Pierre Duhem

First published Fri Jul 13, 2007; substantive revision Thu Jan 20, 2011

Pierre Duhem (1861–1916) was a French physicist and historian and philosopher of science. As a physicist, he championed “energetics,” holding generalized thermodynamics as foundational for physical theory, that is, thinking that all of chemistry and physics, including mechanics, electricity, and magnetism, should be derivable from thermodynamic first principles. In philosophy of science, he is best known for his work on the relation between theory and experiment, arguing that hypotheses are not straightforwardly refuted by experiment and that there are no crucial experiments in science. In history of science, he produced massive groundbreaking work in medieval science and defended a thesis of continuity between medieval and early modern science.

1. Life and Works

Pierre Maurice Marie Duhem was born on June 10, 1861, in Paris, in a modest neighborhood on the Rue des Jeûneurs, near the Grands Boulevards, just South of Montmartre. His father, Pierre-Joseph Duhem, was of Flemish origin, the oldest child of a large family who lived in the French northern industrial city of Roubaix, near the Belgian border. After the death of his parents, Pierre-Joseph was forced to discontinue his studies with the Jesuits in order to provide for the family. He worked in the textile industry as a sales representative, but never abandoned his love of learning; it is said that, late in life, he was seen everywhere with the work of a Latin author under his arm. Pierre Duhem's mother, Marie-Alexandrine Fabre, descended on her mother's side from the Hubault-Delormes, a bourgeois family who had settled in Paris during the seventeenth century. Her father's family had originally come from the southern town of Cabesprine, near Carcasonne, and it was there, in a house they still maintained and to which Pierre returned most summers, that he died on September 14, 1916.

The Duhems made sure that Pierre was well educated. Starting at the age of seven he was given private lessons with a small group of students, on grammar, arithmetic, Latin, and catechism. A letter he wrote about the siege of Chateaudun he experienced in October 1870 attests to his being already a literate writer by the age of nine. The young Duhem was witness to some troubling times, with the Franco-Prussian War raging until the armistice in February 1871 and the Paris Commune in March. The Duhems had avoided the advance of the Prussians against Paris but were caught up in the siege of Chateaudun; they barely escaped to Bordeaux, returning to Paris after the armistice and just before the Paris Commune. That social experiment lasted only two months, though it set the stage for some wide-ranging transformations to French culture that were to have great consequences when they were later established permanently. Among the Commune's decrees were the separation of church from state, the rendering of all church property into public property, and the exclusion of religion from schools. The Duhems did not approve of these measures and were particularly chagrined by some of the extreme actions taken by the most radical elements of the Commune, such as the desecration of churches and graveyards. For the Duhems, the Commune was a paradigm of anarchy and irreligion.

The Fall of 1872 brought two great tragedies to the Duhem family: a diphtheria epidemic killed Pierre's younger sister Antoinette and his recently born brother Jean, leaving only Pierre and Antoinette's twin sister Marie. Pierre continued his education (as demi-pensionnaire) at a Catholic school, the Collège Stanislas in Paris, in 1872 and for the next ten years. The mature Duhem recalled his college days as most formative. In particular, he singled out his science teacher as an important influence:

Let us return to some twenty-five years back to the time when we received our first initiation as a physicist in the mathematics classes of the Collège Stanislas. The person who gave us this initiation, Jules Moutier, was an ingenious theorist; his critical sense, ever aware and extremely perspicacious, distinguished with sure accuracy the weak point of many a system that others accepted without dispute; proofs of his inquiring mind are not lacking, and physical chemistry owes him one of its most important laws. It was this teacher who planted in us our admiration for physical theory and the desire to contribute to its progress. … Being a disciple of Moutier, it was as a convinced partisan of mechanism that we approached the courses in physics pursued at the Ecole Normale. (1914, 417–18; 1954, 275–76.)

Duhem's science teacher Jules Moutier went on to teach at the Ecole Polytechnique and to publish a number of texts, including La thermodynamique et ses principales applications (Paris: Gauthier-Villars, 1885). Duhem recognized in his theory of chemical dissociation and in his thermodynamics generally a first enunciation of the chemical theories that Josiah Willard Gibbs, an important later influence on Duhem, was to develop more fully.

In 1882 Duhem enrolled at the prestigious secular institution of higher education, the Ecole Normale Supérieure. When he entered the Ecole Normale he was first in his class in the Science Section, out of the approximately 30 students chosen from the best 800 or so graduates in France that year, and he remained first throughout his years there. The curriculum at the Ecole Normale usually lasted three years; Duhem was granted a fourth year and stayed on a fifth year as agrégé préparateur. He received a license in mathematics and another in physics at the end of academic year 1883–84. In his final year, Duhem was offered a position in Louis Pasteur's laboratory as a chemist-bacteriologist, though he refused it because of his desire to work in theoretical physics.

One of the turning points in Duhem's career occurred during academic year 1884–85, while he was only a third-year student. Duhem presented a thesis in physics for his doctorate. The thesis, on thermodynamic potential, Le potentiel thermodynamique et ses applications à la mécanique chimique et à l'étude des phénomènes électriques, was rejected by a panel composed of three scholars: the physicist Gabriel Lippmann and the mathematicians Charles Hermite and Emile Picard. The panel, chaired by Lippmann, seems to have made a political decision. The prestigious French scientific publisher, Hermann, published a version of the thesis the following year. Duhem defended another thesis in applied mathematics, on the theory of magnetization by induction, Sur l'aimantation par influence, and received his doctorate in October 1888; this time, the physicist Edmond Bouty, the mathematician Gaston Darboux, and the mathematician-physicist Henri Poincaré constituted the panel that accepted the dissertation. It would be difficult to understand fully these events without delving deeply into the social, cultural, and intellectual context of France at the end of the nineteenth century. At a time when French scientists were predominantly liberal and anti-clerical, Duhem was openly conservative and deeply religious; he was also stubborn and often contentious. The structure of French academia was surely also a factor in the affair. However, the specific motives generally cited in the case were Lipmann's “jealousy” and the fact that Duhem's thesis refuted the principle of maximum work: that chemical changes tend spontaneously to produce maximum heat. It was one of the cherished theses of Marcelin Berthelot, Lippmann's friend and a significant power in the French scientific establishment. It was reported that Berthelot had said: “This young man will never teach in Paris.” Berthelot's edict came true. Duhem spent his academic career in provincial universities far from Paris, the center of academic life in France. His teaching positions brought him from Lille, then briefly to Rennes, then to Bordeaux for the remainder of his life, but never to Paris.

