Value Pluralism

First published Tue Jun 20, 2006; substantive revision Sun Jun 4, 2023

The word ‘pluralism’ generally refers to the view that there are many of the things in question (concepts, scientific world views, discourses, viewpoints etc.) The issues arising from there being many differ widely from subject area to subject area. This entry is concerned with moral pluralism—the view that there are many different moral values.

Moral value pluralism should be distinguished from political pluralism. Political pluralism, which, like moral value pluralism, is often referred to as ‘value pluralism’, is a view associated with political liberalism. Political pluralism is concerned with the question of what sort of restrictions governments can put on people’s freedom to act according to their values. One version of political pluralism is based on moral value pluralism, claiming that there are irreducibly plural moral values and that this justifies a liberal political system. (See Isaiah Berlin 1969; George Crowder 2002, 2019; William Galston 2002, and for a more detailed discussion of this see the entry on Isaiah Berlin). Political Liberalism need not be based on value pluralism: a defence of toleration of different value systems need not rely on the claim that there are plural moral values. We shall leave political pluralism aside for the purposes of this entry, and concentrate on moral value pluralism.

It is also worth emphasising that moral value pluralism does not entail relativism. The idea is not that all values or value systems are equally true. Value pluralism is independent of any particular meta-ethical view. It is a claim about the normative domain: about what value looks like.

Commonsensically we talk about lots of different values—happiness, liberty, friendship, and so on. The question about pluralism in moral theory is whether these apparently different values are all reducible to one supervalue, or whether we should think that there really are several distinct values.

There are different ways that value might be conceived, but the debate about pluralism should be able to cut across different sorts of moral theory. Traditionally, moral philosophers recognize three different ways of thinking about morality: the deontological way, the consequentialist way, and the virtue ethics way, although there is debate about the cogency of these distinctions.[1] The term ‘value’ as it appears in ‘value pluralism’ is neutral between these three theories. Deontologists think of morality as being fundamentally about moral principles. Thus the question of whether a deontological theory is pluralist is a question about how many fundamental principles there are. The consequentialist, by contrast, tends to see value as being realized by goods in the world, such as friendship, knowledge, beauty and so on, and the question of pluralism is thus a question about how many fundamental goods there are. Virtue ethicists focus on how agents should be, so are interested both in principles of action (or motivation) and the pursuit of goods, such as friendship.

Deontologists can clearly be monists or pluralists. Kant can be understood as a monist—arguing that there is one overarching principle, and that all other principles are derived from it. Ross, by contrast, is a pluralist, because he thinks that there is a plurality of prima facie duties. (See Kant (1948), Ross (1930).)[2]

Many utilitarians are monists, arguing that there is only one fundamental value and that is well-being or pleasure or happiness, or something of that sort. In other words, some utilitarians are committed to hedonism. Monist utilitarians must claim that all other putative values, such as friendship, knowledge and so on, are only instrumental values, which are valuable in so far as they contribute to the foundational value. But utilitarians need not be monists. Amartya Sen, for example, argues that utilitarians can take a ‘vector view of utility’, according to which there are differences in the qualities as well of the quantities of utility in goods in the world. According to Sen, we should interpret Mill as a pluralist in this way. (We return to Mill below: it is not entirely clear how we should understand his view). Sen points out that desire satisfaction theorists can be pluralists too. Just as different sorts of pleasure might have different sorts of value, so different desires might have different sorts of value. (Sen, 1981). Even utilitarians who claim that the value to be maximized is well-being can be pluralist: a prominent view of well-being is that well-being itself is plural, an objective list of things that are fundamentally plural. (See Finnis 1980; Griffin 1986; for recent defences see Fletcher 2013; Lin 2014). Another reason to think that hedonistic utilitarians should be pluralists is that it seems essential to say something about the disvalue of pain. As Shelly Kagan points out (2014), we need an account of ill-being in addition to an account of well-being.

In what follows, the presentation will be as neutral as possible between different theoretical approaches to morality, and will focus on the debate between monists and pluralists. Monists claim that there is only one ultimate value. Pluralists argue that there really are several different values, and that these values are not reducible to each other or to a supervalue. Monism has the advantage of relative simplicity: once it has been determined what the supervalue is (whether we think of the super value in terms of the goods approach or any other approach) much of the hard work has been done. On the other hand, monism may be too simple: it may not capture the real texture of our ethical lives. However, pluralism faces the difficulty of explaining how different fundamental values relate to each other, and how they can be compared.

1. Some Preliminary Clarifications

1.1 Foundational and Non-foundational Pluralism

It is important to clarify the levels at which a moral theory might be pluralistic. Let us distinguish between two levels of pluralism: foundational and non-foundational. Foundational pluralism is the view that there are plural moral values at the most basic level—that is to say, there is no one value that subsumes all other values, no one property of goodness, and no overarching principle of action. Non-foundational pluralism is the view that there are plural values at the level of choice, but these apparently plural values can be understood in terms of their contribution to one more fundamental value.[3]

Judith Jarvis Thomson, a foundational pluralist, argues that when we say that something is good we are never ascribing a property of goodness, rather we are always saying that the thing in question is good in some way. If we say that a fountain pen is good we mean something different from when we say that a logic book is good, or a film is good. As Thomson puts it, all goodness is a goodness in a way. Thomson focusses her argument on Moore, who argues that when we say ‘x is good’ we do not mean ‘x is conducive to pleasure’, or ‘x is in accordance with a given set of rules’ and nor do we mean anything else that is purely descriptive. As Moore points out, we can always query whether any purely descriptive property really is good—so he concludes that goodness is simple and unanalyzable.[4] Moore is thus a foundational monist, he thinks that there is one non-natural property of goodness, and that all good things are good in virtue of having this property. Thomson finds this preposterous. In Thomson’s own words:

