Leo Strauss

First published Wed Dec 1, 2010

Leo Strauss was a twentieth-century German Jewish émigré to the United States whose intellectual corpus spans ancient, medieval and modern political philosophy and includes, among others, studies of Plato, Maimonides, Machiavelli, Hobbes, Spinoza, and Nietzsche. Strauss wrote mainly as a historian of philosophy and most of his writings take the form of commentaries on important thinkers and their writings. Yet as he put it: “There is no inquiry into the history of philosophy that is not at the same time a philosophical inquiry” (PL, p. 41). While much of his philosophical project involved an attempt to rethink pre-modern philosophy, the impetus for this reconsideration and the philosophical problems that vexed Strauss most were decidedly modern. Strauss especially worried about the modern philosophical grounds for political and moral normativity as well as about the philosophical, theological, and political consequences of what he took to be modern philosophy's overinflated claims for the self-sufficiency of reason.

1. Life and Work

Strauss was born on September 20, 1899 in Kirchhain, a small, rural town in Germany. He was raised in an orthodox Jewish home and also studied at a Gymnasium in nearby Marburg where he received a broad humanistic education. At the age of seventeen Strauss became a devoted advocate of political Zionism. He spent a year in Belgium as an interpreter for the military after which he began his studies at the University of Marburg, where the neo-Kantian Jewish philosopher, Hermann Cohen (1842–1918) had established a thriving school of neo-Kantianism. In 1921, Strauss completed his dissertation, “The problem of Knowledge in the Philosophical Doctrine of F.H. Jacobi,” under the direction of Cohen's student, Ernst Cassirer (1874–1945). Strauss's dissertation considered the implications of Jacobi's notion of revelation for the problem of knowledge. Although Strauss would come to regard his dissertation as “a disgraceful performance,” the question of the meaning and status of divine revelation would continue to occupy him throughout his life.

Strauss spent 1922 in Freiburg where he attended Edmund Husserl's lectures on phenomenology. Like a number of others, who would soon become famous philosophers in their own right, such as Emmanuel Levinas, Hans-Georg Gadamer, Karl Löwith, and Hannah Arendt, Strauss was quickly taken with Husserl's student, Martin Heidegger, who, he later wrote, impressed him as no other contemporary thinker had. The following year Strauss began lecturing in Frankfurt under the auspices of a center for adult education, the Freies Jüdische Lehrhaus, founded by Franz Rosenzweig (1886–1929). In 1925, Julius Guttmann (1880–1950) invited Strauss to Berlin to edit the jubilee edition of Moses Mendelssohn's work for the Academy of the Science of Judaism. In 1930, Strauss published his first book, Spinoza's Critique of Religion, dedicated to Rosenzweig's memory, in which he argued that nineteenth and twentieth-century readers of Spinoza could see him as a “God intoxicated man” only because they had ceased to take the possibility of divine revelation seriously.

In 1932, Strauss wrote a review of Carl Schmitt's recently published book The Concept of the Political, in which he argued that, despite Schmitt's attempts to do otherwise, Schmitt still remained within the horizon of modern liberalism because he was unable to offer reasons for his normative commitment to what he called “the political.” Many of Strauss's subsequent critics have interpreted his claim that Schmitt remained a liberal as proof of what they consider Strauss's anti-liberal ire. However, Strauss's critique of Schmitt is perhaps better understood as evidence of what would be Strauss's life long worry about modern liberalism's ability to justify its normative commitment to liberal ideals in the face of moral skepticism and relativism. If the modern liberal state is impartial to questions of value, how then does the liberal state justify its own value? Schmitt would state that no one had understood him as Strauss had, and Strauss would later claim that reading Schmitt changed his own orientation toward the question of the relation between philosophy and politics.

In 1932, due to the financial problems of the Academy for the Science of Judaism, Strauss found himself without a job. With a letter of recommendation from Schmitt, he received a fellowship from the Rockefeller Foundation to begin work, in France, on a study of Hobbes. In Paris, Strauss attended seminars on Hegel led by Alexandre Koyré (1892–1964) and Alexandre Kojève (1902–1968). The next year, he received an extension on his Rockefeller grant to work in London and Cambridge on his book on Hobbes.

Strauss's work on Hobbes coincided with Hitler's rise to power. Strauss thus turned his attention to Hobbes, whom he took to be the founding theorist of the liberal state, just as the idea of the German liberal state seemed to be collapsing. Strauss's third book, The Political Philosophy of Hobbes: Its Basis and Its Genesis was published in 1936. Linking his newly found attention to the relation between philosophy and politics with his previous work on what he regarded as Spinoza's critique of religion, the book concerns what Strauss claimed was the intimate tie between modern liberalism and its critique of religion.

In 1935 Strauss had published his second book, Philosophy and Law: Contributions to the Understanding of Maimonides and his Predecessors. Here too the political realities within which he was living overlapped with his scholarly pursuits. At the urging of Gershom Scholem, Strauss turned three separate essays on Maimonides into a book. Scholem and Strauss hoped that the publication of Philosophy and Law would help Strauss to get a position in medieval Jewish philosophy at the Hebrew University of Jerusalem. Strauss did not receive the position, which went instead to Julius Guttmann, Strauss's supervisor at the Academy for the Science of Judaism and a primary target of critique in Philosophy and Law.

Much of Philosophy and Law is an attack on Guttmann's assumption that the central problem for medieval Jewish philosophy was epistemological in nature. According to Guttmann, the fundamental question in studying medieval Jewish philosophy was how medieval Jewish philosophers, and Maimonides in particular, understood the relation between reason and revelation as sources of knowledge. Strauss argued, in contrast, that Maimonides' basic concern was not epistemological but instead political. Before any questions about the basis of knowledge can be asked, the question of what it means to philosophize in the framework of the authority of the law must be answered. Strauss argued that philosophy can clarify the meaning of the law, but philosophy cannot derive the law itself. Instead, the law is the pre-philosophical context of and framework for philosophy. It was also within the context of Philosophy and Law that Strauss began to consider something he had up until then thought impossible: a return to pre-modern philosophy.