Duhem assumed the position of Maitre de Conférences at the Faculté des Sciences at Lille in October 1887. There he met Adèle Chayet, whom he married in October 1890. Their daughter Hélène was born in September 1891. Tragically, Adèle died in childbirth the following summer; the newborn child also did not survive. Duhem never remarried. He left the upbringing of Hélène to his mother who lived with him after his father Pierre-Joseph died. The situation in Lille soured for Duhem. Never one to back off from a dispute, he fought with the Dean of his faculty over a minor issue: an assistant had failed to unlock the door of Duhem's laboratory for his students during their licentiate examinations. The assistant complained about his mistreatment by Duhem to the Dean, who requested that the assistant write a letter of apology; Duhem rejected the apology and took issue with the Dean, who then brought the matter to the Rector, adding further complaints against Duhem. The minor issue having escalated to immense proportions, Duhem requested and received a change of positions at the end of academic year 1893. During these formative years, Duhem worked very hard on his science. He published six books: a two-volume work on hydrodynamics, elasticity, and acoustics, his lectures on electricity and magnetism, in three volumes, and an introduction to physical chemistry. Duhem was one of the first to appreciate the work of W. J. Gibbs, writing the earliest critical examination of Gibbs' “On the Equilibrium of Heterogeneous Substances” in 1887 and later promoting the French translation of Gibbs' works (Duhem 1907).

In October 1893, Duhem left Lille for Rennes. He lasted only one year, leaving for Bordeaux in October 1894. He was hoping for a position in Paris. The prodigious quantity and quality of his publications in many fields of science, the philosophy of science, and the history of science were not able to change his situation. Very late in life, he was approached about the newly created chair in the History of Science at the Collège de France, but he refused to be a candidate for it. The proud and stubborn Duhem told his daughter: “I am a theoretical physicist. Either I will teach theoretical physics at Paris or else I will not go there.”

Duhem's curriculum vitae, written in 1913, on the occasion of his nomination as non-resident member of the Académie des Sciences (1917, 41–70), lists over 350 items, about 50 of which were books. From the mid-1880s to 1900, Duhem's primary interests were scientific, ranging from thermodynamics and physics, but publishing on elasticity and energetics as late as 1911. In the 1890s, while still at Lille, he began writing essays on questions of methodology that would lead to the publication of his most influential books in the philosophy of science, translated into English as The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory and To Save the Phenomena. It was also in the mid-1890s that Duhem published his first essays in the history of science, starting on the path that would lead him in 1904 to a new understanding of the history of science and to his thesis of continuity between medieval and early modern science. This path would culminate in such important historical works as Études sur Léonard de Vinci and Le système du monde.

Duhem made a number of enduring contributions to thermodynamics and physical chemistry. Among these were the Duhem–Margules and Gibbs–Duhem equations, which deal with reversible processes in thermodynamics as quasi-static limiting processes and give a general proof of the Gibbs phase rule. These results were obtained in the context of a program of generalized thermodynamics called “energetics.” Indeed, Duhem's entire scientific program was driven by the conviction that a generalized thermodynamics should be foundational for physical theory, thinking that all of chemistry and physics, including mechanics, electricity and magnetism, should be derivable from thermodynamic first principles. Duhem started from the concept of the thermodynamic potential (the topic of his failed thesis), deploying it in a manner similar to that of potentials in mechanics, so as to represent all physical and chemical changes. The program finds its mature statement in his Traité d'énergétique of 1911; it was well received by late-nineteenth-century energeticists, such as Wilhelm Ostwald and Georg Helm. So important was energetics for Duhem, that his work in the history and philosophy of science has been viewed as an attempt to defend its aims and methods (see Lowinger 1941). More recently, Niall Martin and others have argued for the importance of religious motives in Duhem's work (see Martin 1991, Jaki 1991) and it has become clear in the course of Duhem's writings that he expected the endpoint of science to harmonize with the teachings of the Catholic Church.

Whatever was Duhem's initial motivation, his historical and philosophical work took on a life of its own. One cannot read Duhem's numerous historical and philosophical tomes and think that his labor was only in the service of energetics and that the sole goal of his works was but a defense of its methods and its historical position. No doubt energetics might be a thread running through Duhem's various works, and no doubt these works harmonize with the method of energetics as he conceives it, but energetics cannot be the whole story.

2. Philosophy of Science

Duhem's early methodological views reflected late nineteenth-century positivism: Physical theory was no more than an aid to memory, summarizing and classifying facts by providing a symbolic representation of them; the facts of physical theory are different from common sense and metaphysics, especially from the mechanical theories fashionable at the time. Duhem's position was immediately attacked by a Catholic engineer, Eugène Vicaire, on the grounds that separating physics from metaphysics implied that physics was the only real knowledge (another positivistic thesis), and thus conceded too much to skepticism. Vicaire raised an important point for turn-of-the-century Catholics because the Church was officially committed to neo-Thomism, with its generally rationalist apologetics (see Martin 1991, chap. 2). In his reply Duhem adopted a quasi-Thomist position: metaphysics is a real form of knowledge, more excellent than physics, but separated from it in that it has different objects and is governed by different methods. This immediate response fitted reasonably well into the framework of neo-Thomism, though it did not go as far as to reunite the disparate forms of knowledge into a hierarchical system of sciences including cosmology and metaphysics. Duhem's mature position was somewhat different, containing three key ideas elaborated upon on various occasions: (1) the underdetermination of theory by fact, often referred to as the Duhem Thesis, (2) the rejection of metaphysics and models in physics, and (3) natural classification as the endpoint of physical theory.

