First published Mon Jun 1, 2009; substantive revision Wed Dec 16, 2020

Patriotism raises questions of the sort philosophers characteristically discuss: How is patriotism to be defined? How is it related to similar attitudes, such as nationalism? What is its moral standing: is it morally valuable or perhaps even mandatory, or is it rather a stance we should avoid? Yet until a few decades ago, philosophers used to show next to no interest in the subject. The article on patriotism in the Historical Dictionary of Philosophy, reviewing the use of the term from the 16th century to our own times, gives numerous references, but they are mostly to authors who were not philosophers. Moreover, of the few well known philosophers cited, only one, J. G. Fichte, gave the subject more than a passing reference – and most of what Fichte had to say actually pertains to nationalism, rather than patriotism (see Busch and Dierse 1989).

This changed in the 1980s. The change was due, in part, to the revival of communitarianism, which came in response to the individualistic, liberal political and moral philosophy epitomized by John Rawls’ Theory of Justice (1971); but it was also due to the resurgence of nationalism in several parts of the world. The beginning of this change was marked by Andrew Oldenquist’s account of morality as a matter of various loyalties, rather than abstract principles and ideals (Oldenquist 1982), and Alasdair MacIntyre’s argument that patriotism is a central moral virtue (MacIntyre 1984). Largely in response to MacIntyre, some philosophers have defended constrained or deflated versions of patriotism (Baron 1989, Nathanson 1989, Primoratz 2002). Others have argued against patriotism of any sort (Gomberg 1990, McCabe 1997, Keller 2005). There is now a lively philosophical debate about the moral credentials of patriotism that shows no signs of abating. A parallel discussion in political philosophy concerns the kind of patriotism that might provide an alternative to nationalism as the ethos of a stable, well-functioning polity.

1. Conceptual issues

1.1 What is patriotism?

The standard dictionary definition reads “love of one’s country.” This captures the core meaning of the term in ordinary use; but it might well be thought too thin and in need of fleshing out. In the first philosophical book-length study of the subject, Stephen Nathanson (1993, 34–35) defines patriotism as involving:

  1. Special affection for one’s own country
  2. A sense of personal identification with the country
  3. Special concern for the well-being of the country
  4. Willingness to sacrifice to promote the country’s good

There is little to cavil about here. There is no great difference between special affection and love, and Nathanson himself uses the terms interchangeably. Although love (or special affection) is usually given expression in special concern for its object, that is not necessary. But a person whose love for her country was not expressed in any special concern for it would scarcely be considered a patriot. Therefore the definition needs to include such concern. Once that is included, however, a willingness to make sacrifices for one’s country is implied, and need not be added as a separate component. Identification with the country, too, might be thought implied in the phrase “one’s country.” But the phrase is extremely vague, and allows for a country to be called “one’s own” in an extremely thin, formal sense too. It seems that if one is to be a patriot of a country, the country must be his in some significant sense; and that may be best captured by speaking of one’s identification with it. Such identification is expressed in vicarious feelings: in pride of one’s country’s merits and achievements, and in shame for its lapses or crimes (when these are acknowledged, rather than denied).

Accordingly, patriotism can be defined as love of one’s country, identification with it, and special concern for its well-being and that of compatriots.

This is only a definition. A fuller account of patriotism is beyond the scope of this article. Such an account would say something about the patriot’s beliefs about the merits of his country, his need to belong to a group and be a part of a more encompassing narrative, to be related to a past and a future that transcend the narrow confines of an individual’s life and its mundane concerns, as well as social and political conditions that affect the ebb and flow of patriotism, its political and cultural influence, and more.

1.2 Patriotism and nationalism

Discussions of both patriotism and nationalism are often marred by lack of clarity due to the failure to distinguish the two. Many authors use the two terms interchangeably. Among those who do not, quite a few have made the distinction in ways that are not very helpful. In the 19th century, Lord Acton contrasted “nationality” and patriotism as affection and instinct vs. a moral relation. Nationality is “our connection with the race” that is “merely natural or physical,” while patriotism is the awareness of our moral duties to the political community (Acton 1972, 163). In the 20th century, Elie Kedourie did the opposite, presenting nationalism as a full-fledged philosophical and political doctrine about nations as basic units of humanity within which the individual can find freedom and fulfilment, and patriotism as mere sentiment of affection for one’s country (Kedourie 1985, 73–74).

George Orwell contrasted the two in terms of aggressive vs. defensive attitudes. Nationalism is about power: its adherent wants to acquire as much power and prestige as possible for his nation, in which he submerges his individuality. While nationalism is accordingly aggressive, patriotism is defensive: it is a devotion to a particular place and a way of life one thinks best, but has no wish to impose on others (Orwell 1968, 362). This way of distinguishing the two attitudes comes close to an approach popular among politicians and widespread in everyday discourse that indicates a double standard of the form “us vs. them.” Country and nation are first run together, and then patriotism and nationalism are distinguished in terms of the strength of the love and special concern one feels for it, the degree of one’s identification with it. When these are exhibited in a reasonable degree and without ill thoughts about others and hostile actions towards them, that is patriotism; when they become unbridled and cause one to think ill of others and act badly towards them, that is nationalism. Conveniently enough, it usually turns out that we are patriots, while they are nationalists (see Billig 1995, 55–59).

