Social Minimum

First published Tue Nov 16, 2004; substantive revision Thu Oct 7, 2021

Consider the following statements:

People should not be allowed to starve.

No one should be denied access to a decent minimum of health-care.

Every citizen should be able to meet their basic needs.

These statements all express a widespread view that a political community should seek to ensure that its members are all able to enjoy at least a minimally decent standard of living. They assert the importance of what is often called the social minimum. However, the exact nature of the social minimum, the considerations that support it, and even its basic justifiability, are all matters of philosophical controversy. The aim here is to provide a guide through the terrain of these controversies. This is done in three stages.

Firstly, in section 1, we look more closely at the question, “What is a social minimum?” This section introduces a number of basic distinctions that will serve to clarify the discussion. We define a “social minimum” as that bundle of resources which suffices in the circumstances of a society to enable someone to lead a minimally decent life. We define a “social minimum policy regime” as a set of policies and institutions that serve to secure reasonable access to this social minimum for all members of the society. As part of the task of clarification in this section, we review some of the main philosophical issues posed by these definitions. In particular, how are we to understand the notion of a “minimally decent life”?

In section 2, we then consider the question, “Why a social minimum?” Specifically, we outline a range of influential theories of social justice, and we consider in each case whether and how the theory in question might lend support to the enactment of a social minimum (that is, to the establishment of a social minimum policy regime). The theories considered include utilitarianism, libertarianism, left-libertarianism, egalitarian liberalism, and relational egalitarianism.

In section 3, we then turn to the critics of enactment, posing the question “What can be said against enactment of a social minimum?” We consider three sets of objections that appeal respectively to the values of individual freedom, fairness, and legitimacy. Although the objections do not seem to refute the case for enacting a social minimum, some are helpful in thinking about the form the social minimum should take and about the political procedures surrounding its enactment. Section 4 offers a brief conclusion to our discussion.

1. What is a social minimum?

Our first task, then, is to clarify what a social minimum is. When we speak of a “social minimum” we mean to refer to the bundle of resources that a person needs in order to lead a minimally decent life in their society. Now the members of a society might decide to introduce a set of institutions and policies that secures every member reasonable access to a social minimum in this sense. We shall refer to this set of institutions and policies as a “social minimum policy regime”. In the discussion that follows we shall often speak of “enacting a social minimum”. Enactment is a somewhat legalistic word, but we intend the term to be understood broadly here; “enacting a social minimum” means putting in place a social minimum policy regime. (Strictly speaking, we should perhaps speak of “enacting a social minimum policy regime”; but “enacting a social minimum” is a less clumsy phrase, and these comments should suffice to make clear what we mean by it.) These concepts—of the social minimum and of a social minimum policy regime—are intended to be quite abstract, and they clearly raise further questions. These include:

How do we specify the level and kind of resources that people need “to lead a minimally decent life in their society”?
What do we mean by speaking of “reasonable access” to a social minimum?

We shall now explore question (1) in sections 1.1–1.3, turning to question (2) in section 1.4.

A further preliminary point will be helpful to note first, however. When we speak of a ‘society’ enacting a social minimum, this term can be taken in different ways. We could be referring to a national society and thus to the enactment of a social minimum by a national government. Or we could be talking about a society at a transnational or the global level, and to the enactment of a transnational or global social minimum. In the discussion that follows, we will assume a national context as the baseline for discussion but many of the arguments are also relevant to a transnational or global context.

1.1 Welfare, capabilities, and resources

If we are concerned with enacting a social minimum what are we ultimately trying to secure a minimum of?

This relates to a wider question on political philosophy about how we should understand the ultimate focus of concern when assessing economic distributions. Three possible answers to this question are: welfare; capabilities; and resources.

The first position suggests that what we should be aiming for in enacting a social minimum is a minimum of welfare for all. “Welfare” here is understood in one of two ways. In classical Utilitarian thinking, pioneered by Jeremy Bentham, welfare refers to happiness which, in turn, is understood as the net balance of pleasure over pain that the individual experiences (Bentham 1789). On this view, in assessing how well off someone is in life, we should look at how happy they are, that is, at the net balance of pleasure over pain in their life. In more recent economic writings, welfare is identified with desire-satisfaction; people have more or less welfare, and so have better or worse lives in a fundamental sense, depending on how far they satisfy their desires.

Welfarism has been subject to compelling criticism. While we do not have the space here to review the critique of welfarism in depth, two apparent problems may be noted. One is the problem of adaptive preferences. If people are born into deprived circumstances, then they might adjust their expectations so that they are satisfied with their lot. Even though they are poor, they are happy, or don’t suffer from much frustration of desire, because they have adapted to life in which they have few resources at their command. But, as Amartya Sen asks of a person in this situation,

Can we possibly believe that he is doing well just because he is happy and satisfied? Can the living standard of a person be high if the life that he or she leads is full of deprivation? (Sen 1987a: 8)

Another problem, according to the critics, is that it is wrong to think that all that has fundamental value in a human life is how much happiness or desire-satisfaction this life contains. Being happy is a valuable achievement, to be sure; but critics argue that it is hardly the only thing that matters, in a fundamental way, for how well our lives are going (Sen 1987b, 1992, 1999, 2009: chapters 11–14).

These two thoughts have inspired a second position on how we should conceive of the ultimate focus of distributional concern. Pioneered by the economist, Amartya Sen, this is known as the capability approach. Sen’s analysis starts with a definition of a person’s well-being as constituted by the “functionings” that they achieve:

… beings and doings [which]…can vary from such elementary things as being adequately nourished, being in good health, avoiding escapable morbidity and premature mortality, etc., to more complex achievements such as being happy, having self-respect, taking part in the life of the community, and so on. (Sen 1992: 39)

Note that “functionings” here include welfarist concerns, such as “being happy”, but are not confined to such concerns. A person’s capability is then defined by Sen as their power to achieve functionings: “a set of vectors of functionings, reflecting the person’s freedom to lead one type of life or another” (Sen 1992: 40). On Sen’s view, then, we should assess how well off a person is by looking at how far they possess a range of important capabilities. These might include a capability for welfare in either or both senses defined above, but will not be restricted to this one capability. A social minimum is understood as the bundle of resources necessary to endow people with a decent basic range and level of capabilities in this sense.

The challenge for advocates of the capabilities approach, however, is then to explain which functionings and capabilities matter in a fundamental way. What capabilities ought to feature on our list when we come to make assessments of how well off people are? The worry is that any list we draw up will reflect one rather specific, perhaps sectarian understanding of what gives value and meaning to life, an understanding that other people might reasonably reject. In short, the worry is that the capabilities approach will either be too abstract to be of any use, or else will be insufficiently neutral as between different reasonable ethical conceptions (conceptions, that is, of what gives value and meaning to life).

This concern, combined with the aforementioned concerns about welfarism, motivates a third view about how to conceive what is of ultimate concern in assessing economic distributions: resourcism. Resourcism reflects the concern to try to find an appropriately neutral way of assessing the respective advantage in life enjoyed by different people. The idea is that although reasonable people disagree about what gives life fundamental value and meaning, they can nevertheless agree that it is important to hold certain “all-purpose means” for the pursuit of whatever plans of life they have (see, for example, Rawls 1993: 187–190). In the simplest imaginable version of resourcism, we might focus solely on the level of income and/or wealth someone has in making a judgment about how well off they are in a fundamental sense.

The problem with resourcism, however, is that it looks potentially “fetishistic” (Sen 1992): it asks us, in its simplest form, to focus on resource holdings—income/wealth—without considering what different people can do or be in virtue of these holdings. Individuals’ needs differ, e.g., due to differences in health conditions. Resourcism, at least in its most straightforward form, seems not to take account of this variability. Sen and others argue that it is a merit of the capability approach that it is sensitive to these differences – the approach advises that individuals might require different amounts of resources to achieve a given level of capability. Ronald Dworkin’s theory of ‘equality of resources’ can be seen as trying to address this problem by, in effect, regarding differences in needs as a kind of difference in ‘resources’ (for example, a person who needs more income to achieve something due to a health condition is said to have fewer ‘resources’ by virtue of this health condition and therefore as a candidate for getting additional income). However, and putting aside other objections to this theory, one can ask whether it is ultimately just using the language of ‘resources’ to try to talk about what Sen calls capabilities. It seems better to talk explicitly in terms of capabilities (see also Oosterlaken 2020 for a discussion of the resourcist-capability theorist debate).