2.1 Against “Newtonian Method”: The Duhem Thesis

Duhem's work was important for members of the Vienna Circle, including Otto Neurath and Philipp Frank, as it had been for Ernst Mach. Despite Duhem's conservative beliefs, his work was also taken up by participants in the Viennese political scene, such as Friedrich Adler, who had translated La théorie physique into German in 1908. The Duhem thesis surfaced fully in Anglo-American philosophy in the 1950s through the work of W. V. O. Quine. In Quine's “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” the second dogma is reductionism, the belief that “each meaningful statement is equivalent to some construct upon terms which refer to immediate experience” (1953, 20). Quine argues that reductionism is an ill-founded dogma. He asserts that although reductionism has ceased to figure in some empiricists' thoughts, there remains a more subtle form of reductionism that each statement taken in isolation can admit confirmation or disconfirmation. Against this dogma Quine suggests that “our statements about the external world face the tribunal of sense experience not individually, but only as a corporate body” (1953, 41), and, in a footnote of the reprinted article in his collected essays, From a Logical Point of View, says that the doctrine was well argued by Pierre Duhem. Quine proceeds to detail an “empiricism without the dogmas” in which knowledge is to be likened to a field of force where “a conflict with experience at the periphery occasions readjustments in the interior of the field” (1953, 42), and “any statement can be held true come what may, if we make drastic enough adjustments elsewhere in the system” (1953, 43). Because of Quine's reference to Duhem, the thesis formed from the two sub-theses, that (i) since empirical statements are interconnected, they cannot be singly disconfirmed, and (ii), if we wish to hold a particular statement true we can always adjust another statement, has become known as the Duhem-Quine thesis. Quine attributes only sub-thesis (i) to Duhem; Duhem would have recognized sub-thesis (i) as an offspring of his, but would not have fully agreed with it as formulated by Quine. I first give reasons to think that Duhem would not have accepted sub-thesis (ii), and then discuss some differences between his thesis and sub-thesis (i).

Duhem does not claim that when there is some conflict with experience, we can always make enough adjustments elsewhere in the system. He makes a weaker claim, also limited in other ways, but which would be equivalent to: when there is some conflict with experience what is disconfirmed is necessarily ambiguous. Duhem's formulation of his non-falsifiability thesis is that “if the predicted phenomenon is not produced, not only is the questioned proposition put into doubt, but also the whole theoretical scaffolding used by the physicist” (1914, 281; 1954, 185). He does not take the second Quinean step of holding any statement true come what may, but says “the only thing the experiment teaches us is that, among all the propositions used to predict the phenomenon and to verify that it has not been produced, there is at least one error; but where the error lies is just what the experiment does not tell us” (1914, 281; 1954, 185). He refers to two possible ways of proceeding when an experiment contradicts the consequences of a theory: a timid scientist might wish to safeguard certain fundamental hypotheses and attempt to complicate matters by invoking various cases of error and multiplying the corrections, while a bolder scientist can resolve to change some of the essential suppositions supporting the entire system (1914, 329; 1954, 216–17). The scientist has no guarantee of success: “If they both succeed in satisfying the requirements of the experiment, each is logically permitted to declare himself content with the work he has accomplished” (1914, 330; 1954, 217).

Moreover, Duhem does not argue directly for the non-falsifiability thesis. He seems to regard it as an obvious corollary of another thesis, which could be called the non-separability thesis, that the physicist can never submit an isolated hypothesis to experimental test: “To seek to separate each of the hypotheses of theoretical physics from the other assumptions upon which this science rests, in order to subject it in isolation to the control of observation, is to pursue a chimera” (1914, 303; 1954, 199–200).

The Duhemian thesis usually makes its appearance in the context of Duhem's critique of the inductive method (or what he calls the Newtonian method), which rejects any hypothesis about imperceptible bodies and hidden movements and admits only general laws known by induction from observation. Duhem accuses this method of being unmanageable; he asserts that a science can only follow the Newtonian method when its means of knowing are those of common sense: “When science no longer observes facts directly but substitutes for them measurements, given by instruments, of magnitudes that mathematical theory alone defines, induction can no longer be practiced in the manner that the Newtonian method requires,” (1917, 153; 1996, 234). He clearly indicates that some sciences can use the Newtonian method, derive their principles by induction from observation and disconfirm them as tests warrant. What Duhem thinks is wrong with inductivism is that it cannot be used by all sciences. For Duhem the non-falsifiability thesis is a consequence of the non-separability thesis, and the non-separability thesis is an empirical thesis depending upon factors that do not govern all sciences. This is supported as well by Duhem's assertions, in La théorie physique, that he is imposing narrow limits on his inquiry, and is restricting his generalizations to physics; when he first announces the non-separability thesis, he announces it as a principle about what physicists do, whose consequences will be developed in the remainder of the book.

It is not generally known that Duhem in his lifetime confronted an extension of his thesis in the fashion of Quine and had previously rejected it. In the 1913 essay entitled “Examen logique de la théorie physique,” republished as part II of the overview of all his work, Duhem sketched the set of theses constituting the Duhem thesis and stated:

Separated from the various schools of Pragmatists on the subject of the value of physical theory, we do not take our stand, in any circumstance, among the number of their followers. The analysis we have given of experiments in physics shows fact to be completely interpenetrated by theoretical interpretation, to the point where it becomes impossible to express fact in isolation from theory, in such experiments. This analysis has found great favor on the side of many Pragmatists. They have extended it to the most diverse fields: to history, to exegesis, to theology. (1917, 156; 1996, 237.)

Thus, already by 1913, the scope of Duhem's thesis had been stretched beyond Duhem's intentions. “The several authors we have just cited often draw from this analysis of the experimental method used in physics conclusions which go beyond the boundaries of physics; we shall not follow them that far, but shall stay always within the limits of physical science” (1914, 218n; 1954, 144n). While Duhem did not identify these authors, these “pragmatists,” as early as 1905, in a footnote of La théorie physique, he asserts that some of his friends and acquaintances and, in particular, Gaston Milhaud, Edouard Le Roy, and Joseph Wilbois had adopted his analysis of experimental method, as discussed in his earlier articles (1914, 217–218n; 1954, 144n). And these same thinkers, together with Duhem's very good friend, Maurice Blondel, were referred to favorably as “French pragmatists” by William James in 1907 in his Lectures on Pragmatism: “If my lectures interest any reader in the general subject, he will doubtless wish to read farther. I therefore give him a few references. … Furthermore, see J. Milhaud, Le Rationnel, 1898, and the fine articles by Le Roy in the Revue de Metaphysique, vols. 7, 8, and 9. Also articles by Blondel and de Sailly in the Annales de Philosophie Chrétienne, 4eme Série, vols. 2 and 3. Papini announces a book on Pragmatism, in the French language, to be published very soon” (James, 1981, 3; a quick glance at Milhaud's Le Rationnel reveals numerous references to Duhem). Thus the Duhem thesis in its extended form was favorably received in the Anglophone world during the first few decades of the twentieth century, well before Quine's reference to it. Duhem's reaction to the extension of his thesis was as follows:

We do not deny that this extension is legitimate to some extent. However different the problems may be, it is always the same human intellect that exerts itself to resolve them. In the same way, there is always something common in the several procedures reason employs. But if it is good to notice the analogies between our diverse scientific methods, it is on condition that we do not forget the differences separating them. And, when we compare the method of physics, so strangely specialized in the application of mathematical theory and by the use of measuring instruments, to other methods, there are surely more differences to describe than analogies to discover. (1917, 156; 1996, 237.)

