Tropes

First published Mon Sep 9, 2013

According to trope theory, the world consists (wholly or partly) of ontologically unstructured (simple) abstract particulars or, as they are normally called, tropes. Tropes are abstract yet they are not universal, they are particular yet they are not concrete. In accepting the existence of entities characterized in this (unusual) way, the theory can be said to occupy a middle position in between classical nominalism—according to which all there is are concrete particulars—and classical realism—according to which there is a separate and fundamental category of abstract universals. And this, it has been argued, means that trope theory avoids well-known problems with both of those views. By accepting the existence of abstract entities (like shapes and weights), the trope theorist is able to explain how distinct concrete particulars can be simultaneously similar to, and different from, each other. And this is something the classical nominalist, whose basic ontology is more coarse-grained, has been accused of not being able to do (for a famous instance of this critique of classical nominalism, see Armstrong 1978). And by not accepting the existence of universals, she avoids having to accept the existence of a kind of entity many find mysterious, counterintuitive, and “unscientific” (Schaffer 2001: 249f.; Molnar 2003: 22–25; and Armstrong 2005: 310). Apart from this very thin core assumption—that there are tropes—different trope theories need not have very much in common. Most trope theorists (but not all) believe that there is nothing but tropes. Most trope theorists (but, again, not all) hold that resemblance between concrete particulars is to be explained in terms of resemblance between their respective tropes. And most (but not all) hold that resemblance between tropes is determined by their primitive intrinsic nature. In fact, even to call one's posits “tropes” is by some considered problematic (see especially Bacon 2011).[1] In this entry, different views on the nature and individuation of tropes, on how tropes relate to both universals and concrete particulars, and on how tropes might or might not be used to (dis)solve well known problems in philosophy, are introduced.


1. Historical Background

The father of the contemporary debate on tropes was D. C. Williams (1997 [1953]; 1963; 1986). In 1953, he published “On the Elements of Being I” in which he argued for a one-category theory of tropes (for the first time so labeled), a bundle theory of concrete particulars, and a resemblance class theory of universals. All of these have become elements of what is now considered the “standard” view of tropes (a view that will be further spelled out and explained in sections 2–4). But Williams was in all probability not the first to posit the existence of trope-like entities. Who to count among his trope-theoretical predecessors is unavoidably contentious. It will depend on how the nature of the trope is conceptualized, and on what the essential elements of a trope—or trope-like—theory are taken to be, matters on which opinions have been very much divided. Here the history of trope theory can only be cursorily treated (for a more thorough account, see Mertz 1996 and Mulligan et al. 1984).

Even if there are those who think that both Plato and Aristotle posited entities somewhat like what later thinkers would refer to as “tropes” (see Mertz 1996: 83–118), and even if (most likely even stronger) reasons exist for holding that many of the medieval thinkers (including Aquinas, Duns Scotus, and Suarez) also accepted the existence of trope-like entities, it is in the writings of 19th century German-speaking philosophers that the earliest and most systematic pre-Williams “trope”-theories can be found (as argued by e.g., Mulligan et al. (1984: 293)). The clearest example of an early trope theorist of this variety is undoubtedly Edmund Husserl. In the third part of his Logical Investigations (2001 [1900/1913]), Husserl sets out his theory of “moments,” which is his name for the world's abstract (and essentially dependent) individual parts, in order to then clearly distinguish and relate them to the world's concrete parts using his theory of “foundations,” a species of the kind ontological dependence (for more on Husserl's version of the trope theory, see Correia 2004 and Beyer 2011).[2]

Husserl developed his version of the theory in a purely phenomenological framework. That is, he posited tropes as (one of) the fundamental constituents of phenomenal reality. This was also the setting for the trope-like entities posited by G. F. Stout (1921; 1952),[3] Roman Ingarden (1964 [1947–1948]), and Ivar Segelberg (1999 [1945, 1947, 1953]),[4] among others. Williams's own views are not so easily classified. Although he maintained that all our knowledge rests on perceptual experience, he agreed that it should not be limited to the perceptually given and that it could be extended beyond that by legitimate inference (see Campbell et al. 2013). That more or less all the post-Williams proponents of tropes treat their posits as the fundamental constituents of mind-independent, not phenomenal, reality, is however clear. In fact, several of the theory's proponents have emphasized not just that there is a distinction, but also that there may be a (radical) difference between reality as it appears to us, and reality as it is independently of how it appears, and they have then spent much time and effort trying to overcome the epistemological challenges their views would seem to entail (see e.g., Heil 2003).

After Williams, the second most influential trope theorist is arguably Keith Campbell (1997 [1981]; 1990). Campbell more or less adopted the basics of Williams's (standard) theory and then further developed and defended it. Later proponents of variants of the standard view include John Bacon (1995), Anna-Sofia Maurin (2002), and Douglas Ehring (2011) (although Ehring treats sameness of tropes in class-primitivist terms rather than in terms of resemblance classes (see section 3.1)). A very influential paper also arguing for a version of the standard view (although inspired more by Husserl than by Williams) is “Truth-Makers” (Mulligan et al. 1984). This paper defends the view that tropes are essentially dependent entities, the objects of perception, and the world's basic truthmakers. Proponents of trope theories which posit tropes as one of several fundamental categories include John Heil (2003) and George Molnar (2003), who both defend ontologies that include (but are not limited to) tropes understood as powers, and E. J. Lowe (2006), who counts tropes as one of four fundamental categories. Even more “unorthodox” are the views set forth by Arda Denkel (1996), who argues that tropes constitute a derived category because they must be bundled, and, not least, D. W. Mertz (1996), whose trope-like entities are categorized as a kind of relations.[5] We will return to the views expressed by all of these philosophers (and then some) in what follows.

2. The Nature of Tropes

To be a trope theorist you need not agree on much more than that there are tropes. But what, more precisely, does agreeing on this (admittedly minimal) thesis entail? What exists when tropes exist?

2.1 Property or Substance?

In philosophy, new posits are regularly introduced by being compared with, or likened to, an already familiar item. Tropes are no exception to this rule. In fact, tropes have been introduced by being compared with and likened to not one but two distinct but equally familiar kinds of things: the property and the substance. Consider the way Williams first introduces his fundamental posits (1997 [1953]: 113). Williams famously asks the reader to imagine a situation in which there are three distinct but similar lollipops. Each lollipop, more precisely, is partially similar to (and partially different from) each other lollipop. To say of any two things a and b that they are “partially similar,” we are told, is to say that a part of a is wholly similar to a part of b. And in this particular case, Williams tells us, the lollipops are partially similar at least because their sticks and shapes, unlike their colors and tastes, are wholly similar.