1.2 An ecumenical-capabilities conception of the social minimum?

To adopt the capability approach, however, we do need to address the objection that it is potentially sectarian: to avoid the problem of resource-“fetishism”, it asks us to consider whether or not people have certain specific capabilities that are allegedly central to the good life, but there is then a danger of specifying a list that some regard as too biased towards one ethical doctrine or societal culture than another – an issue which is perhaps even more pressing if we are considering a social minimum at a transnational or global level. One response to this apparent dilemma is to try to develop a self-consciously “ecumenical” version of the approach. Aware of the danger of sectarianism, the capabilities theorist seeks to identify capabilities that are genuinely important to people across a wide range of reasonable ethical doctrines and societal cultures; and they seek to find ways to make the application of the approach sensitive to ethical and cultural diversity. Such an approach offers one way of elaborating what we mean by a social minimum: the resources necessary for a person to lead a “minimally decent life in their society” can be understood as the resources necessary to hold a specified range of ecumenically significant capabilities, taking due account of the society’s understanding of how these capabilities are typically realized.

An approach of this kind has been developed by Martha Nussbaum (see especially Nussbaum 1990, 1992, 1999, 2000, 2007). Nussbaum believes we can identify a set of vitally important capabilities by posing the question:

What activities characteristically performed by human beings are so central that they seem constitutive of a life that is truly human? (Nussbaum 1999: 39)

More concretely: What activities and related capabilities seem important to us when we consider whether someone who has undergone a major change in their capacities is still capable of a human life? What activities and related capabilities are important to people when they differentiate between the human and the non-human (sub-human or superhuman) in, say, constructing stories? Proceeding inductively through reflection on these questions, Nussbaum claims to identify a range of “central human functional capabilities”, capabilities people must have if they are to be able to live a truly human life. These include (for more details, see Nussbaum 1999: 40–41):

  1. the capability for physical survival;
  2. the capability for bodily health;
  3. the capability for bodily integrity;
  4. the capability for the exercise of imagination;
  5. the capability for emotional response and exploration;
  6. the capability for practical reason;
  7. the capability for love and friendship;
  8. the capability for connection with nature and other species;
  9. the capability for play;
  10. the capability for the exercise of control over environment, including political control.

Adopting this approach, then, we would elaborate the concept of the social minimum by agreeing on a specific list of capabilities, such as that above, as necessary to a “minimally decent life”, and by working out the kinds and levels of resources that people need to have these capabilities to an adequate extent. The above list is clearly pitched at a high level of generality, and so it will make sense in applying this approach to consider how the various capabilities are typically manifested in particular national societies. At the same time, such a list arguably provides a safeguard against excessive cultural relativism in thinking about the social minimum. If we can see no way in which a given capability on the list is adequately satisfied for a given group, then we must conclude that the society is denying these people the opportunity to lead a “minimally decent life”. The idea of the social minimum can in this way have some critical bite in evaluating existing social arrangements.

One important complicating factor must be noted here. Consider item (2) on Nussbaum’s list, the capability for bodily health. What does it mean for people to have this capability to an adequate extent? There is, after all, probably no limit to how far a society could go in increasing this capability for its members by devoting more and more of its resources to this end. At what point can we say that it is doing enough? This is the problem of limit-setting: the problem of determining in a fair way, and in a way that has legitimacy for those concerned, just what level of coverage for a given capability is satisfactory, given the commitment to ensure that everyone has reasonable access to the resources necessary for a minimally decent life. We shall not consider this problem further here, but we will return to it in section 3.3 below.

We should note that Nussbaum’s attempt to define a determinate list of key or basic capabilities like the above is controversial. Critics object that the approach is too rooted in a theorist’s specific vision of what is valuable in a human life, and that it may therefore be not sensitive enough to reasonable differences of view (for discussion, see Robeyns 2005, 2006). Similar approaches to Nussbaum’s, which employ the notion of “human needs”, have similarly controversial elements (see especially Doyal and Gough 1991).[1] But some disagreement of this kind seems unavoidable when we try to specify a standard for judging whether people enjoy a “minimally decent life”. Along with the problem of limit-setting, this creates a potential problem of political legitimacy in the specification and enactment of the social minimum to which we shall return below (see section 3.3). An important challenge in practice is to steer a course between an overly prescriptive listing of desirable capabilities by, say, academic philosophers and an overly subjective listing that might be prone to problems such as adaptive preferences (for helpful discussions, see Robeyns 2005, 2006, Wolff and De-Shalit 2007, and Claassen 2020).

1.3 The social minimum and relative deprivation

We have said that a social minimum is the bundle of resources necessary for someone to live a minimally decent life in their society. Let’s say we are talking, for the moment, about a particular national society.

The question arises of how far the resources we need to live a minimally decent life in a given national society are affected by the general level of opulence of this society. Is the social minimum higher in nations that are wealthier than others? This question is closely related to a question that has long exercised students of income and wealth distribution: Is poverty a matter of absolute income or of relative income (or both)? Many studies of poverty assume that poverty has a relative dimension. Estimates of the number of households in poverty then take as the ‘poverty line’ a level of income that is some fraction (say 50%) of average household income, adjusted for differences in household size. Thus, if the incomes of the poor at time t2 are the same as they were at time t1, and in this time average income has increased, then on this approach we would have to conclude that the people who were poor at t1 have become even poorer at t2 even though their absolute income level has not changed. This clearly makes sense only if one thinks that poverty is a matter of how well off people are in income terms relative to others in their society. However, this way of thinking about poverty invites the objection that the researcher is confusing poverty with inequality. Critics argue that if one group has become worse off in income terms relative to others then inequality has increased, but this does not mean that poverty has, especially if the group in question remains just as well off as before in terms of its absolute level of income.

The ecumenical-capabilities approach outlined above offers reasonable support for the claim that the social minimum does vary with a nation’s level of income/wealth, and in turn, for the claim that poverty can increase when a group falls further behind the rest of a national society in terms of its income. Following Sen, capabilities theorists argue that even if the capabilities that define a minimally decent life remain basically the same across nations of varying income levels, the resources needed to have a given capability will be greater, in the case of some capabilities, the richer one’s nation is. In other words, the resource cost of a given capability will tend to increase with national income. According to Sen:

To lead a life without shame, to be able to visit and entertain one’s friends, to keep track of what is going on and what others are talking about…requires a more expensive bundle of goods and services in a society that is generally richer, and in which most people have, say, means of transport, affluent clothing, radios or television sets, etc.. (Sen 1987a: 18)

For this reason at least, the level and content of the social minimum in a given national society will to some extent be relative to the average income of this society; and, accordingly, it will make sense to define the poverty line in relation to (as some fraction of) average income.

One idea that plays a particularly important role in discussions of this issue is that of self-respect. People have an interest in (capability for) self-respect (on which, see Rawls 1971 [1999]: 386–391). But, so the argument runs, our self-respect depends on our being able to maintain a style of life that is sufficiently similar to that of our fellow citizens. We will perhaps look inferior, and start to feel inferior, if we do not wear the sort of clothes that our fellow citizens wear, participate in the social activities that they do, and so on. If self-respect depends on relative consumption in this way, and “a minimally decent life” is one that includes our being able to enjoy self-respect, then the social minimum is properly seen as being relative to average income and the levels of consumption that can be sustained on this level of income.

On the other hand, there is almost certainly a lower limit to this relativity. If the average income level in a nation is very low indeed, then even people with high income in relation to this average might well lack the resources needed to lead a minimally decent life. For example, if people in a given nation cannot eat well enough to avoid malnutrition on an income that is twice the national average, then even some people who are relatively rich in this nation will still be living below the level of the social minimum. For this reason, it also seems essential to hold to an idea of an absolute global social minimum alongside that of nationally-specific minima.

1.4 Reasonable access to the social minimum

Let us imagine that we have settled on an acceptable definition of what is necessary for a person to enjoy a “minimally decent life in their society”. We now wish to enact a social minimum to ensure that all members of a society have reasonable access to the resources necessary to lead such a life. A key term here is “reasonable access”. What is meant by this term? Why not say simply that society should ensure that its members have the resources they need to lead a minimally decent life? Why take this apparently roundabout way of expressing things by saying that they ought to have reasonable access to such resources, rather than the resources themselves?

