The Epistemology of Modality

First published Wed Dec 5, 2007; substantive revision Mon Apr 13, 2015

Whereas facts about what is actual are facts about how things are, facts about modality (i.e., what is possible, necessary, or impossible) are facts about how things could, must, or could not have been. For example, while there are in fact eleven players on a soccer team, there could have been thirteen, though there couldn’t have been zero. The first of these is a fact about what is actual; the second is a fact about what was possible, and the third is a fact about what is impossible. Humans are often disposed to consider, make, and evaluate judgments about what is possible and necessary, such as when we are motivated to make things better and imagine how things might be. We judge that things could have been different than they actually are, while other things could not have been. These modal judgments and modal claims therefore play a central role in human decision-making and in philosophical argumentation. This entry is about the justification we have for modal judgments.

Most of the time, we encounter what might be called ordinary modal judgments, such as the following:

  1. Although I am a philosopher, I could have been a musician.
  2. Not only does 2 + 2 = 4, it is necessary that 2 + 2 = 4.
  3. Not only is it the case that nothing is red and green all over at the same time, it impossible for something to be red and green all over at the same time.
  4. Although the table is not broken, it could have been broken.
  5. Even though the cup is on the left side of the table, it could have been on the right side.

However, philosophers often, in the course of an argument, formulate what might be called extraordinary modal judgements; these typically are about some special philosophical concept relevant to the discussion. Here are some examples:

St. Anselm
Necessarily: God exists.

It is possible for the mind to exist without the body.

It is impossible for anything to exist unperceived.

Now a modal argument is one in which either a premise or the conclusion is an ordinary or an extraordinary modal judgment. Thus, in modal arguments, we reason about what is necessary, possible, or impossible, or about what might, must, or could not be the case. Modal arguments can therefore be found both inside and outside of philosophy (within philosophy many important philosophical positions are in fact modal positions). Assuming that a modal argument is valid (i.e., the premises validly imply the conclusion), then the evaluation of a modal argument focuses on whether the premises are justified. The question then arises: how does one show that a modal premise of a modal argument is justified?

Philosophers have long been interested in how a modal claim can be known, justified, or understood. The philosophy of modality is the area in which one studies the metaphysics, semantics, epistemology, and logic of modal claims—that is, claims about what is necessary, possible, contingent, essential, and accidental. Epistemology is the general area of philosophy in which one studies the nature of knowledge. The central questions of epistemology concern: (i) what it is to know something, (ii) what it is to be justified in believing something, (iii) what it is to understand something, and (iv) what are the means by which we can come to possess understanding, justification, or knowledge. Within the philosophy of modality one finds the sub-discipline known as the epistemology of modality. The central question of this field is:

How can we come to know (be justified in believing or understand) what is necessary, possible, contingent, essential, and accidental for the variety of entities and kinds of entities there are?

This is similar to the central questions found in the epistemology of mathematics and morality, where one inquires into, the nature of mathematical knowledge or moral knowledge. Special interest in modal epistemology (another name for the epistemology of modality) often derives from the following contrast between knowledge of the actual and knowledge of what could have been and could not have been the case.

In general, perception of the actual world can guide us to knowledge of realized possibilities, possibilities that are actual. For most philosophers hold that given that what is actual is possible, knowledge of actuality can inform us of knowledge of some possibilities. However, actuality appears to be an insufficient guide to what is: (a) merely possible, since the possibility is not realized, or (b) impossible, since what is actually the case does not tell us what could not be the case. To better understand this phenomenon, consider a cup, \(c\), located at \(L\) at time \(t\). The following line of reasoning illustrates the central question and its special interest in the case of ordinary possibilities.

  • Actual world fact: \(c\) is at \(L\) at \(t\), and \(S\) perceives that \(c\) is at \(L\) at \(t\).
  • Knowledge of actuality: \(S\) knows that \(c\) is at \(L\), since \(S\) perceives \(c\) at \(L\) and there is no reason for \(S\) to believe that their perception of \(c\) at \(L\) is misguided.
  • Actuality-to-Possibility Principle: If \(P\) is actually true, then \(P\) is possibly true, since realized possibilities are evidence of possibility.
  • Knowledge of Realized Possibilities: \(S\) can know that it is possible for \(c\) to be at \(L\) through derivation from the actuality-to-possibility principle and perception of the actual world fact.
  • Non-Actual/Unrealized Possibility Datum: \(c\) could have been at \(L^*\), a location distinct from \(L\), at \(t\).
  • \(S\) believes that \(c\) could have been at \(L^*\) at \(t\), and \(S\) can come to know that \(c\) could have been at \(L^*\) at \(t\).
  • Epistemic Question: How does \(S\) know that \(c\) could have been at \(L^*\) at \(t\)?

With respect to the epistemic question, all of the following have been proposed as potential answers:

  • Perception: even though \(c\) is not at \(L^*\). \(S\) sees that \(c\) could be at \(L^*\).
  • Intuition: even though \(c\) is not at \(L^*\), \(S\) has a non-sensory based intuition that \(c\) could be at \(L^*\) when \(S\) entertains the question: could \(c\) have been at \(L^*\)?
  • Conceivability: \(S\) can conceive of a scenario in which \(c\) is at \(L^*\). \(S\) derives justification for believing that \(c\) can be at \(L^*\) from conceiving of it.
  • Imaginability: Were \(S\) to imagine a process whereby \(c\) moved from \(L\) to \(L^*\), \(S\) would not arrive at a contradiction. So, \(S\) is justified in believing that \(c\) could have been at \(L^*\) on the basis of imagining the movement.
  • Deduction: \(S\) can deduce from knowledge of what \(c\) is fundamentally and the relevant details about location \(L^*\) that \(c\) could have been at \(L^*\), since what \(c\) is fundamentally is not incompatible with it being at \(L^*\).
  • Theory: From \(S\)’s knowledge of what \(c\) is, as well as the relevant facts about the location of \(L^*\), \(S\) can come to know that \(c\) could have been at \(L^*\).
  • Similarity: From \(S\)’s prior observation of objects relevantly similar to \(c\), as well as their actual locations and movement, \(S\) can come to know that \(c\) could have been at \(L^*\).

In addition to these theories, one overarching idea is that they can either be offered as part of a uniformity account or as part of a non-uniformity account of modal knowledge. The uniformity view holds that there is only one single route to modal knowledge at the most fundamental level of explanation. The non-uniformity view maintains either that different people can come to know the same modal truth through different routes or that at the fundamental level of investigation there must be more than one route to modal knowledge.

In addition to the central question there are three other main questions of interest.

Modal Sorting:
how can we knowledgeably sort necessary truths from essential truths and contingent truths?

At least one point of interest in the sorting question derives from work in the metaphysics of modality. Necessity and possibility are interdefinable, \(P\) is necessary when it is not possible that not-\(P\). However, some such as Fine (1994), have argued that essence cannot be defined in terms of necessity. This leads us to the question: how can we sort the essential from the necessary?

Modal Skepticism:
what are the limits of modal knowledge?

At least one point of interest in the skeptical question derives from work on the range of modal knowledge. All theories of modal knowledge should be able to account for ordinary cases. However, some, such as Van Inwagen (1998), have presented skeptical arguments about extending modal knowledge to a variety of exotic philosophical claims.

Modal Architecture/Epistemic Priority:
given that there is a distinction between necessity, possibility, and essence, is knowledge of one more fundamental than knowledge of the others? For example is our knowledge of necessity more fundamental than our knowledge of possibility and essence, and additionally a pathway to our knowledge of both possibility and essence?

At least one point of interest in the architecture/epistemic priority question derives from work on the proper route to modal knowledge. Bob Hale (2003) has drawn an important distinction between necessity-first and possibility-first approaches to modal knowledge. A necessity-first approach holds that we first arrive at knowledge of necessary truths, and then derive knowledge of possibility through compatibility with knowledge of necessity. A possibility-first approach holds that we first arrive at knowledge of possible truths, and then aim to determine what necessary truths hold.

It is important to take note of two points about general inquiry in the epistemology of modality. First, the field is typically concerned with investigating (i) alethic modality (modality concerned with what could have been true), as opposed to epistemic modality (modality concerned with what might be true in an epistemic sense of “might”) or deontic modality (modality concerned with what might be done in some normative or evaluative sense). Second, (ii) the investigation centers on metaphysical modality, as opposed to logical or physical modality.

For those that accept the reality of metaphysical inquiry, metaphysical modality is often understood as being the modality concerned with metaphysics as opposed to logical modality, which concerns itself with logical relations or physical modality, which concerns itself with physical relations. In addition, on the standard model of the relation between these kinds of modalities the logical possibilities are the most inclusive; they include any proposition that sheer logic leaves open, no matter how otherwise impossible it might be. The metaphysical possibilities are the logical possibilities that are also allowed by the natures of all of the things that could have existed. The physical possibilities are the logical and metaphysical possibilities that are also allowed by the physical laws of nature. On the standard model, the following nesting relation holds:

diagram with 3 concentric ovals labeled from inner to outer as: physical, metaphysical, logical

This entry will focus on a selection of theories in the epistemology of modality.

1. Introduction

1.1 Kripke on a posteriori Necessities and The Deduction Model

Contemporary analytical debates in the epistemology of modality often take Saul Kripke’s (1971, 1980) defense of a posteriori necessities (necessities that are knowable only through sense experience, and not by way of abstract reflection alone) and his deduction model of how we arrive at knowledge of them as a point of departure. In order to better understand what an a posteriori necessity is, it will be important to first introduce the central idea of possible worlds semantics (PWS). Consider the following claims:

  1. It is possible that P. For example, although there are 15 people in the room, it is possible that 20 are in the room.
  2. It is necessary that P. For example, not only are whales mammals, it is necessary that whales are mammals.
Now ask: under what circumstances are possibilities and necessities like (i) and (ii) true? According to (PWS), (iii) and (iv) provide the truth-conditions for statements of possibility and necessity.
  1. “It is possible that P” is true just in case P is true in some possible world. Thus, “it is possible that 20 people are in the room” is true just in case in some possible world “20 people are in the room” is true.
  2. “It is necessary that P” is true just in case P is true in all possible worlds. Thus, “it is necessary that whales are mammals” is true just in case in all possible worlds “whales are mammals” is true.

Possible worlds are complete alternative realities; they are ways that the whole of reality might have been. Philosophers have various theories of their nature. (For more about them see the possible worlds entry.) With (PWS) in place an a posteriori necessity is a statement that is true in all possible worlds, and what makes it a posteriori is that it is knowable only by empirical investigation of the actual world. The two most commonly discussed examples are the necessity of Hesperus being identical with Phosphorus, and the necessity of water being identical to H2O. The former case concerns the celestial body Venus, which is picked out by both “Hesperus” and “Phosphorus”. The latter example has to do with theoretical identifications in science, cases in which scientists provide a theoretical identification of a natural kind, such as water, gold, light, or heat by capturing its underlying nature or essence through scientific investigation.

