Ontological Dependence

First published Thu May 12, 2005; substantive revision Wed Jul 22, 2020

Ontological dependence is a relation—or, more accurately, a family of relations—between entities or beings (onta in Greek, whence ontological). For there are various ways in which one being may be said to depend upon one or more other beings, in a sense of “depend” that is distinctly metaphysical in character and that may be contrasted, thus, with various causal senses of this word. More specifically, a being may be said to depend, in such a sense, upon one or more other beings for its existence or for its identity. A traditional approach was to analyze all forms of ontological dependence in modal terms, that is, in terms of distinctly metaphysical notions of possibility and necessity, but more recently an analysis in terms of the notion of essence has become popular. A third option is to treat the notion of ontological dependence as a metaphysical primitive, in which case it is not possible to give a further definition of it. This entry will remain neutral about the ultimate basis of ontological dependence. At least in some cases, it is possible to use ontological dependence as a tool to describe the relationship between entities without taking a stand about its basis, but in other cases this may not be possible. Notions of ontological dependence are frequently called upon by metaphysicians in their proposed analyses of other metaphysically important notions, such as the notion of substance or the thought that tropes depend for their existence on a substance.

1. Varieties of Ontological Dependence

A crucial notion in metaphysics is that of one entity depending for its existence upon another entity—not in a merely causal sense, but in a deeper, ontological sense (but see Ingthorsson 2002: 96 for discussion on the idea that causal relations could be understood as one-sided existential dependence; cf. also Bennett 2017: Ch. 4, where it is argued that the line between causal and noncausal determination is not clear). The kind of dependence in question must also be distinguished from any kind of logical dependence, because logical relations, strictly speaking, cannot obtain between concrete objects, nor between abstract objects that are not propositional in nature. We should also distinguish ontological dependence, broadly conceived, from what is usually considered a stricter type of metaphysical dependence, namely metaphysical grounding. The link between ontological dependence and metaphysical grounding (or simply “metaphysical dependence”, as it is sometimes called, see Rosen 2010 and the separate entry on metaphysical grounding; see also Trogdon 2013 for discussion) will be discussed below, but this entry concerns a somewhat broader family of relations of dependence. The notion of ontological independence is also important, and it is often used to describe the idea that something is fundamental. This idea as well will be discussed below (but see also the separate entry on fundamentality).

While much of the early work on ontological dependence was done primarily in a setting where dependence was thought to be an inherently modal notion (e.g., Simons 1987), the recent trend in hyperintensional metaphysics (see Nolan 2014) has had an enormous impact for discussion surrounding dependence. The thought here is that we need more fine-grained tools than mere necessary equivalence: two statements can apply to the very same entities across all possible worlds but not be equivalent. Here, the notion of essence is often invoked, and many would now regard the ultimate basis of dependence (and indeed of modality itself) to be essence (see Fine 1994a, Lowe 1998, Correia 2005, and Koslicki 2012). Finally, it is entirely possible to deny both approaches and regard the notion of ontological dependence itself as a primitive (see Thomasson 1998: Ch. 2 and Barnes 2012: 879). Some would regard the notions of metaphysical grounding or fundamentality to be similarly primitive (see Fine 2012, Rodriguez-Pereyra 2005, Rosen 2010, Schaffer 2009, and Wilson 2014). Primitivism does not mean that the notion is mysterious or obscure, as we can still illuminate it, e.g., by describing its instances. But it does mean that the notion is unanalyzable.

In what follows, the discussion will roughly follow the historical development, starting with the attempts to give a modal-existential analysis of ontological dependence in §2. As we will see in §2.2, these attempts do have some serious shortcomings, even if they can be of use especially in certain restricted contexts. In §3, we see that there are important cases where a more fine-grained, asymmetric notion of explanatory dependence seems warranted. We will then proceed to the essentialist analysis of dependence in §4, a discussion of the relationship between metaphysical grounding and dependence in §5, finishing with a brief discussion of various other connections and applications in §6.

To get us started, we may consider a few simplified examples. It is not uncommon to see the notion of ontological dependence used in a rather coarse-grained manner, given that it encompasses a family of relations. For instance, we often see claims such as:

“Sets ontologically depend on their members.”
“Electricity ontologically depends on electrons.”
“Socrates does not ontologically depend on singleton Socrates.”

