Continental Feminism

First published Tue Nov 10, 2020

Continental feminism denotes an approach to feminist issues in philosophy and the world both via figures and methods of what is called the “Continental” tradition in philosophy and via critical interventions into this tradition. Continental tradition in philosophy today refers to a set of nineteenth and twentieth century figures and theoretical traditions from mainland Europe, arising as a way for English-speaking philosophers in the United States to distinguish their approach to philosophical questions from that of the analytic tradition. By utilizing one or more of the signature schemas of the Continental tradition, Continental feminists contribute to problem areas ranging from metaphysics, epistemology, aesthetics, ethics, and social and political philosophy. Continental feminism thus refers to a body and style of work consisting of feminist interpretations of mainstream Continental figures (largely from what is called “Continental Europe”, such as Hegel, Levinas, Derrida, Foucault); feminist uses of psychoanalysis, phenomenology, deconstruction, genealogy, and critical theory; and of interpretations of European feminists and figures such as de Beauvoir, Irigaray, Arendt, and Kristeva. Note, however, that Europe is not and has never been a continent, and in this sense, Continental feminism, like Continental philosophy, is more of an imagined community of approaches, figures, and traditions, or an umbrella concept, rather than a precise term.

Elaine Miller points out that the term “Continental feminism” came into circulation in the United States in 2007 (Miller 2017); as she defines it, Continental feminism

involves a commitment to the historicity of philosophical concepts, including the sometimes-uncomfortable contexts of their production, a belief that it is through the examination of texts that the genealogy of ideas can be traced and resources for critically responding to them can be formulated, and that the “canon” is subject to constant re-interrogation and reconfiguration. (Miller 2017: 154)

In Allison Stone’s terms,

describing the world as it really is—not as an aggregate of static items but as an ever-shifting web of relations—calls for unfamiliar, difficult language. (Stone 2015: 4)

A distinguishing feature of Continental feminism, Miller and Stone agree, is that it

embodies a refusal to prima facie privilege clarity and succinctness of argument over acknowledging through language the complexity, difficulty, and problematic nature of the issues being addressed. (Miller 2017: 154; Stone 2015: 2)

As a way of beginning to address the Euro- and U.S.-centric biases of continental philosophy, a transContinental turn in Continental feminism proposed by Kyoo Lee and Alyson Cole aims to incorporate a global view of feminist issues and theories, where

“trans” serves as a marker for the constant geo-cultural flows of ideas in transit, as in “transatlantic”, “transpacific”, “transoceanic”, etc., as well as for cutting-edge works, conversations, and debates in trans-critical, cultural, disciplinary, human, gender, genic, lingual, medial, national fields, etc., and as trans*feminist discourses. (Cole and Lee 2019: iv)

Accordingly, this entry will take Continental feminism to include the following distinct yet related set of issues and areas: (1) the feminist use of figures, traditions, and approaches of phenomenology/existentialism, psychoanalysis, post-structuralism (deconstruction and genealogy), and critical theory; (2) critical interventions into the assumptions about sex, gender, class, race, ability, religion, and age endemic to European philosophy; and (3) interpretations of hitherto underrepresented figures and methods of feminism from a transContinental and transAtlantic perspective that establish new, abandoned, or previously delegitimated genealogies for feminist thought.

It is important to note that not all Continental feminists are philosophers or work in Philosophy departments; thus, Continental feminism is interdisciplinary and its practitioners come from various fields. As this subfield developed in the early 2000s, there were already disciplinary, intra-disciplinary and extra-disciplinary projects that explored feminist issues by utilizing phenomenological, psychoanalytic, deconstructive, and critical theoretical approaches. Rather than organizing this entry around the signature schemas of the Continental tradition and subsuming ongoing work that uses these approaches under them, this entry will locate crucial genealogies for Continental feminism in the work of Black feminists, post- and decolonial feminists, women of color feminists, Asian American feminists, trans feminists, and queer feminists. We take these genealogies as central to the past, present, and future of Continental feminism, and accordingly this entry is organized topically, in order to outline the ways that Continental feminisms have developed in conversation and in tension with these interdisciplinary projects. These projects have been unearthing the cissexist, sexist/misogynistic, racist, heterosexist, classist, ageist, ableist, colonial commitments of philosophy as a discipline and a professional field as they are simultaneously expanding, transforming, and pushing the concerns and methods of Continental thought in interdisciplinary iterations. Indeed, what distinguishes Continental feminism clearly from Analytic feminism are its call for interdisciplinarity and its belief that feminist omissions themselves can become sites from which new projects are launched, as will be highlighted throughout this entry. As such, Continental feminism starts with the premise that European or Anglo-American norms and categories of thought can be interpreted, critiqued, and re-envisioned or abandoned for feminist purposes.

1. Characteristics of Continental Feminism

Continental feminists share with other Continental thinkers an interest in close reading that uses careful exegesis to unpack the deep meanings of texts through attention to their linguistic and historical specificity. However, to utilize a philosophical tradition that has largely presumed rather than explored the impacts of sex and gender on material life, continental feminists often read irreverently to focus on concerns that traditional philosophy might push to the side. While all feminist theorizing deals with questions of power, subjectivity, and culture, Continental feminist approaches to these issues are often critical in the sense that they explore how external power dynamics affect the constitution of inner experiences, and in turn how embodied and subjective re-articulations of power can and should transform the world in the pursuit of justice. This frequently involves taking lived experience as a crucial component of critical philosophy; as Gail Weiss puts it,

only by interrogating the “ordinary” dimensions of experience is it possible to arrive at an understanding of the dynamic forces that give meaning to individual lives and that are both the obstacle and the vehicle to achieving lasting social change. (Weiss 2008: 5)

To present a broad sketch of characteristics of continental feminism throughout its history, this section focuses on methods that Continental feminists use to engage embodied experience in their projects. The gendered critique of the traditional Western philosophical tendency to dichotomize the body that feels and the mind that thinks is an ongoing theme in continental feminism (see entry on feminist perspectives on the body). The account presented here is not at all complete, as the specific aims and methods of such feminist projects differ widely, most importantly in terms of how an analysis of sex and gender is impacted by other aspects of embodied experience such as race, sexuality, and ability. This section first addresses some ways that continental feminists trouble a mind-body distinction by engaging affect and emotion in their work. Next, it explores two examples of how continental traditions, psychoanalysis and phenomenology, are made into critical resources in Continental feminist projects. Finally, it presents work that engages an ongoing critique of culture and everyday experience as an important aspect of feminist theorizing.

Many Continental feminists focus on the overlaying of mental and physical experience via the concepts of affect, emotion, and feeling. Affect is described by Teresa Brennan as “the physiological shift accompanying a judgment” (Brennan 2004: 5). The “transmission of affect” describes the way that one can catch the mood of another; this experience is “social in origin but biological and physical in effect” (Brennan 2004: 3). Brennan describes transmission as when the “emotions or affects of one person, and the enhancing or depressing energies these affects entail” pass from one person to another (Brennan 2004: 3). Affect is thus one way to describe how social experience impacts the corporeal life of subjects through the transference of energy. In Brennan’s case, affective states are directional; they are not neutral but push or press on subjects. At the same time, terms like affect and feeling might be distinguished based on the extent to which one considers affect to be already coded with or influenced by social significance for a subject (see Ahmed 2010: 230–231, Seigworth & Gregg 2010, esp. 5–8).

