Logical Constructions

First published Wed Nov 20, 1996; substantive revision Wed Sep 10, 2014

The term “logical construction” was used by Bertrand Russell to describe a series of similar philosophical theories beginning with the 1901 “Frege-Russell” definition of numbers as classes and continuing through his “construction” of the notions of space, time and matter after 1914. Philosophers since the 1920s have argued about the significance of “logical construction” as a method in analytic philosophy and proposed various ways of interpreting Russell's notion. Some were inspired to develop their own projects by examples of constructions. Russell's notion of logical construction influenced both Carnap's project of constructing the physical world from experience and Quine's notion of explication, and was a model for the use of set theoretic reconstructions in formal philosophy later in the twentieth century.

It was only when looking back on his work, in the programmatic 1924 essay “Logical Atomism”, that Russell first described various logical definitions and philosophical analyses as “logical constructions”. He listed as examples the Frege-Russell definition of numbers as classes, the theory of definite descriptions, the construction of matter from sense data and then series, ordinal numbers and real numbers. Because of the particular nature of Russell's use of “contextual” definitions of expressions for classes, and the distinctive character of the theory of definite descriptions, he regularly called the expressions for such entities “incomplete symbols” and the entities themselves “logical fictions”.

Logical constructions differ in whether they involve explicit definitions or contextual definitions, and in the extent to which their result should be described as showing that the constructed object is a mere “fiction”. Russell's 1901 definition of numbers as classes of equinumerous classes is straightforwardly a case of constructing one sort of entity as a class of others with an explicit definition. This was followed by the theory of definite descriptions in 1905 and the “no-classes” theory for defining classes in Principia Mathematica in 1910, both of which involved the distinctive technique of contextual definition. In a contextual definition apparent singular terms (either definite descriptions or class terms) are eliminated through rules for defining the entire sentences in which they occur. Constructions which are like those using contextual definitions are generally called “incomplete symbols”, while those like the theory of classes are called “fictions.” Russell included the construction of matter, space and time as classes of sense data at the end of his 1924 list. The main problem for interpreting the notion of logical construction is to understand what these various examples have in common, and how the construction of matter is comparable to either of the early constructions of numbers as classes or the theory of definite descriptions and “no-classes” theory of classes. None of the expressions “fiction”, “incomplete symbol” or even “constructed from” seems appropriate for an analysis of the fundamental features of the familiar physical world and the material objects that occupy it.

1. Honest Toil

The earliest construction on Russell's 1924 list is the famous “Frege/Russell definition” of numbers as classes of equinumerous classes from 1901 (Russell 1993, 320). The definition follows the example of the definitions of the notions of limit and continuity that were proposed for the calculus in the preceding century. Russell did not rest content with adopting the the Peano axioms as the basis for the theory of the natural numbers and then showing how the properties of the numbers could be logically deduced from those axioms. Instead, he defined the basic notions of “number” , “successor” and “0” and proposed to show, with carefully chosen definitions of their basic notions in terms of logical notions, that those axioms could be derived from principles of logic alone.

Russell defined natural numbers as classes of equinumerous classes. Any pair , a class with two members, can be put into a one to one correspondence with any other, hence all pairs are equinumerous. The number two is then identified with the class of all pairs. The relation between equinumerous classes when there is such a one to one mapping relating them is called “similarity”. Similarity is defined solely in terms of logical notions of quantifiers and identity. With the natural numbers so defined, Peano axioms can be derived by logical means alone. After natural numbers, Russell adds “series, ordinal numbers and real numbers” (1924, 166) to his list of constructions, and then concludes with the construction of matter.

Russell credits A. N. Whitehead with the solution to the problem of the relation of sense data to physics that he adopted in 1914:

I have been made aware of the importance of this problem by my friend and collaborator Dr Whitehead, to whom are due almost all the differences between the views advocated here and those suggested in The Problems of Philosophy. I owe to him the definition of points, and the suggestion for the treatment of instants and “things,” and the whole conception of the world of physics as a construction rather than an inference. (Russell 1914b, vi)

It is only later, in an essay in which Russell reflected on his philosophy that he also described his earlier logical proposals as “logical constructions.” The first specific formulation of this method of replacing inference with construction as a general method in philosophy is in the essay “Logical Atomism”:

One very important heuristic maxim which Dr. Whitehead and I found, by experience, to be applicable in mathematical logic, and have since applied to various other fields, is a form of Occam's Razor. When some set of supposed entities has neat logical properties, it turns out, in a great many instances, that the supposed entities can be replaced by purely logical structures composed of entities which have not such neat properties. In that case, in interpreting a body of propositions hitherto believed to be about the supposed entities, we can substitute the logical structures without altering any of the detail of the body of propositions in question. This is an economy, because entities with neat logical properties are always inferred, and if the propositions in which they occur can be interpreted without making this inference, the ground for the inference fails, and our body of propositions is secured against the need of a doubtful step. The principle may be stated in the form: ‘Whenever possible, substitute constructions out of known entities for inferences to unknown entities’. (Russell 1924, 160)

Russell was referring to logical constructions in this frequently quoted passage from his Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy. He objects to introducing entities with implicit definitions, that is, as being those things that obey certain axioms or “postulates”:

The method of ‘postulating’ what we want has many advantages; they are the same as the advantages of theft over honest toil. Let us leave them to others and proceed with our honest toil. (Russell 1919, 71)

He charges that we need a demonstration that there are any objects which satisfy those axioms.The “toil” here is the work of formulating definitions of the numbers so that they can be shown to satisfy the axioms using logical inference alone.

