the aid of Jones; but that (b) that if Smith were going to go to the aid of Jones, then this fact would require that Smith notify Jones in advance; and furthermore (c) that if Smith were not going to go to the aid of Jones, then this fact would require that Smith not notify Jones in advance. Finally, there is the stipulation (d) that Smith is not going to go to the aid of Jones. This solution to Chisholm's puzzle would be of greatest interest if it could be shown not only to provide a suitable semantical interpretation for the four cited sentences, but also to pave the way to a complete system of deontic logic adequate for the expression of statements of conditional obligation.

Chisholm's paper had a profound impact. It provoked renewed interest in the logic of obligation. Several philosophers began working on new systems of deontic logic. Many of these new systems incorporated a new idea — conditional obligation. This was intended to provide a formal representation for the thought behind such statements as ‘if you don't do what you ought to do, then you ought to apologize’.

12. Ethics III — The Ethics of Requirement

As we noted above in Section 10, Chisholm offered an account of the concept of intrinsic goodness by appeal to the concept of requirement. In some places, Chisholm defended the idea that a thing is intrinsically good (bad) when contemplation of just that thing requires that the contemplator loves (hates) it. But Chisholm wanted to go much further. In his discussion of these matters in [B&IV] Chisholm remarks:

This way of defining intrinsic value, then, makes use of the concept of requirement. And there is reason to think that the concept of requirement is the central concept of ethics. It yields adequate definitions of the basic intrinsic value concepts. And it has the following advantage as well: It provides a way of reducing the concepts of the theory of value (“axiology”) to those of ethics (“deontology”). ([B&IV], 53)

In a couple of papers, Chisholm tried to show how the central concepts of axiology and deontology can be defined by appeal to this one fundamental concept of requirement. These papers provide beautiful illustrations of one of Chisholm's most characteristic philosophical procedures — the clear definition of a tangle of related concepts by appeal to a small set of undefined primitives. In this instance, he tries to explain confusing and problematic concepts in the realm of ethics. He makes use of just a few undefined concepts. One of them — requirement — seems to carry all of the distinctively normative burden. (It would be interesting to compare Chisholm's efforts on behalf of requirement in ethics with his efforts on behalf of more reasonable than in epistemology. The projects seem to illustrate the same methodological propensity.)

In “The Ethics of Requirement”, Chisholm uses ‘pRq’ to abbreviate ‘p would require q’. The relevant concept of requirement is operative in the statement ‘If I were to promise to meet you for lunch that would require my meeting you for lunch.’ An actual requirement for q comes into being when q is required by something, p, and p actually occurs. Thus, if I actually did promise to meet you for lunch, then there is a requirement that I show up. But even if actual, the requirement is defeasible. It may be overridden. When an action is actually required in this way, it counts at least as a prima facie obligation. If I meet an injured stranger on the way to lunch, and I alone am qualified to tend to his injuries, then this further state of affairs overrides my prima facie obligation to meet you for lunch. In light of this, Chisholm defines all-in, or all things considered, obligation as non-overridden requirement. In other words:

q is all things considered obligatory =dfp(pRq & p occurs & ~∃s(s occurs & ~((p&s)Rq)))

This concept of obligation is not restricted to actions. It is a concept of the “ought to be”. In order to explain the “ought to do”, Chisholm introduces another operator, ‘A’. ‘Ap’ expresses the idea that a person S succeeds in bringing about the state of affairs p. Making use this further expression, Chisholm defines the ought to do by saying that the statement that S ought to bring about some state of affairs p just means OAp.

Once we have a definition of all things considered obligation, it is easy enough to define permission, forbiddenness, and gratuitousness. Chisholm does this in the expected ways.

A person has a prima facie obligation to do something when his doing it is required by something that happens. An all-in obligation arises when there is a non-overridden requirement for him to do it. Chisholm claims that this helps to solve the puzzle about conflicts of obligation. Obviously, there can be conflicts of prima facie obligation. But there cannot be conflicts of all-in obligation.