We use this formulation so as to keep open at this stage some important questions about the terms on which people may/ought to receive these resources. It is tempting to think of enacting a social minimum as introducing institutions and policies that will give people the resources necessary to lead a minimally decent life in their society. However, this is possibly too restrictive an understanding of what it can mean to enact a social minimum. To see why, consider the following case. There is an individual, called Arya, who is unemployed and hence unable to buy food and shelter. As things stand, Arya lacks the resources necessary to lead a minimally decent life; they are living, as we might say, below the social minimum. However, the government responds to their plight by offering them a job with a wage equal to the level of the social minimum. Now, provided that Arya is able to work, and the work in question is not demeaning or punitive, or the terms of employment otherwise unfair, we can reasonably say that if the government does this for all those in Arya’s position then, for them, it has enacted a social minimum. But clearly it has not given Arya and others like them a social minimum. Rather, it has intervened in a way that provides Arya and these others with reasonable access to the social minimum.

Now it might well be that in some cases—perhaps, in the majority of cases—the most appropriate way to ensure reasonable access to the social minimum is precisely to give people the resources in question. If, say, Arya is simply unable to do a job, then offering them the job will not provide reasonable access to the social minimum. It will be appropriate just to give them the social minimum. And, as we shall see below (see section 3.2), some philosophers argue that the ethically most defensible policy is to give everybody a social minimum, rather than conditioning the social minimum on work or some other kind of behavior. However, this is just one view of the form that the social minimum policy regime should take, and it would be inappropriate to build this specific view into our very definition of what a social minimum policy regime is, and thus, of what it means to enact a social minimum. The substantive ethical debate about the desirability of “conditionality”—making resources conditional on behaviour, such as work-related activity—is one we shall return to below (see section 3.2).

2. Why a social minimum?

Hopefully, we have now clarified what a social minimum is and what it means to enact a social minimum. These clarificatory concerns met, we can now consider why we might want to enact a social minimum. As noted in the introduction, we shall review a number of influential theories of social justice asking, with respect to each theory, what support (if any) it can give to the case for enactment. The five theories to be reviewed are: utilitarianism; libertarianism; left-libertarianism; egalitarian liberalism; and relational egalitarianism.

2.1 Utilitarianism

Utilitarianism is the view that actions and institutions should be judged on how far they produce welfare (or “utility”) for people (or for all beings capable of experiencing welfare). In its classical form, utilitarianism demands that social institutions be arranged so as to maximize the sum total of happiness, understood as pleasure net of pain, while in its more contemporary version it calls for these institutions to maximize the sum total of desire-satisfaction. In calculating this total, utilitarianism insists on a principle of equality: each person’s utility counts equally with that of every other person (Mill 1861).

Utilitarianism has sometimes been a major inspiration for reformers concerned to establish a welfare state so as to enact a social minimum. It is not hard to see why. Imagine a society that leaves the distribution of income to the market so that incomes are distributed very unequally. Let’s say we think that there is some level of income, Y, which people typically need to lead a minimally decent life. The inequality in this society is such that some people have income levels below Y. However, it is possible for the government to introduce tax-transfer schemes that will guarantee that the poorest members of a society have reasonable access to Y. Now if the marginal utility of income diminishes as people get more income, then it seems quite likely that the shift from the free-market economic system to the system with the social minimum policy regime will produce a net gain in society’s overall utility. Quite simply, the utility that the poor gain as a result of the shift to the social minimum system is likely to be greater than the utility lost by the rich in moving to this system (given the assumption of the diminishing marginal utility of income). Clearly, given that the utilitarian focus is on welfare as the good in human life, a utilitarian conception of the social minimum will be welfarist in kind: the social minimum will be seen as the bundle of resources necessary to ensure a life with a minimally acceptable level of happiness or desire-satisfaction. However, as a matter of policy, a utilitarian might readily support enactment of a social minimum inspired by some version of the capabilities approach because, for the reason given above, they judge the social minimum policy package in question as promoting an increase in aggregate welfare. (For a discussion of the utilitarian rationale for enactment of a social minimum, see Brandt 1981.)

From a utilitarian point of view, however, the foregoing argument for the enactment of some form of social minimum is not conclusive. There are arguments that can be made from within the utilitarian framework that tell against enactment of a social minimum (whether conceived in capabilities or welfarist terms).

The main utilitarian argument against enactment of a social minimum appeals to the idea of incentives. The argument begins with the claim that if we make a shift from a free-market economic system to a system with a social minimum policy regime, we will reduce incentives to work, save and be entrepreneurial. The rich will allegedly work less hard, save less and be less entrepreneurial, because they are being more heavily taxed to pay for the social minimum policy regime. The poor will allegedly work less hard, save less, and so on, because they have a welfare safety-net to fall back on. As a result of this dampening of incentives, it is possible that total income will be lower, or the growth of total income will be slower, under the economic system with the social minimum policy regime than under the free-market system. These economic impacts might result in lower aggregate welfare in the system with the social minimum policy regime than in the free-market system. If so, then as utilitarians, we must not enact a social minimum.

Of course, it is possible that these concerns about incentives and damage to the economy are much exaggerated and that a utilitarian perspective consequently will support enacting a social minimum. Nevertheless, it is important to see how a specifically utilitarian perspective does leave the justification of enacting a social minimum dependent on these empirical claims about how this affects the economy - and thereby aggregate welfare - overall.

2.2 Libertarianism

If utilitarianism’s criterion of justice is aggregate welfare, libertarianism’s is individual rights. Individuals are “inviolable”: they have rights, and these rights may not be violated even for the sake of increasing aggregate welfare—indeed, even for the sake of preventing the wider violation of rights (Nozick 1974: 28–35).

If we ask exactly what rights the individual has, on the libertarian view, then a large part of the answer is that the individual is endowed with the rights of self-ownership. Someone enjoys self-ownership, in the relevant sense, when they have full private ownership of their own body and abilities (Cohen 1995: 68). A corollary of the idea of self-ownership is the idea that individuals do not have any non-contractual obligations to use their labor for the benefit of others. In exercising their rights of self-ownership, people may contract with others to offer them specified services and benefits. But if the state forces people to provide such services and benefits without the consent of the individuals concerned, it violates their rights of self-ownership. It would, so the argument runs, treat the individuals concerned as if they are state-owned assets, to be pressed into service for the good of others at the state’s discretion. Now, in order to enact a social minimum, it seems likely that the state will have to impose a non-contractual obligation on high earning citizens to transfer resources to the less fortunate who are otherwise at risk of falling below the level of the social minimum. But this apparently violates the self-ownership rights of the high earners (because it apparently forces them to share the ‘fruits of their labours’ with others without their consent). For this reason, libertarianism looks like an unpromising basis on which to defend enactment of a social minimum.

However, things are not quite so clear-cut. Return to the question of exactly what rights individuals have on the libertarian view. The concept of self-ownership provides a large part of, but cannot provide the whole, answer to this question. For the world does not only contain people, but a wide variety of external resources, such as land. What kind of rights do we have in relation to these other resources? If we believe that individuals can come to have private property rights in these resources, no less inviolable than those they have in relation to their own bodies and abilities, we need to know how the individuals concerned acquire these property rights. Part of the answer the libertarian gives is that if we acquire a resource through voluntary exchange with someone who already owns it (legitimately), then we come to own the resource (an aspect of what Nozick calls “justice in transfer”; Nozick 1974: 150–153). But if we trace the history of such trades back there will be a point at which the resource in question did not have an owner; someone, somehow, made an unowned resource—a piece of land, say—their private property. But how can this happen? In Robert Nozick’s terms, the libertarian must given an account of “justice in acquisition” (Nozick 1974: 151, 174–182).

The nature of justice in acquisition is a source of controversy amongst libertarians. Assuming that the external resources we have in mind are initially unowned, one might argue that specific individuals can appropriate resources as private property by “mixing” their self-owned powers with the resources concerned. This thought, which we find in the work of John Locke (Locke 1689: Book 2, chapter 5), is that individuals integrate something they already own (their labor) with something initially unowned (say, a piece of land), and, thereby, come to own what they initially did not own. However, some libertarians, such as Nozick, follow Locke in arguing that appropriation through the exercise of self-owned powers is just only if it does not harm those who, following appropriation, lose access to the resource. This condition (often referred to as the Lockean Proviso) can be elaborated in various ways. In Nozick’s influential statement of the libertarian view, the condition is apparently elaborated as follows (see Nozick 1974: 174–182; and, for helpful interpretation, Wolff 1991: 107–115): an act of appropriation of a previously unowned resource is just only if no person is thereby made worse off than they would be in a world where all external resources remain unowned. In a world in which all external resources remain unowned, each person would be able to reach a certain level of welfare by using the resources that lie about unowned. For any given individual, i, let us denote this welfare level as Wi. A given act of appropriation is just, then, provided that, post-appropriation, each individual remains able to reach at least Wi. (Note that Wi may differ between particular individuals because of their unequal abilities to produce things in the “state of nature” in which all external resources remain unowned.)

