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Justice, Inequality, and Health

First published Tue Dec 23, 2008

In the ten healthiest counties in the United States, white men have a life expectancy above 76.4 years. By contrast, in the ten least healthy counties, African-American men have a life expectancy of between 61 years (Philadelphia) and 57.9 years (District of Columbia) (Marmot 2001, 134). On the face of it, this inequality in the life expectancy for American men is seriously unjust. If one turns to the international context, inequalities in life expectancy of a similar magnitude can be observed even between the bottom countries and the global average: In 27 countries, both male and female life expectancy is 15 years or more below the global life expectancy of 67 years (combining males and females); and this average is itself 15 years below life expectancy in Japan, which has the highest national average of all.

But whether the appearances of injustice here will withstand close scrutiny is a separate question. Presumably, for example, most (if not all) of the 5 year inequality in life expectancy between white American women and white American men does not represent any injustice at all. In that case, inequalities in health are not unjust per se. So what makes a health inequality an injustice, when it is one? Do health inequalities have some significance in justice that differs from other important inequalities? Or is the injustice of an unjust inequality in health simply due to the application of general principles of equality and justice to the case of health?

To answer these questions, one has to examine two rather different literatures. On the one hand, there is an empirical literature concerning the underlying determinants of health and, on the other hand, there is a philosophical literature concerned with the ethics of population health. The former literature is considerably more extensive and developed than the latter. Even there, however, the answers on offer are hardly complete or fully established.

1. Introduction

Intuitively, if a given inequality in life expectancy is inevitable, then it is not unjust. A plausible necessary condition, that is, on a particular inequality's being unjust is that the inequality in question is avoidable. To the extent, for example, that some biological necessity underlies the widely observed inequality in life expectancy between men and women, this particular gender inequality in health does not qualify as an injustice. (Indeed, Sen 1992 famously relies upon an estimate of some such biologically necessary inequality, as part of an argument criticizing the treatment of women in countries where the inequality in life expectancy actually favours men). A first step, therefore, in analysing the possible injustice of an inequality in health is to establish that the inequality is avoidable. This, in turn, requires some understanding of the underlying determinants (or causes) of health.

More specifically, it requires an understanding of the socially controllable determinants of health, since it is only by reference to their causal contributions that an inequality in health can be accounted ‘avoidable.’ (Of course, some very important determinants of health—notably, biology and luck—are not socially controllable. But their causal contributions serve precisely to make certain health inequalities unavoidable). Most of the empirical literature concentrates on what are known as ‘the social determinants’ of health. In this context, a social determinant of health is a socially controllable factor outside the traditional health care system that is an independent partial cause of an individual's health status. Candidate examples include income, education, occupational rank, and social class.

Health care (personal medical care and public health) is clearly an additional socially controllable determinant of health. Nevertheless, for different reasons, in both the empirical and the philosophical literatures, health care is something of a separate topic. Accordingly, we shall touch on it only briefly. In the public health literature, variations in access to health care are not regarded as a significant contributor to inequalities in health. (For a brief corrective against the natural tendency to reserve a privileged position for health care here, see Marmot and Wilkinson 1999, ch. 1). But to recognise that there are social determinants of health, in the sense we have defined, is not to deny the importance of health care as another partial cause.

Whether universal access to health care reduces inequalities in health significantly or not, there is a widespread conviction that it is a requirement of justice. Indeed, the development of a rationale for universal access to health care (as a requirement of justice) has been the traditional focus of philosophical reflection on health and justice. The most well-known rationale is the equality of opportunity argument developed by Norman Daniels (1985; 2008). On this argument, an individual's entitlement to health care rests on the instrumental contribution that good health makes to preserving her fair share of opportunity. (Since Daniels' rationale does ultimately turn on the claim that universal access reduces inequalities in health, it is open to empirical criticism on this point [Sreenivasan 2001; 2007a]). Another prominent rationale is the prudent insurance argument (Dworkin 2000, ch. 8; Gibbard 1982). Here the individual's entitlement to health care rests on the proposition that, under certain idealized conditions, it would be prudentially rational of her to spend some of her fair share of income on a decent minimum of health care insurance. A third rationale for universal access to health care has been offered by Allen Buchanan (1984). His argument has two distinctive features. On the one hand, it allows the justification for providing an individual with health care to vary across individuals—universal coverage is justified by stitching together a patchwork quilt, as it were, of different justifications. On the other hand, it eschews egalitarian premises (there is no appeal to a ‘fair share’ of anything)—in fact, its largest ‘patch’ is provided by an argument from enforced beneficence that rests on explicitly libertarian premises. (See the entry on justice and access to health care.)