There is yet another way of distinguishing patriotism and nationalism – one that is quite simple and begs no moral questions. We can put aside the political sense of “nation” that makes it identical with “country,” “state,” or “polity,” and the political or civic type of nationalism related to it. We need concern ourselves only with the other, ethnic or cultural sense of “nation,” and focus on ethnic or cultural nationalism. In order to do so, we do not have to spell out the relevant understanding of “nation”; it is enough to characterize it in terms of common ancestry, history, and a set of cultural traits. Both patriotism and nationalism involve love of, identification with, and special concern for a certain entity. In the case of patriotism, that entity is one’s patria, one’s country; in the case of nationalism, that entity is one’s natio, one’s nation (in the ethnic/cultural sense of the term). Thus patriotism and nationalism are understood as the same type of set of beliefs and attitudes, and distinguished in terms of their objects, rather than the strength of those beliefs and attitudes, or as sentiment vs. theory.

To be sure, there is much overlap between country and nation, and therefore between patriotism and nationalism; thus much that applies to one will also apply to the other. But when a country is not ethnically homogeneous, or when a nation lacks a country of its own, the two may part ways.

2. Normative issues

Patriotism has had a fair number of critics. The harshest among them have judged it deeply flawed in every important respect. In the 19th century, Russian novelist and thinker Leo Tolstoy found patriotism both stupid and immoral. It is stupid because every patriot holds his own country to be the best of all whereas, obviously, only one country can qualify. It is immoral because it enjoins us to promote our country’s interests at the expense of all other countries and by any means, including war, and is thus at odds with the most basic rule of morality, which tells us not to do to others what we would not want them to do to us (Tolstoy 1987, 97). Recently, Tolstoy’s critique has been seconded by American political theorist George Kateb, who argues that patriotism is “a mistake twice over: it is typically a grave moral error and its source is typically a state of mental confusion” (Kateb 2000, 901). Patriotism is most importantly expressed in a readiness to die and to kill for one’s country. But a country “is not a discernible collection of discernible individuals”; it is rather “an abstraction … a compound of a few actual and many imaginary ingredients.” Specifically, in addition to being a delimited territory, “it is also constructed out of transmitted memories true and false; a history usually mostly falsely sanitized or falsely heroized; a sense of kinship of a largely invented purity; and social ties that are largely invisible or impersonal, indeed abstract …” Therefore patriotism is “a readiness to die and to kill for an abstraction … for what is largely a figment of the imagination” (907).

Some of these objections can easily be countered. Even if full-fledged patriotism does involve a belief in one’s country’s merits, it need not involve the belief that one’s country is better than all others. And the fact that a country is not a collection of “discernible individuals” and that the social ties among compatriots are “largely invisible or impersonal,” rather than palpable and face-to-face, does not show that it is unreal or imaginary. As Benedict Anderson, who coined the term “imagined community,” points out, “all communities larger than primordial villages of face-to-face contact … are imagined.” “Imagined community” is not the opposite of “real community,” but rather of community whose members have face-to-face relations (Anderson 1991, 6).

However, there is another, more plausible line of criticism of patriotism focusing on its intellectual, rather than moral credentials. Moreover, Tolstoy’s and Kateb’s arguments questioning the moral legitimacy of patriotic partiality and those highlighting the connection of patriotism with international tensions and war cannot be so easily refuted.

2.1 Patriotism and the ethics of belief

When asked “why do you love your country?” or “why are you loyal to it?”, a patriot is likely to take the question to mean “what is so good about your country that you should love it, or be loyal to it?” and then adduce what she believes to be its virtues and achievements. This suggests that patriotism can be judged from the standpoint of ethics of belief – a set of norms for evaluating our beliefs and other doxastic states. Simon Keller has examined patriotism from this point of view, and found it wanting.

Keller argues that whereas one’s love of and loyalty to a family member or a friend may coexist with a low estimate of the person’s qualities, patriotism involves endorsement of one’s country. If the patriot is to endorse her country, she must consider her beliefs about the country’s virtues and achievements to be based on some objectively valid standards of value and an unbiased examination of the country’s past and present record that leads to the conclusion that it lives up to those standards. However, the patriot’s loyalty is not focused on her country simply because it instantiates a set of virtues a country can have. If that were the case, and if a neighboring country turned out to have such virtues to an even higher degree, the patriot’s loyalty would be redirected accordingly. She is loyal to her country because that country, and only that country, is her country; hers is a loyalty “in the first instance.” Thus the patriot is motivated to think of the patria as blessed by all manner of virtues and achievements whether the evidence, interpreted objectively, warrants that or not. Accordingly, she forms beliefs about her country in ways different from the ways in which she forms beliefs about other countries. Moreover, she cannot admit this motivation while at the same time remaining a patriot. This leads her to hide from herself the true source of some of the beliefs involved. This is bad faith. Bad faith is bad; so is patriotism, as well as every identity, individual or collective, constituted, in part, by patriotic loyalty. This, in Keller’s view, amounts to “a clear presumptive case against patriotism’s being a virtue and for its being a vice” (Keller 2005, 587–88).

