Word Meaning

First published Tue Jun 2, 2015; substantive revision Fri Jun 7, 2024

Word meaning has played a somewhat marginal role in early contemporary philosophy of language, which focused more on the compositional processes whereby words combine to form meaningful sentences, rather than on their individual meanings (see the entry on compositionality). Nowadays, there is widespread consensus that the study of word meaning is crucial to our understanding of human language. This entry provides an overview of the way issues related to word meaning have been explored in analytic philosophy and a summary of relevant research on the subject in neighboring domains. Though the main focus will be on philosophical problems, contributions from linguistics, psychology, and neuroscience will also be considered.

1. Basics

The notions of word and word meaning can be tricky to pin down, and this is reflected in the difficulties one encounters in trying to define the basic terminology of lexical semantics. One challenge is that the word ‘word’ itself is highly polysemous (see, e.g., Booij 2007; Lieber 2010). For example, in everyday language ‘word’ is ambiguous between a type-level reading (as in “Color and colour are alternative spellings of the same word”), an occurrence-level reading (as in “There are thirteen words in the tongue-twister How much wood would a woodchuck chuck if a woodchuck could chuck wood?”), and a token-level reading (as in “John erased the last two words on the blackboard”). Before proceeding further, let us clarify what we will mean by ‘word’ (Section 1.1), and outline the questions that will guide our discussion of word meaning for the remainder of this entry (Section 1.2).

1.1 The Notion of Word

What is a word? We can distinguish two approaches to this question: linguistic approaches and metaphysical approaches. Linguistic approaches attempt to define the notion of word by reflecting on the explanatory and descriptive roles played by the notion in linguistic research (on explanation in linguistics, see Egré 2015). Linguistic approaches often end up splitting the notion of word into a plurality of more fine-grained notions, but still tend to regard ‘word’ as a term that tracks (or can track) a scientifically serviceable concept. For example, words are the primary locus of stress and tone assignment; the basic domain of morphological conditions on affixation, clitization, compounding; the theme of phonological and morphological processes of assimilation, vowel shift, metathesis, and reduplication (e.g., Di Sciullo & Williams 1987; Bromberger 2011; Haspelmath 2023).

Metaphysical approaches attempt to illuminate the notion of word by inquiring into the metaphysical underpinnings of the referents of ordinary word-talk. These approaches deal with such questions as “what does it take for a symbol to be a word?”, “how should words be individuated?”, and “under what conditions do two token utterances count as utterances of the same word?”. For example, Kaplan (1990, 2011) has proposed to replace the standard type-token account of the relation between words (qua abstract constituents of the lexicon of a language) and their articulations (e.g., the audible, spatio-temporally located sounds we produce when we pronounce a word) with a “common currency” view on which word types relate to their tokens like continuants relate to stages in four-dimensionalist metaphysics (see the entries on types and tokens and identity over time). Other contributions to this line of work can be found, among others, in McCulloch (1991), Cappelen (1999), Alward (2005), Wetzel (2009), Hawthorne & Lepore (2011), Sainsbury & Tye (2012), Gasparri (2016, 2021), Irmak (2019), Miller (2021), and Stojnić (2022).

For present purposes, we can adopt the following stipulation. Every natural language has a lexicon organized into lexical entries, which specify information about word types or lexemes. These are the smallest linguistic units that are conventionally associated with a non-compositional meaning and can be articulated in isolation to convey semantic content. Word types relate to word tokens and occurrences like phonemes relate to phones in phonological theory. To understand the parallel, think of the variations in the place of articulation of the phoneme /n/, which is pronounced as the voiced bilabial nasal [m] in “ten bags” and as the voiced velar nasal [ŋ] in “ten gates”. Just as phonemes are abstract representations of sets of phones (each defining one way the phoneme can be instantiated in the appropriate speech environments), lexemes can be defined as abstract representations of sets of words (each defining one way the lexeme can be instantiated in the appropriate sentence environments). Thus, “do”, “does”, “did” and “doing” are morphologically and graphically marked realizations of the abstract word type ‘do’. To wrap everything into a single formula, we can say that the lexical entries listed in a lexicon set the parameters defining the instantiation potential of word types in sentences, utterances and inscriptions (cf. Murphy 2010). In what follows, unless otherwise indicated, our talk of “word meaning” should be understood as talk of “word type meaning” or “lexeme meaning”, in the sense just illustrated.

1.2 Theories of Word Meaning

As with general theories of meaning (see the entry on theories of meaning), two kinds of theory of word meaning can be distinguished. The first kind, which we can label a semantic theory of word meaning, is a theory interested in determining the semantic properties of the words of a language. For example, a framework establishing that the word ‘bachelor’ encodes the concept adult unmarried male would be an example of a semantic theory of word meaning. The second kind, which we can label a foundational theory of word meaning, is a theory interested in determining the facts in virtue of which words (come to) have the semantic properties they have in a language. For example, a framework establishing that the word ‘bachelor’ expresses the concept adult unmarried male as a result of such and such dynamics of social coordination, or as a result of such and such historical facts, or as a result of such and such beliefs speakers of English have about ‘bachelor’, would be an example of a foundational theory of word meaning.

Obviously, endorsing a particular semantic theory of word meaning constrains the claims one can make about the foundations of word meaning, and vice versa. Semantic and foundational concerns are inextricably linked, and theories of word meaning tend to be hybrid creatures combining semantic and foundational aspects. For example, according to Ludlow’s (2014) theory of the dynamic lexicon, word meanings are radically underdetermined (a semantic claim), and this is to allow discourse partners to renegotiate the precise semantic properties of words from conversational context to conversational context (a foundational claim). Having said that, semantic and foundational theories remain in principle different and designed to tackle partially non-overlapping sets of issues. Our focus will be on semantic theories of word meaning, i.e., on theories of word meaning—or parts of theories of word meaning—that attempt to answer such questions as “what do words mean?”, “what do we know when we know the meaning of a word?”, and “what semantic information must a speaker associate with a word w in order to qualify as a competent user of w?”.

2. Historical Background

The study of word meaning became a well-established academic enterprise in the 19th century, with the birth of historical-philological semantics (Section 2.2). Nevertheless, word meaning had been a source of curiosity and debate long before that.

2.1 Classical Traditions

We can distinguish three major classical approaches to word meaning: speculative etymology, rhetoric, and classical lexicography (Meier-Oeser 2011; Geeraerts 2013).

  • The prototypical example of speculative etymology is perhaps Plato’s Cratylus (383a-d), where Cratylus lays out his anti-conventionalist view of word meaning. According to this view, words convey the essence of the objects they denote and the forms of words reveal the nature of their referents. For instance, the Greek word ‘anthrôpos’ can be broken down into anathrôn ha opôpe, which translates as “one who reflects on what he has seen”. The word ‘anthrôpos’ has the form it has because its referent is the only animal which possesses the combination of vision and intelligence. For the speculative etymologist, there is a “natural” or “non-arbitrary” relation between the form of words and their meaning, and the task of the theorist is to make this relation explicit. More on speculative etymology in Malkiel (1993) and Del Bello (2007). Note that at least since de Saussure’s (1995 [1916]) codification of the principle of the “arbitrary sign”, the contemporary language sciences have consistently held that the associations between words and their meanings are arbitrary. With few exceptions, the forms of words offer no reliable guide to what they stand for (see the entry on convention). This consensus is being revisited; see Planer & Kalkman (2021) and Gasparri et al. (2023).
  • Since its inception in classical times and up to the late 19th century, the rhetorical tradition has contributed to the study of word meaning through the analysis of figurative uses of words (e.g., metaphor, metonymy, synecdoche). Though originally developed for literary and political purposes (as the science of persuasive discourse), the rhetorical tradition provided a first organized framework to investigate the semantic flexibility of words, and laid the groundwork for further inquiry into our ability to use lexical expressions beyond their literal meaning. More on the rhetorical tradition in Kennedy (1994) and Herrick (2004).
  • Finally, classical lexicography and dictionary writing played an instrumental role in systematizing the descriptive data for later research on word meaning. Putnam’s (1970) claim that the very idea of a semantic theory originated from writing (and needing) dictionaries is probably an overstatement. But lexicography had a major impact on the development of modern theories of word meaning. The practice of separating dictionary entries through lemmatization and defining them using a combination of semantically simpler elements provided a stylistic and methodological paradigm for much subsequent research on lexical phenomena, such as decompositional theories of word meaning (Section 4.3). More on classical lexicography in Jackson (2002) and Hanks (2013).

2.2 Historical-Philological Semantics

Historical-philological semantics incorporated elements from all the above classical traditions and dominated the linguistic landscape roughly from 1870 to 1930 (Gordon 1982). It absorbed from speculative etymology an interest in the conceptual mechanisms underlying the association between forms and meanings, it adopted the taxonomic instruments of rhetorical analysis, and it assimilated the basis of descriptive data provided by lexicography and textual philology (Geeraerts 2013).

On the methodological side, the approach to word meaning introduced by historical-philological semantics had two major features. First, it had a diachronic and pragmatic orientation. That is, it was primarily concerned with the historical evolution of word meaning rather than with word meaning statically understood, and attributed vital importance to the contextual flexibility of word meaning. Examples include Paul’s (1920 [1880]) distinction between usuelle Bedeutung and okkasionelle Bedeutung, or Bréal’s (1924 [1897]) account of polysemy as a byproduct of semantic change. Second, historical-philological semantics regarded word meaning as a psychological phenomenon. It conceived of word meaning in mentalistic terms (i.e., words signify “concepts” or “ideas”), and associated the dynamics of sense modulation, extension, and contraction driving lexical change with patterns of conceptual activity in the human mind. For historical-philological semantics, the psychological mechanisms underlying the production and comprehension of figures of speech were far from marginal appendices to literal meaning: they were integral to the correct functioning of all aspects of lexical systems (Nerlich 1992).

Historical-philological semantics had a long-lasting influence. First, it was the first systematic framework to focus on the dynamic nature of word meaning and to identify contextual flexibility as a key explanandum for a theory of word meaning (Nerlich & Clarke 1996, 2007). Second, its psychologistic commitments added to the agenda of linguistic research the question of how word meaning relates to general cognition. What is the difference between lexical-semantic competence and conceptual competence? How do we draw the line between knowledge of the meaning of a word (e.g., knowledge of what ‘house’ means) and non-linguistic knowledge (e.g., knowledge of what houses are)?

3. Philosophy of Language

In this section we review some theories in analytic philosophy that bear on how lexical meaning should be conceived and described. We follow a roughly chronological order. Some of these theories, such as Carnap’s theory of meaning postulates and Putnam’s theory of stereotypes, have a strong focus on lexical meaning. Others, such as Montague semantics, regard it as a side issue. However, such negative views form an equally integral part of the philosophical debate on word meaning.

3.1 Early Contemporary Views

By taking the connection of thoughts and truth as the basic issue of semantics and regarding sentences as “the proper means of expression for a thought” (Frege 1979a [1897]), Frege paved the way for the 20th century priority of sentential meaning over lexical meaning: the semantic properties of subsentential expressions such as individual words were regarded as derivative, and identified with their contribution to sentential meaning. Sentential meaning was in turn identified with truth conditions, most explicitly in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus logico-philosophicus (1922). However, Frege never lost interest in the “building blocks of thoughts” (Frege 1979b [1914]), i.e., in the semantic properties of subsentential expressions. Indeed, his theory of sense and reference for names and predicates may be counted as the inaugural contribution to lexical semantics within the analytic tradition (see the entry on Gottlob Frege). It should be noted that Frege did not attribute semantic properties to lexical units as such, but to what he regarded as a sentence’s logical constituents. E.g., not to the word ‘dog’ but to the predicate ‘is a dog’. In later work this distinction was obliterated and Frege’s semantic notions came to be applied to lexical units.

