Cosmological Argument

First published Tue Jul 13, 2004; substantive revision Thu Jun 30, 2022

The cosmological argument is less a particular argument than an argument type. It uses a general pattern of argumentation (logos) that makes an inference from particular alleged facts about the universe (cosmos) to the existence of a unique being, generally identified with or referred to as God. Among these initial facts are that particular beings or events in the universe are causally dependent or contingent, that the universe (as the totality of contingent things) is contingent in that it could have been other than it is or not existed at all, that the Big Conjunctive Contingent Fact possibly has an explanation, or that the universe came into being. From these facts philosophers and theologians argue deductively, inductively, or abductively by inference to the best explanation that a first cause, sustaining cause, unmoved mover, necessary being, or personal being (God) exists that caused and/or sustains the universe. The cosmological argument is part of classical natural theology, whose goal is to provide evidence for the claim that God exists, although contemporary treatments of it generally occur outside of considerations of natural theology but have generated a cottage industry of their own.

On the one hand, the argument arises from human curiosity as to why there is something rather than nothing or than something else. It invokes a concern for some full, complete, ultimate, or best explanation of what exists contingently. On the other hand, it raises intrinsically important philosophical questions about contingency and necessity, causation and explanation, part/whole relationships (mereology), possible worlds, infinity, sets, the nature of time, and the nature and origin of the universe. In what follows we will first sketch out a very brief history of the argument, note the two basic types of deductive cosmological arguments, and then provide a careful analysis of examples of each: first, three arguments from contingency, one based on a relatively strong version of the principle of sufficient reason and two others based respectively on a very strong and on a weak version of that principle; and second, an argument from the alleged fact that the universe had a beginning and the impossibility of an infinite temporal regress of causes. In the end we will consider an inductive version of the cosmological argument and what it is to be a necessary being.

1. Historical Overview

Although in Western philosophy the earliest formulation of a version of the cosmological argument is found in Plato’s Laws, 893–96, the classical argument is firmly rooted in Aristotle’s Physics (VIII, 4–6) and Metaphysics (XII, 1–6). Islamic philosophy enriches the tradition, developing two types of arguments. Arabic philosophers (falasifa), such as Ibn Sina (c. 980–1037), developed the argument from contingency, which was taken up by Thomas Aquinas (1225–74) in his Summa Theologica (I,q.2,a.3) and in his Summa Contra Gentiles (I, 13). Influenced by the Neoplatonist John Philoponus (5th c) (Davidson 1969), the mutakallimūm—theologians who used reason and argumentation to support their revealed Islamic beliefs—developed the temporal version of the argument from the impossibility of an infinite regress, now referred to as the kalām cosmological argument. For example, al-Ghāzāli (1058–1111) argued that everything that begins to exist requires a cause of its beginning. The world is composed of temporal phenomena preceded by other temporally-ordered phenomena. Since such a series of temporal phenomena cannot continue to infinity because an actual infinite is impossible, the world must have had a beginning and a cause of its existence, termed Allah or God (Craig 1979: part 1). This version of the cosmological argument entered the medieval Christian tradition through Bonaventure (1221–74) in his Sentences (II Sent. D.1,p.1,a.1,q.2).

Enlightenment thinkers, such as Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz and Samuel Clarke, reaffirmed the cosmological argument. Leibniz (1646–1716) appealed to a strengthened principle of sufficient reason, according to which “no fact can be real or existing and no statement true without a sufficient reason for its being so and not otherwise” (Monadology, §32). Leibniz uses the principle to argue that the sufficient reason for the “series of things comprehended in the universe of creatures” (§36) must exist outside this series of contingencies and is found in a necessary being that we call God (§38). Samuel Clarke likewise employed the principle of sufficient reason in his cosmological argument (Rowe 1975: chap. 2).

Although the cosmological argument does not figure prominently in Asian philosophy, a very abbreviated version of it, proceeding from dependence, can be found in Udayana’s Nyāyakusumāñjali I,4. In general, philosophers in the Nyāya tradition argue that since the universe has parts that come into existence at one occasion and not another, it must have a cause. We could admit an infinite regress of causes if we had evidence for such, but lacking such evidence, God must exist as the non-dependent cause. Many of the objections to the argument contend that God is an inappropriate cause because of God’s nature. For example, since God is immobile and has no body, he cannot properly be said to cause anything. The Naiyāyikas reply that God could assume a body at certain times, and in any case, God need not create in the same way humans do (Potter 1977: 100–07).

René Descartes advances his version of the cosmological argument not only as a piece of natural theology that proves God’s existence by natural reason, but also serving an epistemic function of guaranteeing that God could not be deceiving him (Meditations on First Philosophy, Preface & Meditation 3). The cosmological argument came under serious assault in the 18th century, first by David Hume and then by Immanuel Kant. Hume (1748) attacked both the view of causation presupposed in the argument (that causation is an objective, productive, necessary power relation that holds between two things) and the Causal Principle—every contingent being has a cause of its existence—that lies at the heart of the argument. Kant contended that the cosmological argument, in identifying the necessary being, relies on the ontological argument, which in turn is suspect. We will return to these criticisms below.

In the first part of the 20th century, with the rise of Positivism, the argument was largely abandoned. For critics like J.J.C. Smart (1955), the claim of the cosmological argument that God necessarily exists is equivalent to “Necessarily, God exists.” But since existence claims cannot be logically necessary, the statement is absurd. However, he notes, within us lies a deep-seated question: why should anything exist at all? Smart does not know what sort of question this is for it fails to fit his conception of propositions as either necessary truths or empirical claims. However, he continues, this awe-inspiring theological question appeals to those with a religious attitude. In this, the cosmological argument is reduced to a mystical role, catering to our emotions but devoid of rational content.

Both theists and nontheists in the last part of the 20th century and the first part of the 21st century generally show a healthy skepticism about the argument. Alvin Plantinga concludes “that this piece of natural theology is ineffective” (1967: chap. 1), and from his later Reformed Epistemology, it is unnecessary since belief in God can be properly basic. Richard Gale contends, in Kantian fashion, that since the conclusion of all versions of the cosmological argument invokes an impossibility, no cosmological arguments can provide examples of sound reasoning (1991: chap. 7). (However, Gale seems to have changed his mind and in recent writings proposed and defended his own version of the cosmological argument, which we will consider below.) Similarly, Michael Martin (1990: chap. 4), John Mackie (1982: chap. 5), Quentin Smith (Craig and Smith 1993), Bede Rundle (2004), Wes Morriston (2000, 2002a, 2003, 2010), and Graham Oppy (2006: chap. 3), among numerous others, reason that no current version of the cosmological argument is sound or provides probabilistic evidence. Yet dissenting voices can be heard. Robert Koons (1997) employs mereology and modal and nonmonotonic logic in taking a “new look” at the argument from contingency. In his widely discussed writings William Lane Craig marshals multidisciplinary evidence for the truth of the premises found in the kalām argument. Richard Gale and Alexander Pruss propose a version based on a so-called weak principle of sufficient reason that leads to a finite God that is not omnibenevolent, while Michael Almeida constructs a version of the argument based on modal realism and a strong principle of sufficient reason. Richard Swinburne, though rejecting deductive versions of the cosmological argument, proposes an inductive argument that is part of a larger cumulative case for God’s existence.

There is quite a chance that if there is a God he will make something of the finitude and complexity of a universe. It is very unlikely that a universe would exist uncaused, but rather more likely that God would exist uncaused. The existence of the universe…can be made comprehensible if we suppose that it is brought about by God. (Swinburne 1979: 131–32)

In short, in contrast to the first half of the last century, contemporary philosophers contribute increasingly detailed, complex, and sophisticated arguments on both sides of the debate, some connected to natural theology, many others unconnected but important for their philosophically complex and subtle reasoning.

2. Typology of Cosmological Arguments

Philosophers employ diverse classifications of the cosmological arguments. Swinburne distinguishes inductive from deductive versions. Craig distinguishes three types of deductive cosmological arguments in terms of their approach to an infinite regress of causes. The first, advocated by Aquinas, is based on the impossibility of an essentially ordered infinite regress. The second, which Craig terms the kalām argument, holds that an infinite temporal regress of causes is impossible because an actual infinite is impossible, and even if it were possible it could not be temporally realized. The third, espoused by Leibniz and Clarke, is overtly founded on the Principle of Sufficient Reason (Craig 1980: 282–83), although it appears that all versions use some form of that principle. Craig notes that the distinction between these types of arguments is important because the objections raised against one version may be irrelevant to other versions. So, for example, a critique of a particular version of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR), which one finds developed by William Rowe or Richard Gale, might not be telling against the Thomistic or kalām versions of the argument. Another way of distinguishing between versions of the argument is in terms of the relevance of time to the argument. In Aquinas’s version, consideration of the essential ordering of the causes or reasons proceeds independent of temporal concerns. The relationship between cause and effect is treated as real but not temporal, so that the first cause is not a first cause in time but a sustaining cause (Siniscalchi 2018: 691). In the kalām version, however, the temporal ordering of the causal sequence is central, introducing issues of the nature of time into the discussion.

3. Complexity of the Question

It is said that philosophy begins in wonder. Thus it was for the pre-Socratic Greeks, who wondered what constituted the basic stuff of the world (κóσμος) around them, how this basic stuff changed into the diverse forms they experienced, and how it came to be. These origination questions related to the puzzle of existence that, in its metaphysical dimensions, is the subject of our concern.

First, why is there anything at all? This question becomes clearer when put in contrastive form, Why is there something rather than nothing? We can ask this question even in the absence of contingent beings, though in this context it is likely to prove unanswerable. For example, if God or the universe is logically or absolutely necessary, it would not only exist but must exist even if nothing else existed. Probably no reason can be given for why logically or absolutely necessary things exist, if they do at all. (Almeida disagrees; see his argument below.)

Some doubt whether we can ask this question because there being nothing is not an option. John Heil asks, “What exactly is nothing at all? What would nothing be?” (Heil 2013: 174). He analogizes nothing with the notion of empty space, in terms of which, he thinks, we can conceptualize nothing. He reasons that we cannot achieve a notion of empty space simply by removing the universe’s contents one at a time, for space (the void) would still exist. However, we need not analogize nothing in terms of empty space, and even if we do, we surely can conceive of removing space. If we think of space as a particular type of relation between objects, the removal of all objects (everything) would leave nothing, including relations. The key point is that “leaving nothing” is not to be understood in the sense that nothing is or has existence. We can easily be misled by the language of there being nothing at all, leading to the notion that nothing has being or existence. Heil suggests that nothing might be a precursor to the Big Bang. However, this too is a misconception—though one widely held by those who think that the universe arose out of nothing, e.g., a vacuum fluctuation. A vacuum fluctuation is itself not nothing “but is a sea of fluctuating energy endowed with a rich structure and subject to physical laws” (Craig and Sinclair 2009: 183, 191). The contrastive question is comprehensible: “Why is there something rather than there never having been anything whatsoever?”

Rutten (2012, 13–15, see Other Internet Resources) develops an a priori reductio ad absurdum argument for the impossibility of there being nothing. Suppose nothing exists. If nothing exists, then no actual states of affairs exist, and if no actual states of affairs exist, no merely possible states of affairs exist, since (on an Aristotelean model) there is nothing to actualize them or bring them about. Hence, if nothing exists, there are no possible states of affairs, since to be possible, something must either be actual or merely possible. (This is consistent with the theists’ contention that out of nothing nothing can come.) However, one can conceive of a possible world with at least one actual and hence possible state of affairs S, for example, a world with one atom. But, Rutten notes, on the S5 axiom system of modal logic (see the entry on modal logic), all possible worlds are connected. Hence, if S is metaphysically possible in one world, S is metaphysically possible in all possible worlds. That is, S is necessarily possible. However, this contradicts the original conclusion that if total nothingness is metaphysically possible, there are no possible states of affairs in that possible world. Hence, there is a reductio against the original thesis that there can be nothingness. One might counter this reductio not only by questioning the principle that what is metaphysically possible in one world is so in every world, but also by contending that the argument trades on a confusion between metaphysical necessity, as evidenced by appeal to an Aristotelian principle regarding the relationship between actuality and possibility, with logical necessity, which in invoking the S5 modal system addresses logical possibility across possible worlds (for this distinction, see Burgess 1999, 81).

Second, why are there these particular contingent beings? The starting point here is the existence of particular things, and the question posed asks for an explanation for there being these particular things. If we are looking for a causal explanation and accept a full explanation (in terms of contemporary or immediately prior causal conditions and the relevant natural laws that together necessitate the effect), the answer emerges from an analysis of the relevant immediate causal conditions present in each case. Hume argues that an explanation in terms of temporally conjoined factors is all that is necessary for a satisfactory explanation. In contrast, O’Connor treats this formulation of the question as the basis for his construction of a cosmological argument for the existence of an absolutely necessary being (2008: 65).

Heil suggests that the answer depends on how one understands the Big Bang (2013: 178). If it was spontaneous, the question has no answer. If not spontaneous, there might be an answer. Theists broaden the explanatory search to include final causes or intentions appropriate to a personal cause. It leads us to ask the question, “Supposing that God exists, why did God bring about contingent beings?” This assumes that God exists and now inquires about the reasons for creation. On the one hand, we might argue that this question is unanswerable in that only God would know his reasons for bringing the universe into existence (O’Connor 2008). On the other hand, God acts out of his nature; Swinburne (2004: 47, 114–23) emphasizes God’s goodness, from which we can infer possible reasons for what God brings about (although at this point the problem of evil has bite). God also acts from his intentions (Swinburne 1993: 139–45; 2007: 83–84), so that God could reveal his purposes for his act of creating (Richard Swinburne, The Evolution of the Soul: 309).

Third, why do things continue to exist? This is the question that Thomas Aquinas posed. Aquinas was interested not in a beginning cause but in a sustaining cause, for he believed that the universe could be eternal—although he believed on the basis of revelation that it was not eternal. He constructed his cosmological arguments around the question of what sustains things in the universe in their existence.

Fourth, if the universe has a beginning, what is the cause of that beginning? This is the question that is addressed by the kalām cosmological argument, given its central premise that everything that begins to exist has a cause. Many, however, deny the antecedent in the conditional, that the universe had a beginning.

Fifth and fundamentally, why are there contingent beings? This may be asked about particular finite beings and, if the universe is contingent, the universe. Several responses have been given. One is that particular things exist because of their causes, and their causes because of their causes, and so on. Had those causes not existed, the effect in question would not exist. If one speaks about the universe, then either it exists because it is caused (e.g., brought about by the intentional act of a supernatural being) or it is inexplicable (the universe just exists; its existence is a brute fact; it has always existed, though perhaps through many phases). This is the question that traditional cosmological arguments connected to natural theology address.