This portrayal does seem accurate as far as much patriotism as we know it is concerned. Yet Keller may be overstating his case as one against patriotism as such. When queried about one’s loyalty to one’s country, couldn’t one say: “This is my country, my home; I need no further reason to be loyal to it and show special concern for its well-being”? This might not be a very satisfactory answer; we might agree with J.B. Zimmermann that “the love for one’s country … is in many cases no more than the love of an ass for its stall” (quoted in Nathanson 1993, 3). But however egocentric, irrational, asinine, surely it qualifies as patriotism. (In a later statement of his argument (2007a, 80–81), Keller seems to be of two minds on this point.)

2.2 The moral standing of patriotism

Many think of patriotism as a natural and appropriate expression of attachment to the country in which we were born and raised and of gratitude for the benefits of life on its soil, among its people, and under its laws. They also consider patriotism an important component of our identity. Some go further, and argue that patriotism is morally mandatory, or even that it is the core of morality. There is, however, a major tradition in moral philosophy which understands morality as essentially universal and impartial, and seems to rule out local, partial attachment and loyalty. Adherents of this tradition tend to think of patriotism as a type of group egoism, a morally arbitrary partiality to “one’s own” at odds with demands of universal justice and common human solidarity. A related objection is that patriotism is exclusive in invidious and dangerous ways. Love of one’s own country characteristically goes together with dislike of and hostility towards other countries. It tends to encourage militarism, and makes for international tension and conflict. Tolstoy’s and Kateb’s moral objections to patriotism, mentioned above, are in line with this position.

What, then, is the moral status of patriotism? The question does not admit of a single answer. We can distinguish five types of patriotism, and each needs to be judged on its merits.

2.2.1 Extreme patriotism

Machiavelli is famous (or infamous) for teaching princes that, human nature being what it is, if they propose to do their job well, they must be willing to break their promises, to deceive, dissemble, and use violence, sometimes in cruel ways and on a large scale, when political circumstances require such actions. This may or may not be relevant to the question of patriotism, depending on just what we take the point of princely rule to be. A less well known part of Machiavelli’s teaching, however, is relevant; for he sought to impart the same lesson to politicians and common citizens of a republic. “When the safety of one’s country wholly depends on the decision to be taken, no attention should be paid either to justice or injustice, to kindness or cruelty, or to its being praiseworthy or ignominious” (Machiavelli 1998 [1518], 515). The paramount interests of one’s country override any moral consideration with which they might come into conflict.

This type of patriotism is extreme, but by no means extremely rare. It is adopted much too often by politicians and common citizens alike when their country’s major interests are thought to be at stake. It is encapsulated in the saying “our country, right or wrong,” at least on the simplest and most obvious construal of this saying. Not much needs to be said about the moral standing of this type of patriotism, as it amounts to rejection of morality. “Our country, right or wrong” cannot be right.

2.2.2 Robust patriotism

In his seminal lecture “Is Patriotism a Virtue?” Alasdair MacIntyre contrasts patriotism with the liberal commitment to certain universal values and principles. On the liberal view, where and from whom I learn the principles of morality is just as irrelevant to their contents and to my commitment to them, as where and from whom I learn the principles of mathematics is irrelevant to their contents and my adherence to them. For MacIntyre, where and from whom I learn my morality is of decisive importance both for my commitment to it and for its very contents.

There is no morality as such; morality is always the morality of a particular community. One can understand and internalize moral rules only “in and through the way of life of [one’s] community” (MacIntyre 1984, 8). Moral rules are justified in terms of certain goods they express and promote; but these goods, too, are always given as part and parcel of the way of life of a community. The individual becomes a moral agent only when informed as such by his community. He also lives and flourishes as one because he is sustained in his moral life by his community. “… I can only be a moral agent because we are moral agents … Detached from my community, I will be apt to lose my hold upon all genuine standards of judgment” (10–11).

If I can live and flourish as a moral agent only as a member of my community, while playing the role this membership involves, then my very identity is bound up with that of my community, its history, traditions, institutions, and aspirations. Therefore,

if I do not understand the enacted narrative of my own individual life as embedded in the history of my country … I will not understand what I owe to others or what others owe to me, for what crimes of my nation I am bound to make reparation, for what benefits to my nation I am bound to feel gratitude. Understanding what is owed to and by me and understanding the history of the communities of which I am a part is … one and the same thing. (16)

This leads MacIntyre to conclude that patriotism is not to be contrasted with morality; it is rather a central moral virtue, indeed the bedrock of morality.

The object of patriotic loyalty is one’s country and polity; but this does not mean that a patriot will support any government in power in her country. Here MacIntyre’s position is different from a popular version of patriotism that tends to conflate the two. The patriot’s allegiance, he says, is not to the status quo of power, but rather to “the nation conceived as a project” (13). One can oppose one’s country’s government in the name of the country’s true character, history, and aspirations. To that extent, this type of patriotism is critical and rational. But at least some practices and projects of the patria, some of its “large interests,” must be beyond questioning and critical scrutiny. To that extent, MacIntyre grants that what he considers true patriotism is “a fundamentally irrational attitude” (13). But a more rational and therefore more constrained loyalty would be “emasculated,” rather than real patriotism.