In 1937 Strauss accepted a visiting lectureship in history from Columbia University. The following year Strauss became a visiting researcher at the New School for Social Research, home to many European émigrés. Strauss's position at the New School became permanent, and he remained there for ten years.

The decade that Strauss spent at the New School was arguably the most productive, and certainly the most pivotal, of his intellectual career. In his first years at the New School, Strauss published the seminal essays that would become the book Persecution and the Art of Writing, published in 1952. In these essays, Strauss argued that, when reading certain pre-modern thinkers, it is necessary to read between the lines. The possibility of persecution gives rise to a certain type of writing that allows one set of the readers, the majority, to receive one message while allowing a second set of readers, the philosophical elite, to take away another message. While this type of writing is often referred to as “esoteric,” it is more properly understood as “exoteric,” that is, writing that outwardly vales a secret teaching of some sort. For Strauss, Maimonides, Judah Halevi, and Spinoza were all exoteric writers. Despite the profound differences between them, Maimonides and Spinoza both outwardly teach that philosophy and revelation are reconcilable with one another. Yet, according to Strauss, the careful reader will notice that their respective arguments actually suggest the opposite: that philosophy and revelation are in fact irreconcilable. Halevi, on the other hand, outwardly teaches that philosophy and revelation are irreconcilable. But whereas Halevi's dismissal of philosophy in the face of revelation seems to suggest that philosophy is not a challenge for revelation, Strauss argues that the careful reader will notice that Halevi's argument in fact suggests the opposite: that philosophy is not just a challenge for revelation but a supremely dangerous challenge.

During his New School years, Strauss also delved more deeply into ancient philosophy to explore the themes of persecution and writing. Strauss's fourth book, On Tyranny: An Interpretation of Xenophon's “Hiero,” was published in 1948. In this study, Strauss offers a close reading of the rhetoric of Xenophon's dialogue, which highlights, on Strauss's reading, the tension between the philosophical quest for truth and the requirements of society.

Strauss accepted a position at the University of Chicago in 1949, where he would teach until his retirement in 1967. Upon joining Chicago's faculty, Strauss gave a series of lectures on “Natural Right and History,” which would be published in 1953 under the same title. Natural Right and History remains Strauss's best-known American work but its basic worry is an extension of his early doubts about the ability of twentieth-century philosophy to respond to the challenges of political and moral relativism. In the United States, and in the department of political science at Chicago, Strauss criticized what he took to be the moral relativism upon which the social sciences rested. He begins the book with an analysis of Max Weber, one of the principle founders of the academic discipline of social science, and attempts to show a direct line leading from Weber's positivism to historicism, which Strauss defines as the view that “all human thoughts or beliefs are historical” (NRH, p. 25). He then contrasts modern conceptions of natural right, beginning with Hobbes, with ancient conceptions, beginning with Plato. The former, argues Strauss, ends in historicist relativism, in which there are no moral, political, or scientific standards beyond particular historical contexts. Natural Right and History asks, though does not answer, the question of whether it is possible to return to some concept of nature for understanding who we are as human beings and therefore to some notion of absolute moral standards.

Strauss published two other books and many essays in his later years. In 1958 he published what is likely his most controversial study, Thoughts on Machiavelli, in which he pronounced Machiavelli's “anti-theological ire” the source of modernity. After retiring from Chicago, Strauss taught at Claremont Men's College in California for a year and then joined his old friend Jacob Klein (1899–1978) at St. John's College in Annapolis as a scholar in residence. Strauss died in 1973. The Argument and Action of Plato's “Laws” was published posthumously in 1975. At the time of his death, Strauss had also been at work on studies of Nietzsche, Thucydides, and Xenophon. A number of important collections of Strauss's essays have since been edited and published by some of his former students.

2. Controversies

A number of controversies surround Strauss and his work. First, in recent years, Strauss has been accused of being the intellectual godfather of the neo-conservative political movement and thus of being the intellectual force behind the Bush administration's plan to invade of Iraq. Second, no aspect of Strauss's work is as hotly contested as his claims about esotericism. Interpretations of Strauss's view of esotericism include: that Strauss advocates clandestine cabals with secrets imparted from teacher to disciple; that Strauss's writings are themselves esoteric documents; that Strauss thinks that all thinkers write esoterically; that Strauss claims to know a secret; and that, in one particularly crude rendering, Strauss promoted mass deception and perpetual war. This reading often serves to support a purported Strauss-Bush connection. After exploring the broad themes and context of Strauss's work, this article will return to reconsider these varying claims about Strauss.

3. Esotericism

Strauss's claims about esotericism ought to be understood within the broader trajectory of his life's work. Such an approach is in fact in keeping with Strauss's own recommendation for how to read philosophical texts, esoteric or otherwise. According to Strauss, an interpretation of a given text must begin “from an exact consideration of the explicit statements of an author.” However, “The context in which a statement occurs…must be perfectly understood before an interpretation of the statement can reasonably claim to be adequate or even correct” (PAW, p. 130). Turning to the context of Strauss's claims about esotericism helps to unravel a number of other important themes in his work, including what he calls the “theologico-political predicament of modernity,” the quarrel between the ancients and the moderns, and the relation between revelation and philosophy (what Strauss also calls “Jerusalem and Athens”).