Moore says that the question he will be addressing himself to in what follows is the question ‘What is good?’, and he rightly thinks that we are going to need a bit of help in seeing exactly what question he is expressing in those words. He proposes to help us by drawing attention to a possible answer to the question he is expressing—that is, to something that would be an answer to it, whether or not it is the correct answer to it. Here is what he offers us: “Books are good.” Books are good? What would you mean if you said ‘Books are good’? Moore, however, goes placidly on: “though [that would be] an answer obviously false; for some books are very bad indeed”. Well some books are bad to read or to look at, some are bad for use in teaching philosophy, some are bad for children. What sense could be made of a person who said, “No. no. I meant that some books are just plain bad things”? (Thomson 1997, pp. 275–276)

According to Thomson there is a fundamental plurality of ways of being good. We cannot reduce them to something they all have in common, or sensibly claim that there is a disjunctive property of goodness (such that goodness is ‘goodness in one of the various ways’. Thomson argues that that could not be an interesting property as each disjunct is truly different from every other disjunct. Thomson (1997), p. 277). Thomson is thus a foundational pluralist—she does not think that there is any one property of value at the most basic level.

W.D. Ross is a foundational pluralist in a rather complex way. Most straightforwardly, Ross thinks that there are several prima facie duties, and there is nothing that they all have in common: they are irreducibly plural. This is the aspect of Ross’s view that is referred to with the phrase, ‘Ross-style pluralism’. However, Ross also thinks that there are goods in the world (justice and pleasure, for example), and that these are good because of some property they share. Goodness and rightness are not reducible to one another, so Ross is a pluralist about types of value as well as about principles.

Writers do not always make the distinction between foundational and other forms of pluralism, but as well as Thomson and Ross, at least Bernard Williams (1981), Charles Taylor (1982), Stuart Hampshire (1983), Charles Larmore (1987), John Kekes (1993), Michael Stocker (1990 and 1997), David Wiggins (1997), Christine Swanton (2001), and Jonathan Dancy (2004) are all committed to foundational pluralism.

Non-foundational pluralism is less radical—it posits a plurality of bearers of value. In fact, almost everyone accepts that there are plural bearers of value. This is compatible with thinking that there is only one ultimate value. G.E. Moore (1903), Thomson’s target, is a foundational monist, but he accepts that there are non-foundational plural values. Moore thinks that there are many different bearers of value, but he thinks that there is one property of goodness, and that it is a simple non-natural property that bearers of value possess in varying degrees. Moore is clear that comparison between plural goods proceeds in terms of the amount of goodness they have.

This is not to say that the amount of goodness is always a matter of simple addition. Moore thinks that there can be organic unities, where the amount of goodness contributed by a certain value will vary according to the combination of values such as love and friendship. Thus Moore’s view is pluralist at the level of ordinary choices, and that is not without interesting consequences. (We return to the issue of how a foundational monist like Moore can account for organic unities in section 3.)

Mill, a classic utilitarian, could be and often has been interpreted as thinking that there are irreducibly different sorts of pleasure. Mill argues that there are higher and lower pleasures, and that the higher pleasures (pleasures of the intellect as opposed to the body) are superior, in that higher pleasures can outweigh lower pleasures regardless of the quantity of the latter. As Mill puts it: “It is quite compatible with the principle of utility to recognize the fact, that some kinds of pleasure are more desirable and more valuable than others.” (2002, p. 241). On the foundational pluralist interpretation of Mill, there is not one ultimate good, but two (at least): higher and lower pleasures. Mill goes on to give an account of what he means:

If I am asked, what I mean by difference in quality in pleasures, or what makes one pleasure more valuable than another, merely as a pleasure, except its being greater in amount, there is but one possible answer. Of two pleasures, if there be one to which all or almost all who have experience of both give a decided preference, irrespective of any feeling of moral obligation to prefer it, that is the more desirable pleasure. (2002, p. 241).

The passage is ambiguous, it is not clear what role the expert judges play in the theory. On the pluralist interpretation of this passage we must take Mill as intending the role of the expert judges as a purely heuristic device: thinking about what such people would prefer is a way of discovering which pleasures are higher and which are lower, but the respective values of the pleasure is independent of the judges’ judgment. On a monist interpretation we must understand Mill as a preference utilitarian: the preferences of the judges determine value. On this interpretation there is one property of value (being preferred by expert judges) and many bearers of value (whatever the judges prefer).[5]

Before moving on, it is worth noting that a theory might be foundationally monist in its account of what values there are, but not recommend that people attempt to think or make decisions on the basis of the supervalue. A distinction between decision procedures and criteria of right has become commonplace in moral philosophy. For example, a certain form of consequentialism has as its criterion of right action: act so as to maximize good consequences. This might invite the complaint that an agent who is constantly trying to maximize good consequences will often, in virtue of that fact, fail to do so. Sometimes concentrating too hard on the goal will make it less likely that the goal is achieved. A distinction between decision procedure and right action can provide a response—the consequentialist can say that the criterion of right action, (act so as to maximize good consequences) is not intended as a decision procedure—the agent should use whichever decision procedure is most likely to result in success. If, then, there is some attraction or instrumental advantage from the point of view of a particular theory to thinking in pluralist terms, then it is open to that theory to have a decision procedure that deals with apparently plural values, even if the theory is monist in every other way. [6]

1.2 A Purely Verbal Dispute?

One final clarification about different understandings of pluralism ought to be made. There is an ambiguity between the name for a group of values and the name for one unitary value. There are really two problems here: distinguishing between the terms that refer to groups and the terms that refer to individuals (a merely linguistic problem) and defending the view that there really is a candidate for a unitary value (a metaphysical problem). The linguistic problem comes about because in natural language we may use a singular term as ‘shorthand’: conceptual analysis may reveal that surface grammar does not reflect the real nature of the concept. For example, we use the term ‘well-being’ as if it refers to one single thing, but it is not hard to see that it may not. ‘Well-being’ may be a term that we use to refer to a group of things such as pleasure, health, a sense of achievement and so on. A theory that tells us that well-being is the only value may only be nominally monist. The metaphysical question is more difficult, and concerns whether there are any genuinely unitary values at all.