This account of patriotism is exposed to several objections. One might question the communitarian foundations of MacIntyre’s case for patriotism: his view of the moral primacy of the community over the individual. One might find fault with the step from communitarianism to patriotism:

Even if his communitarian conception of morality were correct and even if the process of moral development ensured that group loyalty would emerge as a central virtue, no conclusion would follow about the importance of patriotism. The group to which our primary loyalty would be owed would be the group from which we had obtained our moral understanding. This need not be the community as a whole or any political unit, however. It could be one’s family, one’s town, one’s religion. The nation need not be the source of morality or the primary beneficiary of our loyalty. (Nathanson 1989, 549)

Yet another objection would focus on the fundamentally irrational character of robust patriotism: its insistence that “large interests” of the patria must be beyond questioning.

MacIntyre concedes that “on occasion patriotism might require me to support and work for the success of some enterprise of my nation as crucial to its overall project … when the success of that enterprise would not be in the best interests of mankind” (14). If so, this type of patriotism would seem to involve the rejection of such basic moral notions as universal justice and common human solidarity.

Tolstoy and other critics have argued that patriotism is incompatible with these notions – that it is egoism writ large, an exclusive and ultimately aggressive concern for one’s country, and a major cause of international tensions and war. This is not a fair objection to patriotism as such. Patriotism is defined as a special concern for one’s country’s well-being, and that is not the same as an exclusive and aggressive concern for it. But the objection is pertinent, and has considerable force, when brought up against the type of patriotism advocated by MacIntyre. MacIntyre’s patriot may promote his country’s interests in a critical, and therefore non-exclusive way, over a range of issues. But when it comes to those “large interests” of his country that are beyond criticism and must be supported in an irrational way, his concern will inevitably become exclusive, and most likely aggressive too. If justice is understood in universal, rather than parochial terms, if common human solidarity counts as a weighty moral consideration, and if peace is of paramount importance and war is morally permissible only when it is just, then this kind of patriotism must be rejected.

2.2.3 Moderate patriotism

Rejecting robust patriotism does not entail adopting sweeping impartialism that acknowledges no special obligations, and allows no partiality, to “our own.” Nor does it entail adopting the more restricted, cosmopolitan position, that allows no partiality to our own country and compatriots. There is considerable middle ground between these extremes. Exploring this middle ground has led some philosophers to construct positions accommodating both the universal and the particular point of view – both the mandates of universal justice and claims of common humanity, and the concern for the patria and compatriots.

One such position is “patriotism compatible with liberal morality,” or “liberal patriotism” for short, advocated by Marcia Baron (1989). Baron argues that the conflict between impartiality and partiality is not quite as deep as it may seem. Morality allows for both types of considerations, as they pertain to different levels of moral deliberation. At one level, we are often justified in taking into account our particular commitments and attachments, including those to our country. At another level, we can and ought to reflect on such commitments and attachments from a universal, impartial point of view, to delineate their proper scope and determine their weight. We can conclude, for example, “that with respect to certain matters and within limits, it is good for an American to judge as an American, and to put American interests first” (Baron 1989, 272). In such a case, partiality and particular concerns are judged to be legitimate and indeed valuable from an impartial, universal point of view. This means that with respect to those matters and within the same limits, it is also good for a Cuban to judge as a Cuban and to put Cuban interests first, etc. Actually, this is how we think of our special obligations to, and preferences for, our family, friends, or local community; this kind of partiality is legitimate, and indeed valuable, not only for us but for anyone.

In MacIntyre’s view, the type of partiality in general, and patriotism in particular, that is at work only at one level of moral deliberation and against the background of impartiality at another, higher level, lacks content and weight. For Baron, on the other hand, MacIntyre’s strongly particularistic type of patriotism is irrational and morally hazardous. Baron also finds problematic the popular understanding of patriotism which focuses on the country’s might and its interests as determined by whatever government is in power. She emphasizes concern for the country’s cultural and moral excellence. By doing so, she argues, our patriotism will leave room for serious, even radical criticism of our country, and will not be a force for dissension and conflict in the international arena.

Another middle-of-the-road view is “moderate patriotism” propounded by Stephen Nathanson (1989, 1993). He, too, rejects the choice between MacIntyre’s robust patriotism and cosmopolitanism, and argues that impartiality required by morality allows for particular attachments and special obligations by distinguishing different levels of moral thinking. A good example is provided by the Ten Commandments, a major document of Western morality. The wording of the commandments is for the most part universal, impartial; but they also tell us “honor your father and your mother.”

The kind of patriotism defended by Nathanson and Baron is moderate in several distinct, but related respects. It is not unbridled: it does not enjoin the patriot to promote his country’s interests under any circumstances and by any means. It acknowledges the constraints morality imposes on the pursuit of our individual and collective goals. For instance, it may require the patriot to fight for his country, but only in so far as the war is, and remains, just. Adherents of both extreme and robust patriotism will consider themselves bound to fight for their country whether its cause be just or not. Extreme patriots will also fight for it in whatever way it takes to win. Whether adherents of MacIntyre’s robust patriotism, too, will do so is a moot point. If they do not, that will be because the morality of their own community places certain constraints on warfare, whether of a particularistic type (“a German officer does not execute POWs”), or by incorporating some universalistic moral precepts (“an officer does not execute POWs”).