In his first published contention that Maimonides is an esoteric writer, Strauss self-consciously examines what it means to write about an esoteric text. Clearly referring to himself, Strauss writes:

No historian who has a sense of decency and therefore a sense of respect for a superior man such as Maimonides will disregard light-heartedly the latter's emphatic entreaty not to explain the secret teaching of the Guide. It may fairly be said that an interpreter who does not feel pangs of conscience when attempting to explain that secret teaching and perhaps when perceiving for the first time its existence and bearing lacks that closeness to the subject which is indispensable for the true understanding of any book. Thus the question of adequate interpretation of the Guide is primarily a moral one. (PAW, p. 55)

Strauss maintains that before attempting to answer the question of whether a secret teaching, only hinted at in the text, can be grasped with confidence and precision, it is necessary to consider the moral implications as well as the moral impetus of a writer willing to write about such a secret. In making this claim, Strauss aligns his own dilemma with Maimonides' dilemma and by so doing he points to the basic motivation that directs his own claims about esotericism. The question is thus twofold: why did Maimonides write the Guide in the first place and why does Strauss write about esoteric writing? In answering the first question, Strauss notes that the literary form of the Guide is a letter to Maimonides' gifted student Joseph, who, like many Jews of Maimonides' time, was traveling in far and distant lands: “Joseph's departure was a consequence of his being a Jew in the Diaspora. Not a private need but only an urgent necessity of nation-wide bearing can have driven Maimonides to transgress an explicit prohibition [to write about esoteric matters]. Only the necessity of saving the law can have caused him to break the law” (PAW, p. 49).

If this is Maimonides' reason, what is Strauss's? Strauss is willing to make the seemingly immoral and indecent move of revealing the secrets of an esoteric text in order to save those secrets. The secret that Strauss seeks to save is insight into the political, philosophical, and theological meaning of what he calls “a forgotten type of writing.” But why does Strauss care about this forgotten type of writing? We can only answer this question by looking to Strauss's published work as a whole and to the place of Persecution and the Art of Writing within this whole and to do so it is necessary to understand Strauss's most basic question, which concerns what he calls the “theologico-political predicament of modernity.”

4. The Theologico-Political Predicament of Modernity

In the 1965 preface to the English translation of Spinoza's Critique of Religion, Strauss describes the beginnings of his intellectual journey by stating that “This study of Spinoza's Theologico-Political Treatise was written during the years 1925–28 in Germany. The author was a young Jew born and raised in Germany who found himself in the grip of the theologico-political predicament” (SCR, p. 1). Also in 1965 Strauss's The Political Philosophy of Hobbes was published, with a new preface by the author, for the first time in German. There Strauss refers to the “theologico-political problem,” deeming it “the theme of my studies” (GS 3, p. 8).

Strauss employs the term “theological-political predicament,” to diagnose what he contends are the devastating philosophical, theological, and political consequences of the early modern attempt to separate theology from politics. However, Strauss in no way favors a return to theocracy or, like his contemporary Carl Schmitt, a turn toward political theology. Instead, Strauss attempts to recover classical political philosophy not to return to the political structures of the past but to reconsider ways in which pre-modern thinkers thought it necessary to grapple and live with the tensions, if not contradictions that, by definition, arise from human society. For Strauss, a recognition, and not a resolution, of the tensions and contradictions that define human society is the necessary starting point for philosophically reconstructing a philosophy, theology, and politics of moderation, all of which, he claims, the twentieth-century desperately needs.

5. Philosophy and Revelation

In describing the “theological-political predicament” Strauss continually returns to the questions of the epistemological and political status of revelation vis-à-vis philosophy. He criticizes the modern critique of religion beginning in the 17th century for advancing the idea that revelation and philosophy should answer to the same scientific criteria, maintaining that this notion brings meaningful talk of revelation to an end, either in the form of banishing revelation from conversation or in the form of so-called modern defenses of religion which only internalize this banishment. Strauss's early musings on the theologico-political predicament led him to a theme upon which he would insist again and again: the irreconcilability of revelation and philosophy (or the irreconcilability of what he would call elsewhere Jerusalem and Athens or the Bible and Greek philosophy). Strauss maintains that because belief in revelation by definition does not claim to be self-evident knowledge, philosophy can neither refute nor confirm revelation:

The genuine refutation of orthodoxy would require the proof that the world and human life are perfectly intelligible without the assumption of a mysterious God; it would require at least the success of the philosophical system: man has to show himself theoretically and practically as the master of the world and the master of his life; the merely given must be replaced by the world created by man theoretically and practically (SCR, p. 29).

Because a completed system is not possible, or at least not yet possible, modern philosophy, despite its self-understanding to the contrary, has not refuted the possibility of revelation.

On Strauss's reading, the Enlightenment's so-called critique of religion ultimately also brought with it, unbeknownst to its proponents, modern rationalism's self-destruction. Strauss does not reject modern science, but he does object to the philosophical conclusion that “scientific knowledge is the highest form of knowledge” because this “implies a depreciation of pre-scientific knowledge.” As he put it, “Science is the successful part of modern philosophy or science, and philosophy is the unsuccessful part—the rump” (JPCM, p. 99). Strauss reads the history of modern philosophy as beginning with the elevation of all knowledge to science, or theory, and as concluding with the devaluation of all knowledge to history, or practice. In Strauss's words: “the root of all modern darkness from the seventeenth century on is the obscuring of the difference between theory and praxis, an obscuring that first leads to a reduction of praxis to theory (this is the meaning of so-called [modern] rationalism) and then, in retaliation, to the rejection of theory in the name of praxis that is no longer intelligible as praxis” (FPP, p. 66). Whereas in the seventeenth-century, Hobbes, like Spinoza after him, depreciates pre-scientific knowledge in the name of science, Heidegger, in the twentieth-century, depreciates scientific knowledge in the name of historicity. While many philosophers (including Heidegger) have understood Heidegger's philosophy as breaking with modern rationalism, Strauss views Heidegger's philosophy as a logical outcome of that same rationalism. According to Strauss, modern rationalism implodes upon itself: what starts as a modern quest for delineating scientific standards in the name of certain knowledge leads to the conclusion that there are neither such standards nor such truths.

