Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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George Herbert Mead

First published Sun Apr 13, 2008

George Herbert Mead (1863-1931), American philosopher and social theorist, is often classed with William James, Charles Sanders Peirce, and John Dewey as one of the most significant figures in classical American pragmatism. Dewey referred to Mead as “a seminal mind of the very first order” (Dewey, 1932, xl). Yet by the middle of the twentieth-century, Mead's prestige was greatest outside of professional philosophical circles. He is considered by many to be the father of the school of Symbolic Interactionism in sociology and social psychology, although he did not use this nomenclature. Perhaps Mead's principal influence in philosophical circles occurred as a result of his friendship with John Dewey. There is little question that Mead and Dewey had an enduring influence on each other, with Mead contributing an original theory of the development of the self through communication. This theory has in recent years played a central role in the work of Jürgen Habermas. While Mead is best known for his work on the nature of the self and intersubjectivity, he also developed a theory of action, and a metaphysics that emphasizes emergence and temporality, in which the past and future are viewed through the lens of the present. Although the extent of Mead's reach is considerable, he never published a monograph. His most famous work, Mind, Self, and Society from the Standpoint of a Social Behaviorist, was published after his death and is a compilation of student notes and selections from unpublished manuscripts.

1. Life and Influences

George Herbert Mead was born on February 27, 1863, in South Hadley, Massachusetts. His father, Hiram Mead, a minister in the Congregational Church, moved his family from Massachusetts to Ohio in 1869 in order to join the faculty of The Oberlin Theological Seminary. At Oberlin he taught homiletics and held the chair in Sacred Rhetoric and Pastoral Theology. Mead would attend Oberlin College from 1879-1883, and matriculate at Harvard from 1887-1888. At Harvard he studied with Josiah Royce, a philosopher deeply indebted to G.W.F. Hegel, who also left a lasting impression on Mead. (Mead met William James at Harvard, although he did not study with him. Almost immediately after graduation, Mead resided in William James's summer home tutoring his son Harry.) Mead's mother, Elizabeth Storrs Billings, was a devoutly religious woman, who taught at Oberlin for two years after the death of her husband in 1881, and served as president of Mount Holyoke College from 1890-1900. After his college years, Mead became a committed naturalist and non-believer, but he had struggled for years with the religious convictions that he had inherited from his family and community. For a period of time after college he even considered Christian Social Work as a career, but 1884 he explained in a letter to his friend Henry Castle why this career path would be problematic.

I shall have to let persons understand that I have some belief in Christianity and my praying be interpreted as a belief in God, whereas I have no doubt that now the most reasonable system of the universe can be formed to myself without a God. But notwithstanding all this I cannot go out with the world and not work for men. The spirit of a minister is strong with me and I come fairly by it (Shalin 1988, 920-921).

Mead did indeed move away from his earlier religious roots, but the activist spirit remained with him. Mead marched in support of women's suffrage, served as a treasurer for the Settlement House movement, immersed himself in civic matters in Chicago, and generally supported progressive causes. Jane Addams was a close friend. In terms of his transformation into a naturalist, no doubt Darwin played a significant role. As a matter of fact, one can understand much of Mead's work as an attempt to synthesize Darwin, Hegel, Dewey's functionalist turn in psychology, and insights gleaned from James. Mead taught with Dewey at the University of Michigan from 1891-1894, and when Dewey was made chair at the University of Chicago in 1894, he requested that Mead receive an appointment. Mead spent the rest of his career at Chicago. But before he began teaching at Michigan, Mead was directly exposed to major currents of European thought when he studied in Germany from 1888-1891, taking a course from Wilhelm Dilthey and immersing himself in Wilhelm Wundt's research.

2. Language and Mind

Dewey and Mead were not only very close friends, they shared similar intellectual trajectories. Both went through a period in which Hegel was the most significant philosophical figure for them, and both democratized and de-essentialized Hegelian ideas about the self and community. Nevertheless, neo-hegelian organic metaphors and notions of negation and conflict, reinterpreted as the problematic situation, remain central to their positions. The teleological also remains important in their thought, but it is reduced in scale from the world historical and localized in terms of anticipatory experiences and goal oriented activities.

