David Lewis

First published Thu Jul 23, 2009; substantive revision Thu Nov 18, 2021

David Lewis (1941–2001) was one of the most important philosophers of the 20th Century. He made significant contributions to philosophy of language, philosophy of mathematics, philosophy of science, decision theory, epistemology, meta-ethics and aesthetics. In most of these fields he is essential reading; in many of them he is among the most important figures of recent decades. And this list leaves out his two most significant contributions.

In philosophy of mind, Lewis developed and defended at length a new version of materialism (see the entry on physicalism). He started by showing how the motivations driving the identity theory of mind and functionalism could be reconciled in his theory of mind. He called this an identity theory, though his theory motivated the position now known as analytic functionalism. And he developed detailed accounts of mental content (building on Davidson’s interpretationism) and phenomenal knowledge (building on Nemirow’s ability hypothesis) that are consistent with his materialism. The synthesis Lewis ended up with is one of the central positions in contemporary debates in philosophy of mind.

But his largest contributions were in metaphysics. One branch of his metaphysics was his Hume-inspired reductionism about the nomological. He developed a position he called “Humean supervenience”, the theory that said that there was nothing to reality except the spatio-temporal distribution of local natural properties. And he did this by showing in detail how laws, chances, counterfactual dependence, causation, dispositions and colours could be located within this Humean mosaic. The other branch of his metaphysics was his modal realism. Lewis held that the best theory of modality posited concrete possible worlds. A proposition is possible if and only if it is true at one of these worlds. Lewis defended this view in his most significant book, On the Plurality of Worlds. Alongside this, Lewis developed a new account of how to think about modal properties of individuals, namely counterpart theory, and showed how this theory resolved several long-standing puzzles about modal properties.

1. Lewis’s Life and Influence

As we’ve already seen, part of Lewis’s significance came from the breadth of subject matter on which he made major contributions. It is hard to think of a philosopher since Hume who has contributed so much to so many fields. And in all of these cases, Lewis’s contributions involved defending, or in many cases articulating, a big picture theory of the subject matter, as well as an account of how the details worked. Because of all his work on the details of various subjects, his writings were a font of ideas even for those who didn’t agree with the bigger picture. And he was almost invariably clear about which details were relevant only to his particular big picture, and which were relevant to anyone who worked on the subject.

Lewis was born in Oberlin, Ohio in 1941, to two academics. He was an undergraduate at Swarthmore College. During his undergraduate years, his interest in philosophy was stimulated by a year abroad in Oxford, where he heard J. L. Austin’s final series of lectures, and was tutored by Iris Murdoch. He returned to Swarthmore as a philosophy major, and never looked back. He studied at Harvard for his Ph.D., writing a dissertation under the supervision of W. V. O. Quine that became his first book, Convention. In 1966 he was hired at UCLA, where he worked until 1970, when he moved to Princeton. He remained at Princeton until his death in 2001. While at Harvard he met his wife Stephanie. They remained married throughout Lewis’s life, jointly attended numerous conferences, and co-authored three papers. Lewis visited Australia in 1971, 1975, every year from 1979 to 1999, and again shortly before his death in 2001.

Lewis was a Fellow of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, a Corresponding Fellow of the British Academy, and an Honorary Fellow of the Australian Academy of the Humanities. He received honorary doctorates from the University of Melbourne, the University of York in England, and Cambridge University. His Erdös number was 3.

Lewis published four books: Convention (1969a), Counterfactuals (1973a), On the Plurality of Worlds (1986a) and Parts of Classes (1991a). His numerous papers have been largely collected in five volumes: Philosophical Papers Vol. I (1983a), Philosophical Papers Vol. II (1986b), Papers in Philosophical Logic (1998a), Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology (1999a) and Papers in Social Philosophy (2000a). This entry starts with a discussion of Lewis’s first two books, then looks at his contributions to philosophy of mind. Sections 5 and 6 are on his metaphysics, looking in turn at Humean Supervenience and modal realism. Section 7 looks very briefly at some of the many works that aren’t been covered in the previous five categories.

2. Convention

David Lewis’s first book was Convention (1969a; note that all citations are to works by David Lewis, unless explicitly stated otherwise). It was based on his Harvard Ph. D. thesis, and published in 1969. The book was an extended argument that language could be entirely grounded in convention. There is a simple argument that this could not be so. Conventions are formed by agreement, agreements are made in language, so language must precede convention, not be grounded in convention. (In the foreward Quine contributes to Convention, Quine appears to express some sympathy for this argument.) Lewis’s response is to deny that conventions require anything like an agreement. Rather, on his view, conventions are regularities in action that solve co-ordination problems. We can stumble into such a regularity without ever agreeing to do so. And such a regularity can persist simply because it is in everyone’s best interest that it persist.

2.1 Analysis of Convention

Lewis viewed conventions as solutions to co-ordination problems (see Section 3.2 of the entry on convention). His thinking about these problems was heavily influenced by Thomas Schelling’s work on co-operative games in The Strategy of Conflict (Schelling 1960). Many of the key ideas in Lewis’s book come from game theory.

The simplest cases in which conventions arise are ones where we are repeatedly playing a game that is purely co-operative, i.e. the payoffs to each agent are the same, and there are multiple equilibria. In such a case, we may well hope for the equilibrium to persist. At the very least, we will prefer the persistence of the equilibrium to any one person deviating from it. And we will have this preference even if we would prefer, all things considered, to be in some other equilibrium state. In such a case, there may well be a practice of continuing to play one’s part in the equilibrium that has been reached. This is a regularity in action—it involves making moves in the repeated game. Given that everyone else is following the regularity, each agent has a reason to follow the regularity; otherwise it wouldn’t be an equilibrium. But if other agents acted differently, agents would not be interested in following the regularity, since there are alternative equilibria. Because these three conditions are met, Lewis argued that the practice is really a convention, even if there was never any explicit agreement to continue it.

The case we started with was restricted in two important ways. First, the case involved games that were perfectly repeated. Second, it involved games where the payoffs were perfectly symmetric. Lewis’s theory of convention involved getting rid of both restrictions.

Instead of focussing on repeated co-ordination problems, Lewis just focussed on repeated situations which collectively constitute a co-ordination problem. Lewis does not identify situations with games. A repeated situation may come in different ‘versions’, each of which is represented by a different game. For example, it may be that the costs of performing some kind of action differ on different occasions, so the formal game will be different, but the differences are small enough that it makes sense to have a common practice. And Lewis does not require that there be identity of interests. In Convention he does require that there be large overlap of interests, but this requirement does not do much work, and is abandoned in later writing. With those requirements weakened, we get the following definition of convention.

A regularity R in the behaviour of members of a population P when they are agents in a recurrent situation S is a convention if and only if it is true that, and it is common knowledge in P that, in almost any instance of S among members of P,
  1. almost everyone conforms to R;
  2. almost everyone expects everyone else to conform to R;
  3. almost everyone has approximately the same preferences regarding all possible combinations of actions;
  4. almost everyone prefers that any one more conform to R, on condition that almost everyone conform to R;
  5. almost everyone would prefer that any one more conform to R, on condition that almost everyone conform to R′,

where R′ is some possible regularity in the behaviour of members of P in S, such that almost no one in almost any instance of S among members of P could conform to both R′ and to R. (Lewis 1969: 78)

This is clearly a vague definition, with many ‘almost’s scattered throughout. But Lewis, characteristically, thought this was a feature not a bug of the view. Our intuitive notion of a convention is vague, and any analysis of it should capture the vagueness. The idea that analyses of imprecise folk concepts should be imprecise recurs throughout Lewis’s career.

The notion of ‘common knowledge’ that Lewis is working with here is not the standard modern notion. Lewis does not require that everyone know that everyone know etc., that all of these conditions hold. Rather, when Lewis says that it is common knowledge that p, he means that everyone has a reason to believe that p, and everyone has a reason to believe everyone has a reason to believe that p, and everyone has a reason to believe that everyone has a reason to believe everyone has a reason to believe that p, and so on. That people act on these reasons, or are known to act on these reasons, to form beliefs is unnecessary. And that the beliefs people would get if they acted on their reasons are true is also not part of the view. Hence it is necessary to specify truth as well as common belief in the definition.

Lewis argues that this definition captures many of our ordinary conventions, such as the convention of driving on the right side of the road in the United States, the convention of taking certain pieces of paper as payments for debts, and, most importantly, the conventions governing the use of language.

2.2 Conventions of Language

In the final chapter of Convention, Lewis gives his theory of what it is for a community to speak a language (see the section on conventional theories of meaning in the entry on convention), i.e., for a community to have adopted one language as their language by convention. Lewis individuates languages largely by the truth conditions they assign to sentences. And his account of truth conditions is given in terms of possible worlds. So the truth condition of an indicative sentence is the set of possible worlds in which it is true. Somewhat more abnormally, Lewis takes the truth condition for an imperative to be the set of possible worlds in which the imperative is obeyed. (The account of language in Convention covers many different moods, but we will focus here on the account of indicatives.)

The focus on truth conditions is not because Lewis thinks truth conditions are all that there are to languages. He acknowledges that languages also have ‘grammars’. A grammar, in Lewis’s sense, is a lexicon (i.e. a set of elementary constituents, along with their interpretation), a generative component (i.e. rules for combining constituents into larger constituents), and a representing component (i.e. rules for verbally expressing constituents). Lewis’s preferred interpretations are functions from possible worlds to extensions. So we can sensibly talk about the meaning of a non-sentential constituent of the language, but these meanings are derived from the truth conditions of sentences, rather than determining the meanings of sentences. That’s because, as we’ll see, what the conventions of language establish in the first instance are truth conditions for entire messages, i.e., sentences.

Given this understanding of what a language is, Lewis goes on to say what it is for a population to speak a language. One natural approach would be to say that speakers and hearers face a co-ordination problem, and settling on one language to communicate in would be a solution to that problem. When Lewis is analysing signalling, that is the approach he takes. But he doesn’t think it will work for language in general. The reason is that he takes conventions to be regularities in action, and it is hard to say in general what actions are taken by hearers.

So instead Lewis says that a population P speaks a language L if and only if there is a convention of speaking truthfully in L that persists amongst P. The parties to the co-ordination problem (and the convention that solves it) are the different people who want to communicate in P. They solve their problem by speaking truthfully (on the whole) in L.

It might be wondered whether it could really be a convention to speak truthfully in L. After all, there is no obvious alternative to speaking truthfully. As Lewis points out, however, there are many natural alternatives to speaking truthfully in L; we could speak truthfully in L′ instead. The existence of alternative languages makes our use of L conventional. And the convention can be established, and persist, without anyone agreeing to it.

2.3 Later Revisions

In “Languages and Language” (1975b), Lewis makes two major revisions to the picture presented in Convention. He changes the account of what a convention is, and he changes the account of just what convention must obtain in order for a population to speak a language.

There are two changes to the account of convention. First, Lewis now says that conventions may be regularities in action and belief, rather than just in action. Second, he weakens the third condition, which was approximate sameness of preferences, to the condition that (almost) each agent has a reason to conform when they believe others conform. The reason in question may be a practical reason, when conformity requires action, or an epistemic reason, when convention requires belief.

In Convention, the conventions that sustained language were regularities amongst speakers. As we noted, it would be more natural to say that the conventions solved co-ordination problems between speakers of a language and their hearers. That is what the new account of what it is for a population to speak a language does. The population P speaks the language L iff there are conventions of truthfulness and trust in L. Speakers are truthful in L if and only if they only utter sentences they believe are true sentences of L. Hearers are trusting in L if and only if they take the sentences they hear to be (generally) true sentences of L.

The old account took linguistic conventions to be grounded in co-ordination between speakers generally. We each communicate in English because we think we’ll be understood that way given everyone else communicates that way, and we want to be understood. In the new account there is still this kind of many-way co-ordination between all the speakers of a language, but the most basic kind of co-ordination is a two-way co-ordination between individual speakers, who want to be understood, and hearers, who want to understand. This seems like a more natural starting point. The new account also makes it possible for someone to be part of a population that uses a language even if they don’t say anything because they don’t have anything to say. As long as they are trusting in L, they are part of the population that conforms to the linguistic regularity.

John Hawthorne (1990) argued that Lewis’s account cannot explain the intuitive meaning of very long sentences. While not accepting all of Hawthorne’s reasons as to why very long sentences are a problem, in “Meaning Without Use: Reply to Hawthorne” (1992a) Lewis agreed that such sentences pose a problem to his view. To see the problem, let L be the function from each sentence of English to its intuitive truth condition, and let L* be the restriction of that function to sentences that aren’t very long. Arguably we do not trust speakers who utter very long sentences to have uttered truths, under the ordinary English interpretation of their sentences. We think, as Lewis said, that such speakers are “trying to win a bet or set a record, or feigning madness or raving for real, or doing it to annoy, or filibustering, or making an experiment to test the limits of what it is humanly possible to say and mean.” (Lewis 1992a: 108) That means that while there may be a convention of truthfulness and trust in L*, there is no convention of trust in L in its full generality. So the “Languages and Language” theory implies that we speak L*, not L, which is wrong.

Lewis’s solution to this puzzle relies on his theory of natural properties, described below in Section 4.6. He argues that some grammars (in the above sense of grammar) are more natural than others. By default, we speak a language with a natural grammar. Since L has a natural grammar, and L* doesn’t, other things being equal, we should be interpreted as speaking L rather than L*. Even if other things are not quite equal, i.e. we don’t naturally trust speakers of very long sentences, if there is a convention of truthfulness and trust in L in the vast majority of verbal interactions, and there is no other language with a natural grammar in which there is a convention of truthfulness and truth, then the theory will hold, correctly, that we do speak L.

3. Counterfactuals

David Lewis’s second book was Counterfactuals (1973a). Counterfactual conditionals were important to Lewis for several reasons. Most obviously, they are a distinctive part of natural language and it is philosophically interesting to figure out how they work. But counterfactuals would play a large role in Lewis’s metaphysics. Many of Lewis’s attempted reductions of nomic or mental concepts would be either directly in terms of counterfactuals, or in terms of concepts (such as causation) that he in turn defined in terms of counterfactuals. And the analysis of counterfactuals, which uses possible worlds, would in turn provide motivation for believing in possible worlds. We will look at these two metaphysical motivations in more detail in section 4, where we discuss the relationship between counterfactuals and laws, causation and other high-level concepts, and in section 5, where we discuss the motivations for Lewis’s modal metaphysics.

3.1 Background

To the extent that there was a mid-century orthodoxy about counterfactual conditionals, it was given by the proposal in Nelson Goodman (1955). Goodman proposed that counterfactual conditionals were a particular variety of strict conditional. To a first approximation, If it were the case that p, it would be the case that q (hereafter p □→ q) is true just in case Necessarily, either p is false or q is true, i.e. □(pq). Goodman realised that this wouldn’t work if the modal ‘necessarily’ was interpreted unrestrictedly. He first suggested that we needed to restrict attention to those possibilities where all facts ‘co-tenable’ with p were true. More formally, if S is the conjunction of all the co-tenable facts, then p □→ q is true if and only if □((p ∧ S) ⊃ q).