Strauss argues that just as modern philosophy begins with an over-inflated sense of reason that privileges theory over practice and ends with a radical historicism that denies any meaning to reason outside of history, so too, modern political philosophy begins with the attempt to make the human being part of nature as defined by science and ends by denying any notion of nature all together. For Strauss, these trajectories come together in the coincidence of Heidegger's philosophy and his political misadventures:

The crucial issue concerns the status of those permanent characteristics of humanity, such as the distinction between the noble and the base…. It was the contempt for these permanencies which permitted the most radical historicist in 1933 to submit to, or rather to welcome, as a dispensation of fate, the verdict of the least wise and least moderate part of his nation… The biggest event of 1933 would rather seem to have proved, if such proof was necessary, that man cannot abandon the question of the good society…. (WPP, pp. 26–27).

Strauss does not mean to imply that National Socialism was inevitable. Rather he means to investigate why there was no adequate rational, moral response to the rise of National Socialism. It is here that the modern crises of philosophy and theology meet in the modern crisis of politics. Neither modern political philosophy nor theology nor philosophy had the critical resources to respond to the disintegration of the liberal state, the very political structure that was touted as “the opposite of… ‘the kingdom of darkness,’ i.e., of medieval society” (SCR, p. 3).

It would become the mature Strauss's task to consider how philosophy, theology, and political philosophy could each once again have the critical resources to make the most basic distinction between the noble and the base. To do so, Strauss would have to overcome what he called the “powerful prejudice, that a return to pre-modern philosophy is impossible (SCR, p. 31).

6. Esotericism Revisited

We are now in a position to reconsider Strauss's claims about esotericism. In a 1936 essay on the political science of Maimonides and Farabi, Strauss returns to the meaning of prophecy for Maimonides. While most interpreters, including Strauss in Spinoza's Critique of Religion and in parts but not all of Philosophy and Law, viewed Maimonides' conception of prophecy in epistemological terms, Strauss argues that Maimonides' innovation was to think of prophecy in political terms. According to Strauss, “Maimonides neither wished nor was able, nor had any need, to lift the veil which conceals the origins of the Torah, the foundation of the perfect nation” (RPSMF, pp. 15–16). Yet, Strauss maintains, the attentive reader will notice that Maimonides distinguishes between Moses, the lawgiver, and all other prophets. Maimonides stresses Moses' exalted status, argues Strauss, because for Maimonides Moses is the Platonic philosopher-legislator. The emphasis on the uniqueness of Moses as the ideal prophet and ideal ruler is the core of Maimonides' political philosophy because “Not the mystery of its [the Torah's] origin, the search for which leads either to theosophy or ‘Epicureanism,’ but its end, the comprehension of which guarantees obedience to the Torah, is accessible to human reason” (RPSMF, p. 16).

Obedience to the law and the philosophical meaning of the law are two different matters that are reflected in what Strauss argues is Maimonides' dual conception of law. The exterior, literal meaning of the law serves to sustain the political community in which certain forms of behavior and belief are required, while the ideal meaning of the law is a matter of philosophical speculation only for those who are capable of such speculation. This dual conception of law parallels the dual character of Maimonides' writing, which offers what Strauss calls a “moderate” reading meant for the masses and what he calls a “radical” reading meant for the philosophical reader. As Strauss would elaborate just two years later in greater detail, this dialectical tension lies at the heart of Maimonides' style of writing and argumentation.

According to Strauss, Maimonides is able to properly balance the relation between praxis, obedience to the law, and theory, the mystery of the law's origins, not by conflating them but by keeping them in continual dialectical tension. For Strauss, Maimonides' refusal to resolve the tension between law and philosophy (between praxis and theory) expresses Maimonides' moderate claims both for what philosophy can produce on its own (it cannot produce the law) and for what revelation can claim to know absolutely (it cannot provide certain knowledge of the mystery of its origin). Strauss's attention to esotericism is rooted in a philosophical interest in “a golden mean which is neither a compromise nor a synthesis, which is hence not based on the two opposed positions, but which suppresses them both, uproots them by a prior, more profound question, by raising a fundamental problem, the work of a truly critical philosophy” (RPSMF, p. 4).

For Strauss, the work of a truly critical philosophy is to grasp problems, and not to provide solutions. What is the absolute problem at the heart of esotericism, according to Strauss? The problem concerns the self-sufficiency of reason or, put another way, the inescapable and necessary tension between theory and practice. The theological-political predicament of modernity stems from the modern commitment to the self-sufficiency of reason that, Strauss argues, results in reason's self-destruction. Esotericism is a means toward preserving the limits of philosophy and revelation (or law) vis-à-vis one another. The law comes up against its own limitations in the quest to articulate the philosophical foundations of the law. But at the same time, philosophy comes up against its own limits in recognizing that the philosopher is always already within society (or the law) and for this reason dependent upon the law. Strauss thus makes the seemingly immoral move of revealing Maimonides' art of writing for the sake of saving the possibility of both revelation and philosophy.

7. The Quarrel between the Ancients and the Moderns

Another recurrent theme in Strauss's work is what he calls “the quarrel between the ancients and the moderns.” Most specifically, the quarrel between the ancients and the moderns for Strauss is about the excesses of modern claims for the authoritative claims of reason and the philosophical moderation of the ancients. As we saw above, according to Strauss, the trajectory of modern philosophy's demise begins with the belief that modern philosophy has refuted revelation once and for all. This false belief is based on an overreaching view of what philosophical reason alone can accomplish and it leads to the equally false belief that there are no rational standards because reason is always imbedded within and determined by history. Strauss contrasts Socrates' moderation with the excess of modern philosophers. Socrates' moderation is not merely a political concession, according to Strauss, but bears upon the question of how we come to truth: “Socrates implied that disregarding the opinions about the nature of things would amount to abandoning the most important access to reality which we have, or the most important vestiges of truth which are within our reach” (NRH, p. 124). But even though truth is within our reach, philosophy begins and ends with the quest for truth: “philosophy is meant—and that is the decisive point—not as a set of propositions, a teaching, or even a system, but as a way of life, a life animated by a peculiar passion, the philosophic desire, or eros; it is not understood as an instrument or a department of human self-realization” (NRH, p. 122). As a way of life, “the problems are always more evident than the solutions. All solutions are questionable… Therefore, the right way of life cannot be established metaphysically except by a completed metaphysics, and therefore the right way of life remains questionable” (NRH, pp. 122–123).