For Mead, the development of the self is intimately tied to the development of language. To demonstrate this connection, Mead begins by articulating what he learned about the gesture from Wundt. Gestures are to be understood in terms of the behavioral responses of animals to stimuli from other organisms. For example, a dog barks, and a second dog either barks back or runs away. The “meaning” of the “barking gesture” is found in the response of the second organism to the first. But dogs do not understand the “meaning” of their gestures. They simply respond, that is, they use symbols without what Mead refers to as “significance.” For a gesture to have significance, it must call out in a second organism a response that is functionally identical to the response that the first organism anticipates. In other words, for a gesture to be significant it must “mean” the same thing to both organisms, and “meaning” entails the capacity to consciously anticipate how other organisms will respond to symbols or gestures. How does this capacity arise? It does so through the vocal gesture.

A vocal gesture can be thought of as a word or phrase. When a vocal gesture is used the individual making the gesture responds (implicitly) in the same manner as the individual hearing it. If you are about to walk across a busy street during rush hour, I might shout out, “Don't walk!” As I shout, I hear my gesture the way in which you hear it, that is, I hear the same words, and I might feel myself pulling back, stopping in my tracks because I hear these words. But, of course, I don't hear them exactly as you do, because I am aware of directing them to you. According to Mead, “Gestures become significant symbols when they implicitly arouse in the individual making them the same responses which the explicitly arouse, or are supposed to arouse, in other individuals” (MSS, 47). He also tells us that, "the critical importance of language in the development of human experience lies in this fact that the stimulus is one that can react upon the speaking individual as it reacts upon the other” (MSS, 69).

As noted, Mead was indebted to the Hegel's work, and the notion of reflexivity plays a fundamental role in Mead's theory of mind. Vocal gestures—which depend on sufficiently sophisticated nervous systems to process them—allow individuals to hear their own gestures in the way that others hear them. If I shout “Boo” at you, I might not only scare you, I might scare myself. Or, to put this in other terms, vocal gestures allow one to speak to oneself when the other is not present. I make certain vocal gestures and anticipate how they would be responded to by others, even when they are not present. The responses of others have been internalized and have become part of an accessible repertoire. (Mead would agree with Ludwig Wittgenstein that there are no private languages. Language is social all the way down.) According to Mead, through the use of vocal gestures one can turn “experience” back on itself through the loop of speaking and hearing at relatively the same instant. And when one is part of a complex network of language users, Mead argues that this reflexivity, the “turning back” of experience on itself, allows mind to develop.

Mentality on our approach simply comes in when the organism is able to point out meanings to others and to himself. This is the point at which mind appears, or if you like, emerges…. It is absurd to look at the mind simply from the standpoint of the individual human organism; for, although it has its focus there, it is essentially a social phenomenon; even its biological functions are primarily social (MSS, 132-133).
It is by means of reflexiveness—the turning back of the experience of the individual upon himself—that the whole social process is thus brought into the experience of the individuals involved in it; it is by such means, which enable the individual to take the attitude of the other toward himself, that the individual is able consciously to adjust himself to that process, and to modify the resultant of that process in any given social act in terms of his adjustment to it. Reflexiveness, then, is the essential condition, within the social process, for the development of mind (MSS, 134).

The reflexivity of mind is developed not only through the use of vocal gestures, but in the taking of roles, which will be addressed below. Here it is worth noting that the cognitive or reflexive is circumscribed in Mead. As we shall see, although the self is a cognitive object for Mead, the self is not all that there is to the person. Like Dewey, Mead argues that reflection is an aspect of human experience, which is primarily non-reflective. For both, habitual, non-reflective, experience constitutes the basic way that we engage the world. There are a host of background beliefs and assumptions that are not raised to (self) consciousness unless problems occur that warrant reflection. For Dewey, this background is described as "funded experience." For Mead, it is the world that this there and the “biologic individual.”

The immediate experience which is reality, and which is the final test of the reality of scientific hypotheses as well as the test of the truth of all our ideas and suppositions, is the experience of what I have called the “biologic individual.”…[This] term lays emphasis on the living reality which may be distinguished from reflection…. Actual experience did not take place in this form but in the form of unsophisticated reality (MSS, 352-353).