Lewis argued that this could not be the correct set of truth conditions for p □→ q in general. His argument was that strict conditionals were in a certain sense indefeasible. If a strict conditional is true, then adding more conjuncts to the antecedent cannot make it false. But intuitively, adding conjuncts to the antecedent of a counterfactual can change it from being true to false. Indeed, intuitively we can have long sequences of counterfactuals of ever increasing strength in the antecedent, but with the same consequent, that alternate in truth value. So we can imagine that (3.1) and (3.3) are true, while (3.2) and (3.4) are false.

(3.1) If Smith gets the most votes, he will be the next mayor.

(3.2) If Smith gets the most votes but is disqualified due to electoral fraud, he will be the next mayor.

(3.3) If Smith gets the most votes, but is disqualified due to electoral fraud, then launches a military coup that overtakes the city government, he will be the next mayor.

(3.4) If Smith gets the most votes, but is disqualified due to electoral fraud, then launches a military coup that overtakes the city government, but dies during the coup, he will be the next mayor.

If we are to regard p □→ q as true if and only if □((p ∧ S) ⊃ q), then the S must vary for different values of p. More seriously, we have to say something about how S varies with variation in p. Goodman’s own attempts to resolve this problem had generally been regarded as unsuccessful, for reasons discussed in Bennett (1984). So a new solution was needed.

3.2 Analysis

The basic idea behind the alternative analysis was similar to that proposed by Robert Stalnaker (1968). Let’s say that an A-world is simply a possible world where A is true. Stalnaker had proposed that p □→ q was true just in case the most similar p-world to the actual world is also a q-world. Lewis offered a nice graphic way of thinking about this. He proposed that we think of similarity between worlds as a kind of metric, with the worlds arranged in some large-dimensional space, and more similar worlds being closer to each other than more dissimilar worlds. Then Stalnaker’s idea is that the closest p-world has to be a q-world for p □→ q to be true. Lewis considered several ways of filling out the details of this proposal, three of which will be significant here.

First, he rejected Stalnaker’s presupposition that there is a most similar p-world to actuality. He thought there might be many worlds which are equally similar to actuality, with no p-world being more similar. Using the metric analogy suggested above, these worlds all fall on a common ‘sphere’ of worlds, where the centre of this sphere is the actual world. In such a case, Lewis held that p □→ q is true if and only if all the p-worlds on this sphere are q-worlds. One immediate consequence of this is that Conditional Excluded Middle, i.e., (p □→ q) ∨ (p □→ ~q) is not a theorem of counterfactual logic for Lewis, as it was for Stalnaker.

Second, he rejected the idea that there must even be a sphere of closest p-worlds. There might, he thought, be closer and closer p-worlds without limit. He called the assumption that there was a sphere of closest worlds the “Limit Assumption”, and noted that we could do without it. The new truth conditions are that p □→ q is true at w if and only if there is a pq-world closer to w than any p ∧ ¬q-world, or that there is no p world.

Third, he considered dropping the assumption that w is closer to itself than any other world, or even the assumption that w is among the worlds that are closest to it. When we think in terms of similarity (or indeed of metrics) these assumptions seem perfectly natural, but some philosophers have held that they have bad proof theoretic consequences. Given the truth conditions Lewis adopts, the assumption that w is closer to itself than any other world is equivalent to the claim that pq entails p □→ q, and the assumption that w is among the worlds that are closest to it is equivalent to the claim that p □→ q and p entail q. The first of these entailments in particular has been thought to be implausible. But Lewis ultimately decided to endorse it, in large part because of the semantic model he was using. When we don’t think about entailments, and instead simply ask ourselves whether any other world could be as similar to w as w is to itself, the answer seems clearly to be no.

As well as offering these semantic models for counterfactuals, in the book Lewis offers an axiomatisation of the counterfactual logic he prefers (see Table 6 in Section 3.3 of the entry logic of conditionals), as well as axiomatisations for several other logics that make different choices about some of the assumptions we’ve discussed here. And he has proofs that these axiomatisations are sound and complete with respect to the described semantics.

He also notes that his preferred counterfactual logic invalidates several familiar implications involving conditionals. We already mentioned that strengthening the antecedent, the implication of (pr) □→ q by p □→ q, is invalid on Lewis’s theory, and gave some natural language examples that suggest that it should be invalid. Lewis also shows that contraposition, the implication of ~q □→ ~p by p □→ q, and conditional syllogism, the implication of p □→ r by p □→ q and q □→ r, are invalid on his model, and gives arguments that they should be considered invalid.

3.3 Similarity

In Counterfactuals, Lewis does not say a lot about similarity of worlds. He has some short arguments that we can make sense of the notion of two worlds being similar. And he notes that on different occasions we may wish to use different notions of similarity, suggesting a kind of context dependency of counterfactuals. But the notion is not spelled out in much more detail.

Some reactions to the book showed that Lewis needed to say more here. Kit Fine (1975) argued that given what Lewis had said to date, (3.5) would be false, when it should be true.

(3.5) If Richard Nixon had pushed the button, there would have been a nuclear war.

(‘The button’ in question is the button designed to launch nuclear missiles.) The reason it would be false is that a world in which the mechanisms of nuclear warfare spontaneously failed but then life went on as usual, would be more similar, all things considered, to actuality than a world in which the future consisted entirely of a post-nuclear apocalypse.

In “Counterfactual Dependence and Time’s Arrow” (1979c), Lewis responded by saying more about the notion of similarity. In particular, he offered an algorithm for determining similarity in standard contexts. He still held that the particular measure of similarity in use on an occasion is context-sensitive, so there is no one true measure of similarity. Nevertheless there is, he thought, a default measure that we use unless there is a reason to avoid it. Here is how Lewis expressed this default measure.

  1. It is of the first importance to avoid big, widespread, diverse violations of law.
  2. It is of the second importance to maximize the spatio-temporal region throughout which perfect match of particular fact prevails.
  3. It is of the third importance to avoid even small, localized, simple violations of law.
  4. It is of little or no importance to secure approximate similarity of particular fact, even in matters that concern us greatly. (Lewis 1979c: 47–8)

Lewis argues that by this measure, worlds in which the mechanisms of nuclear warfare spontaneously fail will be less similar to the actual world than the post-nuclear apocalypse. That’s because the failure of those mechanisms will either lead to divergence from the actual world (if they fail partially) or widespread, diverse violations of law (if they fail completely). In the former case, there’s a violation of law that isn’t made up for in an increase in how much spatio-temporal match we get. In the latter case the gain we get in similarity is only an expansion of the spatio-temporal region throughout which perfect match of particular fact prevails, but that doesn’t help in getting us closer to actuality if we’ve added a big miracle. So in fact the nearest worlds are ones where a nuclear war occurs, and (3.5) is true.

One way to see the effects of Lewis’s ordering is to work through its implication for an important class of cases. When the antecedent of a counterfactual is about the occurrence or non-occurrence of a particular event E at time t, the effect of these rules is to say that the nearest worlds are the worlds where the following claims all hold, with t* being as late as possible.

  • There is an exact match of particular fact with actuality up to t*.
  • There is a small, localized law violation at t*.
  • There is exact conformity to the laws of actuality after t*.
  • The antecedent is true.

So we find a point just before t where we can make the antecedent true by making a small law violation, and let the laws take over from there. There is something intuitively plausible about this way of viewing counterfactuals; often we do aim to talk about what would have happened if things had gone on in accordance with the laws, given a starting point slightly different from the one that actually obtained.

Jonathan Bennett (2003) notes that when the antecedent of a conditional is not about a particular event, Lewis’s conditions provide the wrong results. For instance, if the antecedent is of the form If one of these events had not happened, then Lewis’s rules say that the nearest world where the antecedent is true is always the world where the most recent such event did not happen. But this does not seem to provide intuitively correct truth conditions for such conditionals. This need not bother Lewis’s larger project. For one thing, Lewis was not committed to there being a uniform similarity metric for all counterfactuals. Lewis could say that his default metric was only meant to apply to cases where the antecedent was about the happening or non-happening of a particular event at a particular time, and it wouldn’t have seriously undermined his larger project. Indeed, as we’ll see in Section 5.2 below, the counterfactuals he was most interested in, and for which these criteria of similarity were devised, did have antecedents concerning specific events.

4. Philosophy of Mind

In “Reduction of Mind” (1994b), David Lewis separates his contributions to philosophy of mind into two broad categories. The first category is his reductionist metaphysics. From his first published philosophy paper, “An Argument for the Identity Theory” (1966a), Lewis defended a version of the mind-brain identity theory (see the entry on the identity theory of mind). As he makes clear in “Reduction of Mind”, this became an important part of his global reductionism. We’ll look at his metaphysics of mind in sections 4.1–4.3.

The second category is his theory of mental content. Following Donald Davidson in broad outlines, Lewis held that the contents of a person’s mental states are those contents that ’fit’ the typical causal profile of the state. For example, a state isn’t constituted by the combination of a desire for some end plus a belief that waving will bring about that end, unless it typically causes waving. In this respect Lewis’s views resembled interpretationist theories of beliefs. But he differed from other interpretationists in several ways. We will focus here on two of them. Lewis held that mental contents are typically properties, not propositions. And he held that a theory of mental content requires an inegalitarian theory of properties. We’ll look at his theory of content in sections 4.4–4.6.

4.1 Ramsey Sentences

The logical positivists faced a hard dilemma when trying to make sense of science. On the one hand, they thought that all meaningful talk was ultimately talk about observables. On the other hand, they respected science enough to deny that talk of unobservables was meaningless. The solution was to ‘locate’ the unobservables in the observation language; in other words, to find a way to reduce talk of unobservables to talk about observables.

Lewis didn’t think much of the broader positivist project, but he was happy to take over some of their technical advances in solving this location problem. Lewis noted that this formal project, the project of trying to define theoretical terms in an already understood language, was independent of the particular use we make of it. All that really matters is that we have some terms introduced by a new theory, and that the new theory is introduced in a language that is generally understood. In any such case it is an interesting question whether we can extract the denotation of an introduced term from the theory used to introduce it.

The term-introducing theory could be a scientific theory, such as the theory that introduces terms like ‘electron’, and the language of the theory could be observation language. Or, more interestingly, the term-introducing theory could be folk psychology, and the language of the theory could be the language of physics. If we have a tool for deriving the denotations of terms introduced by a theory, and we have a way of treating folk psychology as a theory (i.e., a conjunction of sentences to which folk wisdom is committed), we can derive the denotations of terms like ‘belief’, ‘pain’, and so on using this theory. Some of Lewis’s important early work on the metaphysics of mind was concerned with systematising the progress positivists, especially Ramsey and Carnap, had made on just this problem. The procedure is introduced in “An Argument for the Identity Theory”, “Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications” (1972a) and “How to Define Theoretical Terms” (1970c). There are important later discussions of it in “Reduction of Mind” and “Naming the Colours” (1997c), among many others.

In the simplest case, where we have a theory T that introduces one new name t, Lewis says that t denotes the x such that T[x], where T[x] is the sentence we get by (a) converting T to a single sentence, perhaps a single long conjunction, and (b) replacing all occurrences of t with the variable x. That is, if there is a unique x such that T[x], t denotes it, and t is denotationless otherwise. (Note that it isn’t meaningless, but it is denotationless.)

The simplest case is not fully general in a few respects. First, theories often introduce many terms simultaneously, not just one. So the theory might introduce new terms t1, t2, …, tn. No problem, we can just quantify over n-tuples, where n is the number of new terms introduced. So instead of looking at ∃1x T[x], where ∃1 means ‘exists a unique’ and x is an individual variable, we look at ∃1x T[x], where x is a variable that ranges over n-tuples, and T[x] is the sentence you get by replacing t1 with the first member of x, t2 with the second member of x, …, and tn with the nth member of x. Although this is philosophically very important, for simplicity I’ll focus here on the case where a single theoretical term is to be introduced.

The simplest case is not general in another, more important, respect. Not all theoretical terms are names, so it isn’t obvious that we can quantify over them. Lewis’s response, at least in the early papers, is to say we can always replace them with names that amount to the same thing. So if T says that all Fs are Gs, and we are interested in the term ‘G’, then we’ll rewrite T so that it now says Gness is a property of all Fs. In the early papers, Lewis says that this is a harmless restatement of T, but this isn’t correct. Indeed, in later papers such as “Void and Object” (2004d) and “Tensing the Copula” (2002a) Lewis notes that some predicates don’t correspond to properties or relations. There is no property of being non-self-instantiating, for instance, though we can predicate that of many things. In those cases the rewriting will not be possible. But in many cases, we can rewrite T, and then we can quantify into it.

The procedure here is often called Ramsification, or Ramseyfication. (Both spellings have occurred in print. The first is in the title of Braddon-Mitchell and Nola (1997), the second in the title of Melia and Saatsi (2006).) The effect of the procedure is that if we had a theory T which was largely expressed in the language O, except for a few terms t1, t2, …, tn, then we end up with a theory expressed entirely in the O-language, but which, says Lewis, has much the same content. Moreover, if the converted theory is true, then the T-terms can be defined as the substitutends that make the converted sentence true. This could be used as a way of eliminating theoretical terms from an observation language, if O is the observation language. Or it could be a way of understanding theoretical terms in terms of natural language, if O is the old language we had before the theory was developed.

In cases where there is a unique x such that T[x], Lewis says that t denotes that x. What if there are many such x? Lewis’s official view in the early papers is that in such a case t does not have a denotation. In “Reduction of Mind”, Lewis retracted this, and said that in such a case t is indeterminate between the many values. In “Naming the Colours” he partially retracts the retraction, and says that t is indeterminate if the different values of x are sufficiently similar, and lacks a denotation otherwise.

A more important complication is the case where there is no realiser of the theory. Here it is important to distinguish two cases. First, there is the case where the theory is very nearly realised. That is, a theory that contains enough of the essential features of the original theory turns out to be true. In that case we still want to say that the theory manages to provide denotations for its new terms. Second, there are cases where the theory is a long way from the truth. The scientific theory of phlogiston, and the folk theory of witchcraft, are examples of this. In this case we want to say that the terms of the theory do not denote.

As it stands, the formal theory does not have the resources to make this distinction. But this is easy to fix. Just replace the theory T with a theory T*, which is a long disjunction of various important conjuncts of T. So if T consisted of three claims, p1 p2 and p3, and it is close enough to true if two of them are true, then T* would be the disjunction (p1p2) ∨ (p1p3) ∨ (p2p3). Lewis endorses this method in “Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications” The disjuncts are propositions that are true in states that would count as close enough to the world as described by T that T’s terms denote. Note that in a real-world case, some parts of T will be more important than others, so we won’t be able to just ‘count the conjuncts’. Still, we should be able to generate a plausible T* from T. And the rule in general is that we apply the above strategy to T* rather than T to determine the denotation of the terms.

