Feminist Perspectives on Power

First published Wed Oct 19, 2005; substantive revision Thu Oct 28, 2021

Although any general definition of feminism would no doubt be controversial, it seems undeniable that much work in feminist theory is devoted to the tasks of critiquing gender subordination, analyzing its intersections with other forms of subordination such as racism, heterosexism, and class oppression, and envisioning prospects for individual and collective resistance and emancipation. Insofar as the concept of power is central to each of these theoretical tasks, power is clearly a central concept for feminist theory as well. And yet, curiously, it is one that is not often explicitly thematized in feminist work (exceptions include Allen 1998, 1999, Caputi 2013, Hartsock 1983 and 1996, Yeatmann 1997, and Young 1992). Indeed, Wendy Brown contends that “Power is one of those things we cannot approach head-on or in isolation from other subjects if we are to speak about it intelligently” (Brown 1988, 207). This poses a unique challenge for assessing feminist perspectives on power, as those perspectives must first be reconstructed from discussions of other topics. Nevertheless, it is possible to identify three main ways in which feminists have conceptualized power: as a resource to be (re)distributed, as domination, and as empowerment. After a brief discussion of the power debates in social and political theory, this entry will survey each of these feminist conceptions.

1. Defining power

In social and political theory, power is often regarded as an essentially contested concept (see Lukes 1974 and 2005, and Connolly 1983). Although this claim is itself contested (see Haugaard 2010 and 2020, 4–10; Morriss 2002, 199–206 and Wartenberg 1990, 12–17), there is no doubt that the literature on power is marked by deep, widespread, and seemingly intractable disagreements over how the term should be understood.

One such disagreement pits those who define power as getting someone else to do what you want them to do, that is, as an exercise of power-over others, against those who define it as an ability or a capacity to act, that is, as a power-to do something. The classic formulation of the former definition is offered by Max Weber, who defines power as “the probability that one actor within a social relationship will be in a position to carry out his own will despite resistance…” (1978, 53). Similarly, Robert Dahl offers what he calls an “intuitive idea of power” according to which “A has power over B to the extent that he can get B to do something that B would not otherwise do” (1957, 202–03). Dahl’s discussion of power sparked a vigorous debate that continued until the mid-1970s, but even his sharpest critics seemed to concede his definition of power as an exercise of power-over others (see Bachrach and Baratz 1962 and Lukes 1974). As Steven Lukes notes, Dahl’s one-dimensional view of power, Bachrach and Baratz’s two-dimensional view, and his own three-dimensional view are all variations of “the same underlying conception of power, according to which A exercises power over B when A affects B in a manner contrary to B’s interests” (1974, 30). Similarly, but from a very different theoretical background, Michel Foucault’s highly influential analysis implicitly presupposes that power is a kind of power-over; and he puts it, “if we speak of the structures or the mechanisms of power, it is only insofar as we suppose that certain persons exercise power over others” (1983, 217). Notice that there are two salient features of this definition of power: power is understood in terms of power-over relations, and it is defined in terms of its actual exercise.

Classic articulations of power understood as power-to have been offered by Thomas Hobbes – power is a person’s “present means…to obtain some future apparent Good” (Hobbes 1985 (1641), 150) – and Hannah Arendt – power is “the human ability not just to act but to act in concert” (1970, 44). Arguing in favor of this way of conceptualizing power, Hanna Pitkin notes that the word “power” is related etymologically to the French pouvoir and the Latin potere, both of which mean to be able. “That suggests,” she writes, “that power is a something – anything – which makes or renders somebody able to do, capable of doing something. Power is capacity, potential, ability, or wherewithal” (1972, 276). Similarly, Peter Morriss (2002) and Lukes (2005) define power as a dispositional concept, meaning, as Lukes puts it, that power “is a potentiality, not an actuality – indeed a potentiality that may never be actualized” (2005, 69). (Note that this statement amounts to a significant revision of Lukes’s earlier analysis of power, in which he argued against defining power as power-to on the grounds that such a definition obscures “the conflictual aspect of power – the fact that it is exercised over people” and thus fails to address what we care about most when we decide to study power (1974, 31). For helpful discussion of whether Lukes’s embrace of the dispositional conception of power is compatible with his other theoretical commitments, see Haugaard (2010)). Some of the theorists who analyze power as power-to leave power-over entirely out of their analysis. For example, Arendt distinguishes power sharply from authority, strength, force, and violence, and offers a normative account in which power is understood as an end in itself (1970). As Jürgen Habermas has argued, this has the effect of screening any and all strategic understandings of power (where power is understood in the Weberian sense as imposing one’s will on another) out of her analysis (Habermas 1994). (Although Arendt defines power as a capacity, she also maintains that “power springs up between men when they act together and vanishes the moment they disperse” (1958, 200); hence, it is not clear whether she fully accepts a dispositional view of power). Others suggest that both aspects of power are important, but then focus their attention on either power-over (e.g., Connolly 1993) or power-to (e.g., Morriss 2002). Still others define power-over as a particular type of capacity, namely, the capacity to impose one’s will on others; on this view, power-over is a derivative form of power-to (Allen 1999, Lukes 2005). However, others have argued power-over and power-to refer to fundamentally different concepts and that it is a mistake to try to develop an account of power that integrates them (Pitkin 1972, Wartenberg 1990).

Another way of carving up the power literature is to distinguish between action-theoretical conceptions – that is, those that define power in terms of either the actions or the dispositional abilities of individual actors – and broader systemic or constitutive conceptions – that is, those that view power as systematically structuring possibilities for action, or, more strongly, as constitutive of social actors and the social world in which they act. On this way of distinguishing various conceptions of power, Hobbes and Weber are on the same side, since both of them understand power in primarily instrumentalist, individualist, and action-theoretical terms (Saar 2010, 10). The systemic conception, by contrast, views power as “the ways in which given social systems confer differentials of dispositional power on agents, thus structuring their possibilities for action” (Haugaard 2010, 425; see Clegg 1989). The systemic conception thus highlights the ways in which broad historical, political, economic, cultural, and social forces enable some individuals to exercise power over others, or inculcate certain abilities and dispositions in some actors but not in others. Saar argues, however, that the systemic conception of power should be understood not as an alternative to the action-theoretical conception of power, but rather as a more complex and sophisticated variant of that model. For, as he says, its “basic scenario remains individualistic at the methodological level: power operates on individuals as individuals, in the form of a ‘bringing to action’ or external determination” (Saar 2010, 14).

The constitutive conception of power pushes the insight of the systemic conception further by focusing on the constitutive relationships between power, individuals, and the social worlds they inhabit. The roots of this constitutive conception can be traced back to Spinoza (2002a and 2002b; Saar 2013), but variants of this view are also found in the work of more contemporary theorists such as Arendt and Foucault. Here it is important to note that Foucault’s work on power contains both action-theoretical and constitutive strands. The former strand is evident in his claim, cited above, that “if we speak of the structures or the mechanisms of power, it is only insofar as we suppose that certain persons exercise power over others” (Foucault 1983, 217), whereas the latter strand is evident in his definition of power as “the multiplicity of force relations immanent in the sphere in which they operate and which constitute their own organization; as the processes which, through ceaseless struggles and confrontations, transforms, strengthens, or reverses them;…thus forming a chain or system” (Foucault 1979, 92).

What accounts for the highly contested nature of the concept of power? One explanation is that how we conceptualize power is shaped by the political and theoretical interests that we bring to our study of it (Lukes 1986, Said 1986). For example, democratic theorists are interested in different things when they study power than are social movement theorists or critical race theorists or postcolonial theorists, and so on. Thus, a specific conceptualization of power could be more or less useful depending on the specific disciplinary or theoretical context in which it is deployed, where usefulness is evaluated in terms of how well it “accomplishes the task the theorists set for themselves” (Haugaard 2010, 426). On this view, if we suppose that feminists who are interested in power are interested in understanding and critiquing gender-based relations of domination and subordination as these intersect with other axes of oppression and thinking about how such relations can be transformed through individual and collective resistance, then we would conclude that specific conceptions of power should be evaluated in terms of how well they enable feminists to fulfill those aims.

Lukes suggests another, more radical, explanation for the essentially contested nature of the concept of power: our conceptions of power are, according to him, themselves shaped by power relations. As he puts it, “how we think about power may serve to reproduce and reinforce power structures and relations, or alternatively it may challenge and subvert them. It may contribute to their continued functioning, or it may unmask their principles of operation, whose effectiveness is increased by their being hidden from view. To the extent that this is so, conceptual and methodological questions are inescapably political and so what ‘power’ means is ‘essentially contested’…” (Lukes 2005, 63). The thought that conceptions of power are themselves shaped by power relations is behind the claim, made by many feminists, that the influential conception of power as power-over is itself a product of patriarchal domination (for further discussion, see section 4 below).