3. Roles, the Self, and the Generalized Other

One of the most noteworthy features of Mead's account of the significant symbol is that it assumes that anticipatory experiences are fundamental to the development of language. We have the ability place ourselves in the positions of others—that is, to anticipate their responses—with regard to our linguistic gestures. This ability is also crucial for the development of the self and self-consciousness. For Mead, as for Hegel, the self is fundamentally social and cognitive. It is to be distinguished from the personality, which has non-cognitive dimensions. The self, then, is not identical to the individual and is linked to self-consciousness. It begins to develop when individuals interact with others and play roles. What are roles? They are constellations of behaviors that are responses to sets of behaviors of other human beings. The notions of role-taking and role playing are familiar from sociological and social-psychological literature. For example, the child plays at being a doctor by having another child play at being a patient. To play at being a doctor, however, requires being able to anticipate what a patient might say, and vice versa. It is important to note in this context that while Mead studied physiological psychology, his work on role-taking can be viewed as combining features of the work of the Scottish sympathy theorists (which James appealed to in The Principles of Psychology), with Hegel's dialectic of self and other. In playing roles, we are, to use Mead's terminology, taking the perspective of the other. As we will discover shortly, perspective-taking is associated not only with roles, but with far more complex behaviors.

For Mead, if we were simply to take the roles of others, we would never develop selves or self-consciousness. We would have a nascent form of self-consciousness that parallels the sort of reflexive awareness that is required for the use of significant symbols. A role-taking (self) consciousness of this sort makes possible what might be called a proto-self, but not a self, because it doesn't have the complexity necessary to give rise to a self. How then does a self arise? Here Mead introduces his well-known neologism, the generalized other. When children or adults take roles, they can be said to be playing these roles in dyads. However, this sort of exchange is quite different from the more complex sets of behaviors that are required to participate in games. In the latter, we are required to learn not only the responses of specific others, but behaviors associated with every position on the field. These can be internalized, and when we succeed in doing so we come to “view” our own behaviors from the perspective of the game as a whole, which is a system of organized actions.

The organized community or social group which gives to the individual his unity of self may be called "the generalized other." The attitude of the generalized other is the attitude of the whole community. Thus, for example, in the case of such a social group as a ball team, the team is the generalized other in so far as it enters—as an organized process or social activity—into the experience of any one of the individual members of it (MSS, 154).

For Mead, although these communities can take different forms, they should be thought of as systems; for example, a family can be thought of systemically and can therefore give rise to a generalized other and a self that corresponds to it. Generalized others can also be found in

concrete social classes or subgroups, such as political parties, clubs, corporations, which are all actually functional social units, in terms of which their individual members are directly related to one another. The others are abstract social classes or subgroups, such as the class of debtors and the class of creditors, in terms of which their individual members are related to one another only more or less indirectly (MSS, 157).

In his Principles of Psychology, a book Mead knew well, William James discusses various types of empirical selves, namely, the material, the social, and the spiritual. In addressing the social self, James notes how it is possible to have multiple selves.

Properly speaking, a man has as many social selves as there are individuals who recognize him and carry an image of him in their mind. To wound any one of these his images is to wound him. But as the individuals who carry the images fall naturally into classes, we may practically say that he has as many different social selves as there are distinct groups of persons about whose opinion he cares. He generally shows a different side of himself to each of these different groups (James 1890, 294).

From Mead's perspective, James was on the right track. However, the notion of audience is left undeveloped in James, as is the manner in which language is utilized in the genesis of the self and self-consciousness. For Mead, James's audiences should be thought of in terms of systemically organized groups, such as we find in certain games, which give rise to generalized others. Further, we need an account of how we come to view ourselves from the perspective of these groups that goes beyond the concept of “sympathetic attachments.” Such an account entails a notion of reflexivity that arises with vocal gestures and continues to develop as we take roles. Through a growing capacity to “view” ourselves from ever more “abstract” communities, we develop increasingly complex selves. Mead relates the latter capacity to a cosmopolitan political and cultural orientation, that is, an increasing degree of interaction with others makes possible selves that are capable of relating to a wider variety of individuals and communities. It's worth noting that for Mead a full account of the self should address the phylogenetic as well as the ontogenetic.

