Civil Rights

First published Mon Feb 3, 2003; substantive revision Mon Jan 17, 2022

In contemporary legal and political thought, the term ‘civil rights’ is indissolubly linked to the organized, mass liberation struggle of American blacks during the mid-20th century. The Civil Rights Movement sought the abolition of the Jim Crow system of racial oppression and exploitation and aimed to make free and equal citizenship a reality for blacks. The idea of civil rights central to the movement referred to the rights belonging, as a matter of justice, to free and equal citizens. It was an idea that had found expression in those amendments to the U.S. Constitution adopted in the era of Reconstruction that followed the defeat of the Confederacy in the Civil War.

The Civil Rights Movement sought to redeem the broken promise of free and equal citizenship embodied in the Reconstruction amendments. Significant steps had been taken toward fulfilling that promise during the decade that followed the end of the war. However, violent white resistance across the former Confederacy and a fading commitment to the promise among Northern whites led to the demise of Reconstruction and the rapid consolidation of a new form of racial subjugation. As W.E.B. Du Bois poetically put the matter: “The slave went free; stood a brief moment in the sun; then moved back again toward slavery” (1935/1992: 30).

During the course of the Civil Rights Movement, a relatively narrow idea of civil rights began to dominate public discourse and became the standard idea of what such rights encompassed. The term ’civil rights’ came to refer, not to the full set of claims constitutive of free and equal citizenship, but to rights against discrimination, initially denoting discrimination based on race and ethnicity but soon expanding to include sex, disability, sexual preference and other salient categories of social and personal identity. The older and broader idea of civil rights as the full set of claims belonging to free and equal citizens was eclipsed, as the kinds of issues commonly characterized as involving civil rights became exclusively concerned with matters of discrimination.

Nonetheless, despite the differences in linguistic usage to which the two ideas of civil rights give rise, there is no substantive incompatibility between them. In fact, the older idea subsumes the more recent, on any morally plausible view: it cannot be reasonably denied that the rights constitutive of free and equal citizenship encompass, and go beyond, rights against discrimination. But because discrimination remains a persistent and widely-discussed source of systemic injustice, the standard idea identifying civil rights with rights against discrimination is unlikely to fade in the foreseeable future. Yet, the older idea of civil rights is by no means superannuated: it remains indispensable to legal and political discourse, functioning often as part of the implicit normative background and sometimes as an explicitly articulated subject of the discourse. This entry will follow the older idea, treating all of the rights of free and equal citizens as civil rights; at the same time, the entry gives special attention to current controversies in which rights against discrimination are at issue.

1. Free and Equal Citizenship

Free and equal citizens in a modern society enjoy rights to both public and private autonomy. Each citizen must have rights securing their freedom to participate in the formation of public opinion and in society’s collective decisions (public autonomy), as well as rights guaranteeing their freedom to decide what way of individual life to pursue (private autonomy) (Habermas 1996). The importance of these two dimensions of modern citizenship derives from what Rawls calls “the two moral powers” of personhood: the capacity to have and act from a sense of justice and the capacity to hold, revise, and act from a conception of the good (1995: 164; 2001: 18). Persons stand as free and equal citizens when their society and its political system accord equal and due weight to the interest each one has in the development and exercise of their own moral powers.

The idea of free and equal citizenship emerged over the course of several centuries in Western societies that would become modern representative democracies. The idea can be traced back to 17th century English egalitarians and liberals, such as Lilburne (1649) and Locke (1690/1952), and it received dramatic expression during the French Revolution with its “Declaration of the Rights of Man and of the Citizen” (1789) and the overthrow of the entrenched hierarchies and absolutist rule of the ancien régime. But until well into the 20th century, racist and sexist assumptions about which human beings had the capacity to be fully contributing members of society led to an unduly constricted view of who could legitimately claim the rights of a free and equal citizen. Those assumptions have been largely eliminated from philosophical discourse, although they persist in some segments of society.

2. The Standard Idea

In contemporary public discourse, the term ’civil rights’ is typically used to refer to a range of rights narrower than the full set of claims belonging to free and equal citizens. This usage reflects the now standard idea of civil rights as the rights that members of society have against discrimination on the basis of race, sex, ethnicity, disability, sexual preference, and other characteristics regarded as morally objectionable reasons for the distribution of major social benefits and burdens. Discrimination, in turn, is understood as encompassing those actions, policies and practices that (wrongfully) disadvantage the members of certain socially salient groups, on account of their group identity, relative to other members of society (cf. Lippert- Rasmussen 2014).

Christopher Schmidt argues that the standard idea is a 20th century development, deviating from the concept of civil rights that prevailed in the decades following the Civil War. He notes that the earlier concept referred to “the right to contract, own property, sue, testify in court, and the right to physical security,” all of which were regarded as “fundamental to citizenship” (2021: 30 and 52). But “[w]hen civil rights was [sic] reborn in the middle decades of the twentieth century,” a “novel” concept emerged that “centered on a sweeping nondiscrimination principle rather than on a bounded collection of fundamental rights” (135).

Robin West paints a similar historical picture, though her focus is on legal doctrine rather than on the general public understanding. She writes, “We don’t have a civil right to much of anything, beyond the right to nondiscrimination … under our contemporary conception of civil rights” (2019: 74). West explains how the U.S. Supreme Court has been instrumental in the current dominance of this idea of civil rights, but she also points to the role that mainstream legal scholarship has played. By contrast with this current idea, according to the “classical understanding” (29) held by 19th century jurists, civil rights “were not simply rights ’not to be discriminated against’ on the basis of impermissible characteristics,” but also included “unambiguously rights to something: . . . to protection and security, to enter and enforce contracts, to own buy or sell property” and other categorical claims essential to “membership in society” (149–50 and 157, emphasis in original). As a progressive liberal who seeks to have legal doctrine recognize substantive economic claims as rights of citizenship, West aims to transcend the standard idea by subordinating it to an updated version of the classical understanding.

Perhaps surprisingly, many radical activists calling for revolutionary change have ignored any idea of civil rights broader than the standard one. Accordingly, Angela Davis, who is among the most prominent of those activists, explains that “the frame of civil rights” is too small to understand the nature of the black freedom struggle in America and beyond. The struggle “was not only a question of acquiring the formal rights to fully participate in society, but rather it was also about substantive rights – it was about jobs, free education, free health care, affordable housing, and also about ending the racist police occupation of Black communities” (2016: 72). So Davis follows the legal mainstream in declining to describe as “civil rights” categorical claims to such goods as jobs, housing, health care and trustworthy policing.

West argues that the standard idea is inextricably connected to a conceptual error. Consider the right to protection from private violence, which West characterizes as “the irreducible, minimal, and even quintessential civil right” (2019: 66; emphasis in original). Each member of society has such a right, she contends, and, if the government fails to secure it for everyone, then the civil rights of all are violated, notwithstanding the fact that there would be no discrimination involved in the failure (23). Accordingly, she holds that it is a conceptual mistake to “conflate[ ] the idea of nondiscrimination with the idea of civil rights” (18).

Additionally, West argues that the standard idea is tied to normative errors, because it fails to affirm that members of society not only have a right against being deprived of certain benefits for discriminatory reasons; they also have a categorical right to those benefits. The result is that, given the standard idea, civil rights are rendered “hollow” and “formal,” lacking substantive content because they do not mandate outcomes in the distribution of benefits but only require that processes of distribution be free of discrimination (46 and 48).