2. Power as Resource: Liberal Feminist Approaches

Those who conceptualize power as a resource understand it as a positive social good that is currently unequally distributed. For feminists who understand power in this way, the goal is to redistribute this resource so that women will have power equal to men. Implicit in this view is the assumption that power is, as Iris Marion Young puts it, “a kind of stuff that can be possessed by individuals in greater or lesser amounts” (Young 1990, 31).

The conception of power as a resource is arguably implicit in the work of some liberal feminists (Mill 1970, Okin 1989). For example, in Justice, Gender, and the Family, Susan Moller Okin argues that the modern gender-structured family unjustly distributes the benefits and burdens of familial life amongst husbands and wives. Okin includes power on her list of the benefits, which she calls “critical social goods.” As she puts it, “when we look seriously at the distribution between husbands and wives of such critical social goods as work (paid and unpaid), power, prestige, self-esteem, opportunities for self-development, and both physical and economic security, we find socially constructed inequalities between them, right down the list” (Okin, 1989, 136). Here, Okin seems to presuppose that power is a resource that is unequally and unjustly distributed between men and women; hence, one of the goals of feminism would be to redistribute this resource in more equitable ways.

Although she doesn’t discuss Okin’s work explicitly, Young offers a compelling critique of this view, which she calls the distributive model of power. First, Young maintains that it is wrong to think of power as a kind of stuff that can be possessed; on her view, power is a relation, not a thing that can be distributed or redistributed. Second, she claims that the distributive model tends to presuppose a dyadic, atomistic understanding of power; as a result, it fails to illuminate the broader social, institutional and structural contexts that shape individual relations of power. According to Young, this makes the distributive model unhelpful for understanding the structural features of domination. Third, the distributive model conceives of power statically, as a pattern of distribution, whereas Young, following Foucault (1980), claims that power exists only in action, and thus must be understood dynamically, as existing in ongoing processes or interactions. Finally, Young argues that the distributive model of power tends to view domination as the concentration of power in the hands of a few. According to Young, although this model might be appropriate for some forms of domination, it is not appropriate for the forms that domination takes in contemporary industrial societies such as the United States (Young 1990a, 31–33). On her view, in contemporary industrial societies, power is “widely dispersed and diffused” and yet it is nonetheless true that “social relations are tightly defined by domination and oppression” (Young 1990a, 32–33).

3. Power as Domination

Young’s critique of the distributive model points toward an alternative way of conceptualizing power, one that understands power not as a resource or critical social good, but instead views it as a relation of domination. Although feminists have often used a variety of terms to refer to this kind of relation – including “oppression,” “patriarchy,” “subjection,” and so forth –the common thread in these analyses is an understanding of power as an unjust or illegitimate power-over relation. In the remainder of this entry, I use the term “domination” simply to refer to unjust or oppressive power-over relations. In this section, I discuss the specific ways in which feminists with different political and philosophical commitments – influenced by phenomenology, radical feminism, Marxist socialism, intersectionality theory, post-structuralism, postcolonial and decolonial theory, and analytic philosophy – have conceptualized domination.

3.1 Phenomenological Feminist Approaches

The locus classicus of feminist phenomenological approaches to theorizing male domination is Simone de Beauvoir’s The Second Sex. Beauvoir’s text provides a brilliant analysis of the situation of women: the social, cultural, historical, and economic conditions that define their existence. Her diagnosis of women’s situation relies on the distinction between being for-itself – self-conscious subjectivity that is capable of freedom and transcendence – and being in-itself – the un-self-conscious things that are incapable of freedom and mired in immanence. Beauvoir argues that whereas men have assumed the status of the transcendent subject, women have been relegated to the status of the immanent Other. As she puts it in a famous passage from the Introduction to The Second Sex: “She is defined and differentiated with reference to man and not he with reference to her; she is the incidental, the inessential as opposed to the essential. He is the Subject, he is the Absolute – she is the Other” (Beauvoir, xxii). This distinction – between man as Subject and woman as Other – is the key to Beauvoir’s understanding of domination or oppression. She writes, “every time transcendence falls back into immanence, stagnation, there is a degradation of existence into the ‘en-soi’ – the brutish life of subjection to given conditions – and liberty into constraint and contingence. This downfall represents a moral fault if the subject consents to it; if it is inflicted upon him, it spells frustration and oppression. In both cases it is an absolute evil” (Beauvoir, xxxv). Although Beauvoir suggests that women are partly responsible for submitting to the status of the Other in order to avoid the anguish of authentic existence (hence, they are in bad faith) (see Beauvoir xxvii), she maintains that women are oppressed because they are compelled to assume the status of the Other, doomed to immanence (xxxv). Women’s situation is thus marked by a basic tension between transcendence and immanence; as self-conscious human beings, they are capable of transcendence, but they are compelled into immanence by cultural and social conditions that deny them that transcendence (see Beauvoir, chapter 21).

Some feminists have criticized Beauvoir's conception of oppression for its reliance on a problematic analogy between race and gender (see, for example, her claim that “there are deep similarities between the situation of woman and that of the Negro,” (Beauvoir, xxix)). Beauvoir's frequent use of such analogies, critics contend, erases the experience of Black women by implicitly coding all women as white and all Blacks as male (Gines (Belle) 2010 and 2017, Collins 2019, 194–198, and Simons 2002). As Kathryn T. Gines (now Kathryn Sophia Belle) argues further, Beauvoir's analysis deploys “comparative and competing frameworks of oppression” (Gines (Belle) 2014a). At times, Beauvoir treats not just sexism and racism but also antisemitism, colonialism, and class oppression comparatively, arguing that they rest of similar dynamics of Othering. Her comparative analysis of race and gender is most problematic in her frequent analogy between the situation of women and that of the slave. As Belle argues, this analogy not only obscures the experiences of Black female slaves, it also leads Beauvior to “engage in an appropriation of Black suffering in the form of slavery to advance her philosophical discussion of woman's situation” (265). At other times, Beauvoir treats racism, sexism, antisemitism, colonialism, and class oppression as competing frameworks and argues that gender subordination is the most significant and constitutive form of oppression. Both moves are problematic, according to Belle, the former for its erasure of the oppression of Black women and the latter for its privileging of gender oppression over other forms of oppression.

Feminist phenomenologists have engaged critically with Beauvoir's work while extending her insights into power. For example, Young argues that Beauvoir pays relatively little attention to the role that female embodiment plays in women’s oppression (Young 1990b, 142–3). Although Beauvoir does discuss women’s bodies in relation to their status as immanent Other, she tends to focus on women’s physiology and how physiological features such as menstruation and pregnancy tie women more closely to nature, thus, to immanence. In her essay, “Throwing Like a Girl,” Young draws on Maurice Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenological analysis of the lived body to analyze “the situatedness of the woman’s actual bodily movement and orientation to its surroundings and its world” (Young 1990b, 143). She notes that girls and women often fail to use fully the spatial potential of their bodies (for example, they throw “like girls”), they try not to take up too much space, and they tend to approach physical activity tentatively and uncertainly (Young 1990b, 145–147). Young argues that feminine bodily comportment, movement, and spatial orientation exhibit the same tension between transcendence and immanence that Beauvoir diagnoses in The Second Sex. “At the root of those modalities,” Young writes, “is the fact that the woman lives her body as object as well as subject. The source of this is that patriarchal society defines woman as object, as a mere body, and that in sexist society women are in fact frequently regarded by others as objects and mere bodies” (Young 1990b, 155). And yet women are also subjects, and, thus, cannot think of themselves as mere bodily objects. As a result, woman “cannot be in unity with herself” (Young 1990b, 155). Young explores the tension between transcendence and immanence and the lack of unity characteristic of feminine subjectivity in more detail in several other essays that explore pregnant embodiment, women’s experience with their clothes, and breasted experience (See Young 1990b, chapters 9–11).

Much important work in feminist phenomenology follows Young in drawing inspiration from Merleau-Ponty’s analyses of embodiment and intercorporeality (see Heinamaa 2003, Weiss 1999); like Young, these authors use a Merleau-Pontyian approach to phenomenology to explore the fundamental modalities of female embodiment or feminine bodily comportment. Feminists have also mined the work of Edmund Husserl, the founder of phenomenology, for useful resources for feminist phenomenology (Al-Saji 2010 and Oksala 2016).