2.2 Against “Cartesian Method”: Metaphysics and Models

In the overview of all his scholarly works in the document supporting his candidacy for membership to the Académie des Sciences Duhem contrasted the methodology of energetics with the two leading methodologies at the time, what he called the method of the Cartesians and that of the Newtonians. We have discussed his critique of the Newtonians; we now turn to that of the Cartesians. The salient feature of energetics was that “the principles it embodies and from which it derives conclusions do not at all aspire to resolve the bodies we perceive or the motions we report into imperceptible bodies or hidden motions” (1917, 151; 1996, 232). What energetics offered was a formal theory, with the character of logical system, which instead of reducing physical qualities in the manner of mechanistic theories, limited itself to marking by means of a numerical scale the various intensities of such qualities. Duhem's critique of mechanistic theories (or the method of Cartesians and atomists) was that they are not autonomous:

The physicist who wishes to follow them can no longer use the methods proper to physics exclusively. … Here he enters the domain of cosmology. He no longer has the right to shut his ears to what metaphysics wishes to tell him about the real nature of matter; hence, as a consequence, through dependence on metaphysical cosmology, his physics suffers from all the uncertainties and vicissitudes of that doctrine. Theories constructed by the method of the Cartesians and atomists are also condemned to infinite multiplication and to perpetual reformulation. They do not appear to be in any state to assure consensus and continual progress to science. (1917, 152; 1996, 233–34.)

For Duhem, the contemporary scientist who exemplified the method of the “Cartesians” was James Clerk Maxwell. Duhem issued three interconnected complaints against Maxwell's work: i) Maxwell's theory is overly bold or not systematic enough; ii) it is too dependent on models; and iii) its concepts are not continuous with those of the past.

The justification Duhem gives for the accusation of extreme boldness is that:

When a physicist discovers facts unknown until then, when his experiments have allowed him to formulate new laws that the theory had not foreseen, he must first try with the greatest care to represent these laws, to the required degree of approximation, as consequences of admitted hypotheses. Only after having acquired the certainty that the magnitudes treated until now by the theory cannot serve as symbols for the observed quantities, that received hypotheses cannot flow from the established laws, is he authorized to enrich physics with a new magnitude, to complicate it with a new hypothesis (1902, 7).

According to Duhem, the founders of electrodynamics—Coulomb, Poisson, and Ampere—followed these principles, but Maxwell did not. Duhem cites with approbation Ampere's attempt to represent the attraction or repulsion of currents in wires using Coulomb's formula. He also praises the fact that Ampere abandoned the attempt only after experimental facts about the magneto-optical rotation, discovered by Faraday, showed clearly that Ampere could not succeed in the attempt. But, again, according to Duhem, Maxwell does not follow these principles. In fact, he goes so far as to accuse Maxwell of following the “inverse path”:

At the moment when Maxwell introduced a new magnitude in electrodynamics, the displacement currents, at the moment when he marked, as essential hypotheses, the mathematical form of the laws to which this magnitude should be submitted, no properly observed phenomenon required this extension of the theory of currents; that theory was sufficient for representing, if not all phenomena known until then, at least all those whose experimental study had achieved a sufficient degree of clearness. No logical necessity pressed Maxwell to imagine a new electrodynamics. (1902, 8.)

As a result, Maxwell reversed “with an incredible rashness” the natural order according to which physical theory evolves—he broke with the past before he needed to.

Duhem is well known for his attack on the use of models in physical science. At first, it seems that Duhem tries to link his attack on model building with his espousal of instrumentalism for the physical sciences. He accuses the English scientists of believing that “to understand physical phenomena is to compose a model” (1914, 103; 1954, 71–72) and of “confusing model with theory” (1913, 102; 1954, 71). He specifically blames Maxwell of these misunderstandings, indicating that in his 1855–56 essay Maxwell proposed only “to illustrate” the theory of dielectrics, whereas in his 1861–62 essay he proposed “to represent or to explain” the electrical and magnetic actions by a mechanical model. Duhem even seems scornful of Maxwell's interchangeable use of the verbs “to represent” and “to explain.” He states, “for an English physicist, the two words have the same meaning” (1902, 9).

For Duhem there is a crucial difference between representing and explaining. He divides theories into two large categories, explanatory and purely representative theories, and argues that physical theories should not be considered as explanatory, but as purely representative or classificatory. The argument, as we have seen, is that, in order for physical theory to be explanatory, it would have to be subordinate to metaphysics and not autonomous. The reference to the two words having the same meaning for Maxwell and English scientists is thus a reference to what Duhem would consider a confusion about the aim of physical theory, one that arises in the identification of the model with the theory, in thinking that what is represented by the theory and/or model is real.

But Duhem broadens the critique of model building to include mathematical models along with mechanical models. He decides that, for an English scientist, theory is “for him neither an explanation nor a rational classification of physical laws, but a model of these laws, a model not built for the satisfying of reason but for the pleasure of the imagination” (1914, 117; 1954, 81). The complaint is clear: model building has no real place in physical theory (beyond a minor heuristic role); it can neither be grounded in realism, in the thought that physical theories are explanatory structures, nor in instrumentalism, in the thought that physical theories are classificatory or representative structures. In fact, model building is not even connected to the higher intellectual faculty of reason but to the lower faculty of imagination. So, ultimately, Duhem's attack on model building is rooted in something more fundamental than his instrumentalist methodology for the physical sciences.