The implication of this account of justice in acquisition is that any regime of private property rights is just only provided that every person living under said regime is able to achieve Wi—the welfare level that they would have been able to achieve in a world in which all external resources remain unowned. Many libertarians, including Nozick, express optimism that a private property regime will be able to provide people with the opportunity to achieve this welfare level. But it is conceivable that in the normal operation of the economy, a private property regime might at some times, for some people, fail to provide access to this level of welfare. If so, then justice—as the libertarian understands it—demands that the state act to correct the distribution of welfare generated by the spontaneous play of market forces. Specifically, the state must compensate anyone who, due to the existing allocation of private property rights in external resources, cannot otherwise achieve Wi. According to at least one influential libertarian philosopher, Robert Nozick, our basic rights thus include not only our rights of self-ownership, but this right to welfare as well.

In order to satisfy this right, a libertarian system might have to run some assistance programs for the very poor. To some extent, then, even a libertarian state might have some government programs that resemble those we associate with a social minimum policy regime. It is in this very limited sense that even a libertarian theory of justice might lend support to the enactment of at least a partial social minimum (see also the discussion in Brock 1998a and Sterba 1998).[2]

That said, it is highly unlikely that this argument can be used to support the enactment of anything like a full social minimum. This is so for at least two reasons. Firstly, for most, if not all, people Wi is likely to be very low, precisely because it is the welfare level we could get in a world with no property rights regime to stabilize expectations about the use of resources and, therefore, a world without the huge productivity gains that come from stabilizing such expectations. Hence, the level of assistance entailed by the libertarian right to welfare is likely in general to fall well short of what is needed to ensure people the capabilities for a “minimally decent life” in their society. Secondly, it is important to recall that Wi will almost certainly vary across people according to the nature of their personal, self-owned capacities. Those who are born with a good endowment of productively applicable talents will obviously fare better in the state of nature, in which all external resources remain unowned, than, for example, those who are born with capacities that make it harder for them to engage in production. In the case of some of the latter, Wi may be close to zero—zero denoting the outcome of starving to death in the state of nature. Thus, if these people happen to be unfortunate enough to be starving to death in a real-world private property rights regime, they may well have no claim to assistance under the libertarian right to welfare: this right does not demand that they be prevented from starving if this is what would happen to them in the baseline world in which all external resources remain unowned.

We may conclude that libertarianism gives only contingent and very weak support for the enactment of a social minimum. Indeed, except in some very rare instances, libertarianism implies that enactment of a full social minimum is unjust.

2.3 Left-libertarianism

However, not all libertarians—those who endorse the principle of self-ownership—agree with the theory of justice in acquisition that we find in Nozick’s work. According to some philosophers, sometimes referred to as left-libertarians, the principle of self-ownership should be combined with a more egalitarian principle of division of initially unowned external resources. Thus, if we imagine a group of people who find themselves transported to a previously uninhabited planet, the left-libertarian holds that each of these people has the rights of self-ownership plus a right to an equal, per capita share of this planet’s initially unowned external resources (see, for example, Steiner 1994, and Vallentyne and Steiner 2000a,b).

There is a lively debate amongst left-libertarians as to which goods count as external resources for purposes of equal division, but virtually all would agree that these resources must include society’s inheritance of land. Some would argue that the pool of resources for equal division should also include the capital stock that one generation inherits from past generations. More recently, it has been suggested that “job assets” and the value of the genetic information that we carry as individuals should also be included in the pool for equal division (see, respectively, Van Parijs 1992, 1995, and Steiner, 1994).[3]

Left-libertarianism seems to hold more promise of justifying something like a social minimum than conventional libertarianism. To be sure, a left-libertarian regime will not permit the redistribution of labor incomes by the state as this violates the core libertarian commitment to respect the rights of self-ownership. But the parallel commitment to equal division of initially unowned external resources will ensure that every person starts life with at least some external resources, or a monetary equivalent. To see how this may transform the prospects of those on low incomes, it may help to go back for a moment to the people whom we just imagined being transported to a new planet. On arrival, the people find that on the planet there is a single external resource, uncultivated land, all units of which are of homogeneous quality. Their own population is divided into two groups, a majority who are able to work the land and a minority that are much less able to do this (here we follow Cohen 1995: chapter 4). Now we saw in our discussion of libertarianism above how, under a Nozick-style regime, members of the minority might well have no justice-based claim to assistance against the majority, and, in consequence, could starve. Under a left-libertarian regime, however, the government is obliged to give each person an equal share of the planet’s land. Those unable to work well will be able to sell or lease their share to members of the majority group, and can thereby derive an income from this source. They will thus be at least somewhat better off than under the Nozick-style regime.

In practice, left-libertarians do not propose that we actually divide land and other resources up in this literal way. Instead, following the argument of agrarian radicals such as Thomas Spence and Tom Paine, they argue that the individual should receive a monetary grant reflecting their fair share of society’s external resources, such as land (on Spence and Paine, see Vallentyne and Steiner 2000b). The level of this grant will depend on a host of factors, but it is possible that it will be equivalent—or even higher—in value to the bundle of resources needed to enjoy a minimally decent life in the society in question. Thus, depending on the circumstances of the society in question, left-libertarian principles of justice might support a policy that is more or less equivalent to the enactment of a full social minimum.

Nevertheless, it is clearly important to emphasize the word “might” in the previous sentence. There is no reason why the basic grant we have imagined must be of equivalent value to a full social minimum. Indeed, if the relevant external assets are abundant, so that their market price is low, then the level of the grant might not come anywhere near this level. In such a situation, respect for self-ownership will rule out taking labor incomes to top up the grant. It is possible, therefore, that some people will be left with a level of resources below that necessary to lead a minimally decent life (see Cohen 1995: chapter 4, especially pp. 102–105). Thus, while left-libertarianism offers stronger support for enactment of a social minimum than conventional libertarianism does, this support is still highly contingent, and in many situations left-libertarianism will probably rule out as unjust the course of action needed to enact a full social minimum (taxation of labor incomes). Moreover, even if the resource grant is high enough to provide a full social minimum, some left-libertarians would argue that individuals should receive their basic grant as a capital lump-sum at the start of their adult life rather than as a periodic income payment and/or as a freely available bundle of services.[4] This raises the possibility that some people might “blow” their grants early in their adult lives and might then lack ready access to a social minimum.

2.4 Egalitarian liberalism

Within contemporary political philosophy, egalitarian liberalism seeks to present an alternative both to utilitarianism and to the two versions of libertarianism discussed above. Egalitarian liberals agree with libertarians that utilitarianism fails to take seriously the inviolability of the person. Unlike libertarians, however, egalitarian liberals do not think that respect for the inviolability of the person commits us to the principle of self-ownership (for more on this issue, see section 3.1.2 below). Consequently, they feel much less compunction in advocating tax-transfer schemes, which the libertarian finds objectionable, so as to secure a full social minimum. Indeed, they argue that justice demands that we do introduce such schemes. Let us take a look at one influential egalitarian liberal theory of justice, and its implications for the justifiability of enacting a social minimum (see also Dworkin 1985, 2000).

John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice, first published in 1971 (with a revised edition in 1999) poses an intriguing question: What principles would you accept to govern your society if you did not know your actual or likely position in this society? In practice, we are all aware of the religion we have (if we have one), we have some sense of the natural abilities we have been born with, and the advantages or disadvantages we have gained from our social background. But, for a moment, envisage that we did not know such things and possessed only very general information about the kind of society we are going to live in. Behind this “veil of ignorance”, not knowing our religion, natural ability, or social background, what principles would we choose to govern the institutions that affect the distribution of “primary goods” like income and wealth?

Famously, Rawls argues that in an “original position” of this kind, parties will choose to arrange social and economic inequalities so that

they are both (a) to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged and (b) attached to offices and positions open to all under conditions of fair equality of opportunity. (Rawls 1971 [1999]: 72)

Simplifying somewhat, part (a) of this formulation tells us that inequality in goods like income and wealth is just if it is arranged so that the group that is worst-off under this inequality is better off than it would be under any other level of inequality. Rawls calls this the difference principle.[5]

Many critics have found Rawls’s argument for the difference principle unconvincing (see, for example, Kymlicka 2001: 60–70). They ask why people behind the veil of ignorance would not choose to gamble, selecting an alternative principle that is less favorable to the disadvantaged in society than the difference principle but which would give higher rewards than this principle should one turn out in fact to belong to one of the more favored social classes. However, even if this is valid as a criticism of Rawls’s argument for the difference principle, it can be argued that Rawls’s thought experiment nevertheless provides strong intuitive support for those who believe that justice requires at least the enactment of a social minimum. For while most people placed behind the veil of ignorance might not be so risk averse as to choose the difference principle to govern their society, it is reasonable to suppose that most would at least be concerned to insure themselves against the danger of desperate poverty and would hence desire principles of justice that ensure everyone reasonable access to a social minimum. Interestingly, efforts by psychologists to model decision-making in situations akin to the original position show that people in practice tend to choose a principle that calls for the maximization of average well-being but subject to the constraint that nobody falls below a specified floor (see Frolich and Oppenheimer 1992).