4. The “I” and the “Me”

One of Mead's most significant contributions to social psychology is his distinction between the “I” and the “Me.” It's worth emphasizing that while this distinction is utilized in sociological circles, it is grounded philosophically for Mead. His target, in part, is no less than the idea of the transcendental ego, especially in its Kantian incarnation. It is also important to note that the “I” and “Me” are functional distinctions for Mead, not metaphysical ones.

The self that arises in relationship to a specific generalized other is referred to as the “Me.” The “Me” is a cognitive object, which is only known retrospectively, that is, on reflection. When we act in habitual ways we are not typically self-conscious. We are engaged in actions at a non-reflective level. However, when we take the perspective of the generalized other, we are both “watching” and forming a self in relationship to the system of behaviors that constitute this generalized other. So, for example, if I am playing second base, I may reflect on my position as a second baseman, but to do so I have to be able to think of “myself” in relationship to the whole game, namely, the other actors and the “rules” of the game. We might refer to this cognitive object as my (second baseman) baseball self or “Me.” Perhaps a better example might be to think of the self in relationship to one's family of origin. In this situation, one views oneself from the perspective of the various sets of behaviors that constitute the family system.

To return to the baseball example, one may have a self, a “Me,” that corresponds to a particular position that one plays, which is nested within the game as an organized totality. This self, however, doesn't tell us how any particular play may be made. When a ball is grounded to a second baseman, how he or she reacts is not predetermined. He reacts, and how he reacts is always somewhat different from how he has reacted in the past. These reactions or actions of the individual, whether in response to others or self-initiated, fall within the “sphere” of the “I.” Every response that the “I” makes is somewhat novel. Its responses may differ only in small ways from previous responses, but they will never be absolutely the same. No catch in a ball game is ever identical to a previous catch. Mead declares that, “The ‘I’ gives the sense of freedom, of initiative. The situation is there for us to act in a self-conscious fashion. We are aware of ourselves, and of what the situation is, but exactly how we will act never gets into experience until after the action takes place” (MSS, 177-178). The “I” is both a “source” of spontaneity and creativity. For Mead, this is not a metaphysical assertion. The “I” is not a noumenal ego. It is a label for describing the actions of human beings. We do in fact react in different ways, and some of these ways are sufficiently original to be labeled creative.

The responses of the “I” are non-reflective. How the “I” reacts is known only on reflection, that is, after we retrospect.

If you ask, then, where directly in your own experience the "I" comes in, the answer is that it comes in as a historical figure. It is what you were a second ago that is the "I" of the "me." It is another "me" that has to take that rôle. You cannot get the immediate response of the "I" in the process (MSS, 174).

In other words, once the actions of the “I” have become objectified and known, by definition they have become a “Me.” The status of the “I” is interesting in Mead. In trying to differentiate it from the empirical, knowable, “Me,” he states, “The ‘I’ is the transcendental self of Kant, the soul that James conceived behind the scene holding on to the skirts of an idea to give it an added increment of emphasis" (MSC in SW, 141). However, this statement should not to be interpreted as endorsing the notion of a transcendental ego. Mead is seeking to emphasize that the “I” is not available to us in our acts, that is, it is only knowable in its objectified form as a “Me.” This point is clarified by a remark that directly follows the statement just cited. "The self-conscious, actual self in social intercourse is the objective "me" or "me's" with the process of response continually going on and implying a fictitious "I" always out of sight of himself" (MSC in SW, 141). A transcendental ego is not fictitious. But for Mead, since we are dealing with a functional distinction here, it is quite acceptable to refer to the “I” as fictitious in metaphysical sense.

Why, then, do we seem to experience what Mead refers to as a “running current of awareness,” that is, an ego that appears to be aware of itself as it acts and thinks, if the “I” is not immediately aware of itself (SS in SW, 144)? William James sought to explain this phenomenon in terms of proprioception and the relationship between “parts” of the stream of consciousness. (James 1890, 296-307; James 1904, 169-183; James 1905, 184-194). Mead developed a unique explanation based on the relationship of the “I” to the “Me.” As we have seen, the “I” reacts and initiates action, but the actions taken are comprehended, objectified, as a “Me.” However, the “Me” is not confined to the objectifications of the immediate actions of the “I.” The “Me” carries with it internalized responses that serve as a commentary on the “I's” actions. Mead states, “The action with reference to the others calls out responses in the individual himself—there is then another ‘me’ criticizing, approving, and suggesting, and consciously planning, i.e., the reflective self” (SS in SW, 145). The running current of awareness, then, is not due to the “I” being immediately aware of itself. It is due to the running commentary of the “Me” on the actions of the “I.” The “Me” follows the “I” so closely in time that it appears as if the “I” is the source of the “running current of awareness.”