Duhem banishes model building from physical theory (as he previously banished Maxwell's rashness) because model building breaks with historical continuity; in fact, model building is not only historically non-continuous, but present models are even often “non-continuous” among themselves. Some model builders even find pleasure in building two or more models of the same law. The fact that the English physicist can accept disparate models, breaking up the historical continuity of science and even its present unification, is what shocks Duhem; it is what reconfirms for him that English physics is not the work of reason, but the work of imagination.

A principle of historical continuity is invoked in the conclusion of Duhem's primary work on Maxwell. Duhem evaluates there an interpretation of Maxwell's work he attributes to Heaviside, Hertz, and Cohn, among others. He quotes Hertz as stating that: “what is essential in Maxwell's theories is Maxwell's equations.” He takes this to be Hertz's way of salvaging what is valuable in Maxwell from the midst of logical errors and incoherence, which are not only difficult to correct, but which have frustrated many illustrious mathematicians. But Duhem cannot accept Hertz's implied criterion of identity for physical theories. He asserts that he might accept such a criterion for algebra but “a physicist is not an algebraist”:

An equation does not simply bear on letters; such letters symbolize physical magnitudes which must be either measurable experimentally or formed from other measurable magnitudes. Therefore, if a physicist is given only an equation, he is not taught anything. To this equation must be joined rules by which the letters that the equation bears upon are made to correspond to the physical magnitudes they represent. And that which allows us to know these rules is the set of hypotheses and arguments by which one has arrived at the equations in question. [The set of rules] is the theory that the equations summarize in a symbolic form: in physics, an equation, detached from the theory that leads to it, has no meaning. (1902, 223.)

Duhem proceeds to detail two complete theories that can recover Maxwell's equations within a logical and coherent structure, the theories of Boltzmann and Helmholtz. The only criterion he gives for choosing between these two theories, though without elaborating upon it or justifying it, is that Helmholtz's theory is to be preferred over Boltzmann's theory because it is a natural “extension of the doctrines of Poisson, Ampere, Weber, and Newmann; it leads logically from the principles posited at the start of the nineteenth century to the most seductive consequences of Maxwell's theories, from the laws of Coulomb to the electromagnetic theory of light; [it does so] without losing any of the recent victories of electrical science; it reestablishes the continuity of tradition” (1902, 225).

Duhem does not attempt to justify his criterion of historical continuity in his study of Maxwell, perhaps because he previously broached the question. In an early methodological article, he asserts: “IF WE RESTRICT OURSELVES TO INVOKING CONSIDERATIONS OF PURE LOGIC, we cannot prevent a physicist from representing different sets of laws, or even a single group of laws, by several irreconcilable theories. We cannot condemn incoherence in the development of physical theory” (1893, 366 and elsewhere; 1996, 66). Thus historical continuity as a consideration falls outside of pure logic and outside reasons of physics proper, but deals with the relation between physics and metaphysics, what Duhem calls “metaphysical cosmology.” Surprisingly, if one considers him as an instrumentalist, for Duhem, we must judge a physical theory in comparison to an ideal and perfect theory that provides the total and adequate metaphysical explanation of the nature of material things, that is, the natural classification of laws. For that reason, a coherent physical theory is more perfect than an incoherent set of incompatible theories. Elaborating upon this point and commenting upon the connection between cosmology—that is, metaphysics, natural classification, or the ideal form of physical theory—and physical theory itself, Duhem asserts:

It is not enough for cosmologists to know very accurately the doctrines of contemporary theoretical physics; they must also know past doctrines. In fact, current theory need not be analogous with cosmology, but with the ideal theory toward which current theory tends by a continual progress. Therefore, it is not up to philosophers to compare physics as it is now with their cosmology, by congealing science in some manner at a precise moment of its evolution, but rather to appreciate the development of theory and to surmise the goal toward which it is directed. Now, nothing can guide them safely in conjecturing the path that physics will follow if not the knowledge of the road it has already covered. (1914, 460; 1954, 303.)

Duhem supports this statement using an analogy with the trajectory of a ball. We cannot guess its end point with an instant glance at the ball, but we can prolong its trajectory if we followed the ball from the moment it was struck. So we cannot guess the end point of physical theory, the natural classification, by looking at any particular theory. We must appeal to the trajectory of physical theory, to its history, to enable us to tell whether any particular theory is likely to contribute toward the ultimate natural classification. Duhem's doctrine of natural classification provides the grounds for various commentators to argue that Duhem is not an instrumentalist, that his philosophy of science considered as a whole looks more like convergent or motivational realism (see Maiocchi in Ariew and Barker 1990 and others).

2.3 Later Developments

As presented so far, Duhem is a philosopher who weaves together two large patchworks of theses: (i) instrumentalism or fictionalism, anti-atomism or anti-Cartesianism, anti-modelism, and autonomy of physics from metaphysics and (ii) anti-inductivism or critique of Newtonian method, the Duhem thesis, that is, non-falsifiability and non-separability. Both sets of theses are intended as empirical theses about the workings of science and both are important to understanding Duhem's thought. The first set of theses effectively demarcates physical theory as an autonomous domain apart from other domains, that is, rejects any external method, and the second set then operates on the internal workings of physical theory. Having set apart physical theory, Duhem asserts that no internal method leads inexorably to the truth.

For Duhem, there are always at least two basic ways of proceeding in science. Some scientists prefer the clutter of concrete details and thus do not mind ad hoc explanations, complications, and corrected theories; others prefer abstract, simple, and uncomplicated theories, even if they are gotten at the price of conceptual novelty. As we have seen, Duhem discusses this dichotomy under the rubric of the English mind and the French mind—what he also calls “esprit de finesse” and “esprit de géométrie,” following Blaise Pascal. Despite the labels “English” and “French,” Duhem's categories are analytic ones, not mere epithets to be used rhetorically against his adversaries. In fact, from the start, when he described the broad-shallow English mind, his archetype was Napoleon Bonaparte, a great genius of military details—not an Englishman. Duhem's ideal of the narrow-deep French mind was Newton, the geometer of physics—not a Frenchman. Thus, when Duhem accused Faraday and Maxwell of having English minds, he did so by trying to establish something about how they conducted their science, not by referring to their ancestry.

