Few principles are as often identified with bioethics as informed consent. In clinical practice, the doctrine of informed consent rose to dominance during the course of the 20th century. It replaced a medical ethos founded on trust in physicians' decisions—often on the assumption that “doctor knows best”—with an ethos that sought to put patients in charge of their own care. In medical research on human subjects, informed consent requirements gained prominence in reaction to abuses. One influential response to the cruelty of Nazi experiments was the Nuremberg Code of research ethics, which stipulated, “The voluntary consent of the human subject is absolutely essential” (Faden and Beauchamp 1986, 156). But why should we require informed consent when it comes at a cost to the individual's health? What is the content, the scope, and the status of that requirement? How does informed consent in bioethics, the focus of the present entry, relate to consent in sexual ethics, business ethics, and political philosophy?
- 1. The requirement of informed consent
- 2. Why informed consent?
- 3. The idea of consent
- 4. Informed consent
- 5. Voluntary consent
- 6. Waivers of informed consent
- 7. Exceptions to informed consent
- 8. The status of the requirement
- 9. Consent in other domains
- 10. Conclusion: the core of informed consent
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- Related Entries
In English, “consent” has several meanings. In the relevant sense, consent transactions have a distinct structure: agent A consents to B's φ-ing on A, under a certain description of φ-ing, whether or not the offer was initiated by B. For example, a man may consent to a physician's touching the man's testicles as part of a testicular cancer exam (compare Kleinig 2010, 6–7).
Informed consent is shorthand for informed, voluntary, and decisionally-capacitated consent. Consent is considered fully informed when a capacitated (or “competent”) patient or research subject to whom full disclosures have been made and who understands fully all that has been disclosed, voluntarily consents to treatment or participation on this basis. In its most important role in bioethics, informed consent is a legitimacy requirement for certain actions. Inadequately informed consent makes certain intrusions impermissible. Roughly, when a sufficiently capacitated adult does not give sufficiently informed and voluntary consent to intervention in her body or her private sphere, then, at least when the intervention is substantial, not trivial, and absent severe jeopardy for third parties, the intervention is impermissible—even when it seeks to assist her, physicians recommend it, third parties would benefit from it, and the patient herself had repeatedly consented to it before expressing a change of mind. When the antecedent is inapplicable, for instance, when the patient lacks decision-making capacity, similarly spirited rules apply, such as rules delegating consent “authority” to the patient's advance directive or proxy.
While consent and informed consent are relevant to medical torts, to distributive and proprietary medical claims, and to ideal (as opposed to merely legitimate) doctor-patient relationships, this entry focuses on informed consent in its central role as a legitimacy requirement for medical intervention. Contemporary medical culture and central human rights documents support something like this requirement. In the US, where regulatory commitment to informed consent is especially strong, federal funding for research usually requires review of informed consent procedures, and the constitutional right to privacy binds government to honor patients' refusal of care. Lack of informed consent can be used to establish negligence (and hence malpractice and torts), or battery and assault.
Since the 1970s, extensive bioethics writing focuses on how to define and achieve “valid” consent—sufficiently capacitated, informed, and voluntary consent—and the conditions, especially in medical research, have become increasingly demanding. The contrast between these post-informed consent expectations and an earlier medical ethos is vividly illustrated in an excerpt of the Hippocratic Oath (fifth century B.C.E.): “Conceal most things from the patient… Give necessary orders with cheerfulness and serenity… revealing nothing of the patient's future or present condition.” Present-day physicians like to think that they treat their patients differently.
Section 2 discusses the potential justifications for the requirement of informed consent. Sections 3–5 delineate its content with greater detail. Sections 6–7 note potential waivers and exceptions to the requirement. Sections 8–9 review its status and its relations to consent requirements in other normative fields. Section 10 concludes.
Plato attacks political democracy by drawing on analogy to the medical arena: “When a man is ill… to the physician he must go, and he who wants to be governed, to him who is able to govern” (Plato Republic, VI 489B–C, 180). Nowadays it is common to reject both Plato's anti-democratic politics and his medical ethics. A central defense of political democracy against Plato's attack rests on the Condorcet jury theorem, which underwrites the “wisdom of the masses.” But there are no masses in the medical arena, where the informed consent requirement nonetheless gives a single non-expert—the patient or the research participant—veto power over some interventions, even against the will of many expert physicians. This raises the question: Why not take Plato's, or Hippocrates's, approach in that arena? Why require informed consent, disallowing medical experts to make the final decision on matters that fall within their fields of expertise—medical treatment and medical investigation? The main arguments for informed consent revolve around:
- prevention of abusive conduct,
- non-domination, and
- personal integrity.
The simplest rationale for the informed consent requirement is that it protects patients' and participants' health and welfare. It protects potential research participants from investigators' overzealous attempts to promote science and their careers, even on participants' backs, and it also protects regular patients from physicians' overconfident, but often incorrect, paternalistic judgments on what is good for them. This pragmatic and instrumental rationale is often considered utilitarian, although many moral doctrines endorse duties to protect patients and research participants. Advocates of this rationale echo ideas from utilitarian philosopher John Stuart Mill, and say that patients and research participants are typically the best judges of their own good and mind it far more than doctors do, even when doctors assure them that what they are doing is in the best interest of the patients and study participants (compare Mill 1990, e.g. 215).
However, insofar as the goal is to protect patients and trial participants from harm, why honor informed consent requirements when we are fairly certain that a particular patient or subject is not making a decision that furthers her own medical interests? In clinical care, for example, patients' biases and ignorance about medicine usually exceed those of physicians; and (less frequently) patients refuse interventions that everyone considers best for them—even family, friends, and these patients themselves, before a change of heart. Indeed, some, far from protecting themselves, knowingly jeopardize their own health in the name of religious or moral commitments. This being the case, why is it important—as it seems to many of us and as is enshrined in law—to honor the requirement of informed consent when a fully capacitated Jehovah's Witness refuses a blood transfusion on religious grounds? And why honor the requirement when health is not at stake, for example, in experiments on stored tissue? Finally, specifically from a utilitarian standpoint, why honor the requirement on occasions when it seems to set back collective health, for example, when we cannot develop a new drug that would help many, because no one is altruistic enough to consent to being a test subject?
The 1970s saw the ascent of a second rationale, autonomy, as the predominant justification of informed consent, through influential work by Ruth Faden, Tom Beauchamp, James Childress, and a US President's Commission (Faden and Beauchamp 1986, 8; National Commission for the Protection of Human Subjects of Biomedical and Behavioral Research 1979, section b (1), 282–3; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, ch. 4; Beauchamp 2010; see also President's Commission for the Study of Ethical Problems in Medicine and Biomedical and Behavioral Research 1982, 27; Feinberg 1986; Dworkin 1988, 111, 113; Buchanan and Brock 1989, 36ff.; Brock 1994, 31–2).