The metaphysical question is rather different for naturalist and non-naturalist accounts of value. On Moore’s non-naturalist account, goodness is a unitary property but it is not a natural property: it is not empirically available to us, but is known by a special faculty of intuition. It is very clear that Moore thinks that goodness is a genuinely unitary property:

‘Good’, then, if we mean by it that quality which we assert to belong to a thing, when we say that the thing is good, is incapable of any definition, in the most important sense of that word. The most important sense of ‘definition’ is that in which a definition states what are the parts which invariably compose a certain whole; and in this sense ‘good’ has no definition because it is simple and has no parts. (Moore, 1903, p. 9)

The question of whether there could be such a thing is no more easy or difficult than any question about the existence of non-natural entities. The issue of whether the entity is genuinely unitary is not an especially difficult part of that issue.

By contrast, naturalist views do face a particular difficulty in giving an account of a value that is genuinely unitary. On the goods approach, for example, the claim must be that there is one good that is genuinely singular, not a composite of other goods. So for example, a monist hedonist must claim that pleasure really is just one thing. Pleasure is a concept we use to refer to something we take to be in the natural world, and conceptual analysis may or may not confirm that pleasure really is one thing. Perhaps, for example, we refer both to intellectual and sensual experiences as pleasure. Or, take another good often suggested by proponents of the goods approach to value, friendship. It seems highly unlikely that there is one thing that we call friendship, even if there are good reasons to use one umbrella concept to refer to all those different things. Many of the plausible candidates for the good seem plausible precisely because they are very broad terms. If a theory is to be properly monist then, it must have an account of the good that is satisfactorily unitary.

The problem applies to the deontological approach to value too. It is often relatively easy to determine whether a principle is really two or more principles in disguise—the presence of a conjunction or a disjunction, for example, is a clear giveaway. However, principles can contain terms that are unclear. Take for example a deontological theory that tells us to respect friendship. As mentioned previously, it is not clear whether there is one thing that is friendship or more than one, so it is not clear whether this is one principle about one thing, or one principle about several things, or whether it is really more than one principle.

Questions about what makes individuals individuals and what the relationship is between parts and wholes have been discussed in the context of metaphysics but these issues have not been much discussed in the literature on pluralism and monism in moral philosophy. However, these issues are implicit in discussions of the well-being, nature of friendship and pleasure, and in the literature on Kant’s categorical imperative, or on Aristotelian accounts of eudaimonia. Part of an investigation into the nature of these things is an investigation into whether there really is one thing or not. [7]

The upshot of this brief discussion is that monists must be able to defend their claim that the value they cite is genuinely one value. There may be fewer monist theories than it first appears. Further, the monist must accept the implications of a genuinely monist view. As Ruth Chang points out, (2015, p. 24) the simpler the monist’s account of the good is, the less likely it is that the monist will be able to give a good account of the various complexities in choice that seem an inevitable part of our experience of value. But on the other hand, if the monist starts to admit that the good is complex, the view gets closer and closer to being a pluralist view.

However, the dispute between monists and pluralists is not merely verbal: there is no prima facie reason to think that there are no genuinely unitary properties, goods or principles.

2. The Attraction of Pluralism

If values are plural, then choices between them will be complex. Pluralists have pressed the point that choices are complex, and so we should not shy away from the hypothesis that values are plural. In brief, the attraction of pluralism is that it seems to allow for the complexity and conflict that is part of our moral experience. We do not experience our moral choices as simple additive puzzles. Pluralists have argued that there are incommensurabilities and discontinuities in value comparisons, value remainders (or residues) when choices are made, and complexities in appropriate responses to value. Recent empirical work confirms that our ethical experience is of apparently irreducible plural values. (See Gill and Nichols, 2008.)

2.1 Discontinuities

John Stuart Mill suggested that there are higher and lower pleasures (Mill 2002, p. 241), the idea being that the value of higher and lower pleasures is measured on different scales. In other words, there are discontinuities in the measurement of value. As mentioned previously, it is unclear whether we should interpret Mill as a foundational pluralist, but the notion of higher and lower pleasures is a very useful one to illustrate the attraction of thinking that there are discontinuities in value. The distinction between higher and lower pleasures allows us to say that no amount of lower pleasures can outweigh some amount of higher pleasures. As Mill puts it, it is better to be an unhappy human being than a happy pig. In other words, the distinction allows us to say that there are discontinuities in value addition. As James Griffin (1986, p. 87) puts it: “We do seem, when informed, to rank a certain amount of life at a very high level above any amount of life at a very low level.” Griffin’s point is that there are discontinuities in the way we rank values, and this suggests that there are different values.[8] The phenomenon of discontinuities in our value rankings seems to support pluralism: if higher pleasures are not outweighed by lower pleasures, that suggests that they are not the same sort of thing. For if they were just the same sort of thing, there seems to be no reason why lower pleasures will not eventually outweigh higher pleasures.

Ruth Chang argues that values form organic unities, which is to say that adding more of one value to a situation may not make it better overall, the balance of values in the situation is also important. For example, a life where extra pleasure is added, and all other value contributions left untouched, may not be better overall, because now the pleasure is unbalanced (Chang 2002). As Chang puts it, the Pareto principle of improvement (if something is better along one dimension and at least as good on all the others it will be better overall) does not hold here.

The most extreme form of discontinuity is incommensurability or incomparability, when two values cannot be ranked at all. Pluralists differ on whether pluralism entails incommensurabilities, and on what incommensurability entails for the possibility of choice. Griffin denies that pluralism entails incommensurability (Griffin uses the term incomparability) whereas other pluralists embrace incommensurability, but deny that it entails that rational choice is impossible. Some pluralists accept that there are sometimes cases where incommensurability precludes rational choice. We shall return to these issues in Section 4.