Possibly because of lack of clarity affecting the notion of sense, and surely because of Russell’s (1905) authoritative criticism of Fregean semantics, word meaning disappeared from the philosophical scene during the 1920s and 1930s. In Wittgenstein’s Tractatus the “real” lexical units, i.e., the constituents of a completely analyzed sentence, are just names, whose semantic properties are exhausted by their reference (see the entry on Wittgenstein’s Logical Atomism). In Tarski’s (1933) work on formal languages, which was taken as definitional of the very field of semantics for some time, lexical units are semantically categorized into different classes (individual constants, predicative constants, functional constants) depending on the logical type of their reference, i.e., according to whether they designate individuals in a domain of interpretation, classes of individuals (or of n-tuples of individuals), or functions defined over the domain. However, Tarski made no attempt—nor felt any need—to represent semantic differences among expressions belonging to the same logical type (e.g., between one-place predicates such as ‘dog’ and ‘run’, or between two-place predicates such as ‘love’ and ‘left of’). See the entry on Alfred Tarski.

Quine (1943) and Church (1951) rehabilitated Frege’s distinction of sense and reference. Non-designating words such as ‘Pegasus’ cannot be meaningless: it is precisely the meaning of ‘Pegasus’ that allows speakers to establish that the word lacks reference. Moreover, as Frege (1892) had argued, true factual identities such as “Morning Star = Evening Star” do not state synonymies; if they did, any competent speaker of the language would be aware of their truth. Along these lines, Carnap (1947) proposed a new formulation of the sense/reference dichotomy, which was translated into the distinction between intension and extension. The notion of intension was intended to be an explicatum of Frege’s “obscure” notion of sense: two expressions have the same intension if and only if they have the same extension in every possible world or, in Carnap’s terminology, in every state description (i.e., in every maximal consistent set of atomic sentences and negations of atomic sentences). Thus, ‘round’ and ‘spherical’ have the same intension (i.e., they express the same function from possible worlds to extensions) because they apply to the same objects in every possible world.

Carnap later suggested that intensions could be regarded as the content of lexical semantic competence: to know the meaning of a word is to know its intension, “the general conditions which an object must fulfill in order to be denoted by [that] word” (Carnap 1955). However, such general conditions were not spelled out by Carnap (1947). Consequently, his system did not account, any more than Tarski’s, for semantic differences and relations among words belonging to the same semantic category: there were possible worlds in which one and the same individual could be both a married man and a bachelor, as no constraints were placed on either word’s intension. One consequence, as Quine (1951) pointed out, was that in Carnap’s system, which was supposed to single out analytic truths as true in every possible world, “Bachelors are unmarried”—intuitively, a paradigmatic analytic truth—turned out to be synthetic rather than analytic.

To remedy what he agreed was an unsatisfactory feature of his system, Carnap (1952) introduced meaning postulates, i.e., stipulations on the relations among the extensions of lexical items. For example, the meaning postulate

  • (MP)\(\forall x (\mbox{bachelor}(x) \supset \mathord{\sim}\mbox{married} (x))\)

stipulates that any individual that is in the extension of ‘bachelor’ is not in the extension of ‘married’. Meaning postulates can be seen either as restrictions on possible worlds or as relativizing analyticity to possible worlds. On the former option we shall say that “If Paul is a bachelor then Paul is unmarried” holds in every admissible possible world, while on the latter we shall say that it holds in every possible world in which (MP) holds. Carnap regarded the two options as equivalent; nowadays, the former is usually preferred. Carnap (1952) also thought that meaning postulates expressed the semanticist’s “intentions” with respect to the meanings of the descriptive constants, which may or may not reflect linguistic usage; again, today postulates are usually understood as expressing semantic relations (synonymy, analytic entailment, etc.) among lexical items as currently used by competent speakers.

In the late 1960s and early 1970s, Montague (1974) and other philosophers and linguists (Kaplan, Kamp, Partee, and D. Lewis among others) set out to apply to the analysis of natural language the notions and techniques that had been introduced by Tarski and Carnap and further developed in Kripke’s possible worlds semantics (see the entry on Montague semantics). Montague semantics can be represented as aiming to capture the inferential structure of a natural language: every inference that a competent speaker would regard as valid should be derivable in the theory. Some such inferences depend for their validity on syntactic structure and on the logical properties of logical words, like the inference from “Every man is mortal and Socrates is a man” to “Socrates is mortal”. Other inferences depend on properties of non-logical words that are usually regarded as semantic, like the inference from “Kim is pregnant” to “Kim is not a man”. In Montague semantics, such inferences are taken care of by supplementing the theory with suitable Carnapian meaning postulates. Yet, some followers of Montague regarded such additions as spurious: the aims of semantics, they said, should be distinguished from those of lexicography. The description of the meaning of non-logical words requires considerable world knowledge: for example, the inference from “Kim is pregnant” to “Kim is not a man” is based on a “biological” rather than on a “logical” generalization. Hence, we should not expect a semantic theory to furnish an account of how any two expressions belonging to the same syntactic category differ in meaning (Thomason 1974). From such a viewpoint, Montague semantics would not differ significantly from Tarskian semantics in its account of lexical meaning. But not all later work within Montague’s program shared such a skepticism about representing aspects of lexical meaning within a semantic theory, using either componential analysis (Dowty 1979) or meaning postulates (Chierchia & McConnell-Ginet 2000).

For those who believe that meaning postulates can exhaust lexical meaning, the issue arises of how to choose them, i.e., of how—and whether—to delimit the set of meaning-relevant truths with respect to the set of all true statements in which a given word occurs. As we just saw, Carnap himself thought that the choice could only be the expression of the semanticist’s intentions. However, we seem to share intuitions of analyticity, i.e., we seem to regard some, but not all sentences of a natural language as true by virtue of the meaning of the occurring words. Such intuitions are taken to reflect objective semantic properties of the language, that the semanticist should describe rather than impose at will. Quine (1951) did not challenge the existence of such intuitions, but he argued that they could not be cashed out in the form of a scientifically respectable criterion separating analytic truths (“Bachelors are unmarried”) from synthetic truths (“Aldo’s uncle is a bachelor”), whose truth does not depend on meaning alone. Though Quine’s arguments were often criticized (for criticisms, see Williamson 2007), and in spite of Chomsky’s constant endorsement of analyticity (see e.g. 2000: 47, 61–62), within philosophy the analytic/synthetic distinction was never fully vindicated (for an exception, see Russell 2008). Hence, it was widely believed that lexical meaning could not be adequately described by meaning postulates. Fodor and Lepore (1992) argued that this left semantics with two options: lexical meanings were either atomic (i.e., they could not be specified by descriptions involving other meanings) or they were holistic, i.e., only the set of all true sentences of the language could count as fixing them.

Neither alternative looked promising. Holism incurred in objections connected with the acquisition and the understanding of language: how could individual words be acquired by children, if grasping their meaning involved, somehow, semantic competence on the whole language? And how could individual sentences be understood if the information required to understand them exceeded the capacity of human working memory? (For an influential criticism of several varieties of holism, see Dummett 1991; for a review, Pagin 2006). Atomism, in turn, ran against strong intuitions of (at least some) relations among words being part of a language’s semantics: it is because of what ‘bachelor’ means that it doesn’t make sense to suppose we could discover that some bachelors are married. Fodor (1998) countered this objection by reinterpreting allegedly semantic relations as metaphysically necessary connections among extensions of words. However, sentences that are usually regarded as analytic, such as “Bachelors are unmarried”, are not easily seen as just metaphysically necessary truths like “Water is H2O”. If water is H2O, then its metaphysical essence consists in being H2O (whether we know it or not); but there is no such thing as a metaphysical essence that all bachelors share—an essence that could be hidden to us, even though we use the word ‘bachelor’ competently. On the contrary, on acquiring the word ‘bachelor’ we acquire the belief that bachelors are unmarried (Quine 1986); by contrast, many speakers that have ‘water’ in their lexical repertoire do not know that water is H2O. The difficulties of atomism and holism opened the way to vindications of molecularism (e.g., Perry 1994; Marconi 1997), the view on which only some relations among words matter for acquisition and understanding (see the entry on meaning holism).

While mainstream formal semantics went with Carnap and Montague, supplementing the Tarskian apparatus with the possible worlds machinery and defining meanings as intensions, Davidson (1967, 1984) put forth an alternative suggestion. Tarski had shown how to provide a definition of the truth predicate for a (formal) language L: such a definition is materially adequate (i.e., it is a definition of truth, rather than of some other property of sentences of L) if and only if it entails every biconditional of the form

  • (T) S is true in L iff p,

where S is a sentence of L and p is its translation into the metalanguage of L in which the definition is formulated. Thus, Tarski’s account of truth presupposes that the semantics of both L and its metalanguage is fixed (otherwise it would be undetermined whether S translates into p). On Tarski’s view, each biconditional of form (T) counts as a “partial definition” of the truth predicate for sentences of L (see the entry on Tarski’s truth definitions). By contrast, Davidson suggested that if one took the notion of truth for granted, then T-biconditionals could be read as collectively constituting a theory of meaning for L, i.e., as stating truth conditions for the sentences of L. For example,

  • (W) “If the weather is bad then Sharon is sad” is true in English iff either the weather is not bad or Sharon is sad

states the truth conditions of the English sentence “If the weather is bad then Sharon is sad”. Of course, (W) is intelligible only if one understands the language in which it is phrased, including the predicate ‘true in English’. Davidson thought that the recursive machinery of Tarski’s definition of truth could be transferred to the suggested semantic reading, with extensions to take care of the forms of natural language composition that Tarski had neglected because they had no analogue in the formal languages he was dealing with. Unfortunately, few of such extensions were ever spelled out by Davidson or his followers. Moreover, it is difficult to see how, giving up possible worlds and intensions in favor of a purely extensional theory, the Davidsonian program could account for the semantics of propositional attitude ascriptions of the form “A believes (hopes, imagines, etc.) that p”.

Construed as theorems of a semantic theory, T-biconditionals were often accused of being uninformative (Putnam 1975; Dummett 1976): to understand them, one has to already possess the information they are supposed to provide. This is particularly striking in the case of lexical axioms such as the following:

  • (V1) Val(x, ‘man’) iff x is a man;
  • (V2) Val(\(\langle x,y\rangle\), ‘knows’) iff x knows y.

(To be read, respectively, as “the predicate ‘man’ applies to x if and only if x is a man” and “the predicate ‘know’ applies to the pair \(\langle x, y\rangle\) if and only if x knows y”). Here it is apparent that in order to understand (V1) one must know what ‘man’ means, which is just the information that (V1) is supposed to convey (as the theory, being purely extensional, identifies meaning with reference). Some Davidsonians, though admitting that statements such as (V1) and (V2) are in a sense “uninformative”, insist that what (V1) and (V2) state is no less “substantive” (Larson & Segal 1995). To prove their point, they appeal to non-homophonic versions of lexical axioms, i.e., to the axioms of a semantic theory for a language that does not coincide with the (meta)language in which the theory itself is phrased. Such would be, e.g.,

  • (V3) Val(x, ‘man’) si et seulement si x est un homme.

(V3), they argue, is clearly substantive, yet what it says is exactly what (V1) says, namely, that the word ‘man’ applies to a certain category of objects. Therefore, if (V3) is substantive, so is (V1). But this is beside the point. The issue is not whether (V1) expresses a proposition; it clearly does, and it is, in this sense, “substantive”. But what is relevant here is informative power: to one who understands the metalanguage of (V3), i.e., French, (V3) may communicate new information, whereas there is no circumstance in which (V1) would communicate new information to one who understands English.