8. Philosophy and Revelation Revisited

That the right way of life remains questionable and hence the claim for philosophy's modesty regarding its own capabilities brings us back to philosophy's relation to revelation. Without a completed metaphysics, philosophy cannot refute revelation. This inability to refute revelation has serious consequences for philosophy's self-understanding. As Strauss puts it in Natural Right and History, in what is probably his most well known statement on the topic:

Philosophy has to grant that revelation is possible. But to grant that revelation is possible means to grant that the philosophic life is not necessarily, not evidently, the right life. Philosophy, the life devoted to the quest for evident knowledge available to man as man, would rest on an unevident, arbitrary, or blind decision. This would merely confirm the thesis of faith, that there is no possibility of consistency, of a consistent and thoroughly sincere life, without belief in revelation. The mere fact that philosophy and revelation cannot refute each other would constitute the refutation of philosophy by revelation. (NRH, p. 75)

Here we see that, for Strauss, the tension between revelation and philosophy is not one between irrationality and rationality but between fundamentally irreconcilable criteria for what constitutes the rational starting point of truth. Philosophy begins and ends for Strauss with the philosopher's sense of wonder, while revealed religion begins and ends with adherence to the divine law. Yet as Strauss suggests, this situation puts philosophy at a disadvantage and revelation at an advantage. Never claiming to rest on evident knowledge, revelation can rationally approach its truth claims, not to prove them but to understand them. But philosophy, which values reason first and foremost, is led to the unpleasant truth that it is in fact predicated on something that is and remains unevident: that the human question for knowledge is the right life.

Strauss's simultaneous criticism of the self-sufficiency of reason and defense of the rational plausibility (though not the certainty) of revelation bears an important affinity to arguments of contemporary Christian philosophers of religion, such as Alvin Plantinga and Nicholas Wolterstorff, who point out that philosophers and others take many things for granted for which we do not have certain evidence, such as sense perception, memory, or the inner lives of other people. Like Strauss, these philosophers of religion criticize the hubris of Enlightenment attempts to define knowledge only in terms of scientific evidence. Once we dispense with modern philosophy's overreaching claims for reason, the fact that revelation cannot be proven definitively does not rule out the possibility of making rational arguments about God's revelation. Such arguments become impossible only when absolute proof for God's existence is the prerequisite for reasoning about revelation.

However, unlike Plantinga and Wolterstorff, Strauss's project is not to make rational arguments for God's revelation but only to suggest that such arguments are in theory possible. Because Strauss clearly is not interested in offering a constructive theology, some interpreters have concluded that, despite appearances to the contrary, he did not really take the possibility of revelation seriously. Perhaps most notably, the eminent Strauss scholar, Heinrich Meier, maintains that Strauss purposely overstates the problem posed by revelation for philosophy in order to inspire philosophical readers in their quest for the philosophical life. Meier further understands the theologico-political problem in terms of what he claims is Strauss's life-long effort to create a philosophical school. Meier's basic contention is that the quarrel between revelation and philosophy as Strauss describes it leaves the careful reader many opportunities to consider whether revelation really does constitute the refutation of philosophy and to realize that philosophy does in fact have philosophical and moral resources from which to respond to revelation.

It is true that some of Strauss's sketches of revelation do not make revelation compelling from a philosophical point of view. If the question about the relation between revelation and philosophy pertains to a decision for faith or philosophy, Strauss's conception of revelation sounds very much like Kierkegaard's conception according to which a leap of faith defines revelation. This theological vantage point is similar to Strauss's description of Franz Rosenzweig and Karl Barth's reawakening of theology. Yet Strauss explicitly rejects this sort of theological decisionism because, he argues, this position amounts to a “farewell to reason.” By mistakenly assuming that Strauss defines revelation as blind faith, many of Strauss's interpreters have concluded that he does not in the end take revelation seriously from a philosophical point of view. In support of this position, Meier in fact quotes Julius Guttmann's critical response to Strauss, which is that Strauss shows an “indifference towards the content of revelation… Whether Jewish or Christian revelation is of concern makes no difference whatsoever” (as quoted in Meier 2006, p. 20). For Guttmann, this supposed indifference to revelation's content means that Strauss gets medieval Jewish rationalism wrong. For Meier, this supposed indifference means that despite what seems to be Strauss's defense of revelation's capacity to criticize philosophy, revelation is in the end for Strauss a straw man. As Meier puts it, “What appears to the believer to be ‘indifference’ proves on closer inspection to be a conscious dissociation and ultimately a rejection” (Meier 2006, p. 20, note 25).

Yet Strauss was not indifferent to the content of revelation and certainly not to the difference between Jewish and Christian notions of revelation. In fact, Strauss strongly criticizes what he regards as a particularly Christian view of revelation not in order to banish revelation from intellectual conversation once and for all but to suggest that modernity's intellectual ills stem in large part from the legacy of Christian theology. Strikingly, it was on the basis of the Islamic, as opposed to the Christian, reception of classical political philosophy that Strauss turned to reconsider the meanings of philosophy, revelation, and politics. Strauss's very attempt to move beyond modern philosophy is predicated on a distinction between the Jewish and Islamic conception of revelation on the one hand, and the Christian conception, on the other hand:

For the Christian, the sacred doctrine is revealed theology; for the Jew and the Muslim, the sacred doctrine is, at least primarily the legal interpretation of the Divine Law (talmud or fiqh). The sacred doctrine in the latter sense has, to say the least, much less in common with philosophy than the sacred doctrine in the former sense. It is ultimately for this reason that the status of philosophy was, as a matter of principle, much more precarious in Judaism and in Islam than in Christianity: in Christianity philosophy became an integral part of the officially recognized and even required training of the student of the sacred doctrine….The precarious position of philosophy in the Islamic-Jewish world guaranteed its private character and therewith its inner-freedom from supervision. The status of philosophy in the Islamic-Jewish world resembled in this respect its status in classical Greece. (PAW, pp. 18–19, 21)

Strauss problematizes the Christian view of revelation as doctrinal knowledge that must be believed. From his early to his mature writings, Strauss contends that the making of revelation into knowledge in scholastic theology ultimately led to modern philosophy's far too over-reaching claims. As Strauss puts it rather succinctly, “On the querelle des anciens et des modernes: I do not deny, but assert, that modern philosophy has much that is essential in common with Christian medieval philosophy; but that means that the attack of the moderns is directed decisively against ancient philosophy” (CCM, p. 106). Or, as he puts it elsewhere, “modern philosophy emerged by way of transformation of, if in opposition to, Latin or Christian scholasticism” (JPCM, p. 252).