Moderate patriotism is not exclusive. Its adherent will show special concern for his country and compatriots, but that will not prevent him from showing concern for other countries and their inhabitants. Moreover, this kind of patriotism allows for the possibility that under certain circumstances the concern for human beings in general will override the concern for one’s country and compatriots. Such patriotism is compatible with a decent degree of humanitarianism. By contrast, both extreme and robust patriotism give greater weight to the (substantial) interests of one’s country and compatriots than to those of other countries and their inhabitants whenever these interests come into conflict.

Finally, moderate patriotism is not uncritical, unconditional, or egocentric. For an adherent of this type of patriotism, it is not enough that the country is her country. She will also expect it to live up to certain standards and thereby deserve her support, devotion, and special concern for its well-being. When it fails to do so, she will withhold support. Adherents of both extreme and robust patriotism, on the other hand, love their country unconditionally, and stand by it whatever it does as long as its “safety” or its “large interests” more generally are concerned.

Baron and Nathanson have found a middle ground between sweeping cosmopolitanism that allows for no attachment and loyalty to one’s country and compatriots, and extreme or robust patriotism that rejects universal moral considerations (except those that have become part and parcel of one’s country’s morality). They have shown that the main objections usually advanced against patriotism as such apply only to its extreme or robust varieties, but not to its “liberal” or “moderate” versions. The latter type of patriotism need not conflict with impartial justice or common human solidarity. It will therefore be judged morally unobjectionable by all except some adherents of a strict type of cosmopolitanism.

However, both Baron and Nathanson fail to distinguish clearly between showing that their preferred type of patriotism is morally unobjectionable and showing that it is morally required or virtuous, and sometimes seem to be assuming that by showing the former, they are also showing the latter. Yet there is a gap between the two claims, and the latter, stronger case for moderate patriotism still needs to be made.

2.2.4 Deflated patriotism

What is the case for the claim that moderate patriotism is morally mandatory – that we have a duty of special concern for the well-being of our country and compatriots, similar to special duties to family or friends?

Gratitude is probably the most popular among the grounds adduced for patriotic duty. Echoing Socrates in Plato’s Crito (51c-51d), Maurizio Viroli writes: “… We have a moral obligation towards our country because we are indebted to it. We owe our country our life, our education, our language, and, in the most fortunate cases, our liberty. If we want to be moral persons, we must return what we have received, at least in part, by serving the common good” (Viroli 1995, 9).

Both Socrates and Viroli are exaggerating the benefits bestowed on us by our country; surely any gratitude owed for being born or brought up is owed to parents, rather than patria. But there are important benefits we have received from our country; the argument is that we are bound to show gratitude for them, and that the appropriate way to do so is to show special concern for the well-being of the country and compatriots.

One worry here is that considerations of gratitude normally arise in interpersonal relations. We also speak of gratitude to large and impersonal entities – our school, profession, or even our country – but that seems to be an abbreviated way of referring to gratitude to particular persons who have acted on behalf of these entities. A debt of gratitude is not incurred by any benefit received. If a benefit is conferred inadvertently, or advisedly but for the wrong reason (e.g. for the sake of the benefactor’s public image), gratitude will be misplaced. We owe a moral debt of gratitude (rather than the mere “thank you” of good manners) only to those who confer benefits on us deliberately and for the right reason, namely out of concern for our own good. And we cannot talk with confidence about the reasons a large and complex group or institution has for its actions.

Perhaps we can think of compatriots as an aggregate of individuals. Do we owe them a debt of gratitude for the benefits of life among them? Again, it depends on the reason for their law-abiding behavior and social cooperation generally. But there is no single reason common to all or even most of them. Some do their part without giving much thought to the reasons for doing so; others believe that doing so is, in the long run, the most prudent policy; still others act out of altruistic motives. Only the last group – surely a tiny minority – would be a proper object of our gratitude.

Moreover, gratitude is appropriate only for a benefit conferred freely, as a gift, and not as a quid pro quo. But most of the benefits we receive from our country are of the latter sort: benefits we have paid for by our own law-abiding behavior in general, and through taxation in particular.

The benefits one has received from her country might be considered relevant to the duty of patriotism in a different way: as raising the issue of fairness. One’s country is not a land inhabited by strangers to whom we owe nothing beyond what we owe to any other human being. It is rather a common enterprise that produces and distributes a wide range of benefits. These benefits are made possible by cooperation of those who live in the country, participate in the enterprise, owe and render allegiance to the polity. The rules that regulate the cooperation and determine the distribution of burdens and benefits enjoin, among other things, special concern for the well-being of compatriots which is not due to outsiders. As Richard Dagger puts it:

Compatriots take priority because we owe it to them as a matter of reciprocity. Everyone, compatriot or not, has a claim to our respect and concern … but those who join with us in cooperative enterprises have a claim to special recognition. Their cooperation enables us to enjoy the benefits of the enterprise, and fairness demands that we reciprocate. … We must accord our fellow citizens a special status, a priority over those who stand outside the special relationship constituted by the political enterprise. […] [Our fellow citizens] have a claim on us … that extends to include the notion that compatriots take priority. (Dagger 1985, 446, 443)

This argument conflates the issue of patriotism with that of political obligation, and the notion of a patriot with that of a citizen. Unlike informal cooperation among tenants in a building, for instance, cooperation on the scale of a country is regulated by a set of laws. To do one’s part within such a cooperative enterprise is just to obey the laws, to act as a citizen. Whether we have a moral duty to obey the laws of our country is one of the central issues in modern political philosophy, discussed under the heading of political obligation. One major account of political obligation is that of fairness. If successful, that account shows that we do have a moral duty to abide by the laws of our country, to act as citizens, and that this duty is one of fairness. To fail to abide by one’s country’s laws is to fail to reciprocate, to take advantage of compatriots, to act unfairly towards them. But whereas a patriot is also a citizen, a citizen is not necessarily a patriot. Patriotism involves special concern for the patria and compatriots, a concern that goes beyond what the laws obligate one to do, beyond what one does as a citizen; that is, beyond what one ought, in fairness, to do. Failing to show that concern, however, cannot be unfair – except on the question-begging assumption that, in addition to state law, cooperation on this scale is also based on, and regulated by, a moral rule enjoining special concern for the well-being of the country and compatriots. Dagger asserts that the claim our compatriots have on us “extends to include” such concern, but provides no argument in support of this extension.

Some philosophers seek to ground patriotic duty in its good consequences (see the entry on consequentialism). The duty of special concern for the well-being of our country and compatriots, just like other duties, universal and special, is justified by the good consequences of its adoption. Special duties mediate our fundamental, universal duties and make possible their most effective discharge. They establish a division of moral labor, necessary because our capacity of doing good is limited by our resources and circumstances. Each of us can normally be of greater assistance to those who are in some way close to us than to those who are not. By attending first to “our own,” we at the same time promote the good of humanity in the best way possible.

Patriots will find this account of their love of and loyalty to their country alien to what they feel patriotism is all about. It presents the duty of special concern for the well-being of one’s country and compatriots as a device for assigning to individuals some universal duties. Patriotic duty owes its moral force to the moral force of those universal duties. But if so, then, as a proponent of this understanding of patriotism concedes, “it turns out that ‘our fellow countrymen’ are not so very special after all” (Goodin 1988, 679). They merely happen to be the beneficiaries of the most effective way of putting into practice our concern for human beings in general. The special relationship between the patriot and the patria and compatriots – the relationship of love and identification – has been dissolved.

There is also a view of patriotic duty that, in contrast to the consequentialist account, does not dissolve, but rather highlight this relationship. That is the view of patriotism as an associative duty (see the entry on special obligations, section 4). It is based on an understanding of special relationships as intrinsically valuable and involving duties of special concern for the well-being of those we are related to. Such duties are not means of creating or maintaining those relationships, but rather their part and parcel, and can only be understood, and justified, as such, just as those relationships can only be understood as involving the special duties pertaining to them (while involving much else besides). For instance, one who denies that she has an obligation of special concern for the well-being of her friend shows that she no longer perceives and treats the person concerned as a friend, that (as far as she is concerned) the friendship is gone. One who denies that people in general have a duty of special concern for the well-being of their friends shows that she does not understand what friendship is.

Andrew Mason has offered an argument for the duty of special concern for the well-being of compatriots based on the value embodied in our relationship to compatriots, that of common citizenship. By “citizenship” he does not mean mere legal status, but takes the term in a moral sense, which involves equal standing. Citizenship in this sense is an intrinsically valuable relationship, and grounds certain special duties fellow citizens have to one another. Now citizenship obviously has considerable instrumental value; but how is it valuable in itself?

Citizenship has intrinsic value because in virtue of being a citizen a person is a member of a collective body in which they enjoy equal status with its other members and are thereby provided with recognition. This collective body exercises significant control over its members’ conditions of existence (a degree of control which none of its members individually possesses). It offers them the opportunity to contribute to the cultural environment in which its laws and policies are determined, and opportunities to participate directly and indirectly in the formation of these laws and policies. (Mason 1997, 442)

Mason goes on to claim:

Part of what it is to be a citizen is to incur special obligations: these obligations give content to what it is to be committed or loyal fellow citizen and are justified by the good of the wider relationship to which they contribute. In particular, citizens have an obligation to each other to participate fully in public life and an obligation to give priority to the needs of fellow citizens. (442)

The first of these two special duties can be put aside, as it is not specific to patriotism, but rather pertains to citizenship. It is the second that is at issue. If we indeed have a duty of special concern towards compatriots, and if that is an associative duty, that is because our association with them is intrinsically valuable and bound up with this duty. The claim about the intrinsic value of our association might be thought a moot point. But even if it were conceded, one might still resist the claim concerning the alleged duty. If someone were to deny that she has a duty of special concern for the well-being of her country and compatriots, beyond what the laws of her country mandate and beyond the concern she has for humans and humanity, would she thereby cease to be a citizen (in the sense involving equal standing)? If she were to deny that citizens generally have such an obligation, would that betray lack of understanding of what citizenship (in the relevant sense) is? If she came across two strangers in a life-threatening situation and could only save one, would she have a prima facie moral duty to save the one who was a compatriot? Mason’s position commits him to answering “yes” in each case, but all three claims are implausible (Primoratz 2009).

