Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Continental Feminism

First published Fri Aug 5, 2005

Continental feminists ground their explorations of sex, gender, and the inequalities related to both in the European philosophical traditions that emerged after Kant and throughout the twentieth century, particularly phenomenology, existentialism, deconstructionism, and psychoanalytic theory. Although such feminists are acutely aware of the male bias that runs strongly through these traditions, they also find them useful tools for articulating the depth and structure of women's lived experiences within a patriarchal society.

1. The Continental Tradition

Continental feminism finds its roots in the various philosophical movements and schools that emerged from France and Germany in the decades and centuries following the work of Immanuel Kant. From the dialectic materialism of Hegel to the deconstructionism of Jacques Derrida, these traditions distinguished themselves from the Anglo-American schools of analytic thought in both their content and their methodologies. In many ways, the emergence of the continental tradition was the result of an attempt to recover from Kant's fundamental challenge to philosophy: that logic and reason were limited tools, incapable of answering definitively some of the metaphysical questions that had dominated philosophical inquiries for centuries (for example, the existence of God and the true nature of beings). Rather than remaining wedded to the dictates of logic as traditionally understood, these French and German theorists problematized reason itself. Hegel, in his development of dialectical reasoning, undermined the very assumptions of Aristotelian logic, and posited contradictions not as roadblocks to philosophy, but rather as the very engines of both thought and history. Oppositions now became fuel for progress, and while few continental thinkers subsequent to Hegel (with the exception of the Marxist tradition) adopted his linear view of history with its persistent and apparently value-laden teleology, nevertheless his success in breaking free from the limitations of Kant's theories inspired other thinkers to do likewise.

The continental tradition is, unsurprisingly, not monolithic. It comprises a variety of schools of thought, which will only briefly be discussed here but which are discussed at length in other entries in this encyclopedia. Phenomenology, whose early proponents included Edmund Husserl and Martin Heidegger, attempted to articulate basic structures of lived human experience. Phenomenology overlapped significantly with existentialism, both in its philosophical interests and in the individual thinkers who came to personify one or both movements (for example, Jean-Paul Sartre, most strongly identified with existentialism, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty, who is often claimed by both camps). Although phenomenology at times represented a method that was in some ways more akin to scientific reasoning (Husserl's eidetic reduction, for example, attempted to distill universal structures of human experience from individual experiences) while existentialism explicitly eschewed any thinking comparable to that of the sciences, nevertheless both were concerned with the human being as a living, subjective, dynamic entity, one whose experiences of being in the world could not be reduced to biology or physical forces.

Psychoanalytic theory, another influential school of thought within Continental philosophy, also adopted as its subject the human being, this time through the lens of the psyche. Sigmund Freud, Carl Jung, and Jacques Lacan, among others, sought to unlock the workings of the unconscious mind in order both to explain human behavior and to ameliorate psychological suffering. Philosophically, psychoanalytic theory challenged the notion of the human being as defined by self-conscious, rational thought, and celebrated the powers of inductive thought in its attempt to unearth the psychic events, beliefs, and structures inaccessible to the conscious mind. Compared to phenomenology, psychoanalysis was in many ways even closer to the realm of science, despite the scientific community's persistent reluctance to recognize it as a viable field; nevertheless, many philosophers have found it a rich source of insight into the human condition.

In the twentieth century, two French philosophers, Jacques Derrida and Michel Foucault, dominated continental philosophy with their controversial and at times diverging theories, both of which are often combined under the term “postmodernism” (a term that is at least as confusing as it is helpful, especially because the traditions described above could just as accurately be described as postmodern). Although there are certainly other twentieth-century postmodern figures with enormous influence, such as Merleau-Ponty and Jean Baudrillard, Foucault and Derrida remain among the most well-known and cited philosophers of this tradition, particularly among feminist writers.

Derrida is most often associated with his method and theory of deconstructionism. At its most basic level, deconstructionism is an approach to texts, one that criticizes and undermines crucial and common assumptions about the way in which language works. Derrida insisted that the very way in which language functions, that is, signification, necessitates an unbridgeable gap between the signifier and the signified. Language, in other words, is a form of pointing, a gesture by which one thing stands for or points to another. Words and their meanings are not entirely commensurable: that is, between a word and that to which it refers exists a nontranscendable difference, an abyss that a user of language must cross. Nor can the relationship between words and meaning be controlled by an author or speaker. To approach texts (and Derrida understood the category of “texts” broadly, so that they came to include not only the written word, but also visual art, cultural symbolism, etc.) in the deconstructive mode is to understand language and meaning not as fixed and static, but rather as dynamic relations between and among differentiated beings. A sense of otherness—that is, the way that entities differ from each other, in the sense that they cannot be reduced to other entities, or otherwise be rendered as essentially similar or identical—pervades deconstructionism, not only in the distinction between the signifier and the signified, but also between those individuals who encounter, use, and inhabit language. With this otherness comes an acknowledgement of the limits of reason and objectivity: in terms of written texts, for example, one cannot speak of an “authoritative” or “correct” interpretation, nor does the author know what the work “really” means. Elsebet Jegstrup writes, “Deconstruction is existential. It respects singularity, and, most profoundly, it recognizes otherness and the fact that we may not always be able to say what constitutes otherness. It realizes that although much experience can be shared, there will always be areas of experience, understood in physical as well as metaphysical terms, that cannot be shared” (2004, 2).

If texts do not exist as objectively knowable objects, if the very use of language presupposes not identity but difference (that is, the difference between the signifier and the signified, as well as the difference that exists irreducibly between and among speaking/listening agents), then the unspoken is surely just as significant as the spoken. To deconstruct a text from this perspective is to attempt to articulate some of its underlying, unspoken, and necessary, contradictions, the ways in which what is unsaid contradicts, or is in tension with, the explicitly expressed. The deconstructive strategy is not inherently a criticism of a text: Derrida is in no way implying that texts should be logically consistent. To the contrary, in their inherent openness to interpretation, in their refusal to be trapped by logical principles, in their very infinite nature, texts show themselves to be alive and lively.

This exceedingly brief overview of deconstructionism belies its cultural impact. Derrida's theories have been attacked particularly in the context of the so-called US “culture wars” in their alleged valorization of relativism. Whether such attacks are warranted is a matter not within the purview of this entry, however; our only concern here is the absolutely crucial role that Derrida and his theories play within the field of continental philosophy, a point that is itself hardly controversial.

Let us turn now, similarly briefly, to the work of Michel Foucault, who is known primarily for his theories of power and sexuality, explored in works such as Discipline and Punish, History of Sexuality, and others. Central to his work is the claim that power should be understood not only as repressive—as limiting the behavior or possibilities of the subject—but also, perhaps even primarily, as productive. Dynamics and discourses of power produce certain kinds of subjects, with certain kinds of capacities, desires, and functions. The time-honored example of such a dynamic is that of the soldier, for whom military training is not only about eradicating certain elements of one's personhood, but is also concerned with instilling specific habits and aptitudes. Military training, then, manufactures soldiers, and the depth of the effect of such manufacturing on the subject, Foucault indicates, is profound. Similarly, modern political discourses produce certain types of subjects, with distinct characteristics. Power, then, creates possibility, although it does so always with its own motivations. Moreover, the workings of power cannot be reduced to specific individuals or locations. Power works diffusely, utilizing the very subjects that are constructed within its context to perpetuate its goals. The feudal model of power, with its distinct roles and top-down hierarchy, and its emphasis on punishment, makes way for disciplinary power, targeted distinctly towards the subject's body, dependent upon constant surveillance, and intended to normalize the subject's being and actions—that is, to create a subject according to the norms demanded by the overall power structure.