The description of logical constructions as “incomplete symbols” derives from the use of contextual definitions that provide an analysis or substitute for each sentence in which a defined symbol may occur. The definition does not give an explicit definition, such as an equation with the defined expression on one side that is identified with a definiendum on the other, or a universal statement giving necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of the term in isolation. The connection between being a fiction and expressed by an “incomplete symbol” can be seen in Russell's constructions of finite cardinal and ordinal numbers by means of the theory of classes. That “no-classes” theory, via the contextual definitions for class terms, makes all the numbers “incomplete symbols”, and so numbers can be seen as “logical fictions”.

The notions of construction and logical fiction appear together in this account from Russell's “Philosophy of Logical Atomism” lectures:

You find that a certain thing which has been set up as a metaphysical entity can either be assumed dogmatically to be real, and then you will have no possible argument either for its reality or against its reality; or, instead of doing that, you can construct a logical fiction having the same formal properties, or rather having formally analogous formal properties to those of the supposed metaphysical entity and itself composed of empirically given things, and the logical fiction can be substituted for your supposed metaphysical entity and will fulfill all the scientific purposes that anyone can desire. (Russell 1918, 144)

Incomplete symbols, descriptions, classes and logical fictions are identified with each other and then with the “familiar objects of daily life” in the following passage from earlier in the lectures:

There are a great many other sorts of incomplete symbols besides descriptions. There are classes… and relations taken in extension, and so on. Such aggregations of symbols are really the same as what I call “logical fictions”, and they embrace practically all the familiar objects of daily life: tables, chairs, Piccadilly, Socrates, and so on. Most of them are either classes, or series, or series of classes. In any case they are all incomplete symbols, i.e. they are aggregations that only have a meaning in use and do not have any meaning in themselves. (Russell 1918, 122)

In what follows these various features of logical constructions will be disentangled. The result appears to be a connected series of analyses sharing at least a family resemblance with each other. The common feature is that in each case some formal or “neat” properties of objects that had to be postulated in axioms before could now be derived as logical consequences of definitions. The replaced entities are variously “fictions”, “incomplete symbols” or simply “constructions” depending on the form that the definitions take.

2. Logical Analysis and Logical Construction

It would be a mistake to see Russell's logical constructions as the product of the second stage of a method that begins with logical analysis. Analysis was indeed the distinctive method of Russell's realist and atomistic philosophy with the method of construction appearing only later. Russell's new philosophy was self-consciously in opposition to the Hegelianism prevailing in philosophy at Cambridge at the end of the nineteenth century (Russell 1956, 11–13). Russell first needed to defend the process of analysis, and to argue against the view of the idealists that complex entities are in fact “organic unities” and that any analysis of these unities loses something, as the slogan was “analysis is falsification”. (1903, §439) The subject of our analysis is reality, rather than merely our own ideas:

All complexity is conceptual in the sense that it is due to a whole capable of logical analysis, but is real in the sense that it has no dependence on the mind, but only upon the nature of the object. Where the mind can distinguish elements, there must be different elements to distinguish; though, alas! there are often different elements which the mind does not distinguish. (1903, §439)

As ultimate constituents of reality are what is discovered by logical analysis, logical construction cannot be the converse operation, for undoing the analysis by putting things back together only returns us to the complex entities with which we began. What then is the point of constructing what has already been analyzed?

Russell's methodology is best understood by analogy with the logical approach to scientific theories. On this model the result of “analysis” will be the definitions and primitive propositions or axioms from which the laws of a formalized scientfic theory can be derived by logical inference. The reduction of one theory to another consists of rewriting the axioms of the target theory using the language of the reducing theory, and then proving them as theorems of that reducing theory. Construction, then, is best seen as the process of choosing definitions so that previously primitive statements can be derived as theorems. (See Hager 1994 and Russell 1924.)

Although this picture fits well with this linguistically oriented notion of “theory construction”, it does follow the notion of construction in the tradition of mathematics. Euclid prefaces each demonstration with a “construction” of a figure that features in the following proof. Gottlob Frege begins every proof in his Basic Laws of Arithmetic (1893) with an “Analysis”, which informally explains the notions used in the theorems and the strategy of the derivation, followed by the actual, gapless proof, which is called the “Construction”. Historically, then, there is no notion of a construction as a synthetic stage following an analytic stage as two processes of a comparable nature, but leading in opposite directions.

Even when described in terms of stages of theory construction, analysis and logical construction are not simply converse operations. Russell stresses that the objects discovered and distinguished in analysis are “real” as are their differences. Thus there is a constraint on the “choice” of definitions and primitive propositions with which to begin. The relationships between a deductive system and a realistic ontology differ among the various cases that Russell lists as examples of logical constructions. Propositions and “complexes” such as facts are analyzed in order to find the real objects and relations of which they are composed. A logical construction, on the other hand, results in a theory from which truths follow by logical inferences. The truths that are part of a deductive system resulting from logical construction are only “reconstructions” of some of the “pre-theoretic” truths that are to be analyzed. It is only their deductive relations, in particular their deducibility from the axioms of the theory, that are relevant to the success of a construction. Logical constructions do not capture all of the features of the pre-theoretic entities with which one begins.

Much of the attention to logical construction has focused on whether it is in fact a unified methodology for philosophy that will introduce a “scientific method in philosophy” as Russell says in the subtitle of (Russell 1914b). Commentators from Fritz (1952) through Sainsbury (1979) have denied that Russell's various constructions fit into a unified methodology, as well as questioning the applicability of the language of “fiction” and “incomplete symbol” to all examples. Below it will be shown how, nevertheless, constructions do fall into several natural families that are described by various of these terms with a considerable degree of accuracy.