More generally, Oksala defends the importance of feminist phenomenology as an exploration of gendered experience against poststructuralist critics who find such a project hopelessly essentialist. While Oksala acknowledges that essentialism is a danger found in some work in feminist phenomenology – for example, she is critical of Sonia Kruks (2001) for “considering ‘female experience’ as an irreducible given grounded in a female body” (Oksala 2016, 72) – she also insists that a phenomenological analysis of experience is crucial for feminism. As she puts it, “it is my contention that feminist theory must ‘retrieve experience’, but this cannot mean returning to a pre discursive female experience grounded in the commonalities of women’s embodiment” (40). On her view, experience is always constructed in such a way that it “reflects oppressive discourses and power relations” (43); and yet, experience and thought or discourse are not co-extensive. This means that there is always a gap between our personal experience and the linguistic representations that we employ to make sense of that experience, and it is this gap that provides the space for contestation and critique. Thus, Oksala concludes, “experiences can contest discourses even if, or precisely because, they are conceptual through and through” (50). For Oksala, experience plays a crucial role in reinforcing and reproducing oppressive power relations, but radical reflection on our experience opens up a space for individual and collective resistance to and transformation of those power relations.

The concept of experience is also central to Mariana Ortega's analysis of Latina feminist phenomenology (Ortega 2016). Ortega reads the prominent Latina feminists Gloria Anzaldúa and María Lugones as phenomenologists “whose writings are deeply informed by their lived experience, specifically by their experience of marginalization and oppression as well as their experience of resistance” (7). By highlighting the experience of marginalized and oppressed selves who live their lives at the borderlands or in a state of in-betweenness, Latina feminist phenomenology, as Ortega reads it, offers an important corrective to and expansion of the critique of modern subjectivity in the European phenomenological tradition.

For other influential feminist-phenomenological analyses of domination see Bartky 1990, 2002, Bordo 1993, and Kruks 2001. For helpful overviews of feminist phenomenology, see Fisher and Embree 2000, and Heinamaa and Rodemeyer 2010. For a highly influential articulation of queer phenomenology, drawing on the work of Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, and Fanon, see Ahmed (2006). For a compelling phenomenological analysis of transgender experience, see Salamon (2010).

3.2 Radical Feminist Approaches

Unlike liberal feminists, who view power as a positive social resource that ought to be fairly distributed, and feminist phenomenologists, who understand domination in terms of a tension between transcendence and immanence, radical feminists tend to understand power in terms of dyadic relations of dominance/subordination, often understood on analogy with the relationship between master and slave.

For example, in the work of legal theorist Catharine MacKinnon, domination is closely bound up with her understanding of gender difference. According to MacKinnon, gender difference is simply the reified effect of domination. As she puts it, “difference is the velvet glove on the iron fist of domination. The problem is not that differences are not valued; the problem is that they are defined by power” (MacKinnon 1989, 219). If gender difference is itself a function of domination, then the implication is that men are powerful and women are powerless by definition. As MacKinnon puts it, “women/men is a distinction not just of difference, but of power and powerlessness….Power/powerlessness is the sex difference” (MacKinnon 1987, 123). (In this passage, MacKinnon glosses over the distinction, articulated by many second-wave feminists, between sex – the biologically rooted traits that make one male or female, traits that are often presumed to be natural and immutable – and gender – the socially and culturally rooted, hence contingent and mutable, traits, characteristics, dispositions, and practices that make one a woman or a man. This passage suggests that MacKinnon, like Judith Butler (1990) and other critics of the sex/gender distinction, thinks that sex difference, no less than gender difference, is socially constructed and shaped by relations of power.) If men are powerful and women powerless as such, then male domination is, on this view, pervasive. Indeed, MacKinnon claims that it is a basic “fact of male supremacy” that “no woman escapes the meaning of being a woman within a gendered social system, and sex inequality is not only pervasive but may be universal (in the sense of never having not been in some form” (MacKinnon 1989, 104–05). For MacKinnon, heterosexual intercourse is the paradigm of male domination; as she puts it, “the social relation between the sexes is organized so that men may dominate and women must submit and this relation is sexual – in fact, is sex” (MacKinnon 1987, 3). As a result, she tends to presuppose a dyadic conception of domination, according to which individual women are subject to the will of individual men. If male domination is pervasive and women are powerless by definition, then it follows that female power is “a contradiction in terms, socially speaking” (MacKinnon 1987, 53). The claim that female power is a contradiction in terms has led many feminists to criticize MacKinnon on the grounds that she denies women’s political agency and presents them as helpless victims (for exemplary versions of this criticism, see Brown 1995 and Butler 1997a).

Marilyn Frye likewise offers a radical feminist analysis of power that seems to presuppose a dyadic model of domination. Frye identifies several faces of power, one of the most important of which is access. As Frye puts it, “total power is unconditional access; total powerlessness is being unconditionally accessible. The creation and manipulation of power is constituted of the manipulation and control of access” (Frye 1983, 103). If access is one of the most important faces of power, then feminist separatism, insofar as it is a way of denying access to women’s bodies, emotional support, domestic labor, and so forth, represents a profound challenge to male power. For this reason, Frye maintains that all feminism that is worth the name entails some form of separatism. She also suggests that this is the real reason that men get so upset by acts of separatism: “if you are doing something that is so strictly forbidden by the patriarchs, you must be doing something right” (Frye 1983, 98). Frye frequently compares male domination to a master/slave relationship (see, for example, 1983, 103–105), and she defines oppression as “a system of interrelated barriers and forces which reduce, immobilize, and mold people who belong to a certain group, and effect their subordination to another group (individually to individuals of the other group, and as a group, to that group)” (Frye 1983, 33). In addition to access, Frye discusses definition as another, related, face of power. Frye claims that “the powerful normally determine what is said and sayable” (105). For example, “when the Secretary of Defense calls something a peace negotiation…then whatever it is that he called a peace negotiation is an instance of negotiating peace” (105). Under conditions of subordination, women typically do not have the power to define the terms of their situation, but by controlling access, Frye argues, they can begin to assert control over their own self-definition. Both of these – controlling access and definition – are ways of taking power. Although she does not go so far as MacKinnon does in claiming that female power is a contradiction in terms, Frye does claim that “if there is one thing women are queasy about it is actually taking power” (Frye 1983, 107).

A similar dyadic conception of male domination can arguably be found in Carole Pateman’s The Sexual Contract (1988) (although Pateman's work is heavily influenced by socialist feminism, her account of power is closer to radical feminism). Like MacKinnon, Pateman claims that gender difference is constituted by domination; as she puts it, “the patriarchal construction of the difference between masculinity and femininity is the political difference between freedom and subjection” (Pateman 1988, 207). She also claims that male domination is pervasive, and she explicitly appeals to a master/subject model to understand it; as she puts it, “in modern civil society all men are deemed good enough to be women’s masters” (Pateman 1988, 219). In Pateman’s view, the social contract that initiates civil society and provides for the legitimate exercise of political rights is also a sexual contract that establishes what she calls “the law of male sex-right,” securing male sexual access to and dominance over women (1988, 182). As Nancy Fraser has argued, on Pateman’s view, the sexual contract “institutes a series of male/female master/subject dyads” (Fraser 1993, 173). Fraser is highly critical of Pateman’s analysis, which she terms the “master/subject model,” a model that presents women’s subordination “first and foremost as the condition of being subject to the direct command of an individual man” (1993, 173). The problem with this dyadic account of women’s subordination, according to Fraser, is that “gender inequality is today being transformed by a shift from dyadic relations of mastery and subjection to more impersonal structural mechanisms that are lived through more fluid cultural forms” (1993, 180). Fraser suggests that, in order to understand women’s subordination in contemporary Western societies, feminists will have to move beyond the master/subject model to analyze how women’s subordination is secured through cultural norms, social practices, and other impersonal structural mechanisms. (For Pateman’s response to Fraser’s criticism, see Pateman and Mills (2007, 205–06)).

Although feminists such as Fraser, Judith Butler, and Wendy Brown have been highly critical of the radical feminist account of domination, analytic feminists have found this account more productive. For example, Rae Langton (2009) has used speech act theory to defend MacKinnon's claims that pornography both causes and constitutes women's subordination. More generally, Langton (2009) and Sally Haslanger (2012) have drawn on MacKinnon's work to develop an account of sexual objectification and to explore the ways that objectification is often obscured by claims to objectivity (for further discussion of Haslanger's work, see section 3.7 below).

3.3 Socialist Feminist Approaches

According to the traditional Marxist account of power, domination is understood on the model of class exploitation; domination results from the capitalist appropriation of the surplus value that is produced by the workers. As many second wave feminist critics of Marx have pointed out, however, Marx’s categories are gender-blind (see, for example, Firestone 1970, Hartmann 1980, Hartsock 1983, Rubin 1976). Marx ignores the ways in which class exploitation and gender subordination are intertwined; because he focuses solely on economic production, Marx overlooks women’s reproductive labor in the home and the exploitation of this labor in capitalist modes of production. As a result of this gender-blindness, second wave Marxist or socialist feminists argued that Marx’s analysis of class domination must be supplemented with a radical feminist critique of patriarchy in order to yield a satisfactory account of women’s oppression; the resulting theory is referred to as dual systems theory (see, for example, Eisenstein 1979, Hartmann 1980). As Young describes it, “dual systems theory says that women’s oppression arises from two distinct and relatively autonomous systems. The system of male domination, most often called ‘patriarchy’, produces the specific gender oppression of women; the system of the mode of production and class relations produces the class oppression and work alienation of most women” (Young 1990b, 21). Although Young agrees with the aim of theorizing class and gender domination in a single theory, she is critical of dual systems theory on the grounds that “it allows Marxism to retain in basically unchanged form its theory of economic and social relations, on to which it merely grafts a theory of gender relations” (Young 1990b, 24). Young calls instead for a more unified theory, a truly feminist historical materialism that would offer a critique of the social totality.