2. A social gradient in health

The empirical literature's most significant and powerful reported finding can actually be replicated with any of the listed candidate social determinants of health (income, education, occupational rank, social class): This is the existence, within a given society, of a social gradient in health. The most significant evidence on the relation between a socially controllable factor and health comes from the Whitehall studies, conducted in England by Michael Marmot and his colleagues (1978). In these studies, the candidate social determinant of health is occupational rank.

Between 1967 and 1969, Marmot examined some 18,000 male civil servants aged between 40 and 69 years old. By placing a flag on their records at the National Health Service (NHS) Central Registry, Marmot was able to track the cause and date of death for each subject who later died. His data are unusually good data. To begin with, they are generated from data-points on specific individuals. Each datum reports the relation between the occupational rank of a particular person and the life-span (and cause of death) of the very same person. By contrast, almost every other study begins from aggregate data. In addition, a number of important background factors are held constant for this study population. Notably, all the subjects in this study are stably employed, they live in the same region (greater London), and all have free access to health care provided by the NHS.

Figure 1 presents the Whitehall data after 25 years of follow-up (van Rossum et al. 2000, 181). It reports age adjusted all-cause mortality rate ratios by employment grade, for three periods of follow-up. A mortality rate ratio reports the proportion of deaths in a given group divided by the proportion of deaths in the reference group. There are four grades in the British Civil Service employment hierarchy: administrative (highest), professional/executive, clerical, and ‘other’ (lowest). The professional/executive grade has been used as the reference group, so its mortality rate ratio is 1.0 by definition.

Figure 1. Social gradient in total mortality, Whitehall 25 year follow-up

Figure 1. Social gradient in total mortality, Whitehall 25 year follow-up

The striking and important feature of these data is that the relationship between employment grade and mortality exhibits a marked gradient. It is natural to think that, below some threshold of deprivation, there will be disproportionate ill-health. Yet, in this study population, there is no deprivation, not even in the lowest grade (where everyone is still a government employee with free access to health care). Furthermore, and notably, there is no threshold. Rather, there is a step-wise improvement in health outcomes as one climbs the employment grade ladder. In addition, these gradients persist even after the mortality rates have been adjusted for standard risk factors. For example, coronary heart disease (CHD) accounted for 43 percent of the deaths in the Whitehall study at 10 years of follow-up (Marmot et al. 1984, 1003). Standard risk factors for CHD include smoking, blood pressure, cholesterol and blood sugar levels, and height. Figure 2 presents the Whitehall data on mortality from CHD after 25 years of follow-up (Marmot 2000, 363). It reports relative rates of death from CHD by employment grade, with administrators having a rate of 1.0 by definition. The left bar in each pair displays the relative rate adjusted for age alone, while the right bar adjusts it for all the standard risk factors. Correcting for standard risk factors does explain some of the gradient in CHD mortality, but no more than a third. The remaining gradient is still marked.

Figure 2. Risk factor adjusted social gradient in CHD mortality, Whitehall 25 year follow-up

Figure 2. Risk factor adjusted social gradient in CHD mortality, Whitehall 25 year follow-up

3. Other social determinants of health

The existence of a social gradient in health certainly suggests that something in addition to health care exercises a powerful influence on an individual's health—something, moreover, that at least correlates with a social variable. However, it is not clear exactly what this something is. To begin with, similar domestic gradients in individual life expectancy can be found when the social variable is income (McDonough et al. 1997); when it is education (Huisman et al. 2005; Crimmins and Saito 2001; Elo and Preston 1996; Kunst and Mackenbach 1994); and when it is social class (Wilkinson and Marmot 2003).