Within this understanding of power, there is little about the subject that is untouched by it. Sexuality in particular is viewed by Foucault not as an inherently biological drive, but rather as a set of desires and dynamics that are deeply shaped by the modern cultural context. Indeed, in analyzing the shift to modern disciplinary power, Foucault notes a near obsession with control of sexuality. Whether by science or religion or other forces, the subject's sexuality suddenly came under close scrutiny, and the normalization of sexuality became of paramount concern. Indeed, the discourses of power served to shape sexual desires themselves; that subjects experience them as innate or central to their individual personalities only demonstrates the scope of those networks of power.

The question of resistance is one that permeates much of the philosophical discussions surrounding Foucauldian theories, including feminist discussions. If the subject is so utterly constituted by the discourses of power, what sorts of tools are available for the undermining of that power? With regard to sexuality, Foucault is not seeking to liberate sexuality entirely, to return it, for example, to a politically neutral, perhaps natural state. The existence of such a state is, for Foucault, dubious. Rather, he (controversially) suggests the desexualization of pleasure, by which subjects attempt to undermine certain aspects of the constructed form of sexuality (for example, the reduction of sexuality to the genitals) demanded by the discourses of power. He urges that by transgressing the boundaries of pleasure and sexuality that are demanded by discursive powers, subjects can individually and collectively create new modes of being (for example, a radical undermining of compulsory heterosexuality would cast human sexuality and pleasure in entirely new ways, and would significantly affect social and political institutions). These new modes are no more natural, and no less constructed, than the modes demanded by disciplinary power, but they would be an attempt to exist explicitly in tension with those systems of power, thus rendering those systems more visible and (perhaps) somewhat more vulnerable.

This scanty overview of continental philosophy is by definition incomplete; other central figures not mentioned here, who are nevertheless crucial to the tradition, include Friedrich Nietzsche, Jean-Francois Lyotard, Emmanuel Levinas, Paul Ricoeur, Gilles Deleuze, Felix Guattari, Soren Kierkegaard, and many others. Nevertheless, such an overview is valuable for demonstrating the philosophical legacies from which continental feminism derives. Vital among such legacies are a critical approach to logic and rationality; an emphasis on understanding the lived experience of the human being; and an abiding interest in the deeply embedded assumptions and structures of social and political life. Continental feminists take these concepts, and the methodologies particular to continental thought, and explore both in the light of gender and sexual inequality. They do not do so uncritically, however, and are quick to point out that many of these theories make the same mistakes that feminists have diagnosed in philosophies of all stripes: a persistent devaluing of the feminine, an implicit acceptance that the male human can stand in for all humans, and a failure to recognize the social, political, and philosophical relevance of sexism. In the burgeoning field of continental feminism, two concerns, then, seem to be paramount: on the one hand, thinkers are concerned with rectifying the gaps in the previous theories, with a particular eye toward the gendered nature of those gaps; on the other, they work with (and expand upon) the concepts and methodologies of continental philosophy to deepen our philosophical understandings of human beings as gendered beings and the continual inequalities that exist among the genders.

2. Main Topics of Continental Feminism

2.1 Theories of the Self and Society

Continental feminist thinkers are strongly interested in the ontology of the self, the structure of society, and the connections and disruptions between the two. Central among their philosophical interests here are sexual difference, embodiment, and intersubjectivity.

2.1.1 Sexual Difference

Few of the traditional figures in continental philosophy (even Foucault, with his explicit attention to sexuality) directly addressed the issue of sexual difference. For continental feminists, by contrast, it remains one of the most controversial and central topics of discussion. There are two main schools of thought within continental feminism concerning the issue. The first, best represented by Luce Irigaray, approaches sexual difference as a more or less ontological reality, and asserts that rather than attempting to transcend or deny differences between men and women, feminism should embrace the fact of difference and take it as the very foundation of both theory and practice. The second, best represented by Judith Butler, questions the very reality of any sort of sexual difference, and views such a difference as part and parcel of a system of inequality. Undermining that system entails denying the reality of the difference, and questioning at the most basic level those fields of knowledge (for example, biology) that assume it as given.

Before we explore the concept of sexual difference, it is worth pointing out that it is not the only difference with which continental feminist philosophers concern themselves. Differences that occur among women, such as those regarding class, ethnicity, and sexual orientation, are also explored. Gayatri Spivak, for example, explores issues regarding cultural difference and globalism, Seyla Benhabib's work investigates the possibilities surrounding democracy in a diverse and pluralistic world, and Teresa de Lauretis discusses lesbianism from a psychoanalytic perspective. More generally, continental feminist thinkers persistently criticize their own and others' theories on the basis of whether they misrepresent or exclude experiences of non-white, non-heterosexual, non-Western women (the work of Simone de Beauvoir, for example, fares poorly on these points). Clearly, then, difference itself, and not merely sexual difference, is of primary importance to these thinkers. Nevertheless, no one difference has received as much theoretical attention as sexual difference, and as such it is worthy of extended discussion here.

Let us explore each of these perspectives in more detail. Irigaray's central critique of Western philosophy rests upon her diagnosis of its inherent sexual indifference, that is, a failure on the part of those theories to recognize that the human species is always internally differentiated, certainly by sex, and most likely by other relevant differences as well. When such theories have allowed “male” to stand in for “human”—whether by defining the human in terms of characteristics associated specifically with men, or constructing the male as the paradigm of the species, or by simply conflating the two linguistically by use of the male generic—they have necessarily rendered women as lesser humans. More to the point, they have rendered women as lesser men, as men manqué, as beings who simply have less, in comparison to men, of the attributes necessary to human subjects. By considering the human species as essentially one, and then allowing the male to stand in for that “one,” such a philosophical tradition has defined women out of the specificity of their own existence, and has only allowed women to been seen in relation to men, their desires, and their needs.

When we construct women in this way, when we deny their ontological independence and instead view them as beings who differ only quantitatively from men—such that their being can essentially be reduced to that of men's, that there is nothing about women, particularly, that cannot already be found in the male figure—then it is easy to restrict their roles to those most convenient and useful to men. Women are defined, then, as wives or mothers, and as a culture we are conceptually incapable of understanding them on any basis other than male interests. Moreover, Irigaray emphasizes, relations between men and women become so fundamentally male-centered that real dialogue, real interactions, real exchanges are impossible: with women being understood (and understanding themselves) as nothing more than reflections of male being, what looks like dialogue is actually monologue. Men are conversing only with projections of their own being, and women are not speaking subjects at all. “Yet isn't it time for us to become communicating subjects? Have we not exhausted our other possibilities, indeed, our other desires? Isn't it time for us to become capable not only of speech but also of speaking to one another?” (Irigaray 1996, 45).

Irigaray claims that, for both philosophical and political reasons, Western culture must recognize that difference lies at the very foundation of the human species and experience. Sexual difference is at the very least the most obvious kind of difference among humans, and Irigaray is (at times) careful to indicate that sexual differentiation may not be limited to the two sexes currently recognized by Western culture. The human species, she says, is “at least” two (1996, 37). Her point here is that, trapped as Western culture and thought is within a male-centered metaphysics, both sexes (and those that may remain unrecognized) have been constructed contrary to their ontological distinction. Therefore, we do not really know who men are; their sexual specificity has been veiled utterly by their status as paradigmatic, sex-neutral humans. And we certainly do not know who women are, as their sexual specificity has been utterly denied in the construction of their inferior status.