But what kinds of things are the shapes, colors and tastes of the lollipops, and how do they compare with such things as the lollipops themselves, their sticks, and their heads? Given the way things have been set up, these questions can now be given two seemingly very different answers. The individual shapes, colors and tastes of the lollipops, first, are the sorts of things that characterize lollipops, they are ways the lollipops are, they are properties the lollipops have. Under this view, the shapes, colors and tastes of lollipops are unlike their sticks and heads which do not likewise characterize lollipops, and they are unlike the lollipops themselves which do not characterize either their sticks and heads or anything else for that matter. Alternatively, the individual shapes, colors and tastes of the lollipops are the sorts of things of which lollipops are made up, they are the parts—the substances—of which the lollipops, their sticks, and their heads consist. Under this view, the shapes, colors and tastes of the lollipops are like the sticks and heads of lollipops, and they are like the lollipops themselves (which could, at least in theory, be parts of, and hence make up, some further thing). Williams himself seems to lean more towards viewing his posits as kinds of substances. Names for tropes, he claims, should not be understood as abbreviated definite descriptions of the kind “the ɸ-ness of x”. Instead, to name a trope should be likened with baptizing a child or with introducing a man “present in the flesh,” i.e., ostensively (Williams 1997 [1953]: 114). But opinions are clearly divided on this matter. Mulligan et al. (1984), who seem to regard their tropes more as kinds of properties, argue to the contrary that the correct (in fact the only) way to refer to tropes is precisely by way of expressions such as “the ɸ-ness of x” (or, possibly, “x’s ɸ-ness”). And this, they claim (again pace Williams), is because tropes are essentially of some object, because they are ways the objects are (for another expression of this view, see Heil 2003: 126f).

Does one's choice of model for the trope make more than a merely verbal difference to one's theory of tropes? This matter is very seldom explicitly discussed by the trope proponents (Bacon 1995, 1–2 represents one rare exception). Judging from what the trope-proponents do more than from what they say, the consensus seems to be that it does not. Rather, tropes are by their nature such that they can be adequately categorized both as a kind of property and as a kind of substance. That tropes can have this “double nature” has however been repeatedly questioned by a number of the theory's critics.

One such critic is Jerrold Levinson. In an early paper he points out that although objects can be said to have attributes both in the sense of properties and in the sense of what he calls qualities, having a property—being red—amounts to being in a certain condition whereas having a quality—redness—amounts to “partaking of a certain stuff”. And this, he claims, means that although qualities can be particularized, properties cannot. He argues: “[though] [o]ne can have a bit of redness here and a bit there,” one cannot have “a bit of being red here and another bit there—being red, a condition, is had by each object as a unity or not at all” (Levinson 1980: 107). Therefore, he concludes, tropes cannot be conceived of as a kind of property. More than twenty-five years later, Levinson returns to the question of the nature of the trope, but now in an even more pessimistic mood. As “the supposition of qualities, i.e., abstract stuffs as distinct from properties, i.e., conditions, is ontologically extravagant and conceptually outlandish,” he now argues, “one cannot seriously propose that there are abstract stuffs, things just like familiar material stuffs except that they are abstract” (Levinson 2006: 564). Therefore, tropes cannot be conceived of either as a kind of property or as a kind of quality (i.e., as a substance). But then tropes cannot be conceptualized, period. Therefore, Levinson concludes, there are no tropes.

The ambiguous way in which tropes are for the most part introduced is also criticized by Chrudzimski (2002). According to him, to conceptualize the trope as a property—as a way things are—means understanding it as an entity with a propositional structure (see Levinson 1980: 107 for a similar view). Not so if the trope is understood as a kind of substance. Thus understood, the trope is an unstructured, ontologically simple, entity. But this is problematic. For, Chrudzimski argues, although tropes understood as properties are suitable as semantically efficient truthmakers (in the sense imagined by Mulligan et al. 1984) the same is not true of tropes understood as substances. And, conversely, though tropes understood as substances are suitable candidates for being that from which both concrete particulars and abstract universals can be constructed (see section 3), tropes understood as properties are not. However we conceive of them, therefore, tropes are entities unable to play both of the roles their proponents have taken them to play, and this considerably diminishes the theory's appeal.

Now, both Levinson's and Chrudzimski's pessimistic conclusions can arguably be resisted. One reason for such resistance is that it is not clear why one cannot seriously propose that there can be “abstract stuffs.” Levinson offers us little more than an incredulous stare in defense of this conclusion, and incredulous stares are well-known for lacking the force to convince those not similarly incredulous. Another reason for resistance is that, in order for Chrudzimski's argument to go through, a rather substantial assumption about truthmaking needs to be accepted. We need to accept, that is, that in general, complex truths require complex (propositionally structured) truthmakers, and this is, as a matter of fact, not an assumption that most proponents of truthmaker theory are willing to accept (see e.g., Mulligan et al. 1984).

2.2 Complex or Simple?

As we have just seen, according to some critics of trope theory, to say of the trope that it is a kind of property is to impute in it a complex (propositional) structure. What exists when the trope picked out by the expression “the ɸ-ness of x” does, on this view, is the complex state of affairs that x is ɸ. More or less all trope proponents disagree. To conceptualize tropes as ways things are at most entails that tropes cannot exist except as one of the constituents of something complex: the state of affairs that x is ɸ. But that tropes are one of the constituents of a complex state of affairs does not make them complex. Tropes are still simple, not further ontologically analyzable, entities.[6]

So, tropes are simple. But if they are, Chris Daly (1997 [1994]) has argued, then there must be some reason for preferring a theory of simple tropes over a theory of complex states of affairs. More precisely, in order for trope theory to be justified, there must be something we can do, some problem we can solve, with the help of simple tropes that cannot be done or solved with the help of a substance/substrate exemplifying a universal. But, Daly claims, there isn't. Every reason we can think of for the existence of (simple) tropes is likewise a reason for the existence of (complex) states of affairs. But this means that there is no reason for thinking that there are tropes. Therefore, trope theory should be abandoned.