For West, the normative deficiency of the standard idea is on display in the Supreme Court’s rulings regarding education and employment. The court has ruled that there are constitutional rights against being denied an educational or employment opportunity on grounds of race or sex but has failed to recognize any categorical constitutional right to education or employment (204–212). The court has even failed to recognize a categorical civil right to police protection. West regards those failures as reflections of the standard idea and its radically truncated conception of “the duty the state takes on, when we enter a social compact” (66).

However, the standard idea is not conceptually or normatively deficient in the ways that West claims it to be. The idea is consistently conjoined with the recognition that, beyond antidiscrimination rights, free and equal citizenship requires rights to police protection, education, and other benefits that modern society can and should provide its members. If the Supreme Court is wrong in failing to recognize such claims as among the basic rights of citizens, then the problem is not with the standard idea but rather with the court’s impoverished understanding of free and equal citizenship.

Additionally, West’s charge that the standard idea renders civil rights “hollow” due to the merely “formal” character of antidiscrimination rights appears to unduly minimize the normative significance of claims against discrimination. Even though such claims are, in a sense, “formal,” claims that are formal can still be morally important. Davis acknowledges this point, writing that civil rights are “immensely important,” even though she adds that “freedom is more expansive than civil rights” (2016: 72).

The normative significance of formal rights can be appreciated by considering the right to vote in a free and fair election. There is no guaranteed or predetermined outcome in such an election, and, to that extent, the right to vote is formal: it is a right to be part of a process, not a right to any particular outcome of the process. But the franchise is not normatively “hollow”; rather, it is a right that has helped persons in a modern society to protect themselves from serious injustice (sec. 4 below).

3. Categories of Rights

Civil rights have often been understood by way of contrast with claims said to belong to different categories of rights: political, social, welfare and cultural, among others. Competing conceptions of civil rights have drawn the contrasts in different ways and for different purposes. To the extent that a particular contrast is used to express a view that unduly limits the scope of claims belonging to free and equal citizenship, the contrast is subject to critique and revision on the basis of a suitably capacious idea of civil rights. Such critique and revision were what led to the abandonment of the once widespread view that political rights are not civil rights. And, in the judgment of many, though not all, contemporary thinkers, welfare and cultural rights, like political rights, are essential to the freedom and equality of citizens and so ought to be counted as types of civil rights rather than as rights of an altogether different kind.

3.1 Political and Social Rights

Until well into the 20th century, civil rights were sharply contrasted with political and social rights. Civil rights encompassed the rights to own property, enter into legally binding contracts, receive due process of law, bring private lawsuits, testify in court, and worship one’s religion. They also covered freedom of speech and the press (Amar 1998: 216–17). But they were traditionally conceived as excluding the right to vote or to hold public office, which were assigned to an entirely separate category, that of political rights, and conferred by law only on (some) adult males. Social rights concerned the domain of interactions deemed “private,” which encompassed not only personal relationships such as friendships but transactions between businesses and their clientele.

The separation of civil from political and social rights was traditionally invoked to limit the scope of citizenship rights so as to keep the members of certain social groups, notably women, blacks, and wage-workers, in their subordinate status. The claims of members of those groups to the franchise were denied with the assertion that, even though all citizens were entitled to civil rights, not all were entitled to political rights. The franchise was said to be, not a right, but rather a “privilege,” properly conferred only on those who were fit to exercise it in a way that would promote the good of society (Keyssar: 38 and 177). And the claims of blacks to be served by a business or to travel in a railroad car to which whites had access were denied with the assertion that civil rights did not touch upon social matters such as the decisions of persons and businesses to associate with the members of one race but not another. Such decisions were said to be analogous to a person’s choice of friends or dinner guests.

In the decades following the Civil War, the U.S. Supreme Court ruled that, as a matter of constitutional law, political rights were not among the rights held by all adult citizens and that Congress had no authority to prohibit racial discrimination in access to the goods and services of private firms that catered to the public. In Minor v. Happersett, the Court invoked the civil-political distinction in holding that, even though women were undoubtedly citizens, “the Constitution, when it conferred citizenship, did not necessarily confer the right of suffrage” (1874: 177). And in the Civil Rights Cases, the Court struck down the Civil Rights Act of 1875, writing that the Constitution did not confer upon Congress the power “to adjust what may be called the social rights of men and races in the community, but only to declare and vindicate those fundamental rights which appertain to the essence of citizenship” (1883: 22).

Accordingly, the court used the civil-political-social distinction to formulate its conception of citizenship, and its conception licensed a hierarchical sorting of citizens by sex and race. The court’s rulings and reasoning reflected the dominant views of race and sex in American society at the time and for decades thereafter. Those views did not go unchallenged, however. Challenges were mounted by the women in the suffrage movement and by blacks, who argued that access to the ballot was needed for the effective enjoyment of the rights to property, contract and the other traditional civil rights.

3.2 Social and Welfare Rights

In an influential essay first published in 1950, the British sociologist T.H. Marshall posited “an evolution of citizenship which has been in continuous progress for some 250 years” (Marshall and Bottomore 1987: 7). Marshall employed a tripartite distinction that was, in some ways, similar to the traditional distinction found in the opinions of the U.S. Supreme Court, but his purpose was very different from any effort to hierarchically sort citizens into different categories with differing sets of rights. He assumed that the rights of citizenship should be the same for all, and his aim was to show that the set of rights had been expanding over the centuries.

Marshall distinguished civil, political, and social rights, and he argued that, over the course of several centuries, the idea of citizenship had progressively expanded from encompassing only civil rights to including political rights and then, during the 20th century, to incorporating social rights. His distinction between civil and political rights tracked the line that the U.S. Supreme Court had drawn during the 19th century between rights to property, contract, due process etc., on the one side, and the rights to vote and hold office, on the other. But what he meant by the term ’social rights’ was very different from what the U.S. Supreme Court had in mind.

Marshall explained that ’social rights’ referred to “the whole range [of rights] from the right to a modicum of economic welfare and security to the right to share to the full in the social heritage and to live the life of a civilized being according to the standards prevailing in the society” (8). Included were rights to “a minimum supply of certain essential goods and services (such as medical attention and supplies, shelter and education) or a minimum money income available to be spent on essentials” (32). Marshall’s social rights were thus radically different from the rights that the Supreme Court had invoked in the Civil Rights Cases: the court’s rights were the rights of persons to associate with others who wanted to associate with them and to exclude from their circle anyone whom they pleased, while Marshall’s were rights to a share of basic social goods access to which he thought was essential to individual well-being, or welfare. Accordingly, Marshall was suggesting that what came to be called “welfare rights” were among the rights of free and equal citizens and thus were “civil rights” in the broad sense.

In many wealthy countries today, but not in the U.S., welfare rights are protected as a matter of constitutional principle. For example, Section 75 of the Danish Constitution provides that “any person unable to support himself or his dependents shall, where no other person is responsible for his or their maintenance, be entitled to receive public assistance.” And the German Federal Constitutional Court has found that the country’s Basic Law establishes a “Sozialstaat” (reflecting Marshall’s use of ’social’) and secures for every member of society an enforceable right to be provided by government the “material prerequisites which are indispensable for his or her physical existence and for a minimum of participation in social, cultural and political life” (Egidy 2011: 1964).