It is uncontroversial that we did, and could only have, come to know that Hesperus = Phosphorus or that water is identical to H2O through empirical discovery. However, controversially, it is argued by Kripke that these claims involve (a) identity statements between rigid designators (terms that pick out the same thing in all possible worlds in which they have reference), and (b) because they are identity statements between rigid designators, the entities they pick out will be identical in all possible worlds in which the terms have reference. His arguments rely in part on his proof of the necessity of identity. Historically, a posteriori necessities were thought to be theoretically impossible. This is largely due to the work of Kant, in his Critique of Pure Reason, and subsequent empiricists, such as A.J. Ayer, that critiqued Kant’s view. Originally, Kant thought that there could be both analytic (non-informative) and synthetic (informative) a priori truths. Later empiricists argued that the class of synthetic a priori truths (“synthetic” roughly in that they are genuinely informative, not self-evident, and “a priori” roughly in that they are known on the basis of purely rational reflections) was incoherent. (For more about a priori justification see the entry on a priori justification and knowledge). As a consequence of these arguments, in the mid 20th century many philosophers thought that the following equivalences were true:

  1. A statement S is a priori if and only if S is necessary.
  2. A statement S is a posteriori if and only if S is contingent.

Kripke’s 1970 lectures, later published as Naming and Necessity (1980), provided a serious challenge to both (i) and (ii). Where “\(\Box\)” stands for “it is necessary that”, in his (1971) he offered the following picture of how we can arrive at knowledge of an a posteriori necessity:

First, it is argued that some sort of fact is necessary, if true: \((P \rightarrow \Box P)\).

Second, that the relevant fact is known to be true by empirical investigation: P.

Third, by deduction from (1) and (2) we arrive at a necessary truth, \(\Box P\), that is known a posteriori because empirical investigation is how the premise P is known.

The first premise in the deduction of an a posteriori necessity involves some necessity-generating principle, a principle that moves from some sort of fact, typically a non-modal fact, to the claim that the fact is necessary. Kripke thought that these principles were usually arrived at through a priori philosophical reflection. Plausible, and often discussed, examples of necessity-generating principles are:

  1. The necessity of identity, which maintains that true identity claims are necessary. For example, it is necessary that water = H2O, since water = H2O, and both “water” and “H2O” are rigid designators.
  2. The necessity of origins, which maintains that the originating matter of a given kind of thing is necessary for its existence. For example, given that a table t is wholly carved from a block of wood m, it is necessary that t originated from m—nothing could be t that did not originate from m. Or, given, that Sheba originated from gamete g, the product of sperm s and egg e, nothing could be Sheba that did not originate from g.
  3. The necessity of fundamental kind, which maintains that the fundamental kind that an entity falls under is necessary for its existence. For example, given that a particular table t is fundamentally a material object, it could not have been non-material. Or, given that a particular organism is a biological kind, such as Sheba being a human being, she could not have been a non-biological kind, and additionally could not have failed to be human.

The second premise in the deduction of an a posteriori necessity is a specific a posteriori truth, a truth that is discovered on the basis of empirical investigation. Given the examples above, the relevant claims would be that, in fact: water = H2O, t originates from m, Sheba originates from g, t is a material object, Sheba is a biological kind, and Sheba is a human.

From the first and second step a specific a posteriori necessity is deduced. For example: necessarily water = H2 O, necessarily the table originates from its original wood, necessarily Sheba originates from g, necessarily the table is a material object, necessarily Sheba is a biological kind, and necessarily Sheba is a human. In general, learning a conclusion by an argument is a species of a posteriori knowledge just in case at least one premise is known a posteriori. In sum, even though the deduction of an a posteriori necessity involves, as Kripke claims, an a priori known necessity generating principle, because the important fact is known a posteriori, the conclusion is both necessary and a posteriori.

As a generalization of Kripke’s model it should be noted that there is no reason why one could not come to know a necessary truth through pure a priori deduction. For example, consider the following:

  1. If 2 + 2 = 4, then it is necessary that 2 + 2 = 4 because mathematical truths are necessary truths.
  2. 2 + 2 = 4.


  1. It is necessary that 2 + 2 = 4.

In this case, if (1) and (2) can be known a priori, the conclusion drawn on the basis of (1) and (2), will be an a priori necessity.

1.2 Epistemic Issues Pertaining to Kripke’s Work

In addition to Kripke’s seminal work, there are four epistemic issues in the epistemology of modality that are frequently discussed. The first two are reactions to Kripke’s work, which challenge the success of his reasoning. The latter two derive from considerations concerning the structure of possible worlds semantics.

1.2.1 The Problem of a posteriori Necessities

It is prima facie plausible to think that all modal knowledge is in principle a priori, since at least perception of actuality cannot provide one with knowledge of mere possibility and necessity. For example, if conceivability is taken to be an a priori exercise, and it is linked to possibility, then it is plausible to think that a priori conceiving that P provides one with a priori justification for believing that P is possible. Likewise, finding P inconceivable provides one with a priori evidence that P is impossible. While this might seem to be the only way that such knowledge can be discovered, this simple thought is challenged by Kripke’s arguments for the existence of a posteriori necessities. The problem is discussed in detail in Yablo’s (1993): Is Conceivability a Guide to Possibility? One of the main problems facing contemporary a priori accounts of the epistemology of modality concerns the existence of a posteriori necessities. Recall that an a posteriori necessity is a statement, such as the identity statement “Water = H2O”, that is metaphysically necessary, yet knowable only a posteriori. As a consequence, a priori accounts face the following potential situation:

  1. To X it seems that P is possible on a priori grounds, such as through conceiving of a scenario S or imagining a situation in which P appears true.
  2. Q is necessary and knowable only a posteriori.
  3. Q implies that P is necessarily false.

(1)–(3) forces an initial question: if there are a posteriori necessities, how can one have a priori knowledge of modality? Sure one might be able to have it in cases of pure a priori reasoning, such as with respect to mathematical knowledge. But how can one’s a priori conceiving of a situation in which, for example, water is present without hydrogen provide one with evidence, sufficient for knowledge, for the claim: it is possible for water to be present without hydrogen? For all one knows they have conceived of a situation or were able to conceive of a situation in which P appears to hold because they do not know the relevant facts which make P inconceivable, since those facts are only knowable a posteriori. Surely one can conceive of a situation in which water does not contain hydrogen, if they simply fail to know that water is H2O. But why consider that situation to be a situation in which water is present, as opposed to some superficially similar substance?

The initial question is explored in further detail in the literature along side the following questions. Given that knowledge is distinct from justification, and is also a stronger relation than justification, do a posteriori necessities pose a problem for a priori justification about modal truths or only for a priori knowledge? Do a posteriori necessities render a priori reasoning merely fallible or also completely unreliable?

1.2.2 The Relevant-Depth Problem

Van Inwagen (1998), taking note of Yablo’s (1993) account of what it is to conceive something, discusses what has come to be a fundamental challenge for theories involving conceivability and imaginability. The problem presented by van Inwagen is related to the problem of a posteriori necessities. Van Inwagen’s goal is to present a limited form of skepticism about modal knowledge. He is not a skeptic about all modal knowledge. His position is that we have a lot of ordinary modal knowledge concerning practical, scientific, and mathematical matters, but perhaps limited extraordinary modal knowledge. Extraordinary modal knowledge concerns matters on the periphery of scientific investigation or in the realm of metaphysical debate. He argues for his skepticism about extraordinary modal knowledge on the basis of an analogy with judgments of distance by the naked eye. He maintains that in a range of cases, naked-eye judgments of distance are reliable, though fallible; and likewise in a range of cases, modal judgments about ordinary practical matters and scientific matters are also reliable, though fallible. However, he argues that just as judgments of distance by the naked eye break down in certain cases, judgments about extraordinary modal claims based on conceiving or imagining a situation that appears to verify a statement equally break down. The main issue concerns how we can be confident that we have conceived things to the relevant level of depth required for the scenario to actually be a presentation or manifestation of a genuine possibility.

Given a particular statement S, van Inwagen raises the question: how does one know that the relevant depth of the scenario they have imagined is sufficient to ground the truth of the statement S? For example, conceiving of a situation in which mathematicians announce that a theorem has been proved is not sufficient for believing that the theorem is provable, since we can easily conceive of impossibilities being announced as proven by mathematicians. It would appear that what is required is for one to conceive of the proof itself or something in the vicinity of it that leads to a proof. With reference to the example of water, one might say that the reason one found the statement water is present without hydrogen conceivable is that one had not conceived of the scenario in sufficient enough detail. The appearance of possibility is explained by a failure to have the relevant depth of detail. Conceiving of a liquid and supposing that hydrogen is not a component of it does not constitute the relevant depth of detail. Much more would appear to be required, such as conceiving of how the liquid would still boil at its normal temperature without hydrogen. The general problem of conceiving to the relevant depth is exacerbated when our judgments concern extraordinary modal claims where we are perhaps less confident about what relevant details would need to be in place for a coherent scenario to reveal a genuine possibility rather than a mere appearance of possibility. For example, what grounds our confidence that we have conceived of a mind without a body simply by conceiving of consciousness without a body being present? For instance, one could imagine that someone is consciously thinking about something while just affirming abstractly that no body is present where the thinking occurs. But is that sufficient? Perhaps much more detail is required to verify that we have conceived of consciousness without materiality.

The challenge van Inwagen sets for modal epistemology is the following: how does one know (or how can one be confident) that one has reached sufficient detail in the scenario they have imagined so as to have included in it the truth of the claim in question rather than an unreliable sign of the truth? Geirsson (2005) and Hawke (2011) have further debated the issue discussed by van Inwagen.

1.2.3 The Causal Isolation Problem

One fundamental problem in the epistemology of modality stems from possible worlds semantics. Recall that (PWS), roughly, is the view that the truth conditions for

  1. It is possible that P.
  2. It is necessary that P.


  1. P is true in some possible world.
  2. P is true in all possible worlds.

The core idea is that possibility is truth in some world while necessity is truth in all worlds. The potential problem caused by possible worlds semantics is the causal isolation problem. The problem can be formulated as follows:

Realism about possible worlds in the metaphysics of modality maintains that (i) facts about possible worlds are the truth-makers for modal statements, and (ii) that possible worlds are not causally connected to the actual world, either because a possible world is a comprehensive concrete universe that is causally isolated from our world or because a possible world is an abstract object, and in virtue of being an abstract object it has no causes or effects on the actual world.

Causal Condition:
X has knowledge of P only if X bears a causal connection to the truth-maker of P.

If one accepts Realism and Causal Condition, then there is a prima facie question: How can we ever know anything about metaphysical modality if we do not bear a causal connection to the truth-makers of modal statements?

The motivation for realism about modality comes from a commitment to the mind-independence of the truth-makers for modal claims. The core idea is that what makes a possibility or necessity claim true is not some fact about human minds, but some fact about the entities themselves. “It could have been the case that Rachel has a brother” is true not because Rachel can merely imagine it. Rather, it is true because something independent of her mind grounds the truth, in the case of (PWS), that independent something is part of a possible world.