Two things should be obvious from this discussion. First, questions about existence are more nuanced than usually addressed (Heil 2013: 177). It is important to be more precise about what one is asking when one asks this broader metaphysical question about why there is something rather than nothing. Second, the cosmological argument lies at the heart of attempts to answer the questions, and to this we now turn.

4. Argument for a Non-contingent Cause

Thomas Aquinas held that among the things whose existence needs explanation are contingent beings that depend for their existence upon other beings. Richard Taylor (1992: 84–94) discusses the argument in terms of the world (“everything that ever does exist, except God, in case there is a god”, 1992: 87) being contingent and thus needing explanation. Arguing that the term “universe” refers to an abstract entity or set, William Rowe rephrases the issue, “Why does that set (the universe) have the members that it does rather than some other members or none at all?” (Rowe 1975: 136). Put broadly, “Why is there anything at all?” (Smart, in Smart and Haldane, 1996: 35; Rundle 2004). The response of defenders of the cosmological argument is that what is contingent exists because of some action of a necessary being.

4.1 A Deductive Argument from Contingency

As an a posteriori argument, the cosmological argument begins with a fact known by experience, namely, that something contingent exists. We might sketch out a version of the argument as follows.

  1. A contingent being (a being such that if it exists, it could have not-existed) exists.
  2. All contingent beings have a sufficient cause of or fully adequate explanation for their existence.
  3. The sufficient cause of or fully adequate explanation for the existence of contingent beings is something other than the contingent being itself.
  4. The sufficient cause of or fully adequate explanation for the existence of contingent beings must either be solely other contingent beings or include a non-contingent (necessary) being.
  5. Contingent beings alone cannot provide a sufficient cause of or fully adequate explanation for the existence of contingent beings.
  6. Therefore, what sufficiently causes or fully adequately explains the existence of contingent beings must include a non-contingent (necessary) being.
  7. Therefore, a necessary being (a being such that if it exists, it cannot not-exist) exists.
  8. The universe, which is composed of only contingent beings, is contingent.
  9. Therefore, the necessary being is something other than the universe. (For a Thomistic version of this argument, see Siniscalchi 2018: 690–93).

In the argument, steps 1–7 establish the existence of a necessary or non-contingent being; steps 8–9 attempt in some way to identify it.

Over the centuries philosophers have suggested various instantiations for the contingent being noted in premise 1. In his Summa Theologica (I,q.2,a.3), Aquinas argued that we need a causal explanation for things in motion, things that are caused, and contingent beings.[1] Others, such as Richard Swinburne (2004), propose that the contingent being referred to in premise 1 is the universe. The connection between the two is supplied by John Duns Scotus, who argued that even if the essentially ordered causes were infinite, “the whole series of effects would be dependent upon some prior cause” (Scotus [c. 1300] 1964: I,D.2,p.1,q.1,§53). Richard Gale (1999) calls this the “Big Conjunctive Contingent Fact”. Whereas the contingency of particular existents is generally undisputed, not the least because of our mortality, the contingency of the universe deserves serious defense (see section 4.2). Premise 2 invokes a moderate version of the Principle of Causation, according to which there must be a sufficient cause for any contingent being or event, or of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, according to which there must be a fully adequate explanation for any contingent being or event. Applied here, the Principles of Causation or of Sufficient Reason support the contention that if something is contingent, there must be a sufficient cause of its existence or a fully adequate reason or explanation why it exists rather than not exists. The point of premise 3 is simply that something cannot cause or explain its own existence, for this would require it to already exist (in a logical if not in a temporal sense). Premise 4 is true by virtue of the Principle of Excluded Middle: what explains the existence of the contingent being either are solely other contingent beings or include a non-contingent (necessary) being. Conclusions 6 and 7 follow validly from the respective premises.

For many critics, premise 5 (along with premise 2) holds the key to the argument’s success or failure. The truth of 5 depends upon the requirements for an adequate explanation. Using the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR), what is required here is an account in terms of sufficient conditions that provides an adequate explanation why the cause had the effect it did, or alternatively, why this particular effect and not another arose. Swinburne (2004: 75–79), and Alexander Pruss (2006: 16–18) after him, note diverse kinds of explanations. In a full explanation the causal factors—in scientific causation, contemporary or immediately precedent causal conditions and natural laws; in personal causation, persons and their intentions— are sufficient for the occurrence of an event. They “together necessitate the occurrence of the effect” (Swinburne 2004: 76).

It does not allow a puzzling aspect of the explanandum to disappear: anything puzzling in the explanandum is either also found in the explanans or else explained by the explanans. (Pruss 2006: 17)

It suffices to explain why something comes about given the immediately present causal conditions but leaves unexplained why those explanatory causal conditions and/or reasons themselves hold.

In a complete explanation, every aspect of the explanandum and explanans at the time of the occurrence is accounted for; nothing puzzling remains.

A complete explanation of the occurrence of E is a full explanation of its occurrence in which all the factors cited are such that there is no [further] explanation (either full or partial) of their existence of operation in terms of factors operative at the time of their existence or operation. (Swinburne 2004: 78)

Pruss and Swinburne argue that the kind of explanation required by the PSR is a complete explanation.

Quinn argues that an adequate explanation need not require a complete explanation (2005: 584–85); a partial explanation might do just as well, depending on the context. Among these adequate explanations of why this actual world obtains rather than another possible world (including one with no contingent beings) is that the universe is an inexplicable brute fact or that God strongly actualized the world (although not everything in it). He refuses to take sides on the debate between explanations, except to say that science cannot provide an adequate explanation if the explanatory chain is infinite, for the chain of causes is itself contingent or it ends in an initial contingency not scientifically accountable. However, not only does Quinn not clarify what constitutes an adequate explanation, but as Pruss contends, the PSR “is not compatible with an infinite chain of explanations that has no ultimate explanans” (2006: 17), for in an infinite chain something puzzling remains to be explained, with the result that the PSR would again be invoked to explain what is puzzling. However, as we will question below, is the brute fact of the universe any more unacceptable as a complete explanation than the brute fact of a necessary being (God)?

One worry with understanding the PSR in this way is that it may lead to a deterministic account that not only may bode ill for the success of the argument but on a libertarian account may be incompatible with the contention that God created freely. Pruss, however, envisions no such difficulty, for giving reasons neither makes the event deterministic nor removes freedom.

What gives sufficiency to explanation is that mystery is taken away, for example, through the citing of relevant reasons, not that probability is increased.... Once we have said that \(x\) freely chose \(A\) for \(R\), then the only thing left that is unexplained is why \(x\) existed and was both free and attracted by \(R\). (Pruss 2006: 157,158)

One might reply that an explanation needs to be given for why \(x\) was attracted to \(R_1\) rather than to \(R_2\), and that if that explanation is given, \(x\)’s choice is not free but determined by the degree to which \(x\) is attracted to different reasons. However, Pruss might respond that being “attracted by” is not to be understood in any deterministic sense. One might freely consider an option to be the best without being necessitated to choose it. The debate hinges on how one understands how reasons function in human agency.

Finally, some (disputedly, see below) argue that explanations must be either natural (impersonal) or non-natural (personal). 8 & 9 assert that if the contingent being identified in 1 is the universe, given that the universe encompasses all natural existents and the laws and principles governing them, the explanation must be in terms of a non-natural, eternal, necessary being that provides an intentional, personal, ultimate explanation. Since the argument proceeds independent of temporal considerations, the argument does not necessarily propose a first cause in time, but allows for a first or primary sustaining cause of the universe. As Aquinas noted, the philosophical arguments for God’s existence as first cause are compatible with the eternity of the universe (On the Eternity of the World), although he rejects the latter based on divine revelation.

Whether 8 and 9 are an intrinsic part of the cosmological argument is debated. Kant argued that the argument had two parts, the first establishing the existence of an absolutely necessary being; the second part, identifying this being as the most real being (1787, B633–40). Without the second part, the concept of a necessary being was empty. The issue achieves significance when the question arises whether the argument has religious significance, that is, whether necessary being to which the argument concludes is God. Some contend that from the concept of a necessary being flow properties appropriate to a divine being (Siniscalchi 2018, 693). Timothy O’Connor (2004) argues that being a necessary being cannot be a derivative emergent property, otherwise the being would be contingent. Likewise, the connection between the essential properties must be necessary. Hence, the universe cannot be the necessary being since it is mereologically complex. Similarly, the myriad elementary particles cannot be necessary beings either, for their distinguishing distributions are externally caused and hence contingent. Rather, he contends that a more viable account of the necessary being is as a purposive agent with desires, intentions, and beliefs, whose activity is guided but not determined by its goals, a view consistent with identifying the necessary being as God. Koons (as are Craig and Sinclair 2009: 192–94) is willing to identify the necessary being as God. He identifies seven corollaries regarding God’s nature that follow from his mereological construction of the cosmological argument (e.g., God as the necessary being is not a mere aggregate or composite; has its basic attributes by necessity; is not essentially located in space or time; etc. (1997). Oppy (1999, 381–84), on the other hand, in critiquing Koons’s presentation “of seven corollaries to his (cosmological) proof which are intended to establish that the First Cause has at least some of the attributes which are traditionally attributed to God,” expresses significant skepticism about Koons’s arguments and the possibility of such a deductive move to determine its properties.

Critics have objected to key premises in the argument. We will consider the most important objections and responses.

4.2 Objection 1: The Universe Just Is

Interpreting the contingent being in premise 1 as the universe, Bertrand Russell denies that the universe needs an explanation (premise 2); it just is. Russell, following Hume (1779), contends that since we derive the concept of cause from our observation of particular things, we cannot ask about the cause of something like the universe that we cannot experience. The universe needs no explanation; it is “just there, and that’s all” (Russell 1948 [1964]: 175). This view was reiterated by Hawking (1987: 651).

Swinburne replies that

uniqueness is relative to description. Every physical object is unique under some description,… yet all objects within the universe are characterized by certain properties, which are common to more than one object.… The objection fails to make any crucial distinction between the universe and other objects; and so it fails in its attempt to prevent at the outset a rational inquiry into the issue of whether the universe has some origin outside itself. (Swinburne 2004: 134–35)

We do not need to experience every possible referent of the class of contingent things to be able to conclude that a contingent thing needs a cause. “To know that a rubber ball dropped on a Tuesday in Waggener Hall by a redheaded tuba player will fall to the ground”, I do not need a sample that includes tuba players dropping rubber balls at this location (Koons 1997: 202).

Morriston (2002a: 235) responds that although it is true that we do not need to experience every instance to derive a general principle, the universe is a very different thing from what we experientially reference when we say that things cannot come into existence without a cause. Tuba players are not “anything remotely analogous to the ‘initial singularity’ that figures in the Big Bang theory of the origin of the universe”.

Defenders of the argument respond that there is a key similarity between the cosmos and its content, namely, both are contingent. However, why should we think that the cosmos is contingent? Defenders of the view contend that if the components of the universe are contingent, the universe itself is contingent. Russell replies that the move from the contingency of the components of the universe to the contingency of the universe commits the Fallacy of Composition, which mistakenly concludes that since the parts have a certain property, the whole likewise has that property. Hence, whereas we legitimately can ask for the cause of particular things, to require a cause of the universe based on the contingency of its parts is mistaken.

Russell correctly notes that arguments of the part-whole type can commit the Fallacy of Composition. For example, the argument that since all the bricks in the wall are small, the wall is small, is fallacious. Yet it is an informal fallacy of content, not a formal fallacy. Sometimes the totality has the same quality as the parts because of the nature of the parts invoked—the wall is brick (composed of baked clay) because it is built of bricks (composed of baked clay). The universe’s contingency, theists argue, resembles the second case. If all the contingent things in the universe, including matter and energy, ceased to exist simultaneously, the universe itself, as the totality of these things, would cease to exist. However, if the universe can cease to exist, it is contingent and requires an explanation for its existence (Reichenbach 1972: chap. 5).

It is worth noting that on the one hand, “universe” can refer to what is spatio-temporally connected to us. On the other hand, “universe” can refer to the totality of contingent beings (Oppy 1999: 384). This argument for the contingency of the universe from its component, contingent parts coalesces these two understandings in the cosmological argument.

Whether this argument for the contingency of the universe is similar to that advanced by Aquinas in his Third Way depends on how one interprets Aquinas’s argument. Aquinas holds that “if everything can not-be, then at one time there was nothing in existence” (ST I,q.2,a.3). William Rowe (1975: 160–67) argues that what looks like a similar argument in Samuel Clarke for the contingency of the universe is fallacious, for even if every contingent being were to fail to exist in some possible world, it may be the case that there is no possible world that lacks a contingent being (on Aquinas, see Plantinga 1967: 5–6; Kenny 1969: 56–66). That is, although no being would exist in every possible world, every possible world could possess at least one contingent being. In such a case, although each being is contingent, something must exist. Rowe gives the example of a horse race.

We know that although no horse in a given horse race necessarily will be the winner, it is, nevertheless, necessary that some horse in the race will be the winner. (1975: 164)

Rowe’s example will work only if it is necessary that some horse will finish the race, for otherwise it is possible that all the horses break a leg and none finishes the race—a condition he notes in that “it is necessary that there exists at least one member of the collection”. So why should we think that something must exist, even if it is contingent? Rowe does not say why, but one argument given in defense of this thesis is that the existence of one contingent being may be necessary for the nonexistence of some other contingent being. However, although the fact that something’s existence is necessary for the non-existence of something else holds for certain relational properties (for example, the existence of a spouse is necessary for a man not to be a bachelor), it is doubtful that something’s existence is necessary for the non-existence of something else per se, which is what is needed to support the argument that denies the contingency of the universe.

Haldane (Smart and Haldane 1996: 132) defends the cogency of Aquinas’s reasoning on the grounds that Aquinas’s argument is fallacious only on a temporal reading, but Aquinas’s argument employs an atemporal ordering of contingent beings. That is, Aquinas does not hold that over time there would be nothing, but that in the per se ordering of causes, if every contingent thing in that order did not exist, there would be nothing.

Rowe (1975: 166) develops a different argument to support the thesis that the universe must be contingent. He argues that it is necessary that if God exists, then it is possible that no dependent beings exist. Since it is possible that God exists, it is possible that it is possible that no dependent beings exist. (This conclusion is licensed by the modal principle: If it is necessary that if \(p\) then \(q\), then if it is possible that \(p\), it is possible that \(q\).) Hence, it is possible that there are no dependent beings; that is, that the universe is contingent. Rowe takes the conditional as necessarily true in virtue of the classical concept of God, according to which God is free to decide whether or not to create dependent beings.