3. Natural Numbers

Russell's definition of natural numbers as classes of similar, or equinumerous, classes, first published in (Russell 1901), was his first logical construction, and was the model for those that followed. Similar classes are those that can be mapped one to one onto each other by some relation. The notion of a “one-to-one relation” is defined with logical notions: R is one-one when for every $x$ there is a unique $y$ such that $x \rR y$, and for every such $y$ in the range of $\rR$ there is a unique such $x$. These notions of existence and uniqueness come from logic, and so the notion of number is thus defined solely in terms of classes and of logical notions. Russell announced the goal of his logicist program in The Principles of Mathematics: “the proof that all pure mathematics deals exclusively with concepts definable in terms of a very small number of fundamental logical concepts, and that all its propositions are deducible from a very small number of fundamental logical principles…” (Russell 1903, xv). If class is also shown to be a logical notion, then this definition would complete the logicist program for the mathematics of natural numbers.

Giuseppe Peano (Peano 1889, 94) had stated axioms for elementary arithmetic, which were later formulated by Russell (1919, 8) as:

  1. 0 is a number.
  2. The successor of any number is a number.
  3. No two numbers have the same successor.
  4. 0 is not the successor of any number.
  5. If a property belongs to 0 and belongs to the successor of $x$ whenever it belongs to $x$, then it belongs to every number.

For Peano these were the axioms of number, which, along with axioms of classes and propositions, describing the properties of these entities and lead to the derivation of theorems that express the other important properties of those entities.

Richard Dedekind (Dedekind 1887) had also listed the properties of numbers with similar looking axioms, using the notion of chain, an infinite sequence of sets, each a subset of the next, that is well ordered and has the structure of the natural numbers. Dedekind then proves that the principle of induction (Axiom 5 above) holds for chains. (See entry on Dedekind). Although Russell finds it “most remarkable that Dedekind's previous assumptions suffice to demonstrate this theorem” (Russell 1903, §236), he compares the two approaches, of Peano and Dedekind, with respect to simplicity and their differing ways of treating mathematical induction, and concludes that:

But from a purely logical point of view, the two methods seem equally sound; and it is to be remembered that, with the logical theory of cardinals, both Peano's and Dedekind's axioms become demonstrable. (Russell 1903, §241)

It was Peano and Dedekind that Russell had in mind when he later speaks of “the method of ‘postulating’” when he compares the “advantages” of their method over construction as those of theft over honest toil.

To complete his project Russell needed to find definitions and some “very small number of fundamental logical principles” (Russell 1903, xv) and then produce the required derivations. Finding an adequate definition of classes with the “no-classes theory” and the principles of logic needed to derive the properties of numbers and classes was only completed with Principia Mathematica (Whitehead and Russell 1910–13). This construction of numbers was a clear example of defining entities as classes of others so as to be able to prove certain properties as theorems of logic rather than having to rest with the theft of hypotheses. With the device of contextual definition from the theory of descriptions Russell then eliminated classes too, taking as fundamental the logical notion of a propositional function and so showing that the principles of classes where a part of logic.

4. Definite Descriptions

Definite descriptions are the logical constructions that Russell has in mind when when he describes them as “incomplete symbols”. The notion of a “logical fiction”, on the other hand, applies most straightforwardly to classes. Other constructions, such as the notions of the domain and range of a relation, and of one to one mappings that are crucial to the development of arithmetic, are only “incomplete” in an indirect sense due to their being defined as classes of a certain sort, which are in turn constructions.

Russell's theory of descriptions was introduced in his paper “On Denoting” (Russell 1905) published in the journal Mind. Russell's theory provides an analysis of sentences of the form ‘The $F$ is $G$’ where ‘The $F$’ is called a definite description in contrast with ‘An F’ which is an indefinite description. The analysis proposes that ‘The $F$ is $G$’ is equivalent to ‘There is one and only one $F$ and it is $G$’. Given this analysis, the logical properties of descriptions can be deduced using just the logic of quantifiers and identity. Among the theorems in *14 of Principia Mathematica are those showing that, (1) if there is just one $F$ then ‘The $F$ is $F$’ is true, and if there is not, then ‘The $F$ is $G$’ is always false and then, (2) if the $F = \text{the } G$, and the $F$ is $H$, then the $G$ is $H$. These theorems show that proper (uniquely referring) descriptions behave like proper names, the “singular terms” of logic. Some of these results have been controversial —Strawson (1950) claimed that an utterance of ‘The present King of France is bald’ should be truth valueless since there is no present king of France, rather than “plainly” false, as Russell's theory predicts. Russell's reply to Strawson in (Russell 1959, 239–45) is helpful for understanding Russell's philosophical methodology of which logical construction is just a part. It is, however, by assessing the logical consequences of a construction that it is to be judged, and so Strawson challenged Russell in an appropriate way.

The theory of descriptions introduces Russell's notion of incomplete symbol. This arises because no definitional equivalent of ‘The F’ appears in the formal analysis of sentences in which the description occurs. The sentence ‘The $F$ is $H$’ becomes:

\[ \exists x [ \forall y (Fy \leftrightarrow y=x) \ \&\ Hx ] \]

of which no subformula, or even a contiguous segment, can be identified as the analysis of ‘The F’. Similarly, talk about “the average family” as in “The average family has 2.2 children” becomes “The number of children in families divided by the number of families = 2.2”. There is no segment of that analysis that corresponds to “the average family”. Instead we are given a procedure for eliminating such expressions from contexts in which they occur, hence this is another example of an “incomplete symbol” and the definition of an average is an example of a “contextual definition.”