Further support for the enactment of a social minimum from within Rawls’s theory comes from his discussion of the importance of the “strains of commitment” in determining what is just (Rawls 1971 [1999]: 153–160). The parties behind the veil of ignorance must recognize that they are selecting principles of justice that, having been chosen, they must stick with in social life for good. Thus, before they make their decision, they must honestly ask whether, should they turn out to be the most disadvantaged under a chosen set of principles, they could really bear the strains of commitment entailed by living under these principles. Again, it is debatable as to whether this consideration points unequivocally to the difference principle as the appropriate principle to govern the distribution of income and wealth. However, it seems plausible that this consideration would rule out any principles that do not ensure everyone reasonable access to the resources needed for a minimally decent life. How could one honestly commit to the strains of living in a society that did not guarantee you this? This consideration reinforces the argument that the parties behind the veil of ignorance would choose principles of justice that assure everyone of reasonable access to a social minimum.

Moreover, it might be argued that even if one rejects the veil of ignorance thought experiment as a way of exploring what justice consists in, the strains of commitment idea still has force as a consideration favoring the enactment of a social minimum. Even if one has full knowledge of one’s own and others’ position in society, one can put oneself in the place of others and consider the kind of strains of commitment that they are likely to be suffering under the present system. If one does this, can one really give assent to a social system that, by failing to guarantee reasonable access to a social minimum for some people, puts some of your fellow citizens under what must be intolerable strains of commitment? Since one would surely find such strains intolerable oneself, how can one reasonably expect others to put up with them? (For more discussion of the strains of commitment, see Barry 1995: 61–67, and, with specific connection to case for the social minimum, see Waldron 1993a).

Rawls’s theory as it stands is, however, by no means the last word on justification of the social minimum. For example, Rawls’s own discussion abstracts away from disability but a theory of the social minimum obviously needs to include the claims of disabled people. How far can a ‘contractualist’ approach like that set out by Rawls be extended to include disabled people? (See Nussbaum 2006, chapter 2, for discussion of this question, and for wider discussions of justice and disability see Barnes 2016, Begon 2021.) Does a Rawlsian, egalitarian liberal approach need supplementing (or replacing with?) an alternative that can perhaps better capture the claims of disabled people?

2.5 Relational egalitarianism

Posing this question is one way to draw out the importance of another perspective on social justice, that of relational egalitarianism. This refers to perspectives in social philosophy that give priority to the promotion of equality in power and status relations (understood, let us assume, as a demand of justice; see Fraser 1998, Anderson 1999). Relational egalitarians will be concerned, for example, that disabled people have the capabilities they need to avoid domination by others and a ‘second class’ social status. Relational egalitarian perspectives are not necessarily sharply distinct from egalitarian liberal perspectives, but they do draw out and give more emphasis to considerations that are ignored or underexplored in at least some formulations of egalitarian liberalism (Young 1989).

One focus of concern for the relational egalitarian is with ensuring the effectiveness of citizens’ political liberties. In a political democracy, all citizens have rights to vote, to campaign, and to stand for political office in competitive elections (Dahl 1998). It seems likely that poverty can significantly diminish the effectiveness with which individuals can exercise these rights (for relevant empirical research on this issue, see Krishna 2006, Mood and Jonsson 2015). Someone who is wrapped up in the struggle for basic material well-being might simply lack the time and energy needed to focus on political issues. In addition, they will be less able to afford the monetary costs associated with political participation, e.g., paying party membership fees, making campaign contributions, and so on. This is bad for political democracy. It means that certain viewpoints and interests are not heard, so that policy becomes unfairly skewed against these viewpoints and interests. Hence it can be argued that it is straightforwardly good for a political democracy to enact a social minimum. By relieving the pressure of poverty, an enacted social minimum will enable all citizens to participate effectively in the democratic process, thereby ensuring that this process is indeed genuinely democratic.[6]

Power is not only exercised within and through the formal political process, however, but within and through a wide range of other social relationships. For example, employers can exercise power over their employees. Historically, husbands have often wielded great power over wives. These power relations can emerge in part because of inequalities in the economic positions between the parties (for very helpful discussions, to which we are here indebted, see Goodin 1986, 1988; Okin 1989: chapter 7). One party—the employer, the husband—might be able to do perfectly well financially without the other party. By contrast, the second party—the individual worker, the wife—might be financially reliant on the first party. Were the first party to exit from the relationship, this party would suffer little harm, but the second party would suffer a severe fall in living standards. Precisely because of this inequality in the costs of exiting from the relationship, the first party has the power to shape the relationship on their terms. The worker or wife is not in a position to argue with the employer’s or husband’s commands because the employer’s or husband’s threat to leave the relationship unless obedience is forthcoming will be at once credible (since they stand to lose little financially from exiting it) and compelling (because the worker or wife stand to lose so much financially if the employer or husband do go ahead and exit). Power inequalities of this kind are objectionable for a number of reasons. It can be argued that they directly reduce the freedom of the less powerful parties by subjecting them to ‘domination’ (Pettit 1997). They also put the less powerful parties at risk of exploitation and abuse by the more powerful parties (Goodin 1986, 1988; Okin 1989).

One important argument for the enactment of a social minimum is that this can help to reduce the exit costs from such relationships for the parties that are otherwise vulnerable, and so reduce these objectionable inequalities of power. For example, if a worker knows that the community will guarantee them a decent income even if they quit their current job, then this makes it much easier for them to stand up to the boss and refuse unreasonable demands. If a wife knows that the community will assist her financially if she leaves her husband, then the prospect of leaving him because he abuses her becomes more feasible for her. This can change the dynamic of these relationships, to some extent rebalancing the power relationships between the parties.

For these reasons, then, relational egalitarian perspectives on social justice offer strong support for the enactment of a social minimum (see also Pateman 2005). Indeed, it is hard to see how any society could retain relations characterised by equality of status and the absence of domination for long in the absence of people having reasonable access to a social minimum.

3. What can be said against the enactment of a social minimum?

Having reviewed arguments for the enactment of a social minimum, let us now consider some possible objections to enactment. We shall here consider three objections appealing respectively to the values of freedom, fairness, and legitimacy.

3.1 The freedom objection

One objection to enactment of a social minimum that arises in political discussion is that such enactment conflicts with respect for individual freedom. To enact a social minimum, a government must typically coercively tax and transfer resources and, in the view of some thinkers, this coercion is inherently objectionable. We shall consider two versions of this objection here. The first appeals to freedom understood as the absence of intentional coercion. The second appeals to the libertarian principle of self-ownership that we discussed above (see sections 2.2 and 2.3).

3.1.1 The crude freedom objection

According to writers in the so-called “classical liberal” tradition such as Friedrich Hayek, freedom consists in the absence of intentional coercion (see Hayek 1960). If the government requires one citizen, Bodhi, to pay taxes that will in turn be used to assist a less fortunate citizen, Arya, as part of the process of enacting a social minimum, then the government intentionally coerces Bodhi and, therefore, reduces Bodhi’s freedom. This is regrettable and, if we regard freedom as the most important political value, we should perhaps refrain from using governmental power to assist people like Arya in this way. The welfare of people like Arya might suffer; but freedom will be preserved.

The foregoing paragraph summarizes a common objection to government taxation for welfare programs, or what one might call the crude freedom objection to the enactment of a social minimum (see also Plant 1998: 67). How might a supporter of enacting a social minimum reply to this objection?