4.2 Arguing for the Identity Theory

Lewis’s first, and most important, use of Ramsification was to argue for the mind-brain identity theory, in “An Argument for the Identity Theory”. Lewis claims in this paper that his argument does not rely on parsimony considerations. The orthodox argument for the identity theory at the time, as in e.g. J. J. C. Smart (1959), turned on parsimony. The identity theory and dualism explain the same data, but the dualist explanation involves more ontology than the identity theory explanation. So the identity theory is preferable. Lewis says that this abductive step is unnecessary. (He even evinces concern that it is unsound.) Lewis offers instead an argument from the causal efficacy of experience. The argument is something like the following. (I’ve given the argument that pains are physical, a similar argument can be given for any other kind of experience.)

  1. Pains are the kind of thing that typically have such-and-such physical causes and such-and-such physical effects, where the ‘such-and-such’s are filled in by our folk theory of pain.
  2. Since the physical is causally closed, the things that have such-and-such physical causes and such-and-such physical effects are themselves physical.
  3. So, pains are physical.

The first premise is analytically true; it follows from the way we define theoretical terms. The second premise is something we learn from modern physics. (It isn’t clear, by the way, that we can avoid Smart’s parsimony argument if we really want to argue for premise 2.) So the conclusion is contingent, since modern physics is contingent, but it is well-grounded. Indeed, if we change the second premise a little, drawing on neurology rather than physics, we can draw a stronger conclusion, one that Lewis draws in “Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications”.

  1. Pains are the kind of thing that typically have such-and-such physical causes and such-and-such physical effects, where the ‘such-and-such’s are filled in by our folk theory of pain.
  2. Neural state N is the state that has such-and-such physical causes and such-and-such physical effects.
  3. So, pains are instances of neural state N.

So, at least in the second argument, Lewis is defending a kind of identity theory. Pains just are instances of neural states. I’ll finish up this survey of Lewis’s metaphysics of mind with a look at two complications to this theory.

4.3 Madmen and Martians

Pain is defined by its causal role. Central to that role is that we are averse to pain, and try to avoid it. But not all of us do. Some of us seek out pain. Call them madmen. A good theory of pain should account for the possibility of madmen.

The simplest way to account for madmen would be to simply identify pain with a neural state. So Lewis’s identity theory is well-placed to deal with them. But there is a complication. Not every creature in the universe who is in pain has the same neural states as us. It is at least possible that there are creatures in which some silicon state S plays the pain role. That is, the creatures are averse to S, they take S to be an indicator of bodily damage, and so on. Those creatures are in pain whenever they are in state S. Call any such creature a Martian. A simple identification of pain with neural state N will stipulate that there couldn’t be any Martians. That would be a bad stipulation to make.

The possibility of madmen pushes us away from a simple functional definition of pain. Some creatures have pains that do not play the pain role. The possibility of Martians pushes us away from a purely neural definition of pains. Some creatures have pains that are not like our neural pain states. Indeed, some of them might have pains without having any neural states at all. Lewis’s way of threading this needle is to say that pains, like all mental states, are defined for kinds of creatures. Pains in humans are certain neural states. They are the neural states that (typically, in humans) have the functional role that we associate with pain. In other kinds of creatures pains are other states that (typically, in those creatures) play the pain role. The details of these views are worked out in “Mad Pain and Martian Pain” (1980c).

4.4 Constitutive Rationality

The contents of a mental state are, according to Lewis, the contents that best make sense of the state. As he sometimes puts it, they are the contents that ‘fit’ the state. Part of what it is to fit a state is to rationalise the behavior that the state typically causes. So constraints of rationality, especially concerning what actions are rational given that one is in a mental state, are partially constitutive of mental content.

Put this broadly, Lewis’s position is indebted to Donald Davidson’s work, and Lewis frequently acknowledges the debt. But Lewis differs from Davidson in several respects. I’ll briefly mention four of them here, then look at two substantial changes in the next two sections. (The primary sources for the discussion in this section are “Radical Interpretation” (1974c) and especially its appendices in Philosophical Papers: Volume I (1983a), and “Reduction of Mind”.)

First, Lewis does not think that fit requires that one’s beliefs are typically true. Rather, it requires that beliefs are (typically) rational. If the subject is surrounded by misleading evidence, false beliefs fit better than true ones.

Second, Lewis does not give a particularly special place to the subject’s verbal behaviour in considering which content fits. In particular, we don’t first ask what assignment of contents to their words best makes sense of their verbal behavior, and then say that the central aspect of fit for mental states involves dispositions to produce words with the same contents as belief states. Rather, Lewis follows Grice (among others) in taking mental content to be metaphysically primary, and linguistic content to be determined by mental states (see the section on meaning in the entry on Grice).

Third, Lewis believes in narrow content. Indeed, there is a sense in which he thinks narrow content is primary. He holds that Swampman has contentful states, thereby disagreeing with Davidson (among others). And he thinks that we share many beliefs (most clearly metalinguistic beliefs) with denizens of Twin Earth.

Finally, Lewis’s theory of mental content, like his theory of mind in general, is anti-individualistic. What matters is the functional role that a state typically has in creatures of a certain kind, not what role it has in this creature. So there might be a madman who does not attempt to get what they desire. A pure functionalist may say that such a person has no desires, since desires, by definition, are states that agents attempt to satisfy. Lewis says that as long as this state typically leads to satisfaction-attempts in creatures of this kind, it is a desire. Indeed, if a state typically leads to attempts to get X, it is a desire for X, even if little about the role the state plays in this particular agent would suggest it is a desire for X.

4.5 De Se Content

Some of our beliefs and desires are about specific individuals. I might, for instance, believe that BW is a crook and desire that he be punished. Some of our beliefs and desires are self-directed. I might, for instance, believe that I am not a crook and desire that I not be punished. If I know that I am BW, then I should not have all of those beliefs and desires. But I might be ignorant of this. In some circumstances (e.g., amnesia, or receiving deceptive information about your identity) it is no sign of irrationality to not know who you are. And if you don’t know you are X, you may ascribe different properties to yourself and to X.

Lewis’s way of handling this problem was exceedingly simple. His original version of interpretationism had it that belief-states were ultimately probability distributions over possible worlds, and desire-states were ultimately utility functions, again defined over possible worlds. In “Attitude De Dicto and De Se” (1979b), he argued that this isn’t correct. Beliefs and desires are, at the end of the day, probability and utility functions. (Or at least they are approximations to those functions.) But they are not defined over possible worlds. Rather, they are defined over possible individuals.

What that means for belief and desire is easiest to express using the language of possible worlds. The standard view is that propositions are (or at least determine) sets of possible worlds, and that the content of a belief is a proposition. To believe something then is to locate yourself within a class of possible worlds; to believe that you inhabit one of the worlds at which the proposition is true. Lewis’s view is that properties are (or at least determine) sets of possible individuals, and that the content of a belief is a property. To believe something then is to locate yourself within a class of possible individuals; to believe that you are one of the individuals with the property. More simply, beliefs are the self-ascriptions of properties.

Within this framework, it is easy to resolve the puzzles we addressed at the top of the section. If I believe that BW is a crook, I self-ascribe the property of inhabiting a world in which BW is a crook. (On Lewis’s theory, beliefs that are not explicitly self-locating will be beliefs about which world one is in.) If I believe I am not a crook, I self-ascribe the property of not being a crook. Since there are possible individuals who are (a) not crooks but (b) in worlds where BW is a crook, this is a consistent self-ascription. Indeed, I may even have strong evidence that I have both of these properties. So there is no threat of inconsistency, or even irrationality here.

Lewis’s suggestion about how to think of self-locating mental states has recently been very influential in a variety of areas. Adam Elga (2001, 2004) has extensively investigated the consequences of Lewis’s approach for decision theory. Andy Egan (2007) has developed a novel form of semantic relativism using Lewis’s approach as a model. Daniel Nolan (2007) has recently argued that Lewis’s approach is less plausible for desire than for belief, and Robert Stalnaker (2008) argues that the view makes the wrong judgments about sameness and difference of belief across agents and times.

4.6 Natural Properties

One classic problem for interpretationism is that our dispositions massively underdetermine contents. I believe that (healthy) grass is green. But for some interpretations of ‘grue’, ascribing to me the belief that grass is grue will fit my dispositions just as well. As Lewis points out towards the end of “New Work For a Theory of Universals” (1983e), if we are allowed to change the interpretations of my beliefs and desires at the same time, the fit can be made even better. This looks like a problem for interpretationism.

The problem is of course quite familiar. In different guises it is Goodman’s grue/green problem, Kripkenstein’s plus/quus problem, Quine’s gavagai problem, and Putnam’s puzzle of the brain in a vat with true beliefs (Goodman 1955, Wittgenstein 1953, Kripke 1982, Quine 1960, Putnam 1981). One way or another it has to be solved.

Lewis’s solution turns on a metaphysical posit. Some properties, he says, are more natural than others. The natural properties are those that, to use an ancient phrase, carve nature at the joints. They make for objective resemblance amongst the objects that have them, and objective dissimilarity between things that have them and those that lack them. The natural properties, but not in general the unnatural properties, are relevant to the causal powers of things. Although science is in the business of discovering which natural properties are instantiated, when Lewis talks about natural properties he doesn’t mean properties given a special role by nature. It is not a contingent matter which properties are natural, because it isn’t a contingent matter which properties make for objective similarity.

Some properties are perfectly natural. Other properties are less natural, but not all unnatural properties are alike. Green things are a diverse and heterogeneous bunch, but they are more alike than the grue things are. And the grue things are more alike than some other even more disjunctive bunches. So as well as positing perfectly natural properties, Lewis posits a relation of more and less natural on properties. He suggests that we just need to take the perfectly natural as primitive, and we can define the naturalness of other properties in terms of it. The idea is that the naturalness of a property is a function of the complexity of that property’s definition in terms of perfectly natural properties. It isn’t at all obvious that this suggestion will capture the intuitive idea, and Lewis does not defend it at any length.

Natural properties will play a major role for Lewis. We’ve already seen one place where it turns out they are needed; namely, in saying what it is for two worlds to have an ‘exact match’ of spatiotemporal regions. What Lewis means by that is that the regions are intrinsic duplicates. And the way he analyses intrinsic duplication in (1983e) is that two things are duplicates if they have the same intrinsic properties. We will see many other uses of natural properties as we go along, particularly in the discussion of Humean supervenience in section 5.

But as Lewis (1983e) makes clear, natural properties play many more roles in his larger philosophy, including in the theory of rationality, the theory of mental content, the theory of linguistic content, and the theory of laws. It is rational to have a belief with a more natural rather than a less natural content. If two different assignments of beliefs and desires would make equally good sense of an agent’s dispositions, the more natural assignment is the correct one. If two different interpretations of the words of a public language would make equally good sense of speakers’ practices, the more natural interpretation is the correct one. And laws are simple generalisations, where simplicity is defined in part in terms of naturalness.

There is some scholarly dispute about the relationship between the four theses set out in the last four sentences of the preceding paragraph. Williams (2007) argues that the thesis about laws is explanatorily prior to some of the theses about rationality and content. Sider (2001) argues that the third thesis is a standalone part of Lewis’s theory. Schwarz (2014), however, argues that it isn’t even a part of Lewis’s theory. Weatherson (2003) endorses Sider’s view, but later Weatherson (2013) endorses Schwarz’s critique of Sider’s interpretation, while arguing that a qualified version of the third thesis can nevertheless be derived from the first two. (A version of Schwarz’s paper had been in circulation since 2006, so it well precedes Weatherson’s 2013 paper, despite the slightly later publication date.) Janssen-Lauret and MacBride (2020) respond to Schwarz, arguing that evidence from Lewis’s recently available correspondence supports the view that Lewis took naturalness to play a central role in determining the reference of individual words.

This topic, natural properties, was one of very few topics where Lewis had a serious change of view over the course of his career. Of course, Lewis changed the details of many of his views, in response to criticism and further thought. But the idea that some properties could be natural, could make for objective similarity, in ways that most sets of possibilia do not, is notably absent from his writings before “New Work”. Indeed, as late as “Individuation by Acquaintance and by Stipulation” (1983c), he was rather dismissive of the idea. But natural properties came to play central roles in his metaphysics and, as we see here, his theory of mind. As Lewis notes in “New Work”, much of the impetus for his change of view came from discussions with D. M. Armstrong, and from the arguments in favour of universals that Armstrong presented in his (1978).

5. Humean Supervenience

Many of David Lewis’s papers in metaphysics were devoted to setting out, and defending, a doctrine he called “Humean Supervenience”. Here is Lewis’s succinct statement of the view.

It is the doctrine that all there is to the world is a vast mosaic of local matters of particular fact, just one little thing and then another. (Lewis 1986b: ix)

The doctrine can be factored into two distinct theses. The first is the thesis that, in John Bigelow’s words, “truth supervenes on being”. That is, all the truths about a world supervene on the distribution of perfectly natural properties and relations in that world. The second is the thesis that the perfectly natural properties and relations in this world are intrinsic properties of point-sized objects, and spatiotemporal relations. Lewis held that the first of these was necessary and a priori. (See, for instance, “Parts of Classes” (1991a), “Reduction of Mind”, “Truthmaking and Difference-making” (2001d).) The second is contingently true if true at all. Indeed, modern physics suggests that it is not true (Maudlin 2007: Ch. 2). Lewis was aware of this. His aim in defending Humean supervenience was to defend, as he put it, its “tenability” (1986a: xi). We will return at the end of this section to the question of why he might have wanted to do this. For now, we will focus on how he went about this project.

The primary challenge to Humean supervenience comes from those who hold that providing a subvenient basis for all the truths of this world requires more than intrinsic properties of point-sized objects and spatiotemporal relations. Some of these challenges come from theorists who think best physics will need non-spatiotemporal relations in order to explain Bell’s Theorem. But more commonly it comes from those who think that grounding the modal, the nomic or the mental requires adding properties and relations to any Humean mosaic constructed from properties found in fundamental physics. (I’m using ‘mental’ here to cover all the properties that Lewis considered mental, broadly construed. This includes contents, since Lewis thought content was grounded in mental content, and value, since he thought values were grounded in idealised desires. So it’s a fairly broad category, and there is a lot that isn’t obviously reducible to fundamental physics. As we’ll see, Lewis attempts to reduce it all step-by-step.)

We’ve discussed in the previous section how Lewis aimed to reduce the mental to the nomic. (Or at least much of it; we’ll return to the question of value in section 7.5.) We’ll discuss in the next section his distinctive modal metaphysics. In this section we’ll look at how he attempted to locate the nomic in the Humean mosaic. Lewis’s aim was to show that nomic properties and relations could be located in the Humean mosaic by locating them as precisely and as explicitly as he could. So the location project revealed a lot about these nomic features. We’ll spend the next two subsections looking at the two important parts of this project. Notably, they are two parts where Lewis refined his views several times on the details of the location.

5.1 Laws and Chances

Lewis’s reductionist project starts with laws of nature. Building on some scattered remarks by Ramsey and Mill, Lewis proposed a version of the ‘best-system’ theory of laws of nature. There is no paper devoted to this view, but it is discussed in section 3.3 of Counterfactuals, in “New Work For a Theory of Universals”, extensively in Postscript C to the reprint of “A Subjectivist’s Guide to Objective Chance” in (1986b), and in “Humean Supervenience Debugged” (1994a).