By itself, therefore, the surface fact of a social gradient in health is compatible with quite different accounts of the underlying causal influences on individual health. Each distinct social variable might function as a ‘marker’ for a different underlying causal factor, different social variables might function instead as alternative markers for the same underlying causal factor, or there may be some mixture of both. (It is also possible that some social variables function as a relatively direct causal factor.)

Furthermore, it is not clear how much of the correlation between health and a given social variable is properly causal in the first place. In some cases, there is clearly some ‘reverse causation’ between health and a social variable, notably from poor health to lower income (Deaton 2002). In addition, there is plainly some causation among social variables, notably from education both to higher income and to higher occupational status.

The choice of the social variable in terms of which to describe some social gradient in health can be made on a number of different grounds. One obvious ground would be to choose the variable(s) that came closest to conveying the operative causal mechanism(s). Another ground would be to choose the variable(s) that have independent moral significance, such as race and gender. These grounds need not exclude each other and there may be a case for choosing the same variable on both grounds. The second ground acquires a special relevance if health inequalities suffered by individuals who also suffer, for example, from racial discrimination are more unjust than health inequalities (of the same magnitude) suffered in the absence of racial discrimination. If one injustice can compound another, then the choice of social variable may affect the kind of inequality in health at issue, and not simply its magnitude.

When the social variable is income, there is a further definitional dispute to consider. Income appears to have a significant effect on life expectancy, even controlling for education (Backlund et al. 1999). However, there is an on-going debate about which definition of ‘income’ is adequate to capture the contribution individual income makes to individual life expectancy (see the sample of articles collected in Kawachi et al. 1999). According to the absolute income hypothesis, the contribution income makes to individual life expectancy is entirely a function of the individual's non-comparative income. By contrast, the relative income hypothesis holds, roughly, that an individual's life expectancy is also a function of the relative level of her income—that is, its level compared to others' income in her society—and not simply of its non-comparative level (Wilkinson 1996). To make this second hypothesis precise requires one, among other things, to specify the reference group to which the individual's income is compared and also the nature of the comparison (for examples, see Deaton 2003).

Finally, note that the foregoing discussion proceeds on the assumption that inequalities in health are defined in terms of membership in some social group or other, with the identity of the group following from the choice of social variable. While this is how most of the discussion in the literature is structured, the assumption is not uncontroversial. For example, Christopher Murray and colleagues (2001) have argued in favor of an alternative methodology, in which ‘health inequality’ refers to ‘the variation in health status across individuals in a population’ (201), rather than to a difference in health status between social groups. Anand and colleagues (2001) survey other technical issues in the measurement of health inequalities.

4. Causal pathways

To determine whether any of the correlations between individual life expectancy and a social variable is causal, one needs some account of the causal pathways between candidate social determinants and specific mortality risk factors. Unfortunately, these pathways are not well understood (Adler and Newman 2002; Adler and Ostrove 1999; Evans et al. 1994). While research in this area remains preliminary, it may be useful to describe some of the possibilities.

To begin with, researchers distinguish material pathways from psychosocial ones. Certain conditions of absolute material deprivation constitute well-recognised risks for ill health and mortality, including inadequate nutrition, lack of clean water and sanitation, and poor housing. A very plausible causal pathway runs from low levels of non-comparative individual income through these material risk factors to lower individual life expectancy.

However, the cited social gradients in life expectancy were mainly observed in highly developed societies, where the prevalence of absolute material deprivation is fairly low. In particular, a significant social gradient was observed in the Whitehall studies, where the occupants of even the lowest occupational rank were nevertheless all stably employed civil servants with free access to health care. Since entire gradients can emerge in the absence of material deprivation, many researchers have been moved to postulate additional pathways—i.e., psychosocial pathways—between health and some aspect of social status (Marmot 2004).

