Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Feminist Political Philosophy

First published Sun Mar 1, 2009

Feminist political philosophy is an area of philosophy focused on understanding and critiquing the way political philosophy is usually construed, often without any attention to feminist concerns, and to articulating how political theory might be reconstructed in a way that advances feminist concerns. Feminist political philosophy is a branch of both feminist philosophy and political philosophy. As a branch of feminist philosophy, it serves as a form of critique or a hermeneutics of suspicion (Ricœur 1970). That is, it serves as a way of opening up or looking at the political world as it is usually understood and uncovering ways in which women and their current and historical concerns are poorly depicted, represented, and addressed. As a branch of political philosophy, feminist political philosophy serves as a field for developing new ideals, practices, and justifications for how political institutions and practices should be organized and reconstructed.

While feminist philosophy has been instrumental in critiquing and reconstructing many branches of philosophy, from aesthetics to philosophy of science, feminist political philosophy may be the paradigmatic branch of feminist philosophy because it best exemplifies the point of feminist theory, which is, to borrow a phrase from Marx, not only to understand the world but to change it (Marx and Engels 1998). And, though other fields have effects that may change the world, feminist political philosophy focuses most directly on understanding ways in which collective life can be improved. This project involves understanding the ways in which power emerges and is used or misused in public life (see the entry on feminist perspectives on power). As with other kinds of feminist theory, common themes have emerged for discussion and critique, but there has been little in the way of consensus among feminist theorists on what is the best way to understand them. This introductory article lays out the various schools of thought and areas of concern that have occupied this vibrant field of philosophy for the past thirty years.

1. Historical Context

Current feminist political philosophy is indebted to the work of earlier generations of feminist scholarship and activism, including the first wave of feminism in the English-speaking world, which took place from the 1840s to the 1920s and focused on improving the political, educational, and economic system primarily for middle-class women. Its greatest achievements were to develop a language of equal rights for women and to garner women the right to vote. It is also indebted to the second wave of feminism, which, beginning in the 1960s, drew on the language of the civil rights movements (e.g., the language of liberation) and on a new feminist consciousness that emerged through women's solidarity movements and new forms of reflection that uncovered sexist attitudes and impediments throughout the whole of society. As the entry on approaches to feminism notes, by 1970 feminism had expanded from activism to scholarship with the publication of Shulamith Firestone's The Dialectic of Sex (Firestone 1971); Kate Millett's Sexual Politics (Millett 1970); and Robin Morgan's Sisterhood is Powerful (Morgan 1970).

As a branch of political philosophy, feminist political philosophy has often mirrored the various divisions at work in political philosophy more broadly. Prior to the fall of the Berlin Wall and the end of the Cold War, political philosophy was usually divided into categories such as liberal, conservative, socialist, and Marxist. Except for conservatism, for each category there were often feminists working and critiquing alongside it. Hence, as Alison Jaggar's classic text, Feminist Politics and Human Nature, spelled out, each ideological approach drew feminist scholars who would both take their cue from and borrow the language of a particular ideology (Jaggar 1983). Jaggar's text grouped feminist political philosophy into four camps: liberal feminism, socialist feminism, Marxist feminism, and radical feminism. The first three groups followed the lines of Cold War global political divisions: American liberalism, European socialism, and a revolutionary communism (though few in the west would embrace Soviet-style communism). Radical feminism was the most indigenous of the feminist philosophies, developing its own political vocabulary with its roots in the deep criticisms of patriarchy that feminist consciousness had produced in its first and second waves. Otherwise, feminist political philosophy largely followed the lines of traditional political philosophy. But this has never been an uncritical following. As a field bent on changing the world, even liberal feminist theorists tended to criticize liberalism more than to embrace it, and to embrace socialism and other more radical points of view more than to reject them. Still, on the whole, these theorists generally operated within the language and framework of their chosen approach to political philosophy.

Political philosophy began to change enormously in the 1980s, just before the end of the Cold War, with a new invocation of an old Hegelian category: civil society, an arena of political life intermediate between the state and the household. This was the arena of associations, churches, labor unions, book clubs, choral societies and manifold other nongovernmental yet still public organizations. In the 1980s political theorists began to turn their focus from the state to this intermediate realm, which suddenly took center stage in Eastern Europe in organizations that challenged the power of the state and ultimately led to the downfall of communist regimes.