The motivation for the causal condition often comes from an examination of cases of perception. When perception provides knowledge, part of the explanation appears to be that a causal connection obtains between the subject and the truth-maker of one’s belief. For example, on some accounts of knowledge, seeing a fish in a bowl can provide one with knowledge of the fact that there is a fish in the bowl, partly in virtue of the fact that there is a causal relation that obtains between a fact in the world and the perceiver’s mind.

It is important to note that the causal condition has been argued by some to be either categorically inappropriate or irrelevant as a requirement on a domain that is essentially non-spatio-temporally related to us. The general idea is that a causal condition is appropriate for concrete objects in the spatio-temporal realm, but not for entities outside of the spatio-temporal realm. For discussion of this issue see Lewis (1986). The problem as debated in the contemporary literature for the case of modality finds its most explicit expression in Peacocke’s (1997) discussion of the integration challenge for modality, and his landmark (1999) work Being Known. For further discussion of Peacocke’s solution see Roca-Royes (2010), and for critical discussion of how to eliminate the challenge see Bueno and Shalkowski (2004, 2014).

1.2.4 Skepticism based on Evolution

A related worry to the causal isolation problem comes from naturalistic accounts of epistemology that are grounded in the idea that our capacities for knowledge must be consistent with evolutionary explanations of our cognitive capacities. The arguments are aimed at the very possibility of having justification for beliefs about metaphysical modality. The problem is developed most directly by Nozick (2003: Ch. 3), and depends on two claims: (i) a necessary condition for being justified in believing that P is that a subject have a reliable belief forming module or faculty for the domain in question, and (ii) that evolution by natural selection provides the best explanation for which reliable belief forming mechanisms we possess. The Nozickian evolutionary skeptic argues as follows:

  1. There is no adaptive advantage to getting things right about all possible worlds.
  2. If there is no adaptive advantage to getting things right about all possible worlds, then there is no module or faculty for detecting truths about all possible worlds; and since truth in all possible worlds is the definition of metaphysical necessity, there is no module or faculty for detecting metaphysical necessity.
  3. If there is no reliable module or faculty for detecting necessity, then none of our beliefs about necessity are justified.
  4. So, we are not justified in any of our specific beliefs to the effect that something is metaphysically necessary.

There are three kinds of claims that the Nozickian skeptic brings forth to establish (1):

  1. Our ability to imagine different scenarios is constrained by how evolution engineered our mind, and as a consequence it may not have the power to consider all the possible scenarios.
  2. Whenever we have an appearance of possibility or necessity, the appearance is best explained as being about something other than metaphysical possibility or necessity.
  3. There may be an adaptive advantage to having appearances of impossibility, when in actuality what appears impossible is possible.

Although (a)–(c) are controversial. Some initial plausibility can be given to each.

One reason to accept (a) is that there is no reason to believe that our imagination should be able to track all possibilities. It is likely that our imagination was engineered through evolution to deal primarily with local possibilities in our environment, such as the possibility of an object located in one place being located at another place or the possibility of an object moving at one speed moving at a much faster speed. In dealing with local possibilities, it may not have the capacity to consider all possibilities reliably.

One reason to accept (b) is that metaphysical possibility and necessity, as defined as truth in some possible world and truth in all possible worlds may itself reduce either to logical possibility and necessity or physical possibility and necessity. For our appearances of possibility and necessity to be about metaphysical possibility and necessity it must be the case that the best explanation is that there is a unique kind of modality picked out by “metaphysical modality” and that this modality is the best explanation for what our appearances of possibility and necessity are really about. If metaphysical modality collapses either into logical modality or physical modality, then there is no reason to believe that our appearances of possibility and necessity are really about metaphysical modality.

One reason to accept (c) is by analogy. Appearances of the world often present things to us in a way that may be better for us to process for the purpose of survival. Take the case of perception. On one account of perception and the world, the manifest image of the world as containing medium-sized objects, such as tables and trees, is false. Fundamental physics seems to be capable of complete explanations with no need for tables and trees, so perhaps they don’t really exist.. However, it may be that for human survival it is better for us, in perception, such as vision, to see things as medium-sized dry goods, such as tables and trees, since it is easier for us to navigate and organize our lives around such macroscopic entities. In addition, it may be that there are certain possibilities that we cannot imagine simply because it is better for us either not to be able to see the possibility or because the forces that drove evolution pushed our minds to a place where taking something to be impossible was better than revealing it to be possible.

It is important to note that Nozick’s argument depends on the claim that if there is no reliable module or faculty for detecting necessity, then none of our beliefs about necessity are justified. With respect to this assumption one might argue that although there is no specific faculty for detecting necessity, we are capable of reasoning our way to necessity by way of other faculties that we do have. Counterfactual theories of the epistemology of modality typically take this approach (see section 3 for discussion)

2. Rationalist Theories

Rationalist theories, in one way or another, are grounded in the idea that despite the existence of a posteriori necessities, there is still a great deal of modal knowledge to be gained through a priori means. These views are often not concerned with modal knowledge with respect to a priori matters, such as in the case of logic and mathematics. Rather, these views are concerned with the extent to which we can have rational modal knowledge of matters outside of logic and mathematics, such as with respect to natural kinds or consciousness. The views differ on how much a priori knowledge they endorse, and how they account for it. In this section I review David Chalmers’s Modal Rationalism, Christopher Peacocke’s Principles of Possibility, E.J. Lowe’s Serious Essentialism, and Bob Hale’s Essentialism. Important rationalist accounts, not discussed here, are: Laurence Bonjour’s (1998) In Defense of Pure Reason, George Bealer’s (2002) The Rationalist Renaissance, Keith Hossack’s (2007) The Metaphysics of Knowledge, Jonathan Ichikawa and Benjamin Jarvis’s (2011) Rational Imagination and Modal Knowledge, and Christian Nimtz’s (2012) Conceptual Truths, Strong Possibilities, and Metaphysical Necessity. In studying rationalist theories it is important to note that some theories may not give an explicit answer to the central question. Rather, they may give an account of what the connection is between the a priori and the necessary or between conceptual truths and necessity; or they may give an account of how intuition is reliable, and then argue that modal knowledge can be gained by way of intuition. The theories below are discussed because they aim to directly address the central question.

2.1 Modal Rationalism

In a series of papers (1996, 2002, 2010: Ch. 6) David Chalmers articulates, defends and responds to a number of objections to the view that conceivability entails possibility. Chalmers’s account is not the only account of conceivability in the contemporary literature. Both Yablo (1993) and Menzies (1998) provide important accounts of conceivability. The main difference between their accounts and Chalmers’s is that their views are defenses of evidential theories as opposed to entailment theories. An evidential account aims to show how conceivability provides evidence for possibility. An entailment account goes further and aims to show how in specific cases conceivability entails possibility. Evidential accounts face the problems posed by the existence of a posteriori necessities and the issue of conceiving to the relevant depth of detail. By contrast, Chalmers’s Modal Rationalism is an entailment account; and thus must go beyond what evidential accounts offer. His main positive thesis is:

Weak Modal Rationalism (WMR):
Primary Positive Ideal Conceivability entails Primary Possibility.

(WMR) is constructed out of three distinctions:

  1. Prima facie vs. Ideal rational reflection.
  2. Positive vs. Negative conceivability.
  3. Primary vs. Secondary conceivability/possibility.

The first distinction pertains to the issue of what kind of reasoning has gone into what one has conceived. A prima facie conception is just a person’s initial reaction to a scenario, without reasoning further about the scenario. Better reasoning often gives one reason to doubt a prima facie conception. Ideal rational reasoning, by contrast, is reasoning that cannot be weakened by further reasoning. When an entailment link between conceivability and possibility is to be forged, the kind of reasoning involved has to be ideal. This distinction is used to deal with the problem of relevant-depth. At the level of ideal reasoning the relevant-depth of detail in the scenario has, arguably, been reached.

The second distinction pertains to two distinct ways in which one can engage in conceiving. Positive conceivability corresponds to actually constructing a scenario. In such a case one constructs a story in which a proposition can be verified to be true by the available details given. The story need not be a complete description of a scenario, but it must be sufficiently detailed so as to verify the statement being considered. By contrast, negative conceivability corresponds to not being able to rule out a certain statement. Negative conceivability is often weaker than positive conceivability, since it often derives from ignorance of the relevant facts. For example, if one does not know that water is identical to H2O, they may find the statement “water does not contain hydrogen” conceivable because they cannot rule out the statement “water does not contain hydrogen” as being a priori incoherent. By contrast, conceiving of water without hydrogen in the positive sense requires constructing a scenario in which water is present without hydrogen at the relevant depth of detail required to verify the claim. Arguably, that sort of scenario cannot be constructed.

The third distinction pertains to two distinct ways in which we can evaluate statements across possible worlds. The distinction between primary and secondary conceivability/possibility rests on two independent theories: Epistemic Two-Dimensional Semantics (E2-D) and Modal Monism (MM). Each of these theories is at the heart of Chalmers’s impressive contribution to the epistemology of modality. For an extended discussion of each see Chalmers (2004, 2010). For discussion of a related account of two-dimensional semantics see Jackson (1998, 2004). For an extended more complete discussion of Two-Dimensional Semantics see Schroeter (2012).

The distinction between primary and secondary conceivability and possibility is used to overcome the problem posed by the existence of a posteriori necessities in a way that allows for an entailment link between conceivability and possibility to be forged. What follows first is an intuitive account, followed by a brief technical account of Chalmers’s modal rationalism.

Consider the question: Could water have been something other than H2O? On (E2-D) there is both a yes answer and a no answer depending on how we read the question.

The yes answer comes from reading the question as follows: what would our term “water” have picked out, were we to have applied it to something that looks like water, but has a different chemical composition? That is, we can imagine a substance that looks like water, plays the actual world water-role, but in fact is some other chemical substance. And, we can imagine ourselves having used the term “water” to pick out that substance, rather than H2O. The yes answer comes from thinking about what “water” would have picked out in a world where a different substance plays the water-role.

The no answer comes from reading the question as follows: given what water actually is, what could it have been? We used the term “water” to pick out a certain substance in our environment that plays a certain role. Scientists have discovered that water is identical to H2O. We also have good reason to believe water is essentially H2O. That is, we hold that water’s fundamental chemical nature reveals the essence of what water is. Now if we take the essentialist claim seriously, then we cannot imagine a world in which water is not H2O because to imagine water is to imagine H2O. The no answer comes from thinking about what variations water can undergo, given what we have discovered about its essence.

The intuitive explanation is rendered precise through the (E2-D) model that allows for the construction of an a priori link between conceivability and possibility by (i) making conceivability and possibility primarily a property of statements; (ii) distinguishing two kinds of intensions governing statements; (iii) acknowledging one space of worlds over which statements are evaluated; and (iv) distinguishing between two kinds of conceivability and possibility for statements corresponding to each of the intensions. Primary conceivability and possibility are then argued to allow for an entailment between conceivability and possibility.