One of the most prominent specific risk factors envisaged as the terminus for a psychosocial pathway is (the effects of) stress. As Eric Brunner and Michael Marmot (1999) explain, the long-term effects of stress differ importantly from its short-term effects. In the short-term, an individual's fight-or-flight response to external stressors is beneficial insofar as it enables him to cope with threats and challenges. Among other things, this acute stress response involves the activation of neuroendocrine pathways, along which adrenaline and cortisol (e.g.) are released into the bloodstream. These hormones stimulate psychological arousal (e.g., vigilance) and mobilise energy, while simultaneously inhibiting functions irrelevant to immediate survival (e.g., digestion, growth, and repair). An optimal reactivity pattern is characterised by a sharp increase in levels of circulating adrenaline (and later, cortisol), followed by a rapid return to baseline once the challenge has passed. Sub-optimal patterns are characterised by elevated baseline levels and slower returns to baseline.

By contrast, the long-term effects of stress—either from over frequent provocation of acute stress or from chronic stress—can be physiologically harmful. Stress-induced damage is mediated, among other things, by prolonged elevation of adrenaline and cortisol levels in the blood. Elevated cortisol can lead to the accumulation of cholesterol (e.g., by raising glucose levels even during inactivity); and elevated adrenaline increases the blood's tendency to clot, which can add to the formation of arterial plaques and thereby lead to increased risk of heart disease and stroke. Other risks that may be increased by stress-induced damage include risks for cancer, infection, and cognitive decline.

A psychosocial pathway running from stress-induced damage—or ‘allostatic load’ (McEwen 1998)—has next to be traced to some social factor, preferably one amenable to policy manipulation. Two factors that have attracted considerable attention in this connection are ‘social rank’ and ‘job control.’

The most specific evidence on the role of social rank in producing stress-induced damage comes from studies of non-human primates (Brunner and Marmot 1999; Evans et al. 1994). In various primate species, social life is organised in terms of clear and stable dominance hierarchies. Sapolsky and Mott (1987) found that hierarchies of free-ranging male baboons exhibit an inverse social gradient both in cortisol elevations and in adverse cholesterol ratios. Subordinate baboons have higher baseline levels of cortisol and lower levels of high density lipoprotein (i.e., ‘good’) cholesterol than dominant baboons, while total cholesterol levels are similar across the hierarchy. In subordinate baboons, cortisol levels also return slowly to baseline following a challenge, whereas (a sub-set of) dominant baboons have optimal stress reactivity patterns (Sapolsky 1993). Furthermore, when the dominance hierarchy is experimentally disrupted, then all the baboons (including the former dominants) exhibit the sub-optimal stress reactivity patterns of subordinates.

Yet more specific evidence that stress-induced damage is sensitive to rank (i.e., to relative social status) per se comes from studies of captive macaque monkeys. In these studies, experimenters manipulated the dominance hierarchy, forcing individual monkeys to occupy new ranks, while holding their diet and environment constant. Shively and Clarkson (1994) fed female macaques a cholesterol rich diet while manipulating their hierarchy. Over a two year period, all of the monkeys developed atherosclerosis (coronary plaques). However, dominant monkeys who became subordinate had a five-fold excess as compared to those who remained dominant. (Part of this excess was due to the stress associated simply with a change in social rank [as distinct from a demotion], since subordinate monkeys who became dominant also had more atherosclerosis [albeit, only twice as much] compared to those who remained subordinate). Cohen and colleagues (1997) exposed male macaques to an adenovirus while manipulating their hierarchy. They found an inverse social gradient in the susceptibility to viral infection, with the occupants of the lowest social rank—whoever they might be—being at ‘substantially greater risk’ of infection. Lower status monkeys also exhibited a greater cortisol response to the hierarchy manipulations, but this did not account for their differential susceptibility.

Evidence on the role of low job control in producing stress-induced damage comes from the Whitehall II study (Marmot et al. 1997). ‘Job control’ refers to an individual's level of task control in the workplace, operationalised here in terms of a questionnaire concerning decision authority and skill discretion. One of the principal diseases for which stress-induced damage increases the risk is coronary heart disease (CHD). In Whitehall II, there was an inverse social gradient in age-adjusted CHD incidence: Compared to their high grade counterparts, intermediate grade male civil servants were 1.25 times more likely to develop a new case of CHD in a five year interval, while low grade men were 1.5 times more likely. For women, the odds ratios were 1.12 and 1.47. Marmot and his colleagues also found an inverse social gradient in low job control. Among men, 8.7 percent of high, 26.6 percent of intermediate, and 77.8 percent of low grade civil servants reported low job control; for women, the percentages were 10.1, 34.8, and 75.3. But their key finding was that a substantial part of the gradient in CHD incidence could be attributed to the differences in job control. Controlling for low job control reduced the low grade (e.g.) men's odds ratio for new CHD from 1.5 to 1.18 and the women's from 1.47 to 1.23. By comparison, known CHD risk factors only reduced the same ratios from 1.5 to 1.3 and from 1.47 to 1.35, respectively.