3.3 Cultural Rights

Cultural rights include language rights for members of cultural minorities and the rights of indigenous peoples to preserve their cultural institutions and practices and to exercise some measure of political autonomy. Article 27 of the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights declares that such rights ought to be protected: “In those States in which ethnic, religious or linguistic minorities exist, persons belonging to such minorities shall not be denied the right, in community with the other members of their group, to enjoy their own culture, to profess and practice their own religion, or to use their own language.” Similarly, the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms protects the language rights of minorities, and section 27 provides, “This Charter shall be interpreted in a manner consistent with the preservation and enhancement of the multicultural heritage of Canadians.” In the United States, the Voting Rights Act protects the speakers of certain minority languages (52 U.S.C. §10303), and constitutional doctrine recognizes native Indian tribes as having some rights of political self-rule.

There is substantial philosophical controversy over the legitimacy and scope of rights of cultural membership. Kymlicka has argued that the liberal commitment to protect the equal rights of individuals requires society to protect such rights, suitably defined (1989; 1994; 1995). He distinguishes among three sorts of rights that have been claimed by various groups whose culture differs from the dominant culture of a country: (1) rights of self-government, involving a claim to a degree of political autonomy to be exercised through the minority culture’s own institutions, (2) polyethnic rights, involving special claims by members of the minority culture to facilitate their integration into mainstream institutions and practices, and (3) representational rights, involving a special claim of the minority culture to have its members serve in legislatures and other political bodies of the broader society (1995: 27–33).

Kymlicka argues that these three sorts of group rights can, in principle, be justified for those populations that he designates as “national minorities,” such as native Americans in the United States and the Québécois and Aboriginals in Canada. A national minority is “an intergenerational community, more or less institutionally complete, occupying a given territory or homeland, [and] sharing a distinct language and history” (18). Kymlicka contends that “granting special representational rights, land claims, or language rights to a [national] minority … can be seen as putting … [it] on a more equal footing [with the majority], by reducing the extent to which the smaller group is vulnerable to the larger” (36–37). Such special rights do not involve granting to the national minority the authority to take away any of the civil rights of its members. Rather, the rights are “external protections,” providing the group with powers and immunities with which it can protect its culture against the potentially harmful decisions of the broader society (35).

According to Kymlicka, in contrast to national minorities (and refugees), most immigrants have left their original cultures voluntarily and so are entitled only to a much more limited set of group rights. These “polyethnic rights” are claims to have certain adjustments or accommodations made in the prevailing laws and regulations so as to give individuals access to the social mainstream. Thus, Kymlicka thinks that Orthodox Jews in the U.S. Armed Forces should have the legal right to wear a yarmulke while on duty and Canadian Sikhs have a legitimate claim to be exempt from motorcycle helmet laws (31).

Kymlicka’s distinction between national minorities and immigrants has been criticized by Choudhry, who writes that “in the majority of cases the decision to immigrate is not free” (2002: 64) due to entrenched features of the global economy and other factors beyond the control of immigrants. But Patten defends a qualified form of Kymlicka’s distinction, arguing that, in light of the benefits received by immigrants and a moral prerogative that states enjoy to pursue their own national projects, “a modest prioritizing of the claims of national minorities over those of immigrants is reasonable and permissible” (2014: 295–96).

However, Patten holds that Kymlicka’s approach is deficient when it comes to cultural minorities — including immigrants —who are geographically-dispersed and lack institutions that could serve as the basis for their collective self-government. Contra Kymlicka, Patten argues that, as a matter of justice, such persons have a right that their cultural practices enjoy a level of recognition and accommodation from the state that is equal to what the majority culture enjoys. This right derives from a liberal state’s “obligation to extend a fair opportunity for self- determination to all its citizens,” (29) an obligation entailing that the state “has the responsibility to be neutral toward the various conceptions of the good that are affirmed by its citizens” (27). The appropriate form of neutrality (what Patten calls “neutrality of treatment”) is achieved when the state provides comparable facilities, resources, and opportunities to the members of cultural minority groups so that they are neither disadvantaged nor advantaged, relative to those in the cultural majority, when it comes to pursuing identity-related aspects of their conceptions of the good. Patten explains identity-related features as ones that are not simply preferences but help to define a person’s sense of who she is and hold a place of central importance in a person’s system of ends.

According to Patten, among the areas in which a state might be called upon to extend special rights to cultural minorities are language, holidays, and the arrangement of substate political divisions. For example, neutrality of treatment might require the state to supply its services, such as assistance with tax preparations or information regarding health matters, in the languages of cultural minorities. Although such accommodations would go well beyond what Kymlicka has endorsed, Patten agrees with him that the underlying aim of cultural rights is not to ensure the survival of a culture. As Patten puts it, such rights “are not rights to cultural preservation” (29). Once a framework of fair opportunity is established, whatever cultural outcome that emerges is just, even if some cultures “struggle or … disappear altogether” (29).

Notwithstanding their differences, the positions of Patten and Kymlicka occupy a middle ground between views that are largely antagonistic to the idea of cultural rights and views that embrace such rights on the ground that the survival of cultures has an intrinsic importance, irreducible to the interests of individuals. Barry takes the former, antagonistic view, while Taylor takes the latter.

Barry asserts that “there are certain rights against oppression, exploitation, and injury, to which every single human being is entitled to lay claim, and … appeals to cultural diversity and pluralism under no circumstances trump the value of basic liberal rights” (2001: 132–33). The legal system should protect those rights by impartially imposing the same rules on all persons, regardless of their cultural or religious membership. Barry allows for a few exceptions, such as the accommodation of a Sikh boy whose turban violated school dress regulations, but thinks that the conditions under which such exceptions will be justified “are rarely satisfied” (2001: 62).

At the other end of the spectrum, Taylor (1994) argues for a form of communitarianism that attaches intrinsic importance to the survival of cultures. In his view, differential treatment under the law for certain practices is sometimes justifiable on the ground that such treatment is important for keeping a culture alive. And Taylor contends that cultural survival can sometimes override basic individual rights, such as freedom of speech. Accordingly, he defends legal restrictions on the use of English in Quebec, invoking the survival of Quebec’s French culture.

4. The Right to Vote

Conflict over who should have the right to vote has been a part of the history of modern representative government ever since its emergence in England during the 17th century. Because elections are central to such systems of governance and the different groups that make up society have competing political interests, the issue of which segments of the population should have the franchise has long been contested. Property and sex qualifications drastically limited the franchise into the 20th century. Opposition to universal manhood suffrage came from those claiming that men without sufficient property lacked the independence of mind and the stake in the good of the community needed for the responsible exercise of the franchise (Keyssar 2000: 8–10). After industrialization produced a large class of wage-workers, a common argument against universal suffrage was that giving workers the right to vote would result in the establishment of a disastrous socialist or communist regime. Opposition to women’s suffrage came from those who embraced the traditional patriarchal idea that the inherent capacities of women suited them, not for the public world of politics, but for the restricted private domain of family life and the household (Keyssar 2000: 141).

In the U.S., the right to vote for black men was achieved de jure shortly after the Civil War, but throughout the South the right was de facto denied until the Civil Rights Movement led to the Voting Rights Act of 1965. However, efforts to deny blacks the vote and to dilute their voting power survived the act (secs. 4.1 – 4.3 below).

4.1 The Disenfranchisement of Black Americans

The 15th Amendment of the U.S. Constitution was ratified in 1870, a landmark of the Reconstruction era in which radical Republicans and their allies sought to ensure that America’s freedmen and their fellow blacks would be free and equal citizens. The amendment prohibits the denial or abridgement of the right to vote on account of race and authorizes Congress to enact “appropriate legislation” to implement the prohibition. But it would take a century after the amendment’s ratification before blacks across the South could register and vote free from widespread and overt discrimination and a well-grounded fear of economic coercion and retaliatory violence. Even during Reconstruction, when many blacks could vote under the protection of federal troops occupying the South at the time, there was routine discrimination and violence against blacks seeking to exercise their constitutional right.