It is arguable that Russell's definition of definite descriptions was the most prominent early example of the philosophical distinction between surface grammatical form and logical form, and thus marks the beginnings of linguistic analysis as a method in philosophy. Linguistic analysis begins by looking past superficial linguistic form to see an underlying philosophical analysis. Frank Ramsey described the theory of descriptions as a “paradigm of philosophy” (Ramsey 1929, 1). While in itself surely not a model for all philosophy, it was at least a paradigm for the other examples of logical constructions that Russell listed when looking back on the development of his philosophy in 1924. The theory of descriptions has been criticized by some linguists and philosophers who see descriptions and other noun phrases as full-fledged linguistic constituents of sentences, and who see the sharp distinction between grammatical and logical form as a mistake. (See the entry on descriptions.)

Following Gilbert Ryle's (1931) influential criticisms of Meinong's theory of non-existent objects, the theory of descriptions has been taken as a model for avoiding ontological commitment to objects, and so logical constructions in general are often seen as being chiefly used to eliminate purported entities. In fact, that goal is at most peripheral to many constructions. The principal goal of these constructions is to allow the proof of propositions that would otherwise have to be assumed as axioms or hypotheses. Nor need the introduction of constructions always result in the elimination of problematic entities. Yet other constructions should be seen more as reductions of one class of entity to another, or replacements of one notion by a more precise, mathematical, substitute.

5. Classes

Russell's “No-Class” theory of classes from *20 of Principia Mathematica provides a contextual definition like that of the theory of definite descriptions. One of Russell's early diagnoses of the paradox of the class of all classes that are not members of themselves was that it showed that classes could not be individuals. Indeed Russell seems to have come across his paradox by applying Cantor's famous diagonal argument to show that there are more classes of individuals than individuals. Hence, he concluded, classes could not be individuals, and expressions for classes such as ‘$\{x: Fx \}$’ cannot be the singular terms they appear to be. Inspired by the theory of descriptions, Russell proposed that to say something $G$ of the class of $F$s, $G$ $\{x: Fx \}$, is to say that there is some (predicative) property $H$ coextensive with (true of the same things as) $F$ such that $H$ is $G$. The restriction to predicative properties, or those which are not defined in terms of quantification over other properties, was a consequence of the ramification of the theory of types to avoid intensional or “epistemic” paradoxes which motivated the theory of types in addition to the set theoretical “Russell's Paradox” (see Whitehead and Russell 1910–13, Introduction, Chapter II). These predicative properties are intensional, however, in the sense that two distinct properties might hold of the same objects. (See the entry on the notation in Principia Mathematica.) That classes so defined have the feature of extensionality is thus derivable, rather than postulated. If $F$ and $H$ are coextensive then anything true of $\{x:Fx \}$ will be true of $\{x:Hx \}$. Features of classes then follow from the features of the logic of properties.

Because classes would at first seem to be individuals of some sort, but on analysis are found not to be, Russell speaks of them as “logical fictions,” an expression which echoes Jeremy Bentham's notion of “legal fictions.” (Hart 1994, 84) (See entry on law and language). That a corporation is a “person” at law was for Bentham merely a fiction that could be cashed out in terms of the notion of legal standing and of limits to the financial liability of real persons. Thus any language about such “legal fictions” could be translated in other terms to be about real individuals and their legal relationships. Because statements attributing a property to particular classes are analyzed by existential sentences saying that there is some propositional function having that property, this construction also can be characterized as showing that class expressions, such as ‘$\{x:Fx \}$’, are incomplete symbols. They are not replaced by some longer formula expressing a term. On the other hand, the definition should not be seen as avoiding ontological commitment entirely, as showing that something is literally a “fiction”. Rather it shows how to reduce classes to propositional functions. The properties of classes are really properties of propositional functions and for every class said to have a property there really is some propositional function having that property.

6. Series, Ordinal Numbers and Real Numbers

Whitehead and Russell define a series in volume II of Principia Mathematica at *204.01 as the class Ser of all relations which is transitive, connected and irreflexive. A relation $R$ is transitive when, if $xRy$ and $yRz$ then $xRz$. It is connected when for any $x$ and $y$ for which it is defined, either $xRy$ or $yRx$. Finally, an irreflexive relation is one such that for all $x$, it is not the case that $xRx$. Any relation that has those properties forms a series of the things that it relates. Such relations are now called “linear orderings” or simply, “orderings”. Here the “logical construction” simply consists of an implicit definition of a certain property of relations. There is certainly no thought that series are merely invented “fictions”, and the symbol ‘Ser’ for them is “incomplete” only in that it can be explicitly defined as the intersection of other classes (a class of classes) and classes are themselves “incomplete”.