Continental feminist projects on emotion often analyze historically contextualized experiences. Ann Cvetkovich engages with trauma in a way that

focuses on the everyday and the insidious…and situates it in a social and cultural frame rather than a medical one. (Cvetkovich 2007: 464)

She then presents a political account of depression that depathologizes such negatively-connotated emotional experiences so that they can become more visible in public and thus create a potential foundation for community (Cvetkovich 2007: 460). In The Cultural Politics of Emotion, Sara Ahmed argues that emotion is generated when meaning is produced across social-political interaction; these feelings create the boundaries of affinity groups and impact self-understanding. In this analysis, emotions help constitute what a person understands as their objective condition, and thus

emotions are not “in” either the individual or the social, but produce the very surfaces and boundaries that allow all kinds of objects to be delineated. (Ahmed 2004 [2014: 10])

Because feeling is often ambivalent and multi-faceted, rather than in spite of this complexity, social critics who attend to how affects are employed and manipulated in both textual and social-political argumentation can produce readings that trouble an easy dichotomy between what is a “good” and what a “bad” experience.

Psychoanalytically-informed projects use concepts such as trauma, mourning, melancholia, and abjection to analyze embodied experience (Irigaray 1974 [1985]; Spillers 1996; Butler 1997; Felman 2002; Oliver 2004; entry on psychoanalytic feminism). They frequently engage aesthetics as an aspect of social critique (Chanter 2008; Kristeva 1980 [1982]; Miller 2014). This allows a symptomatic reading of feeling to be interpreted back against the social order, as is seen in Judith Butler’s Frames of War. In this text, Butler analyzes what makes a life grievable and argues that the questions of who appears as a human, whose life should be protected, and who does not are all figured in advance of any particular political decision through a pre-reflexive manipulation of affect (Butler 2009 [2016: 64]). Supplementing democratic theory with Continental feminist interpretations, Noëlle McAfee deploys Kristeva and the resources in her thought, as well as psychoanalysis, specifically on the issues of affect and the notion of the “political unconscious” (McAfee 2000 and 2008).

Critical phenomenologists draw on the methods of phenomenology to demonstrate “the multiple ways in which power moves through our bodies and our lives” (Introduction, Weiss, Murphy, & Salamon 2020: xiv). Lisa Guenther understands critical phenomenology as both a way of doing philosophy and a way of approaching political activism (Guenther 2020: 15). Most characteristically, Guenther argues that critical phenomenology employs reworked versions of

Merleau-Ponty’s concept of the body schema to account for gendered and sexual schemas (Simone de Beauvoir, Iris Marion Young, Talia Mae Bettcher, Gayle Salamon), racialized schemas (Frantz Fanon, Lewis Gordon, Sara Ahmed, George Yancy, Alia Al-Saji), disability schemas (Kay Toombs, Lisa Diedrich, Havi Carel), and other aspects of lived experience. (Guenther 2020: 13–14)

A recent volume edited by Gail Weiss, Ann V, Murphy, and Gayle Salamon, entitled 50 Concepts for a Critical* Phenomenology (2020), shows that many of the central concepts of critical phenomenology intersect with Continental feminism.

Finally, considering the social and political import of inner states and the centering of quotidian experiences of power enable Continental feminists to explore culture as it develops. For instance, Shannon Sullivan’s Good White People: The Problem with Middle-Class Anti-Racism focuses on “the personal side of whiteness and white privilege” with attention to the embodied experience of race (S. Sullivan 2014: 19) to critique the ways through which white liberals set themselves up as altruistic, “good” white people through, e.g., hypocritical modes of tolerance that maintain white domination (S. Sullivan 2014: 4). Robin James’ Resilience & Melancholy explores pop music as a way to analyze the impact of neoliberal biopolitics; she combines music theory with psychoanalytic and Foucauldian philosophies to critique complicity with multi-racial white supremacist patriarchy and argues that music, e.g., Rihanna’s, offer strategies for countering this oppressive power (R. James 2015). In Irony in the Age of Empire: Comic Perspectives on Philosophy and Freedom, Cynthia Willett engages film and stand-up comedy to articulate a libidinal understanding of freedom that can counter the liberal paradigms of individuality with a sense of freedom defined “in terms of equality and solidarity” (Willett 2008: 14). Erin Tarver analyzes practices of sports fans, with particular attention to football, baseball, and basketball fans in the American South, to better understand how individual and group identities are maintained to “…shore up, reproduce, and very occasionally, subvert racial, sexual and gender hierarchies” (Tarver 2017: 3). This work is often interdisciplinary, and some of these projects work at the intersection between continental and pragmatist feminisms (see entry on intersections between pragmatist and continental feminism).

Simultaneously reading carefully and irreverently, continental feminists deepen the philosophical account of experience by integrating historically contextualized feeling into their projects, using and transmuting philosophical traditions and traditional figures, and interrogating everyday experiences in their embodied and cultural specificity. This work insists that meaning and social order function through unrecognized cooptation, subordination or exclusion in various intersectional constellations. In general, continental feminisms are less concerned with changing a woman’s place in a symbolic or social system, and more focused on upending such systems, as will be explored in more detail in the following sections.

2. Continental Feminism and Black Feminist Thought

This section on the convergences between Black and Continental feminist thought begins with a discussion about the history of Black feminist scholarship utilizing existential/phenomenological, psychoanalytic, critical, and hermeneutic approaches. It then introduces intersectionality as the major heuristic for Black feminist theorizing, and concludes by highlighting emerging areas and intersections between Black studies and Black feminist Continental thought.

Black women have long been contributors to the Continental philosophical tradition. One may argue that their contributions to professional philosophy started after the graduation of the first Black woman to earn the PhD in philosophy, Joyce Mitchell Cook, who completed the degree in 1965 from Princeton University. Even prior to this date, however, Black women engaged in projects that we can recognize as Continental feminist projects. Importantly,

many Black intellectuals in the United States going back (at least) to the nineteenth century offered what are now described as existential, phenomenological, and/or genealogical analyses of race and racism. (Belle 2012, 329 fn. 1)

These contributions did not always occur in the form of traditional philosophical discussions, nor are they always created by those who have professional degrees in philosophy, which is certainly true of the nineteenth and early twentieth century thinkers, Sojourner Truth, Maria W. Stewart, and Anna Julia Cooper.