All the main arguments for the claim that patriotism is a duty, then, are exposed to serious objections. Unless a new, more convincing case for patriotism can be made, we have no good reason to think that patriotism is a moral duty.

If not a duty, is patriotism morally valuable? Someone showing concern for the well-being of others well beyond the degree of concern for others required of all of us is considered a morally better person than the rest of us (other things equal), an example of supererogatory virtue. Patriotism is a special concern for the well-being of one’s country and compatriots, a concern beyond what we owe other people and communities. Isn’t a patriot, then, a morally better person than the rest of us (other things equal)? Isn’t patriotism a supererogatory virtue?

One standard example of such virtue is the type of concern for those in an extreme plight shown by the late Mother Theresa, or by Doctors Without Borders. But they are exemplars of moral virtue for the same reason that makes a more modest degree of concern for others a moral duty falling on all of us. The same moral value, sympathy for and assistance to people in need, grounds a certain degree of concern for others as a general moral duty and explains why a significantly higher degree of such concern is a moral ideal. This explanation, however, does not apply in the case of patriotism. Patriotism is not but another extension of the duty of concern for others; it is a special concern for my country because it is my country, for my compatriots because they are my compatriots. Unlike Mother Theresa and Doctors Without Borders, whose concern is for all destitute, sick, dying persons they can reach, the concern of the patriot is by definition selective; and the selection is performed by the word “my.” But the word “my” cannot, by itself, play the critical role in an argument showing that a certain stance is morally valuable. If it could, other types of partialism, such as tribalism, racism, or sexism, would by the same token prove morally valuable too.

If patriotism is neither a moral duty nor a supererogatory virtue, then all its moral pretensions have been deflated. It has no positive moral significance. There is nothing to be said for it, morally speaking. We all have various preferences for places and people, tend to identify with many groups, large and small, to think of them as in some sense ours, and to show a degree of special concern for their members. But however important in other respects these preferences, identifications, and concerns might be, they lack positive moral import. They are morally permissible as long as they are kept within certain limits, but morally indifferent in themselves. The same is true of patriotism (Primoratz 2002).

2.2.5 Ethical patriotism

All four types of patriotism reviewed so far seek to defend and promote what might be termed the worldly, i.e. non-moral, interests of the patria: its political stability, military power, riches, influence in the international arena, and cultural vibrancy. They differ with regard to the lengths to which these interests will be promoted: adherents of extreme and robust patriotism will ultimately go to any length, whereas those whose patriotism is moderate or deflated will respect the limits universal moral considerations set to this pursuit. Marcia Baron also calls for expanding patriotic concern for the flourishing of one’s country to include its “moral flourishing” (see 2.2.3 above).

Thus Baron’s position is half-way between the usual, worldly kind of patriotism, and what might be described as its distinctively ethical type. The latter would put aside the country’s well-being in a mundane, non-moral sense, and would focus instead on its distinctively moral well-being, its moral identity and integrity. A patriot of this sort would not express his love for the patria by seeking to husband the country’s resources and preserve its natural beauty and its historical heritage, or make it rich, powerful, culturally preeminent, or influential on the world scene. Instead, he would seek to make sure that the country lives up to moral requirements and promotes moral values, both at home and internationally. He would work for a just and humane society at home, and seek to ensure that the country acts justly beyond its borders, and shows common human solidarity towards those in need, however distant and unfamiliar. He would also be concerned with the country’s past moral record and its implications for the present. He would support projects exploring the dark chapters of the country’s history, acknowledging the wrongs perpetrated in the past and responding to them in appropriate ways, whether by offering apologies or making amends, and by making sure such wrongs are not perpetrated again.

A patriot of this, distinctively ethical type, would want to see justice done, rights respected, human solidarity at work at any time and in any place. But her patriotism would be at work in a concern that her country be guided by these moral principles and values which is more sustained and more deeply felt than her concern that these principles and values should be put into practice generally. She would consider her own moral identity as bound up with that of her country, and the moral record of the patria as hers too. Unlike a patriot of the more worldly type, she might not feel great pride in her country’s worldly merits and achievements. She would be proud of the country’s moral record, when it inspires pride. But her patriotism would be expressed, above all, in a critical approach to her country and compatriots: she would feel entitled, and indeed called, to submit them to critical moral scrutiny, and to do so qua patriot.

While we have no moral reason to be patriots of the more usual, mundane kind, we do have reason to show special concern for our own country’s moral well-being. As a rule, when someone is wronged, someone else benefits from that. When a country maintains an unjust or inhumane practice, or enacts and enforces an unjust or inhumane law or policy, at least some, and sometimes many of its citizens reap benefits from it. Sometimes such a practice, legislation or policy affects people beyond the country’s borders; in such cases, the population as a whole may benefit. The responsibility for the injustice or lack of basic human solidarity lies with those who make the decisions and those who implement them. It also lies with those who give support to such decisions and their implementation. But some responsibility in this connection may also devolve on those who have no part in the making of the decisions or in their implementation, nor even provide support, but accept the benefits such a practice, law or policy generates.