To avoid any hint of the Fallacy of Composition and to avoid its complications, Koons (1997: 198–99) formulates the argument for the contingency of the universe as a mereological argument. If something is contingent, it contains a contingent part. The whole and part overlap and, by virtue of overlapping, have a common part. Since the part in virtue of which they overlap is wholly contingent, the whole likewise must be contingent.

One might approach Russell’s thesis regarding the brute fact of the universe from a different direction. If theists are willing to accept the existence of God as the necessary being as a brute fact, why cannot nontheists accept the existence of the universe as a brute fact, as a necessary being? Bede Rundle, for example, argues that what has necessary existence is causally independent. Matter has necessary existence, for although it undergoes change as manifested in particular bits of matter, the given volume of matter found in the universe persists, and as persisting matter/energy does not have or need a cause. This accords with the Principle of Conservation of Mass-Energy, according to which matter and energy are never lost but rather transmute into each other. As indestructible, matter/energy is the necessary being. Consequently, although the material components of the universe are contingent vis-à-vis their form, they are necessary vis-à-vis their existence. On this reading, there is not one but there are many necessary beings, all internal to the universe. Their particular configurations are contingent, but since matter/energy is conserved it cannot be created or lost.

Interestingly enough, this approach was anticipated by Aquinas in his third way in his Summa Theologica (I,q.2,a.3). Once Aquinas concludes that necessary beings exist, he then goes on to ask whether these beings have their existence from themselves or from another. If from another, then we have an unsatisfactory infinite regress of explanations. Hence, there must be something whose necessity is uncaused. As Kenny points out, Aquinas understands this necessity in terms of being unable to cease to exist (Kenny 1969: 48). Although Aquinas understands the uncaused necessary being to be God, Rundle takes this to be matter/energy itself.

One question that arises with Rundle’s view is whether there could have been more or less matter/energy than there is. That is, if there is \(n\) amount of matter/energy in the world, could there be a possible world with \(+n\) or \(-n\) amounts of matter/energy? We do not know how much matter/energy existed in the first \(10^{-35}\) seconds of the universe. Even if the universe currently operates according to the principle of the Conservation of Matter and Energy, Rundle’s thesis depends on the contention that during the very early phase of rapid expansion, a period of time we know little about, this principle held. A second significant problem concerns what follows from the existence of necessary beings. If the matter/energy nexus constitutes the necessary being, what causally follows from that nexus is itself necessary, and contingency, even in the composing relations within the universe, would disappear. Everything in the universe would be necessary, which is a disquieting position. Third, O’Connor (2004) argues that since the necessary being provides the ultimate explanation, there is no explanation of the differentiation of the kinds of matter or of contingencies that matter/energy causally undergo, for example, in terms of space-time location. We will return to the question of the contingency of the universe below.

4.3 Objection 2: Explaining the Individual Constituents Is Sufficient

Whereas Russell argued that the universe just is, David Hume held that when the parts are explained the whole is explained.

But the whole, you say, wants a cause. I answer that the uniting of these parts into a whole…is performed merely by an arbitrary act of the mind, and has no influence on the nature of things. Did I show you the particular causes of each individual in a collection of twenty particles of matter, I should think it very unreasonable should you afterwards ask me what was the cause of the whole twenty. This is sufficiently explained in explaining the parts. (Hume 1779: part 9)

Hume contends that uniting the parts or individual constituents into a whole is a mental act. In reality, all that exist are individual, causally-related events, not whole sets of events. When we have provided an account of each of these individual, causally-related events we have explained the whole. We don’t need anything more.

Rowe objects to what he terms the Hume-Edwards principle—that by explaining the parts we have explained the whole:

When the existence of each member of a collection is explained by reference to some other member of that very same collection, then it does not follow that the collection itself has an explanation. For it is one thing for there to be an explanation of the existence of each dependent being and quite another thing for there to be an explanation of why there are dependent beings at all. (Rowe 1975: 264)

Pruss (1999) expands on Rowe’s argument. An explanation of the parts may provide a partial but not a complete explanation. The explanation in terms of parts may fail to explain why these parts exist rather than others, why they exist rather than not, or why the parts are arranged as they are. Each member or part will be explained either in terms of itself or in terms of something else that is contingent. The former would make them necessary, not contingent, beings. If they are explained in terms of something else, they still remain unaccounted for, since the explanation would invoke either an infinite regress of causes or a circular explanation. Pruss employs the chicken/egg sequence: chickens account for eggs, which account for chickens, and so on where the two are paired. However, appealing to an infinite chicken/egg regress or else arguing in a circle explains neither any given chicken nor egg.

Richard Swinburne notes that an explanation is complete when “any attempt to go beyond the factors which we have would result in no gain of explanatory power or prior probability” (2004: 89). However, explaining why something exists rather than something else or than nothing and why it is as it is gives additional explanatory power in explaining why a universe exists at all. Gale (1991: 257–58) concludes that if we are to explain the parts of the universe and their specific concatenation, we must appeal to something other than those parts.

4.4 Objection 3: The Principles of Causation and Sufficient Reason Are Suspect

Critics of the cosmological argument contend that the Causal Principle or, where applicable, the broader Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR) that underlies versions of the argument, is suspect. As Hume argued, there is no reason for thinking that the Causal Principle is true a priori, for we can conceive of events occurring without conceiving of their being caused, and what is conceivable is possible in reality (1748: IV). Neither can an argument for the application of the Causal Principle to the universe be drawn from inductive experience. Even if the Causal Principle applies to events in the world, we cannot extrapolate from the way the world works to the world as a whole (Mackie 1982: 85; Kant 1787: B638).

Several replies are in order. First, Hume’s conceivability to possibility argument is unsound. For one thing, whose conceivability is being appealed to here? For another, someone who fails to understand a necessarily true proposition might conceive of it being false, but from this it does not follow that it possibly is false. A person might think (wrongly) that pi is a determinate number, but it does not follow that it is so. In the phenomenology of conceivability, what is really conceivable is difficult if not impossible to differentiate from what some might think is conceivable. And even if something is conceivable, say in a logical sense, it does not follow that it is metaphysically or factually possible. One might conceive that, since heads can be distinguished from tails on a coin, they can actually be separated, but metaphysically such is impossible. What is distinguishable is not necessarily separable. Hume, it seems, confuses epistemic with ontological conditions. Hence, the argument based on conceivability is suspect (Reichenbach 1972: 57–60).

Second, some suggest a pragmatic-type argument to show that the Causal and Sufficient Reason principles are true, namely that the principles are necessary to make the universe intelligible. Without such principles, Pruss argues, science itself would be undercut. “Claiming to be a brute fact should be a last resort. It would undercut the practice of science” (Pruss 2006: 255). Utilization of the principles best accounts for the success of science, indeed, for any investigatory endeavor (Koons 1997; see also Koons 2008: 111–12, where he argues that it is “a subjectively required presumption needed for immunity to internal defeaters”). The best explanation of the success of science and other such rational endeavors is that the principles really indicate how reality operates.

Critics reply that the principles then only have methodological or practical and not ontological justification. As John Mackie argues, we have no right to assume that the universe complies with our intellectual preferences for causal order. We can simply work with brute facts; beginning with them, science would work just as well.

Pruss goes further to suggest that the PSR in particular is “self-evident, obvious, intuitively clear, in no need of argumentative support” (2006: 189). For example, he holds that the Principle of Sufficient Reason—“necessarily, every contingently true proposition has an explanation” (he defers on whether the principle also applies to necessarily true propositions)—is self-evident in the sense that anyone who understands it correctly understands that it is true. These persons might not know it to be self-evidently true, but they do understand it to be true. This is consistent with other persons denying it is self-evident, for those who deny it might misunderstand the principle in various ways.

The problem with the claim of self-evidence is that it is a conversation ender, not a starter. One who denies its self-evidence might think that those who hold to the principle are the ones who experience conceptual blindness. In contrast to analyticity, self-evidence holds in relation to the knowers themselves, and here intuitions vary, perhaps according to philosophical or other types of perspectives. Furthermore, if the principle truly is self-evident, it would be strange to respond to skeptics by attempting to give reasons to support that contention, and were such demanded, the request would itself invoke the very principle in question.

Pruss responds that being self-evident is not incompatible with providing arguments for self-evident propositions, and he thinks that arguments can show the truth of the PSR to those who deny its self-evidence. Among the numerous arguments he advances is a modal argument employing a Weak Principle of Sufficient Reason, according to which “every contingent proposition possibly has a complete explanation” (Pruss 2006: 234–35). We will develop this in section 6.

Peter van Inwagen (1983: 202–04) argues that the PSR must be rejected. If the PSR is true, every contingent proposition has an explanation. Suppose P is the conjunction of all contingent true propositions. Suppose also that there is a state of affairs S that provides a sufficient reason for P. S cannot itself be contingent, for then it would be a conjunct of P and entailed by P, and as both entailing and entailed by P would be P, so that it would be its own sufficient reason. However, no contingent proposition can explain itself. Neither can S be necessary, for from necessary propositions only necessary propositions follow. Necessary propositions cannot explain contingent propositions, for if x sufficiently explains y, then x entails y, and if x is necessary so is y. S cannot be either contingent or necessary, and hence the PSR is false. Thus, if the cosmological argument appeals to the PSR to establish the existence of a necessary being whose existence is expressed by a necessary proposition as an explanation for contingent beings, it fails in that it cannot account for the contingent beings it purportedly explains.

However, as Pruss notes (2006: chaps. 6 & 7), “The word sufficient can be read in two different ways: the reason given can be logically sufficient for the explanandum, or it can sufficiently explain the explanandum (2006: 103).” According to Pruss, we need not hold to the strong claim of logical sufficiency about the relation between explaining and entailment in cases where the explanation is brought about by libertarian free agency. Although God is a necessary being, his connection with the world is through his free agency, and free actions explain but do not entail the existence of particular contingent states.

Clearly, the soundness of the deductive version of the cosmological argument hinges on whether principles like that of Causation or Sufficient Reason are more than methodologically true and on the extent to which these principles can be applied to things, events, and facts. Critics of the argument will be skeptical regarding the universal application of the principles; defenders of the argument generally not so, at least as limited to contingencies. Perhaps the best one can say, with Taylor, is that even those who critique the PSR (understood broadly that every contingent thing, event, or fact must have a sufficient cause, reason, or ground) invoke it when they suggest that defenders of the principle have failed to provide a sufficient reason for thinking it is true.

The principle of sufficient reason can be illustrated in various ways,…but it cannot be proved…. If one were to try proving it, he would sooner or later have to appeal to considerations that are less plausible than the principle itself. Indeed, it is hard to see how one could even make an argument for it without already assuming it. For this reason it might properly be called a presupposition of reason itself. (Taylor 1992: 87)

It might be denied that the request for a sufficient reason for the truth of principle itself invokes the PSR on the grounds that “reason” has two senses, explanation and evidence. However, in requesting and giving a sufficient reason for the truth of the principle, the explanation of why it is true should provide sufficient evidence to support the claim. (See the introduction to the entry Principle of Sufficient Reason).

Finally, critics have argued that an argument for the application of the Causal Principle to the universe cannot be drawn from inductive experience. Even if the Causal Principle applies to events in the world, we cannot extrapolate from the way the world works to the world as a whole (Mackie 1982: 85). The type of causation we experience in the empirical world is different from the kind of causation proposed to hold between a necessary being and the cosmos (Kant 1787: B638).

We will return to the Principle of Causation below with respect to the kalām argument.

4.5 Objection 4: Problems with the Concept of a Necessary Being

Kant argued that the cosmological argument introduced an empirical premise to evade the difficulties of the ontological argument. Although in the ontological argument the perfect being is allegedly determined to exist through its own concept, in fact nothing can be determined to exist in this manner; one has to begin with existence (see entry on Ontological Arguments). The cosmological argument, on the other hand, proceeds from an empirical premise about my existence to the existence of an unconditioned, absolutely necessary being, a being whose nonexistence is “impossible”, “absolutely inconceivable” (1787: B621). This concept has the same status as geometrical concepts, which though necessary do not establish the existence of anything corresponding to the concept. So, when we think of an absolutely necessary being, are we thinking about anything at all? What this absolutely necessary being is, what properties it has, can be determined not through experience but only through reason, that is, from a priori concepts alone. Since the only concept that suffices to determine its properties is that of a most real being, the concept of an absolutely necessary being presupposes that concept. However, that the most real being necessarily exists is the burden of the ontological argument. Hence, the CA depends on the ontological argument to determine the absolutely necessary being. But since the ontological argument is defective for the above and other reasons, the cosmological argument that depends on or invokes it likewise must be defective (1787: B634; for an alternative interpretation of Kant’s argument see Proops 2014).

Kant’s contention that the necessity found in “necessary being” is logical necessity was common up through the 1960s. J.J.C. Smart wrote,

And by “a necessary being” the cosmological argument means “a logically necessary being”, i.e., “a being whose non-existence is inconceivable in the sort of way that a triangle’s having four sides is inconceivable”.… Now since “necessary” is a word which applies primarily to propositions, we shall have to interpret “God is a necessary being” as “The proposition ‘God exists’ is logically necessary” (1955: 38); in a later work, Smart (Smart and Haldane 1996: 41–47) broadened his notion of necessity.)

Many recent discussions of the cosmological argument, both supporting and critiquing it, interpret the notion of a necessary being as a being that cannot not exist (O’Connor 2008: 78, 2013: 38). For example, Gale-Pruss contend that speaking about necessary beings does not differ from speaking of the necessity of propositions (see section 6). As such, as Plantinga notes, if a necessary being is possible, it exists (God, Freedom and Evil, 1967: 110). It is a being that exists in all possible worlds. The only question that remains is whether God’s existence is possible. This notion is similar to, if not a modernization of, Aquinas’s contention that God’s essence is to exist. Aquinas attempts to avoid the accusation that this invokes the ontological argument on the grounds that we do not have an adequate concept of God’s essence (ST I,q.2,a.1). However, if we understand “necessary being” in this sense, we can dispose of the cosmological argument as irrelevant; what is needed rather is an argument to establish that God’s existence understood as logically necessary is possible, for if it is possible that it is necessary that God exists, then necessarily God exists (by Axiom S5).

However, this need not be the sense in which “necessary being” is understood in the cosmological argument. A more adequate notion of necessary being is that the necessity is metaphysical or factual (Hick 1960). A necessary being is one that if it exists, it neither came into existence nor can cease to exist, and correspondingly, if it does not exist, it cannot come into existence (Reichenbach 1972: 117–20). If it exists, it eternally maintains its own existence; it is self-sufficient and self-sustaining. So understood, the cosmological argument does not rely on notions central to the ontological argument. Rather, instead of being superfluous, the cosmological argument, if sound, gives us reason to think that the necessary being exists rather than not.