The simple version of the theory is that the laws are the winners of a ‘competition’ among all collections of truths. Some truths are simple, e.g. the truth that this table is brown. Some truths are strong; they tell us a lot about the world. For example, the conjunction of every truth in this Encyclopedia rules out a large chunk of modal space. Typically, these are exclusive categories; simple truths are not strong, and strong truths are not simple. But there are some exceptions. The truth that any two objects are attracted to one another, with a force proportional to the product of their masses and inversely proportional to the distance between them, is relatively simple, but also quite strong in that it tells us a lot about the forces between many distinct objects. The laws, says Lewis, are these simple but strong truths.

Two qualifications are needed before we get to Lewis’s 1973 view of laws. It is collections of truths, not individual truths, that are measured and compared for simplicity and strength. And it is not every truth in the winning collection (or best system), but only the generalisations within it, that are laws. So even if the best system includes particular facts about the Big Bang or its immediate aftermath, e.g. that the early universe was a low entropy state, those facts are not laws on Lewis’s view.

In “New Work For a Theory of Universals”, Lewis notes another restriction that is needed. If we measure the simplicity of some truths by the length of their statement in an arbitrarily chosen language, then any truth at all can be made simple. Let Fx be true if and only if x is in a world where every truth in this Encyclopedia is true. Then Everything is F is simply stateable in a language containing F, and is presumably strong. So Everything is F will be a law. But this kind of construction would clearly trivialise the theory of laws. Lewis’s solution is to say that we measure the simplicity of a claim by how easily stateable it is in a language where all predicates denote perfectly natural properties. He notes that this move requires that the natural properties are specified prior to specifying the laws, which means that we can’t reductively specify naturalness in terms of laws. (In any case, since Lewis holds that laws are contingent (1986a: 91) but which properties are natural is not contingent (1986a: 60n), this approach would not be open to Lewis.)

In “Humean Supervenience Debugged”, Lewis notes how to extend this theory to indeterministic worlds. Some laws don’t say what will happen, but what will have a chance of happening. If the chances of events could be determined antecedently to the laws being determined, we could let facts about chances be treated more or less like any other fact for the purposes of our ‘competition’. But, as we’ll see, Lewis doesn’t think the prospects for doing this are very promising. So instead he aims to reduce laws and chances simultaneously to distributions of properties.

Instead of ranking collections of truths by two measures, strength and simplicity, we will rank them by three, strength, simplicity and fit. A collection of truths that entails that what does happen has (at earlier times) a higher chance of happening has better fit than a collection that entails that what happens had a lower chance of happening. The laws are those generalisations in the collection of truths that do the best by these three measures of strength, simplicity and fit. The collection will entail various ‘history-to-chance’ conditionals. These are conditionals of the form If Ht then Pt(A) = x, where Ht is a proposition about the history of the world to t, and Pt is the function from propositions to their chance at t. The chance of A at t in w is x if and only if there is some such conditional If Ht then Pt(A) = x, where Ht is the history of w to t.

The position that I’ve sketched here is the position that Lewis says that he originally was drawn towards in 1975, and that he endorsed in print in 1994. (The dates are from his own description of the evolution of his views in (1994a).) But in between, in both (1980a) and Postscript C to its reprinting in (1986b), he rejected this position because he thought it conflicted with a non-negotiable conceptual truth about chance. This truth was what he called the “Principal Principle”.

The Principal Principle says that a rational agent conforms their credences to the chances. More precisely, it says the following is true. Assume we have a number x, proposition A, time t, rational agent whose evidence is entirely about times up to and including t, and a proposition E that (a) is about times up to and including t and (b) entails that the chance of A at t is x. In any such case, the agent’s credence in A given E is x.

An agent who knows what happens after t need not be guided by chances at t. If I’ve seen the coin land heads, that its chance of landing heads was 0.5 at some earlier time is no reason to have my credence in heads be 0.5. Conversely, if all I know is that the chance is 0.5, that’s no reason for my conditional credence in heads to be 0.5 conditional on anything at all. Conditional on it landing heads, my credence in heads is 1, for instance. But given these two restrictions, the Principal Principle seems like a good constraint. Lewis calls evidence about times after t ‘inadmissible’, which lets us give a slightly more concise summary of what the Principal Principle says. For agents with no inadmissible evidence, the rational credence in A, conditional on the chance of A being x, combined with any admissible evidence, is x.

The problem Lewis faced in the 1980s papers is that the best systems account of chance makes the Principal Principle either useless or false. Here is a somewhat stylised example. (I make no claims about the physical plausibility of this setup; more plausible examples would be more complicated, but would make much the same point.) Let t be some time before any particle has decayed. Let A be the proposition that every radioactive particle will decay before it reaches its actual half-life. At t, A has a positive chance of occurring. Indeed, its chance is 1 in 2n, where n is the number of radioactive particles in the world. (Assume, again for the sake of our stylised example, that n is finite.) But if A occurred, the best system of the world would be different from how it actually is. It would improve fit, for instance, to say that the chance of decay within the actual half-life would be 1. So someone who knows that the chance of A is 1 in 2n knows that A won’t happen.

Lewis called A an ‘undermining’ future; it has a chance of happening, but if it happens the chances are different. The problem with underminers is that they conflict with the Principal Principle. Someone who knows the chance of A should, by the Principal Principle, have credence 1 in 2n that A will happen. But given the chance of A, it is possible to deduce ~A, and hence have credence in A. This looks like an inconsistency, so like any principle that implies a contradiction, the Principal Principle must be false. The most obvious way out is to say that information about the chance of A is inadmissible, since it reveals something about the future, namely that A doesn’t occur. But to say that chances are inadmissible is to make the Principal Principle useless. So given the best systems theory of laws and chances, the Principal Principle is either false or useless. Since the Principal Principle is neither false nor useless, Lewis concluded in these 1980s papers that the best systems theory of laws and chances was false.

The problem with this was that it wasn’t clear what could replace the best systems theory. Lewis floated two approaches in the postscripts to the reprinting of (1980a), one based on primitive chances, and the other based on history-to-chance conditionals being necessary. But neither seemed metaphysically plausible, and although each was consistent with the Principal Principle, they made it either mysterious (in the first case) or implausible (in the second). A better response, as set out in “Humean Supervenience Debugged”, was to qualify the Principal Principle. Lewis said that what was really true was the “New Principle”. His proposal was based on ideas developed by Ned Hall (1994) and Michael Thau (1994).

We’ll explain the New Principle by starting with a special case of the old Principle. Let T be the ‘theory of chance’ for the world, the conjunction of all history-to-chance conditionals. And let H be the history of the world to t. Assuming T is admissible, the old Principal Principle says that the credence in A given HT should be the chance of A at t. The New Principle says that the credence in A given HT should be the chance of A given T at t. That is, where C is the agent’s credence function, and P is the chance function, and the agent has no inadmissible evidence, it should be that C(A | HT) = P(A | T). This compares to the old principle, which held that C(A | HT) = P(A).

That’s the special case of the New Principle for an agent with no inadmissible evidence. The general case follows from this special case. In general, assuming the agent has no inadmissible evidence, the rational credence in A given E is the expected value, given E, of the chance of A given HT. That is, where C is the agent’s credence function, and P is the chance function, it should be the sum across all possible combinations of H and T of C(HT | E)P(A | HT).

The New Principle is, Lewis argues, consistent with the best systems theory of laws and chances. Lewis had originally thought that any specification of chance had to be consistent with the Principal Principle. But in later works he argued that the New Principle was a close enough approximation to the Principal Principle that a theory of chances consistent with it was close enough to our pre-theoretic notion of chance to deserve the name. So he could, and did, happily endorse the best systems theory of laws and chance.

5.2 Causation

In “Causation” (1973b), Lewis put forward an analysis of causation in terms of counterfactual dependence. The idea was that event B was counterfactually dependent on event A if and only if the counterfactual Had A not occurred, B would not have occurred was true. Then event C causes event E if and only if there is a chain C, D1, …, Dn, E such that each member in the chain (except C) is counterfactually dependent on the event before it. In summary, causation is the ancestral of counterfactual dependence.

The reasoning about chains helped Lewis sidestep a problem that many thought unavoidable for a counterfactual theory of causation, namely the problem of pre-empting causes. Imagine that Suzy throws a rock, the rock hits a window and the window shatters. Suzy’s throw caused the window to shatter. But there is a backup thrower—Billy. Had Suzy not thrown, Billy would have thrown another rock and broken the window. So the window breaking is not counterfactually dependent on Suzy’s throw. Lewis’s solution was to posit an event of the rock flying towards the window. Had Suzy not thrown, the rock would not have been flying towards the window. And had the rock not been flying towards the window, the window would have not shattered. Lewis’s thought here is that it is Suzy’s throwing that causes Billy to not throw; once she has thrown Billy is out of the picture and the window’s shattering depends only on what Suzy’s rock does. So we avoid this problem of pre-empters.

Much of the argumentation in “Causation” concerns the superiority of the counterfactual analysis to deductive-nomological theories. These arguments were so successful that from a contemporary perspective they seem somewhat quaint. There are so few supporters of deductive-nomological theories in contemporary metaphysics that a modern paper would not spend nearly so much time on them.

After “Causation” the focus, at least of those interested in reductive theories, moved to counterfactual theories. And it became clear that Lewis had a bit of work left to do. He needed to say more about the details of the notion of counterfactual dependence. He did this in “Counterfactual Dependence and Time’s Arrow” (1979c), as discussed in section 2. He needed to say more about the nature of events. In “Events” (1986g) he said that they were natural properties of regions of space-time. (At this stage he assumed that events were the relata of the causal relation. This assumption is criticised by L. A. Paul (2000), and in (2004d) Lewis drops it.) And prodded by Jaegwon Kim (1973), he needed to add that A and B had to be wholly distinct events for B to counterfactually depend on A. The alternative would be to say that an event’s happening is caused by any essential part of the event, which is absurd.

But the biggest problem concerned what became known as “late pre-emption”. In the rock throwing example above, we assumed that Billy decided not to throw when he saw Suzy throwing. But we can imagine a variant of the case where Billy waits to see whether Suzy’s rock hits, and only then decides not to throw. In such a case, it is the window’s shattering, not anything prior to this, that causes Billy not to throw. That means that there is no event between Suzy’s throw and the window’s shattering on which the shattering is counterfactually dependent.

Lewis addressed this issue in “Redundant Causation”, one of the six postscripts to the reprinting of “Causation” in (1986b). He started by introducing a new concept: quasi-dependence. B quasi-depends on A if and only if there is a process starting with A*, and ending with B* , and B* counterfactually depends on A*, and the process from A* to B* is an intrinsic duplicate of the process from A to B, and the laws governing the process from A* to B* (i.e. the laws of the world in which A* and B* happen) are the same as the laws governing the process from A to B. In short, quasi-dependence is the relation you get if you start with dependence, then add all of the duplicates of dependent processes. Causation is then the ancestral of quasi-dependence. Although the window’s shattering does not depend on Suzy’s throw, it does quasi-depend on it. That’s because there is a world, with the same laws, with a duplicate of Suzy’s throw, but Billy determined not to throw, and in that world the window shatters in just the same way, and depends on Suzy’s throw.

Eventually, Lewis became unsatisfied with the quasi-dependence based theory. In “Causation as Influence” (2000a, 2004a) he set out several reasons for being unhappy with it, and a new theory to supersede it.

One argument against it is that it makes causation intrinsic to the pair C and E, but some cases, especially cases of double prevention, show that causation is extrinsic. Double prevention occurs when an event, call it C, prevents something that would have prevented E from happening. Intuitively, these are cases of causation. Indeed, when we look at the details we find that many everyday cases of causation have this pattern. But that C causes E does not depend on the intrinsic natures of C and E. Rather, it depends on there being some threat to E, a threat that C prevents, and the existence of threats is typically extrinsic to events.

Another argument is that quasi-dependence cannot account for what came to be known as ‘trumping pre-emption’. Lewis illustrated this idea with an example from Jonathan Schaffer (2000). The troops are disposed to obey all orders from either the Sergeant or the Major. But they give priority to the Major’s orders, due to the Major’s higher rank. Both the Major and the Sergeant order the troops to advance, and they do advance. Intuitively, it is the Major, not the Sergeant, who caused the advance, since the Major’s orders have priority. But the advance does quasi-depend on the Sergeant’s orders, since in a world where the Major doesn’t make an order, the advance does depend on the Sergeant.

Lewis’s alternative theory relied on changing the definition of counterfactual dependence. The theory in “Causation” was based on what he came to call ‘whether-whether’ dependence. What’s crucial is that whether B happens depends counterfactually on whether A happens. The new theory was based on what we might call ‘how-how’ dependence. Lewis says that B depends on A if there are large families of counterfactuals of the form If A had happened in this way, then B would have happened in that way, and the ways in which B would happen are systematically dependent on the ways in which A happens. How much A influences B depends on how big this family is, how much variation there is in the way B changes, and how systematic the influence of A on B is. He then defines causation as the ancestral of this notion of counterfactual dependence.

On this new theory, causation is a degree concept, rather than an ‘all-or-nothing’ concept, since counterfactual dependence comes in degrees. Sometimes Lewis says we properly ignore small amounts of causation. For instance, the location of nearby parked cars influences the smashing of a window by a rock in virtue of small gravitational effects of the cars on the flight of the rock. But it’s very little influence, and we properly ignore it most of the time.

There are two other notable features of “Causation as Influence”. It contains Lewis’s most comprehensive defence of the transitivity of causation. This principle was central to Lewis’s theory of causation from the earliest days, but had come under sustained attack over the years. And the paper has a brief attack on non-Humean theories that take causation to be a primitive. Lewis says that these theories can’t explain the variety of causal relations that we perceive and can think about. These passages mark an interesting change in what Lewis took to be the primary alternatives to his counterfactuals based reductionism. In 1973 the opponents were other kinds of reductionists; in 2000 they were the non-reductionists.

5.3 Why Humean Supervenience

Given these concepts, a number of other concepts fall into place. Dispositions are reduced to counterfactual dependencies, though as is made clear in “Finkish Dispositions” (1997b), the reduction is not as simple as it might have seemed. Perception is reduced to dispositions and causes. (See, for instance, “Veridical Hallucination and Prosthetic Vision” (1980d).) We discussed the reduction of mental content to dispositions and causes in section 4. And we discussed the reduction of linguistic content to mental content in section 1. Values are reduced to mental states in “Dispositional Theories of Value” (1989b).

But we might worry about the very foundation of the project. We started with the assumption that our subvenient base consists of intrinsic properties of point-sized objects and spatiotemporal relations. But Bell’s inequality suggests that modern physics requires, as primitive, other relations between objects. (Or it requires intrinsic properties of dispersed objects.) So Humean supervenience fails in this world.

Lewis’s response is somewhat disarming. Writing in 1986, part of his response is scepticism about the state of quantum mechanics. (There is notably less scepticism in “How Many Lives Has Schrödinger’s Cat” (2004b).) But the larger part of his response is to suggest that scientific challenges to Humean supervenience are outside his responsibility.