Not surprisingly, trope proponents disagree. If every reason to think that there are tropes is also a reason to think that there are states of affairs, first, then surely this does not mean that no reason exists for thinking that there are tropes. What we lack is at most a reason for preferring tropes over states of affairs. That we do have reason to prefer a theory of tropes over one of states of affairs should however be obvious. After all, trope theory is (or at least, it can be) a one-category theory, a theory of states of affairs—which posits the existence of substrates instantiating universals—is not. And one-category theories ought to be preferred over many-category theories for reasons of ontological parsimony. Also, states of affairs are partly constituted by what most proponents of tropes would call “mysterious” universals, entities able to, among other things, “fully” exist in more than one place at one moment in time. Tropes are not. And surely, what is less mysterious ought to be preferred over what is more mysterious? And so on. More importantly, trope-proponents have argued, it is far from clear that there are no explanatory tasks which can only be solved with recourse to (simple) tropes. In fact, arguments can be presented for why there are several explanatory tasks of this kind. The most common suggestions (including the sometimes heated debate they have occasioned) are set out in sections 3–4.[7]

According to a number of prominent trope critics, even if Daly's objection can be defused, trope theory is still in serious trouble (for different versions of this argument, see Armstrong 2005: 310; Brownstein 1973: 47; Hochberg 2001: 178–179 and 2004: 39; and Moreland 2001: 70). In Herbert Hochberg's words (2004: 39):

Let a basic proposition be one that is either atomic or the negation of an atomic proposition. Then consider tropes t and t* where “t is different from t*” and “t is exactly similar to t*” are both true. Assume you take either “diversity” or “identity” as primitive. Then both propositions are basic propositions. But they are logically independent. Hence, they cannot have the same truth makers. Yet, for…trope theory /…/ they do and must have the same truth makers. Thus the theory fails.

If tropes are simple, is the argument, then what makes it true that this shape-trope is exactly similar to that shape-trope must be the same thing as that which makes it true that they are distinct. But this violates what appears to be a truly fundamental principle, namely that logically independent basic propositions—in this case that t and t* are exactly similar and that t and t* are distinct—must have distinct truthmakers. Therefore, tropes cannot be simple.

This argument fails, a number of trope proponents have suggested, because what it at most manages to demonstrate, is that the trope theorist must deny that logically independent basic propositions have distinct truthmakers, not that this denial is impossible. Tropes can be simple. All the argument tells us is that, to hold that they are comes at a certain (theoretical) price. A price the trope proponent is willing to pay. The reason the argument fails, moreover, is that it misrepresents the truthmaker theory it assumes. According to truthmaker theory, the trope proponent points out, there is no one-one correlation between truths and that which makes them true (see Mulligan et al. 1984: 296). But this is the same as to say that, according to truthmaker theory, if two truths are (logically) distinct, it does not follow that their truthmakers are likewise (ontologically) distinct. But, of course, that it does is the assumption which drives the objection. Once this assumption is removed, therefore, the argument's conclusion no longer follows from its premises (for one example of this sort of defense, see Robb (as quoted in Armstrong 2005: 310)).[8]

2.3 Trope Individuation

Tropes may be individuated in at least three ways. First, they may be individuated with reference to the objects that “have” them:[9]

Object Individuation (OI):
For all tropes a and b such that a exactly resembles b, a = b iff a belongs to the same object as b does, and ab iff a belongs to an object that is distinct from the object to which b belongs.

A good thing about this way of individuating tropes is that it mirrors the way we normally refer to them (as e.g., “the shape of the lollipop” or as “Socrates' snubnosedness”). A not so good thing about it is that, for someone who thinks that objects are bundles of tropes (which is the standard trope-theoretical view of concrete particulars, see section 3.2), to individuate tropes with reference to the objects that “have” them is circular (see Schaffer 2001: 249 and Ehring 2011: 77). Of course, if the concrete particular is understood instead as a substrate in which a number of tropes are instantiated (a view proposed by Martin (1980) and by Heil (2003)) individuation can be non-circularly accounted for using OI. For in that case, the substrate will carry the individuating burden. Unfortunately, this leaves the individuation of the substrate still unaccounted for, and so we appear to have gotten nowhere (see Mertz 2001). For these reasons no trope theorist has explicitly endorsed OI.

Alternatively, tropes can be individuated with reference to their spatiotemporal position. Thus understood, trope individuation obeys the following principle (see Schaffer 2001: 249 and Campbell 1990: 53f.):

Spatiotemporal Individuation (SI):
For all tropes a and b such that a exactly resembles b, a = b iff a is at zero distance from b, and ab iff a is at non-zero distance from b.

Again, this is an account of trope individuation that accords well with the way tropes are normally picked out. It is also an account on which two arguably empty possibilities that the trope theorist would otherwise have to countenance—swapping and piling—are ruled out (what swapping and piling is, whether or not SI really does rule them out, and whether or not, if it does, this is such a good thing, will be discussed in the next section). In spite of this, the great majority of the trope theorists (Schaffer (2001) being one important exception) have opted instead for a primitivist principle of individuation (see Ehring 2011: 76 for alternative statements of this principle, see also Schaffer 2001: 248 and Campbell 1990: 69):

Primitivist Individuation (PI):
For all tropes a and b, a = b iff a = b, and ab iff ab.

More or less all arguments proposed in support of PI have—naturally enough—been arguments for why tropes ought not to be individuated with reference to their spatiotemporal position. According to what is probably the most influential such argument (an argument that changed Campbell's mind in favor of PI, see Campbell 1990: 55f., see also Moreland 1985: 65), SI should be rejected because if it is not, the (non-empty) possibility that reality (or parts of reality) could be non-spatiotemporal is ruled out from the outset.[10] Proponents of SI remain unimpressed. True, if SI is accepted, the trope theorist must deny that reality could be non-spatiotemporal. But this, they argue, is not really a problem as long as the claim that reality is necessarily spatiotemporal can be independently justified. And it can be.[11] On the other hand, if PI (but not SI) is accepted, the trope theorist must accept the phenomena of “swapping” and “piling”. That these are empty possibilities can however be easily demonstrated. Therefore, SI and not PI ought to be adopted as the most plausible principle of individuation. In the next section, the debate to which this and related claims (about swapping and piling, but also about the related phenomena of sliding, pyramiding, and stacking) has given rise is set out.

2.4 Swapping, Piling, and Sliding

According to the so-called “swapping argument” (first formulated in Armstrong 1989: 131–132, see also Schaffer 2001: 250f; Ehring 2011: 78f.), if properties are tropes, two distinct yet exactly similar tropes might swap places (this redness here might have been there, and vice versa). The result, post-swap, would then be a situation which is ontologically distinct from that pre-swap. But as the swap makes no detectable difference in the world, empirically/causally the pre- and post-swap situations would nevertheless be the same (see LaBossiere 1993: 262, for an argument to the contrary). But then, if we accept the (arguably reasonable) Eleatic principle according to which only changes that matter empirically/causally count as genuine, trope-swapping is ruled out. Therefore, trope theory should be rejected. This objection can be put either in terms of object swapping (the two tropes swap object), or in terms of position swapping (the two tropes swap position). Armstrong formulates the objection in terms of object swapping, but, as Ehring has pointed out (2011: 79), the objection is strengthened if formulated in terms of position. For, to rule out object swapping, all you need to do is add that tropes are “non-transferable” in the sense that they must belong to some specific object. But this does not solve the problem with position swapping. For, even if tropes are non-transferable, two exactly similar objects, including the tropes they “have”, could still swap position with the same presumably problematic result.