Strauss's distinction between Judaism and Islam, on the one hand, and Christianity, on the other, is decisive for understanding his conception of the relation between Jerusalem and Athens as well as for appreciating his conception of the theologico-political problem, as a diagnosis of modernity's philosophical, theological, and political ills. On an epistemological level, philosophy may well have good arguments to make in response to revelation. Strauss explicitly criticizes what he regards as Rosenzweig's and Karl Barth's decisionist conception of revelation, i.e. revelation as a leap of faith, which, he maintains, holds no promise of rationalism. From an epistemological point of view, philosophy understood as a way of life, concerned with problems and unconvinced of promises of absolute solutions, will appear more rational to potential philosophers.

Yet for Strauss the serious argument with which revelation challenges philosophy is not epistemological but moral. This is not to deny the importance of the pursuit of truth for Strauss, but it is to return to his criticism of the modern depreciation of pre-scientific or pre-philosophical knowledge. Again, Strauss is a critic of the Enlightenment's view of the self-sufficiency of reason. If philosophy is to have critical potential, argues Strauss, philosophy must be skeptical even of itself. This means that philosophers should not only tolerate religion for their own instrumental purposes but that philosophy is challenged by revelation, understood as law and not as knowledge, on moral grounds.

9. Strauss's Moral Argument for Revelation

Strauss argues, both in his early work on medieval Jewish rationalism and in his mature American work, that only revelation, and not philosophy, can provide the basis of a universal morality. To be sure, this universal morality is based on faith and not certain knowledge. Nevertheless, it does underscore a moral weakness in the philosophical position. Nowhere does Strauss highlight this point more than in his seminal 1943 essay on the medieval Jewish thinker Judah Halevi. This essay became an integral part of Persecution and the Art of Writing and far from an obscure relic of an interest in things Jewish and medieval, Strauss's reference to this essay forms a decisive part of his argument in Natural Right and History.

Strauss's reading of Halevi centers on the question of what Halevi, in his Kuzari, could have meant by the “law of reason.” Through a detailed analysis of the Halevi's Kuzari, Strauss concludes, “the iura naturalia are really not more than the indispensable and unchangeable minimum of morality required for the bare existence of any society.” But as Strauss points out, the unchangeable minimum of morality is in fact, from a moral point of view, not very much after all. In explicating Halevi's position, Strauss elaborates on Halevi's comment in the Kuzari that “Even a gang of robbers must have a kind of justice among them if their confederacy is to last,” (the analogy refers to, without mentioning, Plato's parable of the robbers in Republic, Book 1, 342b-d). Strauss writes:

he [the philosopher in Halevi's Kuzari] mentions among the governmental laws of the Divine code the prohibition against murder, e.g. while he does not mention it among the governmental and rational nomoi which are known independently of revelation; this again is easily understandable considering that the Bible prohibits murder absolutely, whereas a gang of robbers, e.g., would merely have to prohibit the murder of other members of the gang. (PAW, p. 132)

Strauss concludes his study of Halevi by suggesting that “by going so far with the philosophers…he [Halevi] discover[s] the fundamental weakness of the philosophic position and the deepest reason why philosophy is enormously dangerous” (PAW, p. 140). On Strauss's reading of Halevi, philosophy leads to the dangerous denial of an absolute morality that is not contingent upon allegiance to a specific group.

In Natural Right and History Strauss does not deny that we can know right and wrong, but he does question strongly whether philosophy in and of itself can defend a universal morality beyond that of a closed city or society. Significantly, Strauss alludes to Halevi's analogy of a gang of robbers when he writes:

But it is unfortunate for the defenders of justice that it is also required for the preservation of a gang of robbers: the gang could not last a single day if its members did not refrain from hurting one another, if they did not help one another, or if each member did not subordinate his own good to the good of the gang (NRH, p. 105).

Strauss's allusion to Halevi is made all the stronger by a reference to his essay on Halevi in a note to the following sentence: “There exists an alternative medieval interpretation of Aristotle's doctrine [of natural right], namely, the Averroistic view or, more adequately stated, the view characteristic of the falāsia, as well as of the Jewish Aristotelians” (NRH, p. 158). The context of this comment and note is Strauss's distinction between the Aristotelian view of natural right and the Socratic-Platonic view. For Aristotle, Strauss writes, “there is no fundamental disproportion between natural right and the requirements of political society” (NRH, p. 156). In contrast, Strauss maintains, the Platonic-Socratic view of natural right recognizes a fundamental discrepancy between the justice of natural right, which is independent of law, and the justice of the city, which is of necessity dependent on law. The Platonic-Socratic view of natural right points to the philosopher's lack of inner attachment to the laws of society.