Mackie replies that if God has mere metaphysical or factual necessity, God’s existence is logically contingent, such that some reason is required for God’s own existence (Mackie 1982: 84). As Swinburne notes, God is a logically contingent being, and so could have not-existed (2004: 79, 148). Why, then, does God exist? The PSR can be applied to the necessary being.

The theist responds that the PSR does not address logical contingency but metaphysical contingency. One is not required to find a reason for what is not metaphysically contingent. It is not that the necessary being is self-explanatory; rather, a demand for explaining its existence is inappropriate. Hence, the theist concludes, Hawking’s question “Who created God?” (Hawking 1988: 174) is out of place (Davis 1997). We will return to this discussion in section 9.

5. Argument from a Strong Principle of Sufficient Reason

Michael Almeida (2018) builds on the critical arguments of van Inwagen and others regarding the PSR. He contends that the version of the PSR used by defenders of the cosmological argument is inadequate because it fails to provide the best explanation for the universe. The best explanation, and hence the one required of a sound cosmological argument, is an absolute explanation, where everything is explained completely. There are no brute or contingent facts. He notes that in constructing their respective cosmological arguments, Pruss and Swinburne reject absolute explanation for complete explanations, where the effect is explained fully by the cause operating at a given time but where no explanation of the cause at the time of the occurrence is required. According to him, traditional defenders of the cosmological argument cannot invoke the requirement of an absolute explanation because if they did, given their metaphysic of actualist realism, they would incur a host of problems. Since all is determined on an absolute explanation, they would face the problems of the impossibility of libertarian free will, of indeterministic quantum effects, of modal imagination about lawless worlds where things pop into existence, and the collapse of modal distinctions. These problems, he says, arise not from an absolutist PSR per se but from its conjunction with actualist realism (only the actual is real).

The way around this, he contends, if one is going to defend the cosmological argument, is to opt for a different ontology, namely, genuine modal realism (mere possibilities are also real), which he claims not only can legitimize the cosmological argument but avoids the above problems. According to Almeida, modal realism makes libertarian free will compatible with necessitarianism in that two possible worlds can have the same history H up to time t, but at t, A occurs in one world and not in another world. The two histories do not determine whether A or -A occurs, but all possibilities necessarily occur. To make this work Almeida fudges on the principle of the identity of indiscernibles. Although the two series H and H* up to t are identical, there is not one series H that forks at t. Rather, there are two series, such that at t A can occur in one series and -A can occur in another. The past does not necessitate the future. Similarly, lawless or chaotic worlds, i.e., worlds lacking relations following a causal principle, are possible, so that it is possible and hence necessary that causeless events occur. In such a world the cosmological argument would still hold, he claims, because the principle of sufficient reason, compatible with the falsity of the causal principle, still holds. This analysis, he thinks, frees the defender of the cosmological argument from problems that trouble traditional formulations.

We cannot digress here into modal realism (for discussion of possible worlds, see entries on Possible Worlds and David Lewis: Modal Metaphysics), but turn specifically to Almeida’s cosmological argument. He argues that whereas cosmological arguments in the past commenced with an initial premise that was taken to express a contingent fact known a posteriori, “facts about change, causation, contingency, and objective…becoming are not usefully characterized as a posteriori facts” (2018: 3). He advances a cosmological argument with what he takes is an a priori fact: the pluriverse and everything in it, including all actualia and all possibilia, exist necessarily. This, he claims, is knowable a priori and according to the PSR requires an absolute explanation. Part of his novel approach is his contention that every proposition in the argument expresses a necessary fact known a priori, and that a priori propositions also require an explanation.

Since Almeida does not advance a detailed version of the cosmological argument, we might attempt to reconstruct his view.

  1. “Possible worlds are composite concrete objects… [that] necessarily coexist” (2018: 75). This is a central contention of his Lewisian modal realism (75).
  2. The pluriverse exists as “the collection of all possible worlds” (7,75).
  3. Everything that exists has an absolute explanation for its existence. Strong PSR
  4. “Therefore, there is an absolute explanation for the pluriverse” (75).
  5. An absolute explanation is possible “only if there are no contingent facts,” that is, only if everything exists necessarily (78–79).
  6. Therefore, there are no brute or contingent facts.
  7. This absolute explanation is found in the fact that God necessarily exists (75,82).

The pluriverse is the necessary, creative manifestation of the necessarily existing God (5).

Although from necessary propositions contingent propositions cannot follow, necessary propositions can follow. That is, from God’s necessary existence we can conclude that the pluriverse necessarily exists. This avoids the van Inwagen objection to the PSR as employed in the cosmological argument. Almeida holds that it also avoids the other problems associated with the cosmological argument in that it allows for contingency within absolute explanation. He contends that contingency is protected by lowering the standards of similarity between worlds; that is, contingency is possible where we do not require exact identity between things held to exist in different worlds. He gives the example of his speaking Finnish, something he cannot do in the actual world. If someone who is identical to Almeida exists in another world, metaphysically he must have identical properties. However, it makes sense to say that in another possible world Almeida could speak Finnish and still be Almeida. We lower the standards of similarity in our everyday consideration of existence in alternate worlds to allow for such possibilities and hence for the contingency of his not speaking Finnish in the actual world.

Several objections might be raised against this version of the cosmological argument. Perhaps most basic is the question why one would accept modal realism. It is, as Almeida and others note, “ontologically extravagant”. Second, whereas necessity characterizes the metaphysical world, for Almeida contingency appears to be a subjective, epistemic contribution. That is, metaphysically, everything necessarily is what it is, has all its properties essentially, and is not something else. Epistemically, we can lower the standards of similarity, so that two things with somewhat differing essential properties can be named the same, although strictly or metaphysically speaking, they are not the same. Similarity is an epistemically expansive concept to allow for contingency, but it does not allow for metaphysical contingency. Third, he contends that there are no brute facts on his theory. However, if there must be an absolute explanation for everything, what is the explanation for God’s existence? He gives God as an absolute explanation for the necessary existence of the pluriverse, but no absolute sufficient reason for God’s existence. He might reply that God’s existence is explained by being metaphysically necessary. However, if this explains God’s existence, since every component of the pluriverse and the pluriverse itself necessarily exist, why could not their metaphysical necessity be a sufficient reason or absolute explanation for their existence? Could they, like God, simply be necessary?

6. Argument from a Weak Principle of Sufficient Reason

Richard Gale and Alexander Pruss (1999) advanced a modal version of the cosmological argument. They reject the strong version of the PSR, according to which “for every proposition \(p\), if \(p\) is true, then there is a proposition, \(q\), that explains \(p\)”. In its place they favor using a weak version of the PSR—it is possible that for every true proposition, there is a proposition, \(q\), that explains \(p\)—that they believe is less question-begging and more initially acceptable to critics. They phrase the argument in terms of contingent and necessary propositions. A contingent proposition is one that is both possibly true and possibly false (i.e., true in some worlds and false in others); a necessarily true proposition is true in every possible world. In its simplest form, the argument is (1) if it is possible that it is necessary that a supernatural being of some sort exists, then it is necessary that a supernatural being of that sort exists. Since (2) it is possible that it is necessary that a supernatural being of some sort exists, (3) it is necessary that this being exists. The being that Gale has in mind is a very powerful and intelligent designer-creator, not the perfect God of Anselm, for this perfect God who would exist in all possible worlds would be incompatible with the existence of gratuitous and horrendous evils to be found in some of those possible worlds.

If one grants modal Axiom S5 (if it is possible that it is necessary that \(p\), then it is necessary that \(p\)), the critical premise in the argument is the second, and Gale and Pruss proceed to defend it using their weak PSR. They begin with the notion of a Big Conjunctive Fact (BCF), which is the totality of propositions that would be true of any possible world were it actualized. Since all possible worlds would have the same necessary propositions, they are differentiated by their Big Conjunctive Contingent Fact (BCCF), which would contain different contingent propositions. Let \(p\) be the BCCF of the actual world \(W\). Suppose, further, that it is possible that \(p\) has an explanation, that is, that it is possible that some proposition \(q\) explains \(p\). As such, there is a possible world \(W_{1}\) that contains \(p\), \(q\), and the proposition that \(q\) explains \(p\). The question now is whether \(W_{1}\) is the actual world, that is, whether there is a proposition \(q\) that explains \(p\) in the actual world. Gale argues that \(W_{1}\) (which contains \(q\) and the proposition that \(q\) explains \(p\)) is the actual world, for since \(W_{1}\) contains \(p\), there can be no property of \(p\) that is not found in \(W_{1}\). Every conjunct of \(p\) will be a conjunct of \(p_{1}\) (the BCCF of \(W_{1}\)) in \(W_{1}\). Suppose that \(r\) is a conjunct of \(p\) in \(W\), then not-\(r\) cannot be a conjunct of \(p_{1}\) in \(W_{1}\). Since \(W\) and \(W_{1}\) have the same properties, \(W_{1}\) is the actual world. Therefore, since these worlds are identical, the actual world contains \(p\), \(q\), and the proposition that \(q\) explains \(p\). That is, there is something that explains the BCCF of the actual world. The explanation of the BCCF cannot be scientific, for such would be in terms of law-like propositions and statements about the actual world at a given time, which would be contingent and hence part of the BCCF. Since the only explanations we can conceive of are personal or scientific, \(q\) provides a personal explanation of the BCCF in terms of the intentional action of a necessary being who freely brings it about that the world exists. \(q\) cannot report the action of a contingent being, for then the being would be part of \(p\) and explained by \(q\). However, something cannot explain itself. Hence, although contingent, \(q\) reports the action of a necessary being. Gale concludes that although this necessary being exists in every possible world, this tells little about its power, goodness, and other qualities. To make this being palatable to theists, he offers that the argument be supplemented by other arguments, such as the teleological arguments, to suggest that the necessary being is the kind of being that satisfies theistic requirements. Since

the actual world’s universe displays a wondrous complexity due to its law-like unity and simplicity, fine tuning of natural constants, and natural purpose and beauty,…there exists a necessary supernatural being who is very powerful, intelligent, and good and freely creates the actual world’s universe. (1999: 468–69)

(For the detailed 18 step deductive argument, see Gale and Pruss 1999: 462–69).

Several objections have been raised about the argument from the weak principle of sufficient reason. Almeida and Judisch (2002) construct their objection via two reductio arguments. They note that, according to Gale’s argument, \(q\) is a contingent proposition in the actual world that reports the free, intentional action of a necessary being. As such, since the actual world contains the contingent proposition \(q\), non-\(q\) is possible. That is, there is a possible world \(W_{2}\) that contains \(p\), non-\(q\), and the proposition that \(q\) does not explain \(p\). However, by Gale’s own reasoning, \(W_{2}\) is identical to the actual world. But the actual world cannot contain both \(q\) and non-\(q\). Thus, \(q\) cannot be a contingent proposition.

On the other hand, assume that \(q\) is a contingently necessary proposition, that is, that it is possible that \(q\) is necessary and possible that \(q\) is not necessary. By S5, we get that it is necessary that \(q\) is necessary, making it impossible that \(q\) is not necessary. As a result, it is both possible and not-possible that \(q\) is not necessary, which likewise shows that \(q\) cannot be a contingently necessary proposition. The only other option is that \(q\) is a necessary truth, which would beg the question. Thus, the argument fails by being unable to characterize \(q\). For rebuttals, see Gale and Pruss (2002) and Rutten (2012: 84–87, see Other Internet Resources).

Graham Oppy (2000) similarly argues that suppose \(p_1\) is the BCF of some possible world, and \(p_1\) has no explanation. Then, given \(r\) (namely, that \(p_1\) has no explanation) there is a conjunctive fact \(p_1\) and \(r\). Since by hypothesis the conjunctive fact \(p_1\) and \(r\) is true in some world, on Gale’s account it is true in the actual world. Then by the weak PSR there is a world in which this conjunction of \(p_1\) and \(r\) possibly has an explanation. If there is an explanation for the conjunction of \(p_1\) and \(r\), there is an explanation for \(p_1\). Thus, we have the contradiction that \(p_1\) both has and does not have an explanation, which is absurd. Hence, no world exists where the BCF lacks an explanation, which is the strong principle of sufficient reason that Gale allegedly circumvented. Since accepting the weak PSR would commit the nontheist to the strong PSR and ultimately to a necessary being, the nontheist has no motivation to accept the weak PSR.

Gale and Pruss (2002) subsequently concede that their weak PSR does entail the strong PSR, but they contend that there still is no reason not to proceed with the weak PSR, which they think the nontheist would accept. The only grounds for rejecting it, they claim, is that it leads to a theistic conclusion, which is not an independent reason for rejecting it. Oppy, however, maintains that appealing to some initial instincts of acceptance is irrelevant. Perhaps the nontheists did not see what granting the weak PSR entailed, that it contradicted other things they had independent reasons to believe, or they did not fully understand the principle. There is a modus tollens reason to reject it, since there are other grounds for thinking that theism is false.

Jerome Gellman has argued that the Gale/Pruss conclusion to a being that is not necessarily omnipotent also fails; this being is essentially omnipotent and, if omnipotence entails omniscience, is essentially omniscient. This too Gale and Pruss concede, which means that the necessary being they conclude to is not significantly different from that arrived at by the traditional cosmological argument that appeals to the moderate version of the PSR (that contingent beings need a sufficient reason or explanation for their existence).

7. The Kalām Cosmological Argument

A second type of cosmological argument, contending for a first or beginning cause of the universe, has a venerable history, especially in the Islamic mutakalliman tradition. Although it had numerous defenders through the centuries, it received new life in the recent voluminous writings of William Lane Craig. Craig formulates the kalām cosmological argument this way (Craig and Sinclair 2009; Craig and Smith 1993: chap. 1).

  1. Everything that begins to exist has a cause of its existence.
  2. The universe began to exist.
  3. Therefore, the universe has a cause of its existence.
  4. No scientific explanation (in terms of physical laws and initial conditions of the universe) can provide a causal account of the origin (very beginning) of the universe, since such are part of the universe.
  5. Therefore, the cause must be personal (explanation is given in terms of a non-natural, personal agent).[2]

The kalām argument has been the subject of much recent debate, only some of which can be summarized here. (For greater bibliographic detail, see Craig and Sinclair 2009 and Copan and Craig, eds. 2017 & 2019.)

