The Epistemology of Modality

First published Wed Dec 5, 2007

The modality of a statement or proposition S is the manner in which S's truth holds. Statements or propositions can be either necessary, possible, or contingent. For example, while the statement ‘Aristotle is Plato's student’ is actually true, it is only contingently true. It is possible that Aristotle never met Plato. By contrast, the statement ‘Aristotle is self-identical’ is necessarily true. Aristotle could not have failed to be self-identical. The modality of a property P is the mode in which P is had by an object. Some properties are essential, and others accidental. For example, while it is actually true that Quine wrote Reference and Modality, being the author of the paper is only an accidental property of Quine. Quine could have decided not to write the paper. By contrast, being human is an essential property of Quine. The central issue in the epistemology of modality concerns how we come to have justified beliefs or knowledge of modality.

1. General Introduction

Humans have a natural tendency to modalize. A tendency to think about, assert, and evaluate statements of possibility and necessity. To modalize is to either entertain a modal thought or to make a modal judgment. Modal thoughts and judgements either explicitly or derivatively involve the concept of possibility, necessity, or essence. Prima facie there exists a plurality of kinds of modality. Our natural discourse and theoretical discourse allows for various things to be spoken of as being epistemically possible (necessary), logically possible (necessary), conceptually possible (necessary), metaphysically possible (necessary), physically possible (necessary). And even when we speak of things being physically possible (necessary) we speak of physical possibility in a number of different ways, such as the difference between theoretical physical possibility and technological possibility. Although philosophically controversial, we intuitively distinguish between de re and de dicto modality. De re modality is modality that is predicated of an object, and attaches to the object independently of language. De dicto modality is modality that is predicated of a statement, and attaches to the statement. Consider, for example, the difference between:

(i) 9 is such that it is necessarily greater than 7.

and

(ii) ‘9 is greater than 7’ is necessarily true.

In (i) necessity is predicated of and attaches to the object picked out by ‘9’. In (ii) necessity is predicated of and attaches to the statement ‘9 is greater than 7’. In addition, to the distinction between de re and de dicto modality there are some generally accepted, although not uncontroversial, definitions and examples of the various kinds of modality.

Φ is epistemically possible for a subject S if and only if Φ is not ruled out by what S knows.
Example: Given everything James knows, it is possible that Frank is out of town.

Φ is epistemically necessary for a subject S if and only if ¬Φ is ruled out by what S knows.
Example: Given everything Margaret knows, it is necessary that the U.S. economy will hit a recession in the coming months.

Φ is logically possible in system S if and only if Φ is consistent with the axioms of system S.
Example: Given propositional logic, the statement ‘Italy will win the 2008 world cup’ is logically possible.

Φ is logically necessary in system S if and only if Φ is an axiom of S or derivable from axioms of S through the rules of S.
Example: Given classical propositional logic, (PP) is necessary.

Φ is conceptually possible if and only if Φ is not ruled out by the set of all conceptual truths.
Example: It is conceptually possible that the earth is flat.

Φ is conceptually necessary if and only if ¬Φ is ruled out by the set of all conceptual truths.
Example: It is conceptually necessary that triangles have three sides.

Φ is metaphysically possible if and only if Φ is true in some metaphysically possible world.
Example: It is metaphysically possible that some physical particle moves faster than the speed of light.

Φ is metaphysically necessary if and only if Φ is true in all metaphysically possible worlds.
Example: It is metaphysically necessary that Queen Elizabeth is a human.

Φ is physically possible with respect to physical laws L if and only if Φ is logically consistent with L.
Example: Given the actual laws of physics, it is physically possible for a train to travel at 150 mph.

Φ is physically necessary with respect to physical laws L if and only if Φ is logically entailed by L.
Example: Given the actual laws of physics, it is physically necessary that E = mc².

In addition to the plurality of kinds of modality it is also important to note that our natural tendency to modalize shows itself both in practical and theoretical reasoning. Concerning practical reasoning modalizing is typically found in planning and decision making. When a person or group engages in either of these activities they consult what is possible and necessary in some specific sense of those terms. Both planning and decision making require consulting what is necessary in order to delimit what is possible, and then ruling out certain possibilities given other constraints. For example, when a group of politicians deliberate about whether a preemptive strike is the best way to solve a potential threat, they first consult what alternative actions can be taken (the space of possibilities), and then using some constraints on the available options, select the option that satisfies the constraints. Concerning theoretical reasoning modalizing occurs both in the construction of possible experiments that would verify a scientific hypothesis; and in the exploration of the assumptions and consequences of theories ranging from economics and psychology to mathematics and physics.

One of the primary reasons philosophers are interested in the epistemology of modality stems from the fact that many of the most important historical and contemporary philosophical arguments have a modal statement as either a premise or a conclusion. Some of these modal statements have been used to argue for the existence of god (St. Anselm), the distinctness of the mind from the body (Rene Descartes), and the incoherence of a mind-independent reality (George Berkeley). Modal statements of philosophical interest include: it is logically impossible for a proposition to be both true and false at the same time; it is possible that God exists, it is physically impossible for an object to move faster than the speed of light; it is metaphysically impossible for one to be born substantially earlier than they were actually born; the origin of an object is an essential property of the object; it is metaphysically possible that a human-like creature lacking consciousness exist; it is impossible to conceive of an object unconceived by anyone; it is metaphysically possible for two individuals to behave in exactly the same way with regard to a color stimulus, yet have opposing phenomenal color experiences; it is impossible for an emotion to exist independently of the bodily sensations that accompany it.

Given that humans have a natural tendency to modalize, and that so many crucial arguments in philosophy turn on modal premises, one very important question arises: What is the epistemic nature of human modalizing?

The epistemology of modality is a sub-area of epistemology in which philosophers seek to answer or explain the epistemic nature of human modalizing. There are four basic questions. First, are modal statements the kinds of things that we can know or have justified beliefs about? Second, if they are the kinds of things we can know or have justification for, do we know any of them? Third, in the case that we don't know any modal statements, do we have justification for believing any of them? Fourth, if we can be justified in believing modal statements, what is the primary source of our justification?

Although there are various kinds of modality, as noted above, the primary interest in the epistemology of modality has been over answering these questions with respect to logical, conceptual, metaphysical, and physical modality. And amongst these four kinds of modality, philosophers take answering the questions above with respect to metaphysical modality to be the most basic and central task. There is also special interest in the relation between a suitable notion of epistemic modality and metaphysical modality. One reason for the interest in metaphysical modality stems from the controversial nature of metaphysical modality itself. If metaphysical modality is co-extensive with a kind of logical or conceptual modality, then an epistemology of logical or conceptual modality could suffice for an epistemology of metaphysical modality. Likewise, if metaphysical modality is coextensive with physical modality, then an epistemology of physical modality could suffice for an epistemology of metaphysical modality. For discussion of the relation between metaphysical and logical modality see Chalmers (1996), (2002), and Hale (1996), For a discussion of the view that metaphysical modality is co-extensive with physical modality see Shoemaker (1998), Ellis (2002) and Mackie (2006). For discussion of the distinctness of metaphysical modality from logical and physical modality, see Fine (1996), (2002), and Salmon (1989). The discussion to follow will focus on the epistemology of metaphysical modality.

The first question sets out the main metaphysical issue of realism vs. anti-realism about modality. Given that knowledge and justification are directed at things which can be true, the metaphysical nature of modal statements, must be settled prior to the epistemic investigation of them. Regarding the metaphysical issue there are two distinct topics of discussion based on the distinction between de re and de dicto modality. De re modality is modality that attaches to objects directly, and independently of language. De dicto modality is modality that attaches to statements. In general, it is possible for one to be a realist about one kind of modality while remaining an anti-realist about the other kind. Given that de dicto modality is less controversial than de re modality, the discussion here will focus on the de dicto case; where relevant epistemic issues pertaining to de re modality will be drawn out.

Anti-realists about metaphysical modality maintain that statements of metaphysical modality are neither true nor false. Given that neither justification nor knowledge are available in a domain where the statements in the domain do not make truth-evaluable claims, prima facie it appears as if there is no genuine epistemic project for anti-realists about metaphysical modality. Realists, by contrast, maintain that modal statements can be true or false, and as a consequence, the central issue is over the answer to the second, third, and fourth questions. Although there are disagreements amongst realists about the proper way to construe realism about metaphysical modality, a great deal of contemporary interest in the epistemology of metaphysical modality proceeds from a realist standpoint. For discussion of realism and anti-realism about modality see Blackburn (1993), Craig (1985), Wright (1989), and Divers (2004).

On the assumption that some form of realism about modality is true the second and third question respectively ask: do we have justification or knowledge of any statements of metaphysical modality, and if so in virtue of what do we? The second and third question are distinct on most accounts of knowledge in which it is taken to be a mental state which can be factored into components, one of which is justification. In particular the questions are distinct because one can have justification for believing something without knowing it. In addition, skepticism about modal knowledge is weaker than skepticism about justification for modal beliefs. Although knowledge is taken to be a stronger epistemic relation than justification (i.e. it takes more to know something than it does to be justified in believing something), skepticism about justification is more substantive than skepticism about knowledge. It is one thing for us not to know any modal statements, because for example the standards on knowing are very high; it is quite another and more drastic cognitive situation, if we are not even justified in believing any modal statements.

The fourth question is generated from the fact that many philosophers have recognized that knowledge of modality and justification for modal beliefs, like mathematics and morality, is prima facie not grounded in sense experience. Although this position is questionable, two points make this initial assessment of the epistemology of modality plausible.

It appears as if our senses can ground knowledge of what is actual, but not of what is necessary or merely possible. For example, in virtue of seeing the Eiffel Tower one can perhaps know that it is before them. But, if metaphysical necessity is defined as truth in all possible worlds, then how does knowledge of what is actual ground knowledge of what is necessary? On the other hand, some statements are not actually true, but merely possibly true. For example, even though it is not actually true that world population is going down, world population could go down. On the assumption that we do know this mere possibility, how do we explain our knowledge of it? These twin points ground the prima facie inappropriateness of appealing to the senses as the ultimate ground of justification for beliefs about metaphysical modality. One of the central projects in the epistemology of modality, is thus, to provide some account of the processes which account for our justification or knowledge of modality. It is open at this stage for one to argue that perhaps the prima facie worry that sense experience cannot provide justification for our beliefs about modality is misguided.

