# Logical Constructions

*First published Wed Nov 20, 1996; substantive revision Mon Aug 31, 2009*

Bertrand Russell described several different definitions and philosophical analyses as treating certain entities and expressions as “logical constructions”. Examples he cited were the Frege/Russell definition of numbers as classes of equinumerous classes, the theory of definite descriptions, the construction of matter from sense data, and several others. Generally expressions for such entities are called “incomplete symbols” and the entities themselves “logical fictions”. The notion originates with Russell's logicist program of reducing mathematics to logic, was widely used by Russell, and led to the later Logical Positivist notion of construction and ultimately the widespread use of set theoretic models in philosophy.

## 1. Honest Toil

Russell's most specific formulation of logical construction as a method in philosophy comes from his essay “Logical Atomism”:

One very important heuristic maxim which Dr. Whitehead and I found, by experience, to be applicable in mathematical logic, and have since applied to various other fields, is a form of Occam's Razor. When some set of supposed entities has neat logical properties, it turns out, in a great many instances, that the supposed entities can be replaced by purely logical structures composed of entities which have not such neat properties. In that case, in interpreting a body of propositions hitherto believed to be about the supposed entities, we can substitute the logical structures without altering any of the detail of the body of propositions in question.This is an economy, because entities with neat logical properties are always inferred, and if the propositions in which they occur can be interpreted without making this inference, the ground for the inference fails, and our body of propositions is secured against the need of a doubtful step. The principle may be stated in the form: ‘Whenever possible, substitute constructions out of known entities for inferences to unknown entities’ (1924, p.160)

Russell was speaking of logical constructions in this memorable passage
from his *Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy*: “The method
of ‘postulating’ what we want has many advantages; they are
the same as the advantages of theft over honest toil. Let us leave them
to others and proceed with our honest toil.” (1919, p. 71)

The notion of logical construction appears frequently with the idea that what is defined is a “logical fiction”, and an “incomplete symbol”. The latter term derives from the use of contextual definitions, providing an analysis of each sentence in which a defined symbol may occur without, however, giving an explicit definition, an equation, or a universal statement giving necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of the term in isolation. The terms “fiction” and “incomplete symbol” apply with differing aptness to different constructions.

Russell's first use of construction, and the model for later constructions, is the Frege/Russell definition of numbers as classes. This follows the kind of definitions used in the arithmetization of analysis of the preceding century, in particular, Dedekind's earlier construction of real numbers as bounded classes of rational numbers. Russell's logicist program could not rest content with postulates for the fundamental objects of mathematics such as the Peano axioms for the natural numbers. Instead numbers were to be defined as classes of equinumerous classes. Russell also refers to this method as “abstraction”, now known as the abstraction of an equivalence class. The definition of equinumerosity, or of the existence of a one to one mapping between two classes, also called “similarity”, is solely in terms of logical notions of quantifiers and identity. With the numbers defined, for example, two as the class of all two membered sets, or pairs, the properties of numbers could be derived by logical means alone.

## 2. Definite Descriptions and Classes

The most influential of Russell's constructions was the *theory of
descriptions* from his paper “On Denoting” in
1905. Russell's theory provides an analysis of sentences of the form
‘The *F* is *G*’ where
‘The *F*’ is called a *definite
decription*. The analysis proposes that ‘The *F* is
*G*’ is equivalent to ‘There is one and only
one *F* and it is *G*’. With this analysis, the
logical properties of descriptions can now be deduced using just the
logic of quantifiers and identity. Among the theorems in *14
of *Principia Mathematica* are those showing that, (1) if there
is just one *F* then ‘The *F* is *F*’
is true, and if there is not, then ‘The *F*
is *G*’ is always false and, crucially for the logical
manipulation of descriptions, (2) if the *F* = the *G*,
and the *F* is *H*, then the *G*
is *H*. In other words, proper (uniquely referring)
descriptions behave like singular terms. Some of these results are
contentious—Strawson noted that ‘The present king of france is
bald’ should be truth valueless since there is no present king
of France, rather than “plainly false”, as Russell's
theory predicts.

The theory of descriptions introduces Russell's notion of
*incomplete symbol*. Definite descriptions ‘The F’
do not show up in the formal analysis of sentences in which they
occur, thus ‘The *F* is *H*’ becomes:

∃x[∀y(Fy↔y=x) &Hx]

of which no subformula, or continuous segment, can be identified as the analysis of ‘The F’. Similarly, talk about “the average family” as in “The average family has 2.2 children” becomes “The number of children in families divided by the number of families = 2.2”, there is no portion of that analysis that corresponds with “the average family”. Instead we have a formula for eliminating such expressions from contexts in which they occur, hence the notion of “incomplete symbol” and the related notion of “contextual definition”. It is standard to see in this the origins of the distinction between surface grammatical form and logical form, and thus the origin of linguistic analysis as a method in philosophy which operates by seeing past superficial linguistic form to underlying philosophical analysis. The theory of descriptions has been criticized by some linguists and philosophers who see descriptions and other noun phrases as full fledged linguistic constituents of sentences, and who see the sharp distinction between grammatical and logical form as a mistake.