After the end of the Cold War, political philosophy along with political life radically realigned. New attention focused on civil society and the public sphere, especially with the timely translation of Jürgen Habermas's early work, the Structural Transformation of the Public Sphere (Habermas 1989). Volumes soon appeared on civil society and the public sphere, focusing on the ways in which people organized themselves and developed public power rather than on the ways that the state garnered and exerted its power. In fact, there arose a sense that the public sphere ultimately might exert more power than the state, at least in the fundamental way in which public will is formed and serves to legitimate—or not—state power. In the latter respect, John Rawls's work was influential by developing a theory of justice that tied the legitimacy of institutions to the normative judgments that a reflective and deliberative people might make (Rawls 1971). By the early 1990s, Marxists seemed to have disappeared or at least become very circumspect (though the downfall of communist regimes needn't have had any effect on Marxist analysis proper, which never subscribed to Leninist or Maoist thought). Socialists also retreated or transformed themselves into “radical democrats.”

Now the old categories of liberal, socialist, and Marxist feminisms were much less relevant. Along with political philosophy more broadly, more feminist political philosophers began to turn to the meaning and interpretation of civil society, the public sphere, and democracy itself.

2. Contemporary Approaches and Debates

Of Jaggar's categories, liberal feminism and radical feminism remain strong currents in feminist political thought. Care ethics, which was originally developed as an alternative to mainstream ethical theory, has been harnessed to counter liberal political theory (Gilligan 1982; Held 1995). More recently, two other approaches have emerged: radical democratic or “agonistic” feminism (Mouffe 1992, 1993, 1999, 2000) and deliberative or communicative democratic theory (Benhabib 1992, 1996; Benhabib and Cornell 1987; Fraser 1989; Young 1990, 1997, 2000). An even newer approach that might be termed “performative” is also developing (Zerilli 2005; Cornell 1998). This section gives a brief overview of these various approaches and attendant issues.

2.1 Liberal Feminism

The first of these, liberal feminism, can be traced back to feminist efforts and theorizing around political and economic equality for women. This approach got a boost with the publication of John Rawls's A Theory of Justice (Rawls 1971) and subsequently his Political Liberalism (Rawls 1993). Susan Moller Okin (Okin 1989, 1979; Okin et al. 1999) and Eva Kittay (Kittay 1999) have used Rawls's work productively to extend his theory to attend to women's concerns. From a more critical perspective, several feminist theorists have argued that some of the central categories of liberalism occlude women's lived concerns; for example, the central liberal private/public distinction sequesters the private sphere, and any harm that may occur there to women, away from political scrutiny (Pateman 1983). Perhaps more than any other approach, liberal feminist theory parallels developments in liberal feminist activism. While feminist activists have waged legal and political battles to criminalize, as just one example, violence against women (which previously, in marital relations, hadn't been considered a crime), feminist political philosophers who have engaged the liberal lexicon have shown how the distinction between private and public realms has served to uphold male domination of women by rendering power relations within the household as “natural” and immune from political regulation. Such political philosophy uncovers how seemingly innocuous and “commonsensical” categories have covert power agendas. For example, old conceptions of the sanctity of the private space of the household and the role of women primarily as child-bearers and caregivers served to protect male domination of women in the household from public scrutiny. Feminist critiques of the public/private split supported legal advances that finally led in the 1980s to the criminalization in the United States of spousal rape (Hagan and Sussman 1988).

2.2 Radical Feminism

A second approach, radical feminism, remains committed to getting at the root of male domination by understanding the source of power differentials, which some radical feminists, including Catharine MacKinnon, trace back to male sexuality and the notion that heterosexual intercourse enacts male domination over women. “Women and men are divided by gender, made into the sexes as we know them, by the requirements of its dominant form, heterosexuality, which institutionalizes male sexual dominance and female sexual submission. If this is true, sexuality is the linchpin of gender inequality” (MacKinnon 1989,113). Radical feminists tend to see power as running one-way, from those with power over those who are being oppressed. As Amy Allen puts it, “Unlike liberal feminists, who view power as a positive social resource that ought to be fairly distributed, and feminist phenomenologists, who understand domination in terms of a tension between transcendence and immanence, radical feminists tend to understand power in terms of dyadic relations of dominance/subordination, often understood on analogy with the relationship between master and slave.” (See the section on radical feminist approaches in the entry on feminist perspectives on power.) Unlike the more reformist politics of liberal feminism, radical feminists have largely sought to reject the prevailing order altogether, sometimes advocating separatism (Daly 1985, 1990).