Finally, of course, plausible causal pathways between stress-induced damage and these particular social factors will only help to breathe causality into the correlations with which we began if either social rank or job control can, in turn, be suitably connected with income, education, occupational rank, or social class. To date, few such connections have been established, apart from that between job control and occupational rank.

In the present context, the point in consulting the empirical literature on the underlying determinants of health was to establish whether (and, ideally, to what extent) particular inequalities in health are avoidable. For the minimal purposes of making an evaluation in justice—that is, of opening the door to such an evaluation—the available evidence is arguably adequate: Given that the distributions of income and of education are more or less socially controllable, as is the composition of occupational hierarchies, it is hard not to believe that the significant inequalities in health that correlate with these factors are at least somewhat avoidable. Otherwise put, it would be implausible, given the evidence, to deny that these inequalities in health represent any injustice at all on the grounds that they are unavoidable.

Things may be different, however, for the purposes of designing policy remedies. As Angus Deaton puts it, ‘policy cannot be intelligently conducted without an understanding of mechanisms; correlations are not enough’ (2002, 15). It is not clear that our existing understanding of the causal pathways between socially controllable factors and specific mortality risks is sufficiently well-developed to underwrite concrete policy proposals. Moreover, even if it were, it would still be a further step to license implementation of some such proposal. Among other things, a license of this kind requires an account of the comparative effectiveness of a proposed reform in relation to salient alternatives.

5. Equality

On the assumption that a particular inequality in health is avoidable, what else is required to establish that it is unjust? Dahlgren and Whitehead (1991) argue that the inequality must also be unfair, while Anand and Peter (2000) object that unfairness entails avoidability and so is not really separate from it. Whatever one decides on that point, appeals to fairness will themselves have to rest on some basis or other. Two fundamentally different approaches to bringing verdicts of fairness to bear on a given health inequality can be distinguished. We might call them the direct and the indirect approaches (for an analogous distinction, see Peter 2004).

The simplest example of the direct approach applies a general principle of equality to the case of health. (For general discussion of the grounds of egalitarianism, as well as of the character of different versions, see the entry on egalitarianism.) With some qualifications, the resultant requirement of ‘equality of health’ is affirmed, for example, by Culyer and Wagstaff (1993). This implies that any avoidable inequality in health is unfair or unjust.

Others might require only that health be ‘more or less’ equal. In some contexts, the bounds of this ‘more or less’ (i.e., of how much inequality is permissible) can be safely left to intuitive judgement. For example, it is plausible to judge—purely in relation to magnitude—that the nearly 8 year difference in life expectancy between English men in social class V (unskilled manual) and those in social class I (professional) (Wilkinson and Marmot 2003, 10) exceeds the bounds of permissible inequality, even though they have not been specified. In the present context, however, this intuitive approach is unfortunately confounded by the fact that we do not know how much of that 8 year difference is actually avoidable. From the plausibility of judging that 8 years exceeds the bounds of ‘more or less equal health’ and that ‘at least some’ of the 8 year difference is avoidable, one cannot safely infer that the observed inequality in English male life expectancy between social classes V and I is unfair.

On the direct approach, a verdict of injustice is spread backwards from the primary injustice of an unjust health inequality to its (socially controllable) causes. For example, the causes of the avoidable part of the inequality in male life expectancy between social classes V and I are themselves accounted unjust precisely because their socially controllable effect is unjust (according to the strict equality principle), and this verdict holds even if these causes are otherwise permissible (i.e., permissible apart from their effects).