The Supreme Court gave a tortured interpretation to federal legislation that sought to protect black voting rights, declaring that the legislation was not “appropriate” as a basis for the prosecution of state officials who had flagrantly prevented blacks from registering to vote (U.S. v. Reese 1875). And after a backroom deal enabled Rutherford Hayes to win the contested presidential election of 1876, his administration instructed federal troops to end their efforts to protect the rights of blacks. With the consequent demise of Reconstruction, the path was opened for Southern whites to turn the 15th Amendment into a dead letter.

Southern states proceeded to adopt literacy requirements and other tests of a voter’s knowledge, poll taxes, and a variety of other measures that, applied in a discriminatory manner by local registrars and combined with terrorist violence and economic coercion, succeeded in disenfranchising the vast majority of blacks in the region. And despite the open defiance of the 15th Amendment, in Giles v. Harris (1903), the Supreme Court declared that the federal judiciary was not the place to go for blacks who sought the abrogation of the system of disenfranchisement. Justice Holmes wrote for the court that “relief from a great political wrong, if done, as alleged, by the people of a state and the state itself must be given by them or by the legislative and political department of the government of the United States” (488). But Holmes and every other minimally-informed American at the time knew full well that there was no realistic possibility that Southern states or Congress would voluntarily act to protect the voting rights of blacks.

It was clear to blacks that, without the franchise, they had no prospect of securely enjoying their legal rights to property, contract, due process and the other claims that had been traditionally regarded as the fundamental rights of free and equal citizens. With no political power, Southern blacks were exposed to ruthless exploitation and oppression at the hands of whites, which was the reason why whites undertook their disenfranchisement schemes in the first place. The experience of Reconstruction had taught whites that the vote was a power that blacks would use to secure their other legal rights. It was no accident that one of the principal aims of the Civil Rights Movement would be the enactment of effective federal legislation to protect voting rights.

4.2 The Voting Rights Act

Among the most effective and important pieces of legislation to come out of the Civil Rights Movement was the Voting Rights Act of 1965 (VRA). The act effected a “quiet revolution” (Davidson and Grofman 1994) in the political systems of southern states by greatly reducing the legal power those states had traditionally enjoyed to determine the rules by which their electoral systems operated. The broad consensus among historians and political scientists is that the VRA put an end to the massive disenfranchisement of southern blacks, as black voter registration rates increased exponentially across Southern states in just a few years after enactment (Wright 2013: 183). Additionally, studies have shown that, with the help of persistent litigation based on the act, the number of black elected officials, especially at the local level, increased substantially (184). In his assessment of the effects of the VRA, Wright concludes that “it is undeniable that local political participation [by blacks] generated positive change in aspects important to [their] communities and their members … . [b]y ensuring that gains from economic growth would be more broadly shared” than would otherwise have been the case (184). Those gains included the provision of basic public services that many black communities in the South had been previously denied due to discrimination, services such as paved roads, streetlights, fire stations, and sewage treatment facilities.

The VRA took a series of unprecedented steps in shifting the power to regulate elections from the states to the national government. The traditional understanding had been that, under the Constitution, states had the exclusive and final power to determine the rules by which elections for state and local offices were held. The VRA overturned that understanding, inserting federal power into the sovereign domain of the states.

Section 2 of the VRA contained a nationwide ban on any voting qualification or procedure that denied or abridged a citizen’s right to vote on account of race or color. The act went on to provide remedies to make the ban effective in jurisdictions that had been particularly egregious in their violations of the 15th Amendment. The remedies applied to jurisdictions that met two conditions (the “coverage formula”): 1) as of November 1964, the jurisdiction was using a literacy test or some similar device to determine eligibility to register, and 2) the proportion of eligible voters in the jurisdiction who were registered on that date, or who had turned out to vote in the election that year, was below 50%. The idea was that low overall registration or voting rates (under 50%) was an objective indicator that a sizeable proportion of the eligible voters were being denied access to the ballot for racially discriminatory reasons. Measures authorized for use against jurisdictions that met the coverage formula included the invalidation of literacy tests, the appointment of federal examiners to replace local registrars and to compile the voting rolls, and, under Section 5, the requirement to gain federal approval (typically from the Attorney General) for any changes in rules governing elections (“the preclearance requirement”). Seven southern states fell under the coverage formula.

The constitutionality of the key provisions of the VRA was challenged by the states that fell under the formula, but the Supreme Court upheld the law in South Carolina v. Katzenbach (1966). The act was then reauthorized several times with some alterations. The alterations sought to strengthen protections against what were called “second- generation” barriers to racial equality in the electoral process. The first generation had included literacy tests and the other devices that were applied in discriminatory fashion to block blacks from registering. The second generation consisted of various ways that the political power of registered minority voters was diluted by electoral arrangements.

Consider the following example of vote dilution. In many counties in the South, whites were in the overall majority but blacks were a majority in certain parts of the county. The counties had been traditionally divided into districts, with each district electing a member of the county board. First-generation discrimination ensured all-white boards by blocking black registration in majority-black districts. When first-generation devices were invalidated as a result of the VRA, many southern counties switched from a district-based system to at-large voting, so that the white majority in the county as a whole could continue to elect an all-white board. The Supreme Court held that such changes were subject to a preclearance review by federal authorities, who were empowered to prohibit the changes (Allen v. State Board of Elections 1969). And treating dilution as a form of racial discrimination, in 1982, Congress amended section 2 to prohibit any electoral rule or arrangement that “results in a denial or abridgement of the right of any citizen of the United States to vote on account of race or color … . [or being] a member of a language minority group” (52 U.S.C. 10301 and 10303).

For more than four decades, the preclearance requirement of section 5 and litigation based on section 2 were used to stop racial vote dilution and a range of other electoral arrangements that were deemed racially discriminatory. Then the Supreme Court upended preclearance in its ruling in Shelby County v. Holder (2013).

4.3 The Shelby Case and Its Aftermath

In Shelby County, the Supreme Court struck down the coverage formula of the VRA, thereby rendering impotent Section 5’s preclearance provision: with no coverage formula, no jurisdictions could be picked out as ones needing to receive federal approval for changing their electoral rules. The formula had been last updated in the early 1970’s, and, writing for the court, Chief Justice Roberts found that the use of the formula had become “irrational” in light of the “dramatic [racial] progress” that had been made in the intervening decades (554 and 556). He pointed out that the jurisdictions covered by the formula had rates of black voter registration and turnout as high, and in some cases higher, than the rates for whites, and that minorities had come to hold office “at unprecedented levels” (547) in those states.

Justice Roberts did not deny the existence of second-generation barriers, but he argued that Congress had failed to reshape the coverage formula to track the parts of the country in which such barriers were most prevalent at present. Accordingly, he did not see a rational relationship between the formula and any remaining obstacles to racial discrimination in voting. Moreover, he contended that Section 5 constituted a “dramatic departure from the principle that all states enjoy equal sovereignty” (535). In light of such a departure from a principle that he regarded as fundamental, Roberts concluded that Congress lacked the constitutional power to impose the old coverage formula.