Black feminists’ contributions to Continental philosophy demonstrate the ways in which their voices are crucial to both shaping and expanding the discipline. Kathryn Sophia Belle, Donna-Dale Marcano, and Maria del Guadalupe Davidson edited Convergences: Black Feminism and Continental Philosophy (del Guadalupe et al. 2010), the only text at the publication of this entry that addresses both these topics simultaneously. For the editors, the concept of convergence is demonstrated by the natural, historical, and necessary engagement of Black women with Continental philosophy. Belle writes,

Black feminist and womanist thinkers inevitably address the very same issues of agency, identity, alienation, power, and so on that are raised in much recent Continental philosophy. Likewise, from Immanuel Kant to the feminist thinkers of the present, Continental philosophy has engaged, to some extent, with issues of race and gender. (2010: 5)

The Black feminist tradition in Continental philosophy demonstrates that Black women are not strangers nor enemies of Continental philosophy; rather, their unique theoretical positioning affords them the opportunity to utilize, challenge, and expand the tradition.

Black feminist thinkers contribute to Continental feminist thought in at least two ways. First, they engage directly with Continental figures and theories. For example, Lorraine Hansberry comments that Simone de Beauvoir’s The Second Sex (1949, translated in 1953) was arguably the “most important work of this century” (1957 [1995: 129 and 133]), and Antillean thinker Paulette Nardal draws on both features of the Harlem Renaissance and existentialist thinkers like Jean-Paul Sartre to provide a phenomenological and genealogical account of how the Black race, and Antilleans in particular, have come to understand their own notion of race consciousness in “The Awakening of Race Consciousness” (1932). More recently, they engage with canonical figures and ideologies of Continental philosophy, as in the work of Kathryn Sophia Belle on Hannah Arendt (2014) or Kris Sealey on Emmanuel Levinas (2014). Second, regardless of their professional Philosophy degrees or lack thereof, Black feminist thinkers utilize the tools of the Continental tradition as part of their interdisciplinary approaches, as in the use of Foucault in the work of Sylvia Wynter (2003) and the use of Freud, Lacan, and psychoanalysis in the work of Hortense Spillers (1996).

Black feminist thinkers have frequently used intersectionality as an effective entry-point into conversations with the Continental tradition. Intersectionality is a Black feminist theory that describes the oppression that Black women experience as a result of lying at the nexus of simultaneously impactful identities, such as that of race, gender, class, and sexuality. As such, intersectionality can be used as a phenomenological tool to describe Black women’s lived experience of oppression. While legal theorist Kimberlé Crenshaw coined the term in 1989, the theory has been articulated at least since the mid-nineteenth century in Sojourner Truth’s proclamation, “Ain’t I a Woman?” (1851). In the speech, Truth highlights that Black women are treated with less respect than white women while bearing the same burdens of racism as Black men. Anna Julia Cooper wrote that Black women are

confronted by a both a woman question and a race problem and is as yet an unknown or an unacknowledged factor in both. (1892 [1988: 134])

In their collective statement from April 1977, The Combahee River Collective argues that

Black feminism [is] the logical political movement to combat the manifold and simultaneous oppressions that all women of color face

and that

[t]here is also undeniably a personal genesis for Black feminism, that is, the political realization that comes from the seemingly personal experiences of individual Black women’s lives. (Taylor 2017: 15 and 17)

Intersectionality is thus a hallmark of Black feminist thought because it prioritizes the lived experiences of Black women. In doing so, it supplies the tools to think about the extent to which one’s consciousness the world is informed by experiences of racism, sexism, classism, and homophobia.

In addition to its utility in explaining Black women’s lived experience, intersectionality also provides tools for Black feminists to critique the presumed whiteness and bourgeois-class status of feminism and to combat various forms of oppression and violence. Thus, intersectionality is also key to critiquing phenomenological analysis, that is, analysis of lived experiences and feminist movements through the lens of sociopolitical identities such as race, sex, and class. Angela Davis’s text Women, Race, & Class (1981) is an early model of this approach; it details the history of U.S. women’s movements and their consideration, or lack thereof, of the class-based and racial dimensions of womanhood. Texts such as Patricia Hill-Collins’s Black Feminist Thought: Knowledge, Consciousness, and the Politics of Empowerment (1990 [2015]) underscore the ways in which Black women create their own epistemological standpoint as a result of their lived experiences. In the 1970s to 90s, when Black women’s contributions to academia reached its zenith, Black feminist scholars such as Barbara Christian in “The Race for Theory” (1988), Toni Morrison in Playing in the Dark (1992), and Audre Lorde in “The Master’s Tools will Never Dismantle the Master’s House” (1984a) and “Age, Race, Class, and Sex: Women Redefining Difference” (1984b) exemplified Black women’s critiques of theoretical approaches that adopt a “neutral” stance toward feminist movements where neutral meant presuming all women to be white, middle-class, young or middle-aged, and heterosexual (see also Hull, Bell-Scott, & Smith 1982).

Current Black feminist work centers Black epistemologies, practices, and concepts. The burgeoning scholarship of Black women philosophers continue to push the boundaries of Continental feminism, as in the work of Lindsey Stewart’s work on Black feminist practices of freedom (2017), Camisha Russell’s work on the issues of race and gender in assisted reproduction (2018), and Axelle Karera’s work, which focuses on the Anthropocene and antiBlackness (2019). In addition to engaging with the canonical figures of the Continental tradition, Black thinkers harvest philosophy from their own perspective and experience of the world as well as their theoretical archives. Much of this more recent work intersects with Black Studies. The work of Black thinkers from disciplines other than philosophy are intersecting with Continental philosophical and feminist approaches, as seen in the works of such as Saidiya Hartman (1997, 2007, and 2019), Christina Sharpe (2016), Rizvana Bradley (2014 and 2018), Jennifer Nash (2019), Denise Ferreira da Silva (2007, 2014, and 2018), Riley Snorton (2017), Selamawit Terrefe (2020), and Zakiyyah Iman Jackson (2020).

3. Continental Feminism and Post- and Decolonial Thought

Continental feminist approaches to questions on colonialism revolve around two main sets of investigations: on the one hand, the interrogation of the hegemony of the West as an abstract category that is deployed strategically to exclude and inferiorize communities deemed Non-Western (Spivak 1999; Narayan 1997; Mohanty 1984), and on the other hand, the question of coloniality, which focuses on the political and epistemic ordering of the globe starting with the colonization of the Americas (Lugones 2003; Wynter 1995; Ortega 2016). To this end, these approaches both use schemas of the Continental tradition (such as phenomenology, psychoanalysis, genealogy, deconstruction, and poststructuralism) and call into question the geographic and racial assumptions that underlie Continental philosophy. For both of these approaches, an analysis of colonialism is inseparable from the political aim of challenging and undoing the colonial world. This challenge entails deconstructing the categories of the colonially determined globe (such as East-West, Western-Non-Western, Developed-Underdeveloped, First World-Third World, North-South) through focusing on the concrete lived experiences of individuals and communities. This section focuses on the general characteristics of these two Continental feminist approaches taken up under the rough categories of postcolonial and decolonial feminisms, with the former focusing on the Western-Non-western divide that marks colonial relations, and the latter on the North-South dialogues that emerge within the relations of coloniality. It concludes by highlighting coalitional thinking, a fundamental aspect of both post- and decolonial feminist approaches.