In a later essay, Young offers a more systematic analysis of oppression, an analysis that is grounded in her earlier call for a comprehensive socialist feminism. Young identifies five faces of oppression: economic exploitation, socio-economic marginalization, lack of power or autonomy over one’s work, cultural imperialism, and systematic violence (Young 1992, 183–193). The first three faces of oppression in this list expand on the Marxist account of economic exploitation, and the last two go beyond that account, bringing out other aspects of oppression that are not well explained in economic terms. According to Young, being subject to any one of these forms of power is sufficient to call a group oppressed, but most oppressed groups in the United States experience more than one of these forms of power, and some experience all five (Young 1992, 194). She also claims that this list is comprehensive, both in the sense that “covers all the groups said by new left social movements to be oppressed” and that it “covers all the ways they are oppressed” (Young 1992, 181; for critical discussion, see Allen 2008b).

Nancy Hartsock offers a different vision of feminist historical materialism in her book Money, Sex, and Power: Toward a Feminist Historical Materialism (1983). In this book, Hartsock is concerned with “(1) how relations of domination along lines of gender are constructed and maintained and (2) whether social understandings of domination itself have been distorted by men’s domination of women” (Hartsock 1983, 1). Following Marx’s conception of ideology, Hartsock maintains that the prevailing ideas and theories of a time period are rooted in the material, economic relations of that society. This applies, in her view, to theories of power as well. Thus, she criticizes theories of power in mainstream political science for presupposing a market model of economic relations – a model that understands the economy primarily in terms of exchange, which is how it appears from the perspective of the ruling class rather than in terms of production, which is how it appears from the perspective of the worker. She also argues that power and domination have consistently been associated with masculinity. Because power has been understood from the position of the socially dominant – the ruling class and men – the feminist task, according to Hartsock, is to reconceptualize power from a specifically feminist standpoint, one that is rooted in women’s life experience, specifically, their role in reproduction. Conceptualizing power from this standpoint can, according to Hartsock, “point beyond understandings of power as power over others” (Hartsock 1983, 12). (We’ll come back to this point in section 4).

Socialist feminism fell largely out of fashion during the latter part of the 20th century, fueled in part by the rise of poststructuralism, the prominence of identity and recognition based politics, and the emergence of a neoliberal consensus (for a trenchant critique of these developments, see Fraser 1996 and 2013). However, in the wake of the global financial crisis of 2008, socialist feminism, now often referred to as Social Reproduction Theory (SRT), has made a comeback. SRT has a long history, with important early contributions by Silvia Federici (1975) and Maria Mies (1986) and connections to the Italian wages for housework campaign that began in the 1970s; for more recent discussions, see Tithi Bhattacharya (2017), Federici (2014 and 2019), and Alessandra Mezzadri (2019). SRT is a Marxist feminist project that orients itself to a question that remains implicit in Marx's theory of value: how is labor power, which is the source of value and thus of exploitation in Marx's account, itself produced, reproduced, and maintained? SRT maintains that labor power is produced and reproduced outside of the official economy, largely through women's unpaid labor within the family or domestic sphere. For social reproduction theorists, the production of goods and services is thus possible only on the basis of (largely) unpaid social reproduction, which includes childbirth, domestic work, caring for children, the elderly and others who cannot work for wages, and so on. For Federici, this represents an ongoing process of expropriation akin to Marx's notion of primitive accumulation (Federici 2014). Social reproduction theorists understand production and reproduction as parts of an integrated system; indeed, they view the distinction between the two as ultimately misleading inasmuch as it obscures the ways in which social reproduction is itself productive of value (Mezzadri 2019). For a related attempt to understand capitalism as a social totality whose relations of production are made possible by the expropriation of socially reproductive labor, environmental resources, and the labor of dispossessed and colonized peoples, see Fraser in Fraser and Jaeggi (2018).

3.4 Intersectional Approaches

Theories of intersectionality highlight the complex, interconnected, and cross-cutting relationships between diverse modes of domination, including (but not limited to) sexism, racism, class oppression, and heterosexism. The project of intersectional feminism grew out of Black feminism, which, as scholars have recently noted, has a long tradition of examining the interconnections between racism and sexism, stretching back to the writing and activism of late 19th and early 20th century black feminists such as Maria W. Stewart, Ida. B. Wells, Anna Julia Cooper, and Sojourner Truth (see Gines 2014b and Cooper 2016). Because these thinkers and activists did not use the term intersectionality, Gines (now Belle) characterizes their work as proto-intersectional, which she defines as follows: “identifying and combating racism and sexism – through activist organizing and campaigning – not only as separate categories impacting identity and oppression, but also as systems of oppression that work together and mutually reinforce one another, presenting unique problems for black women who experience both, simultaneously and differently than white women and/or black men” (Gines 2014b, 14). Other important antecedents to contemporary intersectionality theory include the Combahee River Collective’s notion of “interlocking systems of oppression” (CRC 1977), Deborah King’s analysis of multiple jeopardy and multiple consciousness (King 1988), and the work from the 1980s of Black feminists such as Audre Lorde (1984), Angela Davis (1984), and bell hooks (1981). As Mariana Ortega has argued (2016), there are also important conceptions of intersectionality developed in Latina feminism, particularly in Anzaldúa's account of the borderlands and mestiza consciusness (Anzaldúa 1987) and Lugones's account of the intermeshedness of race, sex, gender, sexual orientation, and class (Lugones 2003).

In other words, the concept of intersectionality has a long history and a complex genealogy (for discussions, see Cooper 2016, Collins 2011 and 2019, 123–126, and Nash 2019). Still, it is widely acknowledged that the contemporary discussion and use of the term intersectionality was sparked by the work of legal theorist Kimberle Crenshaw (Crenshaw 1991a and 1991b), specifically, by her critique of single-axis frameworks for understanding domination in the context of legal discrimination. A single-axis framework treats race and gender as mutually exclusive categories of experience. In so doing, such a framework implicitly privileges the perspective of the most privileged members of oppressed groups – sex or class-privileged Blacks in race discrimination cases; race or class-privileged women in sex discrimination cases. Thus, a single-axis framework distorts the experiences of Black women, who are simultaneously subject to multiple and intersecting forms of subordination. As Crenshaw explains, “the intersection of racism and sexism factors into Black women’s lives in ways that cannot be captured wholly by looking at the race or gender dimensions of those experiences separately” (Crenshaw 1991b, 1244).

In the thirty years since the publication of Crenshaw’s essays on intersectionality, this framework has become extraordinarily influential in women’s, gender, and sexuality studies. Indeed, it has been called “the most important contribution that women’s studies, in conjunction with other fields, has made so far” (McCall 2005, 1771). However, feminist philosophers have noted that this influence has yet to be felt within the mainstream of the discipline of philosophy, where “intersectionality is largely ignored as a philosophical theme or framework” (Goswami, O’Donovan and Yount 2014, 6). Moreover, intersectionality is not without its feminist critics.

Some sympathetic critics of intersectionality have suggested that the concept is limited in that it focuses primarily on the action-theoretical level. A full analysis of the intertwining of racial, gender, and class-based subordination also requires, on this view, a systemic or macro-level concept that corresponds to the concept of intersectionality. Echoing the Combahee River Collective (CRC 1977), Patricia Hill Collins proposes the term “interlocking systems of oppression” to fulfill this role. As she explains, “the notion of interlocking oppressions refers to the macro-level connections linking systems of oppression such as race, class, and gender. This is the model describing the social structures that create social positions. Second, the notion of intersectionality describes micro-level processes – namely, how each individual and group occupies a social position within interlocking structures of oppression described by the metaphor of intersectionality. Together they shape oppression” (Collins et al. 2002, 82).

Others have worried that discussions of intersectionality tend to focus too much on relations and sites of oppression and subordination, without also taking into account relations of privilege and dominance. As Jennifer Nash has argued, this has led to “the question of whether all identities are intersectional or whether only multiply marginalized subjects have an intersectional identity” (Nash 2008, 9). Although some feminist scholars claim that intersectionality encompasses all subject positions, not just those that are marginalized or oppressed, Nash notes that “the overwhelming majority of intersectional scholarship has centred on the particular positions of multiply marginalized subjects” (Nash 2008, 9–10). The over-emphasis on oppression in theories of intersectionality leads theorists “to ignore the intimate connections between privilege and oppression,” for example, by “ignor[ing] the ways in which subjects might be both victimized by patriarchy and privileged by race” (Nash 2008, 12). In response to this concern, philosophers such as Ann Garry have offered a broader, more inclusive conception of intersectionality that emphasizes both oppression and privilege (see Garry 2011).