The distinction between primary and secondary intensions has undergone several revisions and refinements since Chalmers (1996). It is a technical distinction. For the purposes of discussion and understanding, here, I will be presenting a brief formal account of the distinction with respect to the core problem posed by a posteriori necessities. Where S is a statement the distinction between primary and secondary intensions is the following:

  1. The primary intension of S is a function from scenarios to truth-values. The primary intension of S is determined by asking an actual world evaluation question: If the scenario w turns out to be the actual world, what is the truth-value of S in w?
  2. The secondary intension of S is a function from worlds to truth-values. The secondary intension of S is given by asking a counterfactual world evaluation question: Given that w is the actual world, what is the truth-value of S in a distinct world w*?

With the distinction in place the critical question is: how does the distinction between primary and secondary intensions ameliorate the problem posed by the existence of a posteriori necessities so as to enable an entailment between conceivability and possibility? To show how the distinction ameliorates the problem, consider the following example concerning the identity of Hesperus and Phosphorus. Assume, as it is actually the case, that:

  1. “Hesperus” is a name of the planet Venus, it was introduced by the description \(H_1\) = the brightest star seen in the morning. The name “Hesperus” is a rigid designator (it picks out the same thing in all possible worlds where it has reference).
  2. “Phosphorus” is a name of the planet Venus, it was introduced by the description \(P_1\) = the brightest star seen in the evening. The name “Phosphorus” is a rigid designator (it picks out the same thing in all possible worlds where it has reference).
  3. It was an empirical discovery that Hesperus = Phosphorus.
  4. It is metaphysically necessary that Hesperus = Phosphorus, since an identity statement between rigid designators captures a metaphysically necessary identity claim. In addition, this metaphysical necessity can only be known a posteriori, because Hesperus = Phosphorus is only knowable a posteriori.

Now suppose a thinker that knows that Hesperus = Phosphorus aims to conceive of a scenario \(S\) in which Hesperus \(\neq\) Phosphorus in order to determine whether it is possible that Hesperus \(\neq\) Phosphorus. In constructing \(S\) they imagine a scenario in which a planet takes one orbital path and another planet takes a distinct orbital path. Question: Is \(S\) a situation in which one has conceived of Hesperus being non-identical to Phosphorus? According to Kripke the answer is no, because in \(S\) one has simply conceived of a scenario in which our ordinary means of access to the referent of “Hesperus” and “Phosphorus” are occupied by distinct planets. These two planets cannot be Hesperus and Phosphorus, because Hesperus = Phosphorus necessarily.

By contrast, the story that weak modal rationalism offers is the following.

When constructing \(S\) we have two options. We can either construct \(S\) using the names “Hesperus” and “Phosphorus” or we can use the descriptions \(H_1\) and \(P_1\). If we use the names and take into consideration the fact that Hesperus = Phosphorus, then we must come to the conclusion, as Kripke does, that \(S\) is not a situation in which Hesperus \(\neq\) Phosphorus. However, if we use the descriptions \(H_1\) and \(P_1\) and ask ourselves the question “what in a given possible world answers to these descriptions?” we may find out that \(H_1\) and \(P_1\) are satisfied by two distinct planets. Why? Because it is not necessary that \(H_1 = P_1\). There are possible worlds in which the brightest star seen in the morning is not identical to the brightest star seen in the evening. In short, the fact that “Hesperus = Phosphorus” is necessary and knowable only a posteriori does not block the a priori conceivability of “Hesperus \(\neq\) Phosphorus” when we conceive of things only using \(H_1\) and \(P_1\), the descriptions we used to fix the reference of “Hesperus” and “Phosphorus” in the actual world. When we conceive of a scenario in which \(H_1\) and \(P_1\) are satisfied by two distinct planets, we have conceived of a scenario in which Hesperus \(\neq\) Phosphorus. The idea is that conceiving with primary intensions requires that we ask the question:

could it have turned out that the brightest star seen in the morning is not the same star as the brightest one seen in the evening?

This question is distinct from the question:

given that Hesperus = Phosphorus, could it have turned out that Hesperus is not Phosphorus?

The former question concerns primary conceivability, the latter concerns secondary conceivability.

With the distinction between primary and secondary intensions in place, Chalmers argues that while primary conceivability does not entail secondary possibility because of a posteriori necessities, primary conceivability under the right circumstances—positive ideal rational reflection—entails primary possibility.

2.2 Critical Questions for Conceivability

Conceivability accounts face a set of general critical questions.

The Connection Question: How is conceivability connected to possibility? Given that modality is mind-independent and conceivability is mind-dependent, how are the two connected such that conceivability provides evidence of possibility? The question becomes clear when one draws a contrast with perception. Perception, such as vision, generally has a connection to the objects that one perceives. And it is through the causal connection that one can argue that perception provides one with justification for believing something about their environment. By contrast, if possible worlds are causally isolated from us, how does mind-dependent conceivability provide one with justification for believing that something is mind-independently possible?

The Dependence Question: Suppose that conceivability does provide justification for believing that something is possible. Does it succeed in doing so simply because one possesses a distinct kind of modal or non-modal knowledge that allows for conceivability to operate so as to produce justification? For example, does conceivability guide one to the belief that a round square is impossible simply because one knows what squares and circles are, and by examining their definition one can arrive safely at the conclusion that such objects are impossible? Similarly, does one simply find water in the absence of hydrogen possible because one either suppresses the knowledge that water contains hydrogen or one does not know that water does contain hydrogen? The dependence question is important because part of the epistemology of modality is concerned with the question of modal architecture/epistemic priority: what is the source of modal knowledge? Is conceivability an ultimate source of modal knowledge, or is it a derivative source of modal knowledge, dependent on another source, such as knowledge of essence and essential properties?

The Conditions Question: suppose that conceivability does provide justification for believing that something is possible. Does conceivability ever entail possibility? If it does, what are the conditions one must be in for conceivability to entail possibility? Do humans ever instantiate those conditions? For example, in the case of Chalmers’s weak modal rationalism one might agree that conceivability entails possibility in the sense he defends, but question whether humans are ever in the position of ideal rational reflection. See Worley (2003) for discussion.

The Direction Question: There are two directions in which conceivability can be discussed.

  • (CP) If \(P\) is conceivable, then \(P\) is possible.
  • (INCP) If \(P\) is inconceivable, then \(P\) is impossible.

It is theoretically possible that the two theses are logically independent. And that one is more reliable than the other. For example, one could argue that inconceivability is a reliable guide to impossibility, while conceivability is a not a reliable guide to possibility.

The Relational Question: what are the relations between the epistemic domain of a priori and a posteriori knowledge and the metaphysical domain of necessary, essential, and contingent truths? That is, independently of human cognition, what relations obtain between the epistemological and the metaphysical categories?

2.3 The Principles of Possibility

Following the work of Benacerraf (1973) in the philosophy of mathematics, Christopher Peacocke (1997, 1999) develops an epistemology of modality aimed at solving the integration challenge for modality. In general, for a given domain of discourse \(D\) the integration challenge for \(D\) is the challenge of integrating the metaphysics/semantics of \(D\) with an epistemology of \(D\) that ratifies our knowledge of the domain. On the assumption that moderate realism, which maintains that modal truths are mind-independent, is true for modal claims, the integration challenge for modality is to reconcile the mind-independence of modal claims with an epistemology that shows how we can know modal claims even though human thinkers do not bear causal relations to the relevant truth-makers for modal truths. That is, Peacocke aims to solve the causal-isolation problem. He believes that the best way to solve the problem is to adopt moderate rationalism, which

seeks to explain cases of a priori knowledge by appeal to the nature of the concepts that feature in contents that are known a priori. (Peacocke 2004: 199)

In pursuing moderate rationalism for modality Peacocke develops the Principles of Possibility account.

The central commitment of Peacocke’s account is that for a subject to possess the concept of metaphysical modality is for that subject to have tacit knowledge of a specific set of Principles of Possibility that govern their understanding and evaluation of modal discourse. An individual thinker’s tacit knowledge of the Principles of Possibility and the role these principles play in their modal discourse is modeled on the way in which principles of grammaticality govern how normal adult speakers understand and evaluate grammaticality in their native language. The analogy is as follows.

  • Grammaticality
  • i. “Mary school went” is ungrammatical.
  • ii. “Jasvir drove her car” is grammatical.

\(X\) understands, evaluates, and makes grammatical claims, such as (i) and (ii), because \(X\) has tacit knowledge of Principles of Grammaticality \(G_1 \ldots G_n\) in virtue of which grammatical claims, such as (i) and (ii), are understood, evaluated and hold true.

  • Modality
  • iii. It is possible for the chair located by the wall to be located in the corner.
  • iv. It is necessary that any specific human, such as Sheba, is a member of a biological kind.

\(X\) understands, evaluates, and is capable of making modal claims, such as (iii) and (iv), because \(X\) has tacit knowledge of Principles of Possibility in virtue of which modal claims, such as (iii) and (iv), are understood, evaluated, and hold true.

Some central claims of the theory are:

  1. A native adult English speaker can be said to know English grammar, and reliably judge that a sentence \(S\) of English is grammatical even though they are unable to state explicitly the rules of English grammar that render \(S\) grammatical.
  2. A plausible explanation of how a native speaker of a language can be credited with making reliable and knowledgeable claims about the grammaticality of sentences in their native language is in virtue of the fact that they tacitly draw on and know the very principles of grammar that render sentences of the language grammatical. These principles and rules of grammar are for the most part not explicitly expressible by the subject, but they are tacitly known.
  3. Likewise, a person that possesses the concept of metaphysical modality tacitly knows a set of Principles of Possibility in virtue of which any given metaphysically modal judgment holds true.
  4. The Principles of Possibility are the principles that the subject tacitly draws on in making, evaluating and understanding metaphysically modal judgments.
  5. The Principles of Possibility are tacitly known, rather than explicitly known.

Much of Peacocke’s project consists in articulating and defending the Principles of Possibility. (For critical discussion of the Principles of Possibility approach see the symposium on Being Known in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 64(3).) In general, there are two main critical issues that surround the Principles of Possibility. On the one hand, there are issues about circularity. It appears that at several places the conception potentially opens itself up to a charge of circularity in virtue of using one kind of modality to explain another kind of modality. For example, genuine possibility is explained via admissibility of assignment. However, admissibility itself is a modal notion. Thus, one could question whether the modality involved in admissibility is problematic. Peacocke (1999) presents several responses to possible circularity objections. On the other hand, there are issues surrounding the kind of modality that is embraced by the approach. It appears that Peacocke’s account acknowledges an actualist conception of modality rather than a possibilist conception. An actualist maintains that objects, properties and relations that actually exist constitute the basis for the construction of all possible worlds. A possibilist denies this, maintaining that in some possible worlds there are objects, properties, or relations that are not found in the actual world. One might worry that the principles articulated in the theory limit the approach to an actualist ontology. Peacocke (2002b) presents an extension of his view, which aims at accounting for some possibilist claims.