Postcolonial feminist approaches maintain that in order to interrogate the hegemony of the West, it is necessary to deconstruct the ways in which it is deployed to exclude the non-Western subject. Furthermore, such deployment is always a strategic one, insofar as the “West” is not a concrete geographical category, and the paradigm of Western subjectivity is continuously built by demarcating those who do not fit in it. Postcolonial feminisms are interdisciplinary and not limited to the field of philosophy, and they challenge the inscription of the gender, racial, and geographic categories that underlie the hegemony of the Western subject. In doing so, Continental feminist approaches engage with figures from poststructuralism and critical theory (such as Foucault, Derrida, Deleuze and Adorno), and they deploy methods such as genealogy and deconstruction (Spivak 1988; Mohanty 1984), in order to question the underlying geographic and gendered assumptions of these methods. In “Can the Subaltern Speak?” for example, Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak engages with French poststructuralism and questions the paradigms of speech/reason that deny the very possibility of capacities such as resistance for those that do not fit within the geographic, racialized, and gendered boundaries of Western Subjectivity (Spivak 1988). In doing so, she highlights the ways in which poststructuralism relies upon the very categories (of speech, reason, or universal subjectivity) that it ostensibly critiques.

The tension highlighted by Spivak, in which the Western Subject constitutes both the dominant subject and the only subject capable of resistance, underlies postcolonial feminisms’ critique of the alignment of the West with modernity and progress (McClintock 1995; Stoler 1995). Chandra Talpade Mohanty, in “Under Western Eyes”, criticizes the hegemony of Western approaches in defining the scope and goals of feminist struggles. Issues such as the veil debate, in this sense, point to the political and phenomenological racialization of the Non-Western woman (Al-Saji 2010; Sheth 2006). At the same time, Uma Narayan draws attention to the risks of fetishizing the category of the Non-Western and highlights how such a fetishization remains within colonially determined divisions (Narayan 1997; Narayan & Harding 2000). Namita Goswami, in Subjects That Matter, develops heterogeneity as a kind of conceptual continuity between feminism, philosophy, and postcolonial studies, which allows for an understanding of difference beyond oppositional and antagonistic terms (Goswami 2019).

Decolonial feminisms emerge primarily from the U.S. Latina and Latinx contexts and have a different genealogy, insofar as they are in dialogue with Latin American Philosophy, Continental Philosophy, Anglo-American Thought, and especially U.S. Women of Color feminisms. Focusing on North-South dialogues, Latin American and Latina Feminist philosophers such as Ofelia Schutte engage with the work of figures such as Nietzsche, Kristeva, and Irigaray while developing Latin American philosophy as a field in U.S. academic philosophy (Schutte 1984; 1993; for more, see the entry on Latin American feminism). Linda Martín Alcoff, for example, brings Latin American Philosophy (particularly the work of Enrique Dussel) in dialogue with existentialism and poststructuralism in order to develop the framework for Latinx feminisms (Alcoff 2006, 2015).

One of the major frameworks of decolonial feminisms is “the coloniality of power”, a term first introduced by Aníbal Quijano, and defined as “the social classification of the world’s population around the idea of race” (Quijano 2000: 1). In this sense, the colonization of the Americas is not only a historical moment, but also the emergence of race and the subsequent reorganization of the globe in accordance with what Walter Mignolo calls “the colonial difference”, denoting the abstract positioning of Europe as the global hegemonic power (Mignolo 2002). Decolonial feminisms take an intersectional approach to the coloniality of power and investigate, as María Lugones says, “the emergence of hegemonic gender arrangements along ‘racial’ lines” starting with the colonization of the Americas (Lugones 2007: 190). Decolonial feminists such as Lugones and Wynter bring poststructuralist critique in dialogue with Latin American philosophy and argue that dominant gender arrangements themselves are colonial; these arrangements, such as patriarchy, heterosexualism, or gender dimorphism mark concrete historical processes of the racial inscription of gender norms, starting from and with the coloniality of power (Lugones 2008; Oyěwùmí 2007; Wynter 2006).

Decolonial feminisms’ emphasis on historical critique is inseparable from a concern with the concrete lived experiences of women of color (Moraga and Anzaldúa 1981 [2015]; Pérez 1999; Lugones 2007, Sandoval 2000). Gloria Anzaldúa, in Borderlands/La Frontera, emphasizes bordered thinking as the underlying logic of contemporary systems of oppression, and she formulates the resistances of hybrid identities that emerge both out of and in response to such bordered thinking (Anzaldúa 1987). Mariana Ortega develops Latina feminist phenomenology in emphasizing both the lived experience of borderlands and exile, and the possibilities of resistance by developing “home-tactics” in and through these experiences (Ortega 2016).

Coalitional thinking is a fundamental aspect of both post- and decolonial feminist approaches. Mohanty calls for coalitions across borders in thinking through the concrete lived experiences and emphasizes the importance of situated and local struggles in understanding hegemonic power relations. Moraga and Anzaldúa, in their coedited collection This Bridge Called My Back, call for concrete and sustained coalitions that are based on an intersectional understanding of women’s lives, rather than abstract calls for sisterhood. Decolonial feminists such as Lugones, Chela Sandoval, Ortega, and Emma Pérez, maintain that coalitional thinking cannot be an afterthought for any anti- or decolonial struggles (Pérez 1999; Sandoval 2000).

As Continental feminism expands, it involves further conversations with and in-between these approaches. The questions around the “continent” of Continental feminism, as well as how such a continent is situated within the colonial geographic boundaries of the West and the Global North, continue to be challenged. As spaces for such a flow of ideas open up, further conversations on the possibility of coalition, as well as on challenging the limits of colonial thought continue to reshape the face of Continental feminism.

4. Continental Feminism and Queer Theory/Queer of Color Critique

The relationship between Continental feminism and queer theory is simultaneously productive and fraught. While far from exhaustive, this entry will first highlight some of the overlapping figures and approaches between the two fields, including examples of scholarship at their intersections. It will then briefly introduce one account of the tension between them. Finally, it will close with some reflections on the shared problems across these fields, including their historically white and Anglo-Eurocentric approaches, as well as how recent work in queer of color critique aligns with and points to new directions in Continental feminism.

In the late 1980s and the early 1990s, “queer” emerged as a reclamation of a homophobic slur and a rallying cry for a coalition of the marginalized against the tyranny of the normal (Barker & Scheele 2016; D. Hall & Jagose 2012; Warner 1993; Sedgwick 1993; Anzaldúa 1991 [2009]). Formed in the crucible of the AIDS crisis, which sharpened the need to understand the violence experienced by people excluded by norms related to gender and sexuality, “queer” was meant to bring attention to the range of sexual/gender practices deemed outside the purview of the normal. In one genealogy of queer theory, the field develops this early activist reclamation of the term queer into a wide-reaching critique of how norms operate in and through dominant conceptualizations of identity. Given this motivating impulse of deconstruction, or of denaturalizing categories such as sexuality, it is perhaps of no surprise that queer theory has historically been a field well-populated with figures (e.g., Lacan, Foucault, Derrida) and methodological approaches (poststructuralism, psychoanalysis, phenomenology) that have been associated with Continental philosophy, especially twentieth century European philosophy.