Rather than supplementing the notion of intersectionality with a macro-level concept of interlocking systems of oppression or broadening it to include relations of oppression and privilege, Naomi Zack argues that feminists should move beyond it. Zack maintains that intersectionality undermines its own goal of making feminism more inclusive. It does this, on Zack’s view, by dividing women into smaller and smaller groups, formed by specific intersections of race, class, gender, sexuality, and so forth. As Zack puts it, “as a theory of women’s identity, intersectionality is not inclusive insofar as members of specific intersections of race and class create only their own feminisms” (Zack 2005, 2). Because it tends toward “the reification of intersections as incommensurable identities,” Zack maintains that “intersectionality has not borne impressive political fruit” (Zack 2005, 18).

From a very different perspective, queer theorists such as Lynne Huffer and Jasbir Puar have also criticized intersectionality as a theory of identity. Unlike Zack, however, their concern is not with the proliferation of incommensurable identities but rather with the ways in which the notion of intersectionality remains, as Puar says, “primarily trapped within the logic of identity” (Puar 2012, 60). As Huffer puts the point: “the institutionalization of intersectionality as the only approach to gender and sexuality that takes difference seriously masks intersectionality’s investment in a subject-making form of power-knowledge that runs the risk of perpetuating precisely the problems intersectionality had hoped to alleviate” (Huffer 2013, 18). Puar argues further that the primary concepts of intersectionality, including gender, race, class, and sexuality, are themselves the product of Eurocentric, modernist, and colonial discourses and practices and, as such, are problematic from the point of view of postcolonial and transnational feminism (Puar 2012).

Finally, Anna Carastathis has argued that the problem with intersectionality theory lies in its very success (Carastathis 2013 and 2014). Intersectionality has been, on her view, too easily appropriated by white-dominated feminist theory, cut off from its roots in Black and women of color feminism, and incorporated into a self-congratulatory progressivist narrative according to which “intersectionality is celebrated as a methodological triumph over ‘previous’ essentialist and exclusionary approaches to theorizing identity and power relations” (Carastathis 2014, 59; for related critiques, see Nash 2008 and 2019 and Puar 2012). Carastathis cites Kimberle Crenshaw’s lament that intersectionality’s reach is wide but not very deep, and suggests that this may be the result of aversive racism – that is, a desire to assert or establish racial innocence, but without really coming to terms with their own internalized racism – on the part of white feminists (Carastathis, 2014, 68–69).

In response to these sorts of criticisms of intersectionality, some scholars have attempted to reformulate the concept by understanding it as a family resemblance concept (Garry 2011) or by highlighting its provisionality (Carastathis, 2014). Others have argued for an expansion of the intersectional framework to better account for the experiences of diasporic subjects (Sheth 2014) or for a rethinking of this framework in relation to a Deleuzian notion of assemblage (Puar 2007 and 2012). Collins (2019) has proposed the development of intersectionality as a critical social theory through a reflection on its genealogy, epistemology, and methodology.

3.5 Poststructuralist Feminist Approaches

Most of the work on power done by post-structuralist feminists has been inspired by Foucault. In his middle period works (Foucault 1977, 1978, and 1980), Foucault analyzes modern power as a mobile and constantly shifting set of force relations that emerge from every social interaction and thus pervade the social body. As he puts it, “power is everywhere, not because it embraces everything, but because it comes from everywhere” (1978, 93). Foucault endeavors to offer a “micro-physics” of modern power (1977, 26), an analysis that focuses not on the concentration of power in the hands of the sovereign or the state, but instead on how power flows through the capillaries of the social body. Foucault criticizes previous analyses of power (primarily Marxist and Freudian) for assuming that power is fundamentally repressive, a belief that he terms the “repressive hypothesis” (1978, 17–49). Although Foucault does not deny that power sometimes functions repressively (see 1978, 12), he maintains that it is primarily productive; as he puts it, “power produces; it produces reality; it produces domains of objects and rituals of truth” (1977, 194). It also, according to Foucault, produces subjects. As he puts it, “the individual is not the vis-à-vis of power; it is, I believe, one of its prime effects” (1980, 98). According to Foucault, modern power subjects individuals, in both senses of the term; it simultaneously creates them as subjects by subjecting them to power. As we will see in a moment, Foucault’s account of subjection and his account of power more generally have been extremely fruitful, but also quite controversial, for feminists interested in analyzing domination.

It should come as no surprise that so many feminists have drawn on Foucault’s analysis of power. Foucault’s analysis of power has arguably been the most influential discussion of the topic over the last forty years; even those theorists of power who are highly critical of Foucault’s work acknowledge this influence (Lukes 2005 and, in a somewhat backhanded way, Morriss 2002). Moreover, Foucault’s focus on the local and capillary nature of modern power clearly resonates with feminist efforts to redefine the scope and bounds of the political, efforts that are summed up by the slogan “the personal is political.” At this point, the feminist work that has been inspired by Foucault’s analysis of power is so extensive and varied that it defies summarization (see, for example, Allen 1999 and 2008a, Bartky 1990, Bordo 2003, Butler 1990, 1993, 1997, Diamond and Quinby (eds) 1988, Fraser 1989, Hekman (ed) 1996, Heyes 2007, McLaren 2002, McNay 1992, McWhorter 1999, Sawicki 1990, and Young 1990). I will concentrate on highlighting a few central issues from this rich and diverse body of scholarship.

Several of the most prominent Foucaultian-feminist analyses of power draw on his account of disciplinary power in order to critically analyze normative femininity. In Discipline and Punish, Foucault analyzes the disciplinary practices that were developed in prisons, schools, and factories in the 18th century – including minute regulations of bodily movements, obsessively detailed time schedules, and surveillance techniques – and how these practices shape the bodies of prisoners, students and workers into docile bodies (1977, 135–169). In a highly influential essay, Sandra Bartky criticizes Foucault for failing to notice that disciplinary practices are gendered and that, through such gendered discipline, women’s bodies are rendered more docile than the bodies of men (1990, 65). Drawing on and extending Foucault’s account of disciplinary power, Bartky analyzes the disciplinary practices that engender specifically feminine docile bodies – including dieting practices, limitations on gestures and mobility, and bodily ornamentation. She also expands Foucault’s analysis of the Panopticon, Jeremy Bentham’s design for the ideal prison, a building whose spatial arrangement was designed to compel the inmate to surveil himself, thus becoming, as Foucault famously put it, “the principle of his own subjection” (1977, 203). With respect to gendered disciplinary practices such as dieting, restricting one’s movement so as to avoid taking up too much space, and keeping one’s body properly hairless, attired, ornamented and made up, Bartky observes “it is women themselves who practice this discipline on and against their own bodies….The woman who checks her make-up half a dozen times a day to see if her foundation has caked or her mascara run, who worries that the wind or rain may spoil her hairdo, who looks frequently to see if her stocking have bagged at the ankle, or who, feeling fat, monitors everything she eats, has become, just as surely as the inmate in the Panopticon, a self-policing subject, a self committed to relentless self-surveillance. This self-surveillance is a form of obedience to patriarchy” (1990, 80).

As Susan Bordo points out, this model of self-surveillance does not adequately illuminate all forms of female subordination – all too often women are actually compelled into submission by means of physical force, economic coercion, or emotional manipulation. Nevertheless, Bordo agrees with Bartky that “when it comes to the politics of appearance, such ideas are apt and illuminating” (1993, 27). Bordo explains that, in her own work, Foucault’s analysis of disciplinary power has been “extremely helpful both to my analysis of the contemporary disciplines of diet and exercise and to my understanding of eating disorders as arising out of and reproducing normative feminine practices of our culture, practices which train the female body in docility and obedience to cultural demands while at the same time being experienced in terms of power and control” (ibid). Bordo also highlights and makes use of Foucault’s understanding of power relations as inherently unstable, as always accompanied by, even generating, resistance (see Foucault 1983). “So, for example, the woman who goes into a rigorous weight-training program in order to achieve the currently stylish look may discover that her new muscles give her the self-confidence that enables her to assert herself more forcefully at work” (1993, 28).