2.3 Maternal Feminism

A third important approach in feminist political philosophy draws on what is called care or maternal ethics. (See the discussion in the entry on feminist ethics.) Drawing on feminist research in moral psychology (Gilligan 1982; Held 1995), this field explores the ways in which the virtues that society and mothering cultivate in women can provide an alternative to the traditional emphases in moral and political philosophy on universality, reason, and justice. Some maternalists have sought to take the virtues that had long been relegated to the private realm, such as paying particular attention to those who are vulnerable or taking into consideration circumstances and not just abstract principles, and use them as well in the public realm. This approach has led to intense debates between liberals who advocated universal ideals of justice and maternalists who advocated attention to the particular, to relationships, to care. By the 1990s, though, many maternalists had revised their views. Rather than seeing care and justice as mutually exclusive alternatives, they began to recognize that attention to care should be accompanied by attention to fairness (justice) in order to attend to the plight of those with whom we have no immediate relation (Koggel 1998).

The maternalist approach raises the question of whether and, if so, how women have distinct virtues. Feminists as a whole have long distanced themselves from ideas that women have any particular essence, choosing instead to see femininity and its accompanying virtues as social constructs, dispositions that result from culture and conditioning, certainly not biological givens. So for maternalists to champion the virtues that have inculcated femininity seems also to champion a patriarchal system that relegates one gender to the role of caretaker. The maternalist tactic has largely been to flip the hierarchy, to claim that the work of the household is more meaningful and sustaining than the work of the polis. But critics, such as Drucilla Cornell, Mary Dietz, and Chantal Mouffe, argue that such a revaluation keeps intact the dichotomy between the private and the public and the old association of women's work with childcare. (Butler and Scott 1992; Phillips and NetLibrary Inc 1998, pp. 386-389)

Such concerns are part of a larger set of concerns and criticisms that have run through feminist theorizing since the 1970s, with non-white, non-middle-class, and non-American women starting to question the very category of “woman” and the notion that this title could be a boundary-spanning category that could unite women of various walks of life. (See the entries on identity politics and feminist perspectives on sex and gender.) Criticisms of a unitary identity of “woman” have been motivated by worries that much feminist theory has originated from the standpoint of a particular class of women who mistake their own particular standpoint for a universal one. In her 1981 book, Ain't I a Woman?: Black women and feminism, bell hooks notes that the feminist movement pretends to speak for all women but was made up of primarily white, middle class women who, because of their narrow perspective, did not represent the needs of poor women and women of color and ended up reinforcing class stereotypes (hooks 1981). What is so damning about this kind of critique is that it mirrors the one that feminists have leveled against mainstream political theorists who have taken the particular category of men to be a universal category of mankind, a schema that does not in fact include women under the category of mankind but marks them as other.

Hence, one of the most vexing issues facing feminist theory in general and feminist political philosophy in particular is the matter of identity (see the entry on identity politics). Identity politics in general is a controversial political practice of mobilizing for change on the basis of a political identity (women, black, chicana, etc.). The philosophical debate is whether such identities are based on some real difference or history of oppression, and also whether people should embrace identities that have historically been used to oppress them. Identity politics in feminist practice is fraught along at least two axes: whether there is any real essence or identity of woman in general and even if so whether the category of woman could be used to represent all women. Women at the intersection of various identities (e.g, black women) have raised questions about which identity is foremost or whether either identity is apt. Such questions play out with the question of political representation—what aspects of identity are politically salient and truly representative, whether race, class, or gender (Phillips 1995; Young 1997, 2000). The ontological question of women's identity gets played out on the political stage when it comes to matters of political representation, group rights, and affirmative action. The 2008 U.S. Democratic Party primary battle between Senators Barack Obama and Hillary Clinton turned this philosophical question into a very real and heated one from black women throughout the United States. Was a black woman who supported Clinton a traitor to her race, or a black woman who supported Obama a traitor to her sex? Or did it make any sense to talk about identity in a way that would lead to charges of treason? Of the approaches discussed above, radical and maternal feminism seem particularly wedded to feminist identity politics.