Freud's super-ego could be conscious or unconscious. One might think of the “Me” as similar to the conscious super-ego in the commentary that it provides, but one would have to be careful not to carry this analogy too far. For Mead, the “Me” arises in relationship to systems of behaviors, generalized others, and, therefore, is by definition multiple, although the behaviors of various “Me's” can overlap. Further, Freud's model assumes a determinism that is not inherent in the relationship of the “I” to the “Me.” Not only does the “I” initiate novel responses, its new behaviors can become part of a “Me.” In other words, “Me's” are not static. They are systems that often undergo transformation. This will become more apparent in the next section when we discuss Mead's ideas regarding emergence. In this context it is enough to suggest the following: when a ball player makes a catch in a manner that has never been made before—that is, makes a play that is significantly different from prior catches—the new play may become part of the repertoire of the team's behaviors. In other words, the play may alter the existing generalized other by modifying existing behavioral patterns. In so doing, it gives rise to modified selves. If the game as a whole is sufficiently changed, then a new self may arise. Once again, this may be easier to see in terms of the transformations that occur in families when new reactions arise as children (and adults) go through various developmental phases.

5. Sociality, Emergence, and The Philosophy of the Present

We have seen that the “I” introduces novelty in actions and in the interactions between human beings. For Mead, novelty is not a phenomenon that can be accounted for in terms of human ignorance, as it can for a determinist such as Spinoza. In the Spinozistic framework, even though everything in nature is determined, as finite modes we must remain ignorant of the chain of causes. In principle, however, an infinite Mind could predict every event. Mead, following in the footsteps of Darwin, argues that novelty is in fact an aspect of the natural world, and that there are events that are not only unpredictable due to ignorance, but are in principle impossible to predict. In the latter category, for example, we find mutations that help to give rise to new species, as well as the creative responses of baseball players, musicians, composers, dancers, scientists, etc.

In The Philosophy of the Present—a compilation based on the Carus Lectures delivered in late 1930 in Berkeley—Mead outlines his thoughts on nature and time. Mead did not have the opportunity to develop his ideas into a book. (He passed away early in 1931.) In spite of the fact that these lectures were hurriedly written due to obligations that he had as chair of the University of Chicago's philosophy department, they contain ideas that illuminate his earlier work and indicate the direction of his thought. Mead argues that change is metaphysically real and not merely a subjective, perceptual, phenomenon, as some of the latest theories in physics were suggesting. We are told that while “reality exists in a present,” we do not live in a Parmenidean cosmos (PP, 1). “For a Parmenidean reality does not exist. Existence involves non-existence: it does take place. The world is a world of events” (PP, 1).

Mead claims that not only is change real, emergence is real. The latter occurs, for example, when new species arise. The universe doesn't just spin its wheels and offer change without real novelty. Part of the impetus behind The Philosophy of the Present was to argue against an interpretation of space-time, such as Hermann Minkowski's, which eliminates the truly novel or the emergent. Emergence involves not only biological organisms, but matter and energy, for example, there is a sense in which water can be spoken of as emerging from the combination of hydrogen and oxygen.[1] Nevertheless, biological examples appear best suited to Mead's approach. It's worth noting at this juncture that Mead had always been keenly interested in science and the scientific method. However, as a pragmatist, the test of a scientific hypothesis for him is whether it can illuminate the world that is there. He certainly was never a positivist.