For Strauss, the “Averroistic view” that is “an alternative medieval interpretation of Aristotle's doctrine” is based on the Islamic reception of Plato's Laws and hence is Platonic in a way that the Christian reading of Aristotle is not. Plato and the “Jewish Aristotelians,” Strauss insists, recognize a fundamental tension between philosophy and law, which is also the tension between philosophy and “the city.” As Strauss makes clear in Natural Right and History, it is the Christian interpretation of Aristotle, and particularly Thomas Aquinas' notion of natural law, that denies this tension: “The Thomistic doctrine of natural right or, more generally expressed, of natural law is free from the hesitations and ambiguities which are characteristic of the teachings, not only of Plato and Cicero, but of Aristotle as well…. No doubt is left…” (NRH, p. 163). We have seen that for Strauss, leaving doubt behind is the intellectual error that led to the theologico-political predicament of the early twentieth-century, with ultimately terrible consequences for reason, morality, and politics.

By repeatedly emphasizing his doubts about philosophy's ability to ground a universal morality, Strauss suggests that revelation remains and must remain a continual moral challenge for philosophy (see also JPCM; NRH, pp. 106–107; PAW, p. 140). To be sure, Strauss's is not an argument for revelation. And Strauss himself was not a believer. But Strauss's arguments about revelation do offer the believer intellectual resources with which to challenge the philosopher and for this reason Strauss is neither indifferent to nor does he reject revelation. As Strauss concludes his essay on Halevi, “One has not to be naturally pious, he has merely to have a passionate interest in genuine morality in order to long with all his heart for revelation: moral man as such is the potential believer” (PAW, p. 140, emphasis added).

Of course, revelation's challenge to philosophy is but a challenge and never a victory. At the same time, philosophy always remains a challenge to revelation's ability to make claims about conclusive evidence for revelation's truth. This mutual challenge is ultimately a form of moderation.

10. Controversies Revisited

Let us return to the controversies surrounding Strauss and his work, mentioned above. The claim that Strauss is in some way responsible for the Bush administration's decision to invade Iraq has little merit. As should be clear from the above, Strauss's work does not concern policy issues of any sort. If others have adapted his philosophical ideas in the pursuit of policy questions, they themselves are responsible for those policy decisions, not Strauss. Morever, few, if any, real arguments have been advanced that conclude Bush administration policy makers who studied with Strauss's students ever consciously applied his ideas when making decisions concerning the war in Iraq. In the context of such claims about Strauss's influence on the Bush administration's policies on Iraq and the Middle East more generally, there is an irony, namely, that Strauss himself was devoted to revitalizing Islamic philosophy, as opposed to Christian thought, for the very sake of the future of western civilization.

The variety of claims about Strauss's view of esotericism, mentioned above, is also fundamentally problematic. First, we have seen that a crucial, if usually overlooked, presupposition of Strauss's view of esotericism is his concern with written texts. From the perspective of his own claims about esotericism, what may or may not have been Strauss's own views are irrelevant to interpreting his work.

Second, there is no reason to conclude, as many do, that Strauss himself wrote esoterically. For instance, Laurence Lampert's view that “It is reasonable to suspect that a partisan of esoteric philosophy [i.e. Strauss] would himself write esoterically” (Lampert 2009, p. 63) simply does not follow from Strauss's own claims. In Strauss's words, “The only presentations of an author's views which can be accepted as true are those ultimately borne out by his own explicit statements” (PAW, pp. 26–27). While Maimonides announces in the introduction to the Guide that he will write esoterically, Strauss makes no such statement. So too, in Strauss's words, “the problem inherent in the surface of things, and only in the surface of things, is the heart of things” (TM, p. 13). Strauss tells us that the theologico-political predicament is his focal issue. Why should we, on the basis of Strauss's own terms, think otherwise?

Third, suggestions that Strauss reads a multitude of authors esoterically simply do not hold up. Strauss only uses the term “esotericism” in Persecution and the Art of Writing and hence only in connection with Halevi, Spinoza, and Maimonides.

And fourth, Strauss never claims to have discovered any secret in Maimonides or anyone else, but rather an understanding of the necessity and limits of philosophy as it relates to revelation and politics.

All of these issues aside, the most persistent and serious misunderstanding of Strauss is that he promotes mass deception. On this reading, Strauss suggests that the masses simply cannot handle the truth and are in need of a class of political elites who, while themselves pursuing the truth, support the noble lies necessary for any society to function. If this was Strauss's view then, as Moshe Halbertal has recently and rightly noted, Strauss or “the Straussians are…naïve in believing that genuine elites can be trusted. Trusting the existence of a selected group of wise men who are devoted to the collective good, and who are freed from ambition and self-interest because of their pursuit of truth, is as crude as the belief in a society where masses disappear and deliberation and reason control human's political choices” (CR, p. 163). Halbertal calls Strauss's conception of esotericism “instrumental” because it “focuses on the harmful results of the dissemination” [of the truth] (CR, p. 149).

Yet if we understand Strauss's rather minimal claims about esotericism as an antidote to what he called the theologico-political predicament of modernity, then this reading of Strauss (regardless of what various Straussians claim) is not quite right. As we have seen, Strauss develops his conception of esotericism in an attempt to rethink the relation between theory and praxis. Esotericism is not merely a political, or instrumental, tool for Strauss but also concerns the very nature of truth. Esotericism points to what Strauss regards as the critical problem of philosophy, which concerns the self-sufficiency of reason. Halbertal is right that “Humans, even those who devote themselves to truth, are always embedded within the boundaries of the human condition” (CR, p. 163). But this should not be a criticism of Strauss but is better understood as describing the very impetus for the dialogical structure of Strauss's account of esotericism.

Although he does not apply it to Strauss, Halbertal provides a more helpful rubric under which we may better understand Strauss's conception of esotericism. Strauss's view of esotericism is not “instrumental” but instead “essential,” which means that, to quote Halbertal, esotericism “is not the result of a strategy adopted by philosophy in its relation toward society, but is part of the essence of the philosophical realm” (CR, p. 57). As Halbertal notes, this position leads to a skeptical position that Shlomo Pines (a professor of philosophy at the Hebrew University in Jerusalem from 1952–1990 and the translator of Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed into English for which Strauss provided the introduction) attributed to Maimonides (in an article which, incidentally, he published after Strauss's death). While Pines' concern was specifically with Maimonides' account of language, Strauss saw esotericism as a more generalized form of philosophical skepticism. To return to Strauss's abiding interest in the relation between theory and practice, Strauss's skepticism was also skeptical of itself in recognizing the limits, political, moral, and philosophical, of skepticism. This recognition, for Strauss, is the work of a truly critical philosophy.