2. History

Most contemporary discussions of the epistemology of modality begin with a discussion of philosophers from the modern period that attempted to explain both the nature of modality and our knowledge of it. Though most discussions begin with the Modern period, it is important to note that philosophers from both Ancient philosophy and Medieval philosophy made important contributions to the metaphysics and epistemology of modality. In Ancient philosophy Aristotle's work on modality serves as a basis for much philosophical discussion. The Medieval period also contains substantive discussion of the metaphysics of modality. Perhaps the most famous modal argument from this period is St. Anselm's Ontological Argument, in which he argues for the existence of God on the basis of the inconceivability of God's non-existence. Nevertheless, and because of the nature of the contemporary debate and discussion, the focus of this brief history will be on figures from the Modern period. For extensive discussion of the Medieval period see Medieval Theories of Modality.

2.1 Descartes, Arnauld, Hume, and Reid

Rene Descartes both articulated and defended an extremely important and novel strategy for explaining the source of our knowledge of possibility and necessity. He is the main source of conceivability-based accounts. Contemporary versions will be discussed in the section on conceivability-based accounts.

Descartes' epistemology of modality rested on the rule that clear and distinct perception of possibility entails possibility. In the First Meditation, Descartes argues that we do not know many of things we think we know, such as that there is an external world. He reaches this conclusion on the grounds that if we did know it we could not doubt it, but we can doubt, so we do not know it. In the Second Meditation, though, he argues that unlike skepticism about the external world, he is certain (i.e. that he knows) that he is a thinking thing, since he cannot doubt that he is a thinking thing. Using this fact, in the Third Meditation he articulates a general epistemic rule for the direction of the mind in its search for truth.

I am certain that I am a thinking thing. Do I not therefore also know what is required for my being certain about anything? In this first item of knowledge there is simply a clear and distinct perception of what I am asserting; this would not be enough to make me certain of the truth of the matter if it could ever turn out that something which I perceived with such clarity and distinctness was false. So, I now seem to be able to lay it down as a general rule that whatever I perceive clearly and distinctly is true. (CSM II: 24).

Descartes idea is that if in the one piece of knowledge that he has, the marks of clarity and distinctness are present, then clarity and distinctness must be marks of the truth, since what is known is true.

The principle Descartes articulates is

(CDP) If x clearly and distinctly perceives that P, then P is true.

Here perception is to be understood as mental perception, which for Descartes is tied to intentional notions, such as understanding and grasping. His epistemology of modality can be derived from (CDP), if P is taken to be a statement of modality (a statement involving either the concept of possibility, necessity, impossibility, or essence). For example, on (CDP) if one clearly and distinctly perceives that it is possible for the statue of David to exist without David's left arm, then it is true that it is possible for the statue of David to exist without David's left arm, and one knows that it is true in virtue of their clear and distinct perception of the truth. The core idea is that clear and distinct perception of modality provides knowledge of modality.

In discussing Descartes' epistemology of modality it is important to take note of his metaphysics of modality. Although Descartes is a realist about modality, maintaining that modal truths are mind-independent. He also maintains that God plays a special role with respect to modal truths. In particular, he appears to maintain that modal truths are dependent on God's will. So that although it is necessary that 2 + 2 = 4, the necessity of the mathematical truth could have been otherwise, had God so chosen. For discussion of this issue see Descartes Modal Metaphysics.

Descartes' most famous application of (CDP) occurs in his Sixth Meditation proof of the real distinction between mind and body. Knowledge of this argument is central to contemporary discussions of the epistemology of modality, since these discussions are often linked with debates over whether materialism, substance dualism, or property dualism is the correct metaphysical characterization of the relation between mind and body.

First I know that everything which I clearly and distinctly understand is capable of being created by God so as to correspond exactly with my understanding of it. Hence the fact that I can clearly and distinctly understand one thing apart from another is enough to make me certain that the two things are distinct, since they are capable of being separated, at least by God. The question of what kind of power is required [to do this] does not affect my judgement that the two things are distinct. Thus, simply by knowing that I exist and seeing at the same time that absolutely nothing else belongs to my nature or essence other than that I am a thinking thing, I can infer correctly that my essence consists solely in the fact that I am a thinking thing. It is true that I may have (or, to anticipate, certainly have) a body that is very closely joined to me. But, nevertheless, on the one hand I have a clear and distinct idea of myself, in so far as I am simply a thinking, non-extended thing; and on the other hand I have a distinct idea of body, in so far as this is simply, an extended, non-thinking thing. And accordingly, it is certain that I am really distinct, and certainly can exist without it. (CSM II: 54)

Here Descartes argues for the real distinction between mind and body on the basis of the conceivability of the mind existing independently of the body. According to (CDP), since Descartes clearly and distinctly perceives that his mind can exist independently of his body, it is possible for his mind to exist independently of his body. And since, x is really distinct from y just in case x can exist without y, Descartes' mind is really distinct from his body.

Although many of the correspondents in the Objections and Replies to The Meditations raise important and related worries over (CDP), no discussion of Descartes' epistemology of modality or his argument for the real distinction between mind and body is complete without consideration of Antoine Arnauld's objections contained in the Fourth Set of Objections.

The classical worry over (CDP) is that for it to be a good epistemic principle a subject must be able to tell from the inside first-person phenomenal character of their rational perception, whether what seems to be a clear and distinct perception is in fact a clear and distinct perception. There is a great deal of worry over (CDP), which stems from the fact that the clarity and distinctness of a conceived scenario may not be infallibly available to the subject. If clarity and distinctness are not infallibly available, it appears that the (CDP) applied to the case of modality is either false, irrelevant, or useless. Arnauld sharply raises an objection that can be interpreted in these three ways.

Suppose that someone knows for certain that the angle in a semi-circle is a right angle, and hence that the triangle formed by this angle and the diameter of the circle is right-angled. In spite of this, he may doubt, not yet have grasped for certain, that the square on the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides; indeed he may even deny this, if he is misled by some fallacy. But now, if he uses the same argument as that proposed by our illustrious author, he may appear to have confirmation of his false belief, as follows: ‘I clearly and distinctly perceive’, he may say ‘that the triangle is right angled; but I doubt that the square of the hypotenuse is equal to the squares on the other two sides; therefore it does not belong to the essence of the triangle that the square on its hypotenuse is equal to the square on the other two sides’. (CSM II: 142)

On the false interpretation, the triangle objection falsifies (CDP). If (CDP) is understood as an epistemic rule which allows one to move from clear and distinct perception of possibility to genuine possibility, then if the situation above is coherent one would be moving from the clear and distinct perception of a right-triangle lacking the pythagorean property, to the possibility of a right-triangle lacking the pythagorean property. However, given that the pythagorean property is an essential property of any right-triangle, the link between clear and distinct perception and possibility is broken.

On the irrelevant interpretation, it could be argued that the triangle objection does not show that (CDP) is false, but rather that the kind of possibility that is involved is one that does not correspond to the real nature of things. Clear and distinct perception of possibility does not imply metaphysical possibility, but instead implies formal possibility. Where formal possibility has to do with concepts or some way of understanding a thing, rather than with the metaphysical nature of the thing.

On the useless interpretation, it could be argued that (CDP) is true, and that the kind of possibility involved is the metaphysical kind, but that the central problem is that we can never tell from the inside whether we actually have a clear and distinct perception. If the phenomenology of a clear and distinct perception of possibility is first-person phenomenally indistinguishable from one that is either unclear or indistinct, then even if the properties metaphysically relate a subject to a truth about modality, given their phenomenal nature they are useless. Thus, one might concede that (CDP) is true as a metaphysical principle relating clear and distinct perception of possibility to genuine possibility, but epistemically useless as a practical guide to modality.

While Descartes does offer careful responses to Arnauld's objection, the questions raised by Arnauld's triangle case are important contributions to the epistemology of modality in their own right. Many of the issues raised by Arnauld remain important in contemporary discussions of conceivability-based accounts. In fact Arnauld may be the source of what Brueckner (2003) dubs “the standard objection” to conceivability-based accounts. For excellent discussion of Descartes' exchange with Arnauld see Almog (2005). And for discussion of Descartes' theory of clear and distinct perception and conceivability see Van Cleeve (1983).

Although Hume's discussion of the epistemology of modality bears a surface similarity to Descartes's discussion, it is importantly different. While Descartes is a rationalist and a realist about modality, Hume is an empiricist and an anti-realist about modality. Hume writes:

Tis an established maxim in metaphysics, that whatever the mind clearly conceives includes the idea of possible existence, or in other words, nothing we imagine is absolutely impossible. We can form the idea of a golden mountain, and from thence conclude that such a mountain may actually exist. We can form no idea of a mountain without a valley, and therefore regard it as impossible. (THN: 1.2.2.9)

And that

This therefore is the essence of necessity. Upon the whole, necessity is something that exists in the mind, not in objects, nor is it possible for us ever to form the most distant idea of it, considered as a quality in bodies. (THN: 1.3.14.23)

There are two important parts to the first passage. First, Hume regards what it is to conceive something as being the same as what it is to imagine something. Second, assuming that the two notions are the same, Hume also takes the following two conditionals to be equivalent:

(CON) If P is conceivable, then P is possible.

(INC) If P is inconceivable, then P is impossible.

Both of these points are contentious in the epistemology of modality. First, many philosophers draw a distinction between conceivability and imagination. Second, depending on how conceivability is articulated one could hold (CON) without holding (INC), or vice versa. The key reasons why Hume collapses imagination and conceivability and (CON) and (INC) is because he is a concept empiricist, and an anti-realist about modality. All concepts for Hume derive from experience, they are the fainter remains of sense impressions. As a consequence, any manner in which we can fit our concepts together, must include some kind of possibility. And any manner in which we cannot put our concepts together, implies some kind of impossibility. For Hume the kind of modality that we get from conceivability and inconceivability is a mind-dependent kind. For discussion of Hume's views on conceivability see Lightner (1997) and Kail (2003).

Just as Descartes's epistemology of modality was subject to objections from fellow philosophers, such as Arnauld, Hume's account was subject to objections from fellow philosophers, such as Thomas Reid. Reid's criticisms of Hume are open to response from Hume just as Arnauld's criticisms were open to response from Descartes. But, just as Arnauld's criticisms are important contributions to the epistemology of modality in their own right, so are Reid's. Causullo (1979) both presents and defends Hume's account from objections offered by Reid and Mill. Causullo (1979) notes that Reid's objections proceed from two claims: (i) that modality is a property of a proposition; and (ii) to conceive a proposition is to understand its meaning. As a consequence of (i) and (ii), Reid claims that (CON) is false, since

(a) one can understand a demonstrably false proposition. Example: x is both a square and a circle.