7.1 The Causal Principle and Quantum Physics

The basis for the argument’s first premise is the Causal Principle that undergirds many cosmological arguments. (Oderberg [2002: 308] is mistaken when he tries to establish the uniqueness of the kalām argument by denying that the Causal Principle plays a role in kalām argument. It only does not play a role in supporting a particular premise in the argument.) Defenders and critics alike suggest that basing the argument on the Principle of Causation rather than on the more general Principle of Sufficient Reason is advantageous to the argument (Morriston 2000: 149). Craig holds that the first premise is intuitively obvious; no one, he says, seriously denies it (Craig, in Craig and Smith 1993: 57). Although at times Craig suggests that one might treat the principle as an empirical generalization based on our ordinary and scientific experiences (which might not be strong enough for the argument to succeed in a strong sense, although it might be supplemented by an inference to the best explanation argument that what best explains the success of science is that reality operates according to the causal principle), ultimately, he argues, the truth of the Causal Principle rests “upon the metaphysical intuition that something cannot come out of nothing” (Craig, in Craig and Smith 1993: 147). “No one sincerely believes that things, say, a horse or an Eskimo village, can just pop into being without a cause” (Craig and Sinclair 2009: 182), and this includes the universe.

The Causal Principle has been the subject of extended criticism. (We addressed objections to the Causal Principle as subsumed under the PSR from a philosophical perspective earlier in 4.4.) Some critics deny that they share Craig’s intuitions about the Causal Principle (Oppy 2002). Morriston (2000) argues that, for one thing, it does not seem to be an a priori truth, for not only does it lack “a kind of ‘luminosity’ that makes it impossible not to believe it, but closer inspection does not make it clearer that it is true” (2000: 156–59). He points not only to the presence of serious doubters (which he thinks he should not be able to find were it truly an a priori truth), but also to quantum phenomena, and thereby joins those who raise objections to the Causal Principle based on quantum physics (Davies 1984: 200). On the quantum level, the connection between cause and effect, if not entirely broken, is to some extent loosened. For example, it appears that electrons can pass out of existence at one point and come back into existence elsewhere. One can neither trace their intermediate existence nor determine what causes them to come into existence at one point rather than another. Neither can one precisely determine or predict where they will reappear; their subsequent location is only statistically probable given what we know about their antecedent states. Hence, as Smith argues,

quantum-mechanical considerations show that the causal proposition is limited in its application, if applicable at all, and consequently that a probabilistic argument for a cause of the Big Bang cannot go through. (Smith, in Craig and Smith 1993: 121–23, 182)

Craig responds that appeals to quantum phenomena do not affect the kalām argument. For one thing, quantum events are not completely devoid of causal conditions. Even if one grants that the causal conditions are not jointly sufficient to determine the event, at least some necessary conditions are involved in the quantum event. However, when one considers the beginning of the universe, he notes, there are no prior necessary causal conditions; simply nothing exists (Craig, in Craig and Smith 1993: 146; see Koons 1997: 203). Pruss (2006: 169) contends that in quantum phenomena causal indeterminacy is compatible with the causal principle in that the causes indeterministically bring about the effect. Morriston is rightly puzzled by this reply, for, he asks, what

makes a cause out of a bunch of merely necessary conditions. Apparently not that they are jointly sufficient to produce the effect. (2000: 158)

If conditions are not jointly sufficient, is there reason to think that premise 1 is true? More recently, Craig argues that

not all physicists agree that subatomic events are uncaused…. Indeed, most of the available interpretations of the mathematical formulation of [Quantum Mechanics] are fully deterministic. (Craig and Sinclair 2009: 183. Jean Bricmont 2017, chap. 5, argues that Bohm’s causally deterministic interpretation of quantum phenomena is superior to the nondeterministic interpretation.)

For another, Craig argues, a difference exists between predictability and causality. It is true that, given Heisenberg’s principle of uncertainty, we cannot precisely predict individual subatomic events. What is debated is whether this inability to predict is due to the absence of sufficient causal conditions, or whether it is merely a result of the fact that any attempt to precisely measure these events alters their status. The very introduction of the observer into the arena so affects what is observed that it gives the appearance that effects occur without sufficient or determining causes. However, we have no way of knowing what is happening without introducing observers into the situation and the changes they bring. In the above example, we simply are unable to discern the intermediate states of the electron’s existence apart from introducing conditions of observation. When Heisenberg’s indeterminacy is understood as describing not simply the events themselves but these events relative to our knowledge of the events, the Causal Principle still holds and can still be applied to the initial singularity, although we cannot expect to achieve any kind of determinate predictability about what occurs in specific cases on the sub-atomic level given the cause.

At the same time, it should be recognized that showing that indeterminacy is a real feature of the world at the quantum level would have significant negative implications for the more general Causal Principle that underlies the deductive cosmological argument. The more this indeterminacy has ontological significance, the weaker is the Causal Principle. This is particularly important for subatomic events, which would characterize the beginning of the universe. However, if the indeterminacy has merely epistemic significance, it scarcely affects the Causal Principle. Quantum accounts allow for additional speculation regarding origins and structures of universes. In effect, whether Craig’s response to the quantum objection succeeds depends upon deeper issues, in particular, the epistemic and ontological status of quantum indeterminacy, the nature of the Big Bang as a quantum phenomenon, the nature and role of indeterminate causation, and whether realist theories about quantum phenomena have serious traction. Quantum physics is murky, as evidenced by Bell’s gedanken experiments, as described by Mermin (1985).

Supporting the Causal Principle, Andrew Loke (2017: chapter 5) offers a Modus Tollens argument that he thinks is immune to the criticisms in 4.4 and that responds to the suggestion that only the initial state of reality began to exist uncaused (Oppy 2015). Loke argues that (a) if x begins to exist without a causally antecedent condition, then other kinds of things that can begin to exist can do so without a causally antecedent condition, because (b) there would be no causally antecedent condition that would make it the case that only x (rather than these other kinds of things) begins to exist, and (c) the properties of x and the properties of other kinds of things that differentiate between them would be had by them only when they had already begun to exist. (b) and (c) jointly imply that there would be no essential difference between x and other kinds of things where beginning to exist uncaused is concerned. However, (d) it is not the case that other kinds of things that can begin to exist would also begin to exist without a causally antecedent condition. Therefore, (e) it is not the case that x begins to exist without a causally antecedent condition. For the critic, the critical question concerns the grounds on which (d) is true, since there is a significant difference between quantum events and nonquantum events (see the discussion of Quantum Physics above).

7.2 Impossibility of an Actual Infinite

In defense of premise 2, Craig develops both a priori and a posteriori arguments. His primary a priori argument is

  1. An actual infinite cannot exist.
  2. A beginningless temporal series of events is an actual infinite.
  3. Therefore, a beginningless temporal series of events cannot exist.

Since conclusion 8 follows validly, if premises 6 and 7 are true the argument is sound. In defense of premise 6, he defines an actual infinite as a determinate totality that occurs when a part of a system can be put into a one-to-one correspondence with the entire system (Craig and Sinclair 2009: 104). Craig argues that if actual infinites that neither increase nor decrease in the number of members they contain were to really exist, rather absurd consequences would result. For example, imagine a library with an actually infinite number of books. Suppose that the library also contains an infinite number of red and an infinite number of black books, so that for every red book there is a black book, and vice versa. It follows that the library contains as many red books as the total books in its collection and as many red books as red and black books combined. However, this is absurd; in reality the subset cannot be equivalent to the entire set. Likewise, in a real library by removing a certain number of books we reduce the overall collection. However, if infinites are actual, a library with an infinite number of books would not be reduced in size at all by removal of a specific number of books (short of all of them or all but a specific number), for example, all the red books or those with even catalogue numbers (Craig and Smith 1993: 11–16). The absurdities resulting from attempting to apply basic arithmetical operations, functional in the real world, to infinities suggest that although actual infinites can have an ideal existence, they cannot really exist.

Craig’s point is this. Two sets \(A\) and \(B\) are the same size just in case they can be put into one-to-one correspondence, that is, if and only if every member of \(A\) can be correlated with exactly one member of \(B\) in such a way that no member of \(B\) is left out. In the case of infinite sets, this notion of “same size” yields results like the following: the set of all natural numbers (let this be \(A\)) is the same size as the set of squares of natural numbers (\(B\)), since every member of \(A\) can be correlated with exactly one member of \(B\) in a way that leaves out no member of \(B\) (correlate \(0\leftrightarrow 0\), \(1\leftrightarrow1\), \(2\leftrightarrow4\), \(3\leftrightarrow9\), \(4\leftrightarrow 16\),…). This is a case—recognized in fact as early as Galileo (Dialogues Concerning Two New Sciences)—where two infinite sets have the same size but, intuitively, one of them, as a proper subset, appears to be smaller than the other.

Craig uses a similar, intuitive notion of “smaller than” in his argument concerning the library. It appears that the set \(B\) of red books in the library is smaller than the set \(A\) of all the books in the library, even though both have the same (infinite) size. Craig concludes that it is absurd to suppose that such a library is possible in actuality, since the set of red books would simultaneously have to be smaller than the set of all books and yet equal in size.

Critics fail to be convinced by these paradoxes of infinity. For example, Rundle (2004: 170) agrees with Craig that the concept of an actual infinite is paradoxical, but this, he argues, provides no grounds for thinking it is incoherent. The logical problems with the actual infinite are not problems of incoherence but arise from the features that are characteristic of infinite sets. When the intuitive notion of “smaller than” is replaced by a precise definition, finite sets and infinite sets just behave somewhat differently, that is all. Cantor and all subsequent set theorists define a set \(B\) to be smaller than set \(A\) (i.e., has fewer members) just in case \(B\) is the same size as a subset of \(A\), but \(A\) is not the same size as any subset of \(B\). The application of this definition to finite and infinite sets yields results that Craig finds counter-intuitive but which mathematicians see as our best understanding for comparing the size of sets. They see the fact that an infinite set can be put into one-to-one correspondence with one of its own proper subsets as one of the defining characteristics of an infinite set, not an absurdity. Say that set \(C\) is a proper subset of \(A\) just in case every element of \(C\) is an element of \(A\) while \(A\) has some element that is not an element of \(C\). In finite sets, but not necessarily in infinite sets, when set \(B\) is a proper subset of \(A\), \(B\) is smaller than \(A\). However, this does not necessarily hold for infinite sets—as above where \(B\) is the set of squares of natural numbers and \(A\) is the set of all natural numbers. The proper subset \(B\) might be “smaller” than \(A\). What is crucial is that \(B\) is not smaller in the sense of having a smaller number of members than \(A\) (i.e., a smaller cardinality).

Cantorian mathematicians argue that these results apply to any infinite set, whether in pure mathematics, imaginary libraries, or the real world series of concrete events. Thus, Smith argues that Craig begs the question by wrongly presuming that an intuitive relationship holds between finite sets and their proper subsets, namely, that a set has more members than its proper subsets must hold even in the case of infinite sets (Smith, in Craig and Smith 1993: 85). So while Craig thinks that Cantor’s set theoretic definitions yield absurdities when applied to the world of concrete objects, which entails that infinites cannot be actual, set theorists see no problem so long as the proper definitions are maintained. Further discussion is in Oppy 2006: 137–54.

Loke (2017: 55–61; see Craig and Sinclair, 2009: 105–6) replies to the above objections by arguing that what is mathematically possible is not always metaphysically possible. For example, the quadratic equation \(x^2=4\) can have two mathematically consistent results for \(x\): 2 or −2, but if the question is “how many people carried the box home”, the answer cannot be −2, for in the concrete world it is metaphysically impossible that −2 people carry a box home. Thus, the conclusion of 2 people rather than −2 people derives not from mathematical equations alone but also from metaphysical considerations. Loke proceeds to argue that concrete infinities violate metaphysically necessary truths concerning causal powers.

Craig is well aware of the fact that he is using actual and potential infinite in a way that differs from the traditional usage in Aristotle and Aquinas [Craig and Sinclair 2009: 115. For Aristotle, all the elements in an actual infinite exist simultaneously, whereas a potential infinite is realized over time by addition or division. Hence, the temporal series of events, as formed by successively adding new events, was a potential, not an actual, infinite (Aristotle, Physics, III, 6)]. For Craig, however, an actual infinite is a timeless totality that cannot be added to or reduced. “Since past events, as determinate parts of reality, are definite and distinct and can be numbered, they can be conceptually collected into a totality” (Craig, in Craig and Smith 1993: 25). The future, but not the past, is a potential infinite, for its events have not yet happened.

Turning to premise 7, why should one think that it is true that a beginningless series, such as the universe up to this point, is an actual rather than a potential infinite? For Craig, an actual infinite is a determinate totality or a completed unity, whereas the potential infinite is not. Since the past events of a beginningless series can be conceptually collected together and numbered, the series is a determinate totality (1979: 96–97). And since the past is beginningless, it has no starting point and is infinite. If the universe had a starting point, so that events were added to or subtracted from this point, we would have a potential infinite that increased through time by adding new members. The fact that the events do not occur simultaneously is irrelevant.

Bede Rundle rejects an actual infinite. His grounds for doing so (the symmetry of the past and the future), if sustained, make premise 7 false. He argues that the reasons often advanced for asymmetry, such as those given by Craig, are faulty. It is true that the past is not actual, but neither is the future. Likewise, that the past, having occurred, is unalterable is irrelevant, for neither is the future alterable. The only time that is real is the present.

For Rundle, the past and the future are symmetrical; it is only our knowledge of them that is asymmetrical. Any future event lies at a finite temporal distance from the present. Similarly, any past event lies at a finite temporal distance from the present. For each past or future event, beginning from the present, there can always be either a prior past event or a subsequent future event. Hence, for both series an infinity of events is possible, and, as symmetrical, the infinity of both series is the same. Since the series of future events is not an actual but a potential infinite (or, better, an “indefinitely extendible” series, 2004: 168; Craig and Sinclair 2012, 104–5), the series of past events is also indefinitely extendible. It follows that although the future is actually finite, it does not require an end to the universe, for there is always a possible subsequent event (2004: 180). Similarly, although any given past event of the universe is finitely distant in time from now, a beginning or initial event can be ruled out; for any given event there is a possible earlier event. However, since there is a possible prior or possible posterior event in any past or future series respectively, the universe, although finite in time, is temporally unbounded (indefinitely extendible); both beginning and cessation are ruled out. [How Rundle (2004: 176–78) gets from the possibility of a subsequent event to actually ruling out cessation and beginning is unclear.] Since there is no time when the material universe did not exist, it is not contingent but necessary. Hence, although the principle of sufficient reason is still true, it applies only to the components of the material universe and not to the universe itself. No explanation of the universe is possible. The universe, as matter-energy, is neither caused nor destructible, not in the sense that it could have been caused or could cease, but in the sense that “the notions of beginning and ceasing to exist are inapplicable to the universe” (2004: 178).