While all of the above no doubt express some important type of dependence relationship, there are also important differences between them. (1) may be understood as stating that a set {x, y, z} could not exist if its members, namely x, y, z, did not exist. One way to analyze the type of dependence in question is as rigid existential dependence, to be clarified in a moment. Another sense of dependence that could be at work in (1) is identity-dependence, but we will return to this later on. In (2), we seem to have in mind a more general kind of dependence: there could not be electricity, now or ever, if there were no electrons. So the existence of electricity depends on the existence of a very specific kind of particle, the electron. This second type of dependence is also existential, but to separate it from the rigid dependence in (1), we may call it generic existential dependence. (3) is a famous case borrowed from Fine (1994a, 1994b). Singleton Socrates, expressed by “{Socrates}”, is the set containing Socrates as its sole member. From (1) we see that the set itself plausibly depends on Socrates, but since the set necessarily exists when Socrates does, the dependence between them would seem to be symmetric. However, (3) captures the very plausible idea that it is not any part of the essence or identity of Socrates that it should belong to {Socrates}. So, (3) must refer to some form of essential dependence (or lack thereof in this case).

We will provide a more detailed analysis of these examples below, but we can already see that a family of—sometimes competing—notions is beginning to emerge. However, we should formulate each notion somewhat more precisely. The first thing to note in defining ontological dependence is the modal-existential element in dependence claims. For instance, we’ve said that a set cannot exist unless its members do. So there is a sense in which the existence of a set necessitates the existence of its members. Indeed, it is common to talk about, e.g., rigid existential necessitation as synonymous with rigid existential dependence. Typically, statements of ontological dependence are thought to refer to metaphysical modality (rather than, say, conceptual or logical modality), primarily because they concern matters that are broader than just conceptual or logical. For instance, substances are often considered to be entities that do not depend, in a distinctively metaphysical sense, for their existence upon anything else (see Lowe 1998: Ch. 6). We can see this already in Descartes, who asserts that

by substance we can understand nothing other than a thing which exists in such a way as to depend on no other thing for its existence. (The Philosophical Writings of Descartes: vol. I, p. 210)

The idea of ontological dependence goes back further than Descartes though, at least to Aristotle (see Corkum 2008, Koslicki 2013, and Peramatzis 2011), and it appears throughout the history of philosophy. For instance, there is a notion of dependence operative in the philosophy of John Duns Scotus, who uses it in his proof of the existence of God (see the separate entry on John Duns Scotus, §2.2 for details). Later, precursors to the contemporary work on ontological dependence can be found in the work of Franz Brentano and Edmund Husserl; in particular, Husserl’s work on the dependence between wholes and parts (for discussion, see Simons 1982 and Johansson 2004: Ch. 9).

Finally, there are also those who are sceptical about the metaphysical import of notions of ontological dependence. There are several reasons why one might consider ontological dependence relations to be unintelligible or unhelpful; for instance, one might think that they conflate other relations or that they are extraneous additions to being. However, it is commonly held among those working with ontological dependence that these dependence relations, being formal ontological relations, are not additional elements of being (cf. Lowe 2006: Ch. 3). Such relations are typically thought to be internal (see Armstrong 1978: 85, who defines two things to be internally related if and only if there exist properties of them which logically necessitate that the relation holds; for further discussion on internal and external relations, see the separate entry on relations). Still, there is at least an ideological cost in some approaches to ontological dependence and hence some would prefer a deflationary approach. According to this type of approach, we may be able to account for supposed ontological dependence relations in terms of a “cluster” of modal and mereological relations (for a defense of this type of approach, see Kovacs 2018).

2. The Modal-Existential Analysis of Dependence

In this section we will focus on the modal-existential analysis of ontological dependence, which used to be the dominant approach. But even if this approach has fallen out of fashion, it is important to see why that is the case and we cannot do that without understanding the approach. Moreover, there are those who do not wish to commit to the ontologically heavyweight notion of essence, but who nevertheless employ the notion of ontological dependence (e.g., trope bundle theorists, such as Keinänen, Keskinen, & Hakkarainen 2019). We will discuss some of the problems that this account faces in §2.2 and return to the essentialist analysis in §4.