Philosophers of action usually understand autonomy as governance over one's own agency—acting according to a law that one sets for oneself. Likewise, for bioethicists Beauchamp and Childress, “The autonomous individual acts freely in accordance with a self-chosen plan, analogous to the way an independent government manages its territories and establishes its policies” (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 99–100). As the authors emphasize (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 100–1), autonomy so understood differs from autonomy as having the will that one wants to have (Frankfurt 1988). It also differs from many other uses of “autonomy” in bioethics and biolaw (Dworkin 1988, 101ff.): so many as to prompt some to question the force of autonomy-based justifications (O'Neill 2003). However, initially, autonomy seems like a promising ground for informed consent requirements. Fully informed consent involves many components of autonomy. “Personal autonomy encompasses, at a minimum, self-rule that is free from both controlling interference by others and from certain limitations such as an inadequate understanding that prevents meaningful choice” (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 100–1). One may add deceit and other threats to voluntariness to this list. The rationale for not transfusing a refusing, decisionally-capacitated Jehovah's Witness even when forced transfusion would save the witness's life is clearly not protection of her health. Instead, it seems to have to do with the importance of maintaining her self-rule on such momentous issues: a matter of respect for an autonomous decision maker's refusal.
While occasionally, the need for autonomous authorization of medical intervention is considered “axiomatic” (Beauchamp 2010, 58), it is commonplace to defend autonomy on independent grounds. A complete autonomy-based justification for the informed consent requirement would explain both why personal autonomy, under a plausible explication, matters—why it has high value or status, at least in the health arena; and how honoring the informed consent requirement engages with its value or status correctly.
Some attempt to justify autonomy on merely instrumental grounds, suggesting, for example, that concordance between our care and our values is often key to our continued satisfaction and cooperation with assigned medical teams. More philosophically, it is suggested that autonomy is inherently good for us. First, self-rule is central to a good life, perhaps because it makes us less self-alienated and more worthy of praise for our virtuous decisions. Second, autonomous choices promote our ultimate goals, on the non-controversial assumption that medicine affects non-technical and controversial matters of value and faith on which physicians are not experts (say, a Jehovah's Witness's faith), and the controversial assumption that these goals define how well our lives go (President's Commission for the Study of Ethical Problems in Medicine and Biomedical and Behavioral Research 1982; Dworkin 1988, 113).
However, these links between informed consent, autonomy, and the good life are more tenuous than informed consent requirements purport to be. In the Jehovah's Witness case, any medical good that might come from promoting the patient's future cooperation with assigned medical teams is irrelevant once refusal to accept transfusion makes the patient's future life an impossibility. In addition, Jehovah's Witnesses come in different stripes. Some who adamantly refuse blood transfusion hope that physicians will impose transfusion on them. According to the beliefs of these Witnesses, what their religion says is that they must refuse transfusion, not that undergoing forced transfusion is a breach of their personal integrity or a sure way to wind up in hell. To impose transfusion on Jehovah's Witnesses of that particular persuasion would not blight their lives, but it remains a clear breach of informed consent requirements.
Fully autonomous decision-making often seems to be bad for us, at least in some respects, say, when it involves tortuous deliberations, makes us more accountable for embarrassing mistakes, or invites social pressure to make certain choices (Dworkin 1988, ch. 5). The cost of ensuring that one decision is absolutely autonomous may be a severe, permanent, or fatal health problem. This health problem will likely affect well-being more than a small marginal decrease of autonomy would—but some informed consent requirements apply. Indeed, on no theory of well-being—neither desire satisfaction, hedonic state, nor objective list—does it seem to follow that either informed consent or autonomous choice invariably makes a patient's life better (Buchanan and Brock 1989, ch. 1 §4, esp. p. 40). And if they did, then it would be absurd to claim, as proponents of the autonomy rationale do (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, e.g. pp. 12, 14), that informed consent and the principle of autonomy are distinct from, sometimes conflict with, and often supersede, the principle of beneficence.
A different version of the autonomy rationale states, in the spirit of Immanuel Kant's ethics, that autonomy should command our awe and reverence, whether or not it is good for us (Hill 1991, 43). The literature on informed consent regularly cites Kant's Formula of Humanity (Kant 1996, 80 [4:429]) to establish that duties of respect for autonomy bind physicians (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 63, 103; Dworkin 1988, 110; Levine 1988, 96–7; Pellegrino and Thomasma 1993, 128). Alan Donagan's defense of the requirement of informed consent illustrates this Kantian approach: “Recognition of every human being as having a unique dignity as human, and as therefore being an end in every relation in which others may morally stand to him, entails that no human being may legitimately be interfered with in pursuing his conception of his happiness in whatever way seems best to him” (Donagan 1977, 31).
Onora O'Neill disagrees that autonomy as bioethicists understand it resembles Kant's notion of autonomy (O'Neill 2003): autonomy in the bioethicists' sense bears an affinity to Mill's notion of individuality or spontaneity, which Mill, a utilitarian, associated closely enough with well-being to conclude, “Over himself, over his own body and mind, the individual is sovereign” (Mill 1990, 135; see also ch. 3).
Whether bioethicists' notion of autonomy counts as Kantian or Millian, and regardless of either the exact meaning of autonomy or the extent to which autonomy is good for us, grounding informed consent in autonomy turns out to be difficult. First, not all acts that are generally assumed to violate informed consent seem contrary to autonomous decision-making. Suppose that a sufficiently capacitated adult patient refuses an urgent and beneficial, but non-emergency, intervention, due to a simple misunderstanding of medical facts. There is no time to convince him of his mistake. Being uninformed, his decision cannot count as autonomous. But present medical practices surrounding informed consent continue to forbid, possibly for good reasons, forcing care on such a patient—for example, strapping him to the bed to deliver an operation. In such instances, the problem with forced care cannot be simply violation of autonomy. Some have argued that forced care is legitimate in fairly similar cases, because it would contravene “mere desire” not “rational desire” (Savulescu 1994), and because “the state has the right to prevent self-regarding harmful conduct…when… that conduct is substantially nonvoluntary…” (Feinberg 1986, 12). A different possible conclusion is that present informed consent practices are sound, they just rest on justifications other than respect for personal autonomy. Surely a “No” to an intervention in the body is often a “No” even when the patient lacks the capacity or the information to authorize a “Yes” (compare Estlund 2007, 121–5; Gunderson 1990).
Likewise, informed consent finds some acts far more reprehensible than others, although their impacts on our autonomous action and pursuits are similar. As an example, performing a testicular cancer exam without the patient's informed consent is very problematic, and transgresses core informed consent requirements. It is far harder to justify than looking carefully at a skin mole on a patient's cheek from across a clinic desk, in order to detect cancer, without his informed consent. Non-consensual facial scrutiny might not even violate informed consent. The main difference seems to be in whether a sensitive area of the patient's body is being touched and scrutinized without the patient's consent, which can constitute extreme battery; and not in the patient's exercise of agency, say, in the number or nature of the patient's actions and plans that are thereby blocked. It may be true that extreme battery symbolizes extreme contempt towards the patient as a sovereign agent, but here, at least, it does not involve greater interference with his autonomy.