The theory of descriptions is often described as a model for avoiding ontological commitment to objects such as Meinongian subsistent entities, and so logical constructions in general are often seen as being chiefly used to eliminate purported entities. In fact, that goal is at most peripheral to most constructions. The principal goal of some of these constructions is to allow the proof of propositions that would otherwise have to be assumed as axioms or hypotheses. Nor need the introduction of constructions always result in the elimination of problematic entities. Some other constructions should be seen more as reductions of one class of entity to another, or replacements of one notion by a more precise, mathematical, substitute.

Russell's “No-Class” theory of classes from *20 of
*Principia Mathematica* provides a contextual definition like
the theory of descriptions. One of Russell's early diagnoses of the
paradoxes was that they showed that classes could not be
objects. Indeed he seems to have come across his paradox of the class
of all classes that are not members of themselves by applying Cantor's
argument to show that there are more classes of objects than
objects. Hence, he concluded, classes could not be objects. Inspired
by the theory of descriptions, Russell proposed that to say something
*G* of the class of *F*s,
*G*{*x*: *Fx*}, is to say that there is some
(predicative) property *H* coextensive with (true of the same
things as) *F* such that *H* is
*G*. That classes have the feature of extensionality is thus
derivable, rather than postulated. If *F* and *H* are
coextensive then anything true of {*x*: *Fx*} will be
true of {*x*:
*Hx*}. Features of classes then follow from the features of the
logic of properties, the “ramified theory of types”.
Because classes would seem to be individuals of some sort, but on
analysis are found not to be, Russell speaks of them as “logical
fictions”, an expression which echoes Jeremy Bentham's notion of
a “legal fiction”. Because statements attributing a
property to particular classes are analyzed by existential sentences
saying that there is some propositional function having that property,
this construction should not be seen as avoiding ontological
commitment entirely, but rather of reducing classes to propositional
functions. The properties of classes are really properties of
propositional functions and for every class said to have a property
there really is some propositional function having that property.

## 3. Other Constructions

For other constructions such as propositions no contextual definition is provided. In any case, constructions do not appear as the referents of logically proper names, and so by that account are not part of the fundamental “furniture” of the world. (Early critical discussions of constructions, such as Wisdom's, stressed the contrast between logically proper names, which do refer, and constructions, which were thus seen as ontologically innocent.)

Beginning with *The Problems of Philosophy* in 1912, Russell
turned repeatedly to the problem of matter. As has been described by
Omar Nasim (2008), Russell was stepping into an ongoing discussion of
the relation of sense data to matter that was being carried on by
G.F. Stout, G.E.Moore, T.P. Nunn and Samuel Alexander among
others. The participants of this “Edwardian Controversy”,
as Nasim terms it, shared a belief that direct objects of perception,
with their sensory qualities, were nonetheless extra-mental. The
concept of matter, then, was the result of a loosely described social
or psychological “construction”, going beyond what was
directly perceived. A project shared by the participants in the
controversy was the search for a refution of Berkeleyan idealism,
which would show how the existence and real nature of matter can be
discovered. In *Problems* Russell argues that the existence of
matter is a well supported hypothesis that explains our
experiences. Matter is known only indirectly, “by
description”, as the cause, whatever it may be, of our sense
data, which we directly know by “by acquaintance”. This is
the notion of hypothesis which Russell contrasts with construction in
the famous passage about theft and honest toil which is quoted
above. Russell saw an analogy between the case of simply hypothesizing
the existence of numbers with certain properties, those described by
axioms, and hypothesizing the existence of matter. While we
distinguish the certain knowledge we may have of mathematical entities
from the contingent knowledge of material objects, Russell says that
there are certain “neat” features of matter which are just
too tidy to have turned out by accident. Examples include the most
general spatiotemporal properties of objects, that no two can occupy
the same place at the same time, and so on. With the project of
constructing matter, material objects are now to be seen as
collections of sense data. Influenced by William James, Russell
defended a “neutral monism” by which matter and minds were
both to be constructed from sense data, but in different
ways. Intuitively, the sense data occuring as they do “in”
a mind, are material to construct that mind, the sense data derived
from an object from different points of view to construct that
object. Russell saw some support for this in the theory of relativity,
and the fundamental importance of frames of reference in the new
physics.