2.4 Democratic Feminism

Fourth is feminist democratic theory, perhaps best known through the works of Seyla Benhabib (Benhabib 1992, 1996), greatly inspired by the work of the German critical theorist, Jürgen Habermas. Like other feminist democratic theorists, Benhabib's work engages democratic theorists quite broadly, not just feminist theorists. This passage of hers helps to clarify what she takes to be the best aim of a political philosophy: a state of affairs to which all affected would assent. As she writes,

Only those norms (i.e., general rules of action and institutional arrangements) can be said to be valid (i.e., morally binding), which would be agreed to by all those affected by their consequences, if such agreement were reached as a consequence of a process of deliberation that had the following features: 1) participation in such deliberation is governed by norms of equality and symmetry; all have the same chances to initiate speech acts, to question, to interrogate, and to open debate; 2) all have the right to question the assigned topics of conversation; and 3) all have the right to initiate reflexive arguments about the very rules of the discourse procedure and the way in which they are applied or carried out. (Benhabib 1996, 70)

Democratic theorists such as Benhabib and Habermas contend that certain conditions need to be in place in order for members of a political community to arrive at democratic outcomes, namely the proceedings need to be deliberative. Some take deliberation to be a matter of reasoned argumentation; others see it as less about reason or argumentation but more about an open process of working through choices. (McAfee 2004.)

Deliberative theory is not the only prominent form of feminist democratic theory. Iris Young's pioneering book, Justice and the Politics of Difference and several of her subsequent works have been very influential and have led to a good deal of hesitance in feminist theoretical communities about the claims of deliberative theory. Where Benhabib is confident that conditions can be such that all who are affected can have a voice in deliberations, Young points out that those who have been historically silenced have a difficult time having their views heard or heeded. Young is skeptical of the claims of mainstream democratic theory that democratic deliberative processes could lead to outcomes that would be acceptable to all (Young 1990, 1997). Young, along with Nancy Fraser (Fraser 1989) and others, worried that in the process of trying to reach consensus, the untrained voices of women and others who have been marginalized would be left out of the final tally. Young's criticisms were very persuasive, leading a generation of feminist political philosophers to be wary of deliberative democratic theory. Instead of deliberative democracy, in the mid 1990s Young proposed a theory of communicative democracy, hoping to make way for a deliberative conception that was open to means of expression beyond the rational expression of mainstream deliberative democratic theory. Young worried that deliberation as defined by Habermas is too reason-based and leaves out forms of communication that women and people of color tend to use, such as greeting, rhetoric, and storytelling. Young argued that these alternative modes of communication, modes that women and people of color and other marginalized people tended to use, could provide the basis of a more democratic, communicative theory. In her last major book, Inclusion and Democracy (Young 2000), Young had clearly moved to embrace deliberative theory itself, seeing the ways in which it could be constructed to give voice to those who had been otherwise marginalized. More recent feminist democratic theory has engaged deliberative theory more positively. (See McAfee and Snyder 2007.)

2.5 Agonistic Feminism

A fifth approach is agonistic feminism, which draws from a certain reading of the work of Hannah Arendt and from Antonio Gramsci, among others. Leading theorists of this approach include Chantal Mouffe (Critchley and Mouffe 1996; Laclau and Mouffe 1985, 2001; Mouffe 1979, 1992, 1993, 1999, 2000, 2005), Bonnie Honig (Honig 1993, 1995, 2001; Honig and Mapel 2002), and Ewa Ziarek (Ziarek 2001). Where liberal feminists inspired by John Rawls and democratic feminists inspired by Jürgen Habermas and/or John Dewey hold out the hope that democratic deliberations might lead to democratic agreements, agonistic feminists maintain that any kind of agreement is inherently undemocratic.