In order to rectify both our philosophical understandings of human beings and our sexual politics, Irigaray elevates the philosophical virtue of wonder. The sexes must approach each other with a sense of humility, an awareness of the unknown, a recognition that no one person or subset of persons can represent the human species in its totality, and that therefore the other has something to teach, and something to say. To approach the other as different is not (as some other philosophical traditions would have it) to construct it as inferior. Difference can be separated from hierarchy, and can in fact be understood as the very condition of possibility of connection, of coalition, of being-together. Rather than aspiring to those ways of being that have been characteristically male, women need to “become who they are”: to discover their own particular modalities of being and free themselves from social, legal, and political institutions that relegate them to faint reflections of masculinity.

Other thinkers that have taken up the concept of sexual difference include Rosi Braidotti, Elizabeth Grosz, and Moira Gatens. Like Irigaray, however, these thinkers have not described this difference in terms of content. That is, they tend not to make substantial claims concerning femininity (they do not, for example, describe women as distinctly nurturing, or empathic, or anything of the sort). The philosophical relevance of this difference is not its content, not the particular ways in which men and women are or may be different (according to Irigaray, of course, we are incapable at least at the moment of perceiving or articulating these particular differences), but rather the fact of alterity itself. Difference then becomes constructed not as a goal—the point is not to discover precisely how the sexes are different—but rather as a shifting foundation, a fluid starting point from which to begin the process of being together as a community.

Criticisms of this emphasis on sexual difference are in some ways philosophically predictable, and they emanate not only from feminists not associated with the continental tradition, but also from those who subscribe to it. Generally speaking, the criticisms question the foundational nature of sexual difference. They argue that what may appear as a given, natural distinction may in fact be nothing more than a political construct, and that to ground either a politics or a philosophy on such a distinction is to doom women to a second-class existence (see, for example, the work of Michéle Le Doeuff). A primary critic of this philosophical embracing of sexual difference is Judith Butler, to whom we now turn our attention.

In her highly influential book Gender Trouble (1989) and the follow-up book Bodies That Matter (1993), Butler radically undermines both feminist and non-feminist understandings of sex and gender. Gender Trouble presented her theory of gender as essentially performative. Gender roles, and indeed gender itself, Butler argues, come into being as they are performed by subjects. There is no gender identity prior to these performances; indeed, there is no gender prior to or beyond those experiences. We are wrong, then, to imagine that women are women before they are taught the behaviors, roles, and scripts that are assigned to them. Moreover, because gender is performative, it demands to be iterated: without the repetition of performance, gender would literally cease to exist. Within this theory is articulated both the persistence of gender—it appears to be so natural, so given, because our very identities have been steeped in it—and the possibility of resistance, for once we are aware of the scripts, we become capable of speaking otherwise. Indeed, because every iteration necessarily includes the possibility of disloyalty, gender demonstrates itself to be paradoxically vulnerable to new and disobedient incarnations.

At this point, Butler's theory may appear to have a striking similarity to the sex/gender distinction that marked so much of the influential work that emanated from the Second Wave of U.S. feminism. This distinction drew a sharp difference between biological characteristics of the different sexes and the social roles and behaviors that were associated with them. The first category, sex, was understood as generally immutable, universal across cultures, and independent of political realities. The second category, gender, was understood as politically constructed, and therefore capable of being transformed. Second Wave feminists claimed that patriarchal society had conflated the two, and had thus wrongly considered women to be naturally, biologically incapable of certain sorts of social roles, when in fact such a limitation was arbitrary and open to transformation. While of enormous political and philosophical use to U.S. feminism, the sex/gender distinction essentially left uncriticized the biological reality of sex.

Butler's theory, however, does not leave the alleged biological reality of sex uncriticized, as she makes clear in Bodies that Matter. Whereas the sex/gender distinction allows the biological fact of sex to precede the cultural fact of gender, Butler argues that even the way that we understand materiality itself, as well as the bodies that are included in the category of materiality, is culturally and politically defined. It matters, in other words, that matter is understood as prior to experience: that definition is part of a politically and philosophically specific way of approaching the world. Once that definition is questioned, materiality itself is shown to be a conceptual construction, one that perpetuates the belief that sex is a natural given. Butler's point is that materiality itself must be rethought as a far more fluid, dynamic, and philosophically contentious notion, and that its role in the construction (at this point in her work, Butler prefers the term “materialization”) of the subject must be recognized. The body here becomes an active element of the materialization of the subject rather than a passive, finite entity.

For Butler, then, Irigaray's claim of a sexual difference that is ontologically fundamental to human existence is untenable. Sexual difference for Butler shows up as an inherent part of a conceptual system that creates and perpetuates unequal power relations. Although, like Foucault, Butler is wary of the claim that subjects (whether individually or collectively) can undermine the totality of such a system, nevertheless she finds some possibility for resistance in the opportunities for rebellious iterations of gender norms, roles, and scripts. In performing such iterations, subjects may literally bring new ways of being gendered (or possibly not being gendered?) into being.

These two approaches to sexual difference, while profoundly dissimilar, nevertheless demonstrate that the lived human experience as currently constructed inevitably locates gender as central to identity. Butler is not, for example, arguing that men and women experience the world in a fundamentally similar way: she would point out that men and women, as beings who have always already been gendered, perform radically different scripts and therefore have radically different experiences and perceptions. Thus for both schools of thought, any discussion of gender inequality must take difference—whether ontologically fundamental or fundamentally constructed—into account.

2.1.2 Embodiment

A strong strand of continental thought includes a reevaluation of the role of the body with regard to subjectivity. Part of continental's philosophy persistent critique of modern, Enlightenment thought was the latter's insistence upon defining the human being primarily in terms of intellectual or cognitive capacities. Especially with the phenomenology of Merleau-Ponty, continental philosophy sought to understand the body not as peripheral (or worse, opposed) to subjectivity, but rather as crucial to the lived experience of the human subject.

Continental feminists have also demonstrated a lasting interest in the body and its relation to agency, ethics, and politics. They have also pointed out, unlike many other continental thinkers, that when modern philosophy ignored or marginalized the body, it simultaneously ignored or marginalized women. That is, by understanding the human being in terms that were allegedly gender-neutral, and by forsaking those aspects of human existence that were clearly gendered/sexed—intellectual moves that denied the relevance of bodily differences among humans—modern thought successfully wrote women out of its project. (There were exceptions, of course, most notably John Stuart Mill and Mary Wollstonecraft, but contemporary continental feminists would find in these theories too a distinctly disembodied philosophical approach). Thus, continental feminism has continually articulated a connection between the ways in which women and the body have been conceptualized.

For the vast majority of continental feminists, to approach the human subject as embodied is crucial. Emphasizing the material aspects of the lived human experience allows thinkers to articulate some (perhaps universal) elements of that experience while also remaining focused on the differences that embodiment necessarily entails. For while all human beings are incarnate, each incarnation is by definition distinct. Nor, it must be emphasized, are the differences that occur among bodies to be reduced to biological differences. The lived body that continental feminists are concerned with is distinct from the body as studied by biology and the other sciences: it is a dynamic, fluid, contentious entity, constantly affected by and affecting its own environment. Bodies, from this philosophical perspective, are deeply social and political organisms, marked inherently by history, geography, and a host of other factors.

Of course, one of the main differences that marks bodies in contemporary culture is gender, and the fact that many continental theories of the body fail to recognize the profound effects of gender on the human lived experience is one of the main imminent critiques to be found in continental feminism. The lived human body is always already sexed, regardless of whether one views such sexing as entirely cultural or as grounded in some sort of deep ontology. To understand the human experience, then, is to recognize that there is no one human experience; thus sex (and other differences as well) should be central to any philosophical theory of either the body or the subject. Continental feminism here serves as a crucial corrective to the general continental theory, which has too often paid insufficient attention to the philosophical relevance of sex/gender.