2.2 Value Conflicts and Rational Regret

Michael Stocker (1990) and Bernard Williams (1973 and 1981) and others have argued that it can be rational to regret the outcome of a correct moral choice. That is, even when the right choice has been made, the rejected option can reasonably be regretted, and so the choice involves a genuine value conflict. This seems strange if the options are being compared in terms of a supervalue. How can we regret having chosen more rather than less of the same thing? Yet the phenomenon seems undeniable, and pluralism can explain it. If there are plural values, then one can rationally regret not having chosen something which though less good, was different.

It is worth noting that the pluralist argument is not that all cases of value conflict point to pluralism. There may be conflicts because of ignorance, for example, or because of irrationality, and these do not require positing plural values. Stocker argues that there are (at least) two sorts of value conflict that require plural values. The first is conflict that involves choices between doing things at different times. Stocker argues that goods become different values in different temporal situations, and the monist cannot accommodate this thought. The other sort of case (which Williams also points to) is when there is a conflict between things that have different advantages and disadvantages. The better option may be better, but it does not ‘make up for’ the lesser option, because it isn’t the same sort of thing. Thus there is a remainder—a moral value that is lost in the choice, and that it is rational to regret.

Both Martha Nussbaum (1986) and David Wiggins (1980) have argued for pluralism on the grounds that only pluralism can explain akrasia, or weakness of will. An agent is said to suffer from weakness of will when she knowingly chooses a less good option over a better one. On the face of it, this is a puzzling thing to do—why would someone knowingly do what they know to be worse? A pluralist has a plausible answer—when the choice is between two different sorts of value, the agent is preferring A to B, rather than preferring less of A to more of A. Wiggins explains the akratic choice by suggesting that the agent is ‘charmed’ by some aspect of the choice, and is swayed by that to choose what she knows to be worse overall (Wiggins 1980, p. 257). However, even Michael Stocker, the arch pluralist, does not accept that this argument works. As Stocker points out, Wiggins is using a distinction between a cognitive and an affective element to the choice, and this distinction can explain akrasia on a monist account of value too. Imagine that a monist hedonist agent is faced with a choice between something that will give her more pleasure and something that will give her less pleasure. The cognitive aspect to the choice is clear—the agent knows that one option is more pleasurable than the other, and hence on her theory better. However, to say that the agent believes that more pleasure is better is not to say that she will always be attracted to the option that is most pleasurable. She may, on occasion, be attracted to the option that is more unusual or interesting. Hence she may act akratically because she was charmed by some aspect of the less good choice—and as Stocker says, there is no need to posit plural values to make sense of this—being charmed is not the same as valuing. (Stocker 1990, p.219).

2.3 Appropriate Responses to Value

Another argument for pluralism starts from the observation that there are many and diverse appropriate responses to value. Christine Swanton (2003, ch. 2) and Elizabeth Anderson (1993) both take this line. As Swanton puts it:

According to value centered monism, the rightness of moral responsiveness is determined entirely by degree or strength of value…I shall argue, on the contrary, that just how things are to be pursued, nurtured, respected, loved, preserved, protected, and so forth may often depend on further general features of those things, and their relations to other things, particularly the moral agent. (Swanton 2003, p. 41).

The crucial thought is that there are various bases of moral responsiveness, and these bases are irreducibly plural. A monist could argue that there are different appropriate responses to value, but the monist would have to explain why there are different appropriate responses to the same value. Swanton’s point is that the only explanation the monist has is that different degrees of value merit different responses. According to Swanton, this does not capture what is really going on when we appropriately honor or respect a value rather than promoting it. Anderson and Swanton both argue that the complexity of our responses to value can only be explained by a pluralistic theory.

Elizabeth Anderson argues that it is a mistake to understand moral goods on the maximising model. She uses the example of parental love (Anderson 1997, p. 98). Parents should not see their love for their children as being directed towards an “aggregate child collective”. Such a view would entail that trade offs were possible, that one child could be sacrificed for another. On Anderson’s view we can make rational choices between conflicting values without ranking values: “…choices concerning those goods or their continued existence do not generally require that we rank their values on a common scale and choose the more valuable good; they require that we give each good its due” (Anderson 1997, p. 104).

3. Monist Solutions

The last section begins by saying that if foundational values are plural, then choices between them will be complex. It is clear that our choices are complex. However, it would be invalid to conclude from that that values are plural—the challenge for monists is to explain how they too can make sense of the complexity of our value choices.

3.1 Different Bearers of Value

One way for monists to make sense of complexity in value choice is to point out that there are different bearers of value, and this makes a big difference to the experience of choice. (See Hurka, 1996; Schaber, 1999; Klocksiem 2011). Here is the challenge to monism in Michael Stocker’s words (Stocker, 1990, p. 272): “[if monism is true] there is no ground for rational conflict because the better option lacks nothing that would be made good by the lesser.” In other words, there are no relevant differences between the better and worse options except that the better option is better. Thomas Hurka objects that there can be such differences. For example, in a choice between giving five units of pleasure to A and ten units to B, the best option (more pleasure for B) involves giving no pleasure at all to A. So there is something to rationally regret, namely, that A had no pleasure. The argument can be expanded to deal with all sorts of choice situation: in each situation, a monist can say something sensible about an unavoidable loss, a loss that really is a loss. If, of two options one will contribute more basic value, the monist must obviously choose that one. But the lesser of the options may contribute value via pleasure, while the superior option contributes value via knowledge, and so there is a loss in choosing the option with the greater value contribution—a loss in pleasure— and it is rational for us to regret this.

There is one difficulty with this answer. The loss described by Hurka is not a moral loss, and so the regret is not moral regret. In Hurka’s example, the relevant loss is that A does not get any pleasure. The agent doing the choosing may be rational to regret this if she cares about A, or even if she just feels sorry for A, but there has been no moral loss, as ‘pleasure for A’ as opposed to pleasure itself is not a moral value. According to the view under consideration, pleasure itself is what matters morally, and so although A’s pleasure matters qua pleasure, the moral point of view takes B’s pleasure into account in just the same way, and there is nothing to regret, as there is more pleasure than there would otherwise have been. Stocker and Williams would surely insist that the point of their argument was not just that there is a loss, but that there is a moral loss. The monist cannot accommodate that point, as the monist can only consider the quantity of the value, not its distribution, and so we are at an impasse.