3.2 Grounding and Lexical Competence

In the mid-1970s, Dummett raised the issue of the proper place of lexical meaning in a semantic theory. If the job of a theory of meaning is to make the content of semantic competence explicit—so that one could acquire semantic competence in a language L by learning an adequate theory of meaning for L—then the theory ought to reflect a competent speaker’s knowledge of circumstances in which she would assert a sentence of L, such as “The horse is in the barn”, as distinct from circumstances in which she would assert “The cat is on the mat”. This, in turn, appears to require that the theory yields explicit information about the use of ‘horse’, ‘barn’, etc., or, in other words, that it includes information which goes beyond the logical type of lexical units. Dummett identified such information with a word’s Fregean sense. However, he did not specify the format in which word senses should be expressed in a semantic theory, except for words that could be defined (e.g., ‘aunt’ = “sister of a parent”): in such cases, the definiens specifies what a speaker must understand in order to understand the word (Dummett 1991). But of course, not all words are of this kind. For other words, the theory should specify what it is for a speaker to know them, though we are not told how exactly this should be done. Similarly, Grandy (1974) pointed out that by identifying the meaning of a word such as ‘wise’ as a function from possible worlds to the sets of wise people in those worlds, Montague semantics only specifies a formal structure and eludes the question of whether there is some possible description for the functions which are claimed to be the meanings of words. Lacking such descriptions, possible worlds semantics is not really a theory of meaning but a theory of logical form or logical validity. Again, aside from suggesting that “one would like the functions to be given in terms of computation procedures, in some sense”, Grandy had little to say about the form of lexical descriptions.

In a similar vein, Partee (1981) argued that Montague semantics, like every compositional or structural semantics, does not uniquely fix the intensional interpretation of words. The addition of meaning postulates does rule out some interpretations (e.g., interpretations on which the extension of ‘bachelor’ and the extension of ‘married’ may intersect in some possible world). However, it does not reduce them to the unique, “intended” or, in Montague’s words, “actual” interpretation (Montague 1974). Hence, standard model-theoretic semantics does not capture the whole content of a speaker’s semantic competence, but only its structural aspects. Fixing “the actual interpretation function” requires more than language-to-language connections as encoded by, e.g., meaning postulates: it requires some “language-to-world grounding”. Arguments to the same effect were developed by Bonomi (1983) and Harnad (1990). In particular, Harnad had in mind the simulation of human semantic competence in artificial systems: he suggested that symbol grounding could be implemented, in part, by “feature detectors” picking out “invariant features of objects and event categories from their sensory projections” (e.g., Steels & Hild 2012). Such a cognitively oriented conception of grounding differs from Partee’s Putnam-inspired view, on which the semantic grounding of lexical items depends on the speakers’ objective interactions with the external world in addition to their narrow psychological properties.

A resolutely cognitive approach characterizes Marconi’s (1997) account of lexical semantic competence. In his view, lexical competence has two aspects: an inferential aspect, underlying performances such as semantically based inference and the command of synonymy, hyponymy and other semantic relations; and a referential aspect, which is in charge of performances such as naming (e.g., calling a horse ‘horse’) and application (e.g., answering the question “Are there any spoons in the drawer?”). Language users typically possess both aspects of lexical competence, though in different degrees for different words: a zoologist’s inferential competence on ‘manatee’ is usually richer than a layman’s, though a layman who spent her life among manatees may be more competent, referentially, than a “bookish” scientist. However, the two aspects are independent, and neuropsychological evidence appears to show that they can be dissociated: there are patients whose referential competence is impaired or lost while their inferential competence is intact, and vice versa (see Section 5.3). Being a theory of individual competence, Marconi’s account does not deal directly with lexical meanings in a public language: communication depends both on the uniformity of cognitive interactions with the external world and on communal norms concerning the use of language, together with speakers’ deferential attitude toward semantic authorities.

3.3 The Externalist Turn

Since the early 1970s, views on lexical meaning were revolutionized by semantic externalism. Initially, externalism was limited to proper names and natural kind words such as ‘gold’ or ‘lemon’. In slightly different ways, both Kripke (1972) and Putnam (1970, 1975) argued that the reference of such words was not determined by any description that a competent speaker associated with the word; more generally, and contrary to what Frege may have thought, it was not determined by any cognitive content associated with it in a speaker’s mind (for arguments to that effect, see the entry on names). Instead, reference is determined, at least in part, by objective (“causal”) relations between a speaker and the external world. For example, a speaker refers to Aristotle when she utters the sentence “Aristotle was a great warrior”—so that her assertion expresses a false proposition about Aristotle, not a true proposition about some great warrior she may “have in mind”—thanks to her connection with Aristotle himself. In this case, the connection is constituted by a historical chain of speakers going back to the initial users of the name ‘Aristotle’, or its Greek equivalent, in baptism-like circumstances. To belong to the chain, speakers (including present-day speakers) are not required to possess any precise knowledge of Aristotle’s life and deeds; they are, however, required to intend to use the name as it is used by the speakers they are picking up the name from, i.e., to refer to the individual those speakers intend to refer to.

In the case of most natural kind names, it may be argued, baptisms are hard to identify or even conjecture (see the entry on natural kinds). In Putnam’s view, for such words reference is determined by speakers’ causal interaction with portions of matter or biological individuals in their environment: ‘water’, for example, refers to this liquid stuff, stuff that is normally found in our rivers, lakes, etc. The indexical component (this liquid, our rivers) is crucial to reference determination: it wouldn’t do to identify the referent of ‘water’ by way of some description (“liquid, transparent, quenches thirst, boils at 100°C, etc.”), for something might fit the description yet fail to be water, as in Putnam’s (1973, 1975) famous Twin Earth thought experiment (see the entry on reference). It might be remarked that, thanks to modern chemistry, we now possess a description that is sure to apply to water and only to water: “being H2O” (Millikan 2005). However, even if our chemistry were badly mistaken (as in principle it could turn out to be) and water were not, in fact, H2O, ‘water’ would still refer to whatever has the same nature as this liquid. Something belongs to the extension of ‘water’ if and only if it is the same substance as this liquid, which we identify—correctly, as we believe—as being H2O.

Let it be noted that in Putnam’s original proposal, reference determination is utterly independent of speakers’ cognition: ‘water’ on Twin Earth refers to XYZ (not to H2O) even though the difference between the two substances is cognitively inert, so that before chemistry was created nobody on either Earth or Twin Earth could have told them apart. However, the label ‘externalism’ has been occasionally used for weaker views: a semantic account may be regarded as externalist if it takes semantic content to depend in one way or another on relations a computational system bears to things outside itself (Rey 2005; Borg 2012), irrespective of whether such relations affect the system’s cognitive state. Weak externalism is hard to distinguish from forms of internalism on which a word’s reference is determined by information stored in a speaker’s cognitive system—information of which the speaker may or may not be aware (Evans 1982). Be that as it may, in what follows ‘externalism’ will be used to mean strong, or Putnamian, externalism.

Does externalism apply to other lexical categories besides proper names and natural kind words? Putnam (1975) extended it to artifactual words, claiming that ‘pencil’ would refer to pencils—those objects—even if they turned out not to fit the description by which we normally identify them (e.g., if they were discovered to be organisms, not artifacts). Schwartz (1978, 1980) pointed out, among many objections, that even in such a case we could make objects fitting the original description; we would then regard the pencil-like organisms as impostors, not as “genuine” pencils. Others sided with Putnam and the externalist account: for example, Kornblith (1980) pointed out that artifactual kinds from an ancient civilization could be re-baptized in total ignorance of their function. The new artifactual word would then refer to the kind those objects belong to independently of any beliefs about them, true or false. Against such externalist accounts, Thomasson (2007) argued that artifactual terms cannot refer to artifactual kinds independently of all beliefs and concepts about the nature of the kind, for the concept of the kind’s creator(s) is constitutive of the nature of the kind. Whether artifactual words are liable to an externalist account is still an open issue (for discussion see Marconi 2013; Bahr, Carrara & Jansen 2019; see also the entry on artifacts), as is, more generally, the scope of application of externalist semantics.

There is another form of externalism that does apply to all or most words of a language: social externalism (Burge 1979), the view on which the meaning of a word as used by an individual speaker depends on the semantic standards of the linguistic community the speaker belongs to. In our community the word ‘arthritis’ refers to arthritis—an affliction of the joints—even when used by a speaker who believes that it can afflict the muscles as well and uses the word accordingly. If the community the speaker belongs to applied ‘arthritis’ to rheumatoids ailments in general, whether or not they afflict the joints, the same word form would not mean arthritis and would not refer to arthritis. Hence, a speaker’s mental contents, such as the meanings associated with the words she uses, depend on something external to her, namely the uses and the standards of use of the linguistic community she belongs to. Thus, social externalism eliminates the notion of idiolect: words only have the meanings conferred upon them by the linguistic community (“public” meanings); discounting radical incompetence, there is no such thing as individual semantic deviance, there are only false beliefs (for criticisms, see Bilgrami 1992, Marconi 1997; see also the entry on idiolects).

Though both forms of externalism focus on reference, neither is a complete reduction of lexical meaning to reference. Both Putnam and Burge make it a necessary condition of semantic competence on a word that a speaker commands information that other semantic views would regard as part of the word’s sense. For example, if a speaker believes that manatees are a kind of household appliance, she would not count as competent on the word ‘manatee’, nor would she refer to manatees by using it (Putnam 1975; Burge 1993). Beyond that, it is not easy for externalists to provide a satisfactory account of lexical semantic competence, as they are committed to regarding speakers’ beliefs and abilities (e.g., recognitional abilities) as essentially irrelevant to reference determination, hence to meaning. Two main solutions have been proposed. Putnam (1970, 1975) suggested that a speaker’s semantic competence consists in her knowledge of stereotypes associated with words. A stereotype is an oversimplified theory of a word’s extension: the stereotype associated with ‘tiger’ describes tigers as cat-like, striped, carnivorous, fierce, living in the jungle, etc. Stereotypes are not meanings, as they do not determine reference in the right way: there are albino tigers and tigers that live in zoos. What the ‘tiger’-stereotype describes is (what the community takes to be) the typical tiger. Knowledge of stereotypes is necessary to be regarded as a competent speaker, and—one surmises—it can also be considered sufficient for the purposes of ordinary communication. Thus, Putnam’s account does provide some content for semantic competence, though it dissociates it from knowledge of meaning.

3.4 Internalism

Some philosophers (e.g., Loar 1981; McGinn 1982; Block 1986) objected to the reduction of lexical meaning to reference, or to non-psychological factors that are alleged to determine reference. In their view, there are two aspects of meaning (more generally, of content): the narrow aspect, that captures the intuition that ‘water’ has the same meaning in both Earthian and Twin-Earthian English, and the wide aspect, that captures the externalist intuition that ‘water’ picks out different substances in the two worlds. The wide notion is required to account for the difference in reference between English and Twin-English ‘water’; the narrow notion is needed, first and foremost, to account for the relation between a subject’s beliefs and her behavior. The idea is that how an object of reference is described (not just which object one refers to) can make a difference in determining behavior. Oedipus married Jocasta because he thought he was marrying the queen of Thebes, not his mother, though as a matter of fact Jocasta was his mother. Theorists that countenance these two components of meaning and content usually identify the narrow aspect with the inferential or conceptual role of an expression e, i.e., with the aspect of e that contributes to determine the inferential relations between sentences containing an occurrence of e and other sentences. Crucially, the two aspects are independent: neither determines the other. The independence of the two factors is also stressed by later versions of so-called “dual aspect” theories, such as Chalmers’s (1996, 2002).