Appearances perhaps to the contrary, to accept SI does not immediately block either object- or positional trope swapping (Schaffer 2001: 250). For, as stated, SI is a principle about trope individuation that holds intra-worldly: within any given world, no two exactly similar tropes are at zero distance from each other. Swapping, on the other hand, concerns what is possibly true (or not) of exactly similar tropes considered inter-worldly. As stated, therefore, SI neither does nor doesn't preclude swapping. That is all very well, as there is one distinct possibility that it would be unfortunate if our principle of individuation did block, namely the possibility—called sliding—that this red-trope here could have been there had the wind blown differently (Schaffer 2001: 251). To get the desired result (i.e., to block swapping while allowing for sliding), Schaffer has therefore suggested, trope theory ought to be combined, not just with SI, but also with a Lewisian counterpart theory of transworld identity (see Lewis 1986). The result would then be an account of trope individuation according to which exactly resembling tropes are intra-worldly identical if they inhabit the same position in space-time, and according to which they are inter-worldly counterparts, if they are distinct, yet stand in sufficiently similar distance- and other types of relations to their respective (intra-worldly) neighbors. With this addition in place, Schaffer claims, sliding is made possible, because (2001: 253):

On the counterfactual supposition of a shift in wind, what results is a redness exactly like the actual one, which is in perfectly isomorphic resemblance relations to its worldmates as the actual one is to its worldmates, with just a slight difference in distance with respect to, e.g., the roundness of the moon.

Yet swapping is disallowed. Because,

…the nearest relative of the redness of the rose which is here at our world would be the redness still here ‘post-swap’. The redness which would be here has exactly the same inter- and intraworld resemblance relations as the redness which actually is here, and the same distance relations, and hence is a better counterpart than the redness which would be there.

Against Schaffer's suggestion it has been argued that, although combining your views with a Lewisian counterpart theory does solve the swapping problem, it does not provide you with a reason for preferring SI over PI. For, PI combined with a Lewisian counterpart theory also prevents swapping. It is, in other words, the counterpart theory, and not SI (or PI), which does all the work. More interestingly, it is not clear that swapping ought to be ruled out after all. For, according to Ehring, there are circumstances in which a series of slidings constitute one case of swapping. Therefore, if sliding is possible (which it certainly seems to be), so is swapping (Ehring 2011: 81–85).

Now, even if swapping does not give us a reason to prefer SI over PI, perhaps its close cousin “piling” does. Consider a particular red rose. Given trope theory, this rose is red because it is partly constituted by a redness-trope. But what is to prevent more than one—even indefinitely many—exactly similar red-tropes from thus partly constituting this rose? If properties are tropes, the objection goes: nothing. Now, the existence of indefinitely many exactly similar red-tropes piled on top of the original one, makes no empirical/causal difference to the world. Given a (plausible) Eleatic principle, therefore, the possibility of piling is empty. Therefore, trope theory ought to be rejected (this argument was first formulated in Armstrong 1978: 86; see also Simons 1994: 558; and Schaffer 2001: 254, fn. 11).

Now, if tropes are individuated with reference to their spatiotemporal position—if SI is accepted—the possibility of piling is immediately blocked. That this should be taken to count in favor of SI has however been questioned. For, again according to Ehring (2011: 87ff.), as there is a kind of piling—“pyramiding”—that does represent a genuine possibility, the possibility of piling in general ought not to be ruled out. To the contrary, the fact that SI rules out piling (and thereby pyramiding) is a reason to adopt PI. Against this, Schaffer has argued that although pyramiding (an example being a 5kg object consisting of five 1kg tropes) is not as clearly objectionable as more problematic kinds of piling (called “stacking”) it ought nevertheless to be rejected. Most importantly, this is because pyramiding faces a serious problem with predication: if admitted, it will be true of the 5kg object that “It has the property of weighing 1kg” (Schaffer 2001: 254). Against this, Ehring has pointed out that to say truly of the 5kg object that “It has the property of weighing 1kg” is at most pragmatically odd, and that, even if this oddness is regarded as unacceptable, to avoid it would not require the considerable complication of one's theory of predication imagined by Schaffer (Ehring 2011: 88–91). Neither swapping nor piling therefore turn out to be the “kiss of death” they are presented as being by the foes of trope theory. Nor, it seems, does their possibility (or not) give us strong reasons to prefer one principle of individuation over another.

3. Tropes as Building Blocks

As we have seen, tropes can be conceptualized, not just as particularized ways things are, but also, and on some versions of the trope theory, primarily, as that out of which everything else is constructed (see section 2.1). Thus conceived, it has been argued, tropes must be able to fulfill at least two important constructive tasks: that of making up (the equivalent of) the realist's universal, and that of making up (the equivalent of) the nominalist's concrete particular. But the attempt to fulfill either of these tasks, critics claim, leads to trouble. Most problematically, it has been repeatedly suggested, both kinds of construction lead to the generation of an infinite regress. Whether or not they do, and whether or not, if they do, this regress is vicious, has been the topic of much debate. In the following two sections, this debate is summarized.

3.1 Tropes and Universals

How can distinct things have one thing in common? This is the problem of “the One over Many” (see Rodriguez-Pereyra 2000). Universals provide a straightforward solution to this problem: Distinct things can have one thing in common, because there is one thing—the universal—which characterizes each of them individually. The trope theorist—at least the trope theorist who does not accept the existence of universals in addition to tropes[12]—does not have recourse to entities that can be likewise identical in distinct instances, and must therefore come up with a slightly more complicated solution to this problem. She must “build” something able to do the same problem-solving work the universal does, using only her abstract particulars.

The standard solution (i.e., the solution proposed by the majority of the trope theorists) is to say that distinct objects “share” a property if (some of) the tropes characterizing each of them individually exactly resemble each other (see Williams 1997 [1953]: 117–118; and Campbell 1990: 31f).[13] But what does this entail, ontologically speaking? What exists when distinct tropes exactly resemble each other? Two different answers have been proposed.[14] Either, what exists is nothing but the resembling tropes themselves, or it is those same tropes plus a (trope-)relation of exact resemblance. Both suggestions have been rejected by the theory's critics.

The most convincing reason for thinking that nothing but the resembling tropes is needed to account for trope resemblance is provided by (one aspect of) the nature of exact resemblance itself. Exact resemblance is an internal relation; it supervenes on whatever it relates. Once the resembling tropes exist, therefore, so must their exact resemblance. But then, given a “sparse” ontology—an ontology according to which only what is minimally required to make true all truths exists—we have no reason to posit exact resemblance in addition to its relata (for more on what makes something a “sparse” ontology, see Schaffer 2004). Sparse ontologies can be independently justified (see Armstrong 1978 for a classic defense). Therefore, what exists when distinct tropes exactly resemble each other—and so what plays the role of the realist's universal—is nothing but the resembling tropes themselves (this view has been defended in e.g., Campbell 1990: 37f.; and in Williams 1963: 608). In Armstrong's words (1989: 56)):[15]

…exact resemblance is an ontological free lunch. The truth-maker, the ontological ground, that in the world which makes it true that the tie holds, is simply the resembling things. More precisely … the ontological ground is the particularized nature of these things. The tie is not something extra.