More recently, Sonia Roca-Royes (2010) draws attention to a distinct kind of circularity problem she calls the revenge of the integration challenge. The basic problem is that on Peacocke’s epistemology of modality our knowledge of modality is parasitic on our knowledge of constitutive principles, whether these principles are implicitly or explicitly known. We determine that something is possible or necessary for an entity in part through our knowledge of what is constitutive of the entity. That is, what it is to be the kind of thing in question. For example, if we know that being human is a constitutive property of a given human, such as Tom, then we can come to know that it is impossible for Tom to be a zebra, but that it is possible for Tom to be born somewhat later than he was actually born. As a consequence of this relation between the role of constitutive principles and our evaluation of specific modal claims for the purposes of generating modal knowledge, a comprehensive account of modal knowledge is incomplete without a picture of how we come to know the relevant constitutive principles involved in our evaluations of modal knowledge. Thus, the integration challenge returns when we ask the question: how do we arrive at our knowledge, implicit or explicit, of the constitutive principles that play a role in explaining our modal knowledge? This question is important because arguably in the case of grammaticality there is an innate universal grammar that aids in the acquisition of a local grammar, such as English; by contrast, in the case of modality it could be that no innate universal modal principles exist. Peacocke himself notes the worry,

the provision of a general theory of the constitutive, as opposed to the modal, seems to me to be an urgent task for philosophy. We certainly do not want all the initial puzzlement about modality simply to be transferred to the domain of the constitutive. Only a satisfactory general theory of the constitutive, and an attendant epistemology, can allay this concern. (Peacocke 1999: 166, fn.37)

2.4 Essentialist Deduction

E.J. Lowe (2008a, 2012) and Bob Hale (2013) have independently developed accounts of the epistemology of modality based on metaphysical essentialism. The two core theses of metaphysical essentialism are: (i) entities have essential properties or essences that are not merely dependent on language, and (ii) not all necessary truths capture an essential truth or the essence of an entity. Although their views differ at crucial points in the epistemic landscape, the program they share maintains the following:

Metaphysical Grounding:
The essential properties or essences of entities are the metaphysical ground of metaphysical modality. When we look for an explanation of why something is metaphysically possible or necessary we ultimately look to the essential properties or essences of the entities involved.

Epistemic Guide:
The fundamental pathway to acquiring knowledge of metaphysical modality derives from knowledge of essential properties or essences of the entities involved. When we look for an explanation of how we can know metaphysical modality we ultimately look to our knowledge of essential properties or essences as the basis upon which we make inferences to metaphysical modality.

As a general point, it is important to note that both Lowe and Hale can be taken to endorse symmetric essentialism, which is the view that essence is both the ground and the epistemic pathway to modal knowledge. This view is to be contrasted with asymmetric essentialism, which holds that while essence is the ground of modality, it is not the epistemic pathway. An asymmetric essentialist holds that our knowledge of necessity is prior to our knowledge of essence. And that it is through a special investigation of necessities that we come to possess knowledge of essence by modal sorting.

From a metaphysical point of view both Lowe and Hale share the view that the essential properties of an entity are distinct from the mere metaphysical necessities that are true of the entity. This position is inspired by the work of Fine (1994) on the relation between essence and metaphysical modality. Fine argues against modal conceptions of essence on which it is claimed that an essential property of an object is simply any property the object has in all possible worlds in which it exists. He offers the following argument against the view:

  1. Socrates is not essentially a member of the set only containing Socrates, abbreviated as: {Socrates}. It is not part of the essence of Socrates that he is a member of {Socrates}. What Socrates fundamentally is does not include being a member of {Socrates} through his real nature. Socrates’s real nature is that of being a human. Being human, by itself, has no relation automatically to being the only member of a certain kind of set.
  2. In every possible world in which Socrates exists, sets also exist, since mathematical entities exist in all possible worlds. Thus {Socrates} exists in every possible world in which Socrates exists. As a consequence, Socrates has the property of being a member of {Socrates} in every possible world in which Socrates exists.
  3. It is false that \(E\) is an essential property of \(x\) if and only if \(x\) has \(E\) in every possible world in which \(x\) exists.

Simply put, essential properties are more fine-grained than necessary properties. As a consequence, we cannot simply take essential properties or essences to be what an object has in every possible world in which it exists.

From an epistemological point of view both Lowe and Hale provide a picture of our knowledge of modality that sharply contrasts with accounts that take conceivability or intuition to be our fundamental source of justification for believing metaphysically modal truths. The core contrast, for example with conceivability, is that modal knowledge derives from essentialist knowledge, and that conceivability is explained as being successful only in virtue of our possession of essentialist knowledge that is unpacked in a conceivability exercise.

For the purposes of clarifying his approach, Lowe explains our knowledge of metaphysical necessities through the following procedure:

  1. First, we arrive at a real definition of the entities in question, such as ellipses and cones, or statues and lumps of clay. A real definition of an entity or kind of entity either specifies what the entity is or what the kind is. This can be done either through a standard definition of the thing, or through a generating principle. Next, from an understanding of the relevant real definitions of the entities in question, we arrive at an understanding of their essential properties or essences, such as the essence of an ellipse, a cone, a statue, or a lump of clay.
  2. Second, we reason our way to a conclusion about what is compatible or incompatible with the relevant essential properties or essences.
  3. Third, using a principle linking essential properties and essences with metaphysical necessity and possibility, we conclude that a certain proposition, derived from claims involving the essential properties or essences of the relevant entities in question, is metaphysically necessary or possible.

Both Lowe and Hale offer an account that aims to validate the following pattern of inference:

  1. The real definition of \(X\)s is \(C\).


  1. The essence of \(X\)s is \(C\).
  2. If the essence of \(X\)s is \(C\), and \(R\) is a property incompatible with \(C\), then it is metaphysically impossible for \(X\)s to have property \(R\).
  3. \(C\) is incompatible with \(R\).


  1. It is metaphysically impossible for \(X\)s to have property \(R\).

For example, the real definition of a circle is that it is a set of points in a plane equidistant from a given point. As a consequence, the essence of a circle is that a circle is a set of points in a plane equidistant from a given point. The property of being (a circle) an entity that is a set of points in a plane equidistant from a given point is incompatible with the property of being (a rectangle) a four-sided closed figure consisting of four right angles. Thus, given the essence of circles, it is metaphysically impossible for a circle to have the property that defines rectangles.

2.5 Critical Questions for Essentialism

Essentialism faces a set of critical questions.

  1. What is the fundamental epistemic relation that essentialism is based on? Is it knowledge of essence, justification for beliefs about essence, or understanding of essence that is the basic epistemic relation?
  2. What is the essence of an entity? Are essences the sum of their essential properties? Are essences distinct existences from those things that they are essences of?
  3. What is an essential property, in addition to being a property that an entity has in every possible world where it exits?
  4. Given that there are mathematical kinds, such as circles and numbers, natural kinds, such as water and lightning, and social kinds, such as chairs and paintings, how is it that we can come to know the essence of these distinct kinds of things? Is it the same in all of these cases?
  5. Do all entities have exactly the same kind of essence? Do social kinds have the same kind of real nature or essence that natural kinds and mathematical kinds possess?
  6. For every entity or kind of entity are its essential properties or essence known a priori or are some known a posteriori?
  7. How is the connection or bridge principle between essence and modality known?

These questions allow for a critical examination of essentialist type accounts. For example, concerning (i), Vaidya (2010) defends an understanding-based account of essence, while Lowe and Hale defend a knowledge-based, or what is known as an essentialist-k style theory. Concerning (vii), Horvath (2014) has argued that Lowe’s account of essentialist-k theory suffers from a prima facie problem. An outline of the problem is as follows:

  1. For \(S\) to know that it is possible for \(e\) to be \(F\), \(S\) must know: (i) either some essential properties of \(e\) or the essence of \(e\), and (ii) the bridge principle (B), that if \(H\) is the essence of \(e\), and \(F\) is incompatible with \(H\), then it is impossible for \(e\) to be \(F\).
  2. Assume that \(S\) possesses essentialist knowledge concerning \(e\). Question: how can \(S\) know (B)?
  3. (B) can be known either through (i) intuition, (ii) conceptual analysis, (iii) conceivability, or (iv) via counterfactual imaginability.
  4. Lowe denies that (i)–(iv) are valid ways of knowing in the epistemology of modality. (Lowe 2012: Section 1)
  5. Lowe argues for the no-further-entity account of essence on which an essential property or an essence of an entity is no further entity over and above the entity it is an essence of.
  6. Given (3)–(5), one can argue that it is unlikely that Lowe can provide an account of our knowledge of possibility on the basis of our knowledge of essence.

The core problem is that by saying there is a single source for modal knowledge—via knowledge of essence—Lowe has potentially undermined his ability to provide an account of how one can know (B). One route that is plausible is the following. Argue that (i) conceptual analysis is how we come to know (B), (ii) in all cases of modal knowledge we reason by way of essence, and (iii) as a consequence the epistemology of modality is non-uniform. However, Lowe cannot adopt this route, since he has ruled out knowledge of modality by (i)–(iv). In contrast to Lowe’s account, it is possible for Hale to offer an account of (B) through the use of conceptual analysis or through a treatment of the real definitions of essence and metaphysical modality.

Finally, one important issue that separates Lowe’s account from Hale’s is Lowe’s commitment to epistemic essentialism, which Hale does not endorse. Lowe articulates his epistemic essentialism in his (2008a).

[E]ssence precedes existence. And by this I mean that the former precedes the latter both ontologically and epistemically. That is to say, on the one hand, I mean that it is a precondition of something’s existing that its essence—along with the essences of other existing things—does not preclude its existence. And, on the other hand … I mean that we can in general know the essence of something \(X\) antecedently to knowing whether or not \(X\) exists. Otherwise, it seems to me, we could never find out that something exists. For how could we find out that something, \(X\), exists before knowing what \(X\) is—before knowing, that is, what it is whose existence we have supposedly discovered? (Lowe 2008a: 40)

The epistemic position can be properly captured as:

Epistemic Essentialism:
knowledge of essence must precede knowledge of existence.

And it can be contrasted with two distinct views.

Epistemic Existentialism:
knowledge of existence must precede knowledge of essence.

Epistemic Entanglement:
knowledge of essence neither necessarily precedes knowledge of essence nor is necessarily preceded by knowledge of existence.

3. Counterfactual Theories

3.1 Counterfactuals and Modal Knowledge

Williamson (2005, 2007a,b), Hill (2006), Kroedel (2012), and Kment (2014) have all offered counterfactual theories of modal knowledge. While the four accounts share formal similarities, in this section the focus will be on Williamson’s account. He partially describes his project in the epistemology of metaphysical modality through discussion of the philosophy of philosophy.