A further challenge to grounding informed consent requirements in personal autonomy is that violating these requirements can have a positive impact on autonomy. One example is when closing off an option, in violation of informed consent, enables more important freedoms. For instance, closing off patients' options for voluntary euthanasia was said to give them freedom from family pressure to use that option, and to increase their autonomy (Velleman 1992).
As a final challenge to grounding informed consent in autonomy, consider a patient who has been treated fairly and offered a simple explanation of her treatment and the alternatives that she could comprehend if she tried; her failure to comprehend it and to choose autonomously is the fruit of her own neglect. Can the physician or the investigator really be blamed for the patient's consequent non-autonomous choice (Sreenivasan 2003; Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 85, 95)? In many areas of life in which consent seems necessary, what matters is not so much the “quality of choice,” say, how autonomous it is, but whether the person had been given the opportunity to make a choice of that quality (Scanlon 1988).
An alternate rationale defends informed consent requirements as a bulwark against such deontological offenses as assault, deceit, coercion, and exploitation (Manson and O'Neill 2007, 75f.). From this viewpoint, informed consent requirements are valuable instrumentally, but in order to thwart certain acts, not in order to thwart or promote certain non-deontic outcomes such as setbacks to health.
The abuse-prevention rationale faces distinctive challenges. First, it may be unable to account for the full extent of clinicians' informed consent duties. Most of us would say that physicians who note that their patients misunderstand medical matters pertinent to the decision ought to correct these errors. Even when earlier these clinicians gave their patients excellent explanations, which worked with similar patients and so rule out reasonable suspicion of deceit, exploitation, and so forth, clinicians who know that misunderstanding persists should make some effort to correct it. This rationale fails to explain this duty (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 118; compare Manson and O'Neill 2007, 82–3). Another challenge for the abuse-prevention rationale is that it is difficult to ground either in a consequentialist or in a deontological ethics. Consequentialist ethics focuses on all bad consequences, not just on abusive conduct and its downstream consequences. Deontological ethics, being agent relative and moment relative, may be unable to provide strong reasons for preventing future deontological offenses, especially by others. It therefore allows little room for strong reasons to enforce informed consent requirements on others, although some informed consent rights are surely legally enforceable. It also allows little room for strong reasons against coercive medical intervention when third parties perform the coercion; for example, against extracting a live kidney from a consenting patient who consents only due to her family's coercion.
In recent years, a number of philosophers have argued that “Informed consent… is generally important [in part] because it can make a distinctive contribution to the restoration of trust” (O'Neill 2002, 145; see also Bok 1999, 11, 26–7, 63; Jackson 1994, 491; Tännsjö 1999, 24). Their trust rationale is future-looking. It points out the importance of ongoing societal trust in caretakers and medical institutions, for example, so the public will continue to comply with medical advice, participate in medical research, and fill in organ donor cards. Since violating informed consent would jeopardize that trust, it is something to be avoided. This rationale has the advantage of potentially justifying an informed consent requirement even to low-risk and low-impact interventions, the imposition of which nevertheless remains strongly unwanted—for example, in the case of forced touching of intimate body parts. It also addresses the wrongness of outright lying to patients, even when it produces beneficial placebo effects. If discovered, such battery and lying could easily undermine public trust in physicians.
Since it is forward-looking, this trust rationale is vulnerable to the objection that, intuitively, informed consent can remain necessary even when the public could never find out that a core violation of the requirement took place. While the requirement of informed consent might not obtain across the board, it seems inappropriate to determine whether it obtains in a given context based on trust considerations. If a physician considers administering a medication without consent, it seems corrupt to consider how chemically traceable is the medication, although that would affect how much her action would jeopardize future public trust in physicians. Another challenge to this version of the trust rationale is that violating a person's informed consent is usually thought to wrong that person, not to wrong only the potential future victims of a decline in public trust. A possible response would be that the (only) reason why we consider informed consent to be the immediate patient's right is that what is likeliest to inspire public trust is unconditional commitment to one's immediate patient's alleged consent rights.
A quite different version of trust rationale is backward-looking. This version defends informed consent as an intrinsically valuable way to honor the trust that the patient has placed in the physician, and as part of the fiduciary role that the physician has undertaken (Joffe and Truog 2010, 352ff.). This can be seen as a matter of virtues like trustworthiness (Pellegrino and Thomasma 1993, 65–78). However, the backward-looking version of the trust rationale has difficulty explaining the need for informed consent outside pre-existing caretaker-patient relationships. Forced bodily trespass, for example, seems (not much less) wrong when it comes from complete strangers.
Another rationale surrounds self-ownership: we are presumed to hold proprietary rights over ourselves and our bodies, perhaps in line with John Locke's idea that “every Man has a Property in his own Person” (Locke 1988, V. 27, 305). Naturally, once an owner's consent is given, the alleged proprietary prohibition on access and direct impact is removed. This rationale may better explain why we must normally grant our permission, even for medical intervention that is safe, low-impact, and clearly beneficial, and requires no agency on our part. Trespass into a truly private sphere can be forbidden even when it involves only touching, and the owner is foolish or selfish to reject it (Archard 2008, 27f; Thomson 1990, ch. 8; Nozick 1986).
Unfortunately, an account based on self-ownership seems to raise more questions than it settles. Self-ownership may just mean that the individual should be the final arbiter in the relevant sphere, and that seems like a part of what informed consent requires—hardly an edifying rationalization for requiring informed consent (compare Cohen 1995, chs. 9–10). Alternatively, self-ownership may designate a more circumscribed list of rights (Archard 2008, 29–30), but this list would also stand in need of a defense, and cannot by itself count as adequate justification. A further challenge is that the self-ownership rationale fails to clarify why touching sensitive areas of the body without consent seems worse than touching less sensitive areas without consent. Property violation is not usually a matter of degree (compare Archard 2008, 30–1). Even if we own our bodies, this would not clarify why physicians must disclose and ensure our comprehension of information prior to intervention, something which proprietary rights seldom require. Indeed, if there are no such property rights to information, the notion of self-ownership could be used against coercing doctors to give patients that information—because such coercion may violate their self-ownership rights to interact as they will.