2.1 The Modal-Existential Analysis

Let us start from (1) in the previous section; how should this relationship between sets and their members be defined according to the modal-existential analysis? An obvious proposal would be to say, quite simply:

x dependsR for its existence upon y =df Necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

The subscript “R” is used here because it seems appropriate to call this species of existential dependence of one object upon another rigid existential dependence. Why “rigid”? Because there is no flexibility here: the existence of a given x requires the existence of that very y. It could not be something a little bit like y, something falling roughly in the same category, for instance; it must be y. The definiens in (EDR) is equivalent to “Necessarily, if x exists, then y exists”, so that according to (EDR) the existential dependenceR of x upon y amounts to the strict implication of y’s existence by x’s existence. We have mentioned one example of rigid existential dependence, namely, sets ontologically depending on their members (more precisely, a set depends rigidly on the very members it has, i.e., any change in a set’s members will change the set itself). Another, although more controversial, example is a particular person depending for her existence on her parents, or, more precisely, on the particular sperm and egg that she originates from. This example is of course related to the essentiality of origin (as discussed in Kripke 1980).

We can express (EDR) in a more compact manner by resorting to further formalization (the following notation is used, e.g., in Correia 2008). We can use the sentential operator “\(\square\)” for metaphysical necessity, the one-place predicate “E” for existence, and the two-place sentential operator “→” for material implication. Following this notation, we can formalize rigid existential dependence as follows: “\(\square(Ex \rightarrow Ey)\)”, which can be read as “x rigidly depends for its existence on y”, or alternatively “x rigidly necessitates y”. Note that (EDR), somewhat controversially, implies that everything dependsR for its existence upon itself. It would, of course, be easy enough to modify (EDR)’s definiens to read “y is not identical with x and, necessarily, x exists only if y exists”, but that would have the disadvantage of precluding anything from dependingR for its existence upon itself.

We can quite naturally contrast rigid existential dependence as defined by (EDR) with what might appropriately be called non-rigid existential dependence, defined as follows:

x dependsN for its existence upon the F =df Necessarily, x exists only if the F exists.

The thought here is that—to use the language of “possible worlds”—“the F” in any instance of (EDN) might well denote different entities in different possible worlds. So, for example, it might be said that a material object x dependsN for its existence upon the matter composing x, even though it might have been composed of different matter, because in every possible world in which x exists the matter composing x in that world exists in that world.

On the face of it, (EDR) seems to capture precisely one strongly intuitive notion of existential dependence; or more accurately, one direction of that notion. The intuitive idea behind this notion is that if y does not exist, then the dependent entity x does not exist. For example, when it is said that a particular event, such as the assassination of Caesar, depends for its existence upon Caesar, (EDR) seems to explicate this appropriately in terms of the fact that the assassination could not have existed if Caesar had not existed to be assassinated. Some other assassination, we may suppose, could have existed at that very time and place, but for that very assassination to have existed, Caesar himself had to exist.

However, there are clearly cases in which (EDR) fails to capture the intuitive sense of dependence at hand. Consider a living organism. A living organism would appear to depend for its existence upon its parts, such as cells. But we also know that a living organism may survive a change of any of its cells, provided that the change is effected in a non-disruptive manner. It is true, of course, that such an organism must have parts such as cells if it is to exist, but which objects those parts are is inessential—and consequently it is not the case that it depends for its existence, in the sense defined by (EDR), upon any one of those parts. But it is possible to define another sense of existential dependence in which it is true to say that a composite object depends for its existence upon its proper parts; a generic notion of existential dependence, defined as follows:

x dependsG for its existence upon Fs =df Necessarily, x exists only if some F exists.