One type of reply is to argue that while taxation to establish a social minimum policy regime might reduce one kind of liberty, it will promote another, more valuable kind of liberty. According to this view, true or real liberty does not consist in the mere absence of intentional coercion, but in the positive capability or power to act in pursuit of significant goals, such as self-development. Poverty, so the argument runs, diminishes this true, “positive liberty”; by abolishing or alleviating poverty, welfare programs, financed through coercive taxation, increase the true, positive liberty of society’s more unfortunate members. The loss to the taxpayer in terms of “negative liberty” (liberty understood as the mere absence of intentional coercion) is, so the reply continues, morally outweighed by this gain in terms of “positive liberty”. This type of reply to the freedom objection has a long history (Freeden 1978).[7]

Despite its historical pedigree, however, this type of reply can be faulted both as inconclusive and as too concessionary to the classical liberal critic of taxation for welfare programs. It is inconclusive because, faced with the reply, the classical liberal critic can always simply counter-assert that “negative liberty” (again, liberty understood as the absence of intentional coercion) is actually the kind of liberty we should be primarily concerned with. We are then apparently at an impasse with each side in the debate asserting the greater value of one kind of liberty over another, or else merely trading competing definitions of what freedom “really” is. The reply is also too concessionary in that it too readily surrenders the value of “negative liberty” to the classical liberal critic of taxation for welfare spending. The argument for taxation and welfare spending can in fact be made using the very notion of freedom to which the classical liberal critic appeals. This argument is likely to offer a more telling reply to the critic than one that appeals to some other (alleged) kind of liberty (on this point, see Cohen 1988: chapter 14: 291–292).

The essential point here is that poverty usually entails a limitation of the kind of liberty that the classical liberal professes to be concerned with. One major reason why poverty typically “bites” into one’s quality of life is that it reduces the range of actions that one can perform without being subject to intentional coercion by others (see Waldron 1993b, Cohen 1997, Swift 2001: 70–71). Imagine, for example, that you are poor and that you wish to get a train from City A to City B. Because you are poor, you cannot buy a ticket for the journey. Because you get on the train without a ticket, the train guard makes you leave the train at Town C, long before you reach your intended destination of City B. Your ability to act as you wish has here been limited by the intentional coercion of others. Or imagine that you are homeless and unable to afford to rent a place to sleep. You locate a field in which to sleep. But the field belongs to someone else, and when the landowner discovers your presence by means of their closed-circuit television camera system they call the police who wake you up and drag you off the land. Once again, your ability to act as you wish is quashed by the intentional coercion of others. By the same token, if the government were to provide you with the money to buy a train ticket or to rent a space to sleep in, then you would become able to perform these actions without being subject to the intentional coercion that you are subject to when you lack this money.

Thus, taxation for welfare spending cannot be said simply to reduce “liberty”, understood as the absence of intentional coercion, in the name of some other value, such as welfare. Rather, it will tend to produce a different distribution of this kind of liberty. It will expose some to intentional coercion that they would otherwise not be exposed to; but, if it genuinely reduces poverty, it should also reduce the extent to which some people are exposed to intentional coercion. For this reason, it simply will not do to object that the enactment of a social minimum is undesirable because it will reduce individual liberty. For the decision not to enact a social minimum will also reduce the liberty of some individuals. If the freedom objection is to have any force, it must take a subtler form than that we have thus far considered.

3.1.2 The self-ownership objection

A second, subtler version of the freedom objection comes from libertarian philosophers committed to the principle of self-ownership. As we have seen, libertarians do not object to transfers of income and wealth which aim to make sure that each person receives their fair share of external resources (or fair compensation for others’ appropriation of their share). However, these transfers might not be enough to ensure that all enjoy a full social minimum. This insight has led some political philosophers to conclude that commitment to the enactment of a social minimum is ultimately incompatible with the libertarian commitment to respect the self-ownership of persons: we must be prepared to override certain claims of self-ownership, and forcibly transfer a portion of labor incomes from higher earners to the less well off, if a social minimum is to be enacted. But is this justifiable? After all, on the face of it, self-ownership seems like an attractive value, capturing some basic commitments we have to the freedom and inviolability of the individual (see Cohen 1995: chapter 3).

Imagine someone, Charlie, who has very high earnings potential. In order to ensure that everyone has reasonable access to a social minimum, the state announces that it will tax 50% of whatever income Charlie earns, and use the funds to raise the incomes of those with low earnings power. The libertarian, including the left-libertarian, will object that this violates Charlie’s rights of self-ownership. Should Charlie choose to work, half of their earnings will be funneled to others, and thus, if they choose to work, they have no choice under this tax regime but to assist others. In this way, the tax system may be said to “harness” Charlie’s talents and energies for the good of others. This effort-harnessing, alleges the libertarian, is inherently wrong; it puts Charlie in a position that is akin to that of a slave, forced to work for the good of others (Nozick 1974: 169).

In reply, some philosophers stress the kinds of freedoms that someone in Charlie’s position retains under the imagined tax regime, freedoms which make it absurd (and offensive), in the view of these philosophers, to compare their position to that of a slave. The tax regime we have described leaves the decision about how much to work to Charlie. It leaves the decision about what kind of job to do to Charlie. In short, taxation of labor incomes does not necessarily deny the worker who is taxed basic control over whether and how they deploy their talents (see especially Christman 1991); and so, according to this argument, there is nothing really objectionable about using such taxation to enact a social minimum. Yes, self-ownership has been limited; but, so the argument goes, nothing essential to personal liberty or self-determination has thereby been diminished.

3.2 The fairness objection

A different objection focuses on the alleged risk of unfairness in enacting a social minimum. Specifically, the unfairness objection is that public provision of a social minimum might lead some people to make inadequate effort to help themselves and that this is unfair to those whose efforts ultimately make the necessary resources available. Note that the behavior allegedly caused by social minimum programs might also or alternatively be considered a bad thing because of its effect on the benefit recipient, rather than (just) because of any unfairness to others. This thought motivates what one might call the dependency objection to enactment of a social minimum, in view of the alleged passivity or “dependency” induced by reliance on welfare benefits (see, for example, Tocqueville 1835, Murray 1984; see also Humboldt 1852). However, a good deal of what can be said in reply to the fairness objection also applies to this dependency objection, and so we will not lose much by focusing just on the fairness objection for present purposes.

Let’s start by stating the fairness objection more precisely. One version of the objection appeals to a principle of reciprocity. This says that if one willingly shares in the benefits created through the efforts of others in society, notably through their work, then one has an obligation to reciprocate by making a contribution to producing these benefits oneself, as long as one has the capacity and opportunity to do so (White 2003). The idea is not necessarily that you should produce in strict proportion to what you consume, but that one should try to ‘do one’s bit’, understanding society as a cooperative scheme to which all should contribute if they are able. Given this principle, the fairness objection to enacting a social minimum is that this could somehow lead to some people enjoying goods and services without satisfying their reciprocity-based obligation to work. To prevent this, the argument goes, we should not enact a social minimum.

As just stated, however, it seems like there is another obvious response to the fairness objection. Rather than not enacting a social minimum, we could instead enact a social minimum but include in the rules of the social minimum policy regime a work- or contribution-related condition. For example, if one claims cash benefits to assist with low income then eligibility for the benefits can be made conditional on work-related activity. We might call this, the principle of work-conditionality (for apparent endorsements of this principle, subject to widely varying degrees of qualification, see Anderson 1999: 321; Gutmann and Thompson 1996: chapter 8; Mead 1986, 1992, 1997; Rawls 2001: 179; White 2000, 2003, 2005). To be clear, by work-conditionality we mean conditions that link elements of the social minimum policy regime to some kind of employment-related activity, such as active job search or retraining, not necessarily to work itself. (‘Work’ is, moreover, a broader concept than ‘employment’, a point we shall return to below.)

This response to the fairness objection itself raises an important ethical question. Should the social minimum be enacted in a way that reflects the principle of work-conditionality? Space permits us here to consider just two of the more important sets of arguments against the principle of work-conditionality (for further, empirically informed discussions, see Watts and Fitzpatrick 2018, Dwyer 2019, Eleveld, Kampen and Arts 2020).

3.2.1 Vulnerability, equity, and the relevance of background injustice

A first important set of arguments against work-conditionality appeals to problems of vulnerability and equity in the application of work conditions in a social minimum policy regime, and, under non-ideal conditions, to the importance of considering the significance of background injustice.

One possible problem concerns vulnerability in the labor market. As we saw above in section 2.5, one rationale for having a welfare state to enact a social minimum is that, by providing access to urgently needed goods independently of the sale of labor-power, it can reduce the pressure on disadvantaged workers to scramble into poor quality (exploitative or abusive) jobs. There is a danger that work-conditionality rules undermine this desirable effect. If, for example, the government tells an unemployed person that they must look for a job and take any job offered by an employer on whatever terms this employer states, or else lose all welfare benefits, then this person will be under severe pressure to find and take a job. They will clearly have much less power to refuse jobs that involve exploitative or abusive treatment than if they received welfare benefits unconditionally. According to some critics, this is the whole point of work-conditionality: to weaken the bargaining position of labor in the interests of business and the property-owning classes (see Piven and Cloward 1993). A distinct but related objection is that work-conditionality might place a burden of “shameful revelation” on those claiming transfers: to qualify for transfers, they have to show that they have looked for a job, but failed to get one, which is potentially damaging to self-respect (Wolff 1998).