Really, what I uphold is not so much the truth of Humean supervenience as the tenability of it. If physics itself were to teach me that it is false, I wouldn’t grieve ... What I want to fight are philosophical arguments against Humean supervenience. When philosophers claim that one or another common-place feature of the world cannot supervene on the arrangement of qualities, I make it my business to resist. Being a commonsensical fellow (except where unactualized possible worlds are concerned) I will seldom deny that the features in question exist. I grant their existence, and do my best to show how they can, after all, supervene on the arrangement of qualities. (1986b: xi)

We might wonder why Lewis found this such an interesting project. If physics teaches that Humean supervenience is false, why care whether there are also philosophical objections to it? There are two (related) reasons why we might care.

Recall that we said that Humean supervenience is a conjunction of several theses. One of these is a thesis about which perfectly natural properties are instantiated in this world, namely local ones. That thesis is threatened by modern physics. But the rest of the package, arguably, is not. In particular, the thesis that all facts supervene on the distribution of perfectly natural properties and relations does not appear to be threatened. (Though see Maudlin (2007: Ch. 2) for a dissenting view.) Nor is the thesis that perfectly natural properties and relations satisfy a principle of recombination threatened by modern physics. The rough idea of the principle of recombination is that any distribution of perfectly natural properties is possible. This thesis is Lewis’s version of the Humean principle that there are no necessary connections between distinct existences, and Lewis is determined to preserve as strong a version of it as he can.

Although physics does not seem to challenge these two theses, several philosophers do challenge them on distinctively philosophical grounds. Some of them suggest that the nomic, the intensional, or the normative do not supervene on the distribution of perfectly natural properties. Others suggest that the nomic, intentional, or normative properties are perfectly natural, and as a consequence perfectly natural properties are not freely recombinable. The philosophical arguments in favour of such positions rarely turn on the precise constitution of the Humean’s preferred subvenient base. If Lewis can show that such arguments fail in the setting of classical physics, then he’ll have refuted all of the arguments against Humean superveience that don’t rely on the details of modern physics. In practice that means he’ll have refuted many, though not quite all, of the objections to Humean supervenience.

A broader reason for Lewis to care about Humean supervenience comes from looking at his overall approach to metaphysics. When faced with something metaphysically problematic, say free will, there are three broad approaches. Some philosophers will argue that free will can’t be located in a scientific world-view, so it should be eliminated. Call these ‘the eliminativists’. Some philosophers will agree that free will can’t be located in the scientific world-view, so that’s a reason to expand our metaphysical picture to include free will, perhaps as a new primitive. Call these ‘the expansionists’. And some philosophers will reject the common assumption of an incompatibility. Instead they will argue that we can have free will without believing in anything that isn’t in the scientific picture. Call these ‘the compatibilists’.

As the above quote makes clear, Lewis was a compatibilist about most questions in metaphysics. He certainly was one about free will. (“Are We Free to Break the Laws?” (1981a).) And he was a compatibilist about most nomic, intentional and normative concepts. This wasn’t because he had a global argument for compatibilism. Indeed, he was an eliminativist about religion (“Anselm and Actuality” (1970a), “Divine Evil” (2007)). And in some sense he was an expansionist about modality. Lewis may have contested this; he thought introducing more worlds did not increase the number of kinds of things in our ontology, because we are already committed to there being at least one world. As Melia (1992: 192) points out though, the inhabitants of those worlds include all kinds of things not found in, or reducible to, fundamental physics. They include spirits, gods, trolls and every other consistent beast imaginable. So at least when it came to what there is, as opposed to what there actually is, Lewis’s ontology was rather expansionist.

For all that, Lewis’s default attitude was to accept that much of our common-sense thinking about the nomic, the intentional and the normative was correct, and that this was perfectly compatible with this world containing nothing more than is found in science, indeed than is found in fundamental physics.

Compatibilists should solve what Frank Jackson calls ‘the location problem’ (Jackson 1998). If you think that there are, say, beliefs, and you think that having beliefs in one’s metaphysics doesn’t commit you to having anything in your ontology beyond fundamental physics, then you should, as Jackson puts it, be able to locate beliefs in the world described by fundamental physics. More generally, for whatever you accept, you should be able to locate it in the picture of the world you accept.

This was certainly the methodology that Lewis accepted. And since he thought that so much of our common sense worldview was compatible with fundamental physics, he had many versions of the location problem to solve. One way to go about this would be to find exactly what the correct scientific theory is, and locate all the relevant properties in that picture. But this method has some shortcomings. For one thing, it might mean having to throw out your metaphysical work whenever the scientific theories change. For another, it means having your metaphysics caught up in debates about the best scientific theories, and about their interpretation. So Lewis took a somewhat different approach.

What Lewis’s defence of Humean supervenience gives us is a recipe for locating the nomic, intentional and normative properties in a physical world. And it is a recipe that uses remarkably few ingredients; just intrinsic properties of point-sized objects, and spatio-temporal relations. It is likely that ideal physics will have more in it than that. For instance, it might have entanglement relations, as are needed to explain Bell’s inequality. But it is unlikely to have less. And the more there is in fundamental physics, the easier it is to solve the location problem, because the would-be locator has more resources to work with.

The upshot of all this is that a philosophical defence of Humean supervenience, especially a defence like Lewis’s that shows us explicitly how to locate various folk properties in classical physics, is likely to show us how to locate those properties in more up-to-date physics. So Lewis’s defence of Humean supervenience then generalises into a defence of the compatibility of large swathes of folk theory with ideal physics. And the defence is consistent with the realist principle that truth supervenes on being, and with the Humean denial of necessary connections between distinct existences. And that, quite clearly, is a philosophically interesting project.

6. Modal Realism

This entry has been stressing Lewis’s many and diverse contributions to philosophy. But there is one thesis with which he is associated above all others: modal realism. Lewis held that this world was just one among many like it. A proposition, p is possibly true if and only if p is true in one of these worlds. Relatedly, he held that individuals like you or I (or this computer) only exist in one possible world. So what it is for a proposition like You are happy to be true in another world is not for you to be happy in that world; you aren’t in that world. Rather, it is for your counterpart to be happy in that world.

Lewis wrote about modal realism in many places. As early as Counterfactuals he wrote this famous passage.

I believe, and so do you, that things could have been different in countless ways. But what does this mean? Ordinary language permits the paraphrase: there are many ways things could have been besides the way they actually are. I believe that things could have been different in countless ways; I believe permissible paraphrases of what I believe; taking the paraphrase at its face value, I therefore believe in the existence of entities that might be called ‘ways things could have been.’ I prefer to call them ‘possible worlds.’ (1973a: 84)

And Lewis used counterpart theory throughout his career to resolve metaphysical puzzles in fields stretching from personal identity (“Counterparts of Persons and Their Bodies” (1971c)) to truthmaker theory (“Things qua Truthmakers” (2003b)). Indeed, Lewis’s original statement of counterpart theory is in one of his first published metaphysics papers (“Counterpart Theory and Quantified Modal Logic” (1968)).

But the canonical statement and defence of both modal realism and counterpart theory is in On the Plurality of Worlds (1986a), the book that grew out of his 1984 John Locke lectures. This section will follow the structure of that book.

The little ‘argument by paraphrase’ from Counterfactuals is a long way from an argument for Lewis’s form of modal realism. For one thing, the argument relies on taking a folksy paraphrase as metaphysically revealing; perhaps we would be better off treating this as just a careless manner of speaking. For another, the folksy paraphrase Lewis uses isn’t obviously innocuous; like many other abstraction principles it could be hiding a contradiction. And the argument does little to show that other possible worlds are concreta; talking of them as ways things could be makes them sound like properties, which are arguably abstracta if they exist at all. The first three chapters of Plurality address these three issues. The fourth chapter is an extended discussion of the place of individuals in modal realism. We’ll look at these chapters in order.

6.1 A Philosophers’ Paradise

The short argument from Counterfactuals that I quoted seems deeply unQuinean. Rather than saying that possible worlds exist because they are quantified over in the best paraphrase of our theories, Lewis says they exist because they are quantified over in just one paraphrase of our theories. To be sure, he says this is a permissible paraphrase. On the other hand, there is vanishingly little defence of its permissibility.

In the first chapter of Plurality Lewis takes a much more orthodox Quinean line. He argues, at great length, that the best version of many philosophical theories requires quantification over possibilities. In traditional terms, he offers an extended indispensability argument for unactualised possibilities. But traditional terms are perhaps misleading here. Lewis does not say that possibilities are absolutely indispensable, only that they make our philosophical theories so much better that we have sufficient reason to accept them.

There are four areas in which Lewis thinks that possible worlds earn their keep.

  • Modality: Traditional treatments of modal talk in terms of operators face several difficulties. They can’t, at least without significant cost, properly analyse talk about contingent existence, or talk about modal comparatives, or modal supervenience theses. All of these are easy to understand in terms of quantification across possibilities.
  • Closeness: Our best theory of counterfactuals, Lewis’s theory, relies on comparisons between possible worlds. Indeed, it relies on comparisons between this world and other worlds. Such talk will be hard to paraphrase away if worlds aren’t real.
  • Content: Lewis argues, in part following Stalnaker (1984), that our best theory of mental and verbal content analyses content in terms of sets of possibilities. This, in turn, requires that the possibilities exist.
  • Properties: We often appear to quantify over properties. The modal realist can take properties to be sets of possibilia, and take such quantification at face value. In his discussion of properties here, Lewis expands upon his theory of natural properties that he introduced in “New Work for a Theory of Universals”, and that we discussed in section 3.

After arguing that we are best off in all these areas of philosophy if we accept unactualised possibilities, Lewis spends the rest of chapter 1 saying what possible worlds are on his view. He isn’t yet arguing for this way of thinking about possible worlds; that will come in chapter 3. For now he is just describing what he takes to be the best theory of possible worlds. He holds that possible worlds are isolated; no part of one is spatio-temporally related to any other world. Indeed, he holds that lack of spatio-temporal relation (or something like it) is what marks individuals as being in different worlds. So his theory has the somewhat odd consequence that there could not have been two parts of the world that aren’t spatio-temporally connected. He holds that worlds are concrete, though spelling out just what the abstract/concrete distinction comes to in this context isn’t a trivial task. And he holds that worlds are plenitudinous, there are enough of them to do the work needed for an analysis of modality. This requires at least that they satisfy a principle of recombination. But since it is possible that things are different in kind to anything that actually exists, plenitude implies that there are worlds that can’t be made by simply putting parts of this world together. (Alastair Wilson (forthcoming) has a good survey of the complicated relationship between plenitude and recombination.)

6.2 Paradox in Paradise?

Chapter 2 deals with several objections to modal realism. Some of these objections claim that modal realism leads to paradox. Other objections claim that it undermines our ordinary practice. We will look at two examples of each.

Peter Forrest and D. M. Armstrong (1984) argue that modal realism leads to problems given the principle of recombination. An unrestricted principle of recombination says that for any things that could exist, there is a world in which there is a duplicate of all of them. Forrest and Armstrong apply the principle by taking the things to be the different possible worlds. A world containing a duplicate of all the worlds would, they show, be bigger than any world. But by the principle it would also be a world. Contradiction. Lewis’ reply is to deny the unrestricted version of the principle. He insists that there is independent reason to qualify the principle to those things whose size and shape permits them to be fit into a single world. Without an unrestricted principle of recombination, there is no way to create the large world that’s at the heart of Forrest and Armstrong’s paradox.

David Kaplan argued that there could be no cardinality of the worlds. Kaplan did not publish this argument, so Lewis replies to the version presented by Martin Davies (1981: 262). On Lewis’s theory, every set of worlds is a proposition. For any proposition, says Kaplan, that proposition might be the only proposition being thought by a person at location l at time t. So for each proposition, there is a world where it (alone) is thought by a person at location l at time t. That means there is a one-one correspondence between the sets of worlds and a subset of the worlds. Contradiction. Lewis’s reply is to deny that every proposition can be thought. He claims that functionalism about belief, plus the requirement that beliefs latch onto relatively natural properties, mean that most propositions cannot be thought, and this blocks the paradox.

Peter Forrest (1982) argues that modal realism leads to inductive scepticism. According to modal realism, there are other thinkers very much like us who are deceived by their surroundings. Given this, we should doubt our inductive inferences. Lewis’s reply is that modal realism does not make inductive challenges any worse than they were before. It is common ground that inductive inference is fallible. That is, it is common ground that these inferences could fail. Thinking of the possibilities of failure as concrete individuals might focus the mind on them, and hence make us less confident, but does not seem to change the inference’s justificatory status. Lewis’s argument seems hard to dispute here. Given the mutually agreed upon fact that the inference could fail, it’s hard to see what epistemological cost is incurred by agreeing that it does fail for someone kind of like the inferrer in a distant possible world.

Robert Adams (1974) argues that modal realism leads to surprising results in moral philosophy. The modal realist says that the way things are, in the broadest possible sense, is not a contingent matter, since we can’t change the nature of the pluriverse. Hence we cannot do anything about it. So if moral requirements flow from a requirement to improve the way things are, in this broadest possible sense, then there are no moral requirements. Lewis rejects the antecedent of this conditional as something that only an extreme utilitarian could accept. What is crucial about morality is that we not do evil. Even if their actions won’t make a difference to the nature of the pluriverse, a virtuous agent will not want to, for instance, cause suffering. By rejecting the view that in our moral deliberations we should care about everyone, possible and actual, equally, Lewis avoids the problem.

6.3 Paradise on the Cheap?

In chapter 3 Lewis looks at the alternatives to his kind of modal realism. He takes himself to have established that we need to have possible worlds of some kind in our ontology, but not that these possible worlds must be concrete. In particular, they can be abstract, or what he calls “ersatz” possible worlds. Lewis does not have a single knock-down argument against all forms of ersatzism. Instead he divides the space of possible ersatzist positions into three, and launches different attacks against different ones.

Lewis starts with what he calls “linguistic ersatzism”. This is the view that ersatz possible worlds are representations, and the way they represent possibilities is something like the way that language represents possibilities. In particular, they represent possibilities without resembling possibilities, but instead in virtue of structural features of the representation.

He levels three main objections to linguistic ersatzism. First, it takes modality as a primitive, rather than reducing modality to something simpler (like concrete possible worlds). Second, it can’t distinguish qualitatively similar individuals in other possible worlds. Lewis argues that will mean that we can’t always quantify over possibilia, as we can in his theory. Third, it can’t allow as full a range of ‘alien’, i.e. uninstantiated, natural properties as we would like. Sider (2002) has replied that some of these challenges can be met, or at least reduced in intensity, if we take the pluriverse (i.e. the plurality of worlds) to be what is represented, rather than the individual worlds.

The second theory he considers is what he calls “pictoral ersatzism”. This is the view that ersatz possible worlds are representations, and the way they represent possibilities is something like the way that pictures or models represent possibilities. That is, they represent by being similar, in a crucial respect, to what they are representing. The pictoral ersatzist, says Lewis, is caught in something of a bind. If the representations are not detailed enough, they will not give us enough possibilities to do the job that possible worlds need to do. If they are detailed enough to do that job, and they represent by resembling possibilities, then arguably they will contain as much problematic ontology as Lewisian concrete possible worlds. So they have the costs of Lewis’s theory without any obvious advantage.