Composite objects are existentially dependent objects in the sense of (EDG), since they require the existence of proper parts (set F as “proper part of x” in (EDG)). Using the previous formal notation, we could express (EDG) as “\(\square(Ex \rightarrow \exists Fy)\)”. Here we have added the existential quantifier “∃” as well as the general term “F” to express the thought that “x generically depends for its existence on something being an F”, or alternatively “x generically necessitates F”. The important difference between the rigid and the generic cases is that (EDR) refers to a specific object whereas (EDG) only requires that at least some Fs exist. Another example, mentioned earlier, where (EDG) would seem to capture the correct sense of dependence is (2), “Electricity ontologically depends on electrons”. More precisely, we could say that electricity dependsG for its existence upon electrons.

We would now have the tools to formalize most of the mentioned examples, but note that there are cases where further tools are required. Consider:

“Children ontologically depend on their parents.”

On the face of it, what we mean in (4) is that if parents x and y had not existed, then their child z could not have come into existence. This looks like a case of rigid existential dependence, but it is clear that once z has been born, her parents can go out of existence without any effect on her own existence. At that point, there is only past rigid existential dependence. For cases such as this, we would require temporally relativized versions of (EDN) and (EDG), but we will omit these complications here (see Thomasson 1998: 24–34 and Correia 2005, 2008 for some versions of temporally relativized ontological dependence).

Note, incidentally, that generic existential dependence as defined by (EDG) above is very close to a pluralized form of non-rigid existential dependence, as defined by (EDN). We could call this plural non-rigid existential dependence, definable as follows:

x dependsP for its existence upon the Fs =df Necessarily, x exists only if the Fs exist.

The similarity between (EDG) and (EDN) is apparent: saying—for example—that a composite object x dependsG for its existence upon proper parts of x is very close indeed to saying that x dependsP for its existence upon the existence of the very kinds of proper parts that x has.

2.2 Some Problems for the Modal-Existential Analysis

An important group of problems for the modal-existential analysis of ontological dependence emerges from essential properties (at least if they are considered as distinct from modal properties, as argued in Fine 1994a). What could be a plausible example of an essential property of an individual object, say, Socrates? Let us assume that properties are to be conceived of as property instances, such as the particular redness of a certain apple. Of course, an apple can change its color, so that this is not an example of an essential property of the apple. But what about—in the case of Socrates—his humanity (as it were, his particular being human)? Certainly, if there is such a thing as the particular humanity of Socrates, he cannot lose it without ceasing to exist. Perhaps we can deny that Socrates’s particular humanity is anything distinct from Socrates himself: after all, its existence necessarily coincides with his. Properties are commonly said to depend for their existence upon the entities that possess them. One might propose to state this in the form of a principle, with the help of (EDR), as follows:

If x is a property and y is an entity possessing x, then x dependsR for its existence upon y.

Now, substituting the definiens of (EDR) into (PROP-DEP) gives us:

If x is a property and y is an entity possessing x, then, necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

Note that (PROP-NEC) is not intended to apply to properties understood as universals, but only to particularized properties (otherwise variously known as property instances, individual accidents, tropes, or modes). These are items exactly like the particular redness of a particular apple mentioned above, conceived of as an object distinct from the redness of any other apple, no matter how well matched in color to the first. On this interpretation, (PROP-NEC) has some plausibility, complying as it does with the intuition that particularized properties cannot “migrate” from one object to another. (Actually, (PROP-NEC) itself does not quite imply this, although it does imply that a particularized property cannot migrate from one object to another when the first object ceases to exist. Here, the friend of an essentialist analysis of dependence has some further options, i.e., one could say that it is part of the nature or essence of a particularized property to be instantiated by the very object that it is instantiated by. But we will leave this aside for now.)

A line of argument that could be developed on this basis suggests that if indeed there are such things as essential particularized properties that are “possessed” by composite objects, then they are in fact to be identified with those objects. But it would be very problematic, quite generally, to argue that wherever items x and y are mutually existentially dependent as defined by (EDR), they are identical. For instance, consider the relationship between Socrates and the temporally extended event or process that was his life. Clearly, in terms of (EDR), Socrates’s life dependsR for its existence upon Socrates—but so, plausibly, does his existence upon it: it is, for Socrates, what we might call an inalienable event. And yet there are things true of the life of Socrates that are not true of him and vice versa (for example, that it was so many years long, and that he weighed so many pounds)—so there is no question of their being identical. Even more strikingly, if we assume that numbers are necessary existents, and hence mutually existentially dependent, this line of thought would seem to entail that any two numbers are identical!