While dual theorists agree with Putnam’s claim that some aspects of meaning are not “in the head”, others have opted for plain internalism. For example, Segal (2000) rejected the intuitions that are usually associated with the Twin-Earth cases by arguing that meaning (and content in general) “locally supervenes” on a subject’s intrinsic physical properties. But the most influential critic of externalism has undoubtedly been Chomsky (2000). First, he argued that much of the alleged support for externalism comes in fact from “intuitions” about words’ reference in this or that circumstance. But ‘reference’ (and the verb ‘refer’ as used by philosophers) is a technical term, not an ordinary word, hence we have no more intuitions about reference than we have about tensors or c-command. Second, if we look at how words such as ‘water’ are applied in ordinary circumstances, we find that speakers may call ‘water’ liquids that contain a smaller proportion of H2O than other liquids they do not call ‘water’ (e.g., tea): our use of ‘water’ does not appear to be governed by hypotheses about microstructure. According to Chomsky, so-called “natural kind words” (which in fact have little to do with kinds in nature, Chomsky claims) may do little more than indicating “positions in belief systems”: studying them may be of some interest for “ethnoscience”, surely not for a science of language. Along similar lines, others have maintained that word meanings are neither concepts nor extensions; instead, they are just composable instructions for how to access and assemble concepts (Pietroski 2010; 2018). If the semantic properties of words and other linguistic expressions constrain but do not determine contents, and sentences do not have context-relativized truth conditions, the connection between meaning, truth and reference may be significantly looser than assumed by standard “content semantics” (Harris 2022).

3.5 Contextualism, Minimalism, and the Lexicon

“Ordinary language” philosophers of the 1950s and 1960s regarded work in formal semantics as essentially irrelevant to issues of meaning in natural language. Following Austin and the later Wittgenstein, they identified meaning with use and were prone to consider the different patterns of use of individual expressions as originating different meanings of the word. Grice (1975) argued that such a proliferation of meanings could be avoided by distinguishing between what is asserted by a sentence (to be identified with its truth conditions) and what is communicated by it in a given context (or in every “normal” context). For example, consider the following exchange:

  • A: Will Kim be hungry at 11am?
  • B: Kim had breakfast.

Although B does not literally assert that Kim had breakfast on that particular day (see, however, Partee 1973), she does communicate as much. More precisely, A could infer the communicated content by noticing that the asserted sentence, taken literally (“Kim had breakfast at least once in her life”), would be less informative than required in the context: thus, it would violate one or more principles of conversation (“maxims”) whereas there is no reason to suppose that the speaker intended to opt out of conversational cooperation (see the entries on Paul Grice and pragmatics). If the interlocutor assumes that the speaker intended him to infer the communicated content—i.e., that Kim had breakfast that morning, so presumably she would not be hungry at 11—cooperation is preserved. Such non-asserted content, called ‘implicature’, need not be an addition to the overtly asserted content: e.g., in irony asserted content is negated rather than expanded by the implicature (think of a speaker uttering “Paul is a fine friend” to implicate that Paul has wickedly betrayed her).

Grice’s theory of conversation and implicatures was interpreted by many (including Grice himself) as a convincing way of accounting for the variety of contextually specific communicative contents while preserving the uniqueness of a sentence’s “literal” meaning, which was identified with truth conditions and regarded as determined by syntax and the conventional meanings of the occurring words, as in formal semantics. The only semantic role context was allowed to play was in determining the content of indexical words (such as ‘I’, ‘now’, ‘here’, etc.) and the effect of context-sensitive structures (such as tense) on a sentence’s truth conditions (see the entries on indexicals and implicature). However, in about the same years Travis (1975) and Searle (1979, 1980) pointed out that the semantic relevance of context might be much more pervasive, if not universal: intuitively, the same sentence type could have very different truth conditions in different contexts, though no indexical expression or structure appeared to be involved. Take the sentence “There is milk in the fridge”: in the context of morning breakfast it will be considered true if there is a carton of milk in the fridge and false if there is a patch of milk on a tray in the fridge, whereas in the context of cleaning up the kitchen truth conditions are reversed. Examples can be multiplied indefinitely, as indefinitely many factors can turn out to be relevant to the truth or falsity of a sentence as uttered in a particular context. Such variety cannot be plausibly reduced to traditional polysemy such as the polysemy of ‘property’ (meaning quality or real estate), nor can it be described in terms of Gricean implicatures: implicatures are supposed not to affect a sentence’s truth conditions, whereas here it is precisely the sentence’s truth conditions that are seen as varying with context.

The traditionalist could object by challenging the contextualist’s intuitions about truth conditions. “There is milk in the fridge”, she could argue, is true if and only if there is a certain amount (a few molecules will do) of a certain organic substance in the relevant fridge (for versions of this objection, Cappelen & Lepore 2005). So the sentence is true both in the carton case and in the patch case; it would be false only if the fridge did not contain any amount of any kind of milk (whether cow milk or goat milk or elephant milk). The contextualist’s reply is that, in fact, neither the speaker nor the interpreter is aware of such alleged literal content (the point is challenged by Fodor 1983, Carston 2002); but “what is said” must be intuitively accessible to the conversational participants (Availability Principle, Recanati 1989). If truth conditions are associated with what is said—as the traditionalist would agree they are—then in many cases a sentence’s literal content, if there is such a thing, does not determine a complete, evaluable proposition. For a genuine proposition to arise, a sentence type’s literal content (as determined by syntax and conventional word meaning) must be enriched or otherwise modified by primary pragmatic processes based on the speakers’ background knowledge relative to each particular context of use of the sentence. Such processes differ from Gricean implicature-generating processes in that they come into play at the sub-propositional level; moreover, they are not limited to saturation of indexicals but may include the replacement of a constituent with another. These tenets define contextualism (Recanati 1993; Bezuidenhout 2002; Carston 2002; relevance theory (Sperber & Wilson 1986) is in some respects a precursor of such views). Contextualists take different stands on the nature of the semantic contribution made by words to sentences, though they typically agree that it is insufficient to fix truth conditions (Stojanovic 2008). See Del Pinal (2018) for an argument that radical contextualism (in particular, truth-conditional pragmatics) should instead commit to rich lexical items which, in certain conditions, do suffice to fix truth conditions.

Even if sentence types have no definite truth conditions, it does not follow that lexical types do not make definite or predictable contributions to the truth conditions of sentences (think of indexical words). It does follow, however, that conventional word meanings are not the final constituents of complete propositions (see Allot & Textor 2012). Does this imply that there are no such things as lexical meanings understood as features of a language? If so, how should we account for word acquisition and lexical competence in general? Recanati (2004) does not think that contextualism as such is committed to meaning eliminativism, the view on which words as types have no meaning; nevertheless, he regards it as defensible. Words could be said to have, rather than “meaning”, a semantic potential, defined as the collection of past uses of a word w on the basis of which similarities can be established between source situations (i.e., the circumstances in which a speaker has used w) and target situations (i.e., candidate occasions of application of w). It is natural to object that even admitting that long-term memory could encompass such a vast amount of information (think of the number of times ‘table’ or ‘woman’ are used by average speakers over the course of their life), surely working memory could not review such information to make sense of new uses. On the other hand, if words were associated with “more abstract schemata corresponding to types of situations”, as Recanati suggests as a less radical alternative to meaning eliminativism, one wonders what the difference would be with respect to traditional accounts in terms of polysemy.

Other conceptions of “what is said” make more room for the semantic contribution of conventional word meanings. Bach (1994) agrees with contextualists that the linguistic meaning of words (plus syntax and after saturation) does not always determine complete, truth-evaluable propositions; however, he maintains that they do provide some minimal semantic information, a so-called “propositional radical”, that allows pragmatic processes to issue in one or more propositions. Bach identifies “what is said” with such minimal information. However, many have objected that minimal content is extremely hard to isolate (Recanati 2004; Stanley 2007). Suppose it is identified with the content that all the utterances of a sentence type share; unfortunately, no such content can be attributed to a sentence such as “Every bottle is in the fridge”, for there is no proposition that is stably asserted by every utterance of it (surely not the proposition that every bottle in the universe is in the fridge, which is never asserted). Stanley’s (2007) indexicalism rejects the notion of minimal proposition and any distinction between semantic content and communicated content: communicated content can be entirely captured by means of consciously accessible, linguistically controlled content together with general conversational norms. Accordingly, Stanley generalizes contextual saturation processes that are usually regarded as characteristic of indexicals, tense, etc.; moreover, he requires that the relevant variables be linguistically encoded, either syntactically or lexically. It remains to be seen whether such solutions apply (in a non-ad hoc way) to all the examples of content modulation that have been presented in the literature.

Finally, minimalism (Borg 2004, 2012; Cappelen & Lepore 2005) is the view that appears to be closest to the Frege-Montague tradition. The task of a semantic theory is just to account for the literal meaning of sentences: context does not affect literal semantic content but “what the speaker says” as opposed to “what the sentence means” (Borg 2012). Contrary to contextualism and Bach’s theory, minimalism holds that lexicon and syntax together determine complete truth-evaluable propositions. Indeed, this is definitional for lexical meaning: word meanings are the kind of things which, if one puts enough of them together in the right sort of way, then what one gets is propositional content (Borg 2012). Borg believes that, in order to be truth-evaluable, propositional contents must be “about the world”, and that this entails some form of semantic externalism. However, the identification of lexical meaning with reference makes it hard to account for semantic relations such as synonymy, analytic entailment or the difference between ambiguity and polysemy, and syntactically relevant properties: the difference between “John is easy to please” and “John is eager to please” cannot be explained by the fact that ‘easy’ means the property easy (see the entry on ambiguity). To account for semantically based syntactic properties, words may come with “instructions” that are not, however, constitutive of a word’s meaning like meaning postulates (which Borg rejects), though awareness of them is part of a speaker’s competence. Once more, lexical semantic competence is divorced from grasp of word meaning. In conclusion, some information counts as lexical if it is either perceived as such in “firm, type-level lexical intuitions” or capable of affecting the word’s syntactic behavior. Borg concedes that even such an extended conception of lexical content will not capture, e.g., analytic entailments such as the relation between ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried’.

3.6 Vague, Ambiguous, Homonymous, and Polysemous Words

The common feature of different notions such as vagueness, ambiguity, homonymy, and polysemy (as applied to words) is that they all indicate some form of semantic underdetermination. Vague words (ambiguous words, and so on) do not straightforwardly determine their extensions, though the reasons are different in each case. The first distinction to be drawn is between the notion of vagueness and the other notions. Vagueness is a property of concepts, and indirectly of the words that express those concepts. For example, the concept heap is vague: even though we can easily grant that two nails definitely are not a heap of nails, whereas one hundred thousand nails definitely form a heap, the question whether, e.g., forty-six nails make a heap does not appear to have a definite answer. The word ‘heap’ simply inherits the vagueness of the concept heap. Similarly with ‘tall’, ‘young’, ‘heavy’, and many other words (see the entry on vagueness).

By contrast, a polysemous word (such as ‘line’, ‘keep’, ‘expire’, and many others) is a word—a pair of sound and script—that expresses several different concepts. ‘Line’ may express the concept of slender cord, of sequence of written characters, of railway track, of a certain device for catching fish, of field of activity or interest, and more. Such concepts need not be themselves underdetermined in any way, though they may be. Beginning with Apresjan (1974), a distinction is often drawn between regular (or logical) and irregular (or accidental) polysemy. A standard example of regular polysemy is the animal/food polysemy: ‘rabbit’ is used to refer to an animal as well as to its meat (“The rabbit was delicious”). The mechanism appears to concern all words for edible animals. By contrast, the polysemy of ‘run’ (“run a mile”, “run a shop”, “musical talent runs in the family”) does not appear to instantiate a pattern that fits other English words as well (see Falkum & Vicente 2015).

In the ‘line’ case, the word’s different senses—the different concepts it expresses—appear to be related to one another, albeit weakly or by way of metaphorical extension (as with the field of activity sense). This is not always the case: some polysemous words have totally disparate senses. ‘Coach’ is used for certain vehicles and passenger cars in trains as well as for sports instructors. Etymologically, the latter sense is in fact derived from the former, via seeing an instructor as one who conveys the pupil through examinations and other challenges. However, the connection is lost in most speakers’ semantic awareness. Polysemous words with such disparate meanings are often called ‘homonyms’.