However, the initial question was whether the monist has succeeded in explaining the phenomenon of ‘moral regret’, and perhaps Hurka has done that by positing a conflation of moral and non-moral regret in our experience. From our point of view, there is regret, and the monist can explain why that is without appealing to irrationality. On the other hand the monist cannot appeal to anything other than quantity of value in appraising the morality of the situation. So although Hurka is clearly right in so far as he is saying that a correct moral choice can be regretted for non-moral reasons, he can go no further than that.

3.2 Diminishing Marginal Value

Another promising strategy that the monist can use in order to explain the complexity in our value choices is the appeal to ‘diminishing marginal value’. The value that is added to the sum by a source of value will tend to diminish after a certain point—this phenomenon is known as diminishing marginal value (or, sometimes, diminishing marginal utility). Mill’s higher and lower pleasures, which seem to be plural values, might be accommodated by the monist in this way. The monist makes sense of discontinuities in value by insisting on the distinction between sources of value, which are often ambiguously referred to as ‘values’, and the super value. Using a monist utilitarian account of value, we can distinguish between the non-evaluative description of options, the intermediate description, and the evaluative description as follows:

description of option
description of option
description of option
Painting a picture Producing x units
of beauty
Producing y units
of value
Reading a book Producing x units
of knowledge
Producing y units
of value

On this account, painting produces beauty, and beauty (which is not a value but the intermediate source of value) produces value. Similarly, reading a book produces knowledge, and gaining knowledge produces value. Now it should be clear how the monist can make sense of phenomena like higher and lower pleasures. The non-evaluative options (e.g. eating donuts) have diminishing marginal non-basic value.

On top of that, the intermediate effect, or non-basic value, (e.g. experiencing pleasure) can have a diminishing contribution to value. Varying diminishing marginal value in these cases is easily explained psychologically. It is just the way we are—we get less and less enjoyment from donuts as we eat more and more (at least in one sitting). However, we may well get the same amount of enjoyment from the tenth Johnny Cash song that we did from the first. In order to deal with the higher and lower pleasures case the monist will have to argue that pleasures themselves can have diminishing marginal utility—the monist can argue that gustatory pleasure gets boring after a while, and hence contributes less and less to the super value—well being, or whatever it is.[9]

This picture brings us back to the distinction between foundational and non-foundational pluralism. Notice that the monist theories being imagined here are foundationally monist, because they claim that there is fundamentally one value, such as pleasure, and they are pluralist at the level of ordinary choice because they claim that there are intermediate values, such as knowledge and beauty, which are valuable because of the amount of pleasure they produce (or realize, or contain—the exact relationship will vary from theory to theory).

3.3 Theoretical Virtues

The main advantage of pluralism is that it seems true to our experience of value. We experience values as plural, and pluralism tells is that values are indeed plural. The monist can respond, as we have seen, that there are ways to explain the apparent plurality of values without positing fundamentally plural values. Another, complementary strategy that the monist can pursue is to argue that monism has theoretical virtues that pluralism lacks. In general, it seems that theories should be as simple and coherent as possible, and that other things being equal, we should prefer a more coherent theory to a less coherent one. Thus so long as monism can make sense of enough of our intuitive judgments about the nature of value, then it is to be preferred to pluralism because it does better on the theoretical virtue of coherence.

Another way to put this point is in terms of explanation. The monist can point out that the pluralist picture lacks explanatory depth. It seems that a list of values needs some further explanation: what makes these things values? (See Bradley 2009, p.16). The monist picture is superior, because the monist can provide an explanation for the value of the (non-foundational) plurality of values: these things are values because they contribute to well-being, or pleasure, or whatever the foundational monist value is. (See also the discussion of this in the entry on value theory).

Patricia Marino argues against this strategy (2015). She argues that ‘systematicity’ (the idea that it is better to have fewer principles) is not a good argument in favour of monism. Marino points out that explanation in terms of fewer fundamental principles is not necessarily better explanation. If there are plural values, then the explanation that appeals to plural values is a better one, in the sense that it is the true one: it doesn’t deny the plurality of values. Even if we could give a monist explanation without having to trade off against our pluralist intuitions, Marino argues, we have no particular reason to think that explanations appealing to fewer principles are superior.

3.4 Preference Satisfaction Views

There is a different account of value that we ought to consider here: the view that value consists in preference or desire satisfaction. On this view, knowledge and pleasure and so on are valuable when they are desired, and if they are not desired anymore they are not valuable anymore. There is no need to appeal to complicated accounts of diminishing marginal utility: it is uncontroversial that we sometimes desire something and sometimes don’t. Thus complexities in choices are explained by complexities in our desires, and it is uncontroversial that our desires are complex.

Imagine a one person preference satisfaction account of value that says simply that what is valuable is what P desires. Apparently this view is foundationally monist: there is only one thing that confers value (being desired by P), yet at the non-foundational level there are many values (whatever P desires). Let us say that P desires hot baths, donuts and knowledge. The structure of P’s desires is such that there is a complicated ranking of these things, which will vary from circumstance to circumstance. The ranking is not explained by the value of the objects,rather, her desire explains the ranking and determines the value of the objects. So it might be that P sometimes desires a hot bath and a donut equally, and cannot choose between them; it might be that sometimes she would choose knowledge over a hot bath and a donut, but sometimes she would choose a hot bath over knowledge. On James Griffin’s slightly more complex view, well-being consist in the fulfillment of informed desire, and Griffin points out that his view can explain discontinuities in value without having to appeal to diminishing marginal utility:

there may well turn out to be cases in which, when informed, I want, say, a certain amount of one thing more than any amount of another, and not because the second thing cloys, and so adding to it merely produces diminishing marginal values. I may want it even though the second thing does not, with addition, lose its value; it may be that I think that no increase in that kind of value, even if constant and positive, can overtake a certain amount of this kind of value. (1986, p. 76).