Queer theory frequently draws on, critiques, and expands the ideas of many figures and approaches that are seen as early progenitors of Continental feminism (e.g., Beauvoir, Irigaray, Kristeva, feminist phenomenology, feminist poststructuralism, critical theory, psychoanalytic theory). As Jagose (2009) points out, however, the critique of normative identity categories was not invented by queer theory, given that feminist scholarship has a rich history of radically disrupting the category of women along lines of race and sexuality. Moreover, the lines between feminism and queer theory are historically blurred. For example, Judith Butler—who is often cited as an originator of queer theory—explicitly marks her early work as occurring in the intersection of these fields (as well as a number of other critical discourses) (1997). In Gender Trouble (1990) and Bodies that Matter (1993), Butler draws on Continental feminist figures such as Irigaray, Beauvoir, and Kristeva, and methods ranging from psychoanalysis to poststructuralism and phenomenology to develop a simultaneously queer and feminist theoretical lens focused on understanding the relationship between gender and sexuality, as well as the operation of norms and identity categories more broadly (Salih 2002).

A second major figure in the relationship between Continental feminism and queer theory is Michel Foucault, who has been extensively used in both queer and Continental (and specifically poststructuralist) feminist theory, but who (as opposed to Butler) did not explicitly use the terms queer and feminist. While a larger account of the connection between Foucault and queer theory is beyond the scope of this entry, the relationship is a rich one. In the late 1980s, Foucault’s The History of Sexuality, Volume One was read heavily by activists and scholars questioning dominant narratives around sexuality and identity (Halperin 1995); Foucault’s work was also influential not only for Judith Butler’s Gender Trouble (1990) but also for another text often cited as foundational for queer theory, Eve Sedgwick’s Epistemology of the Closet (1990 [2008]).

Foucault’s genealogical approach to identity, including his exploration of the histories and models of power at work in modern conceptions of sexuality, has been important for a number of contemporary scholars working at the intersections of feminism and queer theory (Huffer 2010 and 2020; Russell 2010; Sawicki 2005; Schotten 2018; Winnubst 2006). For example, Ladelle McWhorter (1999) takes up Foucault’s account of ethics as a practice of the self, or how we work on ourselves to become particular kinds of people, through a queer framework that resists expected developmental trajectories and normative timelines of a life (e.g., heterosexual coupling resulting in marriage and children). And in a different vein, Jasbir Puar (2007) has drawn on Foucault’s theories of power (as well as a wide range of interdisciplinary theory including postcolonial feminist theory) to analyze the relationship between contemporary biopower and homonationalism, or how certain “good” gay and lesbian subjects, by aligning themselves with U.S. imperialism, are welcomed into the nation-state.

Figures associated with Continental feminism who do not necessarily mark themselves or their work as queer have also been used in queer theoretical projects, just as feminists have historically done with any number of non-feminist philosophers. For example, queer studies scholars have explored the relative absence of Irigaray in queer theory, argued for the queer resources of her thinking (Huffer 2013; Winnubst 2006), called attention to the potential use of Irigaray’s disruption of binaries for queer analyses of identity (Butler 1993: 36–39; Grosz 1989), and used Irigarayan concepts to develop queer analyses of longstanding feminist issues, such as the experience of breast feeding (R. Lee 2018).

Phenomenological methods can also track this traffic between Continental feminism and queer theory. For example, Sara Ahmed’s Queer Phenomenology (2006) explores the use of phenomenology in queer studies by asking, among other questions, how to understand the “orientation” of sexual orientation as the way bodies are directed towards particular objects and away from others. In developing this queer use of phenomenology, Ahmed acknowledges her debt to feminist philosophers of the body such as Sandra Bartky, Iris Marion Young, Rosalyn Diprose, and Gail Weiss, as well as early phenomenologists such as de Beauvoir and phenomenologists of race including Linda Alcoff, Frantz Fanon, and Lewis Gordon.

Given these examples of the overlap of figures and approaches in Continental feminism and queer theory, it is worth asking what distinguishes the approaches. One may be tempted to say that feminism focuses more on gender (historically, within continental feminism, this may be more commonly discussed as sexual difference) and queer theory focuses more on sexuality (including questions of pleasure, desire, and eroticism). Yet many working within Continental feminism, especially as inflected with French theory, also focus on questions related to sexuality such as pleasure, desire, and eroticism. And there are also reasons to be suspicious of how the gender-sexuality split is narrated as a feminist-queer split. While some have argued that there are good reasons to draw distinctions between these fields in order to do justice to their distinct concerns (G. Rubin 2011; Halley 2006), there have also been many challenges to overly programmatic forms of this separation (Huffer 2013) and accounts of how this narrative can overlook the field’s mutual interest in understanding the complex relationship between gender and sexuality, as well as the possibility of a queer feminism (Jagose 2009). Nevertheless, despite the overlaps in figures and archives, as well as the wealth of resources in queer theory on topics that Continental feminist philosophers hold dear (temporality, embodiment, identity, and desire, to name only a few), the relatively slow uptake of texts marked explicitly as queer theory has been noticeable (Winnubst 2010). This is not to erase the important work done at the intersections of these fields but to acknowledge that the relationship is not a seamless one. In their introductory comments to a “Roundtable on Continental Feminism”, Lynne Huffer and Shannon Winnubst (2017) note the relative lack of engagement with queer theory among the contributions, and they ask whether Continental feminism is capacious enough to embrace queer theory, a question that has also been posed to philosophy more broadly (Ahmed 2016b; Salamon 2009; Winnubst 2010).

Finally, both Continental feminism and queer theory have also been extensively critiqued for the whiteness and Anglo-Eurocentric nature of their archives. In one particularly well-known rendition of this critique, Cathy Cohen asks whether queer theory has lived up to its anti-identitarian promise of creating coalitions across difference (2005). As a way to intervene in the whiteness of queer theory (Johnson and Henderson 2005), Roderick Ferguson (2004) coined the term “queer of color critique” to describe how various intersections of race, gender, sexuality, and class operate in nationalistic discourses of identity and belonging; it is, in Ferguson’s words,

a heterogenous enterprise made up of women of color feminism, materialist analysis, poststructuralist theory, and queer critique. (Ferguson 2004: 149)

Other notable and early contributors to this sub-field include José Muñoz, E. Patrick Johnson, Chandan Reddy, and Gayatri Gopinath. Although the topics at work in queer of color critique concerning identity, embodiment, temporality, and affect have also been topics of central interests to Continental feminists, the uptake of queer of color critique, as with queer theory, has been slow in Continental feminism. However, as Continental feminism expands—as shown through this entry— the resources of queer theory and queer of color critique are waiting in the wings as crucial, if at times under acknowledged, interlocutors.