As mentioned, Mead is a systemic thinker who speaks of taking the perspectives of others and of generalized others. These perspectives are not “subjective” for Mead. They are “objective” in the sense that they provide frames of reference and shared patterns of behavior for members of communities. (This is not to say that every community has an equally viable account of the natural world. This is in part why we have science for Mead.) However, it is not only human perspectives that are objective for Mead. While it is true that only human beings share perspectives in a manner that allows them to be (self) conscious about the perspectives of others, there is an objective reality to non-human perspectives. How can a non-human perspective be objective? In order to answer this question, a few general remarks about Mead's notion of "perspective" are in order. First, it is important to note that perspectives are not primarily visual for Mead. They are ways of speaking about how organisms act and interact in environments. In the words of David Miller,

According to Mead, every perspective is a consequence of an active, selecting organism, and no perspective can be built up out of visual experiences alone or out of experiences of the so-called secondary qualities. A perspective arises out of a relation of an active, selective, percipient event and its environment. It determines the order of things in the environment that are selected, and it is in nature….We make distinctions among objects in our environment, finally, through, contact (Miller 1973, 213).

Mead has been referred to as a tactile philosopher, as opposed to a visual one, because of the importance of contact experience in his thought. Perspectives entail contact and interaction between organisms and their environments. For example, a fish living in certain pond can be thought of as inhabiting an ecosystem. The way in which it navigates the pond, finds food to eat, captures its food, etc., can be spoken of as the fish's perspective on the pond, and it is objective, that is, its interactions are not a matter of the subjective perceptions of the fish. Its interactions in its environment shape and give form to its perspective, which is different from the snail's perspective, although it lives in the same waters. In other words, organisms stratify environments in different ways as they seek to meet their needs (Miller 1973, 207-217). The pond, in fact, is not one system but many systems in the sense that its inhabitants engage in different, interlaced interactions, and therefore have different objective perspectives. The fish, of course, does not comprehend its perspective or localized environment as a system, but this doesn't make its perspective subjective. Human beings, given our capacity to discuss systems in language, can describe the ecology of pond (or better, the ecologies of the pond depending on what organisms we are studying). We can describe, with varying degrees of accuracy, what it is like to be a fish living in a particular pond, as opposed to a snail. Through study we learn about the perspectives of other creatures, although we cannot share them as we can the perspectives of the language bearing members of our own species.

For Mead, as noted, systems are not static. This is especially evident in the biological world. New forms of life arise, and some of them are due to the efforts of human beings, for example, the botanists who create hybrids. Mead argues that if a new form of life emerges from another form, then there is a time when the new organism has not fully developed, when it has not settled into its environmental niche, when it may be spoken of as still emerging. There is the old order and the new one that is coming into existence. Mead refers to this state of betwixt and between as sociality.

When the new form has established its citizenship the botanist can exhibit the mutual adjustments that have taken place. The world has become a different world because of the advent, but to identify sociality with this result is to identify it with system merely. It is rather the stage betwixt and between the old system and the new one that I am referring to. If emergence is a feature of reality this phase of adjustment, which comes between the ordered universe before the emergent has arisen and that after it has come to terms with the newcomer, must be a feature also of reality (PP, 47).

Sociality is a key idea for Mead and it has implications for his sociology and social psychology. If we think of the “Me” as a system, then there are times when the “I” initiates new responses that may or may not be integrated into an existing “Me.” But if they come to be integrated, then there is a time betwixt and between the old and new “Me” system. What makes this all the more interesting is that at the level of human interactions we have a capacity for reflection. We can become aware of changes that are taking place and even anticipate new “Me's” that may come into being. We can even set up conditions to promote changes that we believe may transform us in certain ways. Or to put this in another light, new problems are bound to arise in the world, and because of our capacity for sociality, we can get some purchase on the courses of action available to us as we reflect on the novel problems confronting us. Of course, because the problems are novel means that we do not have ready solutions. However, the capacity to at times “stand” betwixt and between old and (possible) new orders, as we do between old and new social roles, provides us with some opportunity for anticipating alternatives and integrating new responses. As a matter of fact, Mead links moral development with our capacity for moving beyond old values, old selves, in order to integrate new values into our personalities when new situations call for them.

To leave the field to the values represented by the old self is exactly what we term selfishness. The justification for the term is found in the habitual character of conduct with reference to these values.…Where, however, the problem is objectively considered, although the conflict is a social one, it should not resolve itself into a struggle between selves, but into such reconstruction of the situation that different and enlarged and more adequate personalities may emerge (SS in SW, 148) (emphasis added).