Perhaps no better example of this corrective function of continental feminism can be found than in the fairly extensive literature concerning Foucault and gender. Here, thinkers such as Sandra Bartky (1990), Ladelle McWhorter (1999), Lois McNay (1992), and Susan Bordo (1993) have both adopted and criticized Foucauldian concepts in order to, on the one hand, indicate where his own theories failed to take up sufficiently the question of sexual difference, and, on the other, to bring new insight to bear on the ways in which feminine bodies and sexualities are constructed. Bartky, for example, uses Foucault's notions of disciplinary power to describe the feminine body as constructed for particular purposes, and to emphasize that the details of this construction extend to minute details in the way women relate to their bodies. Bordo reads Foucault's “docile body” in a sexually specific way in order to better understand how femininity is reproduced in particular incarnations. Foucault, in other words, is a crucial interlocutor for continental feminists in their discussions concerning embodiment and the self.

The embodied subject is, as mentioned above, profoundly marked by its environment, including its interactions with other human (and other-than-human) beings. However, many continental feminists are careful not to portray the material body as a wholly passive tabula rasa upon which political discourses etch their values. Rather, the body is understood as an active, dynamic site, one that always contains the possibility of resistance, and one that takes up the elements of its surroundings in sometimes surprising ways. In contemporary Western society, for example, the female body is expected to engage in significant, and time-consuming, beautification practices. While virtually every woman experiences this pressure, different women may react to it in different ways, and those different ways can affect both their actual bodies (in their appearance, in decisions made concerning the possibilities of cosmetic surgery, etc.) and their perceptions of their bodies. The result is therefore a wide-ranging variety of bodies, from those that undergo extensive beautification to those that eschew it entirely; and, perhaps even more importantly, extending to those that inhabit different places on the continuum at different points in their lives.

If bodies are capable of resisting power dynamics, they are also capable of perpetuating them: embodied subjects, then, are deeply enmeshed in social and political forces. As such, they serve as concrete reminders that such familiar philosophical dichotomies as self/society and mind/body are not as hard and fast as most of Western philosophy would have us believe.

2.1.3 Intersubjectivity

Modern philosophy not only defined the self as primarily rational and intellectual; it also defined the self as autonomous and profoundly alone. Social contract theory posited that individuals came together, out of necessity, to form societies that protected their health and well being, albeit at a somewhat regrettable cost in the form of reduced personal freedom. Most modern political thought is concerned with the delicate balance of individual freedoms and social necessity, but underlying all such questions is the assumption that human beings begin in solitude, and that one of their most precious attributes is their autonomy.

Feminists, of course, have long been concerned with the autonomy of women, having witnessed the failure of so many political systems (including those inspired by Enlightment thought) to extend full independence to the allegedly fair sex. Philosophically, however, continental feminism takes issue with the centrality of autonomy to theories of subjectivity and ethics. More precisely, continental feminism tends to approach the subject not as essentially separate from other human (and in some cases other-than-human) beings, but rather as inextricably intertwined with these beings. In large part, then, continental feminism tends to speak not of subjectivity, with its overtones of independent, autonomous action, but rather of intersubjectivity, which implies that being with others is a necessary condition to any action whatsoever.

In fact, many continental feminists view the privileging of autonomy as a deeply male-centered model of existence. To understand the self as first and foremost alone and free is, after all, to deny the lived experience of dependency that is central to any human existence. More to the point, the person to whom we are most likely to be dependent upon at distinctly vulnerable points in our life experience is often a woman. Rousseau's allegedly natural (if “savage”) man, who is found walking through the forest, gathering his own food, did not spring ex nihilo from his own environment. Someone, most likely a woman, nurtured him in his early infancy and created the conditions for his admired freedom. To take independence as the starting point is thus to ignore once again the work that is most closely associated with women.

If the human being is profoundly intersubjective, if the identity and continued existence of any particular individual depends upon the presence and actions of others, then to highlight autonomy as the hallmark of the ideal human existence is deeply misguided. This is not to say that continental feminists abandon all notions of freedom and autonomy; they do, however, contextualize autonomy within a network of relationships and understand it as emanating from social discourses, rather than as existing as an innate characteristic of the human being. The self, for continental feminists, remains always marked by the other, always entwined by the other, always deeply enmeshed with the other, so much so that to understand it as outside of any social interactions is to misunderstand it completely.

2.2 Theories of Sexual Injustice

Given the approaches that continental feminism takes to the self and its surroundings, it is not surprising to find that its understandings of sexual injustice vary somewhat from those of other forms of feminist thought. In their criticism of liberalism as an insufficient response to sexual inequality, continental feminists are fairly unified; in their diagnosis of what a sexually just society would entail, significant differences remain.

2.2.1 Critique of Liberalism

Continental feminist thought understands liberalism essentially as a political theory whose main tenets are incapable of rooting out the deep causes of sexual inequality. By and large, liberalism claims that the main injustice that patriarchal Western society has imposed upon women has been one of exclusion: women have been denied entrance to those institutions and roles that house most social and political power. To rectify this injustice, society as a whole must seek to introduce women to these institutions and roles, to increase their social and political influence, and (to a certain extent) to ensure that gender does not serve to disadvantage women economically or politically. Indeed, understood in this fashion, it is crucial to note the significant successes that liberalism has achieved in the history of the United States, most notably the achievement of women's suffrage and the significant increase of women in such formerly male-dominated fields as law and medicine.

From the continental perspective, however, liberalism and its goals do not extend nearly far enough. First, generally speaking, liberalism assumes that the basic structure of social and political institutions is both ungendered and acceptable. Marriage, then, remains a viable institution: its elements need only to be tweaked to ensure that both men and women are represented equally within it, and its benefits need only be extended to heretofore excluded groups, such as gays and lesbians, to ensure that it does not constitute the privileging of one form of sexuality over another. The fields of business and politics, too, are not problematic in their structure, but only in their membership, and while some liberal feminists hold out hopes that the inclusion of women will inspire structural change, such structural change is not at the heart of the liberal mission.

Continental feminism argues that the relevance of sex and gender goes far deeper than liberalism assumes. The promises of the Enlightenment are not merely unfulfilled with relation to women (as, for example, the imminent critique of Mary Wollstonecraft holds); rather, the very promises themselves rest upon a foundation of gender inequality. As mentioned above, the centrality of autonomy depends upon a denial of dependence, and a refusal to acknowledge the social necessity of work traditionally known as women's (we can only believe that we are autonomous when we ignore how much of our activities and achievements depend on the fact that we have been cared for, are most likely still cared for, often in invisible ways, and will most likely be cared for more explicitly as we age—and that most of this caring will be done by women). Likewise, the social construction of work in Western society is profoundly, not superficially, gendered. The demands of professional achievement (long work days and weeks and extensive education, for example) still presume an employee who has a partner caring for his and his children's material needs. Yet few women have such a wife. Nor are such institutions developed with the assumption that workers will at some point bear children, or care for aging or ill relatives, with all the physical and emotional demands that such an experience includes. Simply adding women to institutions whose configurations are opposed to their physical and social realities is a recipe for failure, if not on the part of all individual women (some, after all, have succeeded), then certainly on the part of the societal attempt to construct equality between the sexes.