However, one might wonder, are the past series and future series of events really symmetrical? It is true that one can start from the present and count either forward or backward in time. Rundle thinks that …\(x_5\), \(x_4\), \(x_3\), \(x_2\), \(x_1\), \(t_0\), \(y_1\), \(y_2\), \(y_3\), \(y_4\), \(y_5\) are all on the same continuum, so that we cannot distinguish ontologically the time dimension of the future and past series. The two series, going into the past and into the future, would be the same in that however far we count from the present \(t_0\) remains finite although indefinitely extendible. However, is it true that, as he claims, with regard to the past, “any movement currently terminating can be redescribed as extending back”, that counting backward from the present is the same as counting from the past to the present (2004: 176)?

Craig says no, for in the actual world we do not start from now to arrive at the past; we move from the past to the present. To count backwards, we would start from a particular point in time, the present. From where would we start to count forward were the past indefinitely extendible? Both to count and to move from the past to the present, we cannot start from the indefinitely extendible. Indeed, if the past is indefinitely extendible, no matter where we started, we would have arrived at \(t_0\) long before now.

One cannot just reverse the temporal sequence of the past, for we do not ontologically engage the sequence from the present to the past. Rundle’s two movements are quite disparate, such that the two sequences—of the past and of the future—are not symmetrical, which leaves intact Craig’s claim that a beginningless past would result in an actual and not a potential infinite.

Morriston (2010) constructs an argument to show that, contrary to Craig, there is no relevant difference between a beginningless past and a determinate, endless future, such that if one is impossible because of absurdities so is the other, and if one is possible so is the other. He creates a fictional scenario where God commands angels Gabriel and Uriel to praise God alternatively for an eternity.

If you ask, “How many distinct praises will be said?”, the only sensible answer is, “infinitely many.… Each of infinitely many distinct praises will be said, precisely because there will be no future time at which all have been said ”. (Morriston 2010: 443–44)

However, an actually infinite number of future events is not impossible; it can be envisioned and determined by God.

Morriston proceeds to note that puzzles or absurdities parallel to those Craig finds in the concept of an actual infinite of past events also occur in the infinite series of future events. Suppose that

God could instead have determined that Gabriel and Uriel will stop after praise number four. Infinitely many praises would be prevented, and the number of their future praises would be only four. Alternatively, God could have determined that Gabriel be silent during all the celestial minutes between Uriel’s future praises. In this case too, infinitely many praises would be prevented, but the number of future praises would instead be infinite. (Morriston 2010: 444)

Although this shows that an infinite future can have inconsistent implications, God could still bring it about that these angels utter distinct praises, one after another, ad infinitum. But then, Morriston concludes, since these inconsistent implications do not count against an actual infinity of future events, the puzzles Craig poses do not count against the possibility of an actual infinity of past events, i.e., a beginningless universe. If an infinite future is possible, as Craig concedes, so is an infinite past.

Morriston contends that Craig’s reply that in the one case the events have occurred and in the other they have not, and hence that the number of future praises is indefinite, is a distinction without a difference. God can determine that an infinite number of praises will be sung.

The non-existence of past events does not prevent us from asking how many have occurred. Nor should the non-existence of future events prevent us from asking how many will occur. In neither case will “indefinitely many” do as an answer. (2010: 449)

Craig’s defense is that Morriston has ignored the difference between a potential and an actual infinite. According to Craig, an actual infinite is a collection of definite and discrete members whose number is greater than any natural number, whereas a potential infinite is a collection that is increasing toward but never arriving at infinity as a limit (Craig 2010; Craig and Sinclair 2009: 116).

Morriston objects to Craig’s definition of the potential infinite. For one thing, there is no limit to which the future praises grow. The collection of praises continues to grow as the praises are sung, but it does not approach a limit, for always one more praise can be sung. The series of future praises is actually infinite.

Craig responds that Morriston is really attacking his notion of a potential infinite by claiming that no relevant distinction exists between a potential and an actual infinite. But this, he says, rests on confusing an A-theory with a B-theory of time. An infinite directed toward the future would be actual only on a B-theory of time, but not on an A-theory (Craig 2010: 452–53). On an A-theory of time, a change of tense makes a difference. That something actually has happened differs significantly from what may (even if determined) happen.

Cohen (2015: 177) continues Morriston’s argument, insisting that Craig invokes an unmotivated principle that Cohen terms “The Actuality-Infinity Principle: In order for x to be actually infinite in quantity, x must be actual”. Cohen argues that this begs the question. However, Craig’s principle is different: In order for x to be actually infinite in quantity, x must be or have been actual or actualized (Craig 2010: 455–56). Cohen might respond, “Why not then say that for x to be actually infinite in quality x must be, have been, or will be actual or actualized?” Cohen argues that Craig’s presentism does not assist him here, since neither the past nor the future events are present and hence do not exist. Craig thinks otherwise (Craig and Sinclair 2009: 126), tacitly defending the principle in that temporal becoming sees to it that what has not occurred or is not occurring but as future is merely potential, even if determined or foreseen by God.

7.3 Successive Addition Cannot Form an Actual Infinite

Craig’s second argument addresses this very point.

  1. The temporal series of events is a collection formed by successive addition.
  2. A collection formed by successive synthesis is not an actual infinite.
  3. Therefore, the temporal series of events cannot be an actual infinite (Craig 1979: 103; Craig and Sinclair 2009, 117).

The collection of historical events is formed by successively adding events, one following another. The events are not temporally simultaneous but occur over a period of time as the series continues to acquire new members. Even if an actual infinite were possible, it could not be realized by successive addition; in adding to the series, no matter how much adding is done, even to infinity, the series remains finite and only potentially infinite. One can neither count to nor traverse the infinite (Craig and Sinclair 2009: 118).

It might be objected that this sounds very much like Zeno’s paradoxes that prohibit Achilles or anyone from either beginning to cross an area or succeeding in doing so. However, notes Craig, significant disanalogies disallow this conclusion. For one, Zeno’s argument rests on progressively-narrowing, unequal distances that sum to a finite distance, whereas in traversing the past the equal distances continue to the infinity of the future. Second, Zeno’s distances are potential because of divisibility, whereas the distances from the past are actual distances or times to be traversed.

Morriston argues that premise 10 presupposes what is to be shown, namely, that there is a beginning point. He asks,

Why couldn’t there have been an infinite series of years in which there was no first year? It’s true that in such a series we never “arrive” at infinity, but surely that is only because infinity is, so to speak, “always already there”. At every point in such a series, infinitely many years have already passed by.... Each event in a beginningless series terminating in the present could have been “added” to the infinitely many prior events. (2003: 290)

Thus, we don’t need a starting point to form an actual infinite by successive addition. Infinity is already present in the series.

Craig responds that we cannot just add “arriving at the present” to an already existing infinite.

Before the present event could occur, the event immediately before it would have to occur; and before that event could occur, the event immediately before it would have to occur; and so on ad infinitum. One gets driven back into the past, making it impossible for any event to occur. Thus, if the series of events were beginningless, the present could not have occurred, which is absurd. (Craig and Sinclair 209: 118)

In other words, Why this moment rather than another?

Morriston replies that that is just the way it is; “the past just is the series of events that have already happened”. To require a reason for the series of past events arriving at now is to appeal to the principle of sufficient reason, which he deems both suspect and inappropriate for Craig to invoke (Morriston 2003: 293).

To defend his position, Craig presents Bertrand Russell’s example of Tristram Shandy, who writes his autobiography. It takes him a year to write about one day of his life, so that as his life progresses so does his autobiography in which he gets progressively farther behind. Russell concludes that

if (Shandy) had lived forever, and had not wearied of his task, then, even if his life had continued as eventfully as it began, no part of his biography would have remained unwritten. ([1903] 1937: 358)

However, Oderberg (2002: 310) claims, Russell seems to have fallaciously moved from (1) For every day, there is a year such that, by the end of that year, Shandy has recorded that day, which is true, to (2) There is a year such that, for every day, by the end of that year Shandy has recorded that day. (2) is needed for Russell’s conclusion but fails to follow from (1). Shandy’s writing never catches up with his life; indeed, the longer he lives, even if for infinity, his writing would never catch up to his life but progressively would get farther behind. Indeed, if he has been living and writing from infinity, his autobiography is infinitely behind his life. Contrary to Russell, there will be days—an infinite number—about which he will be unable to write. As can be imagined, this example has been greatly contested, modified, and has generated a literature of its own. For samples, see Eells (1988), Oderberg (2002), and Oppy (2003). Waters (2013) reformulates the paradox, attempting to avoid problems with earlier formulations.

Finally, it is objected that Craig’s argument presupposes an \(A\) view of time, where time flows from past to present to future and not all events tenselessly coexist. It seems that Craig’s argument cannot be sustained if time is understood in the \(B\) sense, where all members of the series tenselessly coexist, being equally real (Grünbaum 1994). On a \(B\) view of time there is no beginning, and it would seem that on this view the argument would collapse.

7.4 The Big Bang Theory of Cosmic Origins

One of Craig and Sinclair’s a posteriori arguments for premise 2 invokes the Big Bang theory of cosmic origins. Since the universe is expanding as the galaxies recede from each other, if we reverse the direction of our view and look back in time, the farther we look, the denser the universe becomes. If we push backwards far enough, we find that the universe reaches a state of compression where the density and gravitational force are infinite. This unique singularity constitutes the beginning of the universe—of matter, energy, space, time, and all physical laws. It is not that the universe arose out of some prior state, for there was no prior state. Since time too comes to be, one cannot ask what happened before the initial event. Neither should one think that the universe expanded from some state of infinite density into space; space too came to be in that event. Since the Big Bang initiates the very laws of physics, one cannot expect any scientific or physical explanation of this singularity.

One picture, then, is of the universe beginning in a singular, non-temporal event roughly 13–14 billion years ago. Something, perhaps a quantum vacuum, came into existence. Its tremendous energy caused it, in the first fractions of a second, to expand or inflate and explode, creating the four-dimensional space-time universe that we experience today. How this all happened in the first \(10^{-35}\) seconds and subsequently is a matter of serious speculation and debate. What advocates of premise 2 maintain is that since the universe and all its material elements originate in the Big Bang, the universe is temporally finite and thus had a beginning. (For a detailed consideration of cosmogenic theories from the kalām perspective, see Craig and Sinclair 2009: 125–182; for the counter discussion see Grünbaum 1991). By itself, of course, this reasoning, even if accurate, leaves it the case that premise 2 and hence conclusion 3 are only probably true, dependent on accepted cosmogenic theories.

Several replies to this argument can be made. First, questions have been raised about the adequacy of the theory of inflation to explain the expansion of the universe. One problem is predictability, for on this view anything that can happen will happen, an infinite number of times (Steinhardt 2011: 42). Further, the argument presupposes that the General Theory of Relativity applies to the beginning of the universe, but some doubt that this is so, given that it cannot adequately account for the quantum gravity involved.

Second, some have suggested that since we cannot “exclude the possibility of a prior phase of existence” (Silk 2001: 63), it is possible that the universe has cycled through oscillations, perhaps infinitely, so that Big Bangs occurred not once but an infinite number of times in the past and will do so in the future. The current universe is a “reboot” of previous universes that have expanded and then contracted (Musser 2004).

The traditional idea of an oscillating universe faced significant problems. For one, no set of physical laws accounts for a series of cyclical universe-collapses and re-explosions. That the universe once exploded into existence provides no evidence that the event could reoccur even once, let alone an infinite number of times, should the universe collapse. Second, even an oscillating universe seems to be finite (Smith, in Craig and Smith 1993: 113). Further, the cycle of collapses and expansions would not, as was pictured, be periodic (of even duration). Rather, entropy would rise from cycle to cycle, so that even were a series of universe-oscillations possible, they would become progressively longer (Davies 1992: 52; Tolman 1934). If the universe were without beginning, by now that cycle would be infinite in duration, without any hope of contraction. Fourth, although each recollapse would destroy the components of the universe, the radiation would remain, so that each successive cycle would add to the total.

Responding to these issues, recently proposed cosmologies based on string theory have given new life to a cyclic view. For example, Paul Steinhardt and Neil Turok have proposed a cyclic cosmological model where the universe repeatedly transitions from a big bang to a big crunch to a big bang, and so on. They contend that

the Universe is flat, rather than closed. The transition from expansion to contraction is caused by introducing negative potential energy, rather than spatial curvature. Furthermore, the cyclic behavior depends in an essential way on having a period of accelerated expansion after the radiation and matter-dominated phases. During the accelerated expansion phase, the Universe approaches a nearly vacuous state, restoring very nearly identical local conditions as existed in the previous cycle prior to the contraction phase. (Steinhardt and Turok 2002: 2)

Dark energy becomes a key player in all of this. On the kalām view, the amount of dark energy in the universe makes a return to its original state impossible. The universe is not cyclical but will die a cold death. On a cyclic view, dark energy accelerates the expansion of the universe needed “to dilute the entropy, black holes and other debris produced in the previous cycle so that the universe is returned to its original pristine vacuum state before it begins to contract, bounce, and begin a cycle anew” (Steinhardt and Turok 2001: 1436).

This specific cyclic theory has been challenged, and other cyclic cosmological theories have been proposed. What this shows is that any attempt to support the second premise of the kalām argument by accepting or refuting scientific cosmologies will encounter an ever-changing scene, given the speculative nature of cosmology. Thus, while Craig and Sinclair (2009: 150–74) critically evaluate current contenders as not being viable, changes in and development of these theories and the inevitable development of others make for unending point-counterpoint.

7.5 The Big Bang Is Not an Event

One critical response to the kalām argument from the Big Bang is that, given the Grand Theory of Relativity, the Big Bang is not an event at all. An event takes place within a space-time context. However, the Big Bang has no space-time context; there is neither time prior to the Big Bang nor a space in which the Big Bang occurs. Hence, the Big Bang cannot be considered as a physical event occurring at a moment of time. As Hawking notes, the finite universe has no space-time boundaries and hence lacks singularity and a beginning (Hawking 1988: 116, 136). Time might be multi-dimensional or imaginary, in which case one asymptotically approaches a beginning singularity but never reaches it. And without a beginning the universe requires no cause. The best one can say is that the universe is finite with respect to the past, not that it was an event with a beginning. (Rundle 2004: chap. 8.)

Grünbaum defends this position by arguing that events can only result from other events.

Since the Big Bang singularity is technically a non-event, and \(t=0\) is not a bona fide time of its occurrence, the singularity cannot be the effect of any cause in the case of either event-causation or agent causation alike…. The singularity \(t=0\) cannot have a cause. (Grünbaum 1994; Rundle 2004: 168, writes, “[T]here is no event—the beginning of the universe—to be explained, events being possible only in time”)

One response to Grünbaum’s objection is to opt for broader notions of “event” and “cause”. We might broaden the notion of “event” by removing the requirement that it must be relational, taking place in a space-time context. In the Big Bang the space-time universe commences and then continues to exist in measurable time subsequent to the initiating singularity (Silk 2001: 456). Thus, one might consider the Big Bang as either the event of the commencing of the universe or else a state in which “any two points in the observable universe were arbitrarily close together” (Silk 2001: 63). As such, one might inquire why this initial state of the universe existed in the finite past. Likewise, one need not require that causation embody the Humean condition of temporal priority, but may treat causation counter-factually, or perhaps even, as traditionally, a relation of production. Any causal statement about the universe would have to be expressed atemporally, but for the theist this presents no problem provided that God is conceived atemporally (at least prior to creation) and sense can be made of atemporal causation.