Humans evolved under no pressure to do philosophy. Presumably, survival and reproduction in the Stone Age depended little on philosophical prowess, dialectical skill being no more effective then than now as a seduction technique and in any case dependent on a hearer already equipped to recognize it. Any cognitive capacity we have for philosophy is a more or less accidental byproduct of other developments. Nor are psychological dispositions that are non-cognitive outside philosophy likely suddenly to become cognitive within it. We should expect cognitive capacities used in philosophy to be cases of general cognitive capacities used in ordinary life, perhaps trained, developed, and systematically applied in various special ways, just as the cognitive capacities that we use in mathematics and natural science are rooted in more primitive cognitive capacities to perceive, imagine, correlate, reason, discuss… In particular, a plausible non-skeptical epistemology of metaphysical modality should subsume our capacity to discriminate metaphysical possibilities from metaphysical impossibilities under more general cognitive capacities used in general life. I will argue that the ordinary cognitive capacity to handle counterfactual carries with it the cognitive capacity to handle metaphysical modality. (2007b: 136)

Williamson’s counterfactual theory allows for the construction of an abductive anti-skeptical argument against Nozick’s (2003) evolutionary-based skepticism about our knowledge of metaphysical modality.

  1. Skepticism about knowledge of counterfactual conditionals is implausible, since knowledge of counterfactuals is pervasive for human decision-making, planning, and theory construction.
  2. Metaphysical possibility and necessity are logically equivalent to counterfactual conditionals.
  3. Skepticism about knowledge of metaphysical modality independently of skepticism about counterfactual conditionals is uneconomical and implausible, given that the capacity to handle counterfactuals in reasoning brings along with it the capacity to handle metaphysical modality.


  1. Skepticism about knowledge of metaphysical possibility and necessity is implausible.

The key theses of Williamson’s counterfactual theory are:

Logical Equivalence:
metaphysical possibility and necessity can be proven to be logically equivalent to counterfactual conditionals.

Epistemic Pathway:
counterfactual reasoning in imagination through the method of counterfactual development can provide one with justified beliefs or knowledge about metaphysical possibility and necessity.

Williamson presents his proof of the logical equivalence between counterfactuals and metaphysical modality by engaging the work of Robert Stalnaker and David Lewis. However, he does not commit himself to any specific account of the truth-conditions for counterfactual conditionals. The basic idea he employs from Stalnaker and Lewis is the following:

Where “\(A \gt B\)” express “If it were that \(A\), it would be that \(B\)”, (CC) gives the truth conditions for subjunctive conditionals: A subjunctive conditional “\(A \gt C\)” is true at a possible world \(w\) just in case either (i) \(A\) is true at no possible world or (ii) some possible world at which both \(A\) and \(C\) are true is more similar to \(w\) than any possible world at which both \(A\) and \(\neg C\) are true.

With (CC) and “⊥” as a symbol that stands for contradiction, Williamson proves the following logical equivalences between counterfactuals and metaphysical modality:

  • (NEC) \(\Box A\) if and only if \((\neg A \gt \perp)\)

It is necessary that \(A\) if and only if were \(\neg A\) true, a contradiction would follow.

  • (POS) \(\Diamond A\) if and only if \(\neg(A \gt \perp)\)

It is possible that \(A\) if and only if it is not the case that were \(A\) true, a contradiction would follow.

The basic epistemic idea is that a justified belief about necessity and possibility can be arrived at through a counterfactual development, in imagination, of the supposition that \(\neg A\), for the case of necessity, and the supposition that \(A\), for the case of possibility.

Consider the following example from Williamson.

Suppose that you are in the mountains. As the sun melts the ice, rocks embedded in it are loosened and crash down the slope. You notice one rock slide into a bush. You wonder where it would have ended if the bush had not been there. A natural way to answer the question is by visualizing the rock sliding without the bush there, then bouncing down the slope into the lake at the bottom. Under suitable background conditions, you thereby come to know the counterfactual:

  • (*) If the bush had not been there, the rock would have ended in the lake.

(2007b: 142)

According to his theory the general procedure we use to arrive at (*) is the following:

[O]ne supposes the antecedent and develops the supposition, adding further judgments within the supposition by reasoning, offline predictive mechanisms, and other offline judgments. The imagining may but need not be perceptual imagining. All of one’s background beliefs are available from within the scope of the supposition as a description of one’s actual circumstances for the purposes of comparison with the counterfactual circumstances… Some but not all of one’s background knowledge and beliefs are also available within the scope of the supposition as a description of the counterfactual circumstances, according to complex criteria… To a first approximation: one asserts the counterfactual conditional if and only if the development [of the antecedent] eventually leads one to add the consequent. (2007b: 152–153)

From (*) and (POS), one can reason their way to the modal claim (**) by checking whether the development of the counterfactual yields a contradiction.

  • (**)It is possible for the rock to have ended in the lake.

The counterfactual theory, thus, holds the following.

In the case of necessity: if a robust and good counterfactual development of \(\neg A\) yields a contradiction, we are justified in asserting that \(A\) is necessary. And, if a robust and good counterfactual development of \(\neg A\) does not yield a contradiction, we are justified in denying that \(A\) is necessary.

In the case of possibility: we are justified in asserting that \(A\) is possible when a robust and good counterfactual development of the supposition that \(A\) does not yield a contradiction. And we are justified in denying that \(A\) is possible when a robust and good counterfactual development of \(A\) yields a contradiction.

An important component of Williamson’s account derives from his commentary on the traditional distinction between a priori and a posteriori knowledge. Contemporary theorists often maintain that what separates the a priori from the a posteriori is that in the former case experience only plays an enabling role—a role in enabling possession of a concept for an individual thinker—while in the latter case experience plays not only an enabling role, but an evidential role—the justification for a claim involving the concept requires appeal to experience by the thinker making the claim. Williamson maintains that several instances of counterfactual knowledge (the route by which we acquire modal knowledge) will be neither a priori nor a posteriori in any deep or insightful sense. Rather, he acknowledges an extensive category of armchair knowledge under which many cases of our knowledge of metaphysical modality would fall.

We may acknowledge an extensive category of armchair knowledge, in the sense of knowledge in which experience plays no strictly evidential role, while remembering that such knowledge may not fit the stereotype of the a priori, because the contribution of experience was far more than enabling. (2007b: 169)

He defines armchair knowledge as knowledge that is either strictly a priori knowledge or not strictly a priori or a posteriori. In the latter case, the knowledge is such that experience plays no strictly evidential role, but at the same time the role of experience does not fit the model of a priori knowledge, since far too much experience played a role in enabling concept possession and reliable use. Given Williamson’s acknowledgement of armchair knowledge as a domain into which many instances of modal knowledge fall, it is best to describe his view as being an armchair account of modal knowledge, as opposed to a strictly rationalist or non-rationalist account.

3.2 Critical Questions for Counterfactual Imaginability

There are at least four kinds of critical questions that one can ask about counterfactual imaginability as a theory of our knowledge of metaphysical modality.

The Question of Dependence: Does the counterfactual account of our knowledge of metaphysical modality depend on any kind of modal knowledge? If so, is that dependence problematic? Williamson argues that we can come to possess modal knowledge, such as that it is possible for a rock located at \(L\) to be located nearby at \(L^*\). This knowledge can be arrived at through counterfactual reasoning in imagination. However, one might ask does this counterfactual reasoning depend itself on any kind of modal knowledge or essentialist knowledge? Does one need to know in some problematic sense what essentially a rock is or what is possible for a rock, for one to reason counterfactually and correctly to the conclusion that a rock located at \(L\) could be at \(L^*\) without contradiction?

The Question of Imaginative Engagement: Since the counterfactual account of our knowledge of metaphysical modality depends on counterfactual reasoning in imagination, what are the details of how the counterfactual imagination works? What can we learn about the conditions under which the counterfactual imagination is fallible or likely to be successful? What guides our counterfactual development? Why are we prone to imagine things unfolding in one manner rather than another? For example, when we generally imagine where a rock would have landed had a bush not been in its path, we don’t typically imagine that the rock would have suddenly reversed direction from its current path. More over: what epistemic relevance does the fact that our imagination takes certain directions rather than others have on the epistemic status of our counterfactual development of a subjunctive conditional?

The Question of Scope: Given that the counterfactual account of our knowledge of metaphysical modality aims to capture metaphysical modality, does it really do so for the wide range of metaphysically modal claims that are known? Ordinary modal claims, such as that a bush located at \(L\), could be located at \(L^*\), appear to be non-problematic for the very reasons Williamson offers. However, can the account also provide us with modal knowledge of extraordinary modal claims, such as that it is possible for there to be a physical duplicate of a human that is not conscious? If the theory can only deliver knowledge of ordinary, as opposed to extraordinary, modal knowledge, is this a problem?

The Question of Adequacy: Williamson’s account aims to explain our knowledge of modality via our general capacity to handle counterfactuals. One critical question is whether the strategy is explanatorily adequate. For example, Malmgren (2011: 307) questions Williamson’s assumption that we do have a general capacity to handle counterfactuals:

Is it legitimate to suppose that we do have a general capacity to handle counterfactuals? I will argue that it is not; more precisely, that it is not legitimate to suppose that we have a general capacity at the appropriate level of implementation.

Malmgren’s argument aims to show that even though there might be good reasons to reject rationalism about knowledge of metaphysical possibility, Williamson’s argument against rationalism fails. The core of her argument is as follows:

  1. Let rationalism be the view that our knowledge of metaphysical modality is a priori and that we possess a special faculty for acquiring knowledge of metaphysical modality.
  2. The counterfactual theory of modal knowledge that Williamson defends can be seen to be an attempt to explain modal knowledge in terms of counterfactual knowledge so that there is no need to posit a special faculty that provides us with a priori justification for knowledge of metaphysical modality. The counterfactual theory provides an armchair account of our knowledge of metaphysical modality, and not a strictly rationalist account.
  3. However, the appeal to the logical equivalence between counterfactuals and metaphysical modality does not show that there is no special-faculty for reasoning about metaphysical modality at a lower level of implementation that is a priori across a range of philosophically interesting cases involving metaphysical modality.


  1. The argument against rationalism, via the appeal to our general capacity to handle counterfactuals, fails.

The core of Malmgren’s argument rests on (3). She offers several reasons, which are paraphrased below.

  1. There is a trivial and uncontroversial sense in which we have the capacity to handle counterfactuals. This trivial and uncontroversial sense does not compete with rationalist explanations of our knowledge of metaphysical modality at the same level of explanation. (2011: 309)
  2. A general capacity to handle counterfactuals can be implemented in distinct ways even within the same subject. (2011: 309–310)
  3. If there are multiple mechanisms and ways in which our general capacity to handle counterfactuals can be realized, then it is theoretically possible that in the case of metaphysical modality there is a more specific mechanism at play, and that it provides a priori justification over a range of philosophically interesting cases, such as whether it is metaphysically possible for a person to have a justified true belief without knowledge. (2011: 310)
  4. Most cognitive scientists working on the evaluation of counterfactuals agree that counterfactual evaluation is far from a unified affair—it involves many different capacities and/or mechanisms. Which mechanism gets recruited in a specific case appears to depend, among other things, on the content and complexity of the given counterfactual claim, and the background beliefs of the subject. (2011: 311)
  5. Counterfactual judgments are heterogeneous in the following respects. Some judgments are capable of being justified a priori and others are capable of only being justified a posteriori. For example: “If I had made the supper it would have been inedible” can only be justified a posteriori, while “If twelve people had been killed more than eleven people would have been killed” can be justified a priori. (2011: 315).