Audre Lorde once famously claimed that “the master's tools will never dismantle the master's house,” (1984, 112) and with regard to sexual inequality, continental feminism finds the philosophical tools of liberalism—the emphasis upon the individual, autonomy, and personal achievement—not up to the task of dismantling patriarchy. Inclusion of women in institutions previously barred to them is certainly not sufficient, perhaps not necessary, and for some continental feminists, may even be contrary to the overall goal of sexual equality, insofar as those women may find themselves co-opted into and perpetuating a system from which they may benefit individually but which disadvantages women as a class. Models of sexual justice for continental feminists, then, tend to represent a far deeper, more substantial critique of modern Western culture. On the whole, the models tend to represent the differing approaches to sexual difference to be found within continental feminism as a field.

2.2.2 The Deconstruction of Sex

For those continental feminists who hold sex to be an entirely constructed category, upon which sexual injustice rests and depends, forming a sexually just society and politics demands the radical deconstruction of sex and sexuality. Perhaps nowhere else in the field of continental feminism is the dependence upon the work of Simone de Beauvoir as evident as in relation to this point. Virtually all continental feminists who explore the ways in which femininity and the sexes themselves are constructed refer, explicitly or implicitly, to the famous claim in The Second Sex (1952) that “one is not born a woman.” Indeed, The Second Sex could fairly be termed the very first work within the tradition of continental feminism, insofar as it applied the insights of existentialism to the social and political status of women, claiming that women's existence and experience is framed by a patriarchal order that defines them as inferior, as incapable of the transcendence that is necessary to create meaning. Women, in de Beauvoir's view, are forced by a male-centric society to remain mired in immanence, attached irrevocably to the body and to bodily needs (particularly the needs of men), and in this way are profoundly unfree. Yet this lack of freedom, this construction of sex roles along hierarchical lines, is neither necessary nor invulnerable. Women are capable of escaping the roles that bind them: in other words, femininity is constructed, and must be deconstructed if women are to find liberation (for two excellent treatments of de Beauvoir, her life, and her relevance to feminist thought, see Moi 1994 and Bauer 2001).

The work of Monique Wittig (1992) is an excellent example of the legacy that de Beauvoir bequeathed to feminist thought. In Wittig's vision, society must recognize that the categories of “man” and “women” structurally parallel the categories of “master” and “slave”. Not only do the terms, despite their apparent opposition to each other, in fact define each other mutually (one cannot be a master without a slave, and vice versa), but the very categories and identities they reflect only make sense within a context of hierarchy. Slavery as an institution could not survive without the unexamined belief that certain persons are masters and certain persons are slaves, and as long as those identities remain cogent, the institution is perpetuated. Similarly, the structure of patriarchy depends upon the common belief that some people are male and some are female (for Wittig, like so many continental feminists, the sex/gender distinction does not hold; see also the work of Christine Delphy and Colette Guillaumin, who also rely heavily on the theories of Simone de Beauvoir, even as they push them somewhat beyond their original scope), and the cogency of that distinction is itself part of the continuation of the inequality. To do away with slavery is to destroy all masters and all slaves, and likewise, to do away with patriarchy demands the destruction of sex as a functioning, coherent category of persons.

This dismantling of sex at first appears to be an appeal to androgyny, and while Wittig would take issue with the etymology of the word (what she is seeking is not a combination of the male and the female, but the eradication of the very categories), nevertheless, her ideal is one of persons who are not gendered. This is not the case for all continental feminists who adopt similar models of sexual justice. For some, however, what needs to be dismantled is not necessarily all sexual identities, but rather the tyranny of a system that demands and permits only two. From this perspective, sexual justice would entail the nurturing of a wide diversity of sexual identities and behaviors, none of which could be contained fully with the constraining categories currently in play. Feminists adopting this line of thought consistently point out that all definitions of ’sex’, particularly those based in biology, are inevitably found to be wanting, in that there are always examples of individuals that contradict them. Yet it is important to remember that this model of sexual justice is not at its core liberal: the philosophical assumption is not that there are some innate, inherent sexualities that are being denied, that need simply to be allowed to flower. What these continental feminists seek to do is not to bring to light something that already exists, but rather to allow that which does not currently exist to come into being. Such a proliferation of sexual identities and behaviors would undo the oppressive dichotomies that hierarchichally structure the sexes.

2.2.3 Embracing of Sexual Difference

For those feminists who ground their theories in a recognition of sexual difference, justice takes on a decisively different shape than that described above. Rather than seeking to transcend or undermine the notion of sexual difference, these philosophers claim that ethics must start with an acknowledgment of the fundamental nature of sexual difference, however unclear we may currently be on its other qualities. Rather than founding our sense of ethics and justice on notions of equality and sameness, as do modern political theories, we must start with the understanding that the Other is different from us, unknown and wondrous, and that to attempt to veil or transcend such difference is to do violence to that Other.

With regard to sexual justice in particular, theorists such as Irigaray point out that women have been forced to play roles that are nothing but reflections of men's needs and desires. They have, in other words, been denied their own, independent being, and this denial has resulted in the theft of their particular voice. Political structures have reflected this failure to recognize difference in their insistence that individuals be perceived independently of their sex; yet this very gender-neutrality has masked an insistent, implicit male bias that has treated the male as the norm. If sexual justice is to be achieved, women must be freed from their derivative status. Their particularity must be seen not as a sign of inferiority (after all, theories of sexual difference insist that masculinity is just as particular, just as specific, as femininity), but as the foundation of dialogue and of interaction.

More than any other theorist, Irigaray has applied this notion of sexual difference directly to political and legal systems. In her later work, she has insisted that legal codes, for example, must adopt the notion of “sexed rights,” that is, rights that are specific to each sex. Issues such as reproductive freedom and sexual violence, she claims, cannot be understood in a gender-neutral fashion. The particularity of women's bodies, and the distinct role they play in reproduction, demand an articulation of these rights as women's rights. From Irigaray's perspective, “human rights” is a contradiction in terms: for rights to have any lived meaning, for them to be relevant to the real experiences of individual citizens, they must be infused with a respect for the differentiation that is at the heart of human existence.

As mentioned earlier, sexual difference, while often described as the most fundamental of differences among human beings, is not the only one. Many theorists, such as Elizabeth Grosz, argue that other differences that occur among bodies (race, sexual orientation, physical ability, age, just to name a few) must also be recognized and articulated in order to construct a just society. In order for society to confront racial injustice, for example, society must first admit that a person's race positions them socially, politically, and economically in distinct ways. To insist that social and political systems ignore a person's race is to contradict this lived experience. If, for example, as legislation sponsored by the Racial Privacy Initiative would demand (, government agencies stop listing race on various important documents, it will become virtually impossible to track racial inequalities. More generally, theories of difference would insist that racial difference is not merely superficial, and would claim that many well-meaning theorists and activists from the dominant group have made the mistake of assuming that members of the subordinate group are “just like me.” The ethical imperative of wonder would demand an acknowledgement that even the dominant group is raced and that the race of the dominant group has significantly affected that group's perceptions and reality.

In this model of justice, difference becomes not a problem to be transcended, but in fact a means of contradicting and undermining the unjust systems that today pervade our world. With regard to sexual injustice in particular, theorists of sexual difference (including Rosi Braidotti, Moira Gatens, and Elizabeth Grosz) seek not to liberate women so that they can be men, or man-like, in their status, possibilities, and desires. Rather, they seek to construct a world where women are allowed to be women—whatever form(s) such femininity may take once it is decoupled from the dominant force of masculinity.