Furthermore, suppose Grünbaum is correct that the Big Bang singularity is not an event. Then, by his reasoning that events only arise from other events, subsequent so-called events cannot be the effect of that singularity. If they were, they would not be events either.

Given this understanding of space/time, we might reconceive the kalām argument.

  1. If something has a finite past, its existence has a cause.
  2. The universe has a finite past.
  3. Therefore, the universe has a cause of its existence.
  4. The universe includes space-time.
  5. Therefore, the cause of the universe transcends space-time (in the sense that it existed aspatially and, when there was no universe, atemporally).
  6. If the cause of the universe’s existence transcends space-time, no scientific explanation can provide a causal account of the origin of the universe.
  7. If no scientific explanation can provide a causal account of the origin of the universe, the cause must be personal (explanation is given in terms of a personal agent).
  8. Therefore, a personal cause of the universe exists.

Some critics see a problem with this reformulation of the kalām argument in premise 12. Whereas behind premise 1 of the original argument lies the ancient Parmenidean contention that out of nothing nothing comes, it is alleged that no principle directly connects finitude with causation. They contend that we have no reason to think that just because something is finite it must have a cause of its coming into existence. Theists respond that this objection has merit only if the critic denies that the Principle of Causation is true or that it applies to events like the Big Bang.

Grünbaum (1991) also argues that defenders of the kalām argument cannot make sense of the claim that the universe began to exist.

The question of its beginning is not, “If the universe did have a bounded past of finite duration, what was the cause of its initial event \(t=0\)?” There simply did not exist any instants of time before \(t=0\)!

One simply cannot ask what happened before \(t=0\); the question makes no sense. And if we cannot ask that question, then we cannot inquire whether the Big Bang was an effect, for nothing temporal preceded it. Questions about creation occur in time in the universe, not outside of it (Hawking 1987: 650–51).

Grünbaum’s contention is that to begin to exist requires a previous time, and that there was no time prior to the Big Bang.

[T]here is no first instant of time at all, just as there is no leftmost point on an infinite Euclidean line that extends in both directions. Since here as elsewhere, the term ‘always’ refers to all actual past instants of time, the non-existence of time before \(t=0\) … allows that matter has always existed, despite the finitude of the age of the universe in both sets of models. (1991)

However, as Craig observes, the series is finite, not infinite, even though it includes all past instants of time. Beginning to exist does not entail that one has a beginning point in time. Craig defines “\(x\) begins to exist” as “\(x\) exists at \(t\) and there is no time immediately prior to \(t\) at which \(x\) exists” (1992: 238).

Something has a beginning just in case the time during which it has existed is finite.… So understood, deleting the beginning point of a thing’s existence does not imply that the thing no longer begins to exist and therefore came into being uncaused. (Craig and Sinclair 2009: 185)

Morriston (2000) suggests that this analysis of the universe’s coming to be no longer adequately supports premise 1, for we have no reason to think that something could not just come into existence. Any appeal to ex nihilo nihil fit is either tautologous with the first premise or else appears mistakenly to treat nihilo as if it were “a condition of something”. In part, what Morriston rejects is the intuitiveness that Craig sees in the truth of premise 1, where “beginning to exist” is understood as explicated as above (see our discussion in 7.1). It is not that premise 1 is false; it is just that it is unsupported and hence loses its plausibility. It has the same plausibility (or implausibility) as creation ex nihilo. Morriston thinks that premise 1 fares equally poorly if Craig attempts to justify it empirically, for we have many situations where the causes of events have not been discovered, and even if we could find the causes in each individual case, it provides no evidence that causation applies to the totality of cases (the universe). (See our discussion of this argument in 4.2 and 4.3 above.) Indeed, he argues, the inductive generalization involved in defending the causal principle stands at odds with similar inductive generalizations that conflict with the kalām argument—that something can be made without there being a prior stuff or that causes can bear no temporal relation to their effects.

7.6 Personal Explanation

Finally, something needs to be said about premise 3 and conclusion 5, which asserts that the cause of the universe is personal. Defenders of the cosmological argument suggest two possible kinds of explanation.[3] Natural explanation is provided in terms of precedent events, causal laws, or necessary conditions that invoke natural existents. Personal explanation is given “in terms of the intentional action of a rational agent” (Swinburne 2004: 21; also Gale and Pruss 1999). We have seen that one cannot provide a natural causal explanation for the initial event, for there are no precedent natural events or natural existents to which the laws of physics apply. The line of scientific explanation runs out at the initial singularity, and perhaps even before we arrive at the initial singularity (at \(10^{-35}\) seconds). If no scientific explanation (in terms of physical laws) can provide a causal account of the origin of the universe (premise 4), the explanation must be personal, that is, in terms of the intentional action of an intelligent, supernatural agent.

Morriston (2000: 163–68) questions whether Craig’s argument for the cause being personal goes through. Craig argues that if the cause were an eternal, nonpersonal, operating set of conditions, then the universe would exist from eternity. Below freezing temperatures will always freeze whatever water is present. Since the universe has not existed from eternity, the cause must be a personal agent who chooses freely to create an effect in time. However, notes Morriston, if the personal cause intended from eternity to create the world, and if the intention alone to create is causally sufficient to bring about the effect, then the universe would also exist from eternity, and there would be no reason to prefer a personal cause of the universe over a nonpersonal cause. For a timeless eternal being before creation, which is Craig’s view, “There can be no temporal gap between the time at which it does the willing and the time at which the thing willed actually happens” (2000, 167). So the distinction in this respect between a personal and a nonpersonal eternal cause disappears. Craig (2002) replies that it is not intention alone that must be present, but the personal agent must also employ or exercise its personal causal power to bring about the world. However, Morriston retorts, exercising personal causal power is an action in time, a view that is unavailable to Craig, for there is no time when God would restrain his causal powers.

Paul Davies argues that one need not appeal to God to account for the Big Bang. Its cause, he suggests, is found within the cosmic system itself. Originally a vacuum lacking space-time dimensions, the universe “found itself in an excited vacuum state”, a “ferment of quantum activity, teeming with virtual particles and full of complex interactions” (Davies 1984: 191–92), which, subject to a cosmic repulsive force, resulted in an immense increase in energy. Subsequent explosions from this collapsing vacuum released the energy in this vacuum, reinvigorating the cosmic inflation and setting the scenario for the subsequent expansion of the universe. However, what is the origin of this increase in energy that eventually made the Big Bang possible? Davies’s response is that the law of conservation of energy (that the total quantity of energy in the universe remains fixed despite transfer from one form to another), which now applies to our universe, did not apply to the initial expansion. Cosmic repulsion in the vacuum caused the energy to increase from zero to an enormous amount. This great explosion released energy, from which all matter emerged. Consequently, he contends, since the conclusion of the kalām argument is false, one of the premises of the argument—in all likelihood the first—is false.

Craig responds that if the vacuum has energy, the question arises concerning the origin of the vacuum and its energy. Merely pushing the question of the beginning of the universe back to some primordial quantum vacuum does not escape the question of what brought this vacuum laden with energy into existence. A quantum vacuum is not nothing (as in Newtonian physics) but

a sea of continually forming and dissolving particles that borrow energy from the vacuum for their brief existence. A quantum vacuum is thus far from nothing, and vacuum fluctuations do not constitute an exception to the principle that whatever beings to exist has a cause. (Craig, in Craig and Smith 1993: 143–44)

Hence, he concludes, the appeal to a vacuum as the initial state is misleading.

One might wonder, as Rundle (2004: 75–77) does, how a supernatural agent could bring about the universe. He contends that a personal agent (God) cannot be the cause because intentional agency needs a body and actions occur within space-time. However, acceptance of the cosmological argument does not depend on an explanation of the manner of causation by a necessary being. When we explain that the girl raised her hand because she wanted to ask a question, we can accept that she was the cause of the raised hand without understanding how her wanting to ask a question brought about her raising her hand. As Swinburne notes, an event is “fully explained when we have cited the agent, his intention that the event occur, and his basic powers” that include the ability to bring about events of that sort (2004: 36). Similarly, theists argue, we may never know why and how creation took place. Nevertheless, we may accept it as an explanation in the sense that we can say that God created that initial event, that he had the intention to do so, and that such an event lies within the power of an omniscient and almighty being; not having a body is irrelevant.

The issues raised by the kalām argument concern not only the nature of explanation and when an explanation is necessary, but even whether an explanation of the universe is possible (given the above discussion). Whereas all agree that it makes no sense to ask about what occurs before the Big Bang (since there was no prior time) or about something coming out of nothing, the dispute rests on whether there needs to be a cause of the first natural existent, whether something like the universe can be finite and yet not have a beginning, and crucially the nature of infinities and their connection with reality.

8. An Inductive Cosmological Argument

Richard Swinburne contends that the cosmological argument is not deductively valid; if it were,

it would be incoherent to assert that a complex physical universe exists and that God does not exist. There would be a hidden contradiction buried in such co-assertions…. [A]ttempts to derive obviously incoherent propositions from such co-assertions have failed through commission of some elementary logical error. (2004: 136)

Swinburne is correct that if someone believes that a deductive cosmological argument (proof) for God’s existence is sound, then it would be incoherent for that same person to then deny that God exists. However, in their respective proofs defenders of the deductive cosmological arguments make a claim about incoherence, namely, that it would be contradictory for the same person to affirm the premises of the argument and to claim that God or a personal necessary being does not exist. And they believe both that the respective premises have the intuitiveness that Swinburne deems necessary and that the argument has not committed some “elementary error of logic”.

Has Swinburne shown incoherence? Whereas propositions are true and deductive arguments are valid independent of anyone’s beliefs that they are true and valid (the proposition that the earth orbits the sun is true regardless of whether anyone believes it), the acceptance of premises as true, of deductive arguments as valid, and of an argument’s use as a proof is not independent of those same beliefs. An argument that one person takes as being sound another might believe not to be sound, in that the person rejects one or more of the premises or holds that the conclusions fail to properly follow; arguments are person-relative in their persuasive value or assessment of coherence. Swinburne himself notes that arguments of coherence and incoherence are persuasive only to the extent that someone accepts other statements inherent to the proof as coherent or incoherent and that one statement entails another (1993: 39). Elsewhere Swinburne admits to having

some doubt about whether men have enough initial consensus about what is coherent and what entails what, are clever enough and have enough imagination to reach agreed proofs which would settle all disputes about whether a statement is coherent or incoherent. (1993: 45)

As such, Swinburne cannot so easily dismiss deductive cosmological arguments, although he is justified in wondering whether “reasons less strong than compelling proofs can be given for thinking some statements coherent and others incoherent” (1993: 45).

In place of a deductive argument, Swinburne develops an inductive cosmological argument that appeals to the inference to the best explanation. Swinburne distinguishes between two varieties of inductive arguments: those that show that the conclusion is more probable than not (what he terms a correct P-inductive argument) and those that further increase the probability of the conclusion (what he terms a correct C-inductive argument). In The Existence of God (1979) he presents a cosmological argument that he claims falls in the category of C-inductive arguments. However, for him this argument is part of a larger, cumulative case for a P-inductive argument for God’s existence that includes as its evidence the orderliness of the universe, the existence of consciousness, miracle reports, and religious experience.

Swinburne notes that “a cosmological argument argues that the fact that there is a universe needs explaining” (2004: 9–10). However, he emphasizes that his approach differs from those we have already considered in that he rejects the Principle of Sufficient Reason understood as “everything not ‘metaphysically necessary’ has an explanation in something ‘metaphysically necessary’” (2004: 148), for the PSR leads, as it does in Leibniz, to a being that is logically necessary, and such a being cannot explain the logically contingent. From the logically necessary only the logically necessary follows. In place of using the PSR to construct a deductive argument, he employs a “basic theorem of confirmation theory”, Bayes’ Theorem, to construct an inductive argument (2004: 67). (In making this claim about the need for an explanation of the universe, however, it is hard not to see that he invokes some formulation of the PSR.)

Swinburne begins his discussion with the existence of a physical universe that (a) contains odd events that cannot be fitted into the established pattern of scientific explanation (e.g., miracles, the appearance of conscious beings), (b) is too big in that science cannot explain why there are states of affairs at all or why the fundamental natural laws to which science appeals to explain things hold, and (c) is complex (its matter-energy has relevant powers) (2004: 74, 150).

It is not logically necessary that the existence of the universe needs explanation; we could accept this universe as a brute, inexplicable fact, but Swinburne thinks that to do so fails to accord with the example of the sciences, which seek the best explanation for any given phenomena. Since “it is reasonable to suppose” that there is an explanation (2004: 75), the issue, then, is which view is more reasonable: that science can provide a natural explanation for the existence of this universe, or whether the universe and its phenomena exist because of the intentional, causal activity of a personal being whose existence also is a brute fact.

To find the explanatory hypothesis most likely to be true, especially about something that might be unobservable, he claims to follow the example of science. Using Bayes’ Theorem, he looks for a hypothesis \(h\) such that \(p(e\mid h \amp k) \gt p(e\mid k)\) where \(p\) is probability, \(e\) is the existence of a complex universe, and \(k\) is the background data. A hypothesis is more likely to be true (1) in so far as it has high explanatory power, in that it makes probable the evidence of the observation; this may be predictive but can be postdictive as well (Swinburne 1996: 34, 2001: 80–81), and insofar as the evidence is very unlikely to occur if the hypothesis is false. And (2), it has a greater prior probability. The prior probability of a hypothesis encompasses three features: (a) how well it fits with our background knowledge (2001: 81). The broader the scope, the less relevant this criterion becomes (2004: 60). Since there are no “neighboring fields of inquiry related to the origin of the universe”, Swinburne treats this condition in the cosmological argument as irrelevant or reducing to the feature of simplicity (1996: 29). (b) The scope of the hypothesis (the extent of its claims)—the broader the scope, the less likely it is to be true. For example, all crows are black is less likely to be true than all crows along the upper Mississippi River are black. Since both scientific naturalism and theism have the same scope—explaining the universe, this does not factor into his calculations for explaining the complex universe (2001: 82); and (c) simplicity, which for Swinburne holds the key (2001: 82–83).