In addition, Chisholm attempts to apply his conceptual scheme to some other long-standing puzzles in ethics. Among these is a puzzle about supererogatory action. A supererogatory action is supposedly one that is “beyond the call of duty” — something that would be outstandingly good to do, but permissible to fail to do. Consequentialists have a hard time explaining how there could be any such things, since they typically say that duty requires us to do the best we can. How can there be anything “beyond” that? And how could it be permissible to fail to do such a thing, if it is “extra good”?

Chisholm proposes to explain this by saying that a certain action is supererogatory when its “object” absolutely ought to be, but its agent is neither obligated to bring it about nor to refrain from bringing it about. He uses ‘PAq’ to abbreviate ‘S is permitted to bring about q’, where permission is understood to be the absence of obligation to refrain:

S's doing q is supererogatory =df Oq & P~Aq & PAq

In subsequent papers, Chisholm made further claims about the usefulness of his concept of requirement.

13. Evolution and Criticism of Chisholm's Views

Chisholm continued to work on a multitude of philosophical projects over a period of many years. Though his central convictions remained relatively stable, he steadily revised the details of his formulations in light of criticism from others and as a result of his own reconsideration. Thus it is difficult to identify any chapter or paper as containing the final, official version of his view.

Nevertheless, there are several more or less fundamental Chisholmian doctrines. In what follows, we sketch some of these doctrines. For each, we list some things that Chisholm wrote in which he discussed the doctrine in question. We also list some papers by others in which they offer criticism of Chisholm's view.

In epistemology, Chisholm took as his fundamental primitive concept the idea we express when we say that believing p is more reasonable for S than believing q would be. He tried to define other terms of epistemic evaluation by appeal to this one. Furthermore, he assumed that we in fact do know many of the things we take ourselves to know. He thought that a person can be justified in believing many foundational propositions about his own current mental state. He took one of the central projects of epistemology to be the formulation of epistemic principles that would show how we become justified in believing things about the external world, the past, and other problematic things on the basis of this present, internal, self-oriented foundation.

An early formulation of Chisholm's view can be found in [PPS]. Subsequent formulations were presented in the three editions of [TK] as well as in [FK]. [FK] is a collection of essays in epistemology. Some were newly written for [FK], but most were slightly revised versions of articles that Chisholm had already published. [FK] is thus a comprehensive presentation of Chisholm's distinctive views in epistemology.

Three excellent critical discussions are Heidelberger 1969, Foley 1997, and Sosa 1997.

In metaphysics, Chisholm maintained that certain things are genuinely persisting “substances”. Such things literally last through time and survive changes in their properties. Each person is such a being, retaining his or her strict identity over time. On the other hand, ordinary physical objects can be said to persist only in an extended sense. Since it has undergone changes of parts, today's chair is only “loosely identical” with yesterday's chair. Chisholm thought that a complex thing could strictly persist only if it retained all of its parts. Thus, he endorsed mereological essentialism. He thought that persons would have to be ontologically simple in such a way as to permit strict identity over time. Thus, we are not to be identified with our bodies.

An excellent presentation of Chisholm's views on these matters can be found in [P&O], as well as in his papers “Is There a Mind-Body Problem?” (1978) and “On the Simplicity of the Soul” (1991). Chapters 4, 6, 7, and 13 of [OM] are especially helpful. For a brief final discussion of the metaphysics of persons, see “Persons and Their Bodies: Some Unanswered Questions” (1996).

For a penetrating critical discussion of Chisholm's metaphysics of persons, see Quinn 1997.

Another metaphysical view that evidently fascinated Chisholm is libertarianism. According to this view, there is a special sort of causation in which an event is caused at least in part by an agent. When an agent thus “imminently” helps to bring about some effect, his doing so is not determined by antecedent causal conditions. Thus, he freely makes something happen. This makes genuine moral responsibility possible.

An early defense of this libertarianism can be found in “Freedom and Action” (1966). Another classic statement of the view can be found in Chisholm's “He Could Have Done Otherwise” (1967). Chisholm discussed these ideas in greater detail in Chapter II of [P&O] and then again in Chapters 1 and 2 of [OM].