And what of sexuality under this model? In the model discussed in the previous section, sexual justice took the form of an explosion of sexualities, unhampered by the demands of sexual dualism. Some critics of the sexual difference model claim that it is inherently heterosexist in its emphasis on masculinity and femininity and its persistent interest in male-female dialogue and interaction. Indeed, some of these critiques seem well founded. While Irigaray occasionally remembers, for example, to refer to “at least” two sexes, nevertheless her theory seems to remain focused on how the two most commonly known sexes, men and women, can relate to each other. Little if any attention is paid to how women may relate to each other sexually, or, if there are more than two sexes, how this increased multiplicity may reframe our understanding of sexuality beyond the demands of heterosexuality.

Yet implicit in the theory of sexual difference is a critique of compulsory heterosexuality. If femininity is to be truly decoupled from masculinity, if its ontological distinctness is truly to be recognized, then it cannot be said that femininity and masculinity complement each other. Both are limited, it is true, but not in such a way that they reflect each other's lacks. Given this non-complementarity, heterosexual couples cannot represent, in miniature, the completeness of human existence. The sexes, in other words, do not function as each other's destiny, and if we are to allow feminine sexuality to appear as something other than a projection of masculine desire, then we must not assume that it has any particular orientation. In this sense, a recognition of sexual difference entails a recognition of a diversity of sexual orientations.

2.3 Gender and the Psyche [Authored by Jennifer Hansen]

For many feminists, psychoanalysis, or the work of Sigmund Freud, represents powerful attempts by patriarchy to control women's sexuality. Psychoanalysis as practiced in the 50's and 60's in the United States often blamed mothers as well as feminism as the source of social unrest. Moreover, many scholars have exposed Freud's decision to ignore the accounts of rape and sexual violence that his female patients were giving in therapy, choosing instead to interpret them as mere “fantasies.” Given the problematic relationship between feminism and psychoanalysis, many feminists are bewildered by the growing literature among continental feminists (including such thinkers as Teresa Brennan, Jane Gallop, Drucilla Cornell, and Teresa de Lauretis) on both Freud and Jacques Lacan's work.

In the early seventies, Juliet Mitchell published Psychoanalysis and Feminism (1974), which challenged feminist scholars to look seriously at Freud in order to better understand how patriarchy works. Appearing in France the same year as Mitchell's book, Luce Irigaray's Speculum of the Other Woman (1985) puts Freud on the couch. Irigaray reads Freud very closely, not in order to better master his teachings, but rather to uncover his own unconscious fantasies and fears of the other sex. Speculum has become one type of model for many continental feminists for strategically engaging with the texts of both Freud and Lacan; what these texts reveal is precisely how notions of pathological femininity, penis envy, or castration anxiety emerge in Western thought as expression of deeply entrenched patriarchal fears. Rather than confronting these entrenched ideas about the wickedness of female sexuality, Freud and Lacan naturalize them and use them as explanations for many psychiatric disorders. Irigaray pokes fun at this move by mimicking the very notions of femininity they espouse in order to unearth their blind spots. She identifies how their failure to rethink their fundamental notions of normal and abnormal sexuality (read: male and female sexuality) unconsciously operate in the background of their conceptual edifice.

Another way in which Continental feminists have taken up psychoanalysis coincides with how both the later Freud and Lacan mine the individual's psyche in order to unearth cultural forces at work. Lacan, for example, argues that our very sanity depends on our adherence to both the imaginary and symbolic realm of culture; we rely on these realms to make sense of the world. The imaginary realm provides us with fictitious images of ourselves as whole and self-mastering, while the symbolic realm provides us with the conceptual categories of our shared world. Lacan describes the mirror stage as a turning point in our psychic development because during this phase we come to identify with a stable and coherent image of ourselves—our mirror reflection—that supplants our experience of our body as uncoordinated and fragmented. The image of ourselves as whole, one of the many images that constitute the imaginary realm, gives us a fixed point; identifying with a singular, stable body, in turn allows us to take up speech and thereby enter into the symbolic realm. Lacan points out that our image of ourselves—the moi—(similar to Freud's notion of an ego) lays the groundwork for our ability to becoming speaking subjects—a je—and thereby social subjects. Similarly, we inherit other images from the imaginary realm, such as the representation of the female body as unruly or threatening. Likewise, when we learn how to speak (i.e., enter into the symbolic realm) we learn a particular set of concepts by which to view the world. Many of these concepts are binaries—such as man/woman—that both oppose their constituent parts and rank them in a hierarchy. For Lacan, both the images and the symbols we inherit, through the imaginary and symbolic respectively, are fixed; they are not revised as culture transforms.

Many feminists criticize Lacan's notions of both the imaginary and symbolic realms, precisely because he posits them as fixed, and therefore, immune to cultural revolutions such as feminism. The images he describes of mothers, i.e., beings whom male children must escape or else be devoured by, have much in common with stereotypes imposed on women to maintain their inferiority. Teresa Brennan argues, for example, that the foundational fantasies (which is another way of describing images such as the “mirror stage”) are really drawn from the concrete, historical practices of Lacan and Freud's own culture, rather than pre-historical symbols (Brennan 1992). Irigaray and Jane Gallop, among others, argue for a more fluid notion of the imaginary, one that produces more humane images of women as our cultural ideas shift (Gallop 1982, Irigaray 1985; see also Hansen 2000).

Freud, on the other hand, understood the psyche as a conflict of forces: the id, the super ego, and the ego. The super ego contained the “law of the father,” the cultural norms of behavior. Lacan incorporated Freud's notion of the “law of the father” into his notion of the symbolic realm, which not only names things and sets up power relations between them, but it also teaches us our moral codes. Freud also posited the id, which he argues is a dissident aspect of the self, rebelling against all of the cultural constraints enforced upon us both externally and internally by the super ego. Our egos, lastly, are compromises that grow out of conflict between what society asks of us, and our deepest counter-cultural wishes. Some Continental feminists map either the metapsychology of Freud or Lacan onto the culture itself, studying social systems as the competing forces of normalization and dissidence (see Zakin 2000). In this light, feminism can represent an unruly and dissident attempt—like the id's actions—to bring down the “law of the father” (super ego), which can explain why a patriarchal culture so violently opposes female empowerment: it threatens its very foundation.

In particular, thinkers like Judith Butler have reconceptualized Freud's notion of melancholia (depression) as an indication of a culture that tells certain subjects that they matter, and other that they are failures. Lesbians, for example, are threats to the conservative forces in culture; therefore, there is no pervasive set of images or concepts that embrace this identity. When the ego fails to reach the ideals of the super-ego, according to Freud, the super-ego punishes it, sending the subject into a severe depression. Depressed subjects mourn, often, something they are not allowed to be. Butler shows that this logic works well to explain the very process of all gendered subject formation; all of us, even heterosexuals, must give up parts of ourselves that fail to fit within the rigid symbolic order, wherein only the heterosexual couple (as imagined by patriarchy) is permitted. We “give up” the unruly parts of our sexuality by repressing it or proscribing it, psychic acts that infect all gender formation, for Butler, as a melancholic process (Butler 1997).

Patriarchy deploys a very narrow and restricting view of sexuality; it restrains our ability to imagine and thereby create alternative experiences of sexuality beyond the rigid images of heterosexism. Drucilla Cornell, in response to a punitive and restrictive imaginary, argues for legal protection of the “imaginary domain”—a free psychic space—which, she argues, is compatible with John Rawls' notion of self-respect (Cornell 1995). We should be allowed to imagine and represent to ourselves our sexual nature free from the shameful fantasies or stereotypes imposed on them by a heterosexist culture.