Bioethicists rarely explore the value of non-domination as a rationale for informed consent, although this rationale is used extensively in sexual ethics and political philosophy. The idea here would be that no one should be under the arbitrary control of another and that informed consent requirements help to prevent such arbitrary control. One would argue that medicine is rife with potential to become hierarchical, given the utter dependency of patients and research participants on physicians (Levine 1988, 121–2), as well as the knowledge gaps between them, especially in the investigational context. Therefore, patients and research participants' self-control requires special protection, which informed consent provides. This rationale may shed light on the special importance of informed consent to research participation, where the knowledge gap is greater, and where there is a specific informed consent right to withdraw from research at any point. Even if one has autonomously waived protection, arbitrary control by others, which may ensue without that protection, remains intolerable.
The non-domination rationale has difficulty explaining why physicians and investigators who are closely monitored and cannot afford to abuse patients would also be obligated to let patients decide. Arguably, some existing systems have ample institutional mechanisms in place to prevent physicians and investigators from exercising arbitrary control, even without informed consent rights, and yet the latter remains important.
A final rationale for informed consent requirements is the need to protect patients' sense of personal integrity. One reason offered for keeping surrogate pregnancy contracts non-enforceable is the need to maintain surrogate mothers' sense of personhood by never coercively taking babies away (Radin 1983, e.g., 960). A similar rationale may be thought to justify informed consent in general, and to reflect our special relation to our bodies. As Gerald Dworkin put a slightly different point, “one's body is irreplaceable and inescapable. If my architect doesn't listen to me and this results in a house I do not like, I can always move. I cannot move from my body.” (Dworkin 1988, 113). By one interpretation, personal integrity underlies self-ownership norms. What it requires is, in Ronald Dworkin's words, “a prophylactic line that comes close to making the body inviolate” (Dworkin 1983, 39). However, personal integrity may instead give rise to a normative continuum, on which the outer line of the body is only one stop. Touching someone's cheek without his informed consent is hardly as bad as touching more sensitive areas of his body without his informed consent. The continuum may also extend outside the body. As Judith Thomson points out, it is a greater violation to touch an unwilling person's body than to touch his shoes, and the violation is smaller but still existent when he is not wearing them (Thomson 1990, 207–8). It also matters how and why these areas are touched. Such continua may be thought to track the typical degree of injury to personal integrity.
An account in terms of personal integrity would require more specification. For example, what is the relation between this account and the offense of battery? Would this account condemn the use of a magic wand to treat an unwilling patient's ailments without cutting his skin and so, perhaps without battery (Brock 1999, 529f)? Would it also condemn the use of threats to coerce patients to move their bodies in certain ways, even without touching them? Is the account ultimately grounded in an a priori argument, in evolutionary psychology (Wertheimer 2003, 113f.), in the typical material harms from violations of bodily integrity, or in still other considerations?
Let us now review the different elements of fully free and informed consent in some detail, starting with the notion of consent itself. English admits of both psychological and behavioral senses of consent. Psychologically, consent can designate “a state of mind of acquiescence” (Westen 2003, 5), and “an act of will—a subjective mental state…” (Hurd 1996, 121). But the medical requirement of informed consent seems to include at least some behavioral expression of consent (Kleinig 2010, 9–10), ranging from a patient's signature to his not protesting when a nurse approaches with a syringe (so-called implicit or tacit consent). That said, the need for some comprehension and voluntariness means that mental states also affect when consent legitimizes medical intervention, perhaps supporting a hybrid view (as Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 84 call it).
When emergency intervention is needed but normal consent cannot be obtained, say, because the patient is unconscious and neither she nor her family's specific preferences can be identified in time, proponents of informed consent often justify intervention by invoking a potentially different form of consent. They say that presumed consent obtains, even if actual and express consent does not. Presumed consent is also often invoked in order to legitimize a general policy of harvesting organs from healthy deceased persons to use in transplantation, unless they explicitly indicated their opposition, and a similar general policy of testing all incoming patients for HIV except those who explicitly request not to be tested. Such policies reverse the usual default assumptions about what is permissible and place the onus on any individual who has reservations, to “opt out.” The underlying thought is that when opting out remains easy, so-called presumed consent is perfectly consonant with patient sovereignty (Sunstein and Thaler 2008).
Some authors oppose the terminology of presumed consent as a contrived “myth” or “fiction” of actual consent (Harmon 1990; Brownsword 2004, 232–3; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 107; Dworkin 1988, 117). The opponents concede that when a nurse approaches a patient with a syringe, the patient's failure to protest warrants actual, tacit consent. But they explain that in the latter context, a convention clarifies that non-refusal expresses agreement. This is what turns the patient's silence into actual, albeit tacit, consent. By contrast, it is fraudulent to presume consent when consent is not explicitly given and no relevant conventions clarify that silence expresses consent.
This opposition seems to interpret “presumed consent” ascriptions as meaning: Presumably, the patient has given actual (albeit tacit) consent. The opponents seem right on point: it goes too far to assume that, just because a patient fails to carry in her pocket a directive forbidding care or organ harvesting in the event of an emergency or death, she can be understood as consenting. However, on a different interpretation, presumed consent ascriptions mean: Presumably, the patient would have consented to the intervention if, under the current circumstances, she were decisionally-capacitated. A possible ground for such counterfactual ascriptions is that there is no special information that indicates that the patient would not consent, and most people would consent. This interpretation seems to sidestep the difficulty.
Of course, if opt-out organ procurement policies are justified, it is not necessary that one justify them in terms of consent (presumed or otherwise) as long as one is prepared to argue that sometimes, certain values defeat individuals' consent rights. The primary motivation for having the default be consent instead of non-consent when it comes to things like organ procurement from the deceased is the huge benefit to the organ recipient. It may well be that the general benefits are large enough, and the individual's stake in the issue is low enough, to warrant forgoing informed consent altogether. Nevertheless, given the powerful pro-consent ethos in medicine, it seems easier to justify practices in terms of consent than to justify exceptions to consent requirements. Even this justification can be presented as a matter of presumed consent, in the following sense: In order to fulfill an important social goal (for example, increasing the organ pool), it is permissible to perform the intervention—as permissible as it would have been had the patient explicitly consented; hence equivalence with patient consent and permission to presume consent.
When does consent count as sufficiently informed? We shall discuss potential obstacles in the form of (1) lies, deceit, and partial disclosure, as well as (2) the patient's failure to comprehend well-presented information. We shall then discuss (3) the content and (4) the cogency of the information requirement.
Lies about pertinent matters are assumed to violate the informed consent requirement. Bioethicists usually say the same about non-lying deceit, when it intentionally prompts a false impression, say, in order to keep a patient's spirits high by concealing a grim diagnosis (but see Jackson 1991, 7–9). Non-lying deceit can also be voluntary but unintentional. For example, a false impression can merely be the foreseen side effect of trying to impress a patient with obscure Latin words, instead of describing the diagnosis in simple terms (Jackson 1991, 6). A complex independent question is how much intentional emotional manipulation—for example, placing the good news both at the beginning and also at the end of a diagnostic report so as to lend it more salience—is compatible with informed consent.