In his last work, La science allemande, mostly a work of wartime propaganda, Duhem added a third kind of mind to his original two, namely, the German mind. If there are two basic types, the French mind and the English mind, then what could the German mind possibly be? Citing Pascal, Duhem tells us that truth requires both reason and argument—raison and raisonnement. Logic, or our ability to link propositions with one another, allows us to deduce one truth from another; but that ability, by itself, merely gets us back to first principles or axioms. We also need a faculty that allows us to intuit the truth of the first principles or axioms, that is, bon sens (good sense). Bon sens is to “esprit de finesse” what “pure logic” is to “esprit de géométrie.” Moreover, bon sens, our faculty of recognizing fundamental truth gets perfected by the practice of history, by our becoming more aware of the failures and successes of previous theories, by thinking about the trajectory of scientific theories, rather than by considering a single theory frozen in time. The dual scheme can now be expanded. We need logic, the ability to systematize, but we also need intuition, the recognition of truth. When one of these is allowed to dominate, we get a science which is all intuition, all “esprit de finesse,” but no logical coherence, namely, English science; or we get a science which is all logic, lacking bon sens, namely, German science. German science then is a degenerate kind of French science, the latter being predominantly “esprit de géométrie,” corrected by bon sens.

As a result, we can talk about a continuum of sciences; at one extreme on the theoretical side is German science, or logicism, and at the other extreme on the experimental side is English science, or crude modelism. In the middle is French science, which allegedly tempers the logical bent with historicism.

In a well-known chapter of Social Theory and Social Structure, the sociologist of science Robert Merton refers to Duhem's critique of German science as one of the many polemics against national kinds affirming a universalistic standard: “Dispassionate scientists impugned ‘enemy’ contributions, charging nationalistic bias, log-rolling, intellectual dishonesty, incompetence, and lack of creative capacity. Yet this very deviation from the norm of universalism actually presupposed the legitimacy of the norm. For nationalistic bias is opprobrious only if judged in terms of the standard of universalism… Thus by the very process of condemning their violation, the mores are reaffirmed” (1968, 8).

At first glance Duhem's polemics against German science might seem to arise from a universalistic standard. Duhem does talk at times of a perfect form of science, one without personal or national character: “Quite often the great masters possess a reason in which all the faculties are so harmoniously proportioned that their very perfect doctrines are exempt from all individual character, as from all national character. … In such works one no longer sees the genius of this or that people, but only the genius of Humanity” (1915, 105; 1996, 253). Such perfection for Duhem is an equilibrium of disparate elements, not itself a single ideal type. Duhem might regret what he sees as an overabundance of esprit de géométrie in German science, and might wish that it be tempered by a bit more finesse, but there is no suggestion in Duhem that there is only one way to proceed in science.

Duhem specifically states that the

perfect form of science could not be obtained except by a very precise separation of the various methods concurring in the discovery of truth. Each of the many faculties that human reason puts into play when it wishes to know more and better would have to play its role, without anything being omitted, without any faculty being overlooked. This perfect equilibrium between the many organs of reason does not occur in any one man. In each of us one faculty is stronger and another weaker. In the conquest of truth the weaker will not contribute as much as it should and the stronger will take on more than its share. (1915, 104; 1996, 252).

At bottom, despite his talk of ideal type and equilibrium, Duhem's science is not universalistic. The strength of his analysis is that there is no single direction within science that each individual must follow. For that, one would need to ground physics in a particular metaphysics—which Duhem explicitly rejects with his instrumentalism—or rather, to be guided by what one projects metaphysics will look like over the long run. Unfortunately, Duhem took this last thought too rigidly and ultimately condemned all innovations as breaking with the past, either due to an excess of esprit de géométrie, as with non-Euclidean geometry and relativity, or an excess of esprit de finesse, as with electron theory. But his philosophy of science itself contained the seeds of scientific pluralism, which are the foundations of the Duhem thesis, that is, the thought that there are many legitimate and disparate ways of proceeding in science.

Duhem's famous critique of crucial experiments follows a similar pattern. Duhem argues that crucial experiments resemble false dilemmas: hypotheses in physics do not come in pairs, so that crucial experiments cannot transform one of the two into a demonstrated truth. For example, the Newtonian emission theory predicts that light travels faster in water than in air; according to the wave theory, light travels slower in water than in air. Dominique François Arago proposed a crucial experiment comparing the respective velocities. Léon Foucault then devised an apparatus to measure the speed of light in various media and found a lower velocity in water than in air. Arago and Foucault concluded for the wave theory, thinking that the experiment refuted the emission theory. Discussing Foucault's experiment, Duhem asks whether we dare assert that no other hypothesis is imaginable and suggests that instead of light being either a simple particle or wave, it might be something else, perhaps a disturbance propagated within a dielectric medium, as theorized by Maxwell (1914, 285–89; 1954, 188–90).

3. History of Science

For most of the nineteenth century, scholars treated “medieval science” as an oxymoron. Since nothing from the Middle Ages was worthy of the name “science,” no history of medieval science could be written. For example, William Whewell referred to Greek philosophy as “the period of the first waking of science” and to the medieval era as “that of its mid-day slumber” (1857, I, Introduction). As a result, Whewell's chapter on medieval science from the History of the Inductive Sciences, entitled “Of the Mysticism of the Middle Ages,” was just two-pages long.

With work such as Whewell's being typical of Duhem's intellectual context, when Duhem wrote L'évolution de la mécanique, in 1903, he dismissed the Middle Ages as scientifically sterile. Similarly, Duhem's history of chemical combination, Le mixte et la combinaison chimique, published in book-form in 1902, had jumped from Aristotle's concept of mixtio to modern concepts. It was only in 1904, while writing Les origines de la statique that Duhem came across an unusual reference to a then-unknown medieval thinker, Jordanus de Nemore. His pursuit of this reference, and the research to which it led, is widely acknowledged to have created the field of the history of medieval science. Where Duhem's previous histories had been silent, Les origines de la statique contained a number of chapters on medieval science: one treated Jordanus de Nemore; another treated his followers; a third argued their influence on Leonardo de Vinci. In the second volume, Duhem greatly extended his historical scope. As expected, he covered seventeenth-century statics, but he also returned to the middle ages, spending four chapters on geostatics, including the work of Albert of Saxony in the fourteenth century. Les origines de la statique is thus a transition from Duhem's early conventional histories to the later work for which he is best known, Etudes sur Léonard de Vinci, and Le Système du monde, in which his thesis of the continuity of late medieval and early modern science is fully displayed.