A different case concerns words that came to have the same phonetic and graphic form by historical accident. E.g., ‘bark’1, the characteristic dog noise, comes from Old English beorcan, whereas ‘bark’2, “the tough exterior covering a woody root or stem” (Webster), is from Old Norse bark, and ‘bark’3, a sailing ship, comes from Middle French barque, itself from Late Latin barca, a small boat. In such cases, different etymological chains, originating from entirely distinct words, happened to issue in the same phonetic and graphic form. It is natural to regard ‘bark’1, ‘bark’2, and ‘bark’3 as three different words that happen to sound the same, rather than as three different senses of one and the same word (Lyons 1977). Perhaps the notion of lexical ambiguity should be limited to such cases (see the entry on ambiguity). Alternatively, they may be—and often are—regarded as extreme cases of homonymy. The obvious difference with respect to standard homonymy, however, is that while there is a story concerning the derivation of the sports instructor sense of ‘coach’ from the vehicle sense, no such story can be told connecting the three “senses” of ‘bark’.

What is it for a speaker to be semantically competent on words that have several, often weakly related meanings? Plausibly, the different meanings of ambiguous words (‘bark’) and homonyms (‘coach’) must be acquired one by one and have distinct mental representations, as it is hard to see how a single representation could allow a speaker to derive, e.g., both the vehicle sense of ‘coach’ and the sports instructor sense. Some (Katz 1972; Lakoff 1987, among others) thought that the same applies to polysemous words. This is the “sense enumeration” view of the cognitive semantics of polysemous words (Falkum & Vicente 2015). One difficulty with this picture is that some polysemous words have “too many” senses. For instance, there may be close to a hundred different senses of the English preposition ‘over’ (Brugman 1988).

The main alternative to the sense enumeration theory is the “one representation” theory, on which polysemous words activate a single representation. This may be conceived either as a core meaning that is shared by the polysemous word’s several senses (“thin semantics”), or as a structured representation that includes every sense of the polysemous word by allowing their generation in a context (as in Two-Level Semantics and Generative Lexicon Theory, respectively; see Section 4.3). As we saw in Section 3.5, Recanati (2004), a proponent of a “thin” semantics, suggests that the meanings of polysemous words may be seen as semantic potentials. More generally, pragmaticists such as Recanati, Sperber and Wilson (1986), and Carston (2002, 2012) tend to downplay the role of conventional lexical meaning (whether unique or multiple) in real life communication. In their view, context and the saliences it involves are crucial in determining sentential meaning and communicated content in general, including the meaning of individual words. As a consequence, polysemy as the property of having multiple, stable, conventional meanings turns out not to be a particularly “deep” notion. The sentence “The memorabilia shop was noisier than the newspaper stand”, meaning that the person looking at the memorabilia shop window was noisier than the owner of the newspaper stand, can be perfectly intelligible in the appropriate context. However, one would hesitate to regard person looking at a memorabilia shop window as one of the senses of ‘memorabilia shop’ (same with ‘newspaper stand’). Yet, according to pragmaticists, the mechanisms that are active in recovering intended meaning in this case are essentially the same that underlie polysemy resolution. An even more radical version of the one representation view (“radical” because of its eliminativist undertones) was held by Fodor (1998), who claimed that “there is no such thing as polysemy”. For example, the mental representation corresponding to the verb ‘keep’ is just the concept keep. Though ‘keep’ may seem a polysemous verb expressing a plurality of senses (retain, control, preserve, etc.), in fact it only has one sense—the relation of keeping—, and the illusion of a plurality of senses stems from the fact that keeping can hold among “quite different sorts of things”.

4. Linguistics

The emergence of modern linguistic theories of word meaning is usually placed at the transition between historical-philological semantics (Section 2.2) and structuralist semantics (de Saussure 1995 [1916]).

4.1 Structuralist Semantics

The innovations introduced by the structuralist view of word meaning are best appreciated by contrasting its basic assumptions with those of historical-philological semantics (Lepschy 1970; Matthews 2001).

  • Anti-psychologism. Structuralist semantics views language as a symbolic system whose properties and internal dynamics can be analyzed without taking into account their implementation in the psychology of language users. Just as the rules of chess can be stated and analyzed without making reference to the mental properties of chess players, so a theory of word meaning can, and should, proceed simply by examining the formal roles played by words within the language.
  • Anti-historicism. Since the main explanandum is the role played by words within structured linguistic systems, the framework privileges the synchronic description of lexical meanings. Diachronic accounts are logically posterior to the analysis of the roles synchronically exemplified by words at different stages of the evolution of a language.
  • Anti-localism. Because the semantic properties of words depend on the relations they entertain with other expressions of the language, word meanings cannot be studied in isolation. This is both an epistemological and a foundational claim, i.e., a claim about how matters related to word meaning should be addressed by a semantic theory, and a claim about the dynamics whereby words acquire the semantic properties they have.

Structuralism gave rise to a variety of descriptive approaches to word meaning. We can group them in three categories (Lipka 1992; Murphy 2003; Geeraerts 2006).

  • Lexical Field Theory. Introduced by Trier (1931), it argues that word meaning should be studied by looking at the relations holding between words in the same lexical field. A lexical field is a set of semantically related words whose meanings are interdependent and which, taken together, define the conceptual structure of a relevant domain of reality. Lexical Field Theory holds that lexical fields are closed sets with no overlapping meanings or semantic gaps. Whenever a word undergoes a change in meaning (e.g., its range of application is extended or contracted), the entire lexical field it belongs to is rearranged (Lehrer 1974).
  • Componential Analysis. Developed in the second half of the 1950s by European and American linguists (e.g., Pattier, Coseriu, Bloomfield, Nida), this framework analyzes word meanings as combinations of minimal semantic components or feature symbols. For example, ‘man’ is analyzed as [+ human], [+ male], [+ mature], ‘woman’ as [+ human], [− male], [+ mature], ‘child’ as [+ human], [+/− male] [− mature]. These formulas, effectively equivalent to formalized dictionary definitions, are called “componential definitions” (Leech 1974).
  • Relational Semantics. Prominent in the work of linguists such as Lyons (1963), this approach parallels Lexical Field Theory in the belief that word meaning is inherently relational, but departs from it in two important respects. First, it posits no direct correspondence between sets of semantically related words and domains of reality, thereby dropping the assumption that the organization of lexical fields reflects the organization of non-linguistic reality. Second, while for the lexical field theorist the meaning relations entertained by words (e.g., synonymy, hyponymy) derive from their meaning, for the relational theorist the semantic relations take priority: word meanings are constituted by the semantic relations words participate in (Evens et al. 1980; Cruse 1986).

4.2 Generativist Semantics

The componential current of structuralism was the first to produce an important innovation in theories of word meaning: Katzian semantics (Katz & Fodor 1963; Katz 1972, 1987). Katzian semantics combined componential analysis with a mentalistic conception of word meaning and developed a method for the description of word meanings within a formal grammar. The mentalistic component of Katzian semantics is twofold. First, word meanings are analyzed as bundles of conceptual features derived from our general categorization abilities. Second, the subject matter of the theory is no longer identified with the “structure of the language” but, following Chomsky (1957, 1965), with speakers’ semantic competence. In Katzian semantics, word meanings are structured entities whose representations are called semantic markers. A semantic marker is a hierarchical tree with labeled nodes whose structure reproduces the structure of the represented meaning. For example, the figure below illustrates the meaning of the verb ‘chase’ (simplified from Katz 1987).

a tree of the form [.((Activity)_{[NP,S]}) [.(Physical) [.(Movement) (Fast) [.((Direction of)_{[NP,VP,S]}) ((Toward Location of) _{[NP,VP,S]}) ] ] ] [.(Purpose) ((Catching) _{[NP,VP,S]}) ] ]

Katz (1987) claimed that this approach was superior in both transparency and expressive power to the representations of word meanings that could be provided via meaning postulates (see Section 3.1). For example, in Katzian semantics the validation of conditionals such as \(\forall x\forall y (\textrm{chase}(x, y) \to \textrm{follow}(x,y))\) could be reduced to a simple operation of inspection: one simply had to check whether the semantic marker of ‘follow’ was a subtree of the semantic marker of ‘chase’. Furthermore, the method incorporated syntagmatic relations in the representation of word meanings (notice the grammatical tags ‘NP’, ‘VP’ and ‘S’ above). Katzian semantics was favorably received by the Generative Semantics movement (Fodor 1977; Newmeyer 1980) and spurred an interest in the formal representation of word meaning that would dominate the linguistic scene for decades. Nonetheless, it was eventually abandoned. First, semantic markers did not account for the truth-conditional contribution of words to sentences (Lewis 1972). Second, properties such as the symmetry and the transitivity of predicates could not be modeled with semantic markers, but could be captured with meaning postulates (e.g.,

\[\forall x\forall y (\textrm{sibling}(x, y) \to \textrm{sibling}(y, x))\] or \[\forall x\forall y\forall z (\textrm{louder}(x, y) \mathbin{\&} \textrm{louder}(y, z) \to \textrm{louder}(x, z));\]

see Dowty 1979). Third, Katz’s arguments for a structured view of word meanings were challenged by proponents of semantic atomism (most notably, Fodor & Lepore 1992).

After Katzian semantics, the theoretical landscape split into two camps: one camp advancing the decompositional agenda championed by Katz; and another camp pursuing the relational approach originated by Lexical Field Theory. Following Geeraerts (2010), we will briefly characterize the following frameworks.

Decompositional Frameworks Relational Frameworks
Natural Semantic Metalanguage Symbolic Networks
Conceptual Semantics Corpus Approaches
Two-Level Semantics  
Generative Lexicon Theory  

4.3 Decompositional Approaches

The basic idea of the Natural Semantic Metalanguage approach (henceforth, NSM; Wierzbicka 1972, 1996; Goddard & Wierzbicka 2002) is that word meanings consist of—and can be represented as—combinations of a small set of elementary conceptual particles, known as semantic primes. Semantic primes are primitive (i.e., not decomposable into further conceptual constituents), innate (i.e., not learned), and universal (i.e., explicitly lexicalized in all natural languages, whether in the form of a word, a morpheme, a phraseme, and so forth). Wierzbicka (1996) proposed a catalogue of about 60 semantic primes that could be used to analyze word meanings within so-called “reductive paraphrases”. For example, the reductive paraphrase of ‘top’ is a part of something; this part is above all the other parts of this something.

NSM has generated applications in comparative linguistics (Peeters 2006), language teaching (Goddard & Wierzbicka 2007), and lexical typology (Goddard 2012). However, the approach has been criticized on various grounds. First, it has been argued that the criteria for the identification of semantic primes are unclear: different proponents of NSM commit to different inventories of semantic primes (Matthewson 2003). Second, reductive paraphrases struggle to account for the fine-grained differences in meaning between semantically neighboring words. For example, the reductive paraphrase provided by Wierzbicka for ‘sad’ (i.e., x feels something; sometimes a person thinks something like this: something bad happened; if i didn’t know that it happened i would say: i don’t want it to happen; i don’t say this now because i know: i can’t do anything; because of this, this person feels something bad; x feels something like this) would seem to apply equally well to ‘unhappy’, ‘distressed’, ‘frustrated’, ‘upset’, and ‘annoyed’ (e.g., Aitchison 2012). Third, some semantic primes appear to fail to meet the universality requirement and are not lexicalized in all known languages (Bohnemeyer 2003; Von Fintel & Matthewson 2008). See Goddard (1998) for some replies and Riemer (2006) for further objections.