Chisholm's views in ontology underwent steady pruning. In an earlier period he believed in necessarily existent states of affairs some of which might occur and recur. He also believed in times, though not in “concrete events”. Later he abandoned times and recurrable states of affairs in favor of a sparser ontology including “one shot” states, but lacking times. The earlier view can be found in “Events and Propositions” (1970), and “States of Affairs Again” (1971), and Chapter IV of [P&O]. The later view appears in “Events without Times: An Essay in Ontology” (1990). See also Chapter 16 of [OM] and Chapter 10 of [RTC].

Kim 1979 contains a very helpful critical exposition of Chisholm's early view. Both views are discussed in Brandl 1997. See also Zimmerman 1997.

Chisholm was dubious about such things as sense data, appearances, the “looks” of things. He defended a different view about the ontology of perception. An amusing early paper on this topic is “The Problem of the Speckled Hen” (1942). A more extended discussion, including a presentation of Chisholm's preferred theory of appearing, can be found in Chapter 8 (“Sensing”) of [PPS]. More than forty years later, near the end of his career, Chisholm made some final remarks about appearances in Chapter 13 of [RTC].

Chisholm steadily thought there is something fundamentally right about Brentano's Thesis — the idea that the psychological somehow involves intentionality, and that in this respect it is unlike the purely physical. Chisholm discussed this idea in his early paper “Sentences about Believing” (1955–6). He discussed it again in Chapter 11 (“Intentional Inexistence”) of [PPS]. A summary statement of the view can also be found in Chisholm's article “Intentionality” (1967). Chisholm returned to this topic in Part IV (Chapters 10–14) of [OM].

Two excellent critical discussions of Brentano's Thesis are Sanford 1997 and Kim 2003.

The term ‘Chisholm's Paradox’ has been credited to Graeme Forbes in his “Two Solutions to Chisholm's Paradox” (1984) The topic has been discussed extensively; see, for example, Salmon 1996. In his discussion of the mereological version of the puzzle, Chisholm mentions Chandler 1966. Lewis 1986 is essential reading here. A good discussion of the whole problem of transworld identity can be found in Mackie 2008.

One central Chisholmian view in ethics is the idea that all the main concepts of ethics can be defined by appeal to the concept of requirement. He defends this idea in his early paper “The Ethics of Requirement” (1964) and then again ten years later in “Practical Reason and the Logic of Requirement” (1974). The idea is briefly mentioned, but not developed, in [B&IV] 53.

For quite a long time Chisholm thought that the fundamental bearers of intrinsic value are states of affairs. He also thought that in some cases, the value of a state of affairs could be defeated by that state's occurrence within some larger context. In this he seemed to be working out some ideas of Brentano and Moore. One of Chisholm's most moving presentations of this view can be found in his Presidential Address before the Eastern Division of the American Philosphical Association titled “The Defeat of Good and Evil” (1968). Many of his ideas about defeat, enhancement, mitigation, and organic unities are further developed in Chapters 6, 7, and 8 of [B&IV].

No list of Chisholm's contributions to ethics could be complete without mentioning “Contrary-to-Duty Imperatives and Deontic Logic” (1963).


Primary Literature

Cited Books by Chisholm

[PPS] Perceiving: A Philosophical Study, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1957
[TK1] Theory of knowledge, Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice Hall, 1st edition, 1966; 2nd edition, 1977 [TK2]; 3rd edition 1989 [TK3].
[P&O] Person and Object: A Metaphysical Study, La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1976.
[FP] The First Person: An Essay on Reference and Intentionality, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1981.
[FK] The Foundations of Knowing, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
[B&IV] Brentano and Intrinsic Value, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
[OM] On Metaphysics, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1989.
[RTC] A Realistic Theory of Categories: An Essay on Ontology, Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