Whereas Bartky and Bordo focus on Foucault’s account of disciplinary power, Judith Butler draws primarily on his analysis of subjection. For example, in her early and massively influential book, Gender Trouble (1990), Butler notes that “Foucault points out that juridical systems of power produce the subjects they subsequently come to represent. Juridical notions of power appear to regulate political life in purely negative terms…..But the subjects regulated by such structures are, by virtue of being subjected to them, formed, defined, and reproduced in accordance with the requirements of those structures” (1990, 2). The implication of this for feminists is, according to Butler, that “feminist critique ought also to understand how the category of ‘women’, the subject of feminism, is produced and restrained by the very structures of power through which emancipation is sought” (1990, 2). This Foucaultian insight into the nature of subjection – into the ways in which becoming a subject means at the same time being subjected to power relations – thus forms the basis for Butler’s trenchant critique of the category of women, and for her call for a subversive performance of the gender norms that govern the production of gender identity. In Bodies that Matter (1993), Butler extends this analysis to consider the impact of subjection on the bodily materiality of the subject. As she puts is, “power operates for Foucault in the constitution of the very materiality of the subject, in the principle which simultaneously forms and regulates the ‘subject’ of subjectivation” (1993, 34). Thus, for Butler, power understood as subjection is implicated in the process of determining which bodies come to matter, whose lives are livable and whose deaths grievable. In The Psychic Life of Power (1997b), Butler expands further on the Foucaultian notion of subjection, bringing it into dialogue with a Freudian account of the psyche. In the introduction to that text, Butler notes that subjection is a paradoxical form of power. It has an element of domination and subordination, to be sure, but, she writes, “if, following Foucault, we understand power as forming the subject as well, as providing the very condition of its existence and the trajectory of its desire, then power is not simply what we oppose but also, in a strong sense, what we depend on for our existence and what we harbor and preserve in the beings that we are” (1997b, 2). Although Butler credits Foucault with recognizing the fundamentally ambivalent character of subjection, she also argues that he does not offer an account of the specific mechanisms by which the subjected subject is formed. For this, Butler maintains, we need an analysis of the psychic form that power takes, for only such an analysis can illuminate the passionate attachment to power that is characteristic of subjection.

Although many feminists have found Foucault’s analysis of power extremely fruitful and productive, Foucault has also had his share of feminist critics. In a very influential early assessment, Nancy Fraser argues that, although Foucault’s work offers some interesting empirical insights into the functioning of modern power, it is “normatively confused” (Fraser 1989, 31). In his writings on power, Foucault seems to eschew normative categories, preferring instead to describe the way that power functions in local practices and to argue for the appropriate methodology for studying power. He even seems to suggest that such normative notions as autonomy, legitimacy, sovereignty, and so forth, are themselves effects of modern power (this point has been contested recently in the literature on Foucault; see Allen 2008a and Oksala 2005). Fraser claims that this attempt to remain normatively neutral or even critical of normativity is incompatible with the politically engaged character of Foucault’s writings. Thus, for example, although Foucault claims that power is always accompanied by resistance, Fraser argues that he cannot explain why domination ought to be resisted. As she puts it, “only with the introduction of normative notions of some kind could Foucault begin to answer such questions. Only with the introduction of normative notions could he begin to tell us what is wrong with the modern power/knowledge regime and why we ought to oppose it” (1989, 29). Other feminists have criticized the Foucaultian claim that the subject is an effect of power. According to feminists such as Linda Martín Alcoff and Seyla Benhabib, such a claim implies a denial of agency that is incompatible with the demands of feminism as an emancipatory social movement (Alcoff 1990, Benhabib 1992, and Benhabib et al. 1995; for a reply to this line of criticism, see Allen 2008a chs. 2 and 3). Finally, Nancy Hartsock (1990 and 1996) calls into question the usefulness of Foucault’s work as an analytical tool. Hartsock makes two related arguments against Foucault. First, she argues that his analysis of power is not a theory for women because it does not examine power from the epistemological point of view of the subordinated; in her view, Foucault analyzes power from the perspective of the colonizer, rather than the colonized (1990). Second, Foucault’s analysis of power fails to adequately theorize structural relations of inequality and domination that undergird women’s subordination; this is related to the first argument because “domination, viewed from above, is more likely to look like equality”(1996, 39; for a response to this critique, see Allen 1996 and 1999).

Despite these and other trenchant feminist critiques of Foucault (see, for example, Hekman, ed. 1996 and Ramazanoglu, ed. 1993), his analysis of power continues to be an extremely useful resource for feminist conceptions of domination. For recent important feminist work that draws on Foucault’s genealogical method to offer an intersectional analysis of racism and gender or sexual oppression see Feder (2007) and McWhorter (2009).

3.6 Postcolonial and Decolonial Feminist Approaches

Postcolonial and decolonial theory offer overlapping critiques of historical and contemporary practices and discourses of imperial and colonial domination. Yet they also have distinct lineages, theoretical commitments, and implications (for helpful discussion, see Bhambra 2014 and Ramamurthy and Tambe 2017). Postcolonial theory rose to prominence in the late 20th century, in association with the groundbreaking work of Edward Said (1979) and the Subaltern Studies Collective, and has been most influential in literary and cultural studies. Taking as its primary point of reference the northern European colonization of Southeast Asia and focusing primarily on the discursive and cultural effects of colonialism, postcolonial theory is deeply (though not uncritically) influenced by poststruturalism, particularly the work of Foucault and Jacques Derrida. Decolonial theory emerged somewhat later, in the early 2000s, in association with the Latin American and Carribean scholars in the Modernity/Coloniality group. Its primary point of reference is the colonization of the Americas that began in 1492. Heavily influenced by Latin American Marxism, world systems theory, and indigenous political struggles, decolonial theory focuses on the connections between capitalism, colonialism, and racial hierarchies. Although these two approaches are not mutually exclusive, decolonial theory is often viewed as the more radical of the two, due to its broader historical range and its calls for epistemic decolonization and delinking from capitalist modernity/coloniality (Ruíz 2021).

Gayatri Spivak's “Can the Subaltern Speak?” (1988) is widely viewed as the watershed text in postcolonial feminism. Spivak's essay opens with a critical discussion of an exchange betweeen Foucault and Gilles Deleuze, in which they reject the idea of speaking for the oppressed, insisting instead that the oppressed should speak for themselves. The first part of her essay is devoted to a critique of this claim and of the myriad ways in which Foucault and Deleuze ignore the epistemic violence of imperialism. It is Foucault and Deleuze’s insistence that the oppressed “can speak and know their conditions” that leads Spivak to formulate her famous question, “can the subaltern speak?” (78). If, as Spivak goes on to suggest, the subaltern can not speak, then the “subaltern as female is even more deeply in shadow” (83). Drawing on the example of the British banning the practice of sati in colonial India, Spivak suggests that the subaltern cannot speak because she is caught between imperialist discourse and patriarchal traditionalism, neither of which enables her to voice her experience: “Between patriarchy and imperialism, subject-constitution and object-formation, the figure of the woman disappears, not into a pristine nothingness, but into a violent shuttling which is the displaced figuration of the ‘third world woman’ caught between tradition and modernization” (102). In other words, there is no space from which the subaltern as female can speak and no way she can be heard or read.

Another emblematic text in postcolonial feminism is Chandra Talpade Mohanty's “Under Western Eyes” (1988). Mohanty's essay is framed as a critique of Western feminist analyses of “Third World Women” for their reductive and overly simplistic understandings of power and oppression. In such discourses, as Mohanty explains, “power is automatically defined in binary terms: people who have it (read: men) and people who do not (read: women). Men exploit, women are exploited. Such simplistic formulations are historically reductive; they are also ineffectual in designing strategies to combat oppressions” (73). By contrast, Mohanty calls for an intersectional understanding of power that refuses to homogenize or falsely universalize women's experience: “the…homogenization of class, race, religion, and daily material practices of women in the Third World can create a false sense of the commonality of oppressions, interests, and struggles between and among women globally. Beyond sisterhood there are still racism, colonialism, and imperialism” (77). Furthermore, by representing “Third World Women” as mere passive objects or victims of oppression, Western feminists implicitly position themselves as active subjects of resistance and revolutionary agents – which Mohanty calls “the colonialist move” (79).

Much of the agenda for decolonial feminism was set by Lugones in a pair of essays published in Hypatia (2007 and 2010). Building on the work of Anibal Quijano (2000), who argued that racialization is rooted in the structure of colonial capitalism, Lugones contends that gender itself is “a colonial concept and mode of organization of relations of production, property relations, of cosmologies and ways of knowing” (2007, 186). Seeing gender as a colonial concept enables feminists to break out of the ahistorical framework of patriarchy. As she explains: “To understand the relation of the birth of the colonial/modern gender system to the birth of global colonial capitalism–with the centrality of the coloniality of power to that system of global power–is to understand our present organization of life anew” (2007, 187). Lugones's decolonial feminist framework combines the insights of intersectionality theory with Quijano’s understanding of the coloniality of power (2007, 187–88). This brings into focus what Lugones calls the “modern/colonial gender system” (2007, 189), a system that is characterized by strict sexual dimorphism and presumed correspondence between biological sex and gender. In the later essay, Lugones simplifies her formulation somewhat: “I call the analysis of racialized, capitalist, gender oppression ”the coloniality of gender.“ I call the possibility of overcoming the coloniality of gender ”decolonial feminism“” (2010, 747).