It's worth noting here that Mead did not develop an ethics, at least not one that was systematically presented. But his position bears a kinship to theorists of moral sentiment, if we understand “the taking the perspectives of others” as a more sophisticated statement of sympathetic attachments. It is important to emphasize that for pragmatic reasons Mead does not think that the idea of compassion is sufficient for grounding an ethics. He argues for a notion of obligation that is tied to transforming social conditions that generate pain and suffering.[2]

Returning to Mead's notion of sociality, we can see that he is seeking to emphasize transitions and change between systems. This emphasis on change has repercussions for his view of the present, which is not to be understood as a knife-edge present. In human experience, the present arises from a past and spreads into the future. In a manner reminiscent of James's account of the stream of thought, Mead argues that the present entails duration (James 1890, 237-283). It retains the receding past and anticipates the imminent future. Yet because reality ultimately exists in the present, Mead argues that the historical past, insofar as it is capable of being experienced, is transformed by novel events. History is not written on an unchanging scroll. Novelty gives lie to this way of seeing the past. By virtue of its originality, the novel event can not be explained or understood in terms of prior interpretations of the past. The past, which by definition can only exist in the present, changes to “conform” to novel events.

It is idle, at least for the purposes of experience, to have recourse to a “real” past within which we are making constant discoveries; for that past must be set over against a present within which the emergent appears, and the past, which must then be looked at from the standpoint of the emergent, becomes a different past. The emergent when it appears is always found to follow from the past, but before it appears it does not, by definition, follow from the past (PP, 2).

6. Concluding Comments on Determinism and Freedom

Mead's account of the “Me” and the generalized other has often led commentators to assume that he is a determinist. It is certainly the case that if one were to emphasize Mead's concern with social systems and the social development of the self, one might be led to conclude that Mead is a theorist of the processes of socialization. And the latter, nested as they are within social systems, are beyond the control of individuals. However, when one considers the role of the “I” and novelty in his thinking, it becomes more difficult to view him as a determinist. But his emphasis on novelty only seems to counter determinism with spontaneity. This counter to determinism in itself doesn't supply a notion of autonomy—self-governance and self-determination—that is often viewed as the “essence” of the modern Western notion of the subject. However, Mead was a firm booster of the scientific method, which he viewed as an activity that was at its heart democratic. For him, science is tied to the manner in which human beings have managed from pre-recorded times to solve problems and transform their worlds. We have just learned to be more methodical about the ways in which we solve problems in modern science. If one considers his discussions of science and problem solving behavior, which entail anticipatory experience, the reflexivity of consciousness, the sharing of perspectives and their objective reality, and the creativity of the “I,” then one begins to see how Mead thought that our biological endowments coupled with our social skills could assist us in shaping our own futures, as well aid us in making moral decisions. He did not work out the details of this process, especially with regard to moral autonomy and the “I's” role in it.[3] There is, however, little doubt that he thought autonomy possible, but the condition for its possibility depends on the nature of the self's genesis and the type of society in which it develops.


Primary Sources

(Abbreviations are noted before the entry.)

[MSC] “The Mechanism of Social Consciousness,” The Journal of Philosophy, Psychology, and Scientific Methods, IX, 1912, 401-406. Page references are to the reprinted edition, [SW] Selected Writings: George Herbert Mead, ed. Andrew J. Reck (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1964).
[SS] “The Social Self,” The Journal of Philosophy, Psychology, and Scientific Methods, X, 1913, 374-380. Page references are to the reprinted edition, [SW] Selected Writings: George Herbert Mead, ed. Andrew J. Reck (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1964).
[PP] The Philosophy of the Present, edited, with an Introduction, by Arthur E. Murphy, (La Salle, IL: Open Court, 1932).
[MSS] Mind, Self, and Society: From the Perspective of a Social Behaviorist, edited, with an Introduction, by Charles W. Morris (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1934).
[MT] Movements of Thought in the Nineteenth Century, edited, with an Introduction, by Merritt H. Moore (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1936).
[PA] The Philosophy of the Act, edited, with an Introduction, by Charles W. Morris (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1938).
[SW] Selected Writings: George Herbert Mead, ed. Andrew J. Reck (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1964).
[ISS] The Individual and the Social Self: Unpublished Works of George Herbert Mead, edited, with an Introduction, by David L. Miller (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1982).
[ESP] Essays in Social Psychology, edited, with an Introduction, by Mary Jo Deegan (New Brunswick: Transaction Publishers, 2001).

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