So-called deceptive studies include sham surgeries that sometimes help assess the placebo effect of surgery by intentionally putting patients under the false impression that they underwent real surgery. They also include the many psychological studies that begin while the participant is waiting in the corridor for what she believes is an altogether different experiment. In many early studies of social psychology, the “stranger” in the study was in fact a trained member of the research team, called a confederate, secretly evaluating the actual participant. Many deceptive studies seem to be direct violations of the information component within informed consent requirements. Accordingly, some philosophers oppose any lie or deceit in research (Bok 1995), and there is some work that has been done on how to avoid deceit while minimizing the compromise to scientific progress (Miller, Wendler, and Swartzman 2005). But given bioethicists' harsh tenor on deceit itself, it is striking how rare opposition is to the widely prevalent deception of participants in psychological studies. The intentional use of the placebo effect in clinical care, often a deceitful means to help a patient feel better, is less widely accepted (Bok 1999, 61ff.; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 125).
Apart from avoiding (intentionally) deceitful words, the culture of informed consent endorses extensive positive obligations to disclose all relevant information. Clinical trials, in particular, are commonly anticipated by a formalized process in which participants receive explanations of the purpose, methods, risks, benefits, and alternatives to study participation, as well as the researcher's potential conflicts of interest, before they sign informed consent forms (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 129).
What is the point of this formalized process? One of Plato's characters mocks doctors who set aside time to keep sick patients informed: “Foolish fellow, … you are not healing the sick man, but you are educating him; and he does not want to be made a doctor, but to get well” (Plato Laws, IV.720a–c, p. 413). The Nuremberg Code can be understood to answer: the point of the disclosure process is that a research participant should at least “have sufficient knowledge and comprehension of the elements of the subject matter involved as to enable him to make an understanding and enlightened decision.” Now, clearly mere disclosure does not ensure “sufficient knowledge and comprehension”. In fact, even when the information is given in the participant's language and in simple non-technical terms, severely curtailed comprehension has often been shown to persist. A particularly high percentage of participants do not grasp the full meaning of statistical information about risks, or the fact that in placebo controlled trials, they might not receive the treatment under investigation, or the fact that trials aim to further scientific knowledge and not necessarily their own medical good. The result is that participants tend to overestimate the benefits of trial participation and downplay the risk-to-benefit ratios for themselves, part of a phenomenon called the “therapeutic misconception” (Miller 2010, 382ff.; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 129).
Several contemporary writers therefore emphasize that truly informed consent requires much more than mere disclosure (“thin informed consent”). The comprehension often gained through effective communication (“fuller informed consent”) is a worthier aim (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 127ff; Manson and O'Neill 2007, e.g., 184–5). Psychologists and health literacy experts currently seek effective ways to improve comprehension among candidate participants of research (Candilis and Lidz 2010). However, a normative question persists. When comprehension remains poor despite repeated efforts to disclose and elicit comprehension, what should investigators do? Is enlistment in a trial illegitimate, because no autonomous authorization took place (Faden and Beauchamp 1986; Candilis and Lidz 2010)? Or is it legitimate, because investigators did their parts by giving candidates the opportunity to make an autonomous authorization (Sreenivasan 2003), and thereby treated the candidates fairly (Miller and Wertheimer 2010)? One possible stance is that when a candidate is suspected to not comprehend a good explanation, treating them fairly can require additional interventions to ensure comprehension. A further question is whether, in the event that disclosing all serious risks to candidates makes for long forms that frighten them and therefore inhibit comprehension, investigators should prioritize adequate comprehension over adequate disclosure.
Disclosure is not only clearly insufficient for comprehension, but it can also be seen as unnecessary. Occasionally, a patient or a study participant is known to possess and understand the relevant information anyhow, say, because she is a physician specializing in the field. It then seems unnecessary to disclose that information to her. To some, this is evidence that the main point of disclosure requirements is to ensure autonomous decision-making: these requirements become pointless once autonomy is guaranteed (Beauchamp 2010, 57). However, it may equally be evidence that the point of these requirements is to protect health and to prevent abuse: the requirements are pointless when the patient is already informed and fully capable of protecting herself.
What information should be disclosed or comprehended? It is common to emphasize that patients cannot possibly be “fully informed” if that would include all facts, or all facts that are material to physicians' decisions. For example, research participants, who need to know the main risks of participation, do not need to know much about the history of the disease. But how are we to determine the facts about which patients and trial participants should be informed? Three legal standards exist: the professional standard, the reasonable person standard, and the individual standard. The professional standard mandates informing patients and participants of those details that it is conventional for professionals in the field to mention. Once predominant, this standard is gradually losing its traction with US courts. Often, no professional convention exists, and courts have opined that the so-called patient's right to decide means, among other things, that they should decide which information is pertinent to them. The reasonable person standard mandates disclosing whatever details a reasonable patient would find pertinent. Finally, the individual standard mandates informing the patient or participant of those details she, as a determinate individual, in keeping with her potentially unreasonable conception of the good, would find pertinent, if she were otherwise reasonable (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 122f.; Levine 1988, 104–5; Berg et al. 2001, 46–52). As with many other “standards” in medical ethics, the question arises as to whether these standards remain only good procedures for doctors, judges, and professional educators, or if they purport to capture fundamental moral principles. Courts' appeal to the patient's right to decide seems to suggest that the standards embody a fundamental principle. Indeed, if in a particular case, the standards are followed and yet the patient remains uninformed, most ethicists would agree that a moral deficit persists. Other considerations seem more procedural.
A recent argument against requiring the disclosure of any risk is that neither advance disclosure nor risk comprehension are necessary for the restoration of trust and for deterring abuse of patients and trial participants. What is necessary is only ready patient and trial participant access to the relevant information in the event that abuse is suspected (Manson and O'Neill 2007, 179ff.).
Whether being informed is cashed out in terms of disclosure or of comprehension, and whichever standard is used, asking that patients be even adequately informed may be asking too much. US federal regulations waive the information requirement in research for some studies that involve no more than a minimal risk. In clinical care, many patients would rather not think about risks and prognoses that would turn their stomachs and that they can do little about. Indeed, in some cultures, patients are averse to hearing about risks because they believe that the very mention of remote risks makes those risks more likely to materialize (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 106). Some such circumstances may waive information requirements (see sections 6, 7 below). However, note that if, as seems plausible, outright lies usually remain forbidden, even in such circumstances, a possible conclusion would be that informed consent encompasses several layers of requirement that differ in their stringency.
When is consent sufficiently voluntary? Let us discuss three potential barriers to voluntariness: (1) literal coercion, (2) “undue inducement”, and (3) “no choice” situations.