The final theory he considers is what he calls “magical ersatzism”. Unlike the previous two theories, this theory is defined negatively. The magical ersatzist is defined by their denial that possible worlds represent, or at least that they represent in either of the two ways (linguistic and pictoral) that we are familiar with. And Lewis’s primary complaint is that this kind of theory is mysterious, and that it could only seem attractive if it hides from view the parts of the theory that are doing the philosophical work. Lewis argues that as soon as we ask simple questions about the relationship that holds between a possibility and actuality if that possibility is actualised, such as whether this is an internal or external relation, we find the magical ersatzist saying things that are either implausible or mysterious.

It isn’t clear just who is a magical ersatzist. Lewis wrote that at the time he wrote Plurality no one explicitly endorsed this theory. This was perhaps unfair to various primitivists about modality, such as Adams (1974), Plantinga (1974) and Stalnaker (1976). Given the negative definition of magical ersatzism, and given the fact that primitivists do not think that possible worlds represent possibilities via any familiar mechanism, it seems the primitivists should count as magical ersatzists, or, as Lewis calls them, “magicians”. In any case, if magical ersatzism, in all its varieties, is objectionably mysterious, that suggests ersatzism is in trouble, and hence if we want the benefits of possible worlds, we have to pay for them by accepting concrete possible worlds.

6.4 Counterparts or Double Lives?

The last chapter of Plurality changes tack somewhat. Instead of focussing on different ways the world could be, Lewis’s focus becomes different ways things could be. The chapter defends, and expands upon, Lewis’s counterpart theory.

Counterpart theory was first introduced by Lewis in “Counterpart Theory and Quantified Modal Logic” (1968) as a way of making modal discourse extensional. Instead of worrying just what a name inside the scope of a modal operator might mean, we translate the language of quantified modal logic into a language without operators, but with quantifiers over worlds and other non-actual individuals. So instead of saying □Fa, we say ∀wx ((WwIxwCxa) ⊃ Fx). That is, for all w and x, if w is a world, and x is in w, and x is a counterpart of a, then Fx. Or, more intuitively, all of a’s counterparts are F. The paper shows how we can extend this intuitive idea into a complete translation from the language of quantfied modal logic to the language of counterpart theory. In “Tensions” (1974a) Lewis retracts the claim that it is an advantage of counterpart theory over quantified modal logic that it is extensional rather than intensional, largely because he finds the distinction between these two notions much more elusive than he had thought. But he still thought counterpart theory had a lot of advantages, and these were pressed in chapter 4.

The intuitive idea behind counterpart theory was that individuals, at least ordinary individuals of the kind we regularly talk about, are world-bound. That is, they exist in only one world. But they do not have all of their properties essentially. We can truly say of a non-contender, say Malloy, that he could have been a contender. In the language of possible worlds, there is a possible world w such that, according to it, Malloy is a contender. But what in turn does this mean? Does it mean that Malloy himself is in w? Not really, according to counterpart theory. Rather, a counterpart of Malloy’s is a contender in w. And Malloy himself has the modal property could have been a contender in virtue of having a counterpart in w who is a contender. This way of thinking about modal properties of individuals has, claims Lewis, a number of advantages.

For one thing, it avoids an odd kind of inconsistency. Malloy might not only have been a contender, he might have been 6 inches taller. If we think that is because there is a world in which Malloy himself is 6 inches taller, then it seems like we’re saying that Malloy can have two heights, his actual height and one 6 inches taller. And that looks inconsistent. The obvious way out of this is to say that he bears one height in relation to this world, and another to another world. But that turns height from an intrinsic property into a relation, and that seems like a mistake. Lewis thinks this problem, what he dubs the ‘problem of accidental intrinsics’, is a reason to deny that Malloy himself is in multiple worlds.

For another, it allows us a kind of inconstancy in our modal predications. Could Malloy have been brought by a stork, or must he have had the parents he actually had? In some moods we think one, in other moods we think another. Lewis thinks that counterpart theory can reflect our indecision. There is a world with someone brought by a stork who has a life much like Malloy’s. Is he one of Malloy’s counterparts? Well, he is according to some counterpart relations, and not according to others. When one of the former relations is contextually salient, it’s true to say that Malloy could have been brought by a stork. When more demanding counterpart relations are salient, he isn’t one of Malloy’s counterparts, and indeed all of Malloy’s counterparts share his parents. (More precisely, all of his counterparts have parents who are counterparts of Malloy’s actual parents.) In those contexts, it is true to say that one’s parentage is essential. Throughout his career, Lewis uses this inconstancy of the counterpart relation to resolve all manner of metaphysical puzzles, from puzzles about personal identity (1971c) to puzzles about truthmakers (2003b). The final section of Plurality is Lewis’s most extended argument that this variability of the counterpart relation is a strength, not a weakness, of the theory.

7. Other Writings

Lewis wrote a lot that isn’t covered by the broad categories we’ve discussed so far. The point of this section is to provide a sample of that material. It isn’t close to being comprehensive. It doesn’t include his treatment of qualia in (1988h) and (1995b). It doesn’t include his contributions to causal decision theory in (1979e) and (1981b). It goes very quickly over his many papers in ethics. And it skips his contributions to debates about non-classical logics, such as (1982c) and (1990). We’ve tried to restrict attention to those areas where Lewis’s contributions were groundbreaking, influential, and set out a new positive theory. Shockingly, there is a lot to cover that meets those constraints, and is not included in the above survey of the major themes of his philosophy.

7.1 Mathematics and Mereology

Parts of Classes (1991a) and “Mathematics is Megethology” (1993d) consider the distinctive philosophical problems raised by set theory. As Lewis notes, it is widely held that all of mathematics reduces to set theory. But there is little consensus about what the metaphysics of set theory is. Lewis puts forward two proposals that might, collectively, help to clarify matters.

The first proposal is what he calls the Main Thesis: “The parts of a class are all and only its subclasses” (1991a: 7). By ‘class’ here, Lewis does not mean ‘set’. Classes are things with members. Some classes are proper classes, and hence not sets. And one set, the null set, has no members, so is not a class. Individuals, for Lewis, are things without members. Since the null set has no members, it is an individual. But the overlap between the sets and the classes is large; most sets we think about are classes.

The big payoff of the Main Thesis is that it reduces the mysteries of set theory to a single mystery. Any class is a fusion of singletons, i.e., sets with one member. If we understand what a singleton is, and we understand what fusions are, then we understand all there is to know about classes, and about sets. That’s because any set is just the fusion of the singletons of its members.

But singletons are deeply mysterious. The usual metaphors that are used to introduce sets, metaphors about combining or collecting or gathering multiple things into one are less than useless when it comes to understanding the relationship between a singleton and its member. In (1993d), Lewis settles for a structuralist understanding of singletons. He also says that he “argued (somewhat reluctantly) for a structuralist’ approach to the theory of singleton functions” in (1991a), though on page 54 of (1991a) he appears to offer qualified resistance to structuralism.

One of the technical advances of (1991a) and (1993d) was that they showed how a structuralist account of set theory was even possible. This part of the work was co-authored with John P. Burgess and A. P. Hazen. Given a large enough universe (i.e., that the cardinality of the mereological atoms is an inaccessible cardinal), and given plural quantification, we can say exactly what constraints a function must satisfy for it to do the work we want the singleton function to do. (By ‘the singleton function’ I mean the function that maps anything that has a singleton onto its singleton. Since proper classes don’t have singletons, and nor do fusions of sets and objects, this will be a partial function.) Given that, we can understand mathematical claims made in terms of sets/classes as quantifications over singleton functions. That is, we can understand any claim that would previous have used ‘the’ singleton function as a claim of the form for all s: …ss…, where the terms s go where we would previously have referred to ‘the’ singleton function. It is provable that this translation won’t introduce any inconsistency into mathematics (since there are values for s), or any indeterminacy (since the embedded sentence …ss… has the same truth value for any eligible value for s).

Should we then adopt this structuralist account, and say that we have removed the mysteries of mathematics? As noted above, Lewis is uncharacteristically equivocal on this point, and seemed to change his mind about whether structuralism was, all things considered, a good or a bad deal. His equivocation comes from two sources. One worry is that when we work through the details, some of the mysteries of set theory seem to have been relocated rather than solved. For instance, if we antecedently understood the singleton function, we might have thought it could be used to explain why the set theoretic universe is so large. Now we have to simply posit a very large universe. Another is that the proposal is in some way revisionary, since it takes ordinary mathematical talk to be surreptitiously quantificational. Parts of Classes contains some famous invective directed against philosophers who seek to overturn established science on philosophical grounds.

I’m moved to laughter at the thought of how presumptous it would be to reject mathematics for philosophical reasons. How would you like the job of telling the mathematicians that they must change their ways, and abjure countless errors, now that philosophy has discovered that there are no classes? Can you tell them, with a straight face, to follow philosophical argument wherever it may lead? If they challenge your credentials, will you boast of philosophy’s other great discoveries: that motion is impossible, that a Being than which no greater can be conceived cannot be conceived not to exist, that it is unthinkable that anything exists outside the mind, that time is unreal, that no theory has ever been made at all probable by evidence (but on the other hand that an empirically adequate ideal theory cannot possibly be false), that it is a wide-open scientific question whether anyone has ever believed anything, and so on, and on, ad nauseum? Not me! (1991a: 59)

And yet Lewis’s positive theory here is somewhat revisionary. It doesn’t revise the truth value of any mathematical claim, but it does revise the understanding of them. Is even this too much revision to make on philosophical grounds? Perhaps not, but it is worrying enough for Lewis to conclude merely that the theory he proposes seems better than the alternatives, not that there is a compelling positive case for its truth.

7.2 Philosophy of Language

Lewis’s major contribution to formal semantics was his theory of counterfactual conditionals. But there were several other contributions that he made, both on specific topics in formal semantics, and on the role of semantic theory.

In “Adverbs of Quantification” (1975a), Lewis notes several difficulties in translating sentences involving “usually”, “frequently”, “rarely” or related adverbs into first-order logic or some similar formal system. Lewis’s solution to the puzzles raised involves two formal advances. First, he treats the adverbs as unselective quantifiers, binding all free variables in their scope. The second advance concerns the if-clauses in sentences like Usually, if a team plays well, they win. It is difficult for various reasons to take the structure of this sentence to involve a quantifier over a compound sentence with a conditional connective. Lewis’s second advance is to say that these if-clauses are simply domain restrictors. The ‘if’ is no more a sentential connective than the ‘and’ in New York is between Boston and Washington. Instead, the if-clause restricts what things the quantifier denoted by ‘usually’ ranges over.

This paper is not widely read by philosophers, but it has been very influential among linguists, especially semanticists. Indeed, its uptake by semanticists has made it the fourth most cited paper of Lewis’s on Google Scholar. His most cited paper on Google Scholar is also in philosophy of language; it is “Scorekeeping in a Language Game” (1979f).

That paper is about conversational dynamics. Lewis develops an extended analogy between the role of context in a conversation and the role of score in a baseball game. One central role of the score is to keep a record of what has already happened. In that way, score is influenced by what happens on the field, or in the conversation. But the causal influence runs in the other way as well. Some events on the field are influenced by the score. You’re only out after the third strike, for example. Similarly, Lewis holds that context (or the conversational score) can influence, or even be partially constitutive of, what happens in the conversation. If I say “None of the cats are afraid of Barney”, which cats I’ve managed to talk about depends on which cats are conversationally salient. And in saying this, I’ve made Barney salient, so the score changes in that respect. That change matters; now I can denote Barney by “he”.

Lewis argues that this model can make sense of a number of otherwise puzzling features of language. One notable example of this involves quantification. Most quantifiers we use do not range over the entire universe. We quantify only over a restricted range. Lewis says that it is the salient objects. He also says that this happens not just when we explicitly quantify, but also when we use terms that have a quantificational analysis. He mentions in passing that “knows” might be one such term.

This idea is developed more fully in “Elusive Knowledge” (1996b). Lewis argues that S knows that p is true iff S is in a position to rule out all possibilities in which p is false. But when we say S knows that p, we don’t mean to quantify over all possibilities there are, only over the salient possibilities. The big advantage of Lewis’s approach is that it lets him explain the appeal of scepticism. When the sceptic starts talking about fantastic possibilities of error, she makes those possibilities salient. Since we can’t rule them out, when we’re talking to the sceptic we can’t say we know very much. But since those possibilities aren’t usually salient, we are usually correct in our knowledge-ascriptions. So Lewis lets the sceptic win any debate they are in, without conceding that ordinary knowledge-ascriptions are false.

The kind of position Lewis defends here, which came to be known as contextualism, has been a central focus of inquiry in epistemology for the last fifteen years. “Elusive Knowledge”, along with papers such as Cohen (1986) and DeRose (1995) founded this research program.

7.3 Bayesian Philosophy

This subsection is largely about two pairs of papers: “Probabilities of Conditionals and Conditional Probabilities” (1976b) and its sequel (1986h), and “Desire as Belief” (1988b) and its sequel (1996a). The papers have more in common than merely having a common naming convention. (They’re not even Lewis’s only sequels; “Lucas Against Mechanism” (1969b) also has a sequel (1979d).) In both cases Lewis aims to defend orthodox Bayesian epistemology against some challenges. And in both cases the argument turns on principles to do with updating. Lewis was throughout his career a Bayesian; he frequently said that the ideal epistemic agent was a Bayesian conditionaliser and expected utility maximiser. And he defended this position with some gusto.

The conditionals papers concern a position that was gaining popularity before Lewis showed it was untenable. The position in question starts with the idea that a speaker can properly say Probably, if p, q if and only if their subjective probability of q given p is high. And the position then offers an explanation of this purported fact. The English word ‘if’ is a binary connective which forms a sentence to be written as pq, and it is true in virtue of the meaning of this connective that Pr(q | p) = Pr(pq). So, assuming ‘probably’ means something like subjective probability Probably, if p, q means that the subjective probability of pq, and, assuming the agent is coherent, that is true just in case the subjective probability of q given p is high.

Lewis doubted several aspects of this story. He briefly notes in “Adverbs of Quantification” that he didn’t think the ‘if’ in Probably, if p, q is a binary connective. But the more telling objection was his proof that there could not be a connective → such that for all p, q, Pr(q | p) = Pr(pq). Lewis first argued for this in (1976b), and showed how to weaken some of the assumptions of the argument in (1986h). The effect of Lewis’s position was to essentially end the hope of analysing English ‘if’ in terms of a binary connective with these probabilistic properties.

The desire papers (1988a, 1996b) are also about the Humean view that motivation requires both a belief and a desire. Lewis aims to attack the anti-Humean position that some beliefs, in particular beliefs that a certain thing is good, can play the functional roles of both beliefs and desires. He argues that this is not, in general, possible. And the argument is that beliefs and desires update in different ways. Or, at least, that anyone who updates their beliefs by conditionalisation and updates their valuation functions in a plausible way, will not be able to preserve a perfect correlation between their desire for a proposition being true and their belief in that proposition’s goodness.