(b) every proposition that is necessary stands in opposition to one that is contradictory, and so one that conceives of one, conceives of the other.

(c) in a successful reductio demonstration one is asked to conceive of a proposition which one then goes on to prove leads to a contradiction.

Reid's objections drive at a general question concerning ‘conceivability’: What does it mean to conceive of a proposition? Under the rendering he gives of ‘conceivability’, the objections made are plausible. However, it is open to a theorist of conceivability to render the term ‘conceivability’ in a way that avoids the objection. In fact, Hume may be immune to the objections, and Descartes open to them, since Hume accounts for conceivability in terms of imagination, while Descartes accounts for conceivability in terms of understanding and grasping through clear and distinct perception. Finally, it should be noted that the problems raised in (a)-(c) could be used to argue that conceivability must be understood in some sense stronger than the mental act used in a reductio style demonstration. That is given that the supposition in a successful reductio leads to a proposition that is not possible, conceivability must be something richer than supposing or entertaining. Perhaps, conceiving itself must be constrained by logical possibility or conceptual possibility.

2.2 Kant

In The Critique of Pure Reason Immanuel Kant offers an impressive account of the epistemology of modality. His account is of central importance in 20th century analytic philosophy, both prior to, during, and after logical positivism. On Kant's account of the epistemology of modality, the epistemic, metaphysical, and semantic distinctions below are of central importance.

Epistemological A priori A posteriori
Metaphysical Necessary Contingent
Semantic Analytic Synthetic

Kant held that for a statement to be known a priori is for it to be capable of being known independently of sense experience; and for a statement to be known a posteriori is either for it to be known on the basis of sense experience, or to be essentially knowable only on the basis of sense experience. For example, one could use a calculator to determine whether 2 + 2 = 4. In the case in which one does so, the knowledge gained would be a posteriori. However, one could know that 2 + 2 = 4 by reasoning a priori about 2, +, and =. By contrast, one could not know independently of sense experience that there is a table in front of them. While mathematical statements are knowable a priori, external world knowledge, for example, is essentially a posteriori.

Regarding modality, Kant held the view that necessity is the same as universality. Contemporary metaphysicians of modality typically do not gloss necessity as universality. Thus, for the purposes of this discussion it is best to interpret Kant as holding the view that necessity is truth in all possible worlds; and that contingency is truth in some possible world, but not all possible worlds. Kant's overall metaphysical position of Transcendental Idealism makes it difficult to locate his theory of modality neatly as being fully realist or anti-realist. For discussion of Kant's theory of modality with attention to contemporary accounts of modality see Baldwin (2002).

Kant's distinction between analytic and synthetic statements is drawn through the notion of conceptual containment. An analytic statement is a statement in which the concept expressed by the predicate term is contained in the concept expressed by the subject term. For example, ‘All bachelors are unmarried males’ is an analytic statement, since the concept expressed by ‘unmarried male’ is contained in the concept expressed by ‘bachelor’. A synthetic statement is, correspondingly, any statement that is not analytic. For example, ‘Elizabeth is the Queen of England’ is synthetic, since the concept expressed by ‘the Queen of England’ is not contained in the concept expressed by ‘Elizabeth’, which is the name of a particular individual.

Using these distinctions Kant held that

(i) S is a priori iff S is necessary.

(ii) S is a posteriori iff S is contingent.

(iii) If S is analytic, then S is a priori.

(iv) If S is synthetic, then either S is a priori or S is a posteriori.

Kant is thus often seen as being the first philosopher to set up a partial semantic approach to the epistemology of modality. In some cases, one can obtain knowledge of necessity by looking at meaning. If a statement S is analytic, then S is a priori, in which case S is necessary. And one can obtain knowledge of contingency through sense experience. It is important to note that Kant also held that we can have a priori knowledge of some truths through transcendental reasoning. For example, according to Kant we can know a priori that time is a necessary condition for the possibility of inner experience, and that space is a necessary condition for the possibility of outer experience. However, our knowledge in each of these cases does not come through analyzing the concepts involved, but rather through transcendental reasoning about the universal conditions that make experience possible. Finally, there is a useful and generally acknowledged form of simple reasoning that supports (i)and (ii) which is presented by Kripke (1980).

Concerning (i): If S is knowable a priori, then S is knowable independent of sense experience. If S is knowable independent of sense experience, then S's truth cannot depend on the way the actual world is. If S's truth does not depend on the way the actual world is, then S's truth does not vary across possible worlds. So, S is a priori iff S is necessary.

Concerning (ii): If S is essentially a posteriori, then S is knowable only on the basis of sense experience. If S is knowable only on the basis of sense experience, then S's truth is dependent on the actual world, since our sense experience is only of the actual world. Thus, S's truth depends on the particular facts that are true in a given possible world. So, if facts relevant to S's truth vary across possible worlds, then S's truth varies across possible worlds.

Although the reasoning above is intuitive, it is plausibly fallacious. Kripke (1980) discusses both lines of reasoning.

Concerning (iii): If S is analytic, then the concept expressed by the predicate is contained in the concept expressed by the subject. So, if one simply understands the meaning of the subject term and reasons through it, one will arrive at the meaning of the predicate term. Thus, one will be in a position to grasp the truth of S simply through reasoning about it. Since the reasoning is justificationally independent of sense-experience, S is known a priori. So, if S is analytic, then S is a priori.

Discussion of Kant's arguments for (iv) takes us to far away from our present discussion, since it involves discussion of the notorious synthetic a priori.

Although there are many objections to Kant's overall program, especially with regards to (iv), two points of contact are of central interest in the epistemology of modality. First, one might challenge the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements that is used to build the epistemology of modality partially from semantics. The central question here is whether there really is a coherent distinction between a statement being true in virtue of meaning alone, and a statement being true partially in virtue of meaning and partially in virtue of the way the world is. Second, concerning both of the intuitive arguments for (i) and (ii), one might challenge the link between S's truth being independent or dependent on the actual world, and the truth of S either being invariant or variant across possible worlds. The central question here is over whether the fact that knowledge of S's truth depends on the way the actual world is shows that S's truth varies across possible worlds. In 20th century philosophy both criticisms have been made. The first by Quine (1951), the second by Kripke (1980).

3. Carnap, Quine, Kripke, and Putnam

The informal and partial semantic approach articulated by Kant is most prominently developed in a formal style by Rudolph Carnap (1956). Carnap discards Kant's synthetic a priori, and maintains that

(i) S is analytic iff S is necessary.

(ii) S synthetic iff S is contingent.

Carnap maintains that S is analytic iff S is true in virtue of meaning alone, and that S is synthetic iff S is not analytic. Strictly, Carnap takes the notion of ‘L-truth’ to be an explication of necessity. His definition is:

(iii) Φ is L-true in a semantical system S if and only if Φ is true in S in such a way that its truth can be established on the basis of the semantical rules of S alone, without any reference to extra-linguistic facts.

The central consequence of this is that a priority, analyticity, and necessity coincide. Knowledge of necessity is thus accounted for through analyticity. For example, it is a priori that ‘All bachelors are unmarried males’, since the statement is true in virtue of the semantical system to which the statement belongs. Thus, one can have a priori knowledge of the necessity of a statement by determining whether it is true in virtue of meaning alone.

The formal semantic approach developed by Carnap rests centrally on the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements. Quine's (1951) “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” famously challenged this distinction. Quine argued that the attempt to distinguish between analytic and synthetic statements leads to circularity. A rough statement of the fundamental problem raised is that in order to distinguish between analytic and synthetic statements one must appeal to necessity. However, if necessity is taken to simply be analyticity, then the attempt to distinguish between analytic and synthetic truths circularly rests on the notion of analytic itself. Even though Quine's argument is questionable, its contribution to the epistemology of modality is significant in so far as it articulates a fundamental challenge: Any attempt to ground knowledge of necessity in virtue of knowledge of a statement being analytic requires a plausible and non-circular account of the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements.

Quine's other central contribution to the epistemology of modality concerns the coherence of de re modality. Quine is well known for his skepticism about de re modality. Quine (1961) argued, in some sense following Hume, that it is incoherent to talk of necessity attaching to objects independent of how they are referred to through language. One of Quine's famous arguments is the following.

Substitutivity of identity: Given a true statement of identity, such as ‘a = b’, one can replace the occurrence of ‘a’ in ‘a is F’ with ‘b’, and the result ‘b is F’, will still be true.

1. Necessarily 9 is greater than 7.

2. 9 = the number of planets.

3. Necessarily the number of planets is greater than 7.

Assuming the truth of (1), (2), and the substitutivity of identity it appears that (3) follows. Nevertheless, (3) is false. Quine argues that the problem arises from the fact that modal operators create intensional contexts in the same way that propositional attitudes, such as belief, do. At least on one account, an intensional context is a linguistic context in which the substitutivity of identity fails. On Quine's view when we refer to 9 via ‘9’ it is true that 9 is necessarily greater than 7. However, when we refer to ‘9’ via ‘the number of planets’ it is false that the number of planets is necessarily greater than 7. According to Quine, modality attaches to statements and ways of referring to entities, and not to things in themselves. De re modality is incoherent because it attributes modality directly to an object independent of any way of referring to it. From Quine's arguments a certain kind of challenge is set up for those that want to defend de re modality, and the possibility of an epistemology of it. The challenge to the defender of de re modality is to make sense of de re modality by providing a principled reason for preferring one way of referring to an object over another way of referring to the same object. If somehow ‘9’ is importantly different as a way of referring to 9 from ‘the number of planets’ when making modal attributions, and there is a principled and systematic theory of why the former is importantly different from the latter, then we can make sense of de re modal attributions. For further discussion of Quine's arguments concerning reference and modality see Linsky (1971).

Saul Kripke's work plays a central role in the contemporary debate on the epistemology of modality. Both his formal work in modal logic (1959), (1963) and his Princeton lectures of 1970, which later became Naming and Necessity, engage several issues in the philosophy of modality, philosophy of language, metaphysics, epistemology, and philosophy of mind. Of central importance to the epistemology of modality is Kripke's distinction between rigid and non-rigid designators, the counterexamples he offers to

(i) P is a priori iff P is necessary.