By contrast, on the indirect approach, verdicts of injustice are spread forwards from the primary injustice of an unjust cause of a health inequality to the inequality itself. Suppose, for example, that part of the difference in life expectancy between white and African-American men in the United States is caused by racial discrimination. On the indirect approach, this part of that inequality in health is unjust because its cause is unjust, and this verdict holds even if avoidable inequalities in health are not otherwise unjust (e.g., even if no valid principle of equality applies directly to health).

Of course, it is possible for the two approaches to be combined. If some valid principle of equality applies directly to health, and if some independent injustices function as causes of health inequalities, then a complete account of justice in relation to health inequalities will require a combined approach. The scenario in which one injustice attaches directly to the inequality, while another attaches primarily to its cause also neatly frames the question of whether one injustice can compound another. Suppose, for example, that a strict equality principle applies directly to health. In that case, an avoidable inequality in life expectancy of 2 years between, say, American group A and American group B would be unjust in itself, whatever its cause(s). Now suppose, furthermore, that this 2 year inequality is entirely caused by racial discrimination against group A, committed by the longer-lived group B. The issue of compounding amounts to asking whether the injustice of a 2 year inequality in life expectancy is worse when its cause is independently unjust (second scenario) than when its cause is otherwise permissible (first scenario) or, to put it differently, whether there is more injustice in the second scenario, above and beyond the original injustice of a 2 year inequality in life expectancy and the added injustice of racial discrimination.

In both its strict and weakened versions, the direct approach is naturally understood as pronouncing on the pro tanto injustice of avoidable inequalities in health. This allows for its verdicts of injustice to be outweighed by other moral considerations (Culyer and Wagstaff 1993). Among the various kinds of trade-offs thereby permitted, cases in which equality of health is traded off against non-health considerations can be distinguished from cases in which it is traded off against aggregate health gains.

At least where micro-allocation decisions are concerned, Kamm (2004, 228–9) holds that health considerations operate in a ‘separate sphere,’ against which non-health considerations have no weight at all. A separate spheres view disallows trading equality of health off against non-health considerations, but cannot disallow trading it off against aggregate health gains (after all, this latter trade-off operates entirely within the health sphere). Anand (2004) defends a less extreme version of this view. He argues that a special weight should be attached to considerations of health, since health is constitutive of well-being and not merely instrumental to it. While Anand explicitly countenances trading equality of health off against aggregate health gains, he concludes that we should be less tolerant of such trade-offs in the case of health than in the case of income.

6. Complications

At the most basic level, a principle of equality can only be applied to health if ‘health’ falls within its scope. If the principle applies unrestrictedly to ‘goods’ or ‘functionings,’ then there will be no obstacle to applying it to health. Likewise, if the principle requires equality of ‘welfare,’ then arguably there will be no such obstacle either, since ‘welfare’ is plausibly interpreted to include ‘health’ as a constituent. On the other hand, it is less clear whether health counts as an equilisandum under a principle of equality of ‘resources.’ If it were counted, health would be equalized as a means to some further goal or condition, but not as a goal in itself. While health can plausibly be seen as an important means to various intrinsically valuable goals, the canonical defense of the equality of resources principle does not interpret health as a ‘resource’ in its technical sense (Dworkin 2000, chh. 1–2).

More significantly, the implications a principle of equality has for health may also depend on how ‘equality’ itself is understood. For instance, it can be defined in either relative or absolute terms. In perhaps more familiar language, egalitarianism can either be defined as requiring equality spoken strictly or as requiring priority to the worse off (Parfit 2001). On the first interpretation (i.e., the relative one), the demands of egalitarianism are essentially comparative: equality (e.g., of health) requires that a given person have the same health as others in some specified reference group (e.g., those in the same society or humanity at large). On the second interpretation (i.e., the absolute one), the demands of egalitarianism are essentially non-comparative: a ‘priority of health’ principle requires that a given person have as much health as possible, as judged by some non-comparative metric (e.g., absolute years of life expectancy). More precisely, a priority of health principle holds that the more badly off a given person is on the non-comparative metric (e.g., the fewer her years of life expectancy), the greater the moral weight that attaches to a given increment of improvement in her health (e.g., the addition of a year to her life expectancy).