From 1906 to 1913, Duhem delved deeply into his favorite guide for the recovery of the past, the scientific notebooks of Leonardo de Vinci. He published a series of essays uncovering de Vinci's medieval sources and their influences on the moderns. The third volume of Duhem's Etudes sur Léonard de Vinci gained a new subtitle, Les précurseurs parisiens de Galilée, announcing Duhem's bold new thesis that even the works of Galileo had a medieval heritage; reviewing his historical accomplishments, Duhem summarized them as follows:

When we see the science of Galileo triumph over the stubborn Peripatetic philosophy of somebody like Cremonini, we believe, since we are ill-informed about the history of human thought, that we are witness to the victory of modern, young science over medieval philosophy, so obstinate in its mechanical repetition. In truth, we are contemplating the well-paved triumph of the science born at Paris during the fourteenth century over the doctrines of Aristotle and Averroes, restored into repute by the Italian Renaissance. (1917, 162; 1996, 193.)

Duhem presented Galilean dynamics as a continuous development out of medieval dynamics. He recovered the late medieval theory of impetus, tracing it from John Philoponus' criticism of Aristotle to its mature statements in the fourteenth century works of John Buridan and Nicole Oresme: “The role that impetus played in Buridan's dynamics is exactly the one that Galileo attributed to impeto or momento, Descartes to ‘quantity of motion,’ and Leibniz finally to vis viva. So exact is this correspondence that, in order to exhibit Galileo's dynamics, Torricelli, in his Lezioni accademiche, often took up Buridan's reasons and almost his exact words” (1917, 163–62; 1996, 194). Duhem then sketched the extension of impetus theory from terrestrial dynamics to the motions of the heavens and earth:

Nicole Oresme attributed to the earth a natural impetus similar to the one Buridan attributed to the celestial orbs. In order to account for the vertical fall of weights, he allowed that one must compose this impetus by which the mobile rotates around the earth with the impetus engendered by weight. The principle he distinctly formulated was only obscurely indicated by Copernicus and merely repeated by Giordano Bruno. Galileo used geometry to derive the consequences of that principle, but without correcting the incorrect form of the law of inertia implied in it. (1917, 166; 1996, 196.)

Duhem's essays on Leonardo de Vinci concluded with a speculation about the means for the transmission of medieval ideas to modern science. Since the studies of Buridan and Oresme had remained in large part in manuscript, Duhem suggested that Albert of Saxony, whose works were printed and reprinted during the sixteenth century, was the likely link to Galileo. Duhem's key to understanding the transmission of medieval science was Galileo's use of the phrase Doctores Parisienses, a conventional label denoting Buridan and Oresme, among others. Based on evidence including references to certain unusual doctrines and the particular order in which the questions were arranged, Duhem conjectured that Galileo had consulted George Lokert's compilation of Albert of Saxony, Themo Judaeus, and others, and the works of the Dominican Domingo de Soto (1906–13, III.582–83). Duhem's conjecture has been revised and expanded upon: The means of transmission has been made clearer because of the labor of A. C. Crombie, Adriano Carugo, and William Wallace.

In the three years before his death in 1916, Duhem wrote Le Système du monde, but did not succeed in finishing it. He intended it as a twelve-volume work on the history of cosmological doctrines, ending with Copernicus. He completed nine volumes, the first five being published from 1914 to 1919, and the next four having to wait until the 1950s; a tenth, incomplete volume was also published then. These tomes impart an enormous amount of information about medieval astronomy, astrology, tidal theory, and geostatics, again presenting many sources for the first time in the modern era. They also trace developments in doctrines associated with such concepts as infinity, place, time, void, and the plurality or unity of the world. Duhem intended to write a 300-page summary of his results after he was done with the Le Système du monde; he did not have the time to accomplish what would have surely been an amazing volume.

Unlike his philosophical work, Duhem's influential contemporaries did not receive his historical work with sympathy. As early as 1916, Antonio Favaro, the editor of Le Opere di Galileo Galilei, rejected the continuity of medieval and early modern science. The next generation of historians of science, Alexandre Koyré for example, acknowledged Duhem's studies as the foundation for modern studies of medieval science, but subjected them to harsh criticism. Two themes divide Koyré's historical work from that of Duhem. It presents histories of science in which metaphysics plays a primary role in explaining scientific change and it espouses a historiography that gives a central place to the concept of revolution. Medieval thought and early modern science are judged to be different in kind as well as in content.

At the beginning of an essay on void and infinite space, Koyré quotes a passage from Duhem that has become infamous: “If we were obliged to assign a date to the birth of modern science, we would undoubtedly choose 1277, when the Bishop of Paris solemnly proclaimed that a multiplicity of worlds could exist, and that the system of celestial spheres could, without contradiction, be endowed with straight line motion” (1906–13, II.411; see also 1913–59, VII. 4). Koyré calls the two theses from the condemnations of 1277 “absurdities,” noting that they arise in a theological context, and rejects Duhem's date for the birth of modern science; he remarks that Duhem gives another date elsewhere, corresponding to Buridan's impetus theory being extended to the heavens, but dismisses it also, saying that “it is as false as the first date” (1961, 37n). For Koyré, the introduction of Platonic metaphysics, the mathematization of nature, marks a break with the Aristotelian Middle Ages.

Koyré's work influenced Thomas Kuhn and others who made “scientific revolutions” a central feature of their historical accounts. Still, the work of Kuhn and later historically oriented philosophers and sociologists of science did attempt to reintegrate the philosophical and historical studies that Duhem pursued together but that were separated for a good part of the twentieth century.


Primary Sources

Duhem often first published his main works, such as Les théories électriques de J. Clerk Maxwell, L'évolution de la mécanique, Les origines de la statique, La théorie physique, son objet et sa structure, serially as articles in such journals as Annales de la de la Société scientifique de Bruxelles, Revue Générale des Sciences pures et appliquées, Revue des Questions Scientifiques, Revue de Philosophie, respectively.