Malmgren’s argument questions the adequacy of whether or not a general capacity to evaluate counterfactuals can provide a complete explanation of our knowledge of metaphysical modality.

4. Non-Rationalist Accounts

Non-rationalist accounts of the epistemology of modality aim to explain modal knowledge through mechanisms other than that afforded by a priori reasoning. For example, Carrie Jenkins (2010) offers a non-rationalist account of conceivability grounded in a theory of concepts, and Peter Kung (2010) has developed a sensory-based theory of imagination as a guide to possibility. In general, there are two independent threads of thought that motivate non-rationalism about the epistemology of modality. On the one hand, there is the perceived failure of rationalist attempts to provide a comprehensive account of modal knowledge. Rebecca Hanrahan (2009) and Sonia Roca-Royes (2010, 2011a,b, 2012) provide a treatment of some of the problems with modal rationalism, moderate rationalism, and counterfactual accounts of modal knowledge. On the other hand, some theorists have developed, in detail, non-rationalist theories of the epistemology of modality. For example, Crawford Elder (2005) defends an empiricist account of our knowledge of essence through the test of flanking uniformities. Stephen Biggs’s (2011) defends an abductive account of modality where inference to the best explanation plays a central role in how we acquire and account for modal knowledge. Ásta Sveinsdóttir (2013) defends a conferralist theory of our knowledge of essence, on which essence of an object is not mind-independent, but rather conferred by our practices and consideration of hypothetical scenarios. Amie Thomasson (2013) articulates and defends modal normativism, on which modal discourse is not to be taken as being descriptive. That is modal claims don’t describe modal reality, rather they are normative, and about how we are supposed to use language. Thomas Holden (2014), in articulating Hume’s view of absolute necessity, defends a modal expressivist reading of him. On this account modal discourse expresses the limits of what we can find imaginable and unimaginable. Robert Fischer (forthcoming) defends a theory-based account of the epistemology of modality, on which our modal knowledge primarily derives from the theories both modal and non-modal that are justified through inference to the best explanation. In the next two sections I will discuss in more detail the non-rationalist program known as modalism, articulated and defended by Otávio Bueno and Scott Shalkowski, and the similarity-based view articulated and defended by Sonia Roca-Royes.

4.1 Modalism

Bueno and Shalkowski (2014) defend modalism about the metaphysics and epistemology of modality. For an extended examination of modalism see their (2009) and (2013). For the purposes of the epistemology of modality, modalism maintains the following:

  1. Alethic metaphysical modality is primitive.
  2. Modality does not reduce to quantification over possible worlds. That is, “it is possible that \(P\)” does not mean that “\(P\) is true in some possible world”, and “it is necessary that \(P\)” does not mean that “\(P\) is true in all possible worlds”.
  3. The theory does not appeal to or use possible worlds.
  4. An empiricist-friendly approach to the epistemology of modality does not depend on conceivability or the postulation of possible worlds.

The metaphysical point of departure for modalism comes from understanding why the attempt to reduce modality to possible worlds semantics might be unacceptable. Consider the following two claims about the conditions under which a statement of possibility and necessity are true:

  • (P) \(P\) is possible when \(P\) is true in some world.
  • (N) \(P\) is necessary when \(P\) is true in all worlds.

(P) and (N) give the wrong truth conditions when we allow worlds to include both possible and impossible worlds. The problem is that (P) would supposedly allow for a statement to be true even if it was only true at an impossible world, while (N) would force it to be the case that a statement is necessary only when it is true in all worlds, both possible and impossible. This forces the appropriate amendment: restrict “world” in (P) and (N) to make reference only to possible worlds. Hold as a background assumption that there are no impossible worlds. This yields the following result:

  • (P*) \(P\) is possible when \(P\) is true in some possible world.
  • (N*) \(P\) is necessary when \(P\) is true in all possible worlds.

However, one might object that an account of the truth conditions for possibility and necessity so described is really circular or a non-genuine reduction of modality to something genuinely non-modal. Modalism is in part motivated by the idea that modality is primitive, and that reasoning through such reductions as offered by (P) and (N) to (P*) and (N*) reveals why.

Another point of departure for the modalist program in the epistemology of modality is that because there is no postulation of possible worlds that serve as the truth-makers for claims about possibility and necessity there is no worry that in knowing modal truths we must come into contact with privileged objects that are not thought to be accessible to human minds. In sum, the causal isolation problem is avoided, since there are no causally isolated possible worlds upon which modal truths depend.

The epistemic component of modalism begins with:

  • (INC) If a set of claims is inconsistent, then it is impossible for those claims to be jointly satisfied.

Two basic epistemic principles are involved in the construction of the account:

  • (E1) The stronger the claim, the stronger the grounds required for rational belief in the claim.
  • (E2) Any grounds sufficient for rational belief in a claim are sufficient for rational belief in a weaker claim entailed by the stronger claim.

Intuitively Bueno and Shalkowski hold that a claim \(P\) is stronger than a claim \(Q\) just in case \(P\) says more about the world than \(Q\) does. For example, “snow is white and grass is green” is stronger than “snow is white or grass is green”, since the former requires that two things about the world be true, while the latter only requires that at least one thing about the world be true. Now, since the claim that \(P\) is actual is stronger than the claim that \(P\) is possible, one is always in a position to from a rational belief that \(P\) is possible when \(P\) is actual. However, this leaves open two questions: How can we know non-actual possibilities? How can we know necessities?

Bueno and Shalkowski describe their account of our knowledge of non-actual possibilities as follows:

On our account, what grounds modal knowledge is ultimately our knowledge of the relevant modal properties of the objects under consideration. Conceivability plays no role in our proposal…Suppose we are trying to determine whether we know that the table Hemingway used to write on in his Key West house would have broken had a 26, 000-pound giant African bull elephant sat on it. We say that the table—which, despite Hemingway’s adventures, has never encountered such an elephant—would have broken. On our account, we know that it would have broken simply by knowing the properties that such an elephant has and the properties the table has, modal in character as they already are. (Bueno and Shalkowski 2014: 4.1)

The core idea of their account is that for many cases of modal knowledge we arrive at modal knowledge by investigating the relevant properties and objects in question rather than turning to some special property, such as conceivability. For example, one can know that it is possible for a table \(t\), which is unbroken, to break because \(t\) is breakable. How is that we come to know this piece of ordinary modal knowledge? We do so on the basis of our knowledge of wood, chemical bonds, and the physical relations the table can find itself in, such as having a giant bull elephant sit on it. As Bueno and Shalkowski point out:

There are no bonds than which nothing can be stronger. There are no things composed of other things that are indestructible… Claims about the relative strengths of bonds and of both internal and external forces suffice to warrant a belief that your standard wooden table is breakable. This is so, even if the table before [one] is the first ever to be constructed. (2014: 4.1)

What about necessities? To understand the case of necessity one must ask the question: when is one epistemically entitled to believe that something is necessary and not merely true? The central idea that Bueno and Shalkowski develop as an answer to this question is the following.

Let \(C_{n+1}\) be a claim for which one wants to add a necessity operator to, such as through the transition from (2) to (3).

  1. \(C_{n+1}\)
  2. It is necessary that \(C_{n+1}\).

One is entitled to make the transition from (2) to (3) in certain cases, such as when C has been derived from assumptions/premises that can be dispensed with. Let the general assumptions/premises from which C follows be catalogued in (1).

  1. \(C_1\ldots C_n\)

In cases of zero premise deduction, \(C = C_1\). And in those cases, for example, one can make the transition to (3), since any claim that requires no premises for its proof is a claim that is true no matter what, and thus necessary. For example the axioms of a logical system, such as first order classical logic, may endorse the law of excluded middle:

  • (LEM) \((P \lor \neg P)\)

(LEM) can be proved in classical first-order logic from no premises. So, one is entitled to transition from (LEM) to the necessity of (LEM).

  • (NLEM) It is necessary that \((P \lor \neg P)\)

In addition, given that anything that follows from something that is necessary is itself necessary, one can also conclude that a claim is necessary when it can be derived from a set of necessary truths. A clear case of this occurs when one deduces a theorem from axioms of a logical system. Given that each axiom is itself necessary, the theorem derived only from the axioms, is itself necessary.

One of the key focal points of the approach to necessity offered by Bueno and Shalkowski’s modalism is that one needs to pay attention to the premises or assumptions that go into a proof of necessity. One might characterize the approach to necessity as an argument-based approach, upon which, endorsing a necessity claim amounts to endorsing the premises, and being justified in believing the conclusion requires being justified in believing the premises.

The core idea, then, is that in so far as the premises and assumptions in \(C_1\ldots C_{n+1}\) are non-controversial or accepted by all parties, and as long as \(C_{n+1}\) can be deduced from \(C_1\ldots C_n\), all relevant parties are justified in believing \(C_{n+1}\) to be necessary. Bueno and Shalkowski hold that one is justified in believing something to be necessary when one is justified in believing that something holds no matter what. Warranted belief in the necessity of a claim must at least tacitly arise from warranted belief that something holds no matter what. As a consequence, the focus of the dispute over whether, for example, the necessity of origins holds, amounts to dispute over the premises and assumptions used to derive the necessity of origins.

It may turn out that the argument-based approach to necessity deployed by modalism is limited in that many extraordinary modal claims, claims for example about the necessity of origins, are such that there is no secure ground for them, since they rest on controversial metaphysical principles. By contrast the approach may deliver many ordinary modal claims, claims that are natural extensions of well-grounded scientific and mathematical theories.

One important critical question for the modalist view is: how much knowledge of modal matters can we derive from non-modal knowledge?

For example, in the passage from above we learn the following:

By investigating (i) the non-modal properties of some entities, such as the structure of a table and an elephants weight and when tables usually break under certain kinds of force we can come to form rational beliefs about (ii) the modal properties of certain objects, such as the breakability of the table. However, one might question how far this strategy can go. In what kind of cases does this approach work? And if the approach does break down in certain cases, what accounts for the difference between cases where the approach succeeds and where it fails?

4.2 Similarity as a Guide to Knowledge of De re Possibility

Within metaphysics and the philosophy of modality it is standard practice to draw two important distinctions. On the one hand, a distinction between abstract entities and concrete entities is drawn. Typically, the former are taken to be entities that exist outside of space and time, and the latter are taken to be entities that exist within space and time. For example, some claim that numbers, such as 2, are abstract objects, while particular plants, such as a rose, are concrete objects. On the other hand, a distinction is drawn between de re and de dicto modality. Although the distinction is controversial (see the supplement to propositional attitude reports on the de re/de dicto distinction), at least on one account the distinction holds the following:

A sentence is semantically de re just in case it permits substitution of co-designating terms without changing the truth-value of the sentence. Otherwise, it is semantically de dicto. For example, the sentence “Lois believes that Superman can fly” is semantically de dicto, since if we substitute the co-designating name “Clark Kent” for “Superman” the sentence moves from being true to false. By contrast, the sentence “Mark Twain is a writer” is semantically de re, since if we substitute the co-designating name “Samuel Clemens” for “Mark Twain” the sentence remains true.