These prominent examples are not the only use of the notion of
construction in Russell's thought. In *Principia Mathematica*
the *multiple relation* theory of propositions is introduced by
saying that propositions are “incomplete
symbols”. Russell's multiple relation theory, that he held from
1910 to 1919 or so, argued that the constitituents of propositions,
say ‘Desdemona loves Cassio’, which is false, are unified
in a way that does not make it the case that they constitute a fact by
themselves. Those constituents occur only in the context of beliefs,
say, ‘Othello judges that Desdemona loves Cassio’. The
real fact consists of a relation of Belief holding between the
constituents Othello, Desdemona and Cassio,
thus *B*(*o*, *d*, *L*,
*c*). Because one might also have believed propositions of
other structures, such
as *B*(*o*, *F*, *a*) there need to be
many such relations *B*, thus the “multiple”
relation theory. Like the construction of numbers, this construction
abstracts out what a number of occurrences of a belief have in common,
a believer and various objects in a certain order. The analysis also
makes the proposition an incomplete symbol because there is no
constituent in the analysis of ‘*x* believes that
*p*’ that corresponds to ‘p’.

Russell suggests that even propositional functions are logical
constructions when he says that they are really “nothing”, but
“nonetheless important for that” (1918, p. 96).
Propositional functions are abstracted from their values,
propositions. The propositional function ‘*x* is
human’ is abstracted from its values ‘Socrates is
human’, ‘Plato is human’, etc. Viewing
propositional functions as constructions from propositions which are
in turn constructions by the multiple relation theory helps to make
sense of the theory of types of propositional functions in
*Principia Mathematica*. The notion of “incomplete
symbol” seems less appropriate than “construction”
in the case of propositional functions and propositions. To classify
propositions and even propositional functions as instances of the same
logical phenomenon as definite descriptions requires a considerable
broadening of the notion.

## 4. The History of Logical Construction

In the 1930s Susan Stebbing, John Wisdom and some others, forming what has
come to be called the Cambridge School of Analysis, paid considerable
attention to the notion of logical construction. Stebbing was
concerned with the unclarity about whether it was expressions or
entities that are logical constructions, and with how to understand a
claim such as “this table is a logical construction” and
indeed what it could even mean to contrast logical constructions with
inferred entities. Russell seems to have been inspired by the logicist
project of finding definitions and elementary premises from which
mathematical statements could be proved. Stebbing and Wisdom were
concerned with relating the notion of construction to philosophical
analysis of ordinary language. Wisdom's series of papers in
*Mind* interpreted logical constructions in terms of ideas from
Wittgenstein's *Tractatus*.

Demopoulos & Friedman (1985) find an anticipation of the recent
“structural realist” view of scientific theories in
Russell's *The Analysis of Matter* (1927). They argue that the
logical constructions of sense data in Russell's earlier thinking on
the “problem of matter” were replaced by inferences to the
structural properties of space and matter from patterns of sense
data. We may sense patches of color next to each other in our visual
field, but what that tells us about the causes of those sense data,
about matter, is only revealed by the structure of those
relationships. Thus the color of a patch in our visual field tells us
nothing about the intrinsic properties of the table that causes that
experience. Instead it is the structural properties of our
experiences, their order in time, and which are between which in the
visual field, that gives us a clue as to the structural relationships
of time and space within the material world that causes the
experience. The contemporary version of this account, called
“structural realism”, holds that it is only the structural
properties and relations that a scientific theory attributes to the
world about which we should be scientific realists. Russell's initial
project of replacing inference with logical construction was to find
for each pattern of sense data some logical construction which bears
isomorphic structural relations. That project was transformed,
Demopoulos & Friedman argue, by now replacing inference from the
given in experience to the cause of that experience with an inference
to the rather impoverished, structural, reality of the causes of those
experiences. It seems that in fact Russell's matter project was taken
in this way, and led, in 1928, to G.H. Newman's apparently devastating
objection. Newman pointed out that there is always a structure of
arbitrarily “constructed” relations with any given
structure if only the number of basic entities, in this case sense
data, is large enough. According to Demopoulos & Friedman, Newman
shows that there must be more to scientific theories than trivial
statements to the effect that matter has some structural properties
isomorphic to those of our sense data. The project of *The Analysis
of Matter* faces a serious objection in “Newman's
Problem”, whether or not those difficulties arise for the
earlier project of “logical construction”.

The notion of logical construction had a great impact on the future course of analytic philosophy. One line of influence was via the notion of a contextual definition, or paraphrase, intended to minimize ontological commitment and to be a model of philosophical analysis. The distinction between the surface appearance of definite descriptions, as singular terms, and the fully analyzed sentences from which they seem to disappear was seen as a model for making problematic notions disappear upon analysis. The theory of descriptions has been viewed as a paradigm of philosophical analysis.

A more technical strand in analytic philosophy was influenced by the construction of matter. Rudolf Carnap attempted to carry out the construction of matter from sense data, and later Nelson Goodman continued the project. More generally, however, the use of set theoretic constructions became widespread among philosophers, and continues in the construction of set theoretic models, both in the sense of logic where they model formal theories, and as objects of interest in their own right.

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## Related Entries

Carnap, Rudolf | descriptions | Moore, George Edward | neutral monism | Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox | structural realism