Alternatively, exact resemblance has been regarded as a (relation-)trope, and hence as an addition to the tropes it relates. The main problem with this view is that it appears to gives rise to a version of Russell's famous resemblance regress (first formulated in his 1997 [1912]: 48, see also Küng 1967). In Daly's words (1997 [1994]: 149):

Consider three concrete particulars which are the same shade of red … each of these concrete particulars has a red trope—call these tropes F, G, and H—and these concrete particulars exactly resemble each other in colour because F, G, and H exactly resemble each other in colour. But it seems that this account is incomplete. It seems that the account should further claim that resemblance tropes hold between F, G, and H. That is, it seems that there are resemblance tropes holding between the members of the pairs F and G, G and H, and F and H … Let us call the resemblance tropes in question R1, R2, and R3 … each of these resemblance tropes in turn exactly resemble each other. Therefore, certain resemblance tropes hold between these tropes … we are launched on a regress.

This regress is a problem only if it is a vicious regress. But, it has been suggested, at least two reasons exist for thinking that it is not. According to Campbell, first, the regress is benign because “[i]t proceeds in a direction of greater and greater formality and less and less substance” (1990: 35–36). This is not a very good reason for thinking that the regress is unproblematic, however. It is hard to see why there should be any difference in “substance” between the resemblances added at different stages of the regress. In fact, it is hard to understand what such a difference in “substance” would amount to in the first place (Daly 1997 [1994]: 151–152). A more convincing reason for thinking that the regress is benign is given instead by the “pattern of dependence” it instantiates. For, even those who do not think that the internality of exact resemblance makes it a mere “pseudo-addition” to its subvenient base, agree that resemblance, whatever it is, is such that its existence is necessarily incurred simply given the existence of its relata. But then, no matter how many resemblances we regressively generate, ultimately they will all depend for their existence on the existence of the resembling tropes, which will resemble each other because of their individual nature, which is primitive. This means that the existence of the regress in no way contradicts—it does not function as a reductio against—the resemblance of the original tropes. On the contrary, it is because the tropes resemble each other, that the regress exists. Therefore, the regress is benign (see e.g., Campbell 1990: 37; Maurin 2002: 78ff).

This response will only work if the nature of individual tropes—their being what they are—is primitive and not further analyzable (i.e., it will only work if we assume the standard view of the nature of tropes). To see this, suppose instead that the nature of the trope is understood in terms of the trope's resemblance to other tropes (suppose, that is, that a resemblance nominalism of the kind defended for ordinary concrete particulars in Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002 is accepted). Given a resemblance nominalism of this kind, the pattern of dependence instantiated by the resemblance regress will be quite different from the pattern it instantiates if the nature of the tropes is taken as primitive. For now the tropes will resemble each other, not because of their primitive nature, but because of the (1st order) resemblance-trope which holds between them. And this (1st order) resemblance-trope will, in turn, have its nature determined by the existence of the (2nd order) resemblance-relations in which it stands to other (resemblance-)tropes, and so on, ad infinitum. On this view, therefore, the existence of the regress would contradict—and hence function as a reductio against—the resemblance of the original tropes. Perhaps for that reason, resemblance nominalism has no explicit proponents among the trope theorists.

A radical option, finally, is to simply opt out of the “resemblance game.” For, if resemblance is out of the picture then, clearly, so is the resemblance regress. One such alternative is provided by Ehring (2011: 175ff). According to Ehring, the trope is not what it is either primitively or because of whatever resemblance relations it stands in to other tropes. Rather, it is what it is, because of the natural classes to which it belongs. Distinct objects “share” a property, moreover, if the tropes which partly constitute them are members of the same natural class. Why do the tropes belong to the same natural class? They belong because they belong. It is primitive. But now, critics complain, the order of explanation is implausibly turned on its head. Tropes do not get sorted into natural classes in virtue of their nature, instead they have the nature they do because they belong to this or that natural class. Many find that this is a high price to pay for avoiding the resemblance regress, and the view has few proponents.

3.2 Tropes and Concrete Particulars

The second constructive task facing the trope theorist is that of building something that “behaves” like a concrete particular does, using only tropes. Exactly how a concrete particular behaves is of course a matter that can be debated. This is not a debate to which the trope theorist has had very much, or at least not anything very original, to contribute. Instead, the trope theoretical discussion has been focused on an issue that arguably needs solving before questions concerning what the concrete particular can or cannot do become relevant. The trope theoretical discussion, more precisely, has been focused on the issue of if and how concrete particulars can be made up from tropes in the first place.

According to the “standard” view, endorsed by the majority of the trope theorists, concrete particulars are (structured or unstructured) bundles of tropes. More precisely, a concrete particular consists of a sufficient number of mutually compresent tropes. What is a sufficient number? The admittedly not very informative answer that has been given to this question is that a sufficient number is the number of tropes it takes to turn the many abstract tropes into one concrete whole (it is the number of tropes required to make every need for completion satisfied within the whole, in order to, in Husserl's colorful terms, turn it into a “pregnant whole” ready to give birth to an independent substance (Husserl 2001 [1900/1913])).

What is compresence? When the same question was asked about exact resemblance, the trope theorist had the option of treating the relation either as a real or as a “pseudo” addition to the resembling tropes (see section 3.1). The reason why exact resemblance could be treated as a mere “pseudo” addition, moreover, was that it is an internal relation and so exists necessarily simply given the existence of its relata.

Suppose that compresence is likewise internal. Then the tropes it relates could not not be compresent. In fact, they—provided that they all exist—could not not be compresent with each other.[16] However, that the tropes that now make up a certain concrete particular could exist and not make up that concrete particular seems to be genuinely possible. Therefore, it has been argued, compresence must be regarded as an external relation and, as such, a “real” addition to the tropes it relates.

Just as in the case of resemblance, however, if compresence is a real addition to the tropes it relates, there will be an infinite regress. This regress is often referred to as the “Bradley regress” (after the regress set out in Bradley 1930 [1893]) and it—as well as its possible solutions—has received a lot of attention in the literature (for an overview see Maurin 2012; see also Armstrong 1978; Vallicella 2002 and 2005; Schnieder 2004; and Cameron 2008). One interesting thing about this regress is that it seems to be a problem not just for the trope theorist who holds that concrete particulars are bundles of tropes, but also for the trope theorist who thinks that the concrete particular is a substrate in which a (sufficient) number of tropes are instantiated (a view proposed in Martin 1980; Heil 2003; and Lowe 2006). And it seems to be a problem for those who think that concrete particulars are bundles of universals and for those who believe that they are substrates in which a (sufficient) number of universals are instantiated. In fact, according to Bradley, this is a problem for any view according to which there can be any kind of unity in complexity.