Like Continental feminism, queer theory and queer of color critique continue the longstanding feminist tradition of sending texts and ideas in directions they were perhaps never intended to travel. Recent trajectories at the crossroads of Continental feminism and queer studies include attention to neoliberal capitalism (Winnubst 2015; McWhorter 2012), sex and gender in ancient Greek metaphysics (Bianchi 2014); critical disability theory (Puar 2017; K. Hall 2014; Yergeau 2018; and Gallop 2019), Latina feminism and existential phenomenology (Ortega 2016), affect and temporality (Ahmed 2019; Amin 2017; Freeman 2019), and materialism and concepts of agency (Chen 2012). As explored in the next section, another important interlocutor with both Continental feminism and queer theory is transgender studies.

5. Continental Feminism and Trans Studies

A number of scholars have noted the complex interplay of shared and distinct concerns between trans, feminist, and queer frameworks (Namaste 1996 and 2009; Prosser 1998; Heyes 2003; Salamon 2010a; Stryker 2004). Emerging in the 1990s as a distinct field of academic inquiry, trans studies shares many of the intellectual roots of queer theory yet also departs from queer studies through its explicit focus on trans experience, including both non-monolithic nature of that experience and the importance of trans people speaking for themselves about their own lives. Likewise, while many of the theoretical frameworks and figures at the heart of Continental feminism are present in trans studies (e.g., post-structuralism, phenomenology, Foucauldian genealogy, materialism), there have also been important critiques of how Continental feminist approaches can ignore or sideline trans experience. Significantly, many of the philosophers working in Continental feminism and trans studies cited in this entry cross inter- and intra-disciplinary boundaries.

In exploring the relationship between Continental feminist and trans studies, it is crucial to acknowledge the forms that transphobia and trans-exclusionary gestures can assume in feminist discourse more generally. For an extended overview of this history, see the entry on feminist perspectives on trans issues. The entry explains points of terminology (trans, transgender, trans*, transsexual), as well as the historical emergence of transgender studies and the broader (i.e., non-Continental specific) relationship between feminist and trans issues.

In one widely recognized form of feminist transphobia (found in the work of trans-exclusionary radical feminists such as Janice Raymond), trans women are portrayed as not “real” women and as threats to feminist movements (Bettcher 2006, 2007; McKinnon 2018). However, there is another strand of feminist theory that has a distinct relationship to trans issues, and (importantly for present purposes) it is a lineage of feminism that draws heavily on Continental figures such as Butler. While there is no doubt that Butler’s work has been foundational in trans studies as well as in queer theory (Gerdes 2014; Salah 2007), it is also the case that her work has been critiqued for its selective use of trans experience (Prosser 1998; Namaste 1996; H. Rubin 1998). Critics point out that trans identity tends be affirmed in Butlerian queer feminist discourse when it can be used to demonstrate the actual constructedness of gender, or its lack of ontological necessity, but also that some trans identity is portrayed as problematically essentialist when accompanied by claims to “really be” a man or a woman and/or demands for medical transition (Valentine 2012). While Prosser and Rubin both critique this rejection of claims to gender realness from a phenomenological perspective (and Prosser (1998) from a psychoanalytic framework as well), Namaste (1996) focuses on the institutional reality of gender that is often sidelined in these debates. In response, Jack Halberstam has argued that, while Prosser’s frustration with a selective use of trans identity in queer and feminist theory is understandable, there are still significant problems with the normativity inherent in the idea of gendered realness (2005).

Notably, the proliferation of non-trans feminist writers working on trans issues in the 1990s led to Jacob Hale’s “Suggested Rules for Non-Transsexuals Writing about Transsexuals, Transsexuality, Transsexualism, or Trans” (1997 [Other Internet Resources]). Significant non-trans feminist analyses, following Hale and the emergence of transgender studies, include work by Cressida Heyes (2003) and Naomi Scheman (1996, 2016), both of whom articulate theoretical bases for solidarity between cis and trans feminists. There are also important instances of cis feminist theorists bringing trans issues directly into their own work as serious interlocutors, rather than as thought experiments (Ahmed 2016b; Colebrook 2015; Shotwell & Sangrey 2008) and collaborating with trans theorists (Heyes & Latham 2018). The term “cis” itself has also received more scholarly attention in the last two decades (Aultman 2014). While the original intention behind the term was to denaturalize non-trans subject positions, not all scholars agree that the term successfully destabilizes gender norms, particularly insofar as such norms are racialized (Enke 2012b).

More recently, there have been many new trajectories established at the crossroads of Continental and trans approaches to gender. A number of philosophers have written at the intersections of phenomenology and trans studies, particularly in critical phenomenology, which emphasizes questions of oppression and power in examining how things appear to us in the world (Weiss, Murphy, & Salamon 2020). Ephraim Das Janssen uses phenomenology, including the work of Martin Heidegger, to examine what transgender experience tells us about gender (2017). Megan Burke (2019) takes up Beauvoirian concepts to explore androgyny, trans identity, and agender experience. Gayle Salamon draws on the work of Maurice Merleau-Ponty to develop a phenomenology of transphobia in The Life and Death of Latisha King (2018a). Salamon merges a tradition of earlier work in phenomenology and trans studies (H. Rubin 1998; Prosser 1998) with critical phenomenology. Tamsin Kimoto (2018) has also used both Merleau-Ponty and Frantz Fanon to explore hormonal transition and transphobia.

Along similar lines, new work in psychoanalysis and trans studies is also revising longstanding psychoanalytic approaches to sex and gender, including coercive and pathologizing theories of trans subjectivity (Elliot 2014), and is using resources in psychoanalysis to theorize trans experiences from a less pathologizing perspective (Breslow 2017; Carlson 2010; Coffman 2017; Cavanagh 2010). For example, Amy Ray Stewart uses Julia Kristeva’s concept of “intimate revolt” to illuminate trans and queer experiences of psychic life (2017). Patricia Gherovici (2017) has written about trans phenomena and the need to revise psychoanalytic concepts using Lacanian theory and her own clinical experience working with trans people. Relying on both psychoanalytic and phenomenological frameworks, Salamon (2010a) has also defended Butler’s account of gender against the aforementioned critiques of its treatment of trans experience and developed her own psychoanalytic and phenomenological account of a dissonance between a felt sense of gender and an external appearance of a body that is attuned to trans experience.