Agonistic feminist political philosophy comes out of poststructural continental feminist and philosophical traditions. It takes from Marxism, especially western Marxism, the hope for a more radically egalitarian society. It takes from contemporary continental philosophy notions of subjectivity and solidarity as malleable and constructed. Along with much of postmodern thought, it repudiates any notion of pre-existing moral or political truths or foundations. Its central claim is that feminist struggle, like other struggles for social justice, is engaged in politics as battle or war. Agonistic views see the nature of politics as inherently conflictual, with battles over power and hegemony being the central tasks of democratic struggle. Advocates of agonistic politics worry that the kind of consensus sought by democratic theorists (discussed above) will lead to some kind of oppression or injustice by silencing new struggles. As Chantal Mouffe puts it, “We have to accept that every consensus exists as a temporary result of a provisional hegemony, as a stabilization of power, and that it always entails some form of exclusion” (Mouffe 2000, 104).

2.6 Performative Feminism

A sixth approach to feminist political philosophy is emerging, what could be called performative feminist political philosophy. Performative feminist politics doesn't worry about whether it is possible to come up with a single definition of “woman” or any other political identity; it sees identity as something that is performatively created. “How we assume these identitites,” Drucilla Cornell writes, “is never something ‘out there’ that effectively determines who we can be as men and women—gay, lesbian, straight, queer, transsexual, transgender, or otherwise” (Cornell 2003, 144). It is something that is shaped as we live and externalize identities. From a performative feminist perspective, feminism is a project of anticipating and creating better political futures in the absence of foundations. As Linda Zerilli writes, “politics is about making claims and judgments—and having the courage to do so—in the absence of the objective criteria or rules that could provide certain knowledge and the guarantee that speaking in women's name will be accepted or taken up by others” (Zerilli 2005, 179). Drawing on the works of Arendt, Butler, and Joan Copjec, Zerilli calls for a “freedom-centered feminism” that “would strive to bring about transformation in normative conceptions of gender without returning to the classical notion of freedom as sovereignty” that feminists have long criticized but found difficult to resist (ibid.).

In its feminist incarnations, this view also takes its cue from Judith Butler's performative account of gender as well as Hannah Arendt's concern with the anticipatory nature of rights, as well as other thinkers' ideas, to describe an anticipatory ideal of politics. Linda Zerilli describes this kind of feminist politics as “the contingently based public practice of soliciting the agreement of others to what each of us claims to be universal” (Zerilli 2005, p. 173). From a performatve perspective, normative political claims appeal to other people, not to supposed truths or foundations.

This view recuperates many of the ideals of the Enlightenment—such as freedom, autonomy, and justice—but in a way that drops the Enlightenment's metaphysical assumptions about reason, progress, and human nature. Instead of seeing these ideals as grounded in some metaphysical facts, this new view sees them as ideals that people hold and try to instantiate through practice and imagination. Where many ancient and modern ideals of politics were based on suppositions about the nature of reality or of human beings, contemporary political philosophies generally operate without supposing that there are any universal or eternal truths. Some might see this situation as ripe for nihilism, arbitrariness, or the exercise of brute power. The performative alternative is to imagine and try to create a better world by anticipating, claiming, and appealing to others that it should be so. Even if there is no metaphysical truth that human beings have dignity and infinite worth, people can act as if it were true in order to create a world in which it is seen to be so.

What Zerilli does with the concept of freedom, Drucilla Cornell does with the idea of autonomy. Her work in ethics and political philosophy is also in this vein, arguing for seeing old Enlightenment notions such as autonomy, dignity, and personhood, in a new performative capacity, as ideals that people aspire to rather than as moral facts waiting to be discovered, applied, or realized.

Peformative feminist political philosophy shares liberal feminism's appreciation for Enlightenment ideals but in a way that is skeptical about foundations, just as agonistic feminism repudiates foundations. It has less in common with radical and maternalist feminisms for these very reasons.

In sum, feminist political philosophy is a still evolving field of thought that has much to offer mainstream political philosophy. In the past two decades it has come to exert a stronger influence over mainstream political theorizing, raising objections that mainstream philosophers have had to address, though not always very convincingly. And in its newest developments it promises to go even further.


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