This regress is arguably vicious. The “pattern of dependence” it instantiates is the opposite of that instantiated by the resemblance regress. In the resemblance case, in order for tropes t1, t2, and t3 to exactly resemble each other, what is required is that they exist. Given their (primitively natured) existence, and given that exact resemblance is treated as a real ontological addition (which it arguably doesn't have to be), an infinity of resemblance-tropes can be generated. In the compresence case, on the other hand, tropes t1, t2, and t3 are compresent only given that a relation-trope c1 is added to the bundle. And c1 only turns what are many tropes into one concrete particular given the addition of a (2nd order) relation-trope c2 holding between it and the rest of the tropes in the bundle. But then c2 needs something to tie it to c1. Enter c3. And so on. The existence of this regress arguably contradicts—and hence functions as a reductio against—the compresence of the original tropes in the bundle and, thereby, the (possible) existence of the concrete particular.

Since concrete particulars (possibly) exist, something must be wrong with this argument. But what? One option is to question the externality of compresence, and hold that it is internal after all. This view has been defended primarily by those who think of tropes as a kind of property (see Molnar 2003; Heil 2003 and 2012; see also Armstrong 2006). For, if tropes are ways things are, they are “non-transferable”. But if tropes are “non-transferable”, it is argued, compresence is an internal relation. And, if compresence is internal, then the pattern of dependence instantiated by the regress to which it gives rise is benign. Problem solved. Against this view it may however be objected that if you think of tropes as ways things are, this at most gives you a reason to think that tropes must belong to some object. However, in order to solve the regress problem, tropes must be “non-transferable” in the much stronger sense that they must belong to a specific object. And, critics claim, the only reason for accepting that tropes are “non-transferable” in this strong sense, is that it solves the regress problem. But this means that this is a “solution” which cannot be independently justified (for an account of the different senses of “non-transferable”, see Cameron 2006; see also Maurin 2010).

Or we could do as Peter Simons has suggested (in Simons 1994; see also Keinänen 2011; and Keinänen and Hakkarinen 2013), and view the concrete particular as constituted, partly by a “nucleus” made up from mutually and individually (i.e., internally) dependent tropes, and partly (at least in the normal case) by a “halo” made up from tropes which depend for their existence on the existence of the (individual tropes in the) nucleus, although the (tropes in the) nucleus at most depends for its existence on the existence of tropes of the same kind as the ones now in its halo. This view arguably gives the proponent of the bundle theory all the benefits of a substrate-attribute view, without the embarrassment of having to accept the existence of mysterious substrates. Even better, no regress is generated. The tropes in the nucleus, first, are internally unified, and so nothing needs to be added in order to bring them together. And the tropes in the halo depend specifically on the (individual tropes in the) nucleus, which means that their existence is enough to guarantee the existence of the whole to which they belong. The problem with this view is that, once again, the possibility that the tropes in the halo could exist and not be joined to this particular nucleus is ruled out with no (independent) justification.

According to a number of between themselves very different sorts of trope theorists, therefore, we should stop bothering with the (nature and dependence of the) related tropes, and investigate instead the (special) nature of compresence itself. This seems intuitive enough. After all, is it not the business of a relation to relate? According to one suggestion along these lines (defended in Maurin 2010 and 2011; and Wieland and Betti 2008; see also Robb 2005 and Mertz 1996 for similar views), non-relational tropes have an existence that is independent of the existence of some specific—either non-relational or relational—trope, but relational tropes (including compresence) depend specifically for their existence on the very tropes they relate. This means that, if c1 exists, it must relate the tropes t1, t2, t3 it in fact relates, even though, from the existence of tropes t1, t2, and t3, it doesn't follow that they are compresent. There is, then, no regress and except for c1, the tropes involved in constituting the concrete particular could exist without being compresent with each other. That the compresence trope is an exception could be seen as acceptable since compresence played no role when our modal intuitions about (the constituents of) concrete particulars were first formed.[17]

According to Mertz (see also Maurin 2011), on this view of compresence the Bradley regress turns into an argument for the existence of tropes (over, or in addition to, other kinds of entities). To be able to do the unifying work for which it is introduced, compresence cannot be a universal. For, if it were, then if one of the concrete particulars whose constituents it joins cease to exist, so will every other concrete particular unified by the same (universal) relation of compresence. But, as Mertz points out, “this is absurdly counterfactual!” (Mertz 1996: 190). Nor could it be a state of affairs. For, states of affairs are in themselves complexes, and so could not be used to solve the Bradley problem. If anything, they are part of the problem, not the solution.[18]

4. Trope Applications

If you accept the existence of at least some tropes, it has been repeatedly argued, you have the means available to solve or to dissolve a number of serious problems, not just in metaphysics but in philosophy generally. In what follows, the most common trope-applications proposed in the literature are very briefly introduced.

4.1 Tropes and Causation

According to a majority of the trope theorists, tropes have an important role to play in causation. It is, after all, not the whole stove that burns you, it is its temperature that does the damage. And it is not any temperature, nor temperature in general, which leaves a red mark. That mark is left by the particular temperature had by this particular stove now or, in other words, it is left by the stove's temperature-trope. Claims like these are quite common in the trope literature (see e.g., Williams 1997 [1953]; and Campbell 1990), although, to find those claims further elaborated is more rare (for exceptions, see Denkel 1996; Molnar 2003; and Heil 2003).

That tropes can play a role in causation can hardly be doubted. But can this role also provide the trope-proponent with a reason to think that tropes exist? No, critics have argued. The role tropes (can) play in causation does not provide the trope proponent with any special reason to prefer an ontology of tropes over alternative ontologies. More precisely, it does not give her any special reason to prefer an ontology of tropes over one of states of affairs. Just like tropes, the state of affairs is particular. Just like tropes, it is localized. And, just like tropes, it is non-repeatable (although it contains a repeatable item—the universal—as one of its constituents). Every reason for thinking that tropes are the world's basic causal relata is therefore also a reason to think that this role is played by states of affairs.