Lastly, continental feminists such as Julia Kristeva appropriate psychoanalysis for feminist ends. Kristeva rethinks the fundamental concepts of psychoanalysis in order to show the profound importance of the mother-child relationship on subject formation. Kelly Oliver has extended many of Kristeva's insights to show how the mother-child relationship, even in utero, can serve as a new metaphor for intersubjectivity as opposed to more common cultural images of individuals pitted against each other, competing over precious resources. The mother—child relationship, contrary to patriarchal thought, is not an animal relationship; rather, it is the precursor for all social relationships. Our first relationship is one of dependence on a caring being who nurtures us to become more autonomous. This autonomy is the product of loving relationships. This view of autonomy differs dramatically from classical liberalism, wherein autonomy is invoked to protect us from paternalism. The legacy of classical liberal thought is for us to be suspicious of dependency, rather than celebrate how early attachment and dependency on the mother lays the foundation of our adult self. Kristeva also argues that the psychoanalytic session, especially when the analyst is invested in the process of self-creation of the analysand, provides a needed space for women to begin to articulate their identity. The analyst provides a space in which a subject is allowed to become herself; this is yet another way in which psychoanalysis can be framed as friendly to feminist concerns and aims.

3. Methodologies of Continental Feminism

Rooted as it is within the philosophical traditions of existentialism, phenomenology, psychoanalytic theory, and postmodernism, continental feminism reflects a diversity of methodologies and writing styles. Nevertheless, there are some continuities that are noticeable.

3.1 Recognition of Depth of Male Bias in Philosophy

A persistent move within continental feminism is the discussion of the depth of male bias within the field of philosophy (and within the subfield of continental philosophy). This bias is perceived as neither superficial nor easily rectified.

Some examples of male bias in philosophy, continental and otherwise, are so extreme and explicit as to barely warrant further analysis. Freud, for example, has been persistently criticized for his claims that women suffer from penis envy, and Nietzsche's Beyond Good and Evil and Thus Spake Zarathustra include images of women as weak and lacking in intellectual capacity. Continental feminists note these blatant examples, but also seek to explore the more subtle ways in which theory has taken the male for the standard of human existence, or has simply ignored those aspects of human existence that have been associated with women. Merleau-Ponty's theory of the body, for example, which understands the body as an openness to experience, a way of being-with the world and a means of organizing the world according to one's projects, seems to be based more on the privileged male body (which faces relatively few social or political barriers) as opposed to the constrained, limited female body (see, for example, Sullivan 1997; for a criticism of Sullivan's analysis, see Stoller 2000). Likewise, as mentioned above, Foucault's theories of sexuality, while philosophically productive, are often described as lacking in that they do not directly address the ways in which sexuality is organized hierarchically according to sexual categories.

Beyond these questions of philosophical content, continental feminists also explore the even more implicit ways in which philosophical methodology may be gendered. Husserl's assumption that the individuality of any experience can be filtered out to arrive at a universal, shared structure, is based on the philosophical assumption that gender, among other categories, is essentially an accidental or superficial element of personhood. Yet this turn to gender neutrality masks the ways in which gender powerfully shapes not only the details of one's experiences, but indeed the very ways in which one experiences anything.

Insofar as continental feminists seek to unveil the hidden genderedness of the philosophical theories they use and criticize, they are in common cause with other forms of feminist theory. The shared goal here is to articulate the sometimes insidious ways in which assumptions concerning persons and theory come together to construct philosophies that often perpetuate rather than undermine sexual inequality. However, the depth of these criticisms does not inspire most continental feminist theorists to shun philosophy or theory in its entirety; rather, they seek to develop theories that ameliorate sexual inequality, both in terms of their content and their methodology.

3.2 Historicity of Reason

Like much of continental philosophy, feminist continental philosophy adopts a critical position with regard to reason. In general, the field rejects its status as culturally or historically universal, and while it is recognized as an important and valuable tool, its limits are recognized as well. Thinkers such as Linda Nicholson (1999) and Genevieve Lloyd (1993) point out that the predominance of reason in philosophical circles is deeply, and not accidentally, linked to the exclusion of women from the public realm (for example, one major reason that women were denied the right to vote for so long was the assumption that they were not sufficiently reasonable to make wise political choices). The history of reason, then, has a compellingly gendered nature to it. This point in and of itself, of course, is not sufficient to undermine rationality in toto, but it inspires continental feminist theorists to consider reason and rationality as existing not outside of culture or history, but rather as cultural products that have strengths and weaknesses. When it comes to understanding relations of dependence, for example, reason may have relatively little to tell us; here we must delve into the affective realm of emotion, a realm that has long been considered anathema to philosophical work.

It must be emphasized here that continental feminism does not entirely eschew reason, rationality, or even some fairly traditional understandings of argumentative strength. Such concepts are utilized frequently in the works of the thinkers discussed in this entry. However, those same thinkers refuse to approach those concepts as givens, as overarching structures that can be applied neutrally to any and all topics. Such an approach, continental feminists claim, overstates the relevance, capability, and universality of rationality. Thus, even as they wield reason as a valuable, perhaps even necessary, tool, these thinkers deny that it is the only one to which they have access.

3.3 Writing Styles

Perhaps the most controversial aspect of continental feminism is the density of the writing that tends to mark its central works. This criticism is launched against much of continental philosophy as a whole, although in some cases it seems even more acute when targeted against feminist thinkers, who are expected to make clear contributions to the understanding and undermining of sexual inequality. To the extent that the writing of many continental feminists is complex and, to many readers, impossibly obscure, such thinkers are charged with failing their responsibilities as feminists.

Indeed, continental feminist theory can be challenging. Its mode is distinct from that of analytic philosophy, with its linear argumentation and constant definition of terms. Continental feminists are more likely to coin entire words and phrases, weave together disparate sources, and integrate personal experience with rigorous philosophical argumentation. Allusions are rife, and the language can approach the poetic in its evocative sensibility.

Continental feminists would argue that such an approach to language is central to its philosophical and feminist missions. Language for these philosophers is not a transparent window into a universal, objective reality. Words and grammar reflect the values and political structure of a culture, and as such, must themselves be deconstructed in order to get at the central ideas of an unjust society. Mary Daly is a paradigmatic example of such an approach to language. Works such as Gyn/Ecology (1990) and Websters' First New Intergalactic Wickedary of the English Language (1994) explore assumptions hidden in common words and grammatical structure, and her creative dismantling and reshaping of the English language constitutes a profound critique of sexual inequality. Judith Butler, often criticized for the difficulty of her language, wrote a defense that many continental feminist philosophers would agree with:

No doubt, scholars in the humanities should be able to clarify how their work informs and illuminates everyday life. Equally, however, such scholars are obliged to question common sense, interrogate its tacit presumptions and provoke new ways of looking at a familiar world. Many quite nefarious ideologies pass for common sense. For decades of American history, it was “common sense” in some quarters for white people to own slaves and for women not to vote. Common sense, moreover, is not always “common”—the idea that lesbians and gay men should be protected against discrimination and violence strikes some people as common-sensical, but for others it threatens the foundations of ordinary life. If common sense sometimes preserves the social status quo, and that status quo sometimes treats unjust social hierarchies as natural, it makes good sense on such occasions to find ways of challenging common sense. Language that takes up this challenge can help point the way to a more socially just world. (Butler 1999, 15)

Virtually all continental feminists, then, view language as both philosophically problematic and potentially transformative.