Russell's definitions of ordinal numbers and real numbers resemble the definitions of natural numbers. Ordinal numbers are a special case of relation numbers. Just as a cardinal number can be defined as a class of similar classes where the similarity is simply equinumerosity, the existence of a one to one mapping between the two classes, a relation number is a class of similar classes which are ordered by some relation. Ordinal numbers are the relation numbers of well-ordered classes. “Relation-Arithmetic” is the subject of Part IV of Volume II of Principia Mathematica, chapters *150 to *186. All of the properties of the arithmetic of ordinal numbers are derived from the more general arithmetic of relation numbers. Thus, for example, the addition of ordinal numbers is not commutative. The first infinite ordinal $\omega$ is the relation number of the well-ordered classes similar to $1, 2, 3, \ldots$ etc. The sum $1 + \omega$ will be the relation number of ordered classes which result from adding one element at the beginning of the ordering, say $0, 1, 2, 3, \ldots$ etc., which has the same ordinal number $\omega$. Thus $1 + \omega = \omega$. On the other hand, adding an element at the “end” of such a well ordered class will give an ordering that is not similar: $1, 2, 3, \ldots \text{etc.}, 0$. Consequently, $1 + \omega \ne \omega + 1$. On the other hand addition of ordinals, and indeed relation numbers in general, is associative, that is, $(\alpha + \beta) + \gamma = \alpha + (\beta + \gamma)$, which is proved with certain restrictions in *174. Ordinal numbers are thus defined exactly as natural numbers, as classes of similar classes, in such a way that all the desired theorems can be proved. Describing ordinal numbers as “fictions”, “incomplete symbols” and “constructions” applies in the same way as in the case of natural numbers.

The class of real numbers, Θ, is defined in Volume III of Principia Mathematica at *310.01 as consisting of “Dedekindian series” of rational numbers, which are in turn relation numbers of “ratios” of natural numbers. Whitehead and Russell follow the account of real numbers as Dedekind cuts of the rational numbers, and only differ from more standard developments of the numbers in contemporary set theory by treating rational numbers as relation numbers of a certain sort, rather than ordered pairs of and integers (the “numerator” and “denominator”). Like the construction of relation numbers as classes of similar classes, the “logical construction” of real numbers differs from the theory of definite descriptions and classes in general in not defining “incomplete symbols” or by showing that these numbers are really “fictions”. They are best characterized as definitions that allow for the proof of theorems about these numbers that would otherwise have to be postulated as axioms. They are the product of the “honest toil” that Russell prefers.

7. Mathematical Functions

Mathematical functions are not mentioned by Russell in the 1924 list of “logical constructions” although the analysis of mathematical functions is the principal application of the theory of definite descriptions in PM. The basic “functions” of PM are propositional functions. The Greek letters $\phi, \psi, \theta, \ldots$ are variables for propositional functions, and, with individual variables $x, y, z, \ldots$ go together to form open sentences $\phi(x), \psi(x,y)$, etc. This is the familiar syntax of modern predicate logic. Mathematical functions, such as the sine function and addition, are represented as term forming operators such as $\sin x$, or $x + y$. In contemporary logic they are symbolized by function letters that are followed by the appropriate number of arguments, $f(x),g(x,y)$, etc. In chapter *30 Whitehead and Russell propose a direct analysis of such expressions for mathematical functions in terms of definite descriptions, which they call “descriptive functions”. Consider the relation between a number and its sine, the relation which obtains between $x$ and $y$ when $y = \sin x$. Call this relation “$\text{Sine}(x,y)$” or more simply, “$\bS(x,y)$”, as a two-place relation. The mathematical function can then be expressed with a definite description, interpreting our expression “the sine of $x$” not as “$\sin(x)$”, but literally as “the Sine of $x$”, with a definite description, or “the $y$ such that $\text{Sine}(x,y)$”. Using the notation of the theory of definite descriptions, this is ‘$(\iota x)\bS(x,y)$’. The effect of this analysis is that Whitehead and Russell can replace all expressions for mathematical functions with definite descriptions based on relations. This definition involves relations in extension, which are represented with upper case Roman letters and with the relation symbol between the variables. The definition in PM is: *30.01. $R`y = (\iota x)xRy$, with the notation $R`y$ to be read as “the $R$ of $y$.” As with the theory of descriptions, the result of this definition is to facilitate the proofs of theorems which capture the logical properties of mathematical functions that will be needed in the further work of PM.

The logical analysis of function expressions in PM presents them as a special case of definite descriptions, “the $R$ of $x$”. In the Summary of *30 we find:

Descriptive functions, like descriptions in general, have no meaning in isolation, but only as constituents of propositions. (Whitehead and Russell 1910–13, 232)

Mathematical or descriptive functions are thus explicitly included among the incomplete symbols of Principia Mathematica.

8. Propositions and Propositional Functions

In Principia Mathematica Russell's multiple relation theory of judgment is introduced by presenting an ontological vision:

The universe consists of objects having various qualities and standing in various relations. (Whitehead and Russell 1910–13, 43)

Russell goes on to explain the multiple relation theory of judgment, which finds the place of propositions in this world of objects and qualities standing in relations. (See the entry on propositions.)

Russell's multiple relation theory, that he held from 1910 to around 1919, argued that the constituents of propositions, say ‘Desdemona loves Cassio’, are unified in a way that does not make it the case that they constitute a fact by themselves. Those constituents occur only in the context of beliefs, say, ‘Othello judges that Desdemona loves Cassio’. The real fact consists of a relation of Belief holding between the constituents Othello, Desdemona, and Cassio; $B(o,d,L,c)$. Because one might also have believed propositions of other structures, such as $B(o,F,a)$ there need to be many such relations $B$, of different “arities”, or number of arguments, hence the name “multiple relation” theory. Like the construction of numbers, this construction abstracts from what a number of occurrences of a belief have in common, namely, a relation between a believer and various objects in a certain order. The analysis also makes the proposition an incomplete symbol because there is no constituent in the analysis of ‘$x$ believes that $p$’ that corresponds to ‘$p$’. As a result Russell concludes that:

It will be seen that, according to the above account, a judgment does not have a single object, namely a proposition, but has several interrelated objects. That is to say, the relation which constitutes judgment is not a relation of two terms, namely the judging mind and the proposition, but is a relation of several terms, namely the mind and what we call the constituents of the proposition…

Owing to the plurality of the objects of a single judgment, it follows that what we call a “proposition” (in which it is to be distinguished from the phrase expressing it) is not a single entity at all. That is to say, the phrase which expresses a proposition is what we call an “incomplete” symbol; it does not have meaning in itself, but requires some supplementation in order to acquire a complete meaning. (Whitehead and Russell 1910–13, 43–44)

Although bound variables ranging over propositions hardly occur in Principia Mathematica (with a prominent exception in *14.3), it would seem that the whole theory of types is a theory of propositional functions. Yet following on the claim that propositions are “not single entities at all”, Russell says the same for propositional functions. In the Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy, Russell says that propositional functions are really “nothing”, but “nonetheless important for that” (Russell 1919, 96). This comment makes best sense if we think of propositional functions as somehow constructed by abstracting them from their values, which are propositions. The propositional function “$x$ is human” is abstracted from its values “Socrates is human”, “Plato is human”, etc. Viewing propositional functions as constructions from propositions, that are in turn constructions by the multiple relation theory, helps to make sense of certain features of the theory of types of propositional functions in Principia Mathematica. We can understand how propositional functions seem to depend on their values, namely propositions, and how propositions in turn can themselves be logical constructions. The relation of this dependence to the theory of types is explained in the Introduction to Principia Mathematica in terms of the notion of ”presupposing“:

It would seem, however, that the essential characteristic of a function is ambiguity… We may express this by saying that “$\phi x$” ambiguously denotes $\phi a, \phi b, \phi c,$ etc., where $\phi a, \phi b, \phi c,$ etc. are the various values of “$\phi x$.” … It will be seen that, according to the above account, the values of a function are presupposed by that function, not vice versa. It is sufficiently obvious, in any particular case, that a value of a function does not presuppose the function. Thus for example the proposition “Socrates is human” can be perfectly apprehended without regarding it as a value of the function “$x$ is human.” It is true that, conversely, a function can be apprehended without its being necessary to apprehend its values severally and individually. If this were not the case, no function could be apprehended at all, since the number of values (true and false) of a function is necessarily indefinite and there are necessarily possible arguments with which we are not acquainted. (Russell 1910–13, 39–40)

The notion of “incomplete symbol” seems less appropriate than “construction” in the case of propositional functions and propositions. To classify propositions and even propositional functions as instances of the same logical phenomenon as definite descriptions requires a considerable broadening of the notion.

The ontological status of propositions and propositional functions within Russell's logic, and in particular, in Principia Mathematica, is currently the subject of considerable debate. One interpretation, which we might call “realist,” is summarized in this footnote by Alonzo Church in his 1976 study of the ramified theory of types:

Thus we take propositions as values of the propositional variables, on the ground that this is what is clearly demanded by the background and purpose of Russell's logic, and in spite of what seems to be an explicit denial by Whitehead and Russell in PM, pp. 43–44.

In fact, Whitehead and Russell make the claim: “that what we call a ‘proposition’ (in the sense in which this is distinguished from the phrase expressing it) is not a single entity at all. That is to say, the phrase which expresses a proposition is what we call an ‘incomplete symbol’ …” They seem to be aware that this fragmenting of propositions requires a similar fragmenting of propositional functions. But the contextual definition or definitions that are implicitly promised by the “incomplete symbol” characterization are never fully supplied, and it is in particular how they would explain away the use of bound propositional and functional variables. If some things that are said by Russell in IV and V of his Introduction to the second edition may be taken as an indication of what is intended, it is probable that the contextual definitions would not stand scrutiny.

Many passages in [(Russell 1908)] and [(Whitehead and Russell 1910–13)] may be understood as saying or as having the consequence that the values of propositional functions are sentences. But a coherent semantics of Russell's formalized language can hardly be provided on this basis (notice in particular, that, since sentences are also substituted for propositional variables, it would be necessary to take sentences as names of sentences.) And since the passages in question seem to involve confusions of use and mention or kindred confusions that may be merely careless, it is not certain that they are to be regarded as precise statements of a semantics. (Church 1976, n.4)

Gregory Landini (1998) has proposed that there is indeed a coherent semantics for propositions and propositional functions in PM, which treats functions and propositions as linguistic entities. Landini proposes that this “nominalist semantics” is the intended interpretation of PM and is what remains of Russell's earlier “substitutional theory.” He argues that Russell was led to this nominalism after first rejecting the reality of classes,then of propositional functions, and finally the reality of propositions. This rejection, according to Landini, leaves us with only a nominalist metaphysics of individuals and expressions as the interpretation of Russell's logic. See also Cocchiarella (1980), who describes a “nominalist semantics” for ramified type theory, but rejects it as Russell's intended interpretation. Sainsbury (1979) describes a “substitutional” interpretation of the quantifiers over propositional functions, but combines this with a truth-conditional semantics that does not require the ramification of the theory of types that is central to Russell's interpretation in PM.

Propositions and propositional functions are unlike definite descriptions and classes in that there are no explicit definitions of them in PM. It is unclear what it means to say that a symbol for a proposition, such as a variable $p$ or $q$, has “no meaning in isolation”, and that, however, the meaning can be given “in context”, as it would seem that there no definition is possible, it would seem, in a logic in which propositions and propositional functions appear as primitive notions in the statement of the axioms and definitions of logic.