For NSM, word meanings can be represented with a metalanguage appealing exclusively to primitive linguistic components. Conceptual Semantics (Jackendoff 1983, 1990, 2002) proposes a more open-ended approach. According to Conceptual Semantics, word meanings are interface representations that connect a specialized body of linguistic knowledge (e.g., morphosyntactic knowledge) and non-linguistic cognition. Word meanings are thus modeled as hybrid representations combining linguistic features (e.g., syntactic tags) and conceptual elements grounded in perceptual and motor knowledge. For example, here is the semantic representation of ‘drink’ according to Jackendoff.

\[\left[ \begin{align*} &\text{drink} \\ &\mathrm{V} \\ &\underline{\phantom{xxxi}}\langle \text{NP}_j \rangle \\ &[_{\text{Event}} \text{CAUSE} ([_{\text{Thing}}\quad]_i, [_{\text{Event}} \text{GO} ([_{\text{Thing}} \text{LIQUID}]_j, \\ &\quad [_{\text{Path}} \text{TO} ([_{\text{Place}} \text{IN} ([_{\text{Thing}} \text{MOUTH OF} ([_{\text{Thing}}\quad]_i)])])])])] \end{align*} \right]\]

Syntactic tags represent the grammatical properties of the word under analysis, while the items in subscript are picked from a pool of perceptually grounded primitives (e.g., event, state, thing, path, place, property, amount) which are assumed to be innate, cross-modal and universal categories of the human mind.

The decompositional machinery of Conceptual Semantics has a number of attractive features. For example, unlike NSM’s reductive paraphrases, its representations account for features such as grammatical class and argument structure, which are likely integral to our understanding of the meaning of words. However, the approach has shortcomings of its own. To begin with, speakers tend to use causative predicates (e.g., ‘drink’) and the paraphrases of their decompositional structure (e.g., “cause a liquid to go into someone or something’s mouth”) in non-interchangeable ways. Assuming, as seems plausible, that this is due to a difference in meaning, decompositional paraphrases have a problem of empirical adequacy (e.g., Wolff 2003). Second, like NSM, Conceptual Semantics has a somewhat unclear policy for the identification of the motor-perceptual primitives that can feed decompositional descriptions (Pulman 2005). Third, the decision to confine the decompositional primitives to the realms of perceptual and motor knowledge generates a problem of descriptive power. For example, ‘jog’ and ‘run’ are not synonymous. However, it is difficult to account for their difference in meaning without taking into account higher-level knowledge about, e.g., the social characteristics of jogging—an activity which typically implies a leisure setting, the intention to contribute to one’s physical wellbeing, and so on. See Taylor (1996) and Deane (1996).

As we have seen, a theory of word meaning has to account for the dynamic interaction between word knowledge and world knowledge. The Two-Level Semantics of Bierwisch (1983a,b) and Lang (Bierwisch & Lang 1989; Lang 1993) is another attempt to provide such a dynamic account. In Two-Level Semantics, word meanings are a product of the interaction between two systems: semantic form (SF) and conceptual structure (CS). SF is a formalized representation of the basic grammatical features of a word. It features information about, e.g., the admissible syntactic distribution of the word, plus a set of open variables and semantic parameters whose value is fixed by CS. CS consists of language-independent systems of knowledge (including general world knowledge) that mediate between language and the world (Lang & Maienborn 2011). For example, for Two-Level Semantics polysemous words encode multiple meanings by virtue of having a stable underspecified SF which can be flexibly manipulated by CS. Take the word ‘university’, which can refer either to an institution (“the university selected John’s application”) or to a physical building (“the university is 15 stories high”). Simplifying a bit, the framework models the selection of these readings as follows.

  1. ‘University’ belongs to the category of words denoting objects primarily characterized by their purpose, so the lexical entry for ‘university’ is of type \(\lambda x [\textrm{purpose} [x w]]\).
  2. Because the primary purpose of universities is to provide advanced education, the SF of ‘university’ is \(\lambda x [\textrm{purpose} [x w] \mathbin{\&} \textit{advanced study and teaching} [w]]\).
  3. The alternative readings of ‘university’ are functions of the two ways CS can set the value of the variable x in its SF, such ways being \(\lambda x [\textrm{institution} [x] \mathbin{\&} \textrm{purpose} [x w]]\) and \(\lambda x [\textrm{building} [x] \mathbin{\&} \textrm{purpose} [x w]]\).

Like NSM and Conceptual Semantics, Two-Level Semantics associates word meanings with stable decompositional templates. At the same time, by allowing SFs to interface with world knowledge, it avoids the immediate hindrances of a restrictive account of the factors that can modulate the decompositional templates in contexts. Some issues, however, persist. A first problem is, again, definitional accuracy for semantically close terms: the SF \(\lambda x [\textrm{purpose} [x w] \mathbin{\&} \textit{advanced study and teaching} [w]]\) assigned to ‘university’ would work equally well as the SF of non-synonymous terms designating institutions for higher education, such as ‘college’ or ‘academy’. Furthermore, Two-Level Semantics relies heavily on lambda expressions, and some (e.g., Taylor 1994, 1995) have argued that lambda abstraction is ill-suited for modeling the interaction between word knowledge and world knowledge. See also Wunderlich (1991, 1993).

The Generative Lexicon Theory (GLT; Pustejovsky 1995) takes a different approach. Instead of accounting for the contextual flexibility of words by appealing to rich conceptual operations applied to thin lexical entries, GLT posits rich lexical entries that directly incorporate higher-level conceptual information and world knowledge. According to classical GLT, the resources encoded in the lexical entry for a word w encompass the following four levels.

  • A lexical typing structure, specifying the semantic type of w within the type system of the language;
  • An argument structure, specifying the number and nature of the arguments supported by w;
  • An event structure, specifying the event type denoted by w (e.g., state, process, transition);
  • A qualia structure, specifying the “predicative force” of w.

In particular, the qualia structure of a word w encodes all information about the real-world referent(s) of w that determines how w is used in the language (Pustejovsky 1998). For example, ordinary speakers know that bread is brought about through baking, and this determines how the word ‘bread’ is used in English. For example, knowledge that bread is baked is responsible for our understanding that “fresh bread” means bread which has been baked recently (contrary to, say, “fresh air”). GLT distinguishes four types of qualia:

  • constitutive: the relation between the referent of the word and its parts;
  • formal: the basic ontological category of the referent;
  • telic: the purpose and the function of the referent;
  • agentive: the origin of the referent.

Taken together, these qualia form the “qualia structure” of a word. For example, the qualia structure of the noun ‘sandwich’ will feature information about the composition of sandwiches (constitutive quale), about their nature of physical artifacts (formal quale), about their being intended for eating (telic quale), and about the operations typically involved in the preparation of sandwiches (agentive quale). The notation is as follows.

const = {bread, …}
form = physobj(x)
tel = eat(P, g, x)
agent = artifact(x)

Qualia structure is the primary explanatory device through which GLT accounts for polysemy. The sentence “Mary finished the sandwich” receives the default interpretation “Mary finished eating the sandwich” (instead of “Mary finished making the sandwich”) because the argument structure of ‘finish’ requires an action as a direct object, and the qualia structure of ‘sandwich’ selects the appropriate sense for the verb via type coercion (Pustejovsky 2006). GLT is an ongoing research program (Pustejovsky et al. 2012) that has led to multiple applications in computational linguistics (e.g., Pustejovsky & Jezek 2008; Pustejovsky & Rumshisky 2008). But like the theories mentioned so far, it has been subject to criticisms. A first line of criticism comes from the general arguments against decompositional treatments advanced by proponents of semantic atomism (Fodor & Lepore 1998; see Pustejovsky 1998 for a reply). A second criticism is that GLT’s focus is too narrow. Even assuming that qualia structure successfully accounts for many cases of polysemy resolution, meaning assignments are often performed in context on the basis of more complex reasoning abilities, such as the ability to keep track of the QUD (question under discussion) and maintain discourse coherence. However, it is unclear how these abilities may be accounted for within GLT-style lexical entries (e.g., Asher & Lascarides 1995; Lascarides & Copestake 1998; Kehler 2002; Asher 2011). Finally, the cognitive adequacy of the framework has been called into question. It has been argued that qualia structure sometimes overgenerates or undergenerates admissible interpretations, and that the dense lexical entries of GLT are psychologically implausible (e.g., Jayez 2001; Blutner 2002).

4.4 Relational Approaches

To conclude this section, we briefly mention some contemporary approaches to word meaning that, in different ways, pursue the agenda of the relational current of the structuralist paradigm. For simplicity, we can group them into two categories: network approaches, corpus approaches, and LLM-based approaches.

Network approaches formalize word knowledge by modeling the lexicon as a structured system of entries interconnected by sense relations such as synonymy, antonymy, and meronymy. A classical example is Collins and Quillian’s (1969) hierarchical network model, in which words are represented as entries in a symbolic network of nodes, each comprising a set of conceptual features defining the conventional meaning of the word in question, and connected to other nodes in the network through semantic relations (Lehman 1992). Subsequent developments of the hierarchical network model include the Semantic Feature Model (Smith, Shoben & Rips 1974), the Spreading Activation Model (Collins & Loftus 1975; Bock & Levelt 1994), the WordNet database (Fellbaum 1998), as well as the connectionist models of Seidenberg & McClelland (1989), Hinton & Shallice (1991), and Plaut & Shallice (1993).

As for corpus approaches, their primary aim is to investigate the patterns of co-occurrence among words in linguistic corpora. The idea is to use quantitative data about the frequency of co-occurrence of sets of lexical items to identify their semantic properties and differentiate their senses (for overviews, see Atkins & Zampolli 1994; Manning & Schütze 1999; Stubbs 2002; Sinclair 2004). Note that while symbolic networks are models of the lexicon that aspire to psychological adequacy, and therefore to track how word knowledge is stored and organized in the mind/brain of speakers, corpus approaches to word meaning are not necessarily interested in psychological adequacy, and may have different descriptive and predictive goals.

Until relatively recently, there was a consensus that classical statistical methods were a non-starter when it came to capturing human lexical competence. Statistical approaches, the argument was, process words linearly, so they are bound to miss out on the hierarchical components of speakers’ representations of words and sentences (e.g., Everaert et al. 2015). The situation has changed with developments in deep learning and the emergence of large language models (LLMs), such as OpenAI’s GPT models and Meta AI’s LLaMA models. Current LLMs can produce text of comparable quality to human-written texts, and demonstrate superhuman performance in next-word prediction tasks as well as in some comprehension tasks. While LLMs were not developed as models of human semantic knowledge, they now raise significant questions regarding word meaning and lexical competence. Examples include whether the representations LLMs derive for words are similar to those acquired by humans through language learning (Lake & Murphy 2023), whether LLMs can be said to understand the meaning of words (Mitchell & Krakauer 2023), whether the words generated by LLMs refer (Piantadosi & Hill 2022; Mandelkern & Linzen 2023), and whether (or how) LLMs may achieve human-level proficiency in both formal and functional lexical competence (Mahowald et al. 2024).

See also entries on connectionism, computational linguistics and artificial intelligence.

5. Cognitive Science

Most theories of word meaning in linguistics face the challenge of drawing a plausible line of demarcation between word knowledge and world knowledge, and try to meet this challenge from within the confines of the assumption that the lexicon—however richly interfaced with general intelligence—is a self-standing system encoding a specialized body of linguistic knowledge. Work in cognitive science tends to adopt a different stance. The focus is psychological, which means that the goal is to reveal the representational repertoire underlying word knowledge in the mind/brain of real-world speakers. Unlike the approaches surveyed in Section 4, however, these frameworks tend to encourage a view on which the distinction between the semantic and pragmatic aspects of word meaning is highly unstable (or even impossible to draw) and where word knowledge, conceptual knowledge, and knowledge of worldly facts are aspects of a continuum (Evans 2010).