In her dissent, Justice Ginsburg emphasized the evidential record that Congress had compiled prior to its 2006 reauthorization of the law. That record led Congress to the conclusion that the old coverage formula was adequate to target those jurisdictions where second-generation barriers were most prevalent. For example, the record contained a study showing that covered areas were much more likely to be successfully sued in Section 2 litigation than other jurisdictions. Accordingly, Ginsburg judged that “Congress had reasonably concluded that the coverage formula continues to identify the jurisdictions of greatest concern” (578). She also construed the “equal sovereignty” principle as applying only to the very limited circumstance in which a new state was being admitted to the union: the new state must not be accorded a lesser, or greater, degree of sovereignty than the existing states.

Roberts is correct to see the VRA as a “dramatic departure” (535) from the traditional legal view of the power of the national government to regulate state elections. As Ackerman stresses, the act was a radical piece of legislation, akin to a constitutional amendment in the way that it overturned long-settled legal understandings (2014). Nonetheless, Roberts’s argument that Congress must reshape the coverage formula is not convincing. On the surface, it appears unreasonable for Congress to rely on an old formula despite important changes in the situation of blacks. But the fact that a situation has changed in some relevant respects does not mean that it has changed in all such respects, and a closer look by Congress determined that in one respect matters had not changed: the same jurisdictions picked out by the old formula still had the most problematic records in upholding the rights of blacks to an undiluted vote. Roberts glosses over the fact that increases in registration among blacks do not address the problem of racial vote dilution, and, although he is correct that black officeholding rates have increased considerably since 1970, it was reasonable for Congress to conclude that the increase was due largely to vigorous federal enforcement based on the old coverage formula.

In the wake of Shelby, states that had been subject to the federal preclearance requirement (as well as a number of states that had not been subject to it) have adopted laws and practices that make voting more difficult than it had previously been and that disproportionately disadvantage blacks, members of indigenous tribes, and other racial minorities. These laws and practices include photo ID and proof of citizenship requirements, restrictions on early voting and mail-in ballots, and a reduction in the number of polling places. The prevention of voter fraud is the main rationale offered for such measures. However, litigation challenging the measures has been mounted across the country. Where a discriminatory intent can be shown, the measures are vulnerable to judicial invalidation (NAACP v. McCrory 2016), but absent a “smoking gun” showing such intent, the measures have been generally upheld (see, e.g., Brnovich v. D.N.C. 2021). Their critics have contended that the measures violate section 2 of the VRA because their disproportionate racial impact means that the measures “result[ ] in … [a]n abridgment of the right to vote” on account of race (VRA: section 2; Commission on Civil Rights 2018; Herron and Smith 2016). But legal and philosophical questions remain about how to interpret the results-oriented language of section 2 and whether an intent to discriminate should be seen as a necessary element of any viable claim of racial discrimination in electoral arrangements (Altman 1998).

5. Criminal Justice and Racial Profiling

In recent years, the criminal justice system has become a focal point in the discussion of civil rights in the United States. A number of commentators have argued that the system amounts to a “new Jim Crow,” reducing blacks to an inferior, caste-like status (Alexander 2012; for criticism of the Jim Crow analogy, see Forman 2012). Yet, even apart from such arguments, civil rights concerns have been raised about every dimension of criminal justice in the U.S., from the investigation and arrest of suspects to the imposition of the death penalty. And issues of racial equality with respect to criminal justice are hardly limited to the U.S. (Clarke: 9–10). In France, for example, race-based abuse perpetrated by the police is a matter of serious public concern, and the office of Defender of Rights has found that persons perceived as black or Arab are 20 times as likely to be stopped by police as members of the general population (Bredeen and Morenne 2017).

Among the most controversial tactics used by police in determining who has committed a crime is racial (and ethnic) profiling. The tactic has given rise to the charge that it violates the civil rights of those whom it targets, and, in some cases, the courts have agreed with the charge. In State v. Soto, for example, a New Jersey court found that police traffic stops targeted blacks and amounted to a “selective enforcement” (351) of the law and a violation of the Equal Protection Clause of the 14th Amendment. Nonetheless, debate continues over when, if ever, it is justifiable for police to use race in deciding whom to stop and question.

Risse and Zeckhauser formulate a philosophically sophisticated defense of racial profiling. They argue that, even in a racist society like the United States, such profiling is justifiable under conditions plausibly thought to exist in a range of cases. Their argument combines utilitarian and deontological considerations: the utilitarian strand regards profiling as contributing to the public good of crime control, while the deontological line of argument aims to rebut claims that profiling is objectionably discriminatory and unfair to persons whom it harms.

Risse and Zeckhauser acknowledge that police abuse can be coupled with profiling, but they insist that “abuse and profiling … are different problems that must be assessed independently” (139; emphasis in original). Profiling is “any police initiated-action that relies on the race, ethnicity, or national origin and not merely on the behavior of an individual” (136). Such action need not involve any abusive police behavior, such as “rude words, demeaning demands, physical force, or physical injury” (138). Abuse “must be rectified independently” (139) of profiling.

Some critics of profiling contend that it is wholly ineffective as a crime control measure. Risse and Zeckhauser point out that if this contention is true, then there is no issue: profiling is unjustifiable on that premise. But they reason that, even if some forms of profiling make no net contribution to crime control, it seems unlikely that all forms fit that description, given “a significant correlation between membership in certain racial groups and the tendency to commit certain crimes” (132).

Racial minorities feel aggrieved by profiling, and Risse and Zeckhauser do not disregard that fact. However, they claim that the grievance rests largely on “the underlying systematic racism” (145) of society and that the harm done to minorities by profiling is “small” (169) in comparison to the harm done by that underlying racism. For example, African Americans would be “only slightly” better off if profiling were eliminated, “keeping everything else fixed” (149; emphasis in original). “[T]he harm attached to profiling per se,” they explain, “is expressive” (146; emphasis in original). Profiling is “a symbol of structural disadvantage” (147) but “not the primary cause of … the sense of hurt among minorities” (149). In the utilitarian calculus of Risse and Zeckhauser, the harms that count against the benefits flowing from more effective crime control are “comparatively modest” (149), viz., symbolic harms plus the temporary inconveniences of being stopped and questioned by the police. These modest harms are, in their view, likely to be outweighed in a range of cases by the benefits.

Additionally, Risse and Zeckhauser argue that racial profiling per se is not objectionably discriminatory, because it has neither “the intention or the effect of maintaining or establishing an oppressive relationship” between the races (153; emphasis in original). When it does not involve abuse, profiling has the intention of crime control, and, because profiling “is itself parasitic on an underlying oppressive relationship” (154) and does (mainly) symbolic harm, it “does not contribute to [an] oppressive relationship” (155).

Critics of Risse and Zeckhauser argue that profiling is not only a symbol of society’s underlying racism but that it also contributes materially to such racism and its harmful effects. Eidelson argues that “the use of race as a proxy for criminality is likely to be taken as validation for racist assumptions, and thereby to nurture the very prejudices which contribute most directly to [racially] oppressive relationships” (2015: 215). In a similar vein, Lever contends that profiling “encourages us to see black people as perpetrators” and that “racial profiling exacerbates problems of police abuse” because such profiling “conveys a message that black people are … dangerous” (2007: 24). And Hosein contends that blacks and certain other groups, such as Muslims and persons of Middle Eastern descent, “can reasonably assume that profiling contributes to police abuse in so far as police officers (even if mistakenly) take it to license harsh treatment of those groups” (2018: e17; emphasis in original).