A second problem concerns the vulnerability of dependents. If someone is denied the full social minimum because they choose not to satisfy a work-conditionality rule then this will not only hurt them, but is likely also to hurt others who depend on them for an income such as their children (if they have children). Since these children are in no way responsible for their parents’ decision to ignore a work-conditionality rule, this hurt is surely unfair (and may undermine other social goals, such as achieving equality of educational opportunity for children from different social backgrounds).

A third problem is that work-conditionality rules may in practice lead to inequity between welfare recipients and other citizens. For example, what about those who inherit large amounts of wealth? What can be done to get these wealthier citizens to meet their reciprocity-based obligation to work? If nothing is done, then there is apparently a failure to enforce a given social obligation equitably: citizens who need welfare benefits will be forced to meet their obligation to work, but citizens who receive large inheritances will not be forced to meet this obligation. There is also a danger of inequity in the treatment of different kinds of work. If we think here of ‘work’ only as employment or market-facing work we will ignore the non-market care work that many do for children and other family members and friends. Arguably, at least some of this work also counts in satisfaction of the reciprocity-based obligation to ‘do one’s bit’ in society, and so there is an injustice if those doing this work – in most real-world societies, these people will be disproportionately women – are required also to do as much employment, market-facing work as others.

All of these points connect in turn to a basic, underlying question of how just are the society’s background economic structures. If society’s economic structures are just in other respects, then it may seem reasonable to expect each citizen who is able to work to do so. In a context of otherwise just social arrangements, then this seems part and parcel of fair social cooperation. But what if the background structures of the economy are actually unjust in other respects? For example, perhaps society’s educational institutions fail to secure sufficient equality of opportunity, unfairly leaving some citizens with limited job opportunities. Or perhaps the reward structure is unequal to an unfair extent, leaving some workers with unfairly low pay for the work they do. In this context, it can be argued that the underlying obligation to work, as an expression of fairness in social cooperation, does not in fact hold for those citizens who suffer unfair disadvantage. This point is made by Tommie Shelby in his discussion of the obligations of the Black ghetto poor in the USA:

…job opportunities for low-skilled workers are severely limited and the jobs that are available are often menial, dead-end service positions that pay wages too low to provide adequate economic security for a family. Now it might be replied that if the ghetto poor do not want to take these low-wage jobs they should develop their skills….As is widely known, however, the quality of education available to ghetto residents is generally so substandard that most cannot get a basic education there, let alone proper preparation for college….This lack of equal educational opportunity, which in turn creates an unfair employment opportunity scheme, vitiates any obligation to work… (Shelby 2007, 146–147; see also Shelby 2016, chapter 6.)

The putative, reciprocity-based obligation to work does not exist for those who are unjustly disadvantaged in the way described; hence, there can be no question of justice requiring enforcement of this supposed obligation. In addition, any attempt to enforce the non-existent obligation is likely to make the unjust disadvantage worse, for example, in the contemporary US context, by reinforcing degrading historical conceptions of Black people as people whom it is appropriate to force to work (see Shelby 2016, 197–200).

Taking these points on board, even some of those who have endorsed the principle of reciprocity and the basic idea of work-conditionality have also cautioned against applying work-conditionality in a way that is insensitive to the background distribution of wealth and opportunity in society (see, for example, Gutmann and Thompson 1996: chapter 8; White 2003, 2005; see also Daniels 1981: 160–162). They argue that the principle of work-conditionality should be suspended, or at least moderated, if the background distribution of wealth and opportunity is not sufficiently just. Indeed, given the risks involved, and the complexity of creating the conditions for the fair enforcement of work obligations, there is a case for avoiding work-conditionality altogether even if one accepts the underlying principle of reciprocity (White 2017).

3.2.2 The inheritance argument against conditionality

A further objection to making the social minimum work-conditional comes from philosophers influenced by the left-libertarian tradition reviewed above (see section 2.3). As we saw above, left-libertarians believe that, ideally speaking, individuals have a right to an equal share of resources that are an inheritance from nature or from past generations. Thus, imagine that ten people arrive on an island and find that it contains a factory containing ten machines. The machines can be used to produce the food, clothing and shelter that the islanders need to survive. The left-libertarian will argue that in principle each islander should receive one machine—that is, an equal share of the machines in the inherited factory. Now suppose that one of the ten islanders, call them Drew, decides not to work their machine but to rent it out to other islanders who are prepared to work it for a price. Drew does no work, but simply lives off the rent that other islanders pay them for the use of the machine that they have been allocated. Now, depending on how high the rent is, Drew could conceivably be receiving an income close to their society’s social minimum, and they will be doing no work in return for this income. But the left-libertarian will argue that this is not unjust because Drew is only here making use of their rightful share of society’s inherited goods. As we noted above, it is difficult in practice to divide inherited resources up literally in this way. But we can perhaps identify these resources, assess their market value, and give everyone a grant of income or wealth equivalent to a per capita share of the market value of these resources. Some people might choose to live off this grant without doing any work (or doing as little work as possible). But, according to the left-libertarian, this is no different to Drew deciding to do no work and to live off the rent they can get from charging others to work on their machine: it is a legitimate use of one’s rightful share of society’s inherited resources. Subject to important nuances and variations, a number of philosophers have employed this type of argument in recent years to defend the payment to each citizen of a universal basic income or a universal capital grant (see Steiner 1994; Van Parijs 1992, 1995; Ackerman and Alstott 1999; Dworkin 2000; Birnbaum 2012; Widerquist 2013; Bidadanure 2019).

There are, however, some difficulties with the argument, understood as an attempt to defend the enactment of a full social minimum without any work condition.

The first difficulty, already flagged up in our discussion of left-libertarianism in section 2.3, is that the grant which represents one’s rightful share of society’s inherited wealth might fall somewhat short of the value of the full social minimum.[8]

However, a second issue is whether people do in fact have a right to an equal share of their society’s inherited resources regardless of work effort. The basic issue is whether it is fair to use an inheritance, as Chris does in the example above, to extract a share of what other citizens produce while choosing not to make a productive contribution of one’s own in return.

It might be said that people like Drew do contribute to production – they do so by supplying their share of inherited resources for others to use for productive purposes. But a distinction can be made between the contribution that the inherited resources putatively credited to Drew make to production, and Drew’s own contribution. If Drew were not on the island we imagined, the other islanders could still use the inherited resources that we have supposed are otherwise credited to Drew. They could work just as hard, and produce just as much, as they do when Drew is there and is credited with an equal share of these resources. But they would be better off because they would not have to give a portion of this product to Drew in return for using some of the island’s inherited wealth. This, so the argument runs, shows that Drew themselves is not in any real sense contributing economically to the society. So is it fair for Drew to get an income without working (assuming that they could if they so choose)? Some argue that Drew has as much right to a share of the machines as anyone else and it is up to them what benefit they get from this (Van Parijs 1995, drawing on Dworkin 1985, 2000; Birnbaum 2012). Others argue that cases like this show that a just distribution of assets should be more sensitive to individuals’ own interest in making direct use of the assets (see van Donselaar 2009; see also Van der Veen 1998, White 2007).

To conclude, the concern for economic fairness (as reciprocity) does not offer grounds for rejecting enactment of a social minimum. At most, it supports making elements of a social minimum policy package work-conditional. However, there are strong arguments for limiting work-conditionality. One set of arguments appeals to the ways in which work-conditionality can enhance the vulnerability of citizens to exploitation or other forms of injustice and/or generate or exacerbate other inequities between citizens. This set of arguments has additional force in societies where background economic structures are otherwise significantly unjust (Shelby 2007, 2016, White 2017). Another kind of argument appeals to the idea that citizens have a right to a share of inherited assets that is not conditional with respect to willingness to work, though the scope and precise nature of this right remains disputed.

3.3 The legitimacy objection

A third objection to the enactment of a social minimum appeals to the value of legitimacy. A law or policy lacks legitimacy when the law or policy is arbitrary in the eyes of those bound by the law or policy—that is, they are not given a sufficiently good and accessible reason to justify their subjection to this law or policy. The absence of legitimacy signals a kind of alienation from the law or policy, so that people are unable to identify with it as an expression of what they value and believe. Critics might argue that the establishment of a social minimum policy regime creates distinctive problems of legitimacy for a society; and they might further argue that these problems make it undesirable, all things considered, to enact a social minimum. How might enactment of a social minimum generate problems of legitimacy? How can these problems be tackled? Do the problems really discredit the case for enactment?