5.1 Cognitive Linguistics

At the beginning of the 1970s, Eleanor Rosch put forth a new theory of the mental representation of categories. Concepts such as furniture or bird, she claimed, are not represented just as sets of criterial features with clear-cut boundaries, so that an item can be conceived as falling or not falling under the concept based on whether or not it meets the relevant criteria. Rather, items within categories can be considered more or less representative of the category itself (Rosch 1975; Rosch & Mervis 1975; Mervis & Rosch 1981). Several experiments seemed to show that concept application is no simple yes-or-no business: some items (the “good examples”) are more easily identified as falling under a concept than others (the “poor examples”). An automobile is perceived as a better example of vehicle than a rowboat, and much better than an elevator; a carrot is more readily identified as an example of the concept vegetable than a pumpkin. If the concepts speakers associate with category words (such as ‘vehicle’ and ‘vegetable’) were mere bundles of criterial features, these preferences would be inexplicable. It is thus plausible to assume that the concepts associated with category words have a center-periphery architecture centered on the most representative examples of the category: a robin is perceived as a more “birdish” bird than an ostrich or, as people would say, closer to the prototype of a bird or to the prototypical bird (see the entry on concepts).

Although nothing in Rosch’s experiments licensed the conclusion that prototypical rankings should be reified and treated as the content of concepts (what her experiments did suggest was that a theory of the mental representation of categories should be consistent with the existence of prototype effects), the study of prototypes revolutionized existing approaches to category concepts (Murphy 2002) and was a leading force behind the birth of cognitive linguistics. Prototypes were central to the development of the Radial Network Theory of Brugman (1988 [1981]) and Lakoff (Brugman & Lakoff 1988), which introduced in the architecture of word meanings the center-periphery relation at the heart of Rosch’s work. Brugman modeled word meanings as radial complexes where a dominant sense is related to the less typical ones by means of semantic relations such as metaphor and metonymy. For example, the sense network of ‘fruit’ features product of plant growth at its center and a more abstract outcome at its periphery, and the two are connected by a metaphorical relation. Similarly, the Conceptual Metaphor Theory of Lakoff & Johnson (1980; Lakoff 1987) and the Mental Spaces Approach of Fauconnier (1994; Fauconnier & Turner 1998) combined the view that word meanings have an internal structure arranging in a prototypical fashion multiple related senses, with the appeal to hard-wired mapping mechanisms that selectively favor the integration of some word meanings across conceptual domains. For example, it is in virtue of these mechanisms that the metaphors “love is war” and “life is a journey” are so widespread across cultures and sound so natural to our ears. These associations are creative, spontaneous, perceptually grounded, and motivated by pre-linguistic patterns of conceptual activity which correlate with cross-culturally available features of embodied experience. For more on this, see Gibbs (2008), Dancygier & Sweetser (2014), and the entries on metaphor and embodied cognition.

Prototypes were consistently and influentially criticized by Jerry Fodor as being unsuitable as explicata of concepts. Initially, he claimed that concepts cannot be prototypes because semantic properties are inherited “from lexical concepts to phrasal concepts”; but “in infinitely many cases” complex expressions do not have prototypes. There may be prototypical cities, and even prototypical American cities, but surely there are no “prototypical American cities situated on the East Coast just a little south of Tennessee” (Fodor 1981: 296). Later, Fodor made a different though related point: if concepts are prototypes, then phrasal concepts are not determined by their ingredient concepts, i.e. by the concepts expressed by their lexical constituents; but then, semantic compositionality is lost (Fodor 1996). Suppose that a cat is a prototypical pet, while a trout is a prototypical fish. Can you infer from such information that a goldfish is a prototypical pet fish, as it intuitively is? Apparently not. Could you reach that conclusion by choosing other, no less plausible prototypes of pet or fish? Again, it seems not. Thus, assuming compositionality, concepts cannot be prototypes. According to Gleitman, Connolly and Armstrong (2012), this should not surprise us, as “we typically use adjectival modifiers [such as ‘pet’ in ‘pet fish’] in noun phrases when we are talking about something other than typical instances of the head noun”. Hence, we should not expect the concept expressed by ‘pet fish’ to functionally depend on the prototype associated with ‘fish’.

A trademark of cognitive linguistics is the development of a resolutely “encyclopedic” approach to word meaning, best exemplified by Frame Semantics (Fillmore 1975, 1982) and by the Theory of Domains (Langacker 1987). With some approximation, an approach to word meaning can be regarded as “encyclopedic” insofar as it characterizes knowledge of worldly facts as constitutive of word knowledge (rather than, say, as an extra-linguistic resource accessed to settle the competition between the alternative senses of a word). Our ability to use and interpret the verb ‘buy’, for example, is closely intertwined with our background knowledge of the social nature of commercial transfer, which involves a seller, a buyer, goods, money, the relation between the money and the goods, and so forth. However, knowledge structures of this kind cannot be modeled as concept-like representations. According to Frame Semantics, encyclopedic knowledge is instead represented in long-term memory in the form of frames. Frames are schematic conceptual scenarios that specify the typical features and functions of a denotatum, along with the objects and the events that are likely to accompany it. Words are interpreted by accessing the information contained in frames. For example, according to Fillmore & Atkins (1992), the verb ‘bet’ is governed by the risk frame, which is as follows:

Protagonist: The central agent in the frame.
Bad: The possible bad outcome.
Decision: The decision that could trigger the bad outcome.
Goal: The desired outcome.
Setting: The situation within which the risk exists.
Possession: Something valued by the protagonist and endangered in the situation.
Source: Something or someone which could cause the harm.

In the same vein as Frame Semantics (more on the parallels in Clausner & Croft 1999), on Langacker’s Theory of Domains lexical competence rests on the access to knowledge structures called domains. To exemplify the notion of a domain, take the word ‘diameter’. It is impossible to understand what a diameter is without also understanding what a circle is. According to Langacker, word meaning is a matter of “profile-domain” organization. The profile corresponds to a substructural element designated within a relevant macrostructure, whereas the domain corresponds to the macrostructure providing the background information against which the profile can be interpreted (Taylor 2002). In the diameter/circle example, ‘diameter’ designates a profile in the circle domain. Similarly, expressions like ‘hot’, ‘cold’, and ‘warm’ designate profiles in the temperature domain. Langacker argues that domains are typically structured into hierarchies that reflect meronymic relations and provide a basic conceptual ontology for language use. For example, the meaning of ‘elbow’ is understood with respect to the arm domain, while the meaning of ‘arm’ is situated within the body domain.

Developments of the cognitive-linguistic approach to word meaning include Construction Grammar (Goldberg 1995), Embodied Construction Grammar (Bergen & Chang 2005), Invited Inferencing Theory (Traugott & Dasher 2001), and LCCM Theory (Evans 2009). The notion of a frame has been used in cognitive psychology to model ad hoc categorization (e.g., Barsalou 1983, 1992, 1999; more in Section 5.2 ). Non-neutral overviews can be found in Talmy (2000a,b), Croft & Cruse (2004), and Evans & Green (2006).

5.2 Psycholinguistics

In psycholinguistics, the study of word meaning is the study of the mental lexicon, the long-term representational inventory that underlies the capacity for conscious and unconscious lexical activity (Jarema & Libben 2007). Psycholinguistic work on the mental lexicon is concerned with a variety of problems (for surveys, see Traxler & Gernsbacher 2006, Spivey, McRae & Joanisse 2012, Harley 2014). The main tasks are:

  • Defining the overall organization of the mental lexicon, its components and the role they play in online lexical production and comprehension;
  • Determining the internal makeup of the components of the system;
  • Describing the interface mechanisms connecting the mental lexicon to perception and cognition (e.g., declarative memory);
  • Reconstructing the learning processes responsible for the acquisition and the development of lexical abilities.

From a functional point of view, the mental lexicon is a system of lexical entries, one for each word mastered by the speaker. Though accounts of the internal architecture of lexical entries vary, the standard model of the entry for a word w features the following components (Levelt 1989, 2001; Rapp 2001).

  • A semantic form, determining the semantic contribution made by w to the meaning of sentences containing w;
  • A grammatical form, assigning w to a grammatical category (noun, verb, adjective) and regulating the behavior of w in syntactic environments;
  • A morphological form, representing the morphemic substructure of w and the morphological operations that can be performed on w;
  • A phonological form, specifying the phonological properties of w;
  • An orthographic form, specifying the written shape of w.

In this environment, a theory of word meaning translates into an account of the information stored in the semantic form of lexical entries. A crucial task consists in determining exactly what kind of information is stored in semantic forms as opposed to, e.g., episodic memory or world knowledge. Unsurprisingly, even in psycholinguistics tracing a clear line of demarcation between word processing and general-purpose cognition has proven challenging. The general consensus seems to be that lexical representations and conceptual representations are richly interfaced, but remain functionally distinct (e.g., Gleitman & Papafragou 2013). For example, clinical research distinguishes between amodal deficits, involving an inability to process information at both the conceptual and the lexical level, and modal deficits, specifically restricted to one of the two spheres (Saffran & Schwartz 1994; Rapp & Goldrick 2006; Jefferies & Lambon Ralph 2006; more in Section 5.3). So the general consensus seems to be that lexical activity is the output of the interaction between two functionally neighboring systems: the mental lexicon and a system in charge of the storage and processing of conceptual-encyclopedic knowledge. These two systems communicate with one another through semantic forms (Denes 2009). Note that contrary to the folk, dictionary-like picture of a mental lexicon where words are associated with fully specified meanings or senses, in these models semantic forms are thin representations whose function is to regulate the recruitment of the extra-linguistic information required to interpret words. Some “ultra-thin” models have explicit eliminativist commitments: they suggest that psycholinguistics should dispose of the largely metaphorical notion of an “internal word store”, and that there is no such thing as a “mental lexicon” in the human mind (e.g., Elman 2004, 2009; Dilkina, McClelland & Plaut 2010).

Other approaches reduce word knowledge to a chapter of conceptual knowledge (see the entry on concepts). Lexical symbols are seen either as parts of conceptual networks or as perceptual points of access to conceptual networks. A flow of neuroscientific results has shown that exposure to (certain categories of) words triggers neural activations corresponding to the semantic content of the processed words. For example, listening to sentences that describe actions performed with the mouth, hand, or leg activates the visuomotor circuits which subserve execution and observation of such actions (Tettamanti et al. 2005); reading words denoting actions of the tongue (‘lick’), fingers (‘pick’), and legs (‘kick’) differentially activate areas of the premotor cortex that are active when the corresponding movements are actually performed (Hauk et al. 2004); reading odor-related words (‘jasmine’, ‘garlic’, ‘cinnamon’) differentially activates the primary olfactory cortex (Gonzales et al. 2006); and color words (such as ‘red’) activate areas in the fusiform gyrus that have been associated with color perception (Chao et al. 1999, Simmons et al. 2007; for a survey of results on visual activations in language processing, see Martin 2007).

This body of research originated so-called simulationist (or enactivist) accounts of conceptual competence, on which “understanding is imagination” and “imagining is a form of simulation” (Gallese & Lakoff 2005). In these accounts, conceptual (often called “semantic”) competence is seen as the ability to simulate or re-enact perceptual (including proprioceptive and introspective) experiences of states of affairs, by manipulating memory traces of such experiences or fragments of them. In Barsalou’s theory of perceptual symbol systems (1999), language understanding is based on perceptual experience and its traces in memory. Perception generates mostly unconscious “neural representations in sensory-motor areas of the brain” which represent schematic components of perceptual experience. Such perceptual symbols are not holistic copies of experiences but selective representations filtered by attention. Related perceptual symbols are integrated into a simulator that produces limitless simulations of a perceptual component, such as red or lift. Simulators are located in long-term memory and play the roles traditionally attributed to concepts. A concept is not “a static amodal structure” as in traditional, computationally-oriented cognitive science, but “the ability to simulate a kind of thing perceptually”. Linguistic symbols (i.e., the auditory or visual memories of words) are associated with simulators; perceptual recognition of a word activates the relevant simulator, which simulates a referent for the word; syntax provides instructions for building integrated perceptual simulations, which “constitute semantic interpretations”.