But it could be disputed whether Socrates is existentially dependentR upon his life—whether he necessarily would not have existed if it had not—for it may be urged that he might have had or led a different life. Now, it is true enough that his life might have been qualitatively different in many ways, but what is currently at issue is whether he might have had a numerically different life—and it is hard, perhaps, to see how he could. For if it is accepted that lives dependR for their existence upon the persons whose lives they are, then, necessarily, x’s life exists only if x exists. Suppose, for the sake of argument, that Socrates could have had a numerically different life: then it would still have been a life which could only have been Socrates’s—no one other than Socrates could have had that “other” life. But then what could underpin the supposition that it is indeed a life “other” than the life he actually had (except qualitatively)? Other possible worlds clearly do contain lives that do not exist in the actual world, insofar as they contain people who do not exist in the actual world: but there seem to be no strong grounds to suppose that they do so other than for that reason. It seems thus that there are certain difficult questions which the modal-existential analysis may not fully address, at least not in the form that we have presented it until now. We will continue to discuss these issues in §3 and §4.

3. Asymmetrical Existential Dependence

Where does the above analysis of existential dependence lead us? The case of Socrates’s life demonstrates that (EDR) permits the possibility of mutual existential dependenceR between non-identical things. But this implication does not seem to be acceptable in every context and indeed symmetric dependence more generally is a controversial issue (see Barnes 2018 for discussion). Take, again, the relationship between Socrates and his life. According to (EDR), Socrates is quite as much existentially dependentR upon his life as his life is upon him. And yet there is a strong intuition that, in another and perhaps more important sense, Socrates’s life is the truly dependent object here, while Socrates is, in some sense, an independent existent. We might say that Socrates’s life exists only because Socrates does, whereas it would be putting the cart before the horse to say that Socrates exists because his life does. Now, it appears that the conjunction “because” must be asymmetrical, because it expresses an explanatory relationship and explanation is asymmetrical. Plausibly, two distinct states of affairs cannot explain each other. There may, quite conceivably, be self-explanatory states of affairs, so we should only want to urge that non-identical states of affairs cannot be mutually explanatory. Technically, this means that we should strictly describe explanation as an “antisymmetric” rather than as an asymmetric relation. The asymmetry of explanation is, of course, intimately related to the unacceptability of circular arguments. It is also closely linked to recent discussions regarding metaphysical grounding, to which we will return later, in §5.

One upshot of all this is that, for the purpose of defining ontologically independent existents (if there are any), (EDR) should be replaced, at least to a first approximation, by something like:

x dependsX for its existence upon y =df Necessarily, x exists only because y exists.

We use the subscript “X” because, in line with foregoing remarks, it seems appropriate to call this species of ontological dependence eXplanatory existential dependence. (We shall need the subscript “E” for another use later.) Here it is important to note that the presence of the word “only” in (EDX)’s definiens should not be understood as implying that an object x may not dependX for its existence upon two (or more) different things, y and z. Thus the particularized relation of Mary’s loving Tom—supposing such an object to exist—plausibly exists only because Mary exists, but plausibly also exists only because Tom exists. Furthermore, we may assume that it is not an implication of (EDX) that a composite object dependsX for its existence upon its proper parts, that is, that it is not the case that it “exists only because they exist”—on the grounds that it could still exist in the absence of those particular parts, provided suitable alternative parts were substituted for them. Thus (EDX) is quite unlike (EDG) in its implications for part-whole dependence relations, as far as composite objects are concerned. For the same reason, we may assume that (EDX) does not imply that an “Aristotelian” universal dependsX for its existence upon its particular exemplars. Indeed, we may take it that the definiens of (EDX) entails the definiens of (EDR)—although not vice versa, of course—so that the following is a principle that one could accept:

If, necessarily, x exists only because y exists, then, necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

However, despite these clarifications, it must be conceded that the locution “x exists only because y exists” is hardly very perspicuous, either as to its logical form or as to its exact meaning. Moreover, precisely because we have introduced the conjunction “because” as an explanatory conjunction, it may be felt that it is not well-suited to the ontological role now being devised for it (for one of the many recent attempts to specify the explanatory role of “because”, see deRosset 2013). There are perhaps two sources of worry here: first, that this approach invites a confusion between metaphysics and epistemology; and secondly (but relatedly) that contexts governed by the conjunction “because” are opaque (in the technical sense of the term, in which it implies the non-applicability of Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles).