Hosein also argues, more fundamentally, that a policy of profiling blacks and other groups gives the members of those groups good reason to think that the government “substantially discounts [their] rights and interests” relative to the rest of society and is thereby consigning them to an “inferior political status” (e5). In opposition to utilitarian defenses of profiling, he holds that government has a duty of justice to avoid actions that make it reasonable for members of the political community to believe that they are being consigned to such a status: equal citizenship must be secured by government, and all citizens must have sufficient grounds for confidence that equality is secured for them.

Mogensen contends that, contra Risse and Zeckhauser, racial profiling is pro tanto and inherently wrong because it disrespects a person’s interest in being treated in a way that reflects her merits as determined by personal features over which she has control. He points out that other forms of differential treatment based on statistical generalizations about unchosen features – such as minimum age requirements for obtaining a driver’s license-- are also unfair for disrespecting that interest. But Mogensen’s central claim is that, unlike those other forms, “racial profiling of black citizens [is] especially problematic insofar as it is one of a number of injustices that together constitute … . a systematic pattern of injustice” inflicted on blacks and through which they are subordinated to whites (2019: 467). He notes that, on his account, racial profiling would be seriously wrongful, even if it were kept secret from the public and increased the efficiency of law enforcement.

Reiman agrees with Risse and Zeckhauser that some forms of racial profiling can make a significant contribution to overall safety, but he also supports Lever’s view that racial profiling in a racist society is likely to exacerbate racism and increase the violation of the rights of those victimized by it. While he holds that “profiling is not intrinsically racist” (2011: 17), Reiman argues that Risse and Zeckhauser have not set the bar sufficiently high for profiling to be justified. He contends that, in light of its likely exacerbation of existing racism, “racial profiling [must] be used only for grave crimes and only where there is abundant evidence of its likelihood of significantly increasing apprehension of perpetrators of such crimes” (17). In a similar vein, Hosein argues that profiling is justified only when the social benefits are “compelling” and “there are no other means of achieving the same benefits without creating similar injustice” (2018: e16). For Reiman, Hosein and other critics, then, an adequate appreciation of the connection of racial profiling to systemic injustice compels the conclusion that, if profiling can be justified at all, it is in a narrower range of circumstances that what the Risse- Zeckhauser argument allows.

6. Marriage Equality

Among the most highly contested civil rights issues of recent years has been the question of whether marriage laws should be extended to include same-sex couples. Over the past two decades, a number of countries have liberalized their laws to enable such couples to become married, despite the opposition of those who think that it is morally or theologically unjustified to alter the traditional understanding of marriage as the union of a man and a woman. The countries that currently recognize same-sex marriages include the Netherlands, Belgium, Canada, South Africa, Spain, Norway, Sweden, Mexico, Portugal, Iceland, Argentina, Denmark, Brazil, France, England, New Zealand, and the United States. In most of these countries, nationwide same-sex marriage was brought about by legislation. But in the United States, the Supreme Court ruling in Obergefell v. Hodges (2015) extended same-sex marriage from ten states to all fifty.

Most scholars working in the areas of philosophy and legal theory endorse a principle of equal treatment for same-sex and heterosexual couples and argue that equal treatment requires that same-sex marriages be legalized (Wardle 1996; Eskridge 1996; Balkin 2020). However, there are dissenting voices in the literature, rejecting marriage equality. These voices do not argue in favor the traditional practice of criminalizing same-sex relations, although some contend that such relations are “manifestly unworthy of the human being and immoral” (Finnis 1996: 14). But they all argue that extending marriage to same-sex couples flouts important values and principles.

Many advocates of a right to same-sex marriage argue that abridging a person’s right to marry on the basis of sexual orientation is objectionable for the same reasons that abridging that right on the basis of race cannot be justified: both forms of restriction are arbitrary deprivations of a fundamental civil right (Koh et al.: 18–19 and 42). However, such an argument proceeds too quickly. In the eyes of opponents, the analogy between race and sexual orientation is inapt: the considerations they invoke against same-sex marriage, such as the interests of children or the distinctive nature of heterosexual intercourse, do not apply to interracial marriages. Accordingly, arguments about same-sex marriage must engage with those considerations.

Finnis (1996), Lee (1997) and George (1997) make their case against same-sex marriage by invoking natural law. However, unlike traditional versions of natural law theory, their version does not rest on any explicit theological or metaphysical claims. Rather, it invokes independent principles of practical reasoning that articulate the basic reasons for action. Such reasons are the fundamental goods that action is capable of realizing and, for Finnis, Lee and George, include “marriage, the conjuntio of man and woman” (Finnis 1996: 4). Homosexual conduct, masturbation, and all extra-marital sex aim strictly at “individual gratification” and can be no part of any “common good.” Such actions “harm the character” of those voluntarily choosing them (Lee and George, 1997: 135), and, in taking the actions, the individual becomes a slave to his passions, allowing his reason to be overridden by his raw desire for sensuous pleasure.

On Finnis’s account, when consensual sexual conduct is private, government may not outlaw it, but government “can rightly judge that it has a compelling interest in denying that ‘gay lifestyles’ are a valid and humanly acceptable choice and form of life” (1996: 17). And for Finnis, Lee and George, equal treatment of same-sex and heterosexual relations is out of the question due to the morally defective character of same-sex relations.

Macedo responds to Finnis by arguing that “all of the goods that can be shared by sterile heterosexual couples can also be shared by committed homosexual couples” (1996: 39). Macedo points out that Finnis does not condemn sexual intercourse by sterile heterosexual couples. But Finnis replies that there is a relevant difference between homosexual couples and sterile heterosexual ones: the latter but not the former are united “biologically” when they have intercourse. Lee and George make essentially the same point: only heterosexual couples can “truly become one body, one organism” (1997: 150). But Macedo points out that, biologically, it is not the man and woman who unite but the sperm and the egg (1996: 37). It can be added that the “biological unity” argument seems to run contrary to Finnis’s claim that his position “does not seek to infer normative conclusions from non-normative (natural-fact) premises” (1997: 16). More importantly, Macedo and Koppelman make the key point that the human good realized in intimate relations is a function of “mutual commitment and stable engagement” (Macedo, 1996: 40) and that same-sex couples can achieve “the precise kind of human good” that is available to heterosexual ones (Koppelman, 1997: 1649). Accordingly, equal treatment under the law for same-sex couples, including the recognition of same-sex marriage, would remove unjustifiable obstacles faced by those couples to the achievement of that human good.

Corvino explains one of the central human goods provided by marriage in this way: marriage involves two individuals mutually and publicly committing to be the “Number One Person” for the other in sharing the benefits and alleviating the burdens that life brings (Corvino and Gallagher: 15). Sterile heterosexual couples and those unable to have sexual relations for physical reasons are rightly permitted to marry to secure that good, and Corvino argues that “once the state provides marriage as an option for different-sex partners, even if they cannot or choose not to have children; … [and] even if they are incapable of coitus, … but then denies [marriage] to same-sex couples, it is treating citizens unequally” (89–90).

Gallagher rejects Corvino’s view, contending that “[t]he critical public or ‘civil’ task of marriage is to regulate sexual relationships between men and women in order to reduce the likelihood that children … will face the burdens of fatherlessness, and increase the likelihood that there will be a next generation that will be raised by their mothers and fathers in one family, where both parents are committed to each other and to their children” (Corvino and Gallagher: 96). She argues that “gay marriage is a profound change to the meaning of the word ‘marriage’… . [b]ecause] it disconnects marriage from its grounding in the human reality that male-female sexual relationships are different from other kinds of relationships” (101).