(ii) P is a posteriori iff P is contingent.

and the distinction he draws between epistemic and metaphysical modality.

Concerning the first, Kripke distinguishes between rigid and non-rigid designators as follows:

A term t is a rigid designator if t picks out the same thing in all possible worlds, in which the thing exists.

A term t is a non-rigid designator when it picks out different things across possible worlds.

A rigid designator t is strongly rigid when t picks out x in every possible world, and x exists in all possible worlds.

A rigid designator t is de facto rigid when t picks out x in every possible world and t does so in virtue of a property that is satisfied by the same object in every possible world.

Given the distinction, Kripke argues that proper names, such as ‘Richard Nixon’, and natural kind terms, such as ‘water’, are rigid designators, and that some definite descriptions are de facto rigid, such as ‘the square root of 16’, while others, such as ‘the youngest person in the room’ are not rigid. Kripke's central strategy is to argue that names and natural kind terms are not synonymous with definite descriptions that are used to fix their reference. Although ‘the teacher of Alexander the Great’ may have been used to fix the reference of ‘Aristotle’, the two are not synonymous. Kripke offers three distinct arguments to break the synonymy claim: the modal argument, the semantic argument, and the epistemic argument, see Salmon (1981) for discussion of these three arguments. The modal argument holds that if ‘Aristotle’ and ‘the teacher of Alexander the Great’ are synonymous, then the following statement would be analytic and necessary: If Aristotle exists, then he is the teacher of Alexander the Great. However, it is counter intuitive to hold that Aristotle, the person, could not have done something different in his life. From the point of view of common sense it appears odd to say that if Aristotle exists, then he is the teacher of Alexander the Great, and that he could not have failed to be the teacher of Alexander the Great. The property being the teacher of Alexander the Great appears to be a contingent property of Aristotle.

If ‘Aristotle’ meant the man who taught Alexander the Great, then saying ‘Aristotle was a teacher of Alexander the Great’ would be a mere tautology. But surely it isn't; it expresses the fact that Aristotle taught Alexander the Great, something we could discover to be false. So, being the teacher of Alexander the Great cannot be part of [the sense of] the name. (1980: 30).

Kripke's arguments provide an answer to some of Quine's arguments about the coherence of de re modality. If Kripke is correct about names being rigid designators and definite descriptions being non-rigid, it follows that ‘9’ is a rigid designator while ‘the number of planets’ is a non-rigid designator. The reason for separating these two is that ‘the number of planets’ picks out what it refers to through a contingent property of 9, being the number of the planets in our solar system, while ‘9’, in virtue of not being synonymous with a definite description, does not pick out 9 via a contingent property. Thus, across possible worlds ‘the number of planets’ picks out different things, while across possible worlds ‘9’ picks out the same thing. The distinction between rigid and non-rigid designators can be used to respond to Quine's challenge to provide a systematic account of the special terms in virtue of which de re modality can be made sense of. If Kripke's arguments about the coherence of modality are correct, then contra Quine an epistemology of de re modality is viable. For discussion of Kripke's arguments about de re modality see Della Rocca (2002).

One of Kripke's counterexamples to (i) is the identity statement ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’.

  1. ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is true and knowable only a posteriori.
  2. ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are both rigid designators.
  3. ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true.
  4. So, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessary and a posteriori.

Given that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are rigid designators, if they refer at all, they refer to the same things in all possible worlds, in which those things exist. And since, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is true in the actual world, it follows that it is true in all possible worlds in which the terms refer. Given that it can only be known a posteriori that Hesperus = Phosphorus we have arrived at a statement that is both necessary and a posteriori.

One of Kripke's counterexamples to (ii) is the statement ‘I exist’.

  1. ‘I exist’ when asserted by a person, is true and known by that person a priori.
  2. No human person necessarily exists, each human person has a contingent existence.
  3. So, ‘I exist’ is contingent and known a priori.

The first example, sets up Kripke's general model for the epistemology of necessity.

(Ap) P → □P

(E) P

∴ □P

The basic idea is that through a priori philosophical analysis we can come to know certain conditionals that relate non-modal truths to modal truths. For example, Kripke (1980: 114, fn. 56) argues that given that an object o originates from a certain particular material origin m it is essential that o originate from m. It is an a priori philosophical matter whether the origin of an object is an essential property of the object. However, once we accept that origin is essential, we are in a position to accept a conditional in the form of (Ap). Using a conditional in the form of (Ap) as our background metaphysical principle, from additional empirical truths, such as that a certain table T originates from M, one can deduce that it is metaphysically necessary that T originate from M. For example, from (1) and (2)

  1. If T originates from M, then it is metaphysically necessary that T originates from M.
  2. T originates from M.

it follows that

  1. It is metaphysically necessary that T originates from M.

Kripke also draws a distinction between epistemic and metaphysical modality. This distinction is central to issues in the epistemology of modality. Kripke's basic distinction allows for the articulation of a fallacious pattern of reasoning.

(E) It is epistemically possible that P.

(M) It is metaphysically possible that P.

According to Kripke (M) does not follow from (E). For example, according to Kripke there is a sense in which it is epistemically possible that water does not contain hydrogen, however that is not a sense of epistemic possibility from which we can conclude that it is metaphysically possible that water does not contain hydrogen. One sense in which it is epistemically possible that water does not contain hydrogen comes from the fact that we could have used ‘water’ to pick out a different substance than it actually picks out. And at a certain period in the investigation of the underlying nature of water, it would have been correct to say that water might not contain hydrogen, if ‘water’ picked out something different than it actually does. However, that sense of epistemic possibility only corresponds to the sense in which it is not a priori that water contains hydrogen. Thus, even though it is possible that we could have used ‘water’ to pick out some substance that does not contain hydrogen, it does not follow from that modal truth, that what ‘water’ actually does pick out could have failed to contain hydrogen. In addition to this sense of epistemic possibility, there is another sense in which Kripke discusses epistemic possibility. This other sense is tied to the idea of two communities being qualitatively indiscernible epistemic situations. For discussion of this notion of epistemic possibility see Bealer (2002).

Kripke's work raises many issues about the relation between metaphysical and epistemic possibility. A great deal of contemporary work in the epistemology of modality centers on the possible relations between these two kinds of modality.

For a good discussion of issues related to the relation between epistemic and metaphysical possibility see Simchen (2004) and Yablo (2002).

Finally, Kripke's discussion of the class of a posteriori necessities sets up a fundamental issue in the epistemology of modality. The problem is raised for any account that attempts to use a priori methods to gain access to metaphysical modality. The problem is that if there are genuine a posteriori necessities, then one cannot deduce from the fact that P is a priori that P is necessary.

On a distinct but related issue, Kripke champions the intuitiveness of the content of a proposition as a source of evidence for it.

Of course, some philosophers think that something's having intuitive content is very inconclusive evidence in favor of it. I think it is very heavy evidence in favor of anything, myself. I really don't know, in a way, what more conclusive evidence one can have about anything, ultimately speaking. (1980: 42).

Kripke employs this in an example to justify the coherence of de re modal statements, which at least suggests that Kripke takes the intuitiveness of the content of some de re modal propositions to be evidence for their truth.

Suppose that someone said, pointing to Nixon, ‘That's the guy who might have lost’. Someone else says ‘Oh no, if you describe him as “Nixon”, then he might have lost; but, of course, describing him as the winner, then it is not true that he might have lost’. Now which one is being the philosopher, here, the unintuitive man? It seems to me obviously to be the second. The second man has a philosophical theory. The first man would say, and with great conviction, ‘Well, of course, the winner of the election might have been someone else. The actual winner, had the course of the campaign been different, might have been the loser, and someone else the winner; or there might have been no election at all. So, such terms as “the winner” and “the loser” don't designate the same objects in all possible worlds. On the other hand, the term “Nixon” is just a name of this man’. When you ask whether it is necessary or contingent that Nixon won the election, you are asking the intuitive question whether in some counterfactual situation, this man would in fact have lost the election. (1980: 41).

Putnam (1975) co-contributes to the development of the distinction between epistemic and metaphysical possibility by arguing for semantic externalism. His contribution comes through his famous twin-earth thought experiment, which is a staple of contemporary discussions of the epistemology of modality. In the most commonly cited version of the twin-earth thought experiment Putnam invites us to consider a planet called Twin-Earth, and the thoughts of two individuals: Oscar and Twin-Oscar. Twin-Earth is a planet just like ours in every way except for the fact that the substance that flows in the rivers, lakes, and oceans, and which the inhabitants of the planet drink, and is called ‘water’ is actually made of some other basic chemical compound XYZ. The substance picked out by ‘water’ (or ‘twater’ as it is sometimes called) is superficially just like the water of planet earth, the difference is that at the microphysical level it is made out of XYZ, and not hydrogen and oxygen. In the thought experiment we are asked to consider whether, for example, the statement ‘water tastes good’ uttered by Oscar and Twin-Oscar expresses the same thought. The background assumption is that Oscar and Twin-Oscar are intrinsic duplicates of each other, and neither is an expert on the nature of water. Semantic externalists have the intuition that Oscar's thought that water tastes good is not the same as Twin-Oscar's thought that water tastes good. And at least one reason for this is that Oscar has never interacted with twater, and Twin-Oscar has never interacted with water. The fact that their concepts come from interaction with distinct physical environments is argued to be sufficient for the distinctness of the thoughts expressed by their utterances of ‘water tastes good’. For discussion of Putnam's views on metaphysical necessity see Hale (2004b).

4. Contemporary Epistemic Issues

One of the central problems in the epistemology of modality concerns skepticism about knowledge of metaphysical modality, and skepticism about justification for beliefs about metaphysical modality. Although there are traditional skeptical arguments that can be developed for modality, such as Cartesian skepticism, there are also contemporary problems that are of special interest in the epistemology of modality. One fundamental problem often discussed is the problem of causal isolation, which is generated by applying a problem developed by Paul Benacerraf (1973) in the philosophy of mathematics to the case of metaphysical modality. The problem can be formulated as follows:

Realism about metaphysical modality maintains that (i) facts about possible worlds are the truth-makers for modal statements, and (ii) that possible worlds are not spatio-temporally connected to the actual world.