One potential legitimacy problem is the capability-list problem that we noted above in section 1.2. To say what kind and level of resources are necessary for people to be able to lead “a minimally decent life in one’s society”, we must take a view about the functionings and capabilities that are constitutive of a decent human life, and any such view is bound to be somewhat controversial, perhaps especially if we are trying to define a social minimum transnationally or globally. Some people might not accept the capability-list used to determine the social minimum as the right list. We shall return briefly to this problem towards the end of this section, but only after first give some consideration to a second potential legitimacy problem which we also briefly noted in section 1.1: the limit-setting problem. To recall the problem, consider once again item (2) on Nussbaum’s list of “central human functional capabilities”, as set out in section 1.2, the capability for bodily health. What kind and level of access to health-care resources must a society secure for its members for us to say that this capability is satisfied to an extent that allows everyone to lead “a minimally decent life”? If we hold that a society must ensure access to whatever health-care resources have, say, a life-sustaining impact, then we may well be committing ourselves to spending the vast bulk of a society’s resources just on health-care. At some point limits must be set, or else the health-care sector will devour the whole social product (making it impossible, of course, to provide for other key capabilities). But, on the other hand, how can limits be set in a way that is fair and has legitimacy in the eyes of the people who will have to live with the consequences of these limit-setting decisions? How is it possible for communities to decide whether or not a new, expensive health-care treatment is in or out of the social minimum, and for this decision to have legitimacy in the eyes of the citizens?

These questions invite us to consider explicitly the political processes through which limit-setting (and other) decisions are made. It considers what features these processes must have if they are to treat all those bound by the decisions fairly, and in a way that all those concerned can regard as legitimate.

In the health-care context, the issue of limit-setting is explored in an important paper by Norman Daniels and James Sabin (Daniels and Sabin 1997). Daniels and Sabin argue that for limit-setting decisions in this context to have legitimacy, the decision-making process must satisfy four conditions (see Daniels and Sabin 1997: 322–325; also Ham and Robert 2003: 2):

  1. Publicity. The rationales for limit-setting decisions must be made public.
  2. Reasonableness. The rationales for limit-setting decisions should be reasonable; that is, they should appeal to reasons and principles that can be accepted as relevant by people who are disposed to look for reasons and principles agreeable to all.
  3. Contestability. There should be a mechanism through which decisions can be challenged, with adequate opportunity to present new arguments and evidence.
  4. Enforcement. There should be a mechanism for forcing the limit-setting body to respect the first three conditions.

The idea is not that the people who are affected by a given limit-setting decision will necessarily agree with this decision if these conditions are met, e.g., agree with a decision to exclude a specific medical treatment from the health-care package provided under the social minimum policy regime. Rather, the idea is that all parties will be able to regard the decision as legitimate, even if they disagree with it and some of them continue to oppose it. The conditions of publicity and reasonableness work to ensure that a given decision is grounded in reasons of a kind that affected parties can see at least see as relevant. The contestability condition helps to ensure that the reasonableness of the decision is robust, that all relevant reasons and evidence have indeed been weighed by the decision-making body in coming to its decision. In these circumstances, even the person who “loses” in such a case can feel assured that their interests and point of view have not been overruled arbitrarily. In this sense, they are fairly treated and the decision ought to have, even in their eyes, legitimacy, even if they continue to think it mistaken and oppose it.

The implication of the foregoing analysis is that those who wish to enact a social minimum need to give serious thought to the institutional structures through which limit-setting decisions are made, with an eye to seeing that the conditions of publicity, reasonableness, contestability, and enforcement are met. This applies not only in relation to health-care, but in relation to all the programs that governments must typically have as part of enacting a social minimum, such as cash transfer programs, educational services, and so on.

Moreover, this concern for appropriate procedure should arguably inform not only our response to the limit-setting problem, but to the capability-list problem that we noted above. In a society where there is broad, but not perfect, consensus in support of a Nussbaum-style list of “central human functional capabilities”, the legitimacy of the final capability-list used to help specify the social minimum can be enhanced by subjecting the formulation of the list to a process that has the characteristics of publicity, reasonableness, and contestability noted above (see Sen 1999: 110; Nussbaum 1999: 47–49, for comments along these lines).[9] A similar focus on the importance of fair procedure in the specification of the social minimum policy package can be found in Nancy Fraser’s work on the “politics of need interpretation” (Fraser 1989, 1997), and in Amy Gutmann’s and Dennis Thompson’s account of welfare state policy-making in a “deliberative democracy” (Gutmann and Thompson 1996). The use of conditionality, discussed in the previous section, is perhaps a particularly important area in which to make sure that policy-making procedures have these qualities of publicity, reasonableness, and contestability. In societies where there is significant background injustice, it will be very important also to ensure adequate voice in the decision-making process for those who suffer unjust disadvantage.

A further and key question for consideration here is whether the standard processes of representative democracy are adequate to meet the demands of publicity, reasonableness, and contestability, or whether, to achieve decisions that have legitimacy, these processes need to be supplemented by other kinds of institutions that are more deliberative and inclusive of the people who stand to be bound by limit-setting, capability-listing, and conditionality-defining decisions. Interesting developments in this respect include:

(1) use of citizens’ juries, deliberative opinion polls and Citizens’ Assemblies to assist with decision-making (on which, see Fishkin 1995, Coote and Lenaghan 1998, Smith and Wales 2000, Fung 2003, Smith 2009);

(2) Participatory Budgeting, which originated in Brazil in the 1990s and has since been taken up (in various forms) around the world (de Sousa Santos 2007, Wampler 2007, Baiocchi, Heller and Silva 2011, Fung 2011); and,

(3) village parliaments (gram sabhas) that are constitutionally mandated in rural areas in India and which have helped to empower poorer citizens to exercise more control over provision of local public goods (Véron 2001, Parthasarathy and Rao 2018, Parthasarathy, Rao and Palaniswamy 2019).

In view of the legitimacy problems discussed in this section, those who support enactment of a social minimum should consider the contribution of these and similar institutions in the specification and operation of social minimum policy regimes.

4. Conclusion

Instead of summarizing the arguments of the previous sections here, we close by noting three further points which put our discussion into perspective.

Firstly, we should note that as we move to enact the social minimum there are a number of important policy design questions that arise that our discussion thus far leaves unresolved. We have considered one design issue: the issue of how far access to the social minimum should be work-conditional. But there is a huge range of other design issues that we have not directly considered. For example, if we accept that the government has a responsibility to its citizens to secure access to certain basic goods and services, to what extent should the government itself directly produce these goods and services, e.g., health-care? If we accept that the government must introduce tax-transfer schemes to enact the social minimum, what form should these take? Should the government use “means-testing” to target transfers exclusively to the most needy, or should it seek to enact the social minimum through so-called “social insurance” programs to which all (or virtually all) citizens contribute, and from which all receive benefits?[10] If the government provides citizens with assistance in meeting a specific need, should it provide assistance in the form of “in-kind” benefits or in the form of cash?[11] These are all major design questions that arise in thinking about how to enact the social minimum. One cannot settle them merely by appeal to the basic idea of the social minimum. Although many of the ideas and considerations discussed here will be relevant in addressing these questions, settling them requires further philosophical reflection and, indeed, a lot of empirical research.

Secondly, it is important to emphasise again that much of our discussion has taken the scope of the social minimum to be that of a nation state, but we can and should also consider obligations to enact a social minimum at transnational and global levels. A full discussion of this would need to draw on the growing body of literature on global justice.[12]

Thirdly, even when considering economic and social arrangements within a given nation, we need to keep distinct the specific question of whether and why a social minimum is justified from the broader question of what social justice consists in and demands of us. Enacting a social minimum may well be a demand of social justice. Indeed, it may well be one of the most urgent demands of social justice. But, challenging as this demand is, social justice might require much more of us than this.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Basic Income Earth Network, The BIEN Archive provides a comprehensive listing of books, journal articles, reports and conference papers on basic income, published in a variety of languages.
  • Human Development and Capability Association, a website for academics and practitioners that “seeks to build an intellectual community around the ideas of human development and the capability approach, and relate these ideas to the policy arena.”
  • Basic Income Earth Network, a website run by supporters of the proposal for universal basic income with global coverage of policy debates related to this idea.

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