According to Ehring, this is not true. To see why not, he asks us to consider the following simple scenario: a property-instance at t1 is causally responsible for an instance of the same property at t2. This is a case of (singularist) causation which is also a case of property persistence. But what does property persistence involve? According to Ehring, property persistence is not just a matter of something not changing its properties. For, even in cases where nothing discernibly changes, the property instantiated at t1 could nevertheless have been replaced by another property of the same type during the period between t1 and t2. In order to be able to ontologically explain the scenario set out above, therefore, we first need an account of property persistence able to distinguish “true” property persistence from cases of “non-salient property change” or what may also be called property type persistence. But, Ehring claims, this is something a theory according to which property instances are states of affairs cannot do (this is demonstrated with the help of a number of thought experiments, which space does not allow me to reproduce here, but see Ehring 1997: 91ff). Therefore, causation, and especially property persistence, gives us a special reason to think that tropes exist (for more reasons to prefer tropes as causal relata, see Garcia-Encinas 2009).

4.2 Tropes and Issues in the Philosophy of Mind

Not surprisingly, those who think that tropes play the role of causal relata and of causal mechanisms in causation generally also believe that they play that role in mental physical causal transactions specifically. But you do not have to think that tropes are the world's basic causal relata in order to believe that they have a role to play in this context. To see this, suppose Lisa burns herself on the hot stove. One of the causal transactions that then follow can be described thus: Lisa removed her hand from the stove because she felt pain. This is a description which seems to pick out ‘being in pain’ as one causally relevant property of the cause. That ‘being in pain’ is a causally relevant property accords well with our intuitions. However, to say it is leads to trouble. The reason for this is that mental properties, like that of ‘being in pain’, can be realized by physically very different systems. Therefore, mental properties cannot be identified with physical ones. On the other hand, we seem to live in a physically closed and causally non-overdetermined universe. But this means that, contrary to what we have supposed so far, Lisa did not remover her hand because she felt pain. In general, it means that mental properties are not causally relevant, however much they seem to be.

But if properties are tropes, some trope theorists have proposed, this conclusion can be resisted (see Robb 1997; Martin and Heil 1999; and Heil and Robb 2003; for a hybrid version see Nanay 2009; see also Gozzano and Orilia 2008). To see this, we need first to disambiguate our notion of a “property”. This notion, it is argued, is really two notions, namely:

  • Property1 = that which imparts on an individual thing its particular nature (property as token), and
  • Property2 = that which makes distinct things the same (property as type).

Once “property” is disambiguated, we can see how mental properties can be causally relevant after all. For then, if mental properties1 are tropes, they can be identified with physical properties1. Mental properties2 can still be distinguished from physical properties2, for properties considered as types are, in line with the standard view of tropes, identified with similarity classes of tropes (see section 3.1). When Lisa removes her hand from the stove because she feels pain, therefore, she removes her hand in virtue of something that is partly characterized by a trope which is such that it belongs to a class of mentally similar tropes. This trope is identical with a physical trope—it is both mental and physical—because it also belongs to a (distinct) similarity class of physically similar tropes. Therefore, mental properties can be causally relevant in spite of the fact that the mental is multiply realizable by the physical, and in spite of the fact that we live in a physically closed and non-overdetermined universe.

This suggestion has been criticized. According to Noordhof (1998: 223) it fails because it does not respect the “bulge in the carpet constraint.” And it does not respect that constraint because now, the question which was ambiguously asked about properties, can be unambiguously asked about tropes: is it in virtue of being mental or in virtue of being physical that the trope is causally relevant for the effect (for a response, see Robb 2001; and Ehring 2003)? And Gibb (2004) has complained that the trope's simple and primitive nature makes it unsuitable for membership in two such distinct and radically different classes as that of the mentally and of the physically similar tropes, respectively (for more reasons against the trope-theoretical suggestion see MacDonald and MacDonald 2006).

4.3 Tropes and Perception

Another important reason for thinking that tropes exist, it has been proposed, is the role tropes play in perception. That what we perceive are the qualities of the things rather than the things themselves, first, seems plausible (for various claims to this effect, see Williams 1997 [1953]: 123; and Campbell 1997 [1981]: 130). And that the qualities we perceive are tropes rather than universals or instantiations of universals (states of affairs) is, according to Lowe, a matter that can be determined with reference to our experience. Lowe argues (1998: 205) (see also, Lowe 2008; Mulligan 1999):

[W]hen I see the leaf change in colour—perhaps as it turned brown by a flame—I seem to see something cease to exist in the location of the leaf, namely its greenness. But it could not be the universal greenness which ceases to exist. My opponent must say that really what I see is not something ceasing to exist, but merely the leaf's ceasing to instantiate greenness, or greenness ceasing to be ‘wholly present’ just here. I can only say that the suggestion strikes me as being quite false to the phenomenology of perception. The objects of perception seem, one and all, to be particulars—and, indeed, a causal theory of perception (which I myself favour) would appear to require this, since particulars alone seem capable of entering into causal relations.

A similar view is put forth by Mulligan et al. They argue (1984: 300):

…whoever wishes to reject moments [i.e., tropes] must of course give an account of those cases where we seem to see and hear them, cases we report using definite descriptions such as ‘the smile that just appeared on Rupert's face’. This means that he must claim that in such circumstances we see not just independent things per se, but also things as falling under certain concepts or as exemplifying certain universals. On some accounts (Bergmann, Grossman) it is even claimed that we see the universal in the thing. But the friend of moments finds this counterintuitive. When we see Rupert's smile, we see something just as spatiotemporal as Rupert himself, and not something as absurd as a spatio-temporal entity that somehow contains a concept or a universal.

But, a critic may object, these are not very strong reasons for thinking that it is tropes and not states of affairs that we perceive. For the view that our perception of a trope is not only distinct, but also phenomenologically distinguishable, from our perception of a state of affairs seems grounded in little more than its proponent's introspective intuitions. Especially if tropes are ways things are (a view held by both Lowe and Mulligan et al.), these intuitions seem to be very fragile (see also Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002: 93–94). For more ways in which tropes have been taken to make a difference to (our theory of) perception, see Nanay 2012 and Almäng 2013.

4.4 Tropes and Semantics

That language furnishes the trope theorist with solid reasons for thinking that there are tropes has been indicated by a number of trope theorists and it has also been forcefully argued, especially by Friederike Moltmann in a number of papers (see also Mertz 1996: 3–6). Taking Mulligan et al. 1984 as her point of departure, Moltmann argues that natural language contains a number of phenomena whose semantic treatment is best spelled out in terms of an ontology that includes tropes.

Nominalizations, first, may seem to point in the opposite direction. For, in the classical discussion of properties, the nominalization of predicates such as is wise into nouns fit to refer, has been taken to count in favor of universal realism. A sub-class of nominalizations—such as John's wisdom—can, however, be taken to speak in favor of the existence of tropes. This is the sort of nominalizations which, as Moltmann puts it, “introduce ‘new’ objects, but only partially characterize them” (2007: 363). That these sorts of nominalizations refer to tropes rather than to states of affairs, she argues, can be seen once we consider the vast range of adjectival modifiers they allow for, modifiers only tropes and not states of affairs can be the recipients of (see especially Moltmann 2009: 62–63; see also Moltmann 2003).