Causal Condition: X has knowledge of P only if X bears a causal connection to the truth-maker of P.

If one accepts Realism and Causal Condition, then there is a prima facie question: How can we ever know anything about metaphysical modality if we do not bear a causal connection to the truth-makers of modal statements? This question can also be formulated as: How can our modal judgments be about metaphysical modality if we are not even causally connected to the facts that make modal statements true?

Although realists disagree about the metaphysics of possible worlds, on at least two kinds of accounts, Lewis (1986) and Salmon (1989), they are by their nature not spatio-temporally connected to the actual world. On Lewisian realism, possible worlds are concrete particulars that are just like the actual world, but which are explicitly not spatio-temporally related to the actual world. On any view that takes possible worlds to be abstract objects, such as sets of propositions or sentences, then in virtue of being abstract objects, possible worlds will not be spatio-temporally related to the actual world.

The causal condition is typically motivated by looking at cases of perception. When perception provides justification or knowledge part of the explanation appears to be that a causal connection obtains between the subject and the truth-maker of their belief. For example, on some accounts of the nature of justification and knowledge, seeing a fish in a bowl can provide one with justification or knowledge for the belief that there is a fish in the bowl, partly in virtue of the fact that there is a causal relation that obtains between a fact in the world and the perceiver's mind.

It is important to note with regard to the causal isolation problem that some have argued that it is categorically inappropriate to apply the causal requirement to a domain that is essentially non-spatio-temporally related to us. For discussion of this issue see Grundman (2007) and Tieszen (2002). The problem as developed by Benacerraf regarding mathematics is really the expression of a tension between our best understanding of the semantics of mathematical statements and our best theories of knowledge.

Another kind of skeptical worry in the epistemology of modality comes from naturalistic accounts of epistemology, especially evolutionary epistemology. The arguments are aimed at the very possibility of having justification for beliefs about metaphysical modality. The main target is metaphysical necessity. As the problem is developed by Nozick (2003: Ch. 3) it depends on two claims: (i) a necessary condition for being justified in believing that P is that a subject have a reliable belief forming module or faculty for the domain in question, and (ii) that evolution by natural selection provides the best explanation for which reliable belief forming mechanisms we possess. The Nozickian evolutionary skeptic argues as follows:

  1. There is no adaptive advantage to getting things right in all possible worlds.
  2. If there is no adaptive advantage to getting things right in all possible worlds, then there is no module or faculty for detecting truth in all possible worlds; and since that is the definition of metaphysical necessity, there is no module or faculty for detecting necessity.
  3. If there is no reliable module or faculty for detecting necessity, then none of our beliefs about necessity are justified.
  4. So, we are not justified in believing that anything is metaphysically necessary.

There are three kinds of worries that the Nozickian skeptic brings forth to ground (1):

  1. our ability to imagine different scenarios is constrained by how evolution engineered our mind, and as a consequence it may not have the power to consider all the possible scenarios.
  2. whenever we have an appearance of modality, the appearance is best explained as being about something other than metaphysical modality.
  3. there may be an adaptive advantage to having an appearance that something is impossible, when in actuality it is possible.

A generalized epistemic problem that arises from these worries is the spooky faculty objection. To the degree that an account of the epistemology of modality relies on or is committed to the view that we have a special faculty specifically designed to detect necessity, one might worry that that kind of faculty, for the reasons just given, is odd and lacking a naturalistic explanation. On this account there appears to be a gross disanalogy between the need for humans to have perceptual capacities, and the need for a capacity to detect metaphysical necessity. Survival, according to the Nozickian skeptic, appears to not require the detection of metaphysical necessity, and as such it is unlikely that our intuitions of possibility and necessity are really about metaphysical modality.

Yet another contemporary issue in the epistemology of modality stems from Kripke (1980) and concerns the nature of Modal Error. Modal error occurs whenever a subject finds a statement or proposition to have one modal status, when it actually has the opposite modal status. For example, given that it is metaphysically impossible that water fail to contain hydrogen, what is the best explanation for why someone people have the intuition that water could have failed to contain hydrogen? Is the explanation of modal error in this case simply that a person that has such an intuition has a false belief about water, or fails to recognize a certain modal principle that regulates thoughts about water or the individuation of water. Philosophers working in this area are typically not skeptical about the evidential role of appearances of modality, they agree that we have a basic entitlement to take an appearance of possibility to be grounds for believing that something is possible, and this is similar to the basic entitlement we have to take perceptual appearances of reality as revealing to us what the world is like. The focus of this discussion is how to explain our failure to imagine certain possibilities, the falsity of some of our modal appearances, and the nature of modal illusion in general. For discussion of modal error see Yablo (1993), (2000), (2006), Bealer (2002), (2004), and Nichols (2006a).

5. Conceivability-Based Accounts

Looking at the history of the epistemology of modality it is clear that many philosophers have found conceivability and inconceivability to either be the foundational source of our beliefs about modality or to be one of the central sources of our epistemic justification and knowledge of modality. In addition, if one looks at how we actually go about thinking about common modalities, such as technological possibility or economic possibility, it is clear that we often use conceivability as a basis for our modal judgements. Often when we are asked whether P is possible our natural inclination is to answer the question by attempting to conceive of P. If we are successful in conceiving P or we think we have conceived that P, we judge that P is possible; if we are unsuccessful in conceiving P, we judge that P is impossible. Conceivability-based accounts of the epistemology of modality hold that conceivability is either the fundamental source of our modal knowledge or that it is of central importance in our modalizing behavior.

In contemporary post-Kripkean analytic philosophy there has been a resurgence of interest in the relation between conceivability and modality. The resurgence is based around a unified rejection of skepticism about conceivability. Skepticism about conceivability maintains that conceivability and inconceivability bear no relation to any kind of modality. Against the skeptical position many different accounts of the relation between conceivability and modality have been formulated. In general, there are three important dimensions of conceivability-based accounts. The first dimension is over whether conceivability merely provides evidence of possibility or whether it entails possibility. The second dimension is over whether an account endorses both the relation between conceivability and possibility, and the relation between inconceivability and impossibility, or just one relation. The third dimension, not represented below, concerns what kind of modality is held to be either entailed by conceivability or evidentially supported by conceivability. Where ‘C(P)’ stands for ‘it is conceivable to x that P’ and ‘◊P’ stands for it is possible that P, and ‘E (X / Y)’ stands for ‘X is evidence for Y’, for a given kind of modality, the options are as follows:

Direction Entailment Evidential
Possibility C(P) → ◊P E (C(P) / ◊P)
Impossibility ¬C(P) → ¬◊P EC(P) / ¬◊P)

Given the different dimensions above, there is a subset of combinations of the options that are plausible. Typically those that accept entailment accounts accept evidential accounts, and those that endorse evidential accounts either reject entailment accounts or remain silent over the entailment issue. In addition, some hold that either conceivability is a guide to possibility or that inconceivability is a guide to impossibility, without holding both. See Hale (2003) and Murphy (2006) for discussion.

One of the central issues debated amongst conceivability theorists is the metaphysics of conceivability. The two main questions here are:

(a) What are the objects of conceiving?

And

(b) What is the nature of conceiving?

Concerning the first question the issue is over what the basic proper objects of conceiving are. Is conceivability primarily a property of statements, propositions, images, objects, or some combination of them? Concerning the second question the issue is over what it is that a subject is doing when they are engaged in conceiving, whether there are different ways in which we conceive things, and what the relation is between conceiving, imagining, supposing, and entertaining. Contemporary discussion of these issues can be found in Nagel (1974), Yablo (1993), Hill (1994), and Chalmers (2002). At least from a historical point of view, empiricists tend to collapse the distinction between conceiving and imagining, while rationalists tend to either take conceiving to be broader than pictorial imagining or not even connected with pictorial imagining. On the rationalist side imagining strictly involves pictorial images and objects, while conceiving can involve both pictorial images and propositions. In addition, on most accounts of the nature of conceiving, either empiricist or rationalist, one important element in the account is the notion of a scenario, situation, or world. Prima facie ‘to conceive’ is to do something, which in part involves the construction of something. Often the thing that is constructed is called a ‘scenario’, a ‘situation’, or a ‘world’. What the elements of the constructed scenario, situation, or world are depends on the answer to question (a), and how a scenario, situation, or world is constructed and what role it plays in a conceivability-based account depends on the answer to (b).

Contemporary accounts of conceivability depart from historical accounts in various ways. Yablo (1993), Menzies (1998), and Chalmers (1996) and (2002) each approach the project of characterizing conceivability through distinct methodologies. While Yablo and Menzies both offer evidential accounts, Yablo's account is epistemic in character, while Menzies' account is metaphysical. Chalmers, in contrast to both, offers a metaphysical argument for the claim that conceivability entails possibility, while only offering a partial characterization of the epistemic role of conceivability with regard to possibility. In general, an account is epistemic in character when it pays attention to how we actually engage with conceivability and make conceivability judgements. An account is metaphysical in character when it pays attention to or argues directly for a metaphysical connection between conceivability and modality without explicitly addressing how the practice of employing conceivability experiments and making conceivability judgments works.

Yablo (1993) articulates and argues for a reductive account of conceivability, on which the following conditionals hold:

(CON) P is conceivable for x if x can imagine a world that x takes to verify P.

(INC) P is inconceivable for x if x cannot imagine a world that x does not take to falsify P (i.e. fail to verify P).

There is a general question in the epistemology of modality over what standards one has to satisfy in order to imagine a scenario that verifies P. That is one might ask: what does it take to imagine a world that verifies P? For example, does imagining a world in which several mathematicians get together and proclaim that Goldbach's conjecture —the conjecture that every even integer greater than two is the sum of two primes— has been solved and is true, suffice for imagining a world that verifies the proposition that Goldbach's conjecture is true? Or is one required to imagine the actual proof that shows that every even integer greater than two is the sum of two primes. The former appears to be too weak, since it is compatible with a number of situations in which Goldbach's conjecture is false, such as that all of the mathematicians are wrong or joking; the latter appears too strong, since conceiving of the proof would amount to proving Goldbach's conjecture. The central issue here is over whether there are any general principles governing when an imagined world suffices for verifying a proposition, and if there are, what they are?