9. The Construction of Matter

Whether or not they are provided with contextual definitions by Whitehead and Russell, logical constructions do not appear as the referents of logically proper names, and so by that account constructions are not a part of the fundamental “furniture” of the world. Early critical discussions of constructions, such as Wisdom (1931), stressed the contrast between logically proper names, which do refer, and constructions, which were thus seen as ontologically innocent.

Beginning with The Problems of Philosophy in 1912, Russell turned repeatedly to the problem of matter. As has been described by Omar Nasim (2008), Russell was stepping into an ongoing discussion of the relation of sense data to matter that was being carried on by T.P. Nunn (1910), Samuel Alexander (1910), G.F. Stout (1914), and G.E. Moore (1914), among others. The participants of this “Edwardian controversy”, as Nasim terms it, shared a belief that direct objects of perception, with their sensory qualities, were nonetheless extra-mental. The concept of matter, then, was the result of a loosely described social or psychological “construction”, going beyond what was directly perceived. A project shared by the participants in the controversy was the search for a refutation of George Berkeley's idealism, which would show how the existence and real nature of matter can be discovered. In The Problems of Philosophy (Russell 1912) Russell argues that the belief in the existence of matter is a well supported hypothesis that explains our experiences. Matter is known only indirectly, “by description”, as the cause, whatever it may be, of our sense data, which we directly know by “by acquaintance”. This is and example the sort of hypothesis that Russell contrasts with construction in the famous passage about “theft” and “honest toil”. Russell saw an analogy between the case of simply hypothesizing the existence of numbers with certain properties, those described by axioms, and hypothesizing the existence of matter.

The need for some sort of account of the logical features of matter, what he called “the problem of matter”, had already occupied Russell much earlier. While we distinguish the certain knowledge we may have of mathematical entities from the contingent knowledge of material objects, Russell says that there are certain “neat” features of matter that are just too tidy to have turned out by accident. Examples include the most general spatiotemporal properties of objects, that no two can occupy the same place at the same time, which he calls “impenetrability”, and so on. In The Principles of Mathematics (Russell 1903, §453) there is a list of these features of matter including “indestructibility”, “ingenerability” and “impenetrability”, which were all characteristic of the atomic theory of the day. Russell followed the progression through the exact sciences from logic through arithmetic, and then real numbers and then to infinite cardinals. There followed a discussion of space and time, with the book ending with a last part (VII) on Matter and Motion, chapters §53 to §59. In them Russell discusses what he calls “rational Dynamics as a branch of pure mathematics” (Russell 1903, §437). This rational Dynamics, would involve justifying many of the fundamental principles of physics with pure mathematics alone, from definitions that yield the geometry of space and time and the formal properties of its occupants, quantities of matter and energy. In this respect the construction of matter most resembles the construction of numbers as classes as an effort to replace the “theft” of postulating axioms with the “honest toil” of devising definitions that will validate those postulates.

In the later project of constructing matter, from 1914 on, beginning with Our Knowledge of the External World (Russell 1914b), material objects come to be seen as collections of sense data, than of “sensibilia”. Sensibilia are potential objects of sensation, which, when perceived become “sense data” for the perceiver. Influenced by William James, Russell came to defend a neutral monism by which matter and minds were both to be constructed from sensibilia, but in different ways. Intuitively, the sense data occurring as they do “in” a mind, are material to construct that mind, the sense data derived from an object from different points of view to construct that object. Russell saw some support for this in the theory of relativity, and the fundamental importance of frames of reference in the new physics.

10. Successors to Logical Construction

In the 1930s Susan Stebbing and John Wisdom, founding what has come to be called the “Cambridge School of Analysis,” paid considerable attention to the notion of logical construction (see Beaney 2003). Stebbing (1933) was concerned with the unclarity over whether it was expressions or entities that are logical constructions, and with how to understand a claim such as “this table is a logical construction” and indeed what it could even mean to contrast logical constructions with inferred entities. Russell had been motivated by the logicist project of finding definitions and elementary premises from which mathematical statements could be proved. Stebbing and Wisdom were concerned, rather, with relating the notion of construction to philosophical analysis of ordinary language. Wisdom's (1931) series of papers in Mind interpreted logical constructions in terms of ideas from Wittgenstein's Tractatus (1921).

Demopoulos and Friedman (1985) find an anticipation of the recent “structural realist” view of scientific theories in (Russell 1927), The Analysis of Matter. They argue that the logical constructions of sense data in Russell's earlier thinking on the “problem of matter” were replaced by inferences to the structural properties of space and matter from patterns of sense data. We may sense patches of color next to each other in our visual field, but what that tells us about the causes of those sense data, about matter, is only revealed by the structure of those relationships. Thus the color of a patch in our visual field tells us nothing about the intrinsic properties of the table that causes that experience. Instead it is the structural properties of our experiences, such as their relative order in time, and which are between which others in the visual field, that gives us a clue as to the structural relationships of time and space within the material world that causes the experience. The contemporary version of this account, called “structural realism”, holds that it is only the structural properties and relations that a scientific theory attributes to the world about which we should be scientific realists. (See the entry on structural realism.)