A degree of complicity may also accrue to those who have no part in designing or putting into effect immoral practices, laws or policies, do not support them or benefit from them, but do benefit in various ways from being citizens of the country. One may derive significant psychological benefit from membership in and identification with a society or polity: from the sense of belonging, support and security such membership and identification afford. If one accepts such benefits, while knowing about the immoral practices, laws or policies at issue, or having no excuse for not knowing about them, that, too, may be seen as implicating him in those wrongs. To be sure, he makes no causal contribution to those wrongdoings, has no control over their course, and does not accept benefits from them. But in accepting benefits from his association with the wrongdoers, he may be seen as underwriting those wrongs and joining the class of those properly blamed. His complicity is lesser and the blame to be laid at his door is lesser too – but he still bears some moral responsibility and deserves some moral blame on that account. He cannot say in good faith: “Those wrongs have nothing to do with me. I am in no way implicated in them.”

If this is correct, we have reason to develop and exercise a special concern for the moral identity and integrity of our country. By doing so, we will be attending to an important aspect of our own moral identity and integrity. While patriotism of the more usual, worldly kind is neither morally required nor virtuous, but at best morally permitted, ethical patriotism can, under certain fairly common circumstances, be a moral duty (Primoratz 2006).

3. The political import of patriotism

While moral philosophers debate the standing of patriotism as an instance of the problem of reconciling universal moral considerations with particular attachments and loyalties, political theorists are primarily interested in patriotism as an ethos of the well-ordered polity and an antidote to nationalism. Since the rise of the nation-state, it has been widely held that some form of nationalism is indispensable as a pre-political basis of the unity of the state that makes for solidarity among citizens and provides them with motivation to participate in public life and make sacrifices for the common good. As Roger Scruton put it, “for a liberal state to be secure, the citizens must understand the national interest as something other than the interest of the state. Only the first can evoke in them the sacrificial spirit upon which the second depends” (Scruton 1990, 319). But in the course of the 20th century nationalism was deeply compromised. That has led political theorists to look for alternatives. Some have argued that an emphatically political patriotism could perform the unifying function of nationalism while avoiding its perils. This “new patriotism” puts aside, or at least de-emphasizes, pre-political ties such as common ancestry, language, or culture, and enjoins love of, and loyalty to, one’s political community, its laws and institutions, and the rights and liberties they make possible.

In view of the disastrous record of national socialism, it is not surprising that German thinkers in particular should be suspicious of patriotism as long as it has not been dissociated from nationalism. As early as 1959, political theorist Dolf Sternberger called for a new understanding of the concept of fatherland. “The fatherland is the ‘republic,’ which we create for ourselves. The fatherland is the constitution, to which we give life. The fatherland is the freedom which we truly enjoy only when we ourselves promote it, make use of it, and stand guard over it” (Sternberger 1990, 12). In 1979, on the 30th anniversary of the Federal Republic, he coined the term “constitutional patriotism” (Verfassungspatriotismus) to describe the loyalty to the patria understood in these terms (13–16). The term was later adopted by Jürgen Habermas in the context of a case for overcoming pre-political, i.e. national and cultural, loyalties in public life, and supplanting them with a new, postnational, purely political identity embodied in the laws and institutions of a free and democratic state. Habermas argues that this identity, expressed in and reinforced by constitutional patriotism, can provide a solid foundation for such a state, given the ethnic and cultural heterogeneity characteristic of most countries in western Europe. It can also facilitate further European integration, and provide an antidote to the “chauvinism of affluence” tempting these countries (Habermas 1990).

Constitutional patriotism is the most widely discussed, but not the sole variety of “new patriotism.” Another is “covenanted patriotism” advocated by John H. Schaar as appropriate for countries whose population is much too ethnically and culturally heterogeneous to allow for “natural patriotism.” Schaar’s paradigmatic example is the United States, whose citizens “were bonded together not by blood or religion, not by tradition or territory, not by the walls and traditions of a city, but by a political idea … by a covenant, by dedication to a set of principles and by an exchange of promises to uphold and advance certain commitments” (Schaar 1981, 291). Still another variety is the “patriotism of liberty” propounded by Maurizio Viroli, who calls for a return to what patriotism used to be before it was harnessed in the service of the nation-state and submerged in nationalism: love of the laws and institutions of one’s polity and the common liberty they make possible (Viroli 1995).

This new, emphatically political version of patriotism has been met with both sympathy and skepticism. Those sympathetic to it have been discussing the prospects of a European constitutional patriotism (see Müller 2007, 93–139). Skeptics have argued that patriotism disconnected from all pre-political attachments and identities can generate only much too thin a sense of identity and much too weak a motivation for political participation – that, thus understood, “patriotism is not enough” (Canovan 2000).


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Thanks to Simon Keller, Stephen Nathanson, and Thomas Pogge for helpful comments on a draft of this article.

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