One way of answering the question above that does not specify general principles governing what it takes to imagine a world that verifies P is given by providing a model that characterizes the epistemic practice that governs conceivability. Yablo (1993) provides a dialectical model of the justificatory procedure involved in assessing conceivability assertions. On Yablo's model there are two general forms of reasoning involved in challenging a conceivability claim. Suppose that x claims that P is conceivable, then following (CON), x has imagined a world that x takes to verify P. One can challenge this claim by two methods. First, one can simply ask for the specification of the world that x takes to verify P, and directly challenge whether the world is determinate in enough detail to count as verifying P. Second, one can attempt to find some Q for which

  1. Q
  2. If Q, then NEC (¬P)
  3. that x finds P conceivable is explained by x's unawareness that (a) and/or by x's unawareness that (b).

In general, on Yablo's account conceivability provides us with a basic justification for believing that something is possible. However, our justification is defeasible, and can be challenged by attempting either to show that what we have imagined is not sufficiently fine-grained in detail to be a world in which a proposition is verified or that we have simply failed to take into consideration some instance of (a) and/or (b) relevant to the conceivability of the possibility of P. Further refinements of Yablo's (1993) theory have been developed by Geirsson (2005).

Menzies (1998) develops a response-dependent account of conceivability, on which the following biconditionals hold:

(POS) It is possible that P if and only if an ideal conceiver could conceive that P.

(NEC) It is necessary that P if and only if an ideal conceiver could not conceive that not-P.

In order to understand the response-dependent account of conceivability one has to take into consideration the nature and point of response-dependence biconditionals.

  1. the response-dependent biconditionals do not aim at a reductive analysis of conceivability and of the modal notions of possibility and necessity in terms of more basic concepts. Both the right hand and left hand side of (POS) and (NEC) contain modal notions
  2. the biconditionals do not state application conditions for the concepts of necessity and possibility; rather they state concept possession conditions. They encode those features of the practice that we take to be essential conditions for competent possession of the concepts.
  3. the biconditionals are articulated from a theoretical perspective on the concepts of conceivability, possibility, necessity, and ideal conceiver. The participants engaged in the actual practice may not recognize the truth of the biconditionals, because they may not recognize a concept used in the biconditional. Nevertheless, anyone who does competently possess the concepts of conceivability, modality, and ideal conceiver, can reason through the explanations of the relations between these concepts and a priori grasp their truth.
  4. The response-dependent account strictly involves the notion of an ideal conceiver, which is often thought to be problematic. The objection raised is that given that (POS) and (NEC) use ideal conceiver, they are irrelevant to our cognitive situation, since we rarely instantiate ideal conditions. Nevertheless, it is argued that the use of the concept of an ideal conceiver in the biconditionals need not be understood as rendering the biconditionals silent over our actual practice of justifying claims through conceivability. Recognition of the fact that non-ideal conditions effect conceivability, is essential to possessing the concept of conceivability. Moreover, recognizing the truth of the biconditionals requires recognizing that conceivability is a defeasible criterion for possibility.

Chalmers (2002) articulates and defends Weak Modal Rationalism. as part of an overall modal rationalist program.

(WMR) Primary Positive Ideal Conceivability entails Primary Possibility.

(WMR) is constructed out of three distinctions: prima facie vs. ideal rational reflection, positive vs. negative conceivability, and primary vs. secondary conceivability / possibility.

The first distinction pertains to the issue of what kind of reasoning has gone into what one has conceived. A prima facie conception is just a person's initial reaction to a scenario, without reasoning further about the scenario. Often prima facie conceptions are defeated by better reasoning. Ideal rational reasoning, by contrast, is reasoning that is undefeatable by better reasoning. When an entailment link between conceivability and possibility is to be forged, the kind of reasoning involved has to be ideal. The second distinction pertains to two distinct ways in which one can engage in conceiving. Positive conceivability corresponds to actually constructing a scenario in which a statement is verified. Thought experiments, such as Putnam's Twin Earth, involve positive conceivability. By contrast, negative conceivability corresponds to not being able to rule out a certain statement. Negative conceivability is one way of formulating the general notion of inconceivability. The third distinction pertains to two distinct ways in which we can evaluate statements across possible worlds. The distinction between primary and secondary possibility itself rests on an independent theory: Epistemic Two-Dimensional Semantics (E2-d), Chalmers (2004).

The core of the distinction between primary and secondary conceivability and possibility, as it pertains to the epistemology of modality, can be formulated by looking at the prima facie problem that Kripke's a posteriori necessities create for any attempt at an a priori entailment between conceivability and possibility. Given that there are genuine a posteriori necessities, the central question for the entailment approach is: How can the conceivability of P even under a priori ideal reasoning entail that P is possible? The worry is that one could find P conceivable and be reasoning ideally, but nevertheless there is some a posteriori necessity Q, such that Q entails Nec (¬P), but Q is not a priori accessible. For example, one could find it conceivable that water exist without hydrogen, because they have conceived of a scenario in which a substance superficially similar to water is present, but hydrogen is absent. But this scenario does not entail that it is possible for water to exist without hydrogen. On the standard Kripkean story, given that water essentially involves hydrogen and oxygen, it follows that it is necessary that it involves hydrogen. So, it is impossible for there to be water without hydrogen. The basic metaphysical problem, putting aside issues about the epistemic properties of conceivability, is that the existence of a posteriori necessities undermines any kind of universal, valid, and a priori deduction of possibility from conceivability.

The (E2-d) model allows for the possibility of reconstructing an a priori link between conceivability and possibility by making conceivability and possibility primarily a property of statements, distinguishing two kinds of intensions governing statements, acknowledging one space of worlds over which statements are evaluated, and defining two kinds of conceivability and possibility for statements corresponding to each of the intensions. Primary conceivability and possibility are argued to be linked in a way that makes allows for there to be an entailment between conceivability and possibility. The distinction between primary and secondary intensions has undergone several revisions and refinements, and is still controversial. Nevertheless, there is a core set of examples that are used to give the intuitive understanding of the distinction. Here for purposes of discussion I will be presenting only the intuitive distinction. Where S is a statement

  1. the primary intension of S is a function from centered worlds to truth-values, where a centered world is an epistemic scenario consisting of an agent at a location at a time, and the scenario is taken as an epistemic hypothesis about how the actual world might turn out. Where W is an epistemic scenario, the heuristic question for the primary intension is: If W turns out to be the actual world, what is the truth-value of S?
  2. secondary intension of S is a function from possible worlds to truth-values, where the possible worlds at which S is evaluated are considered counterfactually against a given world taken as actual. Where W and W* are possible worlds, the heuristic question for the secondary intension is: Given that W is the actual world, what is the truth-value of S in W*?

For example, let S = ‘water contains XYZ’, where ‘XYZ’ picks out some chemical compound whose existence is ruled out by the physical laws that govern our universe, and let T-earth be a possible world whose laws of physics are not the same as the laws of physics of our universe, and in which XYZ is present, but hydrogen is not. In addition, let the primary intension of ‘water’ be whatever satisfies the description D, where D = the local potable liquid that takes up 60% of the planets surface, falls from the sky, and is essential to life, and that on T-earth XYZ satisfies D. With these assumptions the two-dimensional analysis of S is as follows:

The primary intension of S is non-empty, since if T-earth turns out to be the actual world, then ‘water’ refers to XYZ, and XYZ satisfies D. If we ask: If T-earth turns out to be the actual world, is ‘water contains XYZ’ true? We are rationally led to the conclusion that ‘water contains XYZ’ is true on T-earth, since by stipulation XYZ satisfies D. By contrast, if we take Earth as fixed, and ask: Is ‘water contains XYZ’ true at T-earth considered counterfactually? We are rationally led to a negative answer. If earth is the actual world, and we take earth to be such that water contains hydrogen is part of its underlying nature, then the meaning of ‘water’ on earth, rules out the possibility that a scenario in which the substance picked out by ‘water’ in the actual world has some distinct underlying essential nature, such as XYZ, is water. Given that water contains hydrogen, it could not have been the case that water contains XYZ. However, given that we fix the reference of ‘water’ by D, and we accept T-earth as a hypothesis about how the actual world is, we are rationally led to conclude that ‘water contains XYZ’ is true.

The (E2-d) analysis of Kripkean a posteriori necessities shows them to have a certain structure. Statements such as, ‘water contains hydrogen’, have a contingent primary intension, and a necessary secondary intension. Kripkean a posteriori necessities have a contingent primary intension because they are false at some worlds considered as actual. For example, ‘water contains hydrogen’ is false and ‘water contains XYZ’ is true at T-earth, when T-earth is considered as a hypothesis about how the actual world turns out. Nevertheless, ‘water contains XYZ’ is false at T-earth given that Earth is taken to be the actual world.

With the distinction between primary and secondary intensions in place, primary conceivability and possibility can be defined in terms of evaluating a primary intension. As a consequence, it is argued that while primary conceivability does not entail secondary possibility, primary conceivability under the right circumstances entails primary possibility. The Kripkean a posteriori necessities that pose a prima facie threat to the possibility of an a priori link between conceivability and possibility are avoided by the distinction between the two kinds of conceivability and possibility.

(WMR), thus, offers an epistemology of modality on which conceivability of a certain kind (primary, positive, ideal) entails a certain kind of modality (primary possibility). There are several kinds of questions and objections that can be raised against (WMR). Objections are generally of two kinds: either they concern one of the distinctions or modal rationalism in general. For example, one could object to the distinction between positive and negative conceivability, prima facie vs. ideal rational reflection, or the distinction between primary and secondary intensions. There is a large literature on the distinction between primary and secondary intensions, given that it rests on epistemic two-dimensional semantics. For a related positive account of a distinction similar to that between primary and secondary intensions see Jackson (1998). For discussion of expository, critical and related issues see Vahid (2006), Soames (2005), Garcia-Carpintero & Macia (2006), Davies & Stoljar (2004). Briefly, a general question can be raised about (WMR) and an additional worry about the distinction between prima facie vs. ideal rational reflection can be drawn out.

In general one might accept (WMR), and still seek a comprehensive account of the epistemology of modality. (WMR) does not provide an exhaustive account of the epistemology of modality. For example, (WMR) provides us with an in principle account of an entailment between primary conceivability and primary possibility (modality tied to the primary intension), but it remains silent over how we have justified beliefs or knowledge of de re modality.