There is also a body of work emerging that puts foundational figures in Continental feminism into conversation with trans studies. Marie Draz (2018) has placed feminist philosophical uses of Nietzsche, such as in the work of Butler (1990) and Rosalyn Diprose (2002), into conversation with trans scholarship on the institutionalization of gender categories, while Tim Johnston (2015) has argued that although scholars of gender and sexuality have used Irigarayan resources for discussing trans and queer issues, Irigaray’s own claim that ontology is sexed and that there is an impassable limit between the sexes conveys an unsalvageable cissexism, or privileging of non-trans experience. In a similar vein, Oli Stephano (2019) critiques Elizabeth Grosz’s emphasis on the irreducibility of sexual difference, showing that her ontology invalidates trans embodiment and subjectivities. This critique of Grosz follows earlier work by Eva Hayward (2017) on the transphobic implications of some of Grosz’s feminist materialist arguments. Gayle Salamon also critically examines the way that sexual difference operates as a limit to the reimagining of embodiment and materiality in the work of both Irigaray and Grosz (Salamon 2010a). María Lugones is another figure of widespread use in Continental feminism who has been regularly cited in scholarship on trans issues (Bettcher 2014b; DiPietro 2019; Draz 2017a; Malatino 2019). Finally, like Butler, the use of Foucault in trans studies has also changed dramatically over the last several decades. For example, Foucault’s work on types of modern power has been used (alongside women of color feminism, indigenous scholarship, and numerous other sources) to examine the violence caused by how state institutions administer legal gender categories in sex-segregated institutions and identity documents (Spade 2011 [2015]). Foucauldian feminist accounts of prison and punishment have also been put into conversation with scholarship rooted in trans and gender non-conforming experience (Dilts 2017; Vitulli 2018; Zurn 2016, 2019).

Trans studies continues, in different veins, many of the foundational questions of Continental feminism by bringing the tools of Continental philosophy to bear on questions of sex, gender, and sexuality, and vice versa, and it continually orients these conversations in new directions. Much of this work is informed by other areas of critical theory (e.g., critical race theory and decolonial theory) and pushes the traditional boundaries of Continental feminism. Recent scholarship on blackness and trans history, for example, has articulated the importance of developing frameworks capable of understanding the dimensions of racialized gender historically and today (Snorton 2017) and work on migration and Latinx trans people has highlighted the need to attend to both the limits of our political theory and the productive capacities of trans people of color for generating new worlds (Pitts 2018). Current conversations about the relationship between Continental feminism and trans studies must also involve attention to the material conditions of the academy itself, as the growing attention to trans experience in philosophy more broadly has not resulted in more trans voices and trans academics (Bettcher 2018 (Other Internet Resources); Marvin 2019, 2020). Future directions in Continental feminism and trans studies will need to be attentive not only to the intriguing philosophical questions occurring in these conversations, but also to the specific contours of the material conditions that allow trans scholarship to flourish.

6. Continental Feminism and Asian American Feminist Thought

This section explores the relationship between Continental feminism and Asian American feminist thought, both the tensions between the two as well as new directions that this relation brings to Continental feminism. A major point of convergence between the two fields is the focus on lived experience of Asian American women. This section begins by discussing the hypervisibility that Asian American women experience due to the specific forms of oppression that they face, namely, orientalization and the Model Minority myth. It then highlights the paradoxical form of invisibility that Asian American feminist phenomenologist trace in their body of work. Next, this section considers the historical position of Asian American women in coalitional feminist projects, especially focusing on the ways in which Asian American women have been relegated to a “tag-along” group. Finally, this section will highlight recent scholarship in Continental feminism that engages with Asian American feminist theory and draws upon both Eastern and Western traditions.

It must be noted from the outset that “Asian” is an exceptionally broad term, and the peoples that are considered Asian/Asian American have often changed throughout history. In accordance with anthologies by Asian American women that respond to this very issue, this section addresses the identities of women who trace their roots back to East Asia, Southeast Asia, and the Indian subcontinent (Asian Women United of California 1989; The Women of South Asian Descent Collective 1993).

In This Bridge Called My Back (Moraga & Anzaldúa 1981 [2015]), Asian American thinkers such as Genny Lim, Merle Woo, Nellie Wong, and Mitsuye Yamada established their positions in feminist theorizing by exploring their own perspectives on topics surrounding gendered identity, sexuality, silencing, the feeling of not-belonging, and living against stereotypes of Asian American women as docile, quiet, agreeable, and submissive. Similarly, in This Bridge We Call Home (Anzaldúa & Keating 2002), Minh-ha T. Pham, Shirley Geok-Lin Lim, and Jid Lee theorize from the specific experiences that they face as Asian American immigrant women, such as exploring a connection to an Asian mother who emigrated to the United States, navigating the cultural connection they still hold to a land that they may have never visited, and living in the face of the Model Minority myth while also subverting the stereotype. Writings that center the perspective of the Asian American and diasporic Asian woman are essential for Asian American feminist theorizing, for, as Sonia Shah emphasized,

[a]n Asian American feminist movement is the only movement that will consistently represent Asian American women’s interests. (1998: xix)

Two early anthologies were very important for the formation of Asian American feminism: Making Waves (Asian Women United of California [AWUC] 1989) and The Forbidden Stitch (Lim & Tsutakawa 1989); they both include writings from different ethnic and national backgrounds, specifically Chinese, Japanese, Filipino, Korean, Vietnamese, and Indian (Hill-Collins & Bilge 2016: 73). In a recent volume entitled Asian American Feminisms and Women of Color Politics, editors Lynn Fujiwara and Shireen Roshanravan present a series of articles emerging at the intersection of Asian American feminist engagement with Women of Color coalition politics, organizing around concepts, methods, and epistemic principles central to Women of Color feminist scholarship (Fujiwara & Roshanravan 2018)

Hypervisibility of Asian American women is a central issue in most Asian American feminist projects. Some Asian American feminist theorists, such as Robin Zheng, argue that Asian American women are hypervisible because they are hypersexualized, orientalized, and exoticized. Robin Zheng (2016) discusses the complexities of hypervisibility “Why Yellow Fever Isn’t Flattering: A Case Against Racial Fetishes”. Zheng argues that there is little difference between what is known as “yellow fever”, the racial fetishization and preference of Asian women and men, and what she calls the “Mere Preference Argument”, which attempts to claim that there is nothing morally wrong with preferring certain racialized phenotypic traits; as she shows, despite the origin of a racialized fetish, both yellow fever and other racialized fetishes “depersonalize and otherize” their subjects (2016: 412). Zheng shows that these fetishes are not just harmless personal preferences, but a set of practices and thought patterns that result in negative social impacts for Asian American women. Relatedly, Asian American women are also hypervisible due to the “Model Minority myth”, that is, the myth that asserts that Asian Americans are uniquely hard-working and thus, the ideal “model” minority, especially in contrast with other minority groups. This myth makes Asian American women hypervisible by making them a part of a group of people who are defined by their ability to achieve upward class mobility (K. Lee 2014).