In many cases, an equality of health principle and a priority of health principle have many of the same practical implications. Most saliently, if one individual (or group) avoidably has a lower life expectancy than another, then both principles will condemn the resultant inequality of health and also sanction efforts to improve the life expectancy of the worse off person (or group). The two principles differ most importantly where an avoidable inequality of health can be eliminated, not by improving the health of the worse off person (or group), but only by reducing the health of the better off person (or group). Here a priority of health principle will not recognize any reason to reduce the health of the better off, whereas an equality of health principle will recognize a reason to reduce the health of the better off—namely, that it eliminates the inequality. This illustrates the so-called ‘levelling down’ objection against principles of equality. Parfit (2001) regards this as a compelling objection, though Temkin (1993) does not.

Further complications arise when the distinction between equality and priority runs across our previous distinction between direct and indirect approaches to applying egalitarianism to the case of health. To bring the clearest examples into view, let us focus on income as a social determinant of health and assume that individual income makes a causal contribution to individual life expectancy. On the indirect approach, the justice of the causes of health is the primary locus of assessment. But whether the health inequalities suffered in consequence of an income inequality count as injustices may depend on the structure of our normative principle, since that may affect whether the income inequality itself (i.e., the cause) counts as unjust in the first place. Suppose that leveling down with respect to income (i.e., reducing the income of the rich without raising that of the poor) were the only way to eliminate a given income inequality. In that case, the income inequality would not count as an injustice on a priority of income principle, and hence neither would the consequent health inequality. However, both inequalities would still count as injustices on an equality of income principle.

On the direct approach, the (in)justice of health inequalities themselves is the primary locus of assessment. Consider the case in which normatively we affirm a priority of health principle, but empirically the relative income hypothesis is correct—that is, an individual's life expectancy is also a function of her income as compared to others' income in her society and not simply of its non-comparative level. Here leveling down with respect to income will produce an absolute health gain for the worse off in terms of income. Hence, it will be licensed by a priority of health principle (especially if the worse off in terms of income are also worse off in terms of health), since an absolute health inequality will (avoidably) persist if we omit to reduce the income of the better off. A similar observation is made by Brighouse and Swift, as part of their discussion of ‘positional goods’ (2006, 480). They regard the case as one in which there is reason to ‘level down.’ However, a lot depends here on definitions (cf. Brighouse and Swift 2006, 477–78). In the sense of Parfit's objection, ‘leveling down’ requires the elimination of the inequality not to produce any absolute benefit to anyone. Our case does not involve leveling down in this sense, as it does produce absolute health benefits for some (via the relative income hypothesis), even though it does not produce absolute income benefits for anyone. Consideration of this last sprinkling of cases may suggest instead that it is artificial and over-simple to put very much weight on mono-factor normative principles, such as ‘equality of income-by-itself’ or ‘priority of health-by-itself.’

A final issue to consider concerns the accommodation of personal responsibility. ‘Luck egalitarians’ have argued that we should discount the moral significance of negative outcomes suffered by an agent (e.g., an inequality of well-being), at least when they are the clear result of a clear choice by that same agent—with the result that these outcomes neither count as injustices nor are they eligible for social redress (see Anderson 1999). A symmetrical discounting is recommended for positive outcomes. Analogous discounts can be invoked by prioritarians as well—for example, Arneson (2000) affirms what he calls ‘responsibility catering prioritarianism.’

When it comes to health, the fundamental issue is well illustrated by the case of lung cancer and smoking. If someone has a treatable case of lung cancer, we might ordinarily reasonably presume that it would be unjust to deny him medical care. However, if his cancer is due to a heavy, life-long smoking habit, the question arises of whether the ordinary presumption is defeated or diminished in strength. For instance, if there is a choice to be made (say, because of resource scarcity) between treating him and treating another lung cancer patient who is in no way responsible for her lung cancer, does justice require preferring the second patient? A simple version of luck egalitarianism holds that it is just to deny treatment to the smoker, as long as his ‘decision to smoke’ qualifies as a ‘clear choice’ according to some suitable criteria. By contrast, Wikler (2004), who examines this issue at some length in the health care context, argues that access to treatment should not be discounted to accommodate considerations of personal responsibility.