Concerning the distinction between prima facie vs. ideal rational reflection, one might worry that many statements that are prima facie conceivable, are in fact under ideal rational reflection contradictory or incoherent. The worry here is that while it is true that there is a metaphysical relation of entailment between conceivability and possibility when we reason along the primary intension, and distinguish between primary and secondary possibility, the existence of this entailment provides us with no justification for holding that any given statement of central importance is in fact more than just prima facie conceivable. In a sense the worry is that (WMR) is correct as a metaphysical thesis about the relation between conceivability and possibility, but silent over the nature of conceivability as an epistemic practice. For discussion of this issue see Brueckner (2001) and Worley (2003). It is important to note that this worry may only show that (WMR) needs to be supplemented by an theory of how conceivability claims should be assessed within human discourse about modality.

For additional criticisms of the role of conceivability and imagination in the epistemology of modality and the use of ‘epistemic possibility’ as a way of understanding conceivability see Fiocco (2007a) and (2007b).

6. Understanding-Based Accounts

There is a way in which we can think of our natural capacity to use concepts, understand statements involving them, and understand relations between them as a guide to what is possible and necessary. For example, by possessing the concepts triangle, square, and circle, and in virtue of understanding these concepts, one could determine that it is impossible for something to be both a triangle and a square, that it is possible for a triangle to be formed by drawing a line from each of the endpoints of the diameter of a circle to any point on the perimeter of a circle, or that it is necessary that a line creating a diagonal in a square forms two right triangles. In contrast to conceivability-based accounts of the epistemology of modality, which feature conceivability as either the distinct fundamental source of our modal knowledge or the most basic form of our modalizing behavior, understanding-based accounts feature the nature of what it is to possess a concept and our general capacity to understand relations between our concepts as the primary source of our justification or knowledge of modality. Conceivability can play a role in the epistemology of modality on an understanding-based approach, however conceivability is not taken to be the most basic explanation of our modal knowledge.

Two independent and distinct developments of the understanding-based approach are given by George Bealer and Christopher Peacocke. Bealer (1987), (1999), (2002) develops and defends Modal Reliabilism, while Peacocke (1997), (1998), and (2002) develops and defends the Principles of Possibility approach.

Modal Reliabilism is the doctrine that something counts as a basic source of evidence if and only if there is an appropriate kind of modal tie between its deliverances and the truth. Modal reliabilism is ultimately used in the context of the epistemology of modality to argue for the claim that intuition is a basic source of evidence, and thus modal intuition is a basic source of evidence for beliefs about modality. One of the main strategies for defending modal reliabilism is through an analysis of what it is for a subject to understand the concepts they possess in a determinate way. It is because modal intuition is argued to have a metaphysically necessary evidential connection to modality through an analysis of understanding, that it is ultimately an understanding-based account of the epistemology of modality. In general, there are many different ways in which a subject can understand a concept. According to Bealer, there is one kind of understanding, determinate understanding, which is argued to be essentially connected with truth. Bealer articulates determinate understanding as that mode m of understanding, which is such that necessarily for all x and all p understood m-ly by x,

(a) p is true if it is possible for x to settle with a priori stability that p is true.

(b.i) p is true only if it is possible for x to settle with a priori stability that p has a counterpart that is true. (for property-identities p).

(b.ii) p is true only if it is possible for x to believe m-ly that p is true. (for p rationally believable by x).

Determinate understanding is a natural mode of understanding which has the three essential properties listed above, where (a) is the correctness condition, (b.1) is the categorical completeness condition, and (b.2) is the noncategorical completeness condition. A mode m has the correctness property if and only if, necessarily, for all individuals x and all propositions p that x understands in mode m, p is true if it is possible for x (or someone starting out in qualitatively the same sort of epistemic situation as x) to settle with a priori stability that p is true, all the while understanding p in mode m. A mode m has the categorical completeness property if and only if, necessarily, for all individuals x, and all true (positive or negative) property-identities p which x understands in mode m, it is possible for x (or someone starting out in qualitatively the same sort of epistemic situation) to settle with a priori stability that there exists some true twin-earth-style counterpart of p, all the while understanding p in mode m. A mode m has the noncategorical completeness property if and only if, necessarily, for all individuals x and all true propositions p that x understands in mode m, and that x could believe, it is possible for x to believe p while still understanding it in mode m. Although there is a substantive theory that goes into articulating each of the elements of Bealer's approach, there is also an intuitive way of illustrating the main connection between determinate understanding and intuition. Consider the case of the multigon which is introduced and centrally discussed by Bealer.

Suppose that in her journal a sincere, wholly normal, attentive woman introduces through use (not stipulation) a new term ‘multigon’. She applies the term to various closed plane figures having several sides (pentagons, octagons, chiliagons, etc.). Suppose her term expresses some definite concept — the concept of being a multigon — and that she determinately understands this concept. By chance, she has neither applied her term ‘multigon’ to triangles and rectangles nor withheld it from them; the question has just not come up. Eventually, however, she considers it. Her cognitive conditions (intelligence, etc.) are good, and she determinately understands these concepts. Suppose that the property of being a multigon is either the property of being a closed, straight-sided plane figure, or being a closed, straight-sided plane figure with five or more sides. Then, intuitively, when the woman entertains the question, she would have an intuition that it is possible for a triangle or a rectangle to be a multigon if and only if being a multigon = being a closed, straight-sided plane figure. Alternatively, she would have an intuition that it is not possible for a triangle or a rectangle to be a multigon if and only if being a multigon = being a closed, straight-sided plane figure with five or more sides. That is, the woman would have truth-tracking intuitions. If she did not, the right thing to say would be that either the woman does not really understand one or more of the concepts involved, or her cognitive conditions are not really ideal. (Bealer: 2002; 103).

The core of the passage above is aimed at suggesting that there is a strong metaphysical connection between understanding a concept C and having truth-tracking intuitions about whether C applies in a given scenario. Intuitively, Bealer's aim is to establish that if a subject S determinately understands a concept C and cognitive conditions are ideal, then S must have truth-tracking intuitions about whether C applies in a given scenario. The central question concerns how to explain a subject's failure to have truth-tracking intuitions. On Bealer's approach there are three options: the concepts are not of the right kind, cognitive conditions are not ideal, or the subject does not determinately understand the concepts. As a consequence, if the concepts are of the right kind, cognitive conditions are ideal, and the subject determinately understands her concepts, it appears difficult to explain how she could fail to have truth-tracking intuitions about C's application in a given scenario.

The analysis of determinate understanding shows that it is metaphysically necessary that in ideal conditions determinate understanding of certain kinds of concepts provides truth-tracking intuitions about those concepts across hypothetical cases. However, there is still a further question as to how exactly intuitions provide us with justification for beliefs about modality or knowledge of modality. It is best to simply look at how a simple Kripkean a posteriori necessity, such as (w), is established.

(w) It is metaphysically necessary that water contains hydrogen.

There are two steps involved in coming to be justified in believing (w).

(e) Water contains hydrogen.

(a) If a sample of a given purely compositional kind is composed of U, then necessarily, all other samples of that purely compositional kind also contain U.

While (e) is justified or known on the basis of sense experience, Bealer argues that (a) can be known a priori. The point is that we do come to know that water is a purely compositional kind and that it contains hydrogen only through empirical investigation. By contrast, according to Bealer, it follows from understanding category concepts such as compositional kind and functional kind and reflecting on cases, that we come to know a priori that compositional kinds are individuated by their underlying essence, while functional kinds are individuated by their functional role. Given that one is in appropriate cognitive conditions and determinately understands categorical concepts, their intuitions about modal principles governing categorial concepts, such as (a), will be truth-tracking. Once one knows (a) and (e), and that water is a compositional stuff, one can deduce (w).

In addition to providing an account of how intuition provides us with evidence, and thus how modal intuition provides us with evidence of modality, Bealer offers an account of modal error.

In contrast to Yablo's (1993) account of modal error, Bealer maintains that in addition to modal error resulting simply from false empirical beliefs or false beliefs about what modal principles are true, modal error additionally results from a failure to understand the nature of categories. According to Bealer (2002), mastery of categorial concepts, such as compositional kind and functional kind, is central to the quality of a subject's intuitions.

Finally, one of the main questions that Bealer's account of the epistemology of modality raises is whether or not we actually determinately understand any of our concepts. One might worry that if we do not determinately understand any of our concepts, then intuition cannot provide us with evidence.

In contrast to Bealer's approach on which an analysis of understanding is used to show that there is a metaphysical connection between understanding a concept and having truth-tracking intuitions about the concept's application across hypothetical cases, Peacocke develops an account on which our understanding of metaphysical modality is explained by a tacit knowledge of principles of possibility that govern metaphysical modality. On this principle-based-conception, to possess the very concept of metaphysical modality is to possess tacit knowledge of the principles that govern possibility in a way that allows one to make, understand, and evaluate modal judgments. The articulation of the principle-based-conception proceeds in three parts. First, an account of the truth-conditions for modal discourse is given. Second, a theory of what it is to understand modal discourse that draws on implicit knowledge of the very principles that fix what it is for something to be a genuine possibility is developed. Finally, a corresponding epistemology of modality is developed that links the truth-conditions for modal discourse with a theory of what it is to possess and understand concepts of metaphysical modality.

Peacocke's Principles of Possibility are built out of principles that concern, on the one hand, concepts, and, on the other hand, objects, properties, and relations. In both cases the principles require that for something to be a genuine possibility it must respect what makes something what it is. That is genuine possibilities respect the essential nature of the things involved. On the principle-based-conception two notions that are of central importance are assignment and admissibility. An assignment s is not a specification of meaning to uninterpreted schematic letters, rather, it is a specification of meanings to concepts, where by, for example, singular concepts, such as expressed by ‘Richard Nixon’, are assigned objects, and monadic predicative concepts, such as expressed by ‘is tall’, are assigned functions from objects to truth-values. Admissibility is a property of an assignment, and provides the key link to genuine possibility. In general, a specification is a genuine possibility if and only if there is some admissible assignment which counts all of its members as true. A theory of what makes an assignment admissible is given by the Principles of Possibility.

The main Principle of Possibility at the level of concepts is the Unified Modal Extension Principle (UMEP):

(UMEP) An assignment s is admissible only if: for any concept C, the semantic value of C according to s is the result of applying the same rule as is applied in the determination of the actual semantic value of C.

(UMEP) states that admissibility is constrained by the rules for a given concept. No assignment is admissible where the rule for the concept in the actual world is not used. For example, an assignment s that specifies that the referent of ‘Bachelor’ is the set of married people, will not count as an admissible assignment, since s does not respect the actual rule that governs the concept.