Both of these papers rely on the idea that conditionalisation is a good way to update beliefs. Neither, by the way, rely on the idea that conditionalisation is the only rational way to update beliefs; the arguments go through given merely the permissibility of conditionalising. Many Bayesians hold something stronger, namely that conditionalisation is the way to update beliefs. One widely used argument in favour of this position is a so-called ‘Dutch Book’ argument. This argument shows that if you plan to follow any strategy for revising beliefs other than conditionalisation, and you do follow that strategy, then someone who knows the strategy that you’re going to follow can produce a series of bets that will seem favourable to you when each is offered, but which will collectively lead to a sure loss. It is also true that if you do update by conditionalisation, there is no similar Dutch Book that can be made, but Lewis did not prove this. (It is Theorem V in Skyrms (1987).) The Dutch Book argument for conditionalisation was introduced to the literature by Paul Teller (1976), who credited it to Lewis. Lewis’s own version of the argument did not appear until 1999, in Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology, under the title “Why Conditionalize?” (1999b). This was something he had written as a course handout in 1972, and which had been very widely circulated, and, via Teller’s paper, very influential on the development of Bayesian epistemology.

Lewis was an early proponent of one of the two major views about the Sleeping Beauty puzzle, which is nicely described in Sorensen 2009:

Sleeping Beauty is an ideal reasoner who knows she will be given a sleeping pill that induces limited amnesia. She knows that after she falls asleep a coin will be flipped. If it lands heads, she will be awakened on Monday and asked: “What is the probability that the coin landed heads?”. She will not be informed which day it is. If the coin lands tails, she will be awaken on both Monday and on Tuesday and asked the same question each time. The amnesia insures that, if awakened on Tuesday she will not remember being woken on Monday. What will her answer be to the questions?

The puzzle was introduced to the philosophical community by Adam Elga (2000), who argued that when Beauty woke up, her credence in Heads should be 13. Lewis argued that the correct answer was 12. The core of his argument was that before Beauty went to sleep, her credence in Heads should be 12. That was agreed on all sides. Moreover, nothing happened that surprised Beauty. Indeed, everything happened exactly as she expected it would. Lewis argued that “Only new relevant evidence, centred or uncentred, produces a change in credence” (2001c: 174), and that Beauty got no new evidence. This idea has featured heavily in subsequent work defending the 12 answer to the Sleeping Beauty puzzle.

The Sleeping Beauty puzzle is important for another reason. As the quote above indicates, the puzzle is usually set up in terms of sets of centered worlds, following the work of Lewis we described in section 4.5. The work generated by the puzzle has been one of the reasons that that work, in particular (1979b), has received a large amount of attention in recent years.

7.4 Philosophy of Religion

In “Anselm and Actuality” (1970a), Lewis tries to give as good a formulation of the ontological argument as can be made in modal realist terms. This is a good framework for discussing the ontological argument, since on one interpretation, the argument rests crucially on cross-world comparisons of greatness and the modal realist can make sense of that kind of talk better than views that reject possible objects. Lewis argues that the principle “A being than which nothing greater can be conceived is possible” is crucially ambiguous. One kind of reading is that the imagined being’s greatness in its world is greater than the greatness of any other being in that being’s world. That may be true, but it doesn’t imply that the being actually exists. Another kind of reading focusses on the imagined being’s greatness in this world. It says that there (actually) is a being whose actual greatness is greater than the greatness of any possible being. That entails the conclusion, but is not plausibly true. The broader conclusion here, that the ontological argument derives its persuasive force from an equivocation, is one that has been widely adopted since Lewis’s paper.

In “Evil for Freedom’s Sake” (1993b), Lewis reflects at length on the free will defence to the problem of evil. Lewis argues that for the defence to work, God must make quite different trade-offs between freedom and welfare than we are usually disposed to make, and our understanding of what freedom consists in, and what divine foreknowledge consists in, must be different to what they currently are.

In “Do We Believe in Penal Substitution?” (1997a), Lewis notes that we only sometimes accept that one person can be properly punished for another’s misdeeds. He uses this to raise an interesting difficulty for the Christian idea that Christ died for our sins, suggesting this may not be a form of penal substitution that is normally acceptable.

In “Divine Evil” (2007), Lewis suggests that proponents of the problem of evil should not focus on what God fails to prevent, but on what God does. In orthodox forms of theism, particularly Christianity and Islam, God is presented as perpetrating great evil against sinners of various stripes in the form of extreme punishments in the afterlife. Lewis suggests that a God that does would be so evil that we should not only reject Him, but we may regard those who endorse the divine punishments as themselves somewhat culpable for divine evil. (The published version of this paper was composed by Phillip Kitcher after Lewis’s death from notes Lewis made, and conversations Kitcher had with Lewis.)

7.5 Ethics

Lewis is obviously not as well known for his work in ethics as for his work in other areas of philosophy. It was something of a surprise when one of the volumes of his collected papers was called Papers in Ethics and Social Philosophy (2000a). On the other hand, the existence of this volume indicates that there is a large body of work that Lewis put together in moral philosophy, very broadly construed. There is very little secondary literature on Lewis’s ethics. I’m drawing heavily here on chapter 8 of Nolan (2005), and Keller (2015).

As Nolan suggests, the least inaccurate summary of Lewis’s ethical positions is that he was a virtue ethicist. Indeed, a focus on virtue, as opposed to consequences, plays a role in his defence of modal realism, as we saw in section 6.4. Nolan also notes that this position is somewhat surprising. Most philosophers who accept views related to Lewis’s about psychology and decision-making (in particular, who accept a Humean story about beliefs and desires being the basis for motivation, and who accept some or other version of expected utility maximisation as the basis for rational decision) have broadly consequentialist positions. But not Lewis.

Lewis was also a value pluralist (1984a, 1989b, 1993b). Indeed, this was part of his objection to consequentialism. He rejected the idea that there was one summary judgment we could make about the moral value of a person. In “Reply to McMichael” (1978a) he complains about the utilitarian assumption that “any sort or amount of evil can be neutralized, as if it had never been, by enough countervailing good —and that the balancing evil and good may be entirely unrelated” (1978a: 85).

In meta-ethics, Lewis defended a variety of subjectivism (1989b). Like many subjectivists, Lewis held that something is valuable for us if and only if we would value it under ideal circumstances. And he held, following Frankfurt (1971), that valuing something is simply desiring to desire it. What is distinctive about Lewis’s position is his view about what ideal circumstances are. He thinks they are circumstances of “full imaginative acquaintance”. This has some interesting consequences. In particular, it allows Lewis to say that different goods have different conditions of full imaginative acquaintance. It might, he suggests, be impossible to properly imagine instantiating several different values at once. And that in turn lets him argue that his value pluralism is consistent with this kind of subjectivism, in a way that it might not be consistent with other varieties of subjectivism.

Lewis also wrote several more papers in applied ethics. In two interesting papers on tolerance (1989a, 1989d), he suggests that one reason for being tolerant, and especially of being tolerant of speech we disapprove of, comes from game-theoretic considerations. In particular, he thinks our motivation for tolerance comes from forming a ‘tacit treaty’ with those with differing views. If we agree not to press our numerical superiority to repress them when we are in the majority, they will do the same. So tolerating opposing views may be an optimal strategy for anyone who isn’t sure that they will be in the majority indefinitely. In these works it is easy to see the legacies of Lewis’s early work on philosophical lessons to be drawn from game theory, and especially from the work of Thomas Schelling.

7.6 Applied Metaphysics

There’s much more that could be said about Lewis’s contributions to philosophy, but we’ll end with a discussion of two wonderful pieces of applied metaphysics.

In “The Paradoxes of Time Travel” (1976d), Lewis discusses the many complicated philosophical issues about time travel. He discusses temporal parts, personal identity, causation and causal loops, free will, and the complications arising from our many different modal concepts. In some cases he uses the canvas provided to illustrate his own take on the metaphysical issues that arise. But in some cases he notes that the problems that arise are problems for everyone.

“Holes” (Lewis and Lewis 1970) was co-written with Stephanie Lewis. In it they discuss, in dialog form, some of the metaphysical issues that holes generate. One of the characters, Argle, wants to eliminate holes from his ontology, and the paper goes over what costs must be met to make this form of nominalism work. The other character, Bargle, pushes Argle to clarify his commitments, and in doing so draws out many details of the nominalist framework. The case is of some interest in itself, but it is also, as the authors note at the end, a useful case-study in the kind of moves nominalists can make in eliminating unwanted ontology, and the costs of those moves.

Each paper can be, and indeed often has been, used for introducing complicated metaphysical issues to students. The papers are, like many of Lewis’s papers, widely anthologised. They are both excellent illustrations of the fact that, as well as being a wonderful philosopher, Lewis was one of the best philosophical writers of his time.