This version of foundational monism/normative pluralism escapes some of the problems that attend the goods approach. First, this view can account for deep complexities in choice. The plural goods that P is choosing between do not seem merely instrumental. Donuts are not good because they contribute to another value, and P does not desire donuts for any reason other than their donuty nature. On this view, if it is hard to choose between donuts and hot baths it is because of the intrinsic nature of the objects. The key here is that value is conferred by desire, not by contribution to another value. Second, this view can accommodate incomparabilities: if P desires a hot bath because of its hot bathy nature, and a donut because of its donuty nature, she may not be able to choose between them.

However, it is not entirely clear that a view like Griffin’s is genuinely monist at the foundational level: the question arises, what is constraining the desires that qualify as value conferring? If the answer is ‘nothing’, then the view seems genuinely monist, but is probably implausible. Unconstrained desire accounts of value seem implausible because our desires can be for all sorts of things—we may desire things that are bad for us, or we may desire things because of some mistake we have made. If the answer is that there is something constraining the desires that count as value conferring, then of course the question is, ‘what?’ Is it the values of the things desired? A desire satisfaction view that restricts the qualifying desires must give an account of what restricts them, and obviously, the account may commit the view to foundational pluralism.

Griffin addresses this question at the very beginning of his book on well being (Griffin, 1986, ch.2).[10] As he puts it,

The danger is that desire accounts get plausible only by, in effect, ceasing to be desire accounts. We had to qualify desire with informed, and that gave prominence to the features or qualities of the objects of desire, and not to the mere existence of desire. (1986, p. 26).

Griffin’s account of the relationship between desire and value is subtle, and (partly because Griffin himself does not distinguish between foundational and normative pluralism) it is difficult to say whether his view is foundationally pluralist or not. Griffin argues that it is a mistake to see desire as a blind motivational force—we desire things that we perceive in a favorable light- we take them to have a desirability feature. When we try to explain what involved in seeing things in a favorable light, we cannot, according to Griffin, separate understanding from desire:

…we cannot, even in the case of a desirability feature such as accomplishment, separate understanding and desire. Once we see something as ‘accomplishment’, as ‘giving weight and substance to our lives’, there is no space left for desire to follow along in a secondary subordinate position. Desire is not blind. Understanding is not bloodless. Neither is the slave of the other. There is no priority. (1986, p. 30)

This suggests that the view is indeed pluralist at the foundation—values are not defined entirely by desire, but partly by other features of the situation, and so at the most fundamental level there is more than one value making feature. Griffin himself says that “the desire account is compatible with a strong form of pluralism about values” (p. 31).

The question whether or not Griffin is a foundational pluralist is not pursued further here. The aim in this section is to show first, that monist preference satisfaction accounts of value may have more compelling ways of explaining complexities in value comparison than monist goods approaches, but second, to point out that any constrained desire account may well actually be foundationally pluralist. As soon as something is introduced to constrain the desires that qualify as value conferring, it looks as though another value is operating.

4. Pluralism and Rational Choice

The big question facing pluralism is whether rational choices can be made between irreducibly plural values. Irreducible plurality appears to imply incommensurability—that is to say, that there is no common measure which can be used to compare two different values. (See the entry on incommensurable values.) Value incommensurability seems worrying: if values are incommensurable, then either we are forced into an ad hoc ranking, or we cannot rank the values at all. Neither of these are very appealing options.

However, pluralists reject this dilemma. Bernard Williams argues that it is a mistake to think that pluralism implies that comparisons are impossible. He says:

There is one motive for reductivism that does not operate simply on the ethical, or on the non-ethical, but tends to reduce every consideration to one basic kind. This rests on an assumption about rationality, to the effect that two considerations cannot be rationally weighed against each other unless there is a common consideration in terms of which they can be compared. This assumption is at once very powerful and utterly baseless. Quite apart from the ethical, aesthetic considerations can be weighed against economic ones (for instance) without being an application of them, and without their both being an example of a third kind of consideration. (Williams 1985, p. 17)

Making a similar point, Ruth Chang points out that incommensurability is often conflated with incomparability. She provides clear definitions of each: incommensurability is the lack of a common unit of value by which precise comparisons can be made. Two items are incomparable, if there is no possible relation of comparison, such as ‘better than’, or ‘as good as’ (1997, Introduction). Chang points out that incommensurability is often thought to entail incomparability, but it does not.

Defenders of pluralism have used various strategies to show that it is possible to make rational choices between plural values.

4.1 Practical Wisdom

The pluralist’s most common strategy in the face of worries about choices between incommensurable values is to appeal to practical wisdom—the faculty described by Aristotle—a faculty of judgment that the wise and virtuous person has, which enables him to see the right answer. Practical wisdom is not just a question of being able to see and collate the facts, it goes beyond that in some way—the wise person will see things that only a wise person could see. So plural values can be compared in that a wise person will ‘just see’ that one course of action rather than another is to be taken. This strategy is used (explicitly or implicitly) by McDowell (1979), Nagel (1979), Larmore (1987), Skorupski (1996), Anderson (1993 and 1997) Wiggins (1997 and 1998), Chappell (1998), Swanton (2003). Here it is in Nagel’s words:

Provided one has taken the process of practical justification as far as it will go in the course of arriving at the conflict, one may be able to proceed without further justification, but without irrationality either. What makes this possible is judgment—essentially the faculty Aristotle described as practical wisdom, which reveals itself over time in individual decisions rather than in the enunciation of general principles. (1979, p. 135)

The main issue for this solution to the comparison problem is to come up with an account of what practical wisdom is. It is not easy to understand what sort of thing the faculty of judgment might be, or how it might work. Obviously pluralists who appeal to this strategy do not want to end up saying that the wise judge can see which of the options has more goodness, as that would constitute collapsing back into monism. So the pluralist has to maintain that the wise judge makes a judgment about what the right thing to do is without making any quantitative judgment. The danger is that the faculty seems entirely mysterious: it is a kind of magical vision, unrelated to our natural senses. As a solution to the comparison problem, the appeal to practical wisdom looks rather like way of shifting the problem to another level. Thus the appeal to practical wisdom cannot be left at that. The pluralist owes more explanation of what is involved in practical wisdom. What follows below are various pluralists’ accounts of how choice between plural values is possible, and whether such choice is rational.