Some of these worries can perhaps be allayed by resorting to the recent work on metaphysical grounding, which presents a much more rigorous analysis of non-causal, metaphysical explanation of this type (see especially the articles in Correia & Schnieder (eds.) 2012a). This is not to take any stand on the relationship between grounding and metaphysical explanation (see §4 of the separate entry on metaphysical grounding), but only to note that the discussion surrounding explanatory dependence has progressed, in part, independently of the wider considerations surrounding ontological dependence. So we should perhaps accept that (EDX) as it stands does not really constitute a satisfactory definition of a species of existential dependence, conceived as an objective metaphysical relation between entities, because it is insufficiently perspicuous. In any case, the fact that (B-NEC) but not its converse holds some appeal indicates that what we should be trying to frame is a perspicuous definition of a species of ontological dependence that is a relation between x and y stronger than (entailing but not entailed by) “necessarily, x exists only if y exists”. This should moreover be (for reasons discussed earlier) an asymmetrical relation—or, more accurately, an antisymmetric relation, that is, a relation \(\Rrel\) such that if \(x\Rrel y\) and \(y\Rrel x\), then \(x = y\). This is to allow that in principle an object may, in the anticipated sense, depend ontologically upon itself, controversial as this may be (it is nevertheless a position that is of at least historical interest, e.g., because of the potential special case of God depending on herself).

As we shall see in a moment, a relation that may be of some assistance in spelling out the relevant sense of dependence is the relation of identity-dependence, to be explained below. But first we should digress for a moment to note that the one-sided holding of the relation defined by (EDR) is unlikely to do the job. According to this suggestion, we have:

x dependsA for its existence upon y =df
necessarily, x exists only if y exists and
it is not the case that, necessarily, y exists only if x exists.

Notice that the relation thus defined is asymmetric (rather than antisymmetric): it doesn’t permit any object to be existentially dependent upon itself. Indeed, we have chosen to use the subscript “A” here because the relation in question may aptly be called asymmetrical rigid existential dependence. One might think that this is at it should be, as on the face of it the idea of something existentially depending on itself appears very strange. There is of course an obvious theological candidate that may violate this condition, namely God, so perhaps we should not rule out the possibility outright. But there may be slightly less controversial candidates as well, for it could be suggested that there are fundamental entities that existentially depend on themselves (rather than on nothing). At any rate, if anything of the sort is possible, we better not rule it out by definition, as (EDA) does.

Perhaps more importantly, an appeal to (EDA) does not seem to help to resolve the difficulty raised by the example of Socrates’s life. For neither Socrates nor his life is existentially dependentA on the other, since in neither case is clause (ii) of (EDA) satisfied. But we were looking for a sense of “ontologically dependent” in which it is true to say that Socrates’s life is ontologically dependent upon him, but not vice versa.

4. Essential Dependence and Identity-Dependence

4.1 Why Essential Dependence?

Until quite recently, it was common to think that ontological dependence can be fully characterized in modal-existential terms, as we have seen above. One obvious reason for this is that if one adopts the usual “modalist” analysis of essence, essential dependence will collapse into a form of modal-existential dependence (one classic defense of the “modalist” analysis is Marcus 1967). But it seems clear already starting from Aristotle that there is an alternative way to formulate ontological dependence if essence is not analyzed in modal terms (as Fine 1994a and especially those working in the “neo-Aristotelian” tradition would have it). However, this is not to suggest that Aristotle did not rely on the modal-existential notion of ontological dependence. Rather, there are reasons to think that Aristotle’s understanding of dependence encompasses both the modal-existential notion and the essentialist notion to be described below (for historical details and further discussion, see Corkum 2008, Koslicki 2013, and Peramatzis 2011).