Primary Literature

  • 1966a, “An Argument for the Identity Theory,” Journal of Philosophy, 63: 17–25.
  • 1966b, “Percepts and Color Mosaics in Visual Experience,” Philosophical Review, 75: 357–368.
  • 1966 (with Jane S. Richardson), “Scriven on Human Unpredictability,” Philosophical Studies, 17: 69–74.
  • 1968, “Counterpart Theory and Quantified Modal Logic,” Journal of Philosophy, 65: 113–126.
  • 1968 (with Wilfrid Hodges), “Finitude and Infinitude in the Atomic Calculus of Individuals,” Noûs, 2: 405–410.
  • 1969a, Convention: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • 1969b, “Lucas against Mechanism,” Philosophy, 44: 231–233.
  • 1969c, “Policing the Aufbau,” Philosophical Studies, 20: 13–17.
  • 1969d, Review of Capitan and Merrill (eds.), Art, Mind, and Religion, Journal of Philosophy, 66: 22–27.
  • 1970a, “Anselm and Actuality,” Noûs, 4: 175–188.
  • 1970b, “General Semantics,” Synthese, 22: 18–67.
  • 1970c, “How to Define Theoretical Terms,” Journal of Philosophy, 67: 427–446.
  • 1970d, “Nominalistic Set Theory,” Noûs, 4: 225–240.
  • 1970 (with Stephanie R. Lewis), “Holes,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 48: 206–212.
  • 1971a, “Analog and Digital,” Noûs, 5: 321–327.
  • 1971b, “Completeness and Decidability of Three Logics of Counterfactual Conditionals,” Theoria, 37: 74–85.
  • 1971c, “Counterparts of Persons and Their Bodies,” Journal of Philosophy, 68: 203–211.
  • 1971d, “Immodest Inductive Methods,” Philosophy of Science, 38: 54–63.
  • 1972a, “Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50: 249–258.
  • 1972b, “Utilitarianism and Truthfulness,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50: 17–19.
  • 1973a, Counterfactuals, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers and Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1973, Reprinted with revisions, 1986.
  • 1973b, “Causation,” Journal of Philosophy, 70: 556–567.
  • 1973c, “Counterfactuals and Comparative Possibility,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 2: 418–446.
  • 1973d, “Lingue e lingua,” Versus, 4: 2–21.
  • 1974a, “Tensions,” in Milton K. Munitz and Peter K. Unger (eds.), Semantics and Philosophy, New York: New York University Press, pp. 49–61.
  • 1974b, “Intensional Logics Without Iterative Axioms,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 3: 457–466.
  • 1974c, “Radical Interpretation,” Synthese, 23: 331–344.
  • 1974d, “Semantic Analyses for Dyadic Deontic Logic,” in Sören Stenlund (ed.), Logical Theory and Semantic Analysis: Essays Dedicated to Stig Kanger on His Fiftieth Birthday, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 1–14.
  • 1974e, “Spielman and Lewis on Inductive Immodesty,” Philosophy of Science, 41: 84–85.
  • 1975a, “Adverbs of Quantification,” in Edward L. Keenan (ed.), Formal Semantics of Natural Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 3–15.
  • 1975b, “Languages and Language,” in Keith Gunderson (ed.), Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Volume VII, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 3–35.
  • 1975 (with Stephanie R. Lewis), Review of Olson and Paul, Contemporary Philosophy in Scandinavia, Theoria, 41: 39–60.
  • 1976a, “Convention: Reply to Jamieson,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 6: 113–120.
  • 1976b, “Probabilities of Conditionals and Conditional Probabilities,” Philosophical Review, 85: 297–315.
  • 1976c, “Survival and Identity,” in Amélie O. Rorty (ed.), The Identities of Persons, Berkeley: University of California Press, pp. 17–40.
  • 1976d, “The Paradoxes of Time Travel,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 13: 145–152.
  • 1977a, “Possible-World Semantics for Counterfactual Logics: A Rejoinder,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 6: 359–363.
  • 1978a, “Reply to McMichael,” Analysis, 38: 85–86.
  • 1978b, “Truth in Fiction,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 15: 37–46.
  • 1979a, “A Problem about Permission,” in E. Saarinen et al. (eds.), Essays in Honour of Jaakko Hintikka, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 163–175.
  • 1979b, “Attitudes De Dicto and De Se,” Philosophical Review, 88: 513–543.
  • 1979c, “Counterfactual Dependence and Time’s Arrow,” Noûs, 13: 455–476.
  • 1979d, “Lucas Against Mechanism II,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 9: 373–376.
  • 1979e, “Prisoners’ Dilemma is a Newcomb Problem,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 8: 235–240.
  • 1979f, “Scorekeeping in a Language Game,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8: 339–359.
  • 1980a, “A Subjectivist’s Guide to Objective Chance,” in Richard C. Jeffrey (ed.), Studies in Inductive Logic and Probability, Volume II, Berkeley: University of California Press, pp. 263–293.
  • 1980b, “Index, Context, and Content,” in Stig Kanger and Sven Öhman (eds.), Philosophy and Grammar, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 79–100.
  • 1980c, “Mad Pain and Martian Pain,” in Ned Block (ed.), Readings in Philosophy of Psychology, Volume I, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, pp. 216–32.
  • 1980d, “Veridical Hallucination and Prosthetic Vision,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 58: 239–249.
  • 1981a, “Are We Free to Break the Laws?,” Theoria, 47: 113–121.
  • 1981b, “Causal Decision Theory,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 59: 5–30.
  • 1981c, “Ordering Semantics and Premise Semantics for Counterfactuals,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 10: 217–234.
  • 1981d, “What Puzzling Pierre Does Not Believe,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 59: 283–289.
  • 1981e, “Why Ain’cha Rich?,” Noûs, 15: 377–380.
  • 1982a, “‘Whether’ Report,” in Tom Pauli (ed.), 320311: Philosophical Essays Dedicated to Lennart Åqvist on his Fiftieth Birthday, Uppsala: University of Uppsala Press, pp. 194–206.
  • 1982b, “Censored Vision,” Written under the name “Bruce LeCatt,”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 60: 158–162.
  • 1982c, “Logic for Equivocators,” Noûs, 16: 431–441.
  • 1983a, Philosophical Papers, Volume I, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1983b, “Extrinsic Properties,” Philosophical Studies, 44: 197–200.
  • 1983c, “Individuation by Acquaintance and by Stipulation,” Philosophical Review, 92: 3–32.
  • 1983d, “Levi Against U-Maximization,” Journal of Philosophy, 80: 531-534.
  • 1983e, “New Work For a Theory of Universals,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 61: 343–377.
  • 1984a, “Devil’s Bargains and the Real World,” in Douglas MacLean (ed.), The Security Gamble: Deterrence in the Nuclear Age, Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Allenheld, pp. 141–154.
  • 1984b, “Putnam’s Paradox,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 62: 221–236.
  • 1986a, On the Plurality of Worlds, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • 1986b, Philosophical Papers, Volume II, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1986c, “A Comment on Armstrong and Forrest,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 64: 92–93.
  • 1986d, “Against Structural Universals,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 64: 25–46.
  • 1986e, “Buy Like a MADman, Use Like a NUT” QQ 6: 5–8.
  • 1986f, “Causal Explanation” in Lewis 1986b, pp. 214–240.
  • 1986g, “Events” in Lewis 1986b, pp. 241–269.
  • 1986h, “Probabilities of Conditionals and Conditional Probabilities II,” Philosophical Review, 95: 581–589.
  • 1987, “The Punishment that Leaves Something to Chance,” Proceedings of the Russellian Society, University of Sydney, 12: 81–97.
  • 1988a, “Ayer’s First Empiricist Criterion of Meaning: Why Does it Fail?,” Analysis, 48: 1–3.
  • 1988b, “Desire as Belief,” Mind, 97: 323–332.
  • 1988c, “Rearrangement of Particles: Reply to Lowe,” Analysis, 48: 65–72.
  • 1988d, “Relevant Implication,” Theoria, 54: 162–174.
  • 1988e, “Statements Partly About Observation,” Philosophical Papers, 17: 1–31.
  • 1988f, “The Trap’s Dilemma,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 66: 220–223.
  • 1988g, “Vague identity: Evans misunderstood,” Analysis, 48: 128–130.
  • 1988h, “What Experience Teaches,” Proceedings of the Russellian Society, University of Sydney, 13: 29–57.
  • 1989a, “Academic Appointments: Why Ignore the Advantage of Being Right?,” in Ormond Papers, Ormond College, University of Melbourne. Reprinted in Lewis 2000a, pp. 187–200.
  • 1989b, “Dispositional Theories of Value,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 63: 113–137.
  • 1989c, “Finite Counterforce,” in Henry Shue (ed.), Nuclear Deterrence and Moral Restraint, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 51–114.
  • 1989d, “Mill and Milquetoast,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 67: 152–171.
  • 1989e, Review of John Bigelow, The Reality of Numbers, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 67: 487–489.
  • 1990, “Noneism or Allism?,” Mind, 99: 23–31.
  • 1991, Parts of Classes, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
  • 1992a, “Meaning Without Use: Reply to Hawthorne,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 70: 106–110.
  • 1992b, Critical Notice of Armstrong, A Combinatorial Theory of Possibility, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 70: 211–224.
  • 1993a, “Counterpart Theory, Quantified Modal Logic, and Extra Argument Places,” Analysis, 53: 69–71.
  • 1993b, “Evil for Freedom’s Sake?,” Philosophical Papers, 22: 149–172.
  • 1993c, “Many, But Almost One,” in Keith Campbell, John Bacon, and Lloyd Reinhardt (eds.), Ontology, Causality and Mind: Essays on the Philosophy of D. M. Armstrong, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 23–38.
  • 1993d, “Mathematics is Megethology,” Philosophia Mathematica, 3: 3–23.
  • 1994a, “Humean Supervenience Debugged,” Mind, 103: 473–490.
  • 1994b, “Reduction of Mind,” in Samuel Guttenplan (ed.), A Companion to Philosophy of Mind, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, pp. 412–431.
  • 1995a, “Ern Malley’s Namesake,” Quadrant, 39: 14–15.
  • 1995b, “Should a Materialist Believe in Qualia?,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 73: 140–144.
  • 1996a, “Desire as Belief II,” Mind, 105: 303–313.
  • 1996b, “Elusive Knowledge,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 74: 549–567.
  • 1996c, “Maudlin and Modal Mystery,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 74: 683–684.
  • 1996d, “Illusory Innocence?” review of Peter Unger, Living High and Letting Die, Eureka Street, 6, No. 10 December 1996: 35–36.
  • 1996 (with Stephanie R. Lewis), Review of R. Casati and A. Varzi, Holes, Philosophical Review, 105: 77–79.
  • 1997a, “Do We Believe in Penal Substitution?,” Philosophical Papers, 26: 203–209.
  • 1997b, “Finkish Dispositions,” Philosophical Quarterly, 47: 143–58.
  • 1998a, Papers in Philosophical Logic, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • 1997c, “Naming the Colours,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 75: 325–342.
  • 1998b, “A World of Truthmakers?” review of D. M. Armstrong, A World of States of Affairs, published under an incorrect title in Times Literary Supplement, 4950, 13 February 1998: 30.
  • 1998 (with Rae Langton), “Defining ‘Intrinsic’,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 58: 333–345.
  • 1999a, Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • 1999b, “Why Conditionalize?,” Written in 1972 as a course handout, but not published until 1999 in Lewis 1999a.
  • 1999c, “Zimmerman and the Spinning Sphere,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 77: 209–212.
  • 2000a, Papers in Ethics and Social Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • 2000b, “Causation as Influence” abridged version, Journal of Philosophy, 97: 182–197.
  • 2001a, “Forget About the ‘Correspondence Theory of Truth’,” Analysis, 61: 275–280.
  • 2001b, “Redefining ‘Intrinsic’,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 63: 381–398.
  • 2001c, “Sleeping Beauty: Reply to Elga,” Analysis, 61: 171–176.
  • 2001d, “Truthmaking and Difference-Making,” Noûs, 35: 602-615.
  • 2001 (with Rae Langton), “Marshall and Parsons on ‘Intrinsic’” Rae Langton, co-author, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 63: 353–355.
  • 2002a, “Tensing the Copula,” Mind, 111: 1–14.
  • 2002b, “Tharp’s Third Theorem,” Analysis, 62: 95–97.
  • 2003a, “Rights to Rights,” Theoria, 69: 160–165.
  • 2003b, “Things qua Truthmakers,” in Hallvard Lillehammer and Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra (eds.), Real Metaphysics: Essays in Honour of D. H. Mellor, London: Routledge, pp. 25–38.
  • 2003 (with Gideon Rosen), “Postscript to ‘Things qua Truthmakers’: Negative Existentials,”, in Hallvard Lillehammer and Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra (eds.), Real Metaphysics: Essays in Honour of D. H. Mellor, London: Routledge, pp. 39–42.
  • 2004a, “Causation as Influence” unabridged version, in John Collins, Ned Hall, and L.A. Paul (eds.), Causation and Counterfactuals, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 75–106.
  • 2004b, “How Many Lives has Schrödinger’s Cat?,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 82: 3–22.
  • 2004c, “Tensed Quantifiers,” in Dean Zimmerman (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Volume 1, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 3–14.
  • 2004d, “Void and Object,” in John Collins, Ned Hall, and L.A. Paul (eds.), Causation and Counterfactuals, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 277–290.
  • 2004e, “Letters to Priest and Beall,” in Graham Priest, J. C. Beall and Bradley Armour-Garb (eds.), The Law of Non-Contradiction, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 176–177.
  • 2005, “Quasi-Realism is Fictionalism” in Mark Calderon (ed.), Fictionalism in Metaphysics, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 314–321.
  • 2007, “Divine Evil” in Louise Anthony (ed.), Philosophers Without Gods, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 231–242.
  • 2009, “Ramseyan Humility” in David Braddon-Mitchell and Robert Nola (eds.), Conceptual Analysis and Philosophical Naturalism, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 203–222.
  • 2015a, “Counterparts of States of Affairs” in Barry Loewer and Jonathan Schaffer (eds.), A Companion to David Lewis, New York: Wiley Blackwell, pp. 15-17.
  • 2015b, “Reply to Dana Scott, “Is There Life on Other Possible Worlds”” in Barry Loewer and Jonathan Schaffer (eds.), A Companion to David Lewis, New York: Wiley Blackwell, pp. 18-21.
  • 2020a, Philosophical Letters of David K. Lewis, volume 1: Causation, Modality, Ontology, edited by Helen Beebee and A. R. J. Fisher, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 2020b, Philosophical Letters of David K. Lewis, volume 2: Mind, Language, Epistemology, edited by Helen Beebee and A. R. J. Fisher, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Cited Secondary Literature

  • Adams, Robert, 1974, “Theories of Actuality” Noûs, 8: 211–231.
  • Armstrong, D. M., 1978, Universals and Scientific Realism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bennett, Jonathan, 1984, “Counterfactuals and Temporal Direction” Philosophical Review, 93: 57–91.
  • Bennett, Jonathan, 2003, A Philosophical Guide to Conditionals, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Braddon-Mitchell, David and Robert Nola, 1997, “Ramsification and Glymour’s Counterexample” Analysis, 57: 167–169.
  • Cohen, Stewart, 1986, “Knowledge and Context”, The Journal of Philosophy, 83: 574–583.
  • Davies, Martin, 1981, Meaning, Quantification, Necessity: Themes in Philosophical Logic, London: Routledge.
  • Elga, Adam, 2000, “Self-Locating Belief and the Sleeping Beauty Problem,” Analysis 60: 143–147.
  • DeRose, Keith, 1995, “Solving the Skeptical Problem”, The Philosophical Review, 104(1), 1–52.
  • –––, 2004, “Defeating Dr. Evil with Self-Locating Belief,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 69: 383–396.
  • Egan, Andy, 2007, “Epistemic modals, relativism and assertion,” Philosophical Studies, 133: 1–22.
  • Fine, Kit, 1975, “Critical Notice of Counterfactuals,” Mind, 84: 451–458.
  • Forrest, Peter, 1982, “Occam’s Razor and Possible Worlds” Monist, 65: 456–464.
  • ––– and D. M. Armstrong, 1984, “An Argument Against David Lewis’ Theory of Possible Worlds,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 62: 164–8.
  • Frankfurt, Harry, 1971, “Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person,” Journal of Philosophy, 68: 5–20.
  • Goodman, Nelson, 1955, Fact, Fiction and Forecast, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Hall, Ned, 1994, “Correcting the Guide to Objective Chance”, Mind 103: 505–518.
  • Hawthorne, John, 1990, “A Note on Languages and Language,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 68: 116–118.
  • Hájek, Alan, 2008, “David Lewis,” in The New Dictionary of Scientific Biography, ed. Noretta Koertke, New York: Scribners.
  • Jackson, Frank, 1998, From Metaphysics to Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Janssen-Lauret, Frederique and Fraser MacBride, 2020, “Lewis’s Global Descriptivism and Reference Magnetism,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 98: 192–198.
  • Keller, Simon, 2015, “David Lewis’s Social and Political Philosophy”, in Barry Loewer and Jonathan Schaffer (eds.), A Companion to David Lewis, New York: Wiley Blackwell, pp. 549-561.
  • Kim, Jaegwon, 1973, “Causes and Counterfactuals,” Journal of Philosophy, 70: 570–572.
  • Kripke, Saul, 1982, Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Lewis, Stephanie, 2015, “Intellectual Biography of David Lewis (1941-2001): Early Influences”, in Barry Loewer and Jonathan Schaffer (eds.), A Companion to David Lewis, New York: Wiley Blackwell, pp. 1-14.
  • Melia, Joseph, 1992, “A Note on Lewis’s Ontology”, Analysis, 52: 191–192.
  • Melia, Joseph and Juha Saatsi, 2006, “ Ramseyfication and Theoretical Content”, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 57: 561–585.
  • Nolan, Daniel, 2005, David Lewis, Chesham: Acumen Publishing.
  • –––, 2007, “Selfless Desires”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 73: 665–679.
  • Paul, L. A., 2000, “Aspect Causation,” Journal of Philosophy, 97: 235–256.
  • Plantinga, Alvin, 1974, The Nature of Necessity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Putnam, Hillary, 1981, Reason, Truth and History, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Quine, Willard van Orman, 1960, Word and Object, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan, “Trumping Preemption,” Journal of Philosophy, 97: 165–181.
  • Schelling, Thomas, 1960, The Strategy of Conflict, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Schwarz, Wolfgang, 2009, David Lewis: Metaphysik und Analyse, Paderborn: Mentis-Verlag.
  • –––, 2014, “Against Magnetism,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 92: 17–36.
  • Skyrms, Brian, 1987, “Dynamic Coherence and Probability Kinematics,” Philosophy of Science, 54: 1–20.
  • Sider, Theodore, 2001, “Criteria of Personal Identity and the Limits of Conceptual Analysis,” Philosophical Perspectives, 15: 279–315.
  • –––, 2002, “The Ersatz Pluriverse,” Journal of Philosophy, 99: 279–315.
  • Smart, J. J. C., 1959 “Sensations and Brain Processes,” Philosophical Review, 68: 141–156.
  • Sorensen, Roy, 2009, “Epistemic Paradoxes,” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2009 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/spr2009/entries/epistemic-paradoxes/>.
  • Stalnaker, Robert, 1968, “A Theory of Conditionals, ” in Nicholas Rescher (ed.), Studies in Logical Theory (American Philosophical Quarterly Monograph Series: Volume 2), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 98–112.
  • –––, 1976, “Possible Worlds” Noûs, 10: 65–75.
  • –––, 1984, Inquiry, Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books.
  • –––, 2008, Our Knowledge of the Internal World, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Teller, Paul, 1976, “Conditionalization, observation, and change of preference” in: W. L. Harper and C. A. Hooker (eds.), Foundations of Probability Theory, Statistical Inference, and Statistical Theories of Science, vol. 1. Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 205–253.
  • Thau, Michael, 1994, “Undermining and Admissibility”, Mind, 103: 491–504.
  • Weatherson, Brian, 2003, “What Good are Counterexamples?” Philosophical Studies, 115: 1–31.
  • –––, 2013, “The Role of Naturalness in Lewis’s Theory of Meaning” Journal for the History of Analytical Philosophy, 1(10) [available online].
  • Williams, J. Robert G., 2007, “Eligibility and Inscrutability,” Philosophical Review, 116: 361–399.
  • Wilson, Alastair, forthcoming, “Plenitude and Recombination,” in Helen Beebee and Anthony Fisher (eds.), David Lewis: A Historical Perspective, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1953, Philosophical Investigations, Oxford: Blackwell.


I’ve learned a lot over the years from talking about Lewis’s philosophy with Wolfgang Schwarz. I trust his book (2009) is excellent on all these topics, but unfortunately it’s only out in German so far, which I don’t read. But a lot of important points are collected on his blog, which is listed under other internet resources. This entry draws heavily on Daniel Nolan’s excellent book David Lewis (2005). Without that book, section 7.5 of this entry wouldn’t exist, section 6.3 would be unintelligible, and every section would be worse. Much of the biographical information in the introduction is taken from Hájek (2008), supplemented by the information in the short biography that written by Stephanie Lewis (2015). Many people helpfully spotted typos and infelicities of expression in earlier versions of this entry. Thanks especially to Zachary Miller for many suggested improvements and revisions. The bibliography is based in large part on a bibliography provided to me by Stephanie Lewis.

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Brian Weatherson <brian@weatherson.org>

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