However, Gallagher is not correct to claim that Corvino’s view rests on the premise that “a union of two men or two women is just the same as a union of husband and wife” (132). The question is whether the two sorts of union are relevantly similar with respect to values that marriage serves. Corvino claims that, with respect to at least one important value, viz., providing support for couples who want to undertake a mutual and public commitment to be each other’s “Number One Person,” there is no relevant difference. Gallagher weakens her own view when she writes that “gay marriage is wrong first and foremost not because of its consequences but because it is a lie” (178), specifically, the lie that same-sex couples “are like man and wife” (177). Rather, in light of her emphasis on how marriage protects children (109–115), it would make more sense for her to argue that regulating sexual relations between men and women in the interest of children is the most important social purpose of marriage and that marriage equality threatens the capacity of marriage to serve that function; she should not deny that marriage has other, socially valuable functions.

Corvino affirms that marriage has an important child-protection function, while rejecting the idea that it is the sole function (192). His key disagreements with Gallagher are over the importance of those other functions and whether there is adequate reason to think that marriage equality threatens the child-protection function. Corvino argues that denying same-sex couples access to the human goods that marriage can provide to them is no small matter for those couples and that Gallagher vastly underestimates what such access means to them (198). Given how persistently and vigorously same-sex couples have fought for marriage equality, it is difficult to disagree with Corvino on the matter.

Citing studies suggesting that male same-sex couples have a relatively weak commitment to sexual fidelity and are relatively unconcerned about their partner having sex outside of the relationship, Gallagher argues that same-sex marriage would dilute the commitment to fidelity among heterosexual couples, thereby undermining an essential marital norm. And, with the fidelity norm seriously weakened, heterosexual marriages would become more unstable and the interests of children would be harmed.

In Corvino’s judgment, however, Gallagher’s argument rests on an “implausible empirical claim about same-sex couples’ power to topple majority norms” (195). Gay marriages would be only a tiny fraction of all marriages, and gay marriages between men who are indifferent to fidelity would be an even smaller fraction. One could add to Corvino’s criticism that, even if Gallagher’s claim is not implausible, it does seem to be little more than speculation, and it is problematic to deny a civil right on such speculative grounds to a portion of the adult population that has made it clear that, contra Gallagher, the right is very important to them. Gallagher might respond that the stakes for society are high, claiming that the well-being of future generations hang in the balance. But essentially the same claims have been made by defenders of traditional marriage about every liberalization of the law of marriage, from the dismantling of coverture (which had placed a married woman almost entirely under the legal power of her husband) to the present controversy over same-sex marriage.

Girgis, Anderson, and George argue that the defense of same-sex marriage rests on a faulty understanding of marriage, what they call “the revisionist view” (4). Such a view derives from the sexual revolution of the 1960’s and rejects the understanding that had prevailed in almost every society until then, “the conjugal view” (3).

On the conjugal view, marriage is a permanent commitment, “ordered to procreation and family life” (7) and constituting a “comprehensive union” of a man and a woman. The union joins spouses “in body as well as in mind” and is “sealed by sexual intercourse” (3). Such a union is “a basic human good, a distinctive way of thriving” (35). And “there is something special” about a marital couple’s sexual intercourse, because it constitutes the “highest kind of bodily unity” (26), a unity not available in any other relationship. In having intercourse, the marital partners “do not merely touch or interlock” but unite in a way that “has generative significance” and “physically embodies their specific, marital commitment” (36). By contrast, the revisionist view regards marriage as essentially a matter of “emotional union and cohabitation” (8). Sex can enhance the emotional connections but is not essential to the marital union, and when the emotions cool, the partners might reasonably seek to end the union.

Girgis et al. claim that the revisionist view warps our grasp of what marriage is. They dismiss Corvino’s idea that marriage is a matter of having a “Number One Person,” arguing that it “cannot distinguish marriage from simple companionship” (15). Nor can the revisionist view explain why the state should be involved in regulating marriage or account for the central marital norms of permanence and sexual exclusivity.

Corvino can respond that his defense of marriage equality does not rest on the revisionist position, even though he does reject the conjugal view. Rather, Corvino is suggesting a way of understanding marriage that gives same-sex partners access to those substantial goods of marriage that are not tied to heterosexual intercourse. Security in a stable relationship that is publicly and legally ratified as lasting and exclusive is among those goods. The liberty to break off a relationship when emotions “cool” is no part of Corvino’s understanding of marriage. And although it is true that companionship and friendship can provide a “Number One Person,” they cannot do so with the same level of assurance that a legally ratified marriage can.

Girgis et al. might reject Corvino’s view on the ground that it rests on mere psychological considerations related to such matters as how secure individuals feel and how likely they are to end a relationship if it is sexually open, whereas their view rests on a priori principles concerning objective human goods. However, Corvino can respond that his understanding of marriage invokes human goods that are no less objective than Girgis’s “comprehensive union.” Additionally, Corvino might note that, even assuming that heterosexual intercourse unites male and female partners, his argument proceeds without recourse to such contestable claims as the quasi-metaphysical thesis that such intercourse between married partners is “the highest” form of bodily unity and that other sorts of sexual activity are a “mere” touching or interlocking of bodily parts.

Girgis et al. think that the conjugal account of marriage reflects its true nature, but this position appears to have been rejected by most democratic societies since the liberalization of marriage laws and norms that began with nineteenth-century criticisms of the law of coverture. Blackstone summarized the law as it had been through the 18th century: “By marriage, the husband and wife are one person in law: that is, the very being or legal existence of the woman is suspended during the marriage, or at least is incorporated and consolidated into that of the husband” (441). Over the course of a century and more, coverture was limited and eventually eliminated in favor of marriage equality between husband and wife, though traditionalists repeatedly argued that such changes violated the essence of marriage as “a union of person in husband and wife” (441). Subsequent changes in the social understanding of marriage were reflected in the rejection of the requirement of sexual intercourse for the consummation of marriage and in the spread of no-fault divorce laws. Given that such radical changes in the understanding of marriage have already taken place and been inscribed in law, it is unclear how law and society can now consistently or justly exclude same-sex couples from forming a marital bond.

7. Disability

During the 1970s and 80s, persons with disabilities increasingly argued that they were treated as second-class citizens by law and society. They organized into a civil rights movement that pressed for legislation that would help secure for them the status of free and equal citizens. Protection against discrimination based on disability was written into the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms, The Charter of Fundamental Rights of the European Union, and the Convention on the Rights of Person with Disabilities. The disability rights movement in the U.S. culminated with the passage of the Americans With Disabilities Act of 1990 (ADA). The ADA has served as a model for legislation in countries such as Australia, India and Israel

The disability rights movement began with the idea that discrimination on the basis of disability was not different in any morally important way from discrimination based on race. The aim of the movement was to enshrine in law the same kind of antidiscrimination principle that protected persons based on their race. But some theorists have questioned how well the analogy holds. They point out that applying the antidiscrimination norm to disability, for example, by installing ramps for access to buildings or offering special education programs, requires taking account of physical or mental differences among people. This seems to be treatment based on a person’s physical or mental features, apparently the exact opposite of the ideal of “colorblindness” behind the traditional antidiscrimination principle.

Even race-based affirmative action does not really seem to be parallel to antidiscrimination policies that take account of disability. Advocates of affirmative action assert that the social ideal is for persons not to be treated on the basis of their race or color at all. Race-conscious policies are seen as instruments that will move society toward that ideal (Wasserstrom: 2001).