Bare demonstratives, next, especially as they occur in so-called identificational sentences, provide another reason for thinking that tropes exist (Moltmann 2013). In combination with the preposition like—as in Turquoise looks like that—they straightforwardly refer to tropes. But even in cases where they arguably do not refer to tropes, tropes nevertheless contribute to the semantics of sentences in which they figure. In particular, tropes contribute to the meaning of so-called identificational sentences like ‘This is Mary’ or ‘That is a beautiful woman’. These are no ordinary identity statements. What makes them stand out is the exceptional neutrality of the demonstratives in subject position. According to Moltmann, these sentences are best understood in such a way that the bare demonstratives that figure in them do not refer to individuals (like Mary), but rather to perceptual features (tropes) in the situation at hand (a view that depends on taking tropes as the objects of perception, see section 4.3). Identificational sentences, she claims, involve precisely the identification of a bearer of a trope via the denotation (if not reference) of a (perceptual) trope.

Comparatives—like John is happier than Mary—finally, are according to the received view, such that they refer to abstract objects that form a total ordering (so-called degrees). According to Moltmann, a better way to understand these sorts of sentences is with reference to tropes. John is happier than Mary should hence be understood as John's happiness exceeds Mary's happiness. This view is according to Moltmann preferable to the standard view, because tropes are easier to live with than “abstract, rarely explicit entities such as degrees or sets of degrees” (Moltmann 2009: 64).

4.5 Tropes in Science

Discussions of what use can be made of tropes in science can be found scattered in the literature. Examples include Harré's 2009 discussion of the role tropes play (and don't play) in chemistry and Nanay's 2010 attempt to use tropes to improve on Ernst Mayr's “population thinking” in biology. Most discussions have however been focused on the relationship between tropes and physics (see e.g., Kuhlmann et al. 2002). Most influential in this respect is Campbell's field-theory of tropes (defended in his 1990: chapter 6; see also Von Wachter 2000) and Simons' “nuclear” theory of tropes and the scientific use he tentatively makes of it (Simons 1994; see also Morganti 2009; and Wayne 2008).

According to Campbell, the world is constituted by a rather limited number of field tropes which, according to our (current) best science, ought to be identified with the fields of gravitation, electromagnetism, and the weak and strong nuclear forces (plus a space-time field). Standardly, these forces are understood as exerted by bodies that are not themselves fields. Not so on Campbell's view. Instead, matter is thought of as spread out and as present in various strengths across a region without any sharp boundaries to its location. What parts of the mass field we choose to focus on will be to a certain degree arbitrary. A zone in which several fields all sharply increase their intensity will likely be taken as one single entity or particle but given the overall framework, individuals of this kind are to be viewed as “well-founded appearances” (Campbell 1990: 151).

Campbell's views have been criticized, among others by Schneider (2006). According to Schneider, the field ontology proposed by Campbell (and by Von Wachter) fails, because the notion of a field with which they seem to be working, is not mathematically rigorous.[19] Morganti who, just like Campbell, wants to identify the tropes with actual entities described by quantum physics, finds several problems with the identifications actually made by Campbell, and proposes instead that we follow Simons and identify the basic constituents of reality with the fundamental particles, where the basic particles are understood as bundles of tropes (Morganti 2009). By taking the basic properties described by the Standard Model as fundamental tropes, is the suggestion, the constitution of particles out of more elementary constituents can be readily reconstructed (possibly by using the formal sheaf-theoretical framework proposed by Mormann 1995, or the algebraic framework suggested by Fuhrmann 1991).

4.6 Tropes and Issues in Moral Philosophy

Relatively little has so far been written on the topic of tropes in relation to issues in moral philosophy and value theory. Two things have however been argued. First, that tropes (and not, as is more commonly supposed, objects or persons or states of affairs) are the bearers of final value. Second, that moral non-naturalists (who hold that moral facts are fundamentally autonomous from natural, or scientific, facts) must regard properties as tropes in order to be able to account for the supervenience of the moral on the natural. That tropes are the bearers of (final) value has been argued by a number or trope theorists. To say that what we value are the particular properties of things, they have pointed out, is prima facie intuitive (see Williams 1997 [1953]: 123). Also, whereas concrete particulars can be the simultaneous subjects of conflicting evaluations, this is not true of tropes, which would seem to make tropes especially suited for the job as value-bearers (Campbell 1997 [1981]: 130-131). Although seemingly attractive, the view that tropes are the bearers of (final) value has received surprisingly little attention in the (non-trope theoretical) value-theoretical community. Two exceptions to this rule are Rabinowicz and Rønnow-Rasmussen 2003 and Olson 2003. According to Rabinowicz and Rønnow-Rasmussen, first, though tropes can be the bearers of final value, they cannot be the only such bearers, mainly because different pro-attitudes are fitting with respect to different kinds of valuable objects. But, Olson responds, this conclusion follows only if we assume that, to what we direct our evaluative attitude is indicative of where value is localized. But final value, Olson argues, should be understood strictly as the value which something has for its own sake, which means that if e.g., a person is valuable because of her courage, then she is not valuable for her own sake but is valuable, rather, for the sake of one of her properties (i.e., her tropes), which means that although the evaluative attitude may well be directed at a person or a thing, the person or thing is nevertheless valued because of, or for the sake of, the tropes which characterize it.

Non-naturalists, next, are often charged with not being able to explain what appears to be a necessary dependence of moral facts on natural facts. Normally, this dependence is explained in terms of supervenience, but in order for such an account to be compatible with the basic tenets of moral non-naturalism, it has been argued, this supervenience must, in turn, be explainable in purely non-naturalistic terms (for an overview of this debate, see Ridge 2010). According to Shafer-Landau (2003) (as interpreted by Ridge (2007)) this problem is solved if moral and physical properties in the sense of kinds, are distinguished from moral and physical properties in the sense of tokens, or tropes. For then we can say, in analogy with what has been suggested in the mental-physical case (see section 4.2), that although (necessarily) every moral trope is constituted by some concatenation of natural tropes, it does not follow from this that every moral type is identical to a natural type. This suggestion is criticized in Ridge 2007.

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categories | causation: causal processes | causation: the metaphysics of | Husserl, Edmund | Ingarden, Roman | mental causation | moral non-naturalism | nominalism: in metaphysics | properties | quantum theory: quantum field theory | states of affairs | Williams, Donald Cary

Acknowledgments

A very special thanks to Johan Brännmark whose invaluable help in all matters—theoretical, practical, or (not least) emotional —I could not live without.

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Anna-Sofia Maurin <Anna-Sofia.Maurin@gu.se>

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