The simulationist paradigm faces three main challenges. First, simulations do not always fit the intuitive truth conditions of sentences: listeners may enact the same simulation upon exposure to sentences that have different truth conditions (e.g., “The man stood on the corner” vs. “The man waited on the corner”; see Weiskopf 2010). Moreover, simulations may overconstrain truth conditions. For example, even though in the simulations most would associate with the sentence “There are three pencils in Anna’s mug” the pencils in question would be in vertical position, the sentence would be true even if they were lying horizontally in the mug. Second, the framework does not sit well with clinical data: e.g., no general impairment with auditory-related words is reported in patients with lesions in the auditory association cortex, nor do patients with damage to the motor cortex seem to have difficulties in linguistic performance, and specifically in inferential processing with motor-related words (for a survey, see Calzavarini 2019). Finally, the theory has difficulties accounting for abstract words (e.g., ‘beauty’, ‘pride’, ‘kindness’), whose meaning does not appear to hinge on sensory-motor simulations (see Dove 2016 for discussion).

5.3 Neurolinguistics

Beginning in the mid-1970s, neuropsychological research on cognitive deficits due to brain lesions has produced a considerable amount of findings related to the neural correlates of lexical competence. More recently, the development of neuroimaging techniques such as PET, fMRI and ERP has provided further means to adjudicate hypotheses about lexical-semantic processes in the brain (Vigneau et al. 2006). Here we do not intend to provide a complete overview of such results (for surveys, see Faust 2012 and Kemmerer 2022). We shall focus on three topics of neurolinguistic research that bear on the philosophical study of word meaning: the partition of the lexicon into categories, the representation of common nouns vs. proper names, and the distinction between the inferential and the referential aspects of lexical competence. In addition, we shall briefly draw attention to the possible emergence of a “paradigm shift” in the conception of word semantic processing in the brain.

Two preliminary considerations. First, a distinction must be drawn between the neural realization of word forms, i.e., traces of acoustic, articulatory, graphic, and motor configurations (‘peripheral lexicons’), and the neural correlates of lexical meanings (‘concepts’). A patient can understand what is the object represented by a picture shown to her (and give evidence of her understanding, e.g., by miming the object’s function) while being unable to retrieve the relevant phonological form from her output lexicon (Warrington 1985; Shallice 1988). Second, there appears to be wide consensus about the irrelevance to brain processing of any distinction between strictly semantic and factual or encyclopedic information (e.g., Tulving 1972; Sartori et al. 1994). Whatever information is relevant to such processes as object recognition or confrontation naming is standardly characterized as “semantic”. This may be taken as a stipulation—it is just how neuroscientists use the word ‘semantic’—or as deriving from lack of evidence for any segregation between the domains of semantic and encyclopedic information (see Binder et al. 2009). Be that as it may, in present-day neuroscience there seems to be no room for a correlate of the analytic/synthetic distinction. Moreover, in the literature ‘semantic’ and ‘conceptual’ are often used synonymously; hence, no distinction is drawn between lexical-semantic and conceptual knowledge. Finally, the focus of neuroscientific research on “semantics” is on information structures roughly corresponding to word-level meanings, not to sentence-level meanings. Hence, so far neuroscientific research has had little to say about the compositional mechanisms that have been the focus—and, often, the entire content—of theories of meaning as pursued within formal semantics and philosophy of language.

Let us start with the partition of the semantic lexicon into categories. Neuropsychological research indicates that the ability to name objects or to answer simple questions involving such nouns can be selectively lost or preserved: subjects can perform much better in naming living entities than in naming artifacts, or in naming animate entities than in naming fruits and vegetables (Shallice 1988; Capitani et al. 2003). Different patterns of brain activation may correspond to such dissociations between performances. E.g., Damasio et al. (1996) found that retrieval of names of animals and of tools activate different regions in the left temporal lobe. However, the details of this partition have been interpreted in different ways. Warrington & McCarthy (1983) and Warrington & Shallice (1984) explained the living vs. artifactual dissociation by taking the category distinction to be an effect of the difference among features that are crucial in the identification of living entities and artifacts: while living entities are identified mainly on the basis of perceptual features, artifacts are identified by their function. A later theory (Caramazza & Shelton 1998) claimed that animate and inanimate objects are treated by different knowledge systems separated by evolutionary pressure: domains of features pertaining to the recognition of living things, human faces, and perhaps tools may have been singled out as recognition of such entities had survival value for humans. Finally, Devlin et al. (1998) suggested to view the partition as the consequence of a difference in how recognition-relevant features are connected with one another: in the case of artifactual kinds, an object is recognized thanks to a characteristic coupling of form and function, whereas no such coupling individuates kinds of living things (e.g., eyes go with seeing in many different animal species). For non-neutral surveys, see Caramazza & Mahon (2006) and Shallice & Cooper (2011).

On the other hand, it is also known that “semantic” (i.e., conceptual) competence may be lost in its entirety (though often gradually). This is what typically happens in semantic dementia. Empirical evidence has motivated theories of the neural realization of conceptual competence that are meant to account for both modality-specific deficits and pathologies that involve impairment across all modalities. The former may involve a difficulty or impossibility to categorize a visually exhibited object which, however, can be correctly categorized in other modalities (e.g., if the object is touched) or verbally described on the basis of the object’s name (i.e., on the basis of the lexical item supposedly associated with the category). The original “hub and spokes” model of the brain representation of concepts (Rogers et al. 2004, Patterson et al. 2007) accounted for both sets of findings by postulating that the semantic network is composed of a series of “spokes”, i.e., cortical areas distributed across the brain processing modality-specific (visual, auditory, motor, as well as verbal) sources of information, and that the spokes are two-ways connected to a transmodal “hub”. While damage to the spokes accounts for modality-specific deficits, damage to the hub and its connections explains the overall impairment of semantic competence. On this model, the hub is supposed to be located in the anterior temporal lobe (ATL), since semantic dementia had been found to be associated with degeneration of the anterior ventral and polar regions of both temporal poles (Guo et al. 2013). According to more recent, “graded” versions of the model (Lambon Ralph et al. 2017), the contribution of the hub units may vary depending on different patterns of connectivity to the spokes, to account for evidence of graded variation of function across subregions of ATL. It should be noted that while many researchers converge on a distributed view of semantic representation and on the role of domain-specific parts of the neural network (depending on differential patterns of functional connectivity), not everybody agrees on the need to postulate a transmodal hub (e.g., Mahon & Caramazza 2011).

Let us now turn to common nouns and proper names. As we saw in Section 3, in the philosophy of language of the last decades, proper names (of people, landmarks, countries, etc.) have been widely regarded as semantically different from common nouns. Neuroscientific work on the processing of proper names and common nouns concurs, to some extent. To begin with, the retrieval of proper names is doubly dissociated from the retrieval of common nouns. Some patients proved competent with common nouns but unable to associate names to pictures of famous people, or buildings, or brands (Ellis, Young & Critchley 1989; many more cases have been reported); in some cases, names of people were specifically affected (McKenna & Warrington 1978). Other patients had the complementary deficit. The patient described in Semenza & Sgaramella (1993) could name no objects at all (with or without phonemic cues) but was able to name 10 out of 10 familiar people, and 18 out of 22 famous people with a phonemic cue. Though this side of the dissociation appears to be less frequent, other cases have been reported by Lyons et al. (2002)—limited to the preservation of geographical names—and Martins & Farrayota (2007). These findings suggest distinct neural pathways for the retrieval of proper names and common nouns (Semenza 2006, 2009). The study of lesions and neuroimaging research initially converged in identifying the left temporal pole as playing a crucial role in the retrieval of proper names, from both visual stimuli (Damasio et al. 1996) and the presentation of speaker voices (Waldron et al. 2014) (though in at least one case damage to the left temporal pole was associated with selective sparing of proper names; see Martins & Farrajota 2007). In addition, recent research has found a role for the uncinate fasciculus (UF). In patients undergoing surgical removal of UF, retrieval of common nouns was recovered while retrieval of proper names remained impaired (Papagno et al. 2016). The present consensus appears to be that “the production of proper names recruits a network that involves at least the left anterior temporal lobe and the left orbitofrontal cortex connected together by the UF” (Brédart 2017). Issues of localization aside, it was generally accepted that proper name processing is neurally distinct from common noun processing. However, even this has been challenged (Desai et al. 2023).

As we have seen in Section 3.2, Marconi (1997) suggested that processing of lexical meaning might be distributed between two subsystems, an inferential and a referential one. Beginning with Warrington (1975), many patients had been described that were more or less severely impaired in referential tasks such as naming from vision (and other perceptual modalities as well), while their inferential competence was more or less intact. The complementary pattern (i.e., the preservation of referential abilities with loss of inferential competence) is less common. Still, a number of cases have been reported, beginning with a stroke patient of Heilman et al. (1976), who, while unable to perform any task requiring inferential processing, performed well in referential naming tasks with visually presented objects (he could name 23 of 25 common objects). In subsequent years, further cases were described. For example, in a study of 61 patients with lesions affecting linguistic abilities, Kemmerer et al. (2012) found 14 cases in which referential abilities were better preserved than inferential abilities. Pandey & Heilman (2014), in describing one more case of preserved (referential) naming from vision with severely impaired (inferential) naming from definition, hypothesized that “these two naming tasks may, at least in part, be mediated by two independent neuronal networks”. Thus, while double dissociation between inferential processes and naming from vision is well attested, it is not equally clear that it involves referential processes in general. On the other hand, evidence from neuroimaging is, so far, limited and overall inconclusive. Some neuroimaging studies (e.g., Tomaszewski-Farias et al. 2005, Marconi et al. 2013), as well as TMS mapping experiments (Hamberger et al. 2001, Hamberger & Seidel 2009) did find different patterns of activation for inferential vs. referential performances. However, the results are not entirely consistent and are liable to different interpretations.

Much research on the brain’s processing of words has been carried out within the Grounded (or Embodied) Cognition paradigm, according to which “concepts are anchored in modality-specific systems for perception and action” and “understanding word meanings involves activating high-level sensory and motor representations in a lexically-driven fashion” (Kemmerer 2022). Thus, semantic processors in the brain are specialized for modality-specific properties such as visual shape, color, sound, etc. For instance, “the meaning of a noun like banana does not reside in any single place in the brain; instead, different fragments of this complex concept are scattered across different cortical regions according to the sensory or motor content of the type of information that is represented” (Kemmerer 2022). In this paradigm, “the first and perhaps critical components of the semantic system are modality specific [visual, motor, etc.]”, while “the multimodal [...] and amodal components of the semantic brain are located outside the perceptual and motor cortices” (Calzavarini 2023). However, many findings appear to contradict this view. For instance, the posterior fusiform gyrus (pFG), supposedly in charge of visual semantic knowledge, also responds to shape information in tactile recognition tasks (Amedi et al. 2002, Hernandez-Pérez et al. 2017); pFG “is shape responsive in both sighted and congenitally blind subjects” (Pietrini et al. 2004). Indeed, practically all the feature-specific regions of the high-level “visual” cortex that have been associated with visual semantic knowledge by advocates of the Grounded Cognition Model show multisensory or supramodal responses (reviews in Ricciardi et al. 2014, Heimler & Amedi 2020). Based on such evidence, some researchers have been led to “doubt the very existence of unimodal structures in the human brain”, and to hypothesize that the traditional model of the perceptual brain, with its partition into modality-specific areas, should be replaced by a view “according to which ‘task-’, ‘feature-’ or ‘computation-specificity’ is the fundamental organization principle” (Calzavarini 2023).


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