At the level of objects, properties, and relations Peacocke develops a partial list of constitutive principles. It is an essential component of the account that a list does exist. However, it is not exactly clear what principles need to go on the list. In general, the goal of these principles is to constrain assignments into admissible and inadmissible assignments. A constitutive principle states that an assignment is admissible only if it respects what is constitutive of the objects, properties, and relations it mentions. Here are some of the main constitutive principles:

Fundamental Kind: If P is a property which is an object x's fundamental kind, then an assignment is inadmissible if it counts the proposition x is P as false.

Origin: An assignment is inadmissible if it counts both the proposition a exists as true and the proposition a develops from b and c as false, if a actually did develop from b and c.

Principle of Constrained Recombination: An assignment is admissible if it respects the set of conditions on admissibility.

In addition, to the constitutive principles, there are modal characterizations.

Characterization of Possibility: A Thought or proposition is possible if and only if it is true according to some admissible assignment.

Characterization of Necessity: A Thought or proposition is necessary if and only if it is true according to all admissible assignments.

According to Peacocke's view it is part of what it is to possess the concept of metaphysical modality that a subject has a tacit knowledge of principles like these and draws on them in evaluating modal sentences and thoughts, and that their tacit knowledge is fundamental rather than derived from something else. The Principles of Possibility in some sense are like the principles that govern how normal adult speakers think about grammaticality in their native language. Just as an adult may not know what principle of English grammar shows that a certain sentence is ungrammatical, they are nevertheless credited with being competent with English grammar. One explanation of this competence is that they draw on a tacit knowledge of English grammar that they possess. The Principles of Possibility are similar in that they are principles that a subject who possesses the concept of metaphysical modality may not be able to articulate, but nevertheless draws upon in understanding and evaluating modal discourse. Given that the Principles of Possibility are offered as an explanation of how we go about understanding and evaluating modal discourse, there is still a further question as to what the nature of modal knowledge is. Here Peacocke articulates three main theses:

Thesis (I): In every case in which a modal truth involving metaphysical necessity or possibility is unknowable by us, its unknowability is wholly explained either by the unknowability by us of some truth not involving metaphysical modalities, or by the unknowability by us of one of the Principles of Possibility.

Thesis (II): In every case in which a content containing a metaphysical modality is known, any modal premises in the ultimate justification which underwrites the status of the belief as knowledge are a priori premises.

Thesis (III): Thesis (II) is necessary, and holds for all possible knowers.

Thesis (I) is best explained by considering how we might fail to know that it is metaphysically necessary that water contains hydrogen. According to Thesis (I), our failure would be due either to a failure to know the empirical claim that water contains hydrogen or through a failure to know some principle of metaphysical modality that connects the kind of thing water is with its being essential that it is that kind of thing. Thesis (II) holds that the Principles of Possibility are known a priori. Taking our example, this means that whatever Principle of Possibility gets us from the empirical fact that water contains hydrogen to the claim that it is metaphysically necessary that water contains hydrogen is known a priori. Thesis (III) encapsulates the idea that knowledge of metaphysical modality has a certain kind of essential nature. Its essential nature is that it has a fundamentally a priori character.

For critical discussion of the Principles of Possibility approach see the symposium on Being Known in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 64.2. In general, there are two main critical issues that surround the Principles of Possibility. On the one hand, there are issues about circularity. It appears that at several places the principle-based-conception potentially opens itself up to a charge of circularity in virtue of using one kind of modality to explain another kind of modality. For example, genuine possibility is explained via admissibility of assignment. However, admissibility itself is a modal notion. Thus, one could question whether the modality involved in admissibility is problematic. Peacocke (1998) presents several responses to possible circularity objections. On the other hand, there are issues surrounding the kind of modality that is embraced by the approach. It appears that Peacocke's account acknowledges an actualist conception of modality rather than a possibilists conception. An actualist maintains that the space of possible worlds is constructed out of objects, properties, and relations found in the actual world. A possibilist denies this, maintaining that in some possible worlds there are either objects, properties, or relations that are not found in the actual world. One might worry that the principles states so far concerning possibility appears to limit the approach to an actualist ontology. Peacocke (2002) presents an extension of his view, which aims at accounting for some possibilist claims.

7. Counterfactual-Based Accounts

Counterfactual accounts of the epistemology of metaphysical modality have been offered by Hill (2006) and Williamson (2007a), and a counterfactual analysis of necessity has been offered by Kment (2006). Although there are certain formal similarities between Hill (2006) and Williamson (2007), there are differences in how the theories are articulated and how the epistemology of metaphysical modality is developed. In general, the central feature of these accounts is that counterfactual reasoning and imagination play the central role in explaining the epistemology of metaphysical modality. There are two key elements present in counterfactual accounts: (i) a definition of metaphysical modality in terms of subjunctive conditionals, and (ii) a theory of how counterfactual reasoning provides one with justified beliefs about modality and knowledge of modality. The central idea of this approach in Williamson (2007) is that given an adequate definition of metaphysical modality in terms of counterfactual conditionals, the epistemology of metaphysical modality can simply be taken to be a special case of the epistemology of counterfactuals. Counterfactual accounts are, therefore, reductive accounts both metaphysically and epistemologically. Metaphysically they reduce metaphysical modality to logically equivalent formulas involving subjunctive conditionals, and epistemologically they reduce the epistemology of metaphysical modality to the epistemology of counterfactual reasoning.

The historical starting point for step (i) is the work of Stalnaker (1968) and Lewis (1973). Each proposed the idea that metaphysical modality can be defined in terms of counterfactual conditionals. Let ‘A > B’ express ‘If A were the case, B would be the case’. According to Lewis, for example, (CC) gives the truth conditions for subjunctive conditionals:

(CC) A subjunctive conditional A > C is true at a possible world W just in case either (a) A is not true at any of the possible worlds that are accessible from W or (b) there is an accessible world at which both A and C are true that is more similar to W than any accessible world at which both A and ¬C are true.

Using (CC) metaphysical necessity and possibility can be defined as:

(NEC) □A = ¬A > A

(POS) ◊A = ¬□¬A

Alternatively, using ‘⊥’ to stand for logical contradiction one can define metaphysical modality as:

(NEC) □A = (¬A > ⊥)

(POS) ◊A = ¬(A > ⊥)

The core metaphysical idea is that a proposition A is necessary if and only if were ¬A true some contradiction would also be true, and that a proposition A is possible when it is not the case that were A true, a contradiction would also be true. It is important to note that in a case in which it is necessary that A, it is not necessary that the contradiction that would be true if ¬A were true be logically derivable from ¬A. Here is a run through of the core idea with a standard example. It is metaphysically necessary that nothing is red and green all over at the same time. This claim is logically equivalent to the claim that were it the case that x is red and green all over at the same time, a contradiction would also be true. Likewise, the claim that it is metaphysically possible that the laws of physics be different from what they actually are is equivalent to the claim that it is not the case that were the laws of physics different, a logical contradiction would also be true. As a technical matter it is important to note that the definitions above are not synonyms, but rather logical equivalences. (NEC) and (POS) show that metaphysical modalities are logically equivalent to counterfactual conditionals involving either negation or negation and logical contradiction.

The core epistemological idea is derived from the logical relation between metaphysical modality and counterfactual conditionals. Given that metaphysical necessity is logically equivalent to a counterfactual conditional involving negation and logical contradiction, the account maintains that someone capable of reasoning with negation and logical contradiction, is capable of reasoning about metaphysical modality. As a consequence, the general procedure for arriving at justified beliefs about metaphysical modality is through working out counterfactual conditionals in imagination. In particular, one is justified in believing that A is metaphysically necessary if by assuming ¬A and working out in imagination what follows they are led to a contradiction. And one is justified in believing that A is metaphysically possible if by assuming that A were the case, and working out in imagination what follows, they are not led to a contradiction. One epistemically significant consequence of this view is that it clearly presents a response to issues raised by the spooky faculty objection. Many philosophers are skeptical of accounts of the epistemology of modality that either explicitly or implicitly rely on a commitment to a special faculty designed specifically for detecting necessity, such a faculty is regarded as being spooky. Consequently, it is preferable to have an account on which there is no explicit or implicit appeal to a faculty for detecting necessity. The counterfactual approach clearly provides an answer. Rather than holding that there is a special faculty, on the counterfactual approach one can hold that our general ability to understand and evaluate counterfactuals is all that is needed for the epistemology of modality.

There are at least two important questions one can raise about the counterfactual account. One question relates to the metaphysical claim about the relation between metaphysical modality and counterfactual conditionals. And the other question relates to the epistemological claim about the reduction of the epistemology of metaphysical modality to the epistemology of counterfactuals. Regarding the first, one might wonder whether the definitions above actually capture metaphysical necessity, rather than simply some kind of necessity. Both Williamson (2007) and Hill (2006) offer strong arguments for the claim that the definitions actually do capture metaphysical necessity. Nevertheless, depending on what account of metaphysical necessity one takes, questions about the adequacy of the definition can be raised. Regarding the second issue, one might wonder whether the fact that x is logically equivalent to y is sufficient for reducing the epistemology of x to the epistemology of y. In the case of synonymy this appears to be correct. Where x and y range over terms of a language, it appears correct to hold that if x is synonymous with y, then the epistemology of what x picks out is the same as the epistemology of what y picks out. For example, ‘bachelor’ is synonymous with ‘unmarried male’, and it appears to be correct to say that knowing all the bachelors is nothing over and above knowing all the unmarried males. However, given that (NEC) and (POS) are not synonyms, but rather logical equivalences, one might wonder whether logical equivalence is sufficiently strong enough for reducing the epistemology of one domain to the epistemology of another domain. Logical equivalence may only be a necessary condition on reducing the epistemology of one domain to the epistemology of another.

In addition, to the two questions above which concern modality, there is an additional question concerning the application of the counterfactual framework towards an analysis of modal intuitions concerning thought experiments. Williamson (2008) has argued that intuitions about, for example, the Gettier case are in fact contingent and instances of armchair knowledge (i.e. not either strictly a posteriori or a priori). This result is contrary to the traditional analysis of thought experiment intuitions under which they are a priori and necessary. For discussion of this issue see Ichikawa & Jarvis (2007).

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