11. Remaining Problems with Strauss's Philosophy

Leaving aside legitimate debate about the intellectual history of western civilization that Strauss sketches, problems remain with many of his philosophical contentions. Strauss certainly cannot be said to have offered definitive arguments against historicism, definitive arguments for or against revelation, or definitive arguments for a return to “nature.” Rather, in all these cases, one might argue, Strauss has merely begged the question. Strauss historicizes philosophy in order to make an argument for timeless truth. His rational defenses of both the possibility of revelation and philosophical rationalism are made on the basis of a critique of reason's self-sufficiency. Finally, Strauss's claims about a return to “nature” rest not upon arguments for “nature” but rather upon arguments about the consequences of not having a conception of “nature.”

In the end, how one evaluates the circular nature of Strauss's questions and answers will depend upon how seriously one takes Strauss's diagnosis of the “theologico-political predicament of modernity.” If one does not think Strauss has made a serious case for the dire intellectual and political implications of this predicament, then one will not be persuaded that Strauss has done much more than creatively re-read some pre-modern philosophers, for better or for worse. If on the other hand, one finds Strauss's diagnosis of the “theologico-political predicament” persuasive, one might think that Strauss has accomplished quite a lot by raising the questions of truth, revelation, and nature anew in a day and age in which discussion of these matters seems to have been deemed mute.

Bibliography

Works by Strauss

PL The Argument and Action of Plato's Laws, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1975.
CCM “Correspondence Concerning Modernity,” trans. George Elliott Tucker, Independent Journal of Philosophy, 4 (1983): pp. 105–119 and 5/6 (1988): pp. 177–192.
FPP Faith and Political Philosophy: The Correspondence Between Leo Strauss and Eric Voegelin, 1934–1964, ed. and trans. Peter Emberley and Barry Cooper, University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2002.
GS 3 Gesammelte Schriften, vol. 3, ed. Heinrich Meier, Stuttgart: J.B. Metzler, 2001.
JPCM Jewish Philosophy and the Crisis of Modernity, ed. Kenneth Hart Green, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1997.
NRH Natural Right and History, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1953.
OT On Tyranny: Including the Strauss-Kojève Correspondence, ed. Victor Gourevitch and Michael S. Roth (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2000).
PAW Persecution and the Art of Writing, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1952.
PL Philosophy and Law: Contributions to the Understanding of Maimonides and his Predecessors, trans. Eve Adler, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 1995.
PPH The Political Philosophy of Hobbes: Its Basis and Its Genesis, trans. Elsa M. Sinclair, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1936.
SRPSMF “Some Remarks on the Political Science of Maimonides and Farabi,” trans. Robert Bartlett Interpretation 18 (1990): pp. 3–30.
SCR Spinoza's Critique of Religion, trans. Elsa M. Sinclair, New York: Schocken, 1965.
TM Thoughts on Machiavelli, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1958.
WPP What is Political Philosophy and Other Studies, Glencoe, IL: The Free Press, 1959.

For a complete bibliography of Strauss's writings see the Leo Strauss Center Website.

Secondary Literature

  • Batnitzky, Leora, 2006, Leo Strauss and Emmanuel Levinas: Philosophy and the Politics of Revelation, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Drury, Shadia, 1988, The Political Ideas of Leo Strauss, New York: St. Martin's Press.
  • Green, Kenneth Hart, 1993, Jew and Philosopher: The Return to Maimonides in the Jewish Thought of Leo Strauss, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Halbertal, Moshe, 2007, Concealment and Revelation: Esotericism in Jewish Thought and its Political Implications, trans. Jackie Feldman, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Janssens, David, 2008, Between Jerusalem and Athens: Philosophy, Prophecy, and Politics in Leo Strauss's Early Thought, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Lampert, Laurence, 1996, Leo Strauss and Nietzsche, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Lampert, Laurence, 2009, “Strauss's Recovery of Esotericism,” Cambridge Companion to Leo Strauss, ed. Steven B. Smith, New York: Cambridge University Press, pp. 63–92.
  • Meier, Heinrich, 1995, Carl Schmitt and Leo Strauss: The Hidden Dialogue, trans. Harvey J. Lomax, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Meier, Heinrich, 2006, Leo Strauss and the Theologico-Political Problem, trans. Harvey J. Lomax, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Orr, Susan, 1995, Jerusalem and Athens: Reason and Revelation in the Works of Leo Strauss, Lanham, MD: Rowan & Littlefield.
  • Pangle, Thomas L., 2006, Leo Strauss: An Introduction to His Thought and Intellectual Legacy, Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Pines, Shlomo, 1979, “The Limitations of Human Knowledge According to al-Farabi, ibn Bajja and Maimonides,” Studies in Medieval Jewish History and Literature, ed. I. Twersky, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, pp. 88–109.
  • Plantinga, Alvin and Wolterstorf, Nicholas, eds., 1991, Faith and Rationality: Reason and Belief in God, South Bend, IN.: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Sheppard, Eugene R., 2006, Leo Strauss and the Politics of Exile, Waltham, MA: Brandeis University Press.
  • Smith, Steven B., 2006, Reading Leo Strauss: Politics, Philosophy, Judaism, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Sorenson, Kim A., 2006, Discourses on Strauss: Revelation and Reason in Leo Strauss and His Critical Study of Machiavelli, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Tanguay, Daniel, 2007, Leo Strauss: An Intellectual Biography, trans. Christopher Nadon, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Zuckert, Catherine and Michael, 2006, The Truth About Leo Strauss: Political Philosophy and American Democracy, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Copyright © 2010 by
Leora Batnitzky <batnitzk@princeton.edu>

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