He holds that we are looking for a complete explanation, where

we may reasonably conclude that the criteria for supposing that factors have no further explanation (scientific or personal) in terms of factors acting at the time and so that any explanation is a complete explanation over all (not just a complete explanation within scientific or within personal explanation) are that any attempt to go beyond the factors that we have would result in no gain of explanatory power or prior probability. (2004: 89)

A scientific explanation fails to give a complete explanation. It leaves us not with a simple but with a very complex explanatory hypothesis, in that “ultimate explanation stops at innumerable, different stopping points, many of them … having exactly the same powers and liabilities as each other” (1996: 42). It presents us with the brute fact of the existence of the universe, not an explanation for it. It explains in terms of a full cause the events at any moment, but it cannot provide a complete explanation of the universe, “for there are no physical causes apart from the universe itself and parts thereof” (1984: 144).

On the other hand, a personal explanation, given in terms of the intentional actions of a person, is simpler and no explanatory power is lost. Further, a personal explanation can be understood, as in the case of explaining basic actions, without knowing or understanding any of the natural causal conditions that enable one to bring it about. In the case of the cosmological argument, personal explanation is couched in terms of a being that has beliefs, purposes, and intentions, and possesses both the power to bring about the complex universe and a possible reason for doing so.

Swinburne argues that a personal explanation of the universe satisfies the above probability criteria. It satisfies condition (1) in that appealing to God as an intentional agent has explanatory power. It leads us to have certain expectations about the universe: that it manifests order, is comprehensible, and favors the existence of beings that can comprehend it. It makes probable the existence of the complex universe because God could have reasons for causing such a universe, whereas we would have no reasons at all if all we had was the brute fact of the material universe. Among these reasons is that the universe would be “a theatre for finite agents to develop and make of it what they will” (Swinburne 1979: 131).

Michael Martin objects at this point. Martin contends that if Swinburne is to compare the a priori probability of there being a complex universe given our background knowledge with the a priori probability of a complex universe given our background knowledge and the existence of God, he has to be clear on how he interprets the probability. Martin notes that herein lies crucial ambiguity that disables calculating the a priori probability. If one compares the very many possible complex universes with there being no universe, on the basis of assigning equal probability to all possibilities the probability of there being a complex universe is nearly 1. However, if one compares the probability of there being a complex universe with there being no universe at all, it is 50 percent (Martin 1986: 155). Furthermore, Martin wonders whether complexity is an issue at all. According to Swinburne, as free God can create any kind of world or no world at all. But then the existence of God is compatible with any number of scenarios: the existence of no world, a simpler world than we have, one like ours, or any number of more complex universes. Consequently, the complexity of this world does not matter in constructing an inductive argument for God’s existence (1986: 155). Put another way, adding the existence of God to our background knowledge does not increase the likelihood of there being a complex universe, let alone of there being this particular universe or a universe at all (1986: 158).

In short, Martin does not see how Swinburne can establish an a priori probability for the existence of a complex universe, to be compared with an a priori probability for the existence of God based on simplicity, a feature of Swinburne’s Bayesian argument. This introduces the theme of simplicity, to which Swinburne devotes much attention.

Swinburne goes on to argue that a personal explanation in terms of God satisfies condition (2) because of its simplicity. If one is going to construct an explanatory hypothesis using the criterion of simplicity, God rather than science is more likely to be the focus of the true explanatory hypothesis. God is one and of one kind; polytheism is ruled out. Moreover, God is the simplest kind of person there can be because a person is a being with power (to do intentional actions), knowledge, and freedom (to choose, uncaused, which actions to do), and in God these properties are infinite, and having infinite properties is simpler than having properties with limits, as humans do. “It is always simpler to postulate infinite or zero degrees of some property than a certain precise finite value of it” (Swinburne 1983: 385). Furthermore, God engages in simple causation, that is, causation by simple intention. Swinburne concludes that although the prior likelihood of neither God nor the universe is particularly high, the prior probability of a simple God exceeds that of a complex universe. Hence, if anything is to occur unexplained, it would be God, not the universe.

Consequently, if we are to explain the universe, we must appeal to a personal explanation

in terms of a person who is not part of the universe acting from without. This can be done if we suppose that such a person (God) brings it about at each instant of time, that (the laws of nature) \(L\) operate. (Swinburne 1979: 126, 2004: 142)

Although for Swinburne this argument does not make the existence of God more probable than not (it is not a P-inductive argument), it does increase the probability of God’s existence (is a C-inductive argument) because it provides a more reasonable explanation for the universe than merely attributing it to the brute fact of the universe’s existence.

Theism does not make [certain phenomena] very probable; but nothing else makes their occurrence in the least probable, and they cry out for an explanation. A priori, theism is perhaps very unlikely, but it is far more likely than any rival supposition. Hence, our phenomena are substantial evidence for the truth of theism. (Swinburne 1979: 290)

In his critique of Swinburne, J. L. Mackie wonders whether personal explanations are reducible to natural, scientific explanations. To implement intentionality requires an entire system of neurological and macro-biological conditions. Not only does God as nonphysical lack these biological conditions, but these conditions are exceedingly complex, not simple. “Only by ignoring such key features [the role of the body] do we get an analogue of supposed divine action” (Mackie 1982: 100). When we incorporate these features, the simplicity disappears.

Swinburne replies that Mackie has misunderstood his argument. “The simplicity of the relation between intention and its realization has nothing to do with how our will or intentions are realized in practice” (Swinburne 1983: 386). Even if we understand all the neural connections and firings, we may not achieve any better explanation of why persons intended to act as they did than simply asking them why they acted as they did. This indicates that the existence of intermediate physical causal links is not an essential part of personal explanation. In fact, Swinburne argues, since it is easier to understand the function of intention without invoking any physical causal limitations, it makes it easier to understand the case of God who as nonphysical has no need for intermediary physical processes. Thus, he claims, Mackie missed the point about God when he invokes the complexity of physical accounts. The point is that God can will to act on his intentions directly, and this provides a simple account or explanation of why things came to exist.

The critical aspect of Swinburne’s argument is his almost total reliance in his inductive cosmological argument on simplicity as the deciding factor between competing hypotheses regarding the cause of the existence of the universe (2004: 333–34; 2010, 9; Ostrowick). Swinburne has at least six understandings that one hypothesis is simpler than another. (1) It invokes the fewest number of entities (2004: 106; 1983: 386; 2001: 87; 2010, 5). This is a quantitative understanding. (2) It invokes the fewest kinds of entities—a qualitative understanding (1983: 386, 2001: 87). (3) It invokes entities with simple or few properties (1983: 386) Swinburne invokes a subcriterion that explanations are simpler when the properties they invoke are observable (2010, 6). (4) It invokes powers, acquisition of beliefs, and consistency of intentions similar to ours when applied to personal explanation of rational behavior (2004: 61–64). (5) The explanation invokes the simplest organization of the features functioning in the explicans, e.g., laws or variables (2001: 83, 89–90). (6) Simplicity can be found in the explicans in that it does not invoke extraneous features that are not necessary to explain the effect (2001: 81).

Swinburne holds that the appeal to God as an explanation is simpler in all of these ways.[4] Not only is there one entity and that entity is simple, the explanation effectively has no organization of the features. The explanation itself is simple. The appeal to God’s causal activity satisfies understanding or interpretation 6 in that it involves no extraneous entities to do the explaining and requires no intermediaries. God can bring about the effect by himself alone.

Several important questions about simplicity arise. First, is simplicity the criterion we should use to decide between hypotheses? For one thing, simplicity is not always a reliable criterion for determining which hypothesis is true or which hypothesis provides the best explanatory account. The rise of quantum explanations suggests that the simplest account of the universe, for example, that of Newton, is not a complete and fully adequate account. The events in the subatomic realm are far from explained simply. For another, although an explanation in terms of four factors might make an explanation simpler, the reverse might hold: an explanation in terms of ten factors might be simpler than an explanation in terms of four because the relationships that hold between the ten factors are less complex than those that hold between the four, making for a simpler explanation (Ostrowick 2012). In reply, Swinburne might grant this, but argue that in these much more limited cases explanatory power, background knowledge, and scope now come into significant play in a way that they don’t when addressing hypotheses explaining the oddness, bigness, and complexity of the universe.

Second, why think that theism is simpler than naturalism? Oppy argues that whereas both naturalism and theism equally fit the data and have the same scope, naturalism is simpler, for theism is

committed to two kinds of entities (the natural and the supernatural), two kinds of external relations (the natural and the supernatural), two kinds of causation (the natural and the supernatural), two kinds of non-topic-neutral properties (the natural and the supernatural), and so on, whereas naturalism is committed to only one kind in each of these categories. (2013: 52)

In conclusion, Swinburne contends that it is very unlikely that a universe would exist uncaused, but more likely that God would exist uncaused. It is likely that if there is a God, he will make something like the finite and complex universe. The puzzling existence of the universe can be made comprehensible (explicable) if we suppose it is brought about by a personal God with intentional beliefs and the power to bring intentions to fruition (2004: 152). Whether simplicity can bear the weight of his argument is the key matter in question.

9. Necessary Being

Finally, even if the cosmological argument is sound or cogent, the difficult task remains to show, as part of natural theology, that the necessary being to which the cosmological argument concludes is the God of religion, and if so, of which religion. Rowe suggests that the cosmological argument has two parts, one to establish the existence of a first cause or necessary being, the other that this necessary being is God (1975: 6). It is unclear, however, whether the second contention is an essential part of the cosmological argument. Although Aquinas was quick to make the identification between God and the first mover or first cause (growing out of his contention that philosophy is the handmaiden of theology, such that in philosophy faith seeks understanding, not confirmation), such identification seems to go beyond the causal reasoning that informs the argument (although one can argue that it is consistent with the larger picture of God and his properties that Aquinas paints in his Summae). Some (Rasmussen, O’Connor, Koons) have plowed ahead in developing this stage 2 process by showing how and what properties—simplicity, unity, omnipotence, omniscience, goodness, and so on—might follow from the concept of a necessary being. It “has implications that bring it into the neighborhood of God as traditionally conceived” (O’Connor 2008: 67). Others have proposed a method of correlation, where to give any religious substance to the concept of a necessary being, one conducts a lengthy discussion of the supreme beings found in the diverse religions and carefully correlates the properties of a necessary being with those of a religious being. This is done to discern compatibilities and incompatibilities (Attfield 1975).

Regardless of the connection of a necessary being with religion, it is necessary to flesh out the nature of the necessary being if one is to hold that the cosmological argument is informative. As O’Connor notes, the mere concept of a necessary being is “quite thin”. Along with classical Islamic defenders of the argument (e.g., al-Baghdadi, c. 1000), O’Connor (2008: 88) concludes that there is a necessary connection between a personal necessary being and its nature. He suggests that there is not a contingent but a “subtle entailment relation” between certain essential properties like being perfectly powerful, perfectly free, and perfectly knowledgeable. For example, the

extent of power seems to be a function of at least two variables: the amount of work that can be performed in a single task and the range of tasks one is able to perform in a given circumstance.… Perfect power and freedom would require an essentially unlimited knowledge, corresponding to the unlimited range of possibilities. (2008: 89)

A necessary being must also be causally independent for its existence and thus transcendent (2008: 92). Similarly, Swinburne ties God’s perfection to his simplicity that, as we have seen, functions centrally in his argument.

Two notions of necessity are found in the conclusion to the deductive argument: “Necessarily, a necessary being exists”. The first is conditional necessity: the proposition is necessary given that the premises are true and the argument valid. The other use concerns what is meant by “necessary being”. O’Connor writes that God is absolutely necessary, by which he means that God is “absolutely invulnerable to nonexistence” (2008: 70).

The concept of a necessary being is of one that could not have failed to exist, absolutely speaking. For such a being to be possible, it must be such that it would exist in every possible circumstance, including the actual one. That’s precisely why the question of its existence cannot arise, thereby ending the regress of explanation nonarbitrarily. (O’Connor 2013: 42)

For him necessary existence is necessarily tied up with a particular nature (otherwise the existence would be contingent) but not derivative from it; God’s existence entails his nature (2008: 88). God’s necessity is not logical (for there is no contradiction in denying that such a being exists) but made possible on explanatory grounds (the cosmological argument). However, we might inquire, if God could not have failed to exist, how does an absolutely necessary being differ from a logically necessary being? O’Connor goes on to argue that God’s absolute necessity does not invoke the ontological argument. He agrees that by modal Axiom S5, if it is possible that a necessary being exists, it necessarily exists (2008: 71), but denies that this invokes the ontological argument, since it “gives no reason to think that the nature in question is genuinely possible, and not merely logically consistent”. However, one might wonder, what would one have to establish to show that the existence of a necessary being understood in this sense is genuinely possible? (see Plantinga, God, Freedom, and Evil, 1967: 112). Gale himself admits that, given this view of necessity and S5, the ontological argument works although we don’t know how to properly construct it (Gale and Pruss 1999: 462).

One way to understand the necessary being is as factually or metaphysically necessary. In this understanding, the necessary being is “sheer, ultimate, unconditioned reality, without beginning or end” (Hick 1960: 730). God’s necessity refers to his aseity, in that God does not depend on anything else for his existence. It is from God’s aseity that his eternity follows.

God is not one fact amongst others, but is related asymmetrically to all other facts as that which determines them. This is the ultimate given circumstance, which it is not possible to go with either question or explanation. For to explain something means either to assign a cause to it or to show its place within some wider context in relation to which it is no longer puzzling to us. However, the idea of the self-existent Creator of everything other than himself is the idea of a reality which is beyond the scope of these explanatory procedures. (Hick 1960: 733–34)

Given this reading of “necessary being”, God as the necessary being possesses metaphysical or factual necessity and logical contingency (Hick 1960; Swinburne 2004: 79). If the necessary being exists at any time, then necessarily it exists at all times. If the necessary being does not exist, it cannot come into existence. Nothing can bring it into existence or cause it to cease to exist. Thus, if God exists now, it is not coherent to suppose that any agent can make it false that God exists (Swinburne 2004: 249, 266). O’Connor objects that if the necessary being is contingent, it just happens to exist (2008: 70; see White (1979) for further objections). However, one might reply that God does not just happen to exist; God exists because of his nature (although his nature does not precede his existence).

Further considerations beyond the scope of the cosmological argument are in order to discern the relationship between a necessary being and the properties often associated with a religious Ultimate. While defenders of the cosmological argument point to the relevance and importance of connecting the necessary being with natural theology, critics find themselves freed from such endeavors.

After all is presented and developed, it is clear that every thesis and argument we have considered, whether in support or critical of the cosmological argument, is seriously contested. Perhaps that is as it should be when trying to answer the difficult questions whether the universe is contingent or necessary, caused or eternal, and if caused, why it exists or what brought it into being.


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