According to this account, Russell's initial project of replacing inference with logical construction was to find for each pattern of sense data some logical construction that bears a pattern of isomorphic structural relations. That project was transformed, Demopoulos and Friedman argue, by replacing inference from the given in experience to the cause of that experience with an inference to the rather impoverished, structural, reality of the causes of those experiences. Russell's matter project was interpreted in this way by others, and led, in 1928, to G.H. Newman's apparently devastating objection. Newman (1928) pointed out that there is always a structure of arbitrarily “constructed” relations with any given structure if only the number of basic entities, in this case sense data, is large enough. According to Demopoulos and Friedman, Newman shows that there must be more to scientific theories than trivial statements to the effect that matter has some structural properties isomorphic to those of our sense data. The project of The Analysis of Matter does indeed face a serious difficulty with “Newman's problem”, whether or not those difficulties arise for the earlier project of logical construction (see Linsky 2013).

The notion of logical construction had a great impact on the future course of analytic philosophy. One line of influence was via the notion of a contextual definition, or paraphrase, intended to minimize ontological commitment and to be a model of philosophical analysis. The distinction between the surface appearance of definite descriptions, as singular terms, and the fully analyzed sentences from which they seem to disappear was seen as a model for making problematic notions disappear upon analysis. Wisdom (1931) proposed this application of logical construction in the spirit of Wittgenstein. In this way the theory of descriptions has been viewed as a paradigm of philosophical analysis of this “therapeutic” sort that seeks to dissolve logical problems.

A more technical strand in analytic philosophy was influenced by the construction of matter. Rudolf Carnap quotes (Russell 1914a, 11) as the motto for his “Aufbau”, the Logical Structure of the World (1967):

The supreme maxim in scientific philosophizing is this: Whenever possible, logical constructions are to be substituted for inferred entities. (Carnap 1967, 6)

In the Aufbau the construction of matter from “elementary experiences”, and later Nelson Goodman (1951) continued the project. Michael Friedman (1999) and Alan Richardson (1998) have argued that Carnap's project of construction owed much more to his background in neo-Kantian issues about the “constitution” of empirical objects than with Russell's project. See, however, Pincock (2002) for a response that argues for the importance of Russell's project of reconstructing scientific knowledge in (Carnap 1967). More generally, the use of set theoretic constructions became widespread among philosophers, and continues in the construction of set theoretic models, both in the sense of logic where they model formal theories and to provide descriptions of truth conditions for sentences about entities.

Willard van Orman Quine saw his notion of “explication” as a development of logical construction. Quine presents his methodology in Word and Object (1960) beginning with an allusion to Ramsey's remark in the title of section 53: “The Ordered Pair as Philosophical Paradigm”. The problem of apparently referring expressions that motivates Russell's theory of descriptions is presented as a general problem:

A pattern repeatedly illustrated in recent sections is that of the defective noun that proves undeserving of objects and is dismissed as an irreferential fragment of a few containing phrases. But some times the defective noun fares oppositely: its utility is found to turn on the admission of denoted objects as values of the variables of quantification. In such a case our job is to devise interpretations for it in the term positions where, in its defectiveness, it had not used to occur. (Quine 1960, 257)

The notion of a “defective noun” that is to be “dismissed as an irreferential fragment” clearly echoes the description of constructions as logical fictions and their expressions as mere incomplete symbols that so aptly describe the contextual definitions for definite descriptions and classes. The task of “devising interpretations” is more like the positive aspect suggested by the term “construction” and illustrated in the cases of the construction of numbers and matter. After concluding that the expression “ordered pair” was such a “defective noun”, Quine says that the notion of an ordered pair $\langle x,y \rangle$ of two entities $x$ and $y$ does have “utility” and is limited only in having to fulfill one “postulate”:

  • (1) If $\langle x,y \rangle = \langle z,w \rangle$ then $x = z$ and $y = w$.

In other words, that ordered pairs are distinguished by having unique first and second elements. Quine then continues:

The problem of suitably ekeing out the use of these defective nouns can be solved once for all by systematically fixing upon some suitable already-recognized object, for each $x$ and $y$, with which to identify $\langle x,y \rangle$. The problem is a neat one, for we have in (1) a single explicit standard by which to judge whether a version is suitable. (Quine 1960, 258)

Again Quine echoes Russell's language with his mention of a “neat” property that calls out for a “construction” from known entities. Quine distinguishes his project, which he calls “explication”, by the fact that there are alternative possible ways to fix the notion. Although Whitehead and Russell give an analysis in PM *55, where they are called “ordinal couples”, the first proposal to treat ordered pairs as classes of their members is from Norbert Wiener (1914) who identifies $\langle x,y \rangle$ with $\{\{ x \}, \{ y, \Lambda \}\}$, where $\Lambda$ is the empty class. From this definition it is easy to recover the first and second elements of the pair, and so Quine's (1) is an elementary theorem. Later, Kuratowski proposed the definition $\{\{ x \}, \{x,y\}\}$, from which (1) also follows. For Quine it is a matter of choice which definition to use, as the points on which they differ are “don't-cares”, issues which give a precise answer to questions about which our pre-theoretic account is mute. An explication thus differs considerably from an “analysis” of ordinary, or pre-theoretic language, both in giving a precise meaning to the expression where it might have been obscure, or perhaps simply silent and in possibly differing from pre-theoretic use, as suggested by the name. This fits well with the asymmetries we have noted between analysis and construction, with analysis aimed at the discovery of the constituents and structure of propositions which are given to us, and construction which is more a matter of choice, with the goal being the recovery of particular “neat” features of the construction in a formal theory. The ordered pair is thus a “philosophical paradigm” for Quine just as Russell's theory of descriptions was a paradigm of philosophy for Ramsey, and each is a “logical construction”.

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Acknowledgments

I am grateful to Allen Hazen for explaining the significance of Quine's chapter on ordered pairs.

Copyright © 2014 by
Bernard Linsky <bernard.linsky@ualberta.ca>

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