3.7 Analytic Feminist Approaches

Although most of the approaches to dominaiton discussed above have been informed by the Continental philosophical tradition, analytic feminists have made important contributions to the feminist literature on domination as well. For example, Ann Cudd (2006) draws on the framework of rational choice theory to analyze oppression (for related work on rational choice theory and power, see Dowding 2001 and 2009; for critical discussion, see Allen 2008c).

Cudd defines oppression in terms of four conditions: 1) the group condition, which states that individuals are subjected to unjust treatment because of their membership (or ascribed membership) in certain social groups (Cudd 2006, 21); 2) the harm condition, which stipulates that individuals are systematically and unfairly harmed as a result of such membership (Cudd 2006, 21); 3) the coercion condition, which specifies that the harms that those individuals suffer are brought about through unjustified coercion (Cudd 2006, 22); and 4) the privilege condition, which states that such coercive, group-based harms count as oppression only when there exist other social groups who derive a reciprocal privilege or benefit from that unjust harm (Cudd 2006, 22–23). Cudd then defines oppression as “an objective social phenomenon” characterized by these four conditions (Cudd 2006, 23).

As Cudd sees it, the most difficult and interesting question that an analysis of oppression must confront is the “endurance question: how does oppression endure over time in spite of humans’ rough natural equality?” (Cudd 2006, 25). Any satisfactory answer to this question must draw on a combination of empirical, social-scientific research and normative philosophical theorizing, inasmuch as a theory of oppression is an explanatory theory of a normative concept (Cudd 2006, 26). (That oppression is a normative – rather than a purely descriptive – concept is evident from the fact that it is defined as an unjust or unfair set of power relations). Cudd argues that social-theoretical frameworks such as functionalism, psychoanalysis, and evolutionary psychology are inadequate for theorizing oppression (Cudd 2006, 39–45). Structural rational choice theory, in her view, best meets reasonable criteria of explanatory adequacy and therefore provides the best social-theoretical framework for analyzing oppression. By appealing to a structural theory of rational choice, Cudd’s analysis of oppression avoids relying on assumptions about the psychology of individual agents. Rather, as Cudd puts it, “the structural theory of rational choice assesses the objective social rewards and penalties that are consequent on” the interactions and social status of specific group members and “uses these assessments to impute preferences and beliefs to individuals based purely on their social group memberships” (Cudd 2006, 45). But, as a structural theory of rational choice, the framework assumes “that agents behave rationally in the sense that they choose actions that maximize their (induced) expected utilities” (Cudd 2006, 46). In other words, structural rational choice theory models human actions as “(basically instrumentally rational) individual choice constrained within socially structured payoffs” (Cudd 2006, 37). When utilized to analyze oppression, structural rational choice theory suggests that the key to answering the endurance question lies in the fact that “the oppressed are co-opted through their own short-run rational choices to reinforce the long-run oppression of their social group” (Cudd 2006, 21–22).

Sally Haslanger’s work on gender and racial oppression, like Cudd’s, is heavily informed by the tools of analytic philosophy, though Haslanger also situates her work within the tradition of Critical Theory (see Haslanger 2012, 22–30). Haslanger distinguishes between two kinds of cases of oppression: agent oppression, in which “a person or persons (the oppressor(s)) inflicts harm upon another (the oppressed) wrongfully or unjustly” (314) and structural oppression, in which “the oppression is not an individual wrong but a social/political wrong; that is, it is a problem lying in our collective arrangements, an injustice in our practices or institutions” (314). Having made this distinction, Haslanger then argues for a mixed analysis of oppression that does not attempt to reduce agent oppression to structural oppression or vice versa. The danger of reducing structural oppression to agent oppression – what Haslanger calls the individualistic approach to oppression – is that doing so fails to acknowledge that “sometimes structures themselves, not individuals are the problem” (320). The danger of reducing agent oppression to structural oppression – what Haslanger calls the institutionalist approach – is that such an approach “fails to distinguish those who abuse their power to do wrong and those who are privileged but do not exploit their power” (320). Haslanger’s mixed approach, by contrast, is “attentive simultaneously [and, we might add, non-reductively] to both agents and structures” (11).

Haslanger also connects her account of structural domination and oppression to her analysis of gender. Haslanger offers what she calls a “focal analysis” of gender, according to which the core of gender is “the pattern of social relations that constitute the social classes of men as dominant and women as subordinate” (228). Other things – such as norms, identities, symbols, etc – are then gendered in relation to those social relations. On her analysis, gender categories are defined in terms of how one is socially positioned with respect to a broad complex of oppressive relations between groups that are distinguished from one another by means of sexual difference (see 229–230). As Haslanger explains, the “background idea” informing this account of gender is “that women are oppressed, and that they are oppressed as women” (231).

By claiming that women are oppressed as women, Haslanger reiterates an earlier claim made by radical feminists such as Catharine MacKinnon (see, for example, MacKinnon 1987, 56–57). Indeed, Haslanger’s analysis is heavily indebted to MacKinnon’s work (see Haslanger 2012, 35–82), though she does not endorse MacKinnon’s strong claims about the link between objectivity and masculinity, nor does she adopt a dyadic (or, to use Haslanger’s terminology, reductively agent focused) understanding of oppression. But, like MacKinnon, Haslanger believes that “gender categories are defined relationally – one is a woman (or a man) by virtue of one’s position in a system of social relations” (58). This means that “one’s gender is an extrinsic property, and…it is not necessary that we each have the gender we now have, or that we have any gender at all” (58). Since the social relations in terms of which gender categories are defined are relations of hierarchical domination and structural oppression, “gender is, by definition, hierarchical: Those who function socially as men have power over those who function socially as women” (61). As Haslanger admits, referencing the sex/gender distinction, this does not mean that all males have power over all females – but it does mean that females who are not subordinated by males are not, strictly speaking, women, and vice versa. Moreover, as Haslanger notes, “MacKinnon’s account of gender, like others that define gender hierarchically, has the consequence that feminism aims to undermine the very distinction it depends upon. If feminism is successful, there will no longer be a gender distinction as such” because the complex of social relations of domination and structural oppression that give gender its meaning will no longer exist (62). While endorsing MacKinnon’s radical conclusion with respect to the currently existing gender categories of ‘man’ and ‘woman’, Haslanger’s own account offers a somewhat more nuanced view that allows for the future possibility of a kind of gender difference that would not be predicted on gender dominance: “gender can be fruitfully understood as a higher order genus that includes not only the hierarchical social positions of man and woman, but potentially other non-hierarchical social positions defined in part by reference to reproductive function. I believe gender as we know it takes hierarchical forms as men and women; but the theoretical move of treating men and women as only two kinds of gender provides resources for thinking about other (actual) genders, and the political possibility of constructing non-hierarchical genders” (235)

4. Power as Empowerment

Up to this point, this entry has focused on power understood in terms of an oppressive or unjust power-over relationship. I have used the term “domination” to refer to such relationships, though some of the theorists discussed above prefer the terms “oppression” or “subjection,” and others refer to this phenomenon simply as “power.” However, a significant strand of feminist theorizing of power starts with the contention that the conception of power as power-over, domination, or control is implicitly masculinist. In order to avoid such masculinist connotations, many feminists from a variety of theoretical backgrounds have argued for a reconceptualization of power as a capacity or ability, specifically, the capacity to empower or transform oneself and others. Thus, these feminists have tended to understood power not as power-over but as power-to. Wartenberg (1990) argues that this feminist understanding of power, which he calls transformative power, is actually a type of power-over, albeit one that is distinct from domination because it aims at empowering those over whom it is exercised. However, most of the feminists who embrace this transformative or empowerment-based conception of power explicitly define it as an ability or capacity and present it as an alternative to putatively masculine notions of power-over. Thus, in what follows, I will follow their usage rather than Wartenberg’s.

For example, Jean Baker Miller claims that “women’s examination of power…can bring new understanding to the whole concept of power” (Miller 1992, 241). Miller rejects the definition of power as domination; instead, she defines it as “the capacity to produce a change – that is, to move anything from point A or state A to point B or state B” (Miller 1992, 241). Miller suggests that power understood as domination is particularly masculine; from women’s perspective, power is understood differently: “there is enormous validity in women’s not wanting to use power as it is presently conceived and used. Rather, women may want to be powerful in ways that simultaneously enhance, rather than diminish, the power of others” (Miller 1992, 247–248).