1886 Le Potentiel thermodynamique et ses applications à la mécanique chimique et à la étude des phénomènes électriques, Paris: Hermann.
1892 “Quelques réflexions au sujet des théories physiques, Revue des Questions Scientifiques, 31: 139–177. English translation in Duhem 1996.
1892 “Notation atomique et hypothèses atomistiques,” Revue des Questions Scientifiques, 31: 391–454.
1893 “Physique et métaphysique,” Revue des Questions Scientifiques, 34: 55–83. English translation in Duhem 1996.
1893 “L'école anglaise et les théories physiques,” Revue des Questions Scientifiques, 34: 345–78. English translation in Duhem 1996.
1894 “Quelques réflexions au sujet de la physique expérimentale,” Revue des Questions Scientifiques, 36: 179–229. English translation in Duhem 1996.
1895 “Les théories de la chaleur” (in 3 parts), Revue des deux mondes, 129: 869–901, 130: 379–415 and 851–68.
1896 “L'évolution des théories physiques du XVIIe siècle jusqu'à nos jours:” Revue des questions scientifiques (2nd series), 40: 463–99.
1902 Les théories électriques de J. Clerk Maxwell: étude historique et critique, Paris: Hermann.
1902 Le mixte et la combinaison chimique, Paris: C. Naud; 2nd. ed., Paris: Fayard, 1985. English translation, Paul Needham, Mixture and chemical combination, and related essays, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2002.
1902 Thermodynamique et chimie, Paris, Gauthier-Villars. English translation, George K. Burgess, Thermodynamics and Chemistry, New York: Wiley, 1903.
1903 L'évolution de la mécanique, Paris: A. Joanin. German translation, P. Frank, Die Wandlungen der Mechanik und der mechanischen Naturerklärung, Leipzig: J.A. Barth, 1912. English translation, Michael Cole, The Evolution of Mechanics, Alphen aan den Rijn: Sijthooff and Noordhoff, 1980.
1903 “Analyse de l'ouvrage de Ernst Mach,” Bulletin des Sciences Mathematiques, 27: 261–83. English translation in Duhem 1996.
1905 “Physique de croyant,” Annales de philosophie chrétienne, 151: 44–67. Republished as an appendix of Duhem 1914.
1905–06 Les origines de la statique, 2 vols., Paris: Hermann. English Translation Grant F. Leneaux, Victor N. Vagliente, and Guy H. Wagener, The Origins of Statics, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1991.
1906 La théorie physique, son objet et sa structure, Paris: Chevalier et Rivière. German Translation Friedrich Adler, Ziel und Struktur der physikalischen Theorien, Leipzig: J.A. Barth, 1908.
1906 Recherches sur l'élasticité, Paris: Gauthier-Villars.
1907 Josiah Willard Gibbs, à propos de la publication de ses mémoires scientifiques, Paris: A. Hermann.
1908 SOZEIN TA PHAINOMENA, essai sur la notion de théorie physique de Platon à Galilée, Paris: Hermann. English Translation Edmond Dolland and Chaninah Maschler, To Save the Phenomena, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1969.
1906–13 Études sur Léonard de Vinci, 3 vols., Paris: Hermann.
1911 “History of Physics,” Catholic Encyclopaedia, New York: R. Appleton, pp. 47–67. Reprinted in Duhem 1996.
1911 Traité d'énergétique ou de thermodynamique générale, 2 vols., Paris: Gauthier-Villars.
1912 “La nature du raisonnement mathématique,” Revue de Philosophie, 12: 531–543. English translation in Duhem 1996.
1913–59 Le système du monde, histoire des doctrines cosmologiques de Platon à Copernic, 10 vols, Paris: Hermann.
1914 La théorie physique son objet et sa structure, 2nd ed., Paris: Chevalier et Rivière. English Translation Phillip Wiener, The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1954.
1915 La science allemande, Paris: Hermann. English translation John Lyon, German Science, La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1991.
1916 La chimie, est-elle une science française? Paris: Hermann.
1917 “Liste des Publications de P. Duhem” and “Notice sur les travaux scientifiques de Duhem,” Mémoires de la Société des Sciences Physiques et naturelles de Bordeaux, 7: 41–169. English translation of Parts 2 and 3 of “Notice” in Duhem 1996.
1985 Medieval Cosmology, Roger Ariew (trans.), Chicago: University of Chicago Press. Partial translation of vols. 7–9 of Le Système du Monde.
1994 Lettres de Pierre Duhem à sa fille Hélène, Stanley L. Jaki (ed.), Paris: Beauchesne.
1996 Essays in History and Philosophy of Science, ed. and translation with Introduction by Roger Ariew and Peter Barker, Indianapolis: Hackett.
1997 L'Aube du savoir: épitomé du système du monde (histoire des doctrines cosmologiques de Platon à Copernic), Anastasios Brenner (ed.), Paris: Hermann. Selections from Duhem 1913–59.

Secondary Sources

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Other Internet Resources

  • Electronic text of Duhem's La théorie physique, son objet, sa structure (1906)]
  • Electronic links to several of the articles in the 1911 Catholic Encyclopedia by Duhem: “History of Physics,” “Pierre de Maricourt,” “Jordanus de Nemore,” “Nicole Oresme,” “Albert of Saxony,” “Thierry of Freburg,” and “Jean de Sax.” Also included are links to Duhem's “Physics of a Believer,” and a few other excerpts.

Related Entries

Albert of Saxony | analytic/synthetic distinction | atomism: 17th to 20th century | Bacon, Roger | Buridan, John [Jean] | condemnation of 1277 | Einstein, Albert: philosophy of science | fictionalism | Galileo Galilei | James, William | Kuhn, Thomas | logic: inductive | Mach, Ernst | Pascal, Blaise | physics: experiment in | Poincaré, Henri | Quine, Willard van Orman | scientific progress | statistical physics: philosophy of statistical mechanics | thought experiments | underdetermination, of scientific theories | Vienna Circle | Whewell, William


I arrived at many of the above interpretations of Duhem's works in collaboration with Peter Barker, whose influence on these interpretations I gratefully acknowledge. I also thank my colleagues, Joanne Waugh, Martin Schönfeld, and Alex Levine, for their criticism of various drafts of this entry.

Copyright © 2011 by
Roger Ariew <rariew@cas.usf.edu>

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