4.2 Super Scales

One direction that pluralists have taken is to argue that although values are plural, there is nonetheless an available scale on which to rank them. This scale is not rationalized by something that the values have in common (that would be monism), but by something over and above the values, which is not itself a super value. Williams sometimes writes as if this is his intention, as do Griffin (1986 and 1997), Stocker (1990), Chang (1997 and 2004), Taylor (1982 and 1997). James Griffin (1986) develops this suggestion in his discussion of plural prudential values. According to Griffin, we do not need to have a super-value to have super-scale. Griffin says:

…it does not follow from there being no super-value that there is no super-scale. To think so would be to misunderstand how the notion of ‘quantity’ of well-being enters. It enters through ranking; quantitative differences are defined on qualitative ones. The quantity we are talking about is ‘prudential value’ defined on informed rankings. All that we need for the all-encompassing-scale is the possibility of ranking items on the basis of their nature. And we can, in fact, rank them in that way. We can work out trade-offs between different dimensions of pleasure or happiness. And when we do, we rank in a strong sense: not just choose one rather than the other, but regard it as worth more. That is the ultimate scale here: worth to one’s life. (Griffin 1986, p. 90)

This passage is slightly hard to interpret (for more on why see my earlier discussion of Griffin in the section on preference satisfaction accounts). On one interpretation, Griffin is in fact espousing a sophisticated monism. The basic value is ‘worth to one’s life’, and though it is important to talk about non-basic values, such as the different dimensions of pleasure and happiness, they are ultimately judged in terms of their contribution to the worth of lives.

The second possible interpretation takes Griffin’s claim that worth to life is not a supervalue seriously. On this interpretation, it is hard to see what worth to life is, if not a supervalue. Perhaps it is only a value that we should resort to when faced with incomparabilities. However, this interpretation invites the criticism that Griffin is introducing a non-moral value, perhaps prudential value, to arbitrate when moral values are incommensurable. In other words, we cannot decide between incommensurable values on moral grounds, so we should decide on prudential grounds. This seems reasonable when applied to incommensurabilities in aesthetic values. One might not be able to say whether Guernica is better than War and Peace, but one might choose to have Guernica displayed on the wall because it will impress one’s friends, or because it is worth more money, or even because one just enjoys it more. In the case of moral choices this is a less convincing strategy: it introduces a level of frivolity into morality that seems out of place.

Stocker’s main strategy is to argue that values are plural, and comparisons are made, so it must be possible to make rational comparisons. He suggests that a “higher level synthesizing category” can explain how comparisons are made (1990, p. 172). According to Stocker these comparisons are not quantitative, they are evaluative:

Suppose we are trying to choose between lying on a beach and discussing philosophy—or more particularly, between the pleasure of the former and the gain in understanding from the latter. To compare them we may invoke what might be called a higher-level synthesizing category. So, we may ask which will conduce to a more pleasing day, or to a day that is better spent. Once we have fixed upon the higher synthesizing category, we can often easily ask which option is better in regard to that category and judge which to choose on the basis of that. Even if it seems a mystery how we might ‘directly’ compare lying on the beach and discussing philosophy, it is a commonplace that we do compare them, e.g. in regard to their contribution to a pleasing day. (Stocker 1990, p. 72)

Stocker claims that goodness is just the highest level synthesizing category, and that lower goods are constitutive means to the good. Ruth Chang’s approach to comparisons of plural values is very similar (Chang 1997 (introduction) and 2004). Chang claims that comparisons can only be made in terms of a covering value—a more comprehensive value that has the plural values as parts.

A recent suggestion by Brian Hedden and Daniel Munoz is that by definition, overall value supervenes on the dimensions of value (Hedden and Munoz 2023). The basic point is that if overall value is affected, then there must be a relevant and distinct way that goodness or badness has been contributed. So, for example, in Chang’s case of adding more pleasure disrupting balance (see section 2.1), Hedden and Munoz argue that balance is a dimension of value, and it is because balance has been adversely affected that there is less value overall.

There is a problem in understanding quite what a ‘synthesizing category’ or ‘covering value’ is. How does the covering value determine the relative weightings of the constituent values? One possibility is that it does it by pure stipulation—as a martini just is a certain proportion of gin and vermouth. However, stipulation does not have the right sort of explanatory power. On the other hand, if a view is to remain pluralist, it must avoid conflating the super scale with a super value. Chang argues that her covering values are sufficiently unitary to provide a basis for comparison, and yet preserve the separateness of the other values. Chang’s argument goes as follows: the values at stake in a situation (for example, prudence and morality) cannot on their own determine how heavily they weigh in a particular choice situation—the values weigh differently depending on the circumstances of the choice. However, the values plus the circumstances cannot determine relevant weightings either—because (simplifying here) the internal circumstances of the choice will affect the weighting of the values differently depending on the external circumstances. To use Chang’s own example, when the values at stake are prudence and morality (specifically, the duty to help an innocent victim), and the circumstances include the fact that the victim is far away, the effect this circumstance will have on the weighting of the values depends on external circumstances, which fix what matters in the choice. So, as Chang puts it, “‘What matters’ must therefore have content beyond the values and the circumstances of the choice” (2004, p. 134).