In contrast, policies designed to counter discrimination based on disability are not sensibly understood as temporary measures or steps toward a goal in which people are not treated based on their disabilities. The policies permanently enshrine the idea that in designing buildings or buses or constructing some other aspect of our physical-social environment, we must be responsive to the disabilities people have in order for the disabled to have “fair equality of opportunity” (Rawls 2001: 43–44; Hartley 2009). The need for a permanent “accommodation” of persons with disabilities marks an important difference in how the antidiscrimination norm should be understood in the context of disability, as opposed to the context of race. However, it is important to recognize that, at the level of fundamental principle, the reasons why disability-based discrimination is morally objectionable and even unjust are parallel to the reasons why racial discrimination is so. At the individual level, disadvantageous treatment of the disabled is often rooted in ill-will, disregard, and moral arbitrariness. At the systemic level, such treatment creates a social pattern of disadvantage that reduces the disabled to second-class status. In those two respects, the grounds of civil rights law are no different when it comes to the disabled.

Another way in which disability is thought to be different from race concerns the special needs that the disabled often have that make life more costly for them. These extra costs would exist even if the socially-constructed physical environment were built to provide the disabled with fair equality of opportunity and their basic civil and political liberties were secured. In order to function effectively, disabled persons may need to buy medications or therapies or other forms of assistance that the able-bodied do not need for their functioning. And there does not seem to be any parallel in matters of race to the special needs of some of those who are disabled. The driving idea of the Civil Rights Movement was that blacks did not have any special needs: all they needed was to have the burdens of racism lifted from them and, once that was accomplished, they would flourish or fail like everyone else in society.

However, Silvers (1998) argues that the parallel between race and disability still holds: all the disabled may claim from society as a matter of justice is that they have fair equality of opportunity and the same basic civil rights as everyone else. Any special needs that the disabled may have do not provide the grounds of any legitimate claims of justice. On the other hand, Kittay (2000) argues that the special needs of the disabled are a matter of basic justice. She focuses on the severely mentally disabled, for whom fair opportunity in the labor market and political rights in the public sphere will have no significance, and on the families that have the responsibility of caring for the severely disabled. Pogge (2000) also questions Silvers’ view, suggesting that it is implausible to deny that justice requires that society provide resources for meeting the needs of the severely disabled. Still, it may be the case that some version of Silvers’ approach is justifiable when it comes to disabled persons who have the capacity “to participate fully in the political and civic institutions of the society and, more broadly, in its public life” (Pogge, 2000: 45). In the case of such persons, the basic civil right to equal citizenship would require that they have the equal opportunity to participate in such institutions, regardless of their disability. Although there may be some aspects of the racial model that cannot be applied to persons with severe forms of mental disability, the principles behind the American civil rights struggles of the 1950s and 60s remain crucial normative resources for understanding and combating forms of unjust discrimination that have only more recently been addressed by philosophers and by society more broadly.

Barnes focuses on the category of physical disability and argues that the conditions fitting under the category are “strikingly heterogenous” (2016: 9 and 46) and that there is no feature common to the bodies of all (physically) disabled persons that makes them disabled. On her account, disability is a socially-constructed category that “people have found useful when organizing themselves in a civil rights struggle” and “disability just is whatever the disability rights movement is promoting justice for” (43 – emphasis in original). Barnes adds that the movement’s judgments about which persons and conditions are included under its umbrella are not arbitrary but rather “rule-based” and implicitly treat the category of disability as a “cluster-concept” to be applied to physical conditions that have “some sufficient number of features such as: being subject to social stigma and prejudice; being viewed as unusual or atypical; making ordinary daily tasks difficult or complicated; causing chronic pain; causing barriers to access public places, … requiring the use of mobility aids or assistive technology [and] requiring medical care” (45). What unifies the various conditions categorized as disabilities, in Barnes’s view, is that they “are the kind of thing that the disability rights movement is trying to make the world a better place to live with” (48 – emphasis in original). To be clear, her view is not that the movement is recognizing a “kind of thing” that would exist even in its absence but that the movement creates the kind of thing we call “disability.” Accordingly, if we ask about each of the conditions that fit under the category of physical disability, ‘What does it have common with the other conditions in the category?, then Barnes thinks that the most illuminating answer is that the disability rights movement is fighting for the just treatment of persons with that condition.

Nonetheless, it is difficult to see how Barnes’s account can adequately explain why some stigmatized features, such as blindness and deafness, count as disabilities at the same time that others, such as dark skin and being Jewish, are not disabilities. Under Jim Crow, dark skin was stigmatized, atypical, made ordinary tasks (like getting medical assistance or a bank loan) difficult, and caused barriers to access public places (where “whites only” signs were found at public parks, hospitals, bathrooms, and swimming pools). Yet, the Civil Rights Movement was not, even implicitly, a matter of eliminating disadvantage based on disability, notwithstanding important parallels between race-based and disability-based discrimination (Lim 2018: 983–84).

Legal Cases and Statutes


  • Ackerman, Bruce, 2014, The Civil Rights Revolution, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Alexander, Michelle, 2012, The New Jim Crow, revised edition, New York: New Press.
  • Altman, Andrew, 1998, “Race and Democracy: The Controversy over Racial Vote Dilution,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 27: 175–201.
  • Amar, Akhil Reed, 1998, The Bill of Rights, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Balkin, Jack M. (ed.), 2020, What Obergefell v. Hodges Should Have Said, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Barnes, Elizabeth, 2016. The Minority Body, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Barry, Brian, 2001, Culture and Equality, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Becker, Lawrence, 2005, “Reciprocity, Justice, and Disability,” Ethics, 116: 9–39.
  • Blackstone, William, 1803 [1996], Blackstone’s Commentaries (Volume II), St. George Tucker (ed.), Union, NJ: Lawbook Exchange.
  • Bredeen, Aurelien and Benoît Morenne, 2017, “Fury Arises in France Over Accusations Police Beat and Raped a Black Man,” New York Times, February 8. Bredeen and Morenne 2017 available online.
  • Choudhry, Sujit, 2002, “National Minorities and Ethnic Immigrants: Liberalism’s Political Sociology,” Journal of Political Philosophy, 10: 54–78.
  • Clarke, Amy, 2012, “People of African Descent in Europe,” briefing paper for the U.K. Race and Europe Network. Clarke 2021 available online.
  • Corvino, John and Maggie Gallagher, 2012, Debating Same-Sex Marriage, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Davidson, Chandler and Bernard Grofman (eds.), 1994, Quiet Revolution in the South: The Impact of the Voting Rights Act, 1965–1990, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Davis, Angela, 2016, Freedom is a Constant Struggle, Chicago: Haymarket Books.
  • Du Bois, W.E.B., 1935 [1992], Black Reconstruction in America, New York: Free Press.
  • Dworkin, Ronald, 1995, Freedom’s Law, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Egidy, Stefanie, 2011, “The Fundamental Right to the Guarantee of a Subsistence Minimum in the Hartz IV Decision of the Federal Constitutional Court,” German Law Journal, 12: 1961–1982.
  • Eskridge, William, 1996, The Case for Same-Sex Marriage, New York: Free Press.
  • Eskridge Jr., William and Darren R. Spedale, 2006, Gay Marriage: For Better or For Worse?: What We’ve Learned from the Evidence, New York: Oxford University Press.
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The editors would like to thank Jesse Gero for spotting several typographical errors and formatting errors of other kinds, and for taking the time to bring these to our attention.

Copyright © 2022 by
Andrew Altman

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