Voluntary consent is usually thought incompatible with coercion, which philosophers define, roughly, as a threat to make someone seriously worse off than she is or should be, unless she consents. However, the prevailing medical ethos tends to set the threshold for condoning conduct as too coercive far lower than this definition would suggest. A threat to cause even slight pain unless a patient acquiesces would be taken to invalidate her consent. It would do so even if the patient and the physician have common knowledge that it would not make her seriously worse off and so, that it would not amount to coercion. A threat to deny care that is not otherwise owed—which therefore rarely amounts to a threat to make the patient worse off than she is or should be—unless the patient consents to an intervention would also be frowned upon.
How much do “implicit threats” count as threats? Imagine a practitioner who asks her own patient to participate in a study that the practitioner runs, and the patient fears that care would suffer if he declines, without the practitioner actually saying so. When the fear is well-founded and intentionally instilled by the practitioner, the norm has been to consider consent invalid. This clearly makes sense if what makes coercion problematic is (unjust) curtailment of options. However, even when the fear is unfounded and unintended, the hierarchy and the power inequality of the physician-patient relationship are often still thought to make such consent involuntary. The thought is that someone's options are curtailed even when what curtails them is her own psychological state; or that what matters for ascriptions of coercion or involuntariness is actual probabilistic impact on decision-making, and not some other conditions. Still, in such situations, the relevant psychological states probably do not obtain across the board and any presumption about involuntariness should remain defeasible.
Another category often thought to undermine voluntariness is undue inducement, a term of art usually meaning that something is being offered that is alluring to the point that it clouds rational judgment, for instance cash in hand or airline tickets in return for kidney donation. Attention is fixated on the benefit, disallowing proper consideration of the risks from, say kidney loss or trial participation. The thought here is not that the offer is too good to decline rationally, but that, as in hypnosis, proper reasoning about it becomes impossible.
Basic questions about undue inducement remain under-explored. Is the size or benefit that constitutes undue inducement the same across individuals and income levels? Is it the same regardless of the risks taken in return for the benefit? What empirical questions would help address the preceding questions?
In some areas of practical ethics, the lack of decent alternatives to accepting a bad offer, a so-called no-choice situation (Wertheimer 1987, e.g., p. 13), is said to make us forced or compelled to choose the offer (Cohen 1979), or to undermine voluntariness otherwise. While in such cases, the alternatives that we are compelled to avoid remain in principle open to us—the offer is not physically imposed on us, it is just bad—the same could be said of most literal coercion. In “your money or your life” situations, the option of dying remains open in principle. Consider then a poor person who knows that his only way to gain access to an expensive life-saving drug is to participate in a risky or very unpleasant study where the drug is provided free of charge. He is not, strictly speaking, coerced (Hawkins 2008, 24–5), but some believe that his consent is involuntary and the trial is unethical. None of the options available to him are decent.
There is a problem with this claim. Its logic suggests that whenever a sick, rich person has no decent alternative to taking a badly unpleasant life-saving drug, there is no voluntary consent, and drug delivery is therefore illegitimate. Even when the nasty side effects remain far better for her than her only alternative—to die of the disease—she is not providing voluntary consent to take the drug, and it is unethical to give it to her. Since the latter reasoning is surely flawed, the former reasoning may be flawed as well.
Some have responded that the poor man's inability to give voluntary consent to trial participation stems from injustice, not natural disease, and that this makes a big difference. But surely medical aid that saves consenting victims from the horrible results of injustice and carries unpleasant side effects can remain fully permissible. For example, following the 2010 earthquake in Haiti, it was fully permissible for the US military and its physicians to perform consensual life-saving leg amputations. It was permissible whether earthquake injuries were purely natural, partly the result of non-US injustice (self-initiated neglect of safety rules by local contractors), or partly the result of US-perpetrated injustice (long-standing US meddling in Haitian politics at the expense of accountability, including, downstream, accountability for neglectful construction projects).
A more promising way out is to say that consent is insufficiently voluntary when the patient's options are unfairly curtailed by the offer itself (Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 92, 97). “Your money or your life” offers curtail our options, and that is why these offers compromise our voluntariness. By contrast, the above-mentioned offers to the poor trial candidate and to the rich patient do not curtail options and they maintain voluntariness. This response notwithstanding, imagine impoverished potential study participants who lack alternative ways to obtain life-saving drugs. Imagine further that the investigators offer them these drugs whether or not they consent to participate, free of charge. The intuition is that this free, unconditional offer increases the voluntariness of these potential participants' decisions on whether to participate, and it makes their invitation to participate in the trial easier to defend ethically. The free offer keeps their options open and thereby, we feel, renders their consent more genuinely voluntary. Note, however, that the options that the offer opens for them are not ones that the invitation to participate would otherwise have curtailed.
When, if ever, is a person authorized to waive her informed consent rights? Letting research subjects who donate blood in a medical trial authorize its use in certain types of future trial, without their specific consent for each token, seems acceptable. But what about a patient or a potential study participant who asks to be spared tedious descriptions of her different options, and would rather entrust the medical team, or her village elder, with all or some decisions? What about someone who asks her physician to lie to her, if he is willing, should her prognosis be despairing? And what about a woman who would like to sell pregnancy services with a fully enforceable contract to hand over the baby even if she develops strong maternal feelings toward him or her?
In democratic politics, we delegate many decisions to representatives. But we keep ourselves barred from signing away others, including the decision to waive our voting rights altogether. The question as to which decisions our institutions should allow patients to delegate to third parties is complex and under-explored. Bioethicists usually frown upon letting patients grant so-calledcarte blanche, or general consent, to whatever the physician considers appropriate for them (Dworkin 1988, e.g., 125–6). Instead, patients are usually encouraged or compelled to make decisions on a more ongoing basis—to give so-called specific consent (Kleinig 2010, 18)—although there are logical limits to how specific consent can be (Manson and O'Neill 2007, 12).
The requirement of informed consent is often attacked on the ground that many patients would rather have physicians make certain decisions for them, and that such delegation often seems acceptable (Schneider 1998). One answer to the attack argues that informed consent is a patient's right, not her duty (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 105, 107), and that, since informed consent serves autonomy, it ought to be autonomously waiveable (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 106). Indeed, autonomously signed advance directives that bind one's future self can be perfectly consensual and autonomous. What we may call “waiveable waivers” of informed consent rights (“Please spare me the full disclosure/decide in my name unless I ask to resume full disclosure/active control”) seem relatively easy to accept and fairly consistent with autonomy. However, we do impose some rights, which we consider inalienable, on unwilling rights holders. The right not to become a slave is inalienable, and the same may apply to some informed consent rights, such as the right not to become a participant of a clinical trial that one cannot exit.
An alternative answer to the attack is that some informed consent rights are waiveable (perhaps including many disclosure rights), and others are non-waiveable (perhaps including the right to refuse bodily intrusion). This answer leaves it open as to which informed consent rights are waiveable, inviting future theory to address this question. It also leaves open the possibility that non-waiveable consent requirements are consistent with patient autonomy because what such requirements impose (interestingly, out of paternalistic concern with protecting the patient's autonomy) is autonomous decision-making. A further interesting question is whether the alleged second-order right to waive informed consent rights is alienable.