7. Just Health, for and against

Daniels, Kennedy, and Kawachi (2000) have recently proposed to decide when health inequalities are unjust by appeal to Rawls' (1971) theory of justice. Their contribution is recapitulated by Daniels (2008, ch. 3) and, for convenience, we refer to the later treatment. Daniels follows the indirect approach to evaluating health inequalities. In the first instance, in other words, his evaluative focus is on the causes of health inequalities. His central claim is that, by a happy coincidence, Rawls' principles of justice regulate all of the principal social determinants of health (2008, 82 and 97).

To begin with, income is regulated by the difference principle: inequalities in income are permitted only to the extent that they work to the greatest benefit of the least well off. Education is regulated by the principle of fair equality of opportunity, which requires ‘equitable public education’ as well as ‘developmentally appropriate day care and early childhood interventions’ (Daniels 2008, 96). (Workplace organisation, if validated as a determinant of health, would also be regulated under the fair equality of opportunity principle). Political participation, which Daniels (2008, 95–6) regards as a social determinant of health, is regulated by the principle of equal basic liberty: among other things, this principle safeguards the fair value of the right to participate politically. Finally, reaffirming his earlier work (1985), Daniels maintains that fair equality of opportunity also requires universal access to comprehensive health care (broadly construed to include public health).

To the extent that these social variables are causal determinants of health, and to the extent that their distribution in society fails to conform to the corresponding principle of Rawlsian justice, the resultant health inequalities will be unjust and unjust because their causes are unjust. The flip-side of this point is that the implementation of Rawls' principles will tend—again, insofar as the relevant determinants are causal—to flatten the social gradient in health (Daniels 2008, 82), i.e., to reduce existing inequalities in health. Hence the title of the jointly authored paper (2000): ‘justice is good for our health.’

As Daniels notices, observing Rawlsian justice may flatten the social gradient in health without eliminating it altogether. For example, the difference principle may permit certain inequalities of income, which are nevertheless possible to eliminate. If income is a causal determinant of health, these permissible income inequalities will (continue to) generate health inequalities if they are left in place. Daniels holds that the persistence of avoidable health inequalities does not give us reason in justice, independently of the difference principle, to eliminate their underlying cause. In his view, justice permits some avoidable inequalities in health: ‘The residual inequalities that emerge with conformance to [Rawls'] principles are not a compromise with what justice ideally requires; they are acceptable as just’ (2008, 99).

This position has been criticized by Anand and Peter (2000, 50–52). To begin with, they argue that there is a tension between two different uses Daniels makes of Rawls' second principle of justice. On the one hand, they argue, Daniels treats its two parts as simply regulating certain specific social determinants of health—the fair equality of opportunity principle regulates education (e.g.), while the difference principle regulates income. On the other hand, his account of health care treats the fair equality of opportunity principle as regulating health itself directly. But the latter employment of fair equality of opportunity, which Anand and Peter actually prefer (2000, 52), threatens to contradict Daniels' treatment of residual health inequalities. If fair equality of opportunity requires (some kind of) egalitarianism about health, then residual health inequalities that remain after the difference principle is fully implemented may still fall within its scope. In that case, Rawlsian justice may well command their reduction.

Anand and Peter's point can be put in terms of our distinction between direct and indirect approaches to evaluating health inequalities. Daniels' treatment of health care seems to employ the logic of the direct approach, deriving an evaluation of a cause of health (health care) from its evaluation of health (itself derived from its evaluation of opportunity). But his conclusion seems to require that we adhere exclusively to the logic of the indirect approach. For Daniels claims that residual health inequalities are just—not because they fall within the scope of an explicitly permitted health inequality, as in ‘more or less’ equal health, but—simply because their causes are otherwise just. However, it is not clear how the justice of a health inequality's cause could settle the question of its permissibility unless no valid principle of justice applies directly to health inequalities. As Anand and Peter put it: ‘This view relies on the premise—not made explicit by the authors—that inequalities in health are unjust if, and only if, they are the result of unjust social arrangements’ (2000, 50, emphasis added). If that is right, then in addition to eschewing even partial reliance on it himself, Daniels would have to show that no version of the direct approach is valid.


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