Paradoxically, Asian American women are also rendered invisible in various feminist movements and discourses. Asian American feminist discussions on invisibility differ from other discussions within Continental feminism on visibility and feminine erasure due to their dual existence as both invisible subjects and hypervisible representations of stereotypes. Poet and activist Mitsuye Yamada states that Asian American women are “the visible minority that is invisible” (1981b). Yamada means this claim in two ways: first, in regard to how Asian American women are rendered invisible in conversations surrounding women of color oppressions; and second, in regard to how the oppressions experienced by Asian American women are often invisible to themselves. In order to carve out a space for themselves in feminist theorizing, Asian American women in this book shared their stories that demonstrate the struggle of becoming visible to oneself while existing in a world that constantly demands one’s invisibility. Yamada’s explains how she was invisible to herself because she practiced passive resistance while believing that others did not see her as the stereotype of an Asian American women. In order to become visible to herself and others, she realized that she must act in ways, such as displaying anger in response to sexist and racist acts, that an oppressive gaze would claim was “uncharacteristic” of her as an Asian American woman (1981b: 40). At the same time, the Model Minority myth can also paradoxically render Asian American women invisible by making them hypervisible as successful paradigms that are perceived as lacking experiences of oppression and violence and thus have no credibility to speak to these lived experiences.

As a result of this specific form of invisibility, Asian American feminists proposed new methods of political organization in order to include the voices of Asian American women in feminist coalitions. The similarities between writings that span nearly two decades gesture to one of the many issues faced by Asian American feminism: Asian American feminists have often been seen, and arguably still are seen, as a group in the background that is simply, as Yamada described, “tagging along” in feminist theorization against oppressions (1981b: 40). In other words, Asian American women are often seen as individuals who do not often experience oppressions that are specific to their own identities and, therefore, have no place in fighting oppression. In response to this, we can see activists such as Grace Lee Boggs, who have worked closely with other people of color in the fight against different oppressions (Boggs & Boggs 1974; 1998 [2016]; Boggs & Kurashige 2011); Lisa Lowe’s essay on heterogeneity, hybridity, and multipolicy of Asian American women’s experiences (Lowe 1991); and more recent Asian American feminist projects that include Asian Americans women in liberatory projects in a manner that does not simply relegate them to tag-along positions (Shah 1998; Fujiwara & Roshanravan, 2018).

A growing number of recent works in Asian American feminism engage with figures and themes in Continental feminism through the framework Eastern philosophy and the Asian American women’s perspective and as such they provide new directions for a genuinely transContinental feminism. For example, building on the discussions concerning gender in Continental feminisms, thinkers such as Kyoo Lee (2014) and Robin Wang (2016) have explored different ways that the gendered body has been discussed. Engaging with the concept of the “dark female animal” (xuapin) in Daodejing, Kyoo Lee explores the revolutionary potential of xuapin, which she claims possesses a gender-bending power. Lee argues that xuapin demonstrates

in a sense, superiority of femaleness and femininity –as the norm, albeit invisible and inaudible

and that it is

gender-bending: female and not female at once, heterosexualized and not at once. (K. Lee 2014: 59)

Wang investigates yin-yang gender dynamics through a variety of both Eastern and Western sources in order to answer whether yin-yang gender construction allows for gender equality. Alluding to Continental feminists who wrote on gender such as Simone de Beauvoir, Judith Butler, and Luce Irigaray, Wang discusses an exploration of gender through a Chinese framework (the yin-yang) that does not make a clear distinction between sex and gender. Wang argues that yin-yang gender construction offers a dynamic and fluid description of gender relationships (Wang 2016: 224).

7. Conclusion and New Directions in Continental Feminism

This entry has listed a number of ways in which Continental approaches and figures are used to address feminist issues; we have attempted both to describe some of the ongoing research areas in Continental feminism and to point out new directions it has been taking over the past decades. However, this list remains incomplete as we have been unable to account for all of the important work underway. A more complete entry would need to include projects on the intersection between Continental feminism and critical disability studies, indigenous feminisms, and new materialisms and humanisms. Furthermore, we do not mean to suggest that there is no overlap or intersection between the topics or figures grouped under each section heading here. Lastly, there is certainly ongoing work of which we are not aware that is already making an impact on the present and future of feminist scholarship. We thus conclude here not with a summative statement defining Continental feminism but rather by reflecting on the material conditions of Continental feminism.

When Linda Martín Alcoff addressed the Eastern American Philosophical Association in 2012, she reflected on the tension and issues within disciplinary philosophy and urged philosophers to “apply our diagnostic impulses to ourselves” (Alcoff 2013: 43). A necessary aspect of such praxis for Continental feminists in light of the genealogies considered here is exemplified by Audre Lorde who, speaking on the “Personal is Political Panel” at the Second Sex Conference in 1979, stated

I urge each one of us here to reach down into that deep place of knowledge inside herself and touch that terror and loathing of any difference that lives there. See whose face it wears. (Lorde 1984a: 101)

Lorde calls feminists to enact a humble and frank confrontation with their own embodied lives and senses of self in the context of each person’s differential implication in racist, sexist, heterosexist, classist and ableist power. Rather than imagining that one puts on one’s thinking hat and reflects “as a theorist” and then take it off and acts “as a regular person”, Continental feminisms suggest that the subject who theorizes is themself always an embodied subject: Kris Sealey reminds us that “Continental methods oftentimes refract differently across race and gender axes” and that for this reason, Continental feminists ought “to be intentional about the relationship they occupy, quite simultaneously, to racial and gender liberation” (Sealey 2017: 166). As this entry has shown, the diversity of Continental feminist thought has been developed through the thoughtful negotiation of many different struggles. For the imagined community of Continental feminism to continue to grow and support these projects, space must continually be made for new practitioners. Since, as we put above, Continental feminism is less concerned with changing a woman’s place in a symbolic or social system, and more on upending that system itself, members of this academic community must continue to do the work that will make it possible to learn from each other. Only in this way Continental feminism can be opened up fully to its interdisciplinary potential.


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The SEP editors would like to thank Dilek Huseyinzadegan, Jana McAuliffe, Tamsin Kimoto, and Jennifer Hansen for helping us to organize the team of coauthors who contributed sections to this entry. We note their contribution and acknowledgments as follows. Section 1 (“Introduction”) is authored by Dilek Huseyinzadegan, who thanks Jana McAuliffe and Marie Draz; Section 2 (“Themes and Characteristics of Continental Feminism”) is authored by Jana McAuliffe; Section 3 (“Black Feminist Thought”) is authored by Jameliah Inga Shorter-Bourhanou; Section 4 (“Post- and Decolonial Thought”) is authored by Selin Ege Islekel; Section 5 (“Queer Theory/Queer of Color Critique”) is authored by Marie Draz; Section 6 (“Trans Studies”) is co-authored by Marie Draz and Tamsin Kimoto; Section 7 (“Asian American Feminist Thought”) is authored by Erika Brown, who thanks Tamsin Kimoto; Section 8 (“Conclusion and New Directions”) is co-authored by Jana McAuliffe and Dilek Huseyinzadegan. Authors also thank Sarah Lee for helping with editing the penultimate version of the entry.

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Dilek Huseyinzadegan <>
Jana McAuliffe <>
Jameliah Inga Shorter-Bourhanou <>
B. Tamsin Kimoto <>
Ege Selin Islekel <>
Marie Draz <>
Erika Brown <>

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