Even absent waivers, and despite absolutist statements of the informed consent requirement, such as the Nuremberg Code, many contemporary theorists agree that there are cases where informed consent procedures are not necessary. The law, and many bioethicists, recognize exceptions to informed consent requirements, such as lack of decision-making capacity, or emergency circumstances where the patient's wishes are unknown (Tännsjö 1999; Emanuel, Wendler, and Grady 2000). That said, these exceptions serve the spirit of informed consent; they can be plausibly woven into full statements of the requirement (as proposed, for instance, in Dworkin 1988, 117), and they question only its crudest, most absolutist statements. Other exceptions seem harder to reconcile with full-blown commitment to informed consent and its central justifications. Let us discuss, specifically, the extent to which informed consent is needed in (1) benign care and benign experiments, (2) certain risky experiments, and (3) public health policy. We shall then present the general question, (4) When is informed consent needed?
The reality is that informed consent procedures are not mandated for the lion's share of medical care. Indeed, form filling, mandatory disclosures, and so forth seem unnecessary for a standard blood draw, in contrast to more major interventions like surgery (Manson and O'Neill 2007, 81f). In medical research, United States federal regulations authorize review boards to omit informed consent requirements on many occasions when “research involves no more than minimal risk to the subjects.” Again, this seems to make sense. A relatively safe and low-impact study comparing two widely used drugs to ascertain which is best seems morally permissible, even without a full-fledged informed consent process (Truog et al. 1999).
Some authors have used such examples to downplay the need for informed consent, criticizing what they call bioethicists' “fixation” with informed consent (O'Neill 2002, 47–8; Brownsword 2004, 224). In response, some proponents of informed consent insist that, in many of the alleged counter-examples, something in the way of informed consent remains vital. In blood draws, for example, when the patient is shown the needle and silently stretches her arm forward, she is said to give tacit or non-verbal consent (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 107; and see also Manson and O'Neill 2007, 11). The proponents' response may be insufficient. For example, when a busy nurse with many patients in line realizes that a patient is very ignorant about a blood draw, such that her tacit consent is uninformed, then intuitively the nurse does not owe the patient a long explanation of the risks from a sanitized needle prick, which are remote and minor. This may suggest that informed consent requirements simply do not obtain in that benign setting.
The thought that informed consent is not always necessary draws further support from what we said earlier about how informed consent requirements have been justified. For instance, the need to protect research participants' health and welfare through informed consent procedures is lesser when informed consent would add little to existing protections. This may reflect that existing protections are perfectly sufficient, or that informed consent cannot improve them further. For example, in observational studies of anonymized electronic health records, the main risk comes from breach of data security and confidentiality—a technical matter that few individual patients could assess reliably—and thus informed consent (on top of expert input and democratic decision making) might be an ineffective, unhelpful protection.
These conclusions should not be taken too far. Some elements of the requirement of informed consent must remain in place, even in standard blood draws and other benign interventions. Physical duress against a refusing patient and the intentional exploitation of a patient's ignorance about blood draws both usually remain wrong. This may suggest that informed consent bundles together several requirements with different levels of stringency. Some are necessary in more contexts than others.
The current practice of not requiring formal informed consent for some benign medical interventions and studies raises interesting questions about the ethical justification of informed consent. For example, some bioethicists hold that informed consent in research is necessary as a preventative bulwark against coercive or exploitative studies. But if this is correct, then the exception for benign studies might make no sense, since these studies may also be coercive or exploitative. Alternatively, if it is correct for such studies to not always require informed consent, this calls the abusive conduct-prevention rationale into question.
Advancing the field of emergency medicine requires medical experimentation, including trials that compare different interventions and that only sometimes serve the best interests of trial participants. But, in emergency circumstances, it is often impossible to obtain consent from the patient or her family in time. Many physicians believe that, because the field of emergency medicine simply cannot progress absent experimentation, there should be an exception to informed consent requirements even for such risky trials, and substitutes for informed consent should be sought (Fost 1998; Largent et al. 2010).
It is interesting that for public health interventions, whose impact on our bodies can exceed that of standard medical interventions, usually little, if any, informed consent is mandated. Promoting populations' health seems legitimate to most of us even when the authority executing the interventions discloses very little about these interventions, their risks, their alternatives, and any real opportunities to avert them. Even in the absence of public health emergencies (which, for some, warrant transgressions like forcing individuals to enter quarantine), the widely accepted standard in public heath seems more intrusive than the one in clinical care. For example, many would agree that it is legitimate to implement smoke-free bar laws that somewhat increase anti-smoking stigma, partly in order to encourage smokers to quit (and not only as measures to protect third parties from second-hand smoke). We would never consider using stigma to drive an individual patient to undergo a beneficial operation; that would be considered to make consent insufficiently voluntary. Is one of these different approaches to informed consent right and the other one, wrong? Or is informed consent morally required for some interventions and not for others?
An emerging picture is that the need for informed consent depends on many variables. Just like being informed, the voluntariness of choices comes in degrees (Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 101). Threats, for example, control us to different degrees, depending on the degree of harm being threatened (Beauchamp 2010, 70–1). The level of voluntariness necessary for valid consent to medical intervention may vary according to the type of intervention offered. So does the level of decision-making capacity necessary for valid consent (Buchanan and Brock 1989, ch. 1; Beauchamp 2010, 71). Robust informed consent that requires a great deal of information, voluntariness, and decisional capacity and is formalized and relatively non-waiveable, is necessary sometimes, but not always. The more risky the intervention, the more it is a high-impact or a definitive “critical life choice” (Archard 2008), the more it is value-laden and controversial, the more private the area of the body that the intervention directly affects, the more conflicted and unsupervised the practitioner, the higher the need for robust informed consent (Joffe and Truog 2010, 358; Miller 2010, 391; Beauchamp and Childress 2008, 101; Beauchamp 2010, 70–1). On other occasions, the need for very robust informed consent, and indeed, for consent of any form, is lesser (Miller 2010, 393). On those occasions, high costs may easily override that need.
Does the need for informed consent depend, among other variables, on whether the consent is for research or for care? Currently, consent procedures for research tend to be more demanding and more regulated than consent procedures for equally intrusive care (Levine 1988, 127–30; Miller 2010, 381). Bioethicists increasingly want to explain why this is the case. A standard account is that the proper goal of research is to gather generalizable knowledge, and not to help the individual, and that this different goal enhances the need for protections like informed consent (Fried 1974). However, actual goals often differ from proper goals. In reality, many researchers are highly committed to promoting participants' health, and many clinicians seek primarily financial gain, sometimes at patients' expense. In addition, some studies are so safe, when reviewed independently, that (with or without consent) they impose virtually no risk. Another rationale for the fewer consent requirements in care is that the relationship between the clinician and the patient is typically a fiduciary one whereas the relationship between the investigator and the study participant is scarcely fiduciary (Joffe and Truog 2010, 364). But this rationale could easily work the other way around: assuming that the fiduciary relationship is a ground for informed consent (Joffe and Truog 2010, 352ff.), the more fiduciary clinical relationship should demand more, not less, by way of informed consent.