For some feminist theorists and writers, language is so deeply intertwined with gender and sexual inequality, both politically and structurally, that women must develop new ways of speaking and writing. Helene Cixous coined the term l'ecriture feminine in her essay “The Laugh of the Medusa” (1976) to refer to an ongoing body of work by women that attempts to speak from, to, and about women's sexual specificity (it is interesting to note that the term conflates “woman” and “feminine,” a conflation that is difficult to render in translation). It is no surprise, then, to find Luce Irigaray often included in the l'ecriture feminine camp, as well Monique Wittig, both of whom tend to write in such a way as to call attention to the significance of the female body and its possibilities. L'ecriture feminine often comprises some of the most challenging of feminist texts. Works such as Wittig's Les Guérillères (1985) challenge the reader to encounter language beyond the demands of phallocentric logic (a logic that falsely promises clarity and self-evidence, but that in fact veils deeply masculine biases) particularly by engaging in a style that is highly evocative and allusive. Yet, as is the case for much of the feminist theory with which it is related, this style is central to the meanings of the work; for if language is as deeply marked by sexual inequality as these theorists suggest, then any language that attempts to exist outside of conventional meanings, or at least in an openly antagonistic relationship to those meanings, is bound to appear at first glance to be nonsensical.

4. Criticisms of Continental Feminism

Like any other school of thought, continental feminism is not without its critics. The most common complaints are as follows: the body of work, as varied as it is, is on the whole insufficiently political; the emphasis on difference poses significant political and philosophical risks; and (related to the first point) its complexity renders it inaccessible to all but a very few readers. Let us take each in turn.

4.1 The Apolitical Nature of Continental Feminism

Some critics of continental feminism have claimed that as a school of thought, continental feminism fails to speak directly to women's lives and to sufficiently articulate political solutions to the gender inequalities that continue to mark Western society. With its dependence upon a philosophical field that is notoriously esoteric and difficult to navigate, continental feminism, from this perspective, seems both hopelessly elitist and relentlessly impractical. Nowhere in its central works can be found specific political goals or strategies, and its relevance to the lived experience of actual women (or men, as equally gendered beings) seems tenuous at best. On this basis, critics such as Martha Nussbaum (1990) have claimed that the work of thinkers such as Judith Butler fail the crucial test of feminist thought, namely, to eradicate sexual inequality.

One central claim of this branch of criticism is that continental feminism is overly wedded to theory rather than practice. Feminist philosophy, after all, while committed to developing strong theoretical underpinnings, nevertheless cannot divorce itself from activism. If continental feminism cannot, or will not, develop a distinctly political approach to current gender inequalities, then, its critics say, it will remain a sterilely academic enterprise, and as such, it represents a waste of time and energy that would be better served engaging in concrete, specific political tasks. To be apolitical, in short, is to fail feminism.

4.2 The Risks of Emphasizing Difference

The second main criticism of continental feminist theory relates to its persistent interest in difference as a hallmark of human existence and as a theoretical basis for sexual ethics and politics. There are (at least) two pitfalls to this interest: one, it erodes the basis of feminist political action; and two, it implicitly risks making the mistake of essentialism, that is, of assuming that all women share an essential trait or set of traits that define them as such.

If, as many continental feminist theorists claim, difference is not limited to sexual difference, but marks human beings in a variety of ways, then it is reasonable to assume that women of different races, for example, may have different political interests, different relationships to their own gender identities, and strikingly different experiences with sexism. Other differences are not far behind: class, sexual orientation, physical ability, ethnic identity, geographic location, etc., all serve to undermine the notion that “woman” is a coherent, unified category. Yet such a category, it would seem, is a necessary condition to the development of a women's movement. If continental feminism undermines our ability to join together as women, if it serves to fragment women rather than bring them together, if in fact there is virtually nothing about being women that all women hold in common, then it is difficult to imagine how large-scale political action is possible. The emphasis on difference, then, manifests itself as problematically divisive.

Given this risk of fragmentation, it would seem contradictory to be concerned about the risks of essentialism inherent in the emphasis on difference. Does not continental feminism, after all, undermine the possibility of any essentialist approach to women as a group? Indeed, it does—yet continental feminism at other points emphasizes difference not among women, but between women and men, and while it does not generally describe sexual difference as having a particular content or character (in other words, continental feminism does not articulate an essential similarity that exists within all women and is universally absent in men), nevertheless in insisting that men and women are different, it creates the very category that in other cases it seems committed to deconstructing. Moreover, in terms of differences among women, the problem of essentialism is not in fact transcended, but is merely moved to other levels. There is assumed to be something essentially similar among a certain category of women (say, European-American bisexual women) that distinguishes them from women of other categories, but such an assumption still constitutes essentialism.

It is interesting to note at this juncture that these two criticisms concerning difference at least appear to be in tension. Without a coherent theory of the unity of the category of woman, continental feminism cannot account for or support a feminist movement; yet the reliance upon sexual difference and other differences as fundamental aspects of human beings risks essentialism.

4.3 The Complexity of the Theories

Finally, and perhaps most common, continental feminist philosophy is criticized for being overly esoteric. This criticism is related conceptually to that concerning its apolitical nature, as described above. However, on its own, this criticism speaks to the fact that comprehending and working within continental feminist theory demands extremely specialized knowledge, and is therefore limited to a very few individuals. Moreover, those individuals are almost inevitably situated within economically and racially privileged groups, since the academic and intellectual background assumed by this body of work is rarely attained without access to extremely high levels of education.

In being dense, intellectually challenging, and, frankly, couched in writing that is highly saturated with jargon and technical language, continental feminist theory presents some very real barriers to those who do not have access to high levels of post-graduate education. To be complex in this way is to be exclusive in a way that is distinctly problematic for feminist thought and activism.

5. Responses to Criticisms

Continental feminists respond to the above criticisms in a variety of ways, which will only be summarized briefly here. To the charge that this body of philosophy is apolitical, these philosophers argue that although the political implications of their work are not always obvious, the very depth of their criticism itself constitutes political action. Butler's point in the defense quoted above is not only that challenging the most basic and often implicit social beliefs is always political, but also that to do so necessarily entails the adopting of language and concepts that are at first glance both foreign and difficult. Thus, the defenses against the two charges of apoliticism and unnecessary esotericism are often quite similar: continental feminist theory is committed to questioning such deeply held, deeply embedded concepts that it must of necessity adopt new kinds of language, new kinds of models, that are by definition counterintuitive.

With regard to the concerns about the emphasis on difference, these theorists make at least two points. One, they stress that adopting difference as a basis for ethics does not preclude forming coalitions among different kinds of groups. In fact, following the work of Irigaray, many theorists point out that to assume that identity or similarity is the only basis for interaction or discourse is simply inaccurate. Difference is that which gives discourse its value, that which creates the space for true interaction. If “women” as a category does not hold entirely, if difference sprouts up again and again, this merely means that we have the opportunity for further understanding, for more kinds of interaction. Finally, some continental theorists (for example, Braidotti 1994) have argued that feminists should stop being so wary of essentialism in any and all forms. While philosophically problematic, essentialism as a political strategy—i.e., women sometimes, and carefully, acting “as if” they were a coherent category—may have significant value.

As mentioned above, this is an extraordinarily scanty representation of the responses on behalf of continental feminists to some of the charges made against their work. There is no doubt that feminist approaches to continental philosophy are as controversial as they are intriguing. This is, after all, a fairly young field in philosophy, both in relation to the discipline as a whole and to the subdiscipline that is feminist theory, and there is every reason to suspect that it will continue to grow in surprising and challenging ways.


A. General

B. Continental Philosophy

C. Continental Feminism

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Beauvoir, Simone de | contractarianism | existentialism | Foucault, Michel | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | Husserl, Edmund | Kant, Immanuel | Kierkegaard, Søren | liberalism | Merleau-Ponty, Maurice | Mill, John Stuart | Nietzsche, Friedrich | phenomenology | Ricoeur, Paul | Sartre, Jean-Paul


The author thanks Jennifer Hansen heartily for her contribution of the Gender and the Psyche" section.