Sonia Roca-Royes (forthcoming) defends a similarity-based view of how we can come to know de re possibilities for concrete entities, such as a table. Her view is important because it explores the area of modal epistemology that concerns de re modality as opposed to de dicto modality. The latter has often been the central focus point of rationalist theories in the epistemology of modality.

The naïve starting point for her account is the following:

I know that the wooden table in my office, Messy, is not broken. How do I know that? I see it. Although not broken, Messy can break. How do I know that? Because the table I had before Messy, which we may call “Twin-Messy”, was a twin-sister of Messy, and it broke; and I know that Twin-Messy broke because I saw it. (Roca-Royes forthcoming: 4)

The account can be unfolded as follows:

  1. In the past \(S\) has seen that something is actually the case, such as that Twin-Messy is broken. So, \(S\) is justified in believing that something is the case, such as that Twin-Messy is broken, and can break.
  2. A group of entities, \(a\) and \(b\), are relevantly similar, such as that Messy and Twin- Messy are relevantly similar.
  3. If \(S\) knows that \(a\) and \(b\) are relevantly similar, and \(S\) knows that actually \(Fa\), then \(S\) can come to know that it is possible that \(Fb\) based on their knowledge of the relevant similarity between \(a\) and \(b\).


  1. \(S\) knows that it is possible that \(Fb\), such as that Messy can break.

In order to better understand the approach that is taken one needs to look carefully at steps (2) and (3). The core question is: what does relevant similarity mean? Roca-Royes characterizes it as follows:

  1. \(a\) and \(b\) are relevantly similar when \(a\) and \(b\) are counterparts.
  2. The counterpart relation involved in relevant similarity is epistemic, and not metaphysical. It is not because Twin-Messy broke that Messy can break, it is because one knows that Twin-Messy broke and that Twin-Messy and Messy are similar that one can come to know that Messy can break.
  3. The epistemic counterpart relation has to do, to a first approximation, with the intrinsic character of the entities involved. For example, Messy and Twin-Messy could be thought of as two tokens of the same IKEA style table.
  4. The theory requires that the uniformity of nature is true. Otherwise, from the mere fact that Twin-Messy broke in the past one could not infer that Messy could break, since the laws of nature could have changed.

Three important questions for the theory are the following:

  1. What specific details of relevant similarity does one need to know to be in a position to make the relevant inference? For example, does one need to simply know that Messy and Twin-Messy are the same kind of IKEA table? Could they know something less specific, such as that they are both wooden tables of roughly the same structure? Or do they need to know something more specific, such as that they are the same IKEA table from the same year and model of design?
  2. How does the theory account for knowledge of possibility across distinct types of entities? For example, because both Twin-Messy and Messy are the same type of IKEA table, it is reasonable to hold that knowledge of the fact that Twin-Messy broke can inform our knowledge of the breakability of Messy. However, suppose one has never owned a table before. Rather, they have only owned a bench before, and they have seen the bench break. Can knowledge of one type of entities modal characteristics provide us with grounds for knowledge of possibility for another type of entity?
  3. How does knowledge of similarity allow us to gain knowledge of necessity? The account provided illustrates how prior knowledge of actuality can allow us to access knowledge of possibility. But we also know necessary truths: how do we arrive at knowledge of necessity?


What follows below is a selection of papers on the epistemology of modality as discussed in the 20th century. Most of the papers are from the time period after Kripke’s seminal Naming and Necessity. It is important to note that because the epistemology of modality is a subarea of the philosophy of modality one can get a better grasp on the epistemology by also engaging the metaphysics, semantics, and logic of modality as well as general epistemology. Thus, many papers that influence the epistemology of modality are not on this list, since they are properly papers in one of the other areas. Finally, there is a vast body of historical literature on the epistemology of modality that stretches across both the Analytic and Phenomenological traditions.

  • Aranyosi, István, 2010, “Powers and the Mind-Body Problem”, International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 18(1): 57–72.
  • Ball, Derek, 2014, “Two-Dimensionalism and the Social Character of Meaning”, Erkenntnis, 79(Supp): 567–595.
  • Barnes, Gordon, 2002, “Conceivability, Explanation, and Defeat”, Philosophical Studies, 108: 327–338.
  • –––, 2007, “Necessity and Apriority”, Philosophical Studies, 132(3): 495–523.
  • Barton, John, 2012, “Peacocke’s Epiphany: A Possible Problem for Semantic Approaches to Metaphysical Necessity”, in Drapeau Contim and Motta 2012b: 99–117.
  • Bealer, George, 1987, “Philosophical Limits of Scientific Essentialism”, Philosophical Perspectives, 1: 289–365. [Bealer 1987 available online]
  • –––, 1996, “A Priori Knowledge and the Scope of Philosophy”, Philosophical Studies, 81(2–3): 121–142. [Bealer 1996 available online]
  • –––, 2000, “A Theory of the A Priori”, Philosophical Perspectives, 13: 29–55. [Bealer 2000 available online]
  • –––, 2002, “Modal Epistemology and the Rationalist Renaissance”, in Gendler and Hawthorne 2002: 71–125. [Bealer 2002 available online]
  • –––, 2004, “The Origins of Modal Error”, Dialectica, 58(1): 11–42. [Bealer 2004 available online]
  • –––, 2006, “A Definition of Necessity”, Philosophical Perspectives, 20: 17–39.
  • Benaceraff, Paul, 1973, “Mathematical Truth”, Journal of Philosophy, 70: 661–679.
  • Berglund, Anders, 2005, From Conceivability to Possibility: An Essay in Modal Epistemology, Umeå Studies in Philosophy 8, Umeå, Sweden: Department of Philosophy and Linguistics, Umeå University.
  • Biggs, Stephen, 2011, “Abduction and Modality”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 83(2): 283–326.
  • Biggs, Stephen and Jessica Wilson, forthcoming, “Carnap and the Necessary A Posteriori”, in Stephan Blatti and Lapointe, Ontology After Carnap, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Björnsson, Gunnar, 2004, “A Naturalist’s Approach to Modal Intuitions”, in Weber & De Mey 2004: 77–92.
  • Blackburn, Simon, 1993, “Modals and Morals”, in his Essays in Quasi Realism, Oxford: Oxford University Press: 52–74.
  • Bonjour, Laurence, 1998, In Defense of Pure Reason, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Botterell, A., 2001, “Conceiving what is not there”, Journal of Consciousness Studies, 8(8): 21–42.
  • Brueckner, Anthony, 2001, “Chalmers’ conceivability argument for dualism”, Analysis, 61: 187–93.
  • Buekens, Filip, 2004, “From Conceivability to Possibility: the Normative Account”, in Weber & De Mey 2004: 23–32.
  • Bueno, Otávio & Scott Shalkowski, 2000, “A Plea for a Modal Realist Epistemology”, Acta Analytica, 15(24): 175–193.
  • –––, 2004, “Modal Realism and Modal Epistemology: A Huge Gap”, in Weber & De Mey 2004: 93–106.
  • –––, 2009, “Modalism and Logical Pluralism”, Mind, 118: 295–321.
  • –––, 2013, “Logical Constants: A Modalist Approach”, Nous, 47: 1–24.
  • –––, 2014, “Modalism and Theoretical Virtues: Toward an Epistemology of Modality”, Philosophical Studies, 172(3): 671–689.
  • Burgess, John P., 2014, “On a derivation of the necessity of identity”, Synthese, 191(7): 1567–1585.
  • Byrne, Alex, 2007, “Possibility and Imagination”, Philosophical Perspectives, 21(1): 125–144.
  • Cameron, Ross P., 2007, “Lewisian Realism: Methodology, Epistemology, and Circularity”, Synthese, 156(1): 143–159.
  • Casullo, Albert, 2000, “Modal Epistemology: Fortune or Virtue?”, Southern Journal of Philosophy, 38(S1): 17–25.
  • –––, 2010, “Knowledge and Modality”, Synthese, 172(3): 341–359.
  • Chalmers, David, 1996, The Conscious Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2002, “Does Conceivability Entail Possibility”, in Gendler and Hawthorne 2002: 145–200. [Chalmers 2002 available online]
  • –––, 2004, “Epistemic Two-Dimensional Semantics”, Philosophical Studies, 118(1–2): 153–226.
  • –––, 2010, The Character of Consciousness, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2012, “Revisability and Conceptual Change in ‘Two Dogmas of Empiricism’”, Journal of Philosophy, 108(8): 387–415.
  • Cohnitz, Daniel, 2003a, “Two-Dimensionalism and the Metaphysical Possibility of Zombies”, in Benedict Löwe, Wolfgang Malzkorn & Thoralf Räsch (eds.), Foundations of the Formal Sciences II: Applications of Mathematical Logic in Philosophy and Linguistics, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers: 55–62.
  • –––, 2003b, “Modal Skepticism: Philosophical Thought Experiments and Modal Epistemology”, in Friedrich Stadler (ed.), The Vienna Circle and Logical Empiricism: Re-evaluation and Future Perspectives, Dordrecht: Springer Science+Business Media: 281–296.
  • –––, 2004, “Why Consistentism Won’t Work”, in Weber & De Mey 2004: 33–52.
  • –––, 2012, “The Logic(s) of Modal Knowledge”, in Greg Restall & Gillian Kay Russell (eds.), New Waves in Philosophical Logic, New York: Palgrave Macmillan: 63–83.
  • Corkum, Philip, 2012, “Meta-conceivability”, Essays in Philosophy, 13(1): 195–210. [Corkum 2012 available online]
  • Davies, Martin and Humberstone, Lloyd, 1980, “Two Notions of Necessity”, Philosophical Studies, 38: 1–30.
  • Davies, Martin and Stoljar, Daniel, 2004, “Introduction to The Two-Dimensional Framework and Applications: Metaphysics, Language, and Mind”, Philosophical Studies, 118(1–2): 1–10.
  • De Mey, Tim, 2004, “Mere Logical Possibilities: a Bridge too Far”, in Weber & De Mey 2004: 53–62.
  • DeLancey, Craig, 2013, “The Modal Arguments and the Complexity of Consciousness”, Ratio, 26(1): 35–50.
  • Dietrich, Eric & Gilles, Anthony, 2001, “Consciousness and the Limits of Our Imaginations”, Synthese, 126(3): 361–381.
  • Divers, John & Gonzáles-Varela, José Edgar, 2013, “Belief in Absolute Necessity”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 87(2): 358–391.
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This entry had gone through many revisions, since its initial publication in 2007. Many people have helped with the production of this entry through readings and commentary. I would like to extend special thanks to: Otávio Bueno, David Chalmers, Robert Fischer, Bob Hale, Joachim Horvath, Dusko Prevelic, Christian Nimtz, Sonia Roca-Royes, Scott Shalkowski, Asger Steffensen, Timothy Williamson, Ed Zalta, as well as four anonymous reviewers.

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