Let us return to the general picture of scalar need for informed consent, which depends on many variables and generates different requirements on different occasions. It also raises interesting practical questions. First, who should decide when fully informed consent is necessary (Joffe and Truog 2010, 361)? Might a crude, one-size-fits-all requirement of informed consent serve most practical purposes? Perhaps a fair compromise is to use an “intervention ladder” that defines broad categories of intervention as more or less intrusive, then specifies broad categories of circumstance that require especially robust consent in some cases and only minimal consent in others (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2007, 41–3)? What seems, in any event, to emerge is that the need for informed consent would be misrepresented as fundamentally a single constraint or threshold. In this area, at least, commonsense morality acknowledges continua and many relevant variables.
When informed consent is required, what kind of requirement does it represent? In particular, does it correlate to a natural right, to a legal right, or to something in the middle?
Bioethicists and human rights lawyers tend to assume that informed consent is a natural right that generates a correlative moral requirement and, downstream, legal and institutional ramifications. But some of the aforementioned justifications for informed consent better support other assumptions. For example, one interpretation of the forward-looking trust rationale (see above) is that, morally, we should enshrine and maintain informed consent as a legal duty and cultural norm so as to maintain trust in medical practitioners. On that view, violating informed consent requirements toward someone does not necessarily violate her natural moral rights, only what are and morally should remain her legally protected interests. In a third model, the justified legal standing of informed consent bolsters the independent moral requirement of informed consent (Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 82–3).
One reason to take non-naturalistic approaches to the status of informed consent seriously is that not all natural rights are legally enforceable. Therefore, a moral informed consent right that is legally enforceable (as that right is usually taken to be) may stand in need of additional moral justification, even if a natural right has been established. That additional, inescapable moral justification may then turn out to justify informed consent regulations even absent natural informed consent rights, say as trust-building measures. In particular, recall that many bioethicists ground informed consent in duties to treat rational, autonomous persons respectfully. Some such duties are clearly non-enforceable. For example, the moral duty not to lie to persons in breach of their autonomous decision-making is seldom legitimately enforceable. It is not the business of third parties to prevent me from disrespectfully and immorally lying to my friends. Thus, additional justification would be needed, beyond simple appeal to respect for autonomy, in order to establish an enforceable informed consent requirement. That inescapable additional moral justification may turn out, if successful, to justify informed consent regulations and the surrounding ethos in full. It may do so even if the project of grounding informed consent in autonomy, and all other attempts to justify natural informed consent rights, founder.
For decades, bioethicists have discussed medical informed consent in relative isolation from consent in political philosophy, contract theory, and sexual ethics, where notions of consent are pivotal as well. This is finally changing (Miller and Wertheimer 2010), and it raises new technical and philosophical questions about how to put these different discourses in dialogue with each other. For instance, is what bioethicists call “presumed consent” the same thing as what political philosophers call “hypothetical consent”? Is what bioethicists call “proxy consent” one with what lawyers call “impersonal consent”? What bioethicists dub “invalid consent” would often be described by contract law experts as “lack of consent” (Beauchamp 2010, 56; Kleinig 2010, 13, 15).
This new development also raises substantive normative questions. For example, imagine that the same basic principle underlies legitimate political regimes and legitimate medical experimentation. It may follow that either tacit consent to a political regime, which Lockean contract theorists often cite, cannot successfully legitimize political regimes; or that tacit consent successfully legitimizes medical experimentation, rendering long consent forms unnecessary. Likewise, imagine that the same basic principle underlies the legitimate procurement of income and that of organs for transplantation. Then perhaps either income tax—without tax-payers' consent—is illegitimate (Nozick 1986), or a “kidney tax” could be perfectly legitimate (Fabre 2008, chs. 4–5). Either way, existing practice in one of these domains would be misguided.
On a different approach, the culture surrounding consent in these different domains varies so profoundly as to suggest that wholly different rationales and norms govern the different domains. For example, in most commercial transactions, there are no legal requirements to disclose all relevant information and to verify that it is understood (Miller and Wertheimer 2010, 80; Joffe and Truog 2010, 351), potentially suggesting that fairness matters there more than autonomous decision-making. Likewise, whereas once we consent to sell a car or to support a political candidate (by signing a contract or casting a vote) our consent is not retractable, invasive medical intervention is usually considered illegitimate once a previously consenting patient or research participant expresses a change of mind—as though the point of consent in the medical arena were not simply autonomous authorization but ongoing control (compare Pateman 1990, 79 on the wrongness of forcing sexual interaction even within otherwise consensual marital relations). The whole point of consent, and hence its proper content and scope, may turn out to vary between domains.
While the turn of the 21st century sees new doubts surfacing about informed consent, the resilience of other parts of the requirement is striking. Even purported critics usually revise only the requirement's prevalent interpretations and justifications, and leave a certain “core” intact. Given how much philosophers usually disagree, it is remarkable that, when a medical intervention is risky, controversial, value-laden, high-impact and/or physically invasive, especially when a patient of sound mind explicitly refuses the intervention, most of us would feel that only the most dire costs would justify imposition of care. The fact that relative skeptics' support for informed consent is grudging may only attest to the force of this resilient core part of the requirement.
In seeking justification for the requirement of informed consent, we may therefore not have one task, but many. We need to justify this powerful, relatively non-controversial core, as well as a weaker and more questionable rim. It is possible that the core stems directly from natural right, whereas the rim is merely instrumental or conventional. It is also possible that they both rely on the same ground, say, the value of autonomy, but touch on it in different measures. For example, it is possible that our autonomy tends to be violated far more in research on our bodies without our consent (a transgression of the core) than in similar research on our body tissue without our consent (perhaps a mere transgression of the rim). Even if the core of the requirement of informed consent commands high priority, other parts may turn out to be easily overridable by competing values, including the advancement of scientific research.
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advance directives | autonomy: in moral and political philosophy | autonomy: personal | contractarianism | decision-making capacity | ethics, biomedical: clinical research | euthanasia: voluntary | liberty: positive and negative | paternalism | privacy | property and ownership | respect | social contract: contemporary approaches to | trust | well-being
For excellent comments, thanks are due to Jennifer Hawkins, as well as Dan Brock, Steve Joffe, Neil Manson, Emma Ryman, Robert Truog, David Wendler, Daniel Viehoff, Alan Wertheimer, Dan Wikler, and my students.