Similarly, Virginia Held argues against the masculinist conception of power as “the power to cause others to submit to one’s will, the power that led men to seek hierarchical control and…contractual constraints” (Held 1993, 136). Held views women’s unique experiences as mothers and caregivers as the basis for new insights into power; as she puts it, “the capacity to give birth and to nurture and empower could be the basis for new and more humanly promising conceptions than the ones that now prevail of power, empowerment, and growth” (Held 1993, 137). According to Held, “the power of a mothering person to empower others, to foster transformative growth, is a different sort of power from that of a stronger sword or a dominant will” (Held 1993, 209). On Held’s view, a feminist analysis of society and politics leads to an understanding of power as the capacity to transform and empower oneself and others.

This conception of power as transformative and empowering is also a prominent theme in lesbian feminism and ecofeminism. For example, Sarah Lucia Hoagland is critical of the masculine conception of power with its focus on “state authority, police and armed forces, control of economic resources, control of technology, and hierarchy and chain of command” (Hoagland 1988, 114). Instead, Hoagland defines power as “power-from-within” which she understands as “the power of ability, of choice and engagement. It is creative; and hence it is an affecting and transforming power but not a controlling power” (Hoagland 1988, 118). Similarly, Starhawk claims that she is “on the side of the power that emerges from within, that is inherent in us as the power to grow is inherent in the seed” (Starhawk 1987, 8). For both Hoagland and Starhawk, power-from-within is a positive, life-affirming, and empowering force that stands in stark contrast to power understood as domination, control or imposing one’s will on another.

A similar understanding of power can also be found in the work of the prominent French feminists Luce Irigaray and Hélène Cixous. Irigaray, for example, urges feminists to question the definition of power in phallocratic cultures, for if feminists “aim simply for a change in the distribution of power, leaving intact the power structure itself, then they are resubjecting themselves, deliberately or not, to a phallocratic order” (Irigaray 1985, 81), that is, to a discursive and cultural order that privileges the masculine, represented by the phallus. If we wish to subvert the phallocratic order, according to Irigaray, we will have to reject “a definition of power of the masculine type” (Irigaray 1985, 81). Some feminists interpret Irigaray’s work on sexual difference as suggesting an alternative conception of power as transformative, a conception that is grounded in a specifically feminine economy (see Irigaray 1981 and Kuykendall 1983). Similarly, Cixous claims that “les pouvoirs de la femme” do not consist in mastering or exercising power over others, but instead are a form of “power over oneself” (Cixous 1977, 483–84).

Along similar lines, Nancy Hartsock refers to the understanding of power “as energy and competence rather than dominance” as “the feminist theory of power” (Hartsock 1983, 224). Hartsock argues that precursors of this theory can be found in the work of some women who did not consider themselves to be feminists – most notably, Hannah Arendt, whose rejection of the command-obedience model of power and definition of ‘power’ as “the human ability not just to act but to act in concert” overlaps significantly with the feminist conception of power as empowerment (1970, 44). Arendt’s definition of ‘power’ brings out another aspect of the definition of ‘power’ as empowerment because of her focus on community or collective empowerment (on the relationship between power and community, see Hartsock 1983, 1996). This aspect of empowerment is evident in Mary Parker Follett’s distinction between power-over and power-with; for Follett, power-with is a collective ability that is a function of relationships of reciprocity between members of a group (Follett 1942). Hartsock finds it significant that the theme of power as capacity or empowerment has been so prominent in the work of women who have written about power. In her view, this points in the direction of a feminist standpoint that “should allow us to understand why the masculine community constructed…power, as domination, repression, and death, and why women’s accounts of power differ in specific and systematic ways from those put forward by men….such a standpoint might allow us to put forward an understanding of power that points in more liberatory directions” (Hartsock 1983, 226).

The notion of empowerment has also been taken up widely by advocates of so-called “power feminism.” A reaction against a perceived over-emphasis on women’s victimization and oppression in feminism of the 1980s, power feminism emerged in the 1990s in the writings of feminists such as Camille Paglia, Katie Roiphe, Christina Hoff Sommers, and Naomi Wolf. Although this movement has had more influence in mainstream media and culture than in academia – indeed, in many ways it can be read as a critique of academic feminism – it has also sparked scholarly debate. As Mary Caputi argues in her book Feminism and Power: The Need for Critical Theory (2013), power feminists reject not only the excessive focus on women’s victimization but also the claim, made by earlier empowerment theorists, that women are “sensitive creatures given more to a caring, interconnected web of human relationships than to the rugged individualism espoused by men” (Caputi 2013, 4). In contrast, power feminists endorse a more individualistic, self-assertive, even aggressive conception of empowerment, one that tends to define empowerment in terms of individual choice with little concern for the contexts within which choices are made or the options from which women are able to choose. Caputi argues that power feminism relies on and mimetically reproduces a problematically masculinist conception of power, one “enthralled by the display of ‘power over’ rather than ‘power with’…” (Caputi 2013, xv). As she puts it: “feminism must query the uncritical endorsement of an empowerment aligned with a masculinist will to power, and disown the tough, sassy, self-assured but unthinking ‘feminist’” (Caputi 2013, 17). Because of its tendency to mimic an individualistic, sovereign, and masculinist conception of power over, power feminism, according to Caputi, “does little, if anything, to rethink our conception of power” (Caputi 2013, 89). In order to prompt such a rethinking, Caputi turns to the resources of the early Frankfurt School of critical theory and to the work of Jacques Derrida.

Serene Khader’s Adaptive Preferences and Women’s Empowerment offers another rethinking of empowerment in feminist theory. Focusing on empowerment in the context of international development practice, Khader develops a deliberative perfectionist account of adaptive preferences. Rather than defining adaptive preferences in terms of autonomy deficits, Khader defines them as preferences “inconsistent with basic flourishing…that are formed under conditions nonconductive to basic flourishing and…that we believe people might be persuaded to transform upon normative scrutiny of their preferences and exposure to conditions more conducive to flourishing” (Khader 2011, 42). The perfectionism in her account leads her to emphasize the distinction between merely adaptive preferences – those formed through adaptation to existing social conditions – and what she calls “inappropriately adaptive preferences” (IAPs) – preferences that are adaptive to bad or oppressive social conditions and that are harmful to those who adopt them (52–53). She also insists that IAPs are most often selective rather than global self-entitlement deficits (109), which means that they impact individuals’ sense of their own worth or entitlement to certain goods not globally but rather in particular domains and contexts and in relation to certain specific individuals or groups. This allows her to acknowledge the psychological effects of oppression working through the mechanism of IAPs without denying the possibility of agency on the part of the oppressed.

Khader draws on her deliberative perfectionist account of IAPs to diagnose and move beyond certain controversies over the notion of empowerment that have emerged in feminist development practice and theorizing. As the concept of women’s empowerment has become central to international development practice, feminists have raised concerns about the ideological effects of this shift. While acknowledging that the language of empowerment in development practice can have ideological effects, Khader addresses these concerns by providing a clearer conception of empowerment than the one implicit in the development literature and emphasizing what she understands as the normative core of this concept, its relation to human flourishing. She defines empowerment as the “process of overcoming one or many IAPs through processes that enhance some element of a person’s concept of self-entitlement and increase her capacity to pursue her own flourishing” (Khader 2011, 176). This definition of empowerment enables her to rethink certain dilemmas of empowerment that have emerged in development theory and practices. For example, many development practitioners define empowerment in terms of choice, and then struggle to make sense of apparently self-subordinating choices. If choice equals empowerment, then does this mean that the choice to subordinate or disempower oneself is an instance of empowerment? Khader’s finely grained analysis provides an elegant way out of this dilemma by emphasizing the conditions under which choices are made and the tradeoffs among different domains or aspects of flourishing that these conditions may necessitate. Discussing a case of young women in Tanzania who chose to undergo clitoridectomy after receiving education about the practice aimed at empowering them, Khader writes: “Are the young women who choose clitoridectomy disempowered because they have few options for unambiguously pursuing their flourishing or are they empowered because they have exercised agential capacities by making a choice? My analysis of IAP allows us to say both” (187). For Khader, empowerment is a messy, complex, and incremental concept. Her analysis of empowerment enables us to see that “self-subordinating choices can have selective empowering effects under disempowering conditions” (189). But the normative core of her account, its deliberative perfectionism, insists that “a situation where one cannot seek one’s basic flourishing across multiple domains is a tragic one” (189).

5. Concluding thoughts

The concept of power is central to a wide variety of debates in feminist philosophy. Indeed, the very centrality of this concept to feminist theorizing creates difficulties in writing an entry such as this one: since the concept of power is operative on one way or another in almost all work in feminist theory, it is extremely difficult to place limits on the relevant sources. Throughout, I have emphasized those texts and debates in which the concept of power is a central theme, even if sometimes an implicit one. I have also prioritized those authors and texts that have been most influential within feminist philosophy, as opposed to the wider terrain of feminist theory or gender studies, though I acknowledge that this distinction is difficult to maintain and perhaps not always terribly useful. Debatable as such framing choices may be, they do offer some much needed help in delimiting the range of relevant sources and providing focus and structure to the discussion.


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