Stocker is aware of the worry that appeal to something in terms of which comparisons can be made reduces the view to monism: Stocker insists that the synthesizing category (such as a good life) is not a unitary value—it is at most ‘nominal monism’ in my terminology. Stocker argues that it is a philosophical prejudice to think that rational judgment must be quantitative, and so he claims that he does not need to give an account of how we form and use the higher level synthesizing categories.

4.3 Basic Preferences

Another approach to the comparison problem appeals to basic preferences. Joseph Raz takes the line that we can explain choice between irreducibly plural goods by talking about basic preferences. Raz approaches the issue of incommensurability by talking about the nature of agency and rationality instead of about the nature of value. He distinguishes between two conceptions of human agency: the rationalist conception, and the classical conception. The rationalist conception corresponds to what we have called the stronger use of the term rational. According to the rationalist conception, reasons require action. The classical conception, by contrast, “regards reasons as rendering options eligible” (Raz 1999, p. 47). Raz favors the classical conception, which regards the will as something separate from desire:

The will is the ability to choose and perform intentional actions. We exercise our will when we endorse the verdict of reason that we must perform an action, and we do so, whether willingly, reluctantly, or regretting the need, etc. According to the classical conception, however, the most typical exercise or manifestation of the will is in choosing among options that reason merely renders eligible. Commonly when we so choose, we do what we want, and we choose what we want, from among the eligible options. Sometimes speaking of wanting one option (or its consequences) in preference to the other eligible ones is out of place. When I choose one tin of soup from a row of identical tins in the shop, it would be wrong and misleading to say that I wanted that tin rather than, or in preference to, the others. Similarly, when faced with unpalatable but unavoidable and incommensurate options (as when financial need forces me to give up one or another of incommensurate goods), it would be incorrect to say that I want to give up the one I choose to give up. I do not want to do so. I have to, and I would equally have regretted the loss of either good. I simply choose to give up one of them. (Raz, 1999, p. 48)

Raz’s view about the nature of agency is defended in great detail over the course of many articles, and all of those arguments cannot be examined in detail here. What is crucial in the context of this discussion of pluralism is whether Raz gives us a satisfactory account of the weaker sense of rational. Raz’s solution to the problem of incommensurability hangs on the claim that it can be rational (in the weak sense) to choose A over B when there are no further reasons favouring A over B. We shall restrict ourselves to mentioning one objection to the view in the context of moral choices between plural goods. Though Raz’s account of choice may seem plausible in cases where we choose between non-moral values, it seems to do violence to the concept of morality. Consider one of Raz’s own examples, the choice between a banana and a pear. It may be that one has to choose between them, and there is no objective reason to choose one or the other. In this case, it seems Raz’s account of choice is plausible. If one feels like eating a banana, then in this case, desire does provide a reason. As Raz puts it, “A want can never tip the balance of reasons in and of itself. Rather, our wants become relevant when reasons have run their course.” In the example where we choose between a banana and a pear, this sounds fine. However, if we apply it to a moral choice it seems a lot less plausible. Raz admits that “If of the options available to agents in typical situations of choice and decision, several are incommensurate, then reason can neither determine nor completely explain their choices or actions” (Raz, 1999, p. 48). Thus many moral choices are not directed by reason but by a basic preference. It is not fair to call it a desire, because on Raz’s account we desire things for reasons—we take the object of our desire to be desirable. On Raz’s picture then, when reasons have run their course, we are choosing without reasons. It doesn’t matter hugely whether we call that ‘rational’ (it is not rational in the strong sense, but it is in the weak sense). What matters is whether this weak sense of rational is sufficient to satisfy our concept of moral choice as being objectively defensible. The problem is that choosing without reasons look rather like plumping. Plumping may be an intelligible form of choice, but it is questionable whether it is a satisfactory account of moral choice.

4.4 Accepting Incomparability

One philosopher who is happy to accept that there may be situations where we just cannot make reasoned choices between plural values is Isaiah Berlin, who claimed that goods such as liberty and equality conflict at the fundamental level. Berlin is primarily concerned with political pluralism, and with defending political liberalism, but his views about incomparability have been very influential in discussions on moral pluralism. Bernard Williams (1981), Charles Larmore (1987), John Kekes (1993), Michael Stocker (1990 and 1997), David Wiggins (1997) have all argued that there are at least some genuinely irresolvable conflicts between values, and that to expect a rational resolution is a mistake. (See also the entry on moral dilemmas). For Williams this is part of a more general mistake made by contemporary moral philosophers—he thinks that philosophy tries to make ethics too easy, too much like arithmetic. Williams insists throughout his writings that ethics is a much more complex and multi-faceted beast than its treatment at the hands of moral philosophers would suggest, and so it is not surprising to him that there should be situations where values conflict irresolvably. Stocker (1990) discusses the nature of moral conflict at great length, and although he thinks that many apparent conflicts can be dissolved or are not serious, like Williams, he argues that much of contemporary philosophy’s demand for simplicity is mistaken. Stocker argues that ethics need not always be action guiding, that value is much more complex than Kantians and utilitarians would have us think, and that as the world is complicated we will inevitably face conflicts. Several pluralists have argued that accepting the inevitability of value conflicts does not result in a breakdown of moral argument, but rather the reverse. Kekes (1993), for example, claims that pluralism enables us to see that irresolvable disagreements are not due to wickedness on the part of our interlocutor, but may be due to the plural nature of values.

5. Conclusion

The battle lines in the debate between pluralism and monism are not always clear. This entry has outlined some of them, and discussed some of the main arguments. Pluralists need to be clear about whether they are foundational or non-foundational pluralists. Monists must defend their claim that there really is a unitary value. Much of the debate between pluralists and monists has focussed on the issue of whether the complexity of moral choice implies that values really are plural—a pattern emerges in which the monist claims to be able to explain the appearance of plurality away, and the pluralist insists that the appearance reflects a pluralist reality. Finally, pluralists must explain how comparisons between values are made, or defend the consequence that incommensurability is widespread.


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