Cited Articles by Chisholm

  • 1942, “The Problem of the Speckled Hen,” Mind 51(204): 368–373.
  • 1955–6, “Sentences about Believing,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 56: 125–148.
  • 1963, “Contrary-to-Duty Imperatives and Deontic Logic,” Analysis, 24: 33–36.
  • 1964, “The Ethics of Requirement,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 1: 147–153.
  • 1966, “Freedom and Action,” in Freedom and Determinism, K. Lehrer (ed.), New York: Random House, pp. 11–44; reprinted in Myles Brand (ed.), The Nature of Human Action, Glenview, IL: Scott Foresman and Company, 1970, pp. 283–292.
  • 1967, “He Could Have Done Otherwise,” Journal of Philosophy, 4: 409–417; reprinted in Myles Brand (ed.), The Nature of Human Action, Glenview, IL: Scott Foresman and Company, 1970, pp. 293–301.
  • 1967, “Identity through Possible Worlds: Some Questions,’ Noûs, 1(1): 1–8.
  • 1967, “Intentionality,” The Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Volume 5), Paul Edwards (ed.), London: Macmillan, pp. 201–4.
  • 1968, “The Defeat of Good and Evil,”, Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 42: 21–38.
  • 1970, “Events and Propositions,” Noûs, 4: 15–24.
  • 1971, “States of Affairs Again,” Noûs, 5: 179–189.
  • 1973, “Parts as Essential to Their Wholes,” Review of Metaphysics, 26: 581–603.
  • 1974, “Practical Reason and the Logic of Requirement,” in S. Korner (ed.), Practical Reason, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, pp. 1–17.
  • 1978, “Is There a Mind-Body Problem?,” Philosophical Exchange, 2: 24–34.
  • 1986, “Self-Profile,” in [RMCp], pp. 3–77.
  • 1990, “Events without Times: An Essay in Ontology,” Noûs, 24: 413–428.
  • 1991, “On the Simplicity of the Soul,” Philosophical Perspectives, 5: 157–81.
  • 1996, “Persons and Their Bodies: Some Unanswered Questions,” in [RTC], pp. 99–105.

Secondary Literature


[A&M] Analysis and Metaphysics (Philosophical Studies Series in Philosophy: Volume 4), Keith Lehrer (ed.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1975.
[RMCp] Roderick M. Chisholm (Profiles: Volume 7), Radu J. Bogdan (ed.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1986.
[EPRMC] Essays on the Philosophy of Roderick M. Chisholm, Ernest Sosa (ed.), Amsterdam: Grazer Philosophische Studien, (Volumes 7-8) 1979.
[LLP] The Philosophy of Roderick M. Chisholm (The Library of Living Philosophers: Volume 25), Lewis Edwin Hahn (ed.), Chicago, La Salle: Open Court, 1997.

Cited Secondary Literature

  • Brandl, J., 1997, “Recurrent Problems — On Chisholm's Two Theories of Events,” in [LLP], pp. 457–477.
  • Brentano, F., 1874, Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint, translated by A.C. Rancurello, D.B. Terrell, and L. McAlister, London: Routledge, 1973.
  • Chandler, H., 1966, “Essence and Accident,” Analysis, 26: 185–188.
  • Davidson, D., 1970, “Events as Particulars,” Noûs, 4(1): 25–32.
  • Foley, R., 1997, “Chisholm's Epistemic Principles,” in [LLP], pp. 241–264.
  • Forbes, G., 1984, “Two Solutions to Chisholm's Paradox,” Philosophical Studies, 46: 171–187.
  • Heidelberger, H., 1969, “Chisholm's Epistemic Principles,” Noûs, 3(1): 73–82.
  • Kim, J., 1979, “States of Affairs, Events, and Propositions,” in [EPRMC], pp. 147–162.
  • Kim, J., 2003, “Chisholm's Legacy on Intentionality,” Metaphilosophy 34(5): 649–662.
  • Lewis, D., 1986, On the Plurality of Worlds, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Mackie, P., 2008, “Transworld Identity,” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2008 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>.
  • Quinn, P., 1997, “Tiny Selves: Chisholm on the Simplicity of the Soul,” in [LLP], pp. 56–66.
  • Salmon, N., 1996, “Trans-world Identification and Stipulation,” Philosophical Studies, 84(2): 203–223.
  • Sanford, D., 1997, “Chisholm on Brentano's Thesis,” in [LLP], pp. 201–214.
  • Sosa, E., 1997, “Chisholm's Epistemology and Epistemic Internalism,” in [LLP], pp. 267–287.
  • Taylor, R., 1975, “A Tribute,” in [A&M], pp. 1–8.
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