One motivation for developing a non-modal conception of ontological dependence is that the modal-existential analysis appears to be too coarse-grained for some cases. We have already discussed some of these cases, but the most well-known examples have been made famous by Fine (e.g., 1994b). Consider, for instance, what the modal-existential account entails in the case of necessary existents. Take Socrates and the number 2, for example. Given that numbers necessarily exist, it is necessarily the case that 2 exists if Socrates does. But presumably we do not want to say that Socrates depends upon the number 2, or indeed on most necessary existents that you might put in the place of 2. So the modal-existential account makes everything depend upon every necessary existent, which seems like the wrong result.

Admittedly, those who defend a modal-existential analysis of ontological dependence could insist that it applies only to contingent objects (cf. Simons 1987: 295). Simons makes this type of qualification by focusing on concrete entities, hence excluding necessary existents by definition; he also excludes self-dependence. Simons calls the resulting notion of dependence weak rigid dependence, but a stronger notion, strong rigid dependence (Simons 1987: 303) is also defined—the latter is a special case of the former. One example of weak rigid dependence as defined by Simons would be a particular water molecule depending for its existence on a particular oxygen atom. In the case of strong rigid dependence, the dependent object cannot be a proper part of the object it depends upon. So object x is strongly rigidly dependent on object y if x depends for its existence on y and y is not a proper part of x. One example of strong rigid dependence defined thus would be a trope (or mode) depending for its existence on a substance. In addition to these rigid notions, Simons defines corresponding notions of (weak and strong) generic dependence.

While it is possible to avoid some of the challenges raised for the modal-existential account with these qualifications, they do nevertheless call for an alternative, more fine-grained account of ontological dependence that could also be applied to necessary existents. As last resort, a proponent of the modal-existential account who does not wish to buy into essentialist ontology could simply bite the bullet and insist that every contingent entity does rigidly depend for its existence on necessary existents. One reason to do so would be the ability to get by with a sparser battery of formal ontological tools—a consideration motivated by parsimony.

The modal-existential analysis of ontological dependence can thus be developed further, and it can perhaps overcome some of the problems that were pointed out earlier. But there are areas where a more fine-grained notion would seem to be required and there is also a historical precedent (e.g., in Aristotle) for such a notion. It should be noted though that much of the contemporary literature in defense of a non-modal, fine-grained analysis (such as Fine 1994b and Koslicki 2012), operates in a “neo-Aristotelian” framework which typically assumes some “non-modalist” version of essentialism. Accordingly, there is an obvious rift between the modal-existential analysis and the essentialist analysis—one that we cannot fully bridge here. In any case, it is good to keep in mind that the notion of ontological dependence itself, when used as a tool to formulate the commitments of a specific theory, does not immediately force one to make a commitment in this regard, even though some of its applications may entail such a commitment.

4.2 Identity-Dependence

A point of entry to the idea that there are notions of dependence not analyzable in terms of the modal-existential account—and hence a motivation to pursue a non-modal analysis of dependence altogether—are cases that do not seem to involve a requirement for existence at all. Indeed, as we already saw in the case of (3), “Socrates does not ontologically depend on singleton Socrates”, it seems that something beyond mere existential independence is being expressed. Instead, one might say that singleton Socrates does not have anything to do with the identity or essence of Socrates, and it is this lack of identity-dependence between Socrates and {Socrates} that we wish to express with (3). In other words, being a member of singleton Socrates is not an essential property of Socrates. Recall that a similar issue seemed to arise with regard to the possibility of composite objects having essential proper parts. We will now consider a more systematic method for dealing with cases of dependence involving the essences or essential properties of objects.

It is not quite straight-forward to define essential dependence, although a formal definition will be given below. Before that, we ought to get a better picture of what it means to say that an object depends upon something for its identity, that is, we should clarify the relation of identity-dependence. Note that the notion of “identity” at play here is not the one symbolized with the “equals” sign, i.e., “=”. Rather, we mean “identity” in the sense of what a thing is, or which thing of a certain kind a thing is (compare this with Aristotle’s to ti esti, “the what it is”, see §7 of the separate entry on Aristotle’s metaphysics). Informally speaking, to say that the identity of x depends on the identity of y—or, more briefly, that x depends for its identity upon y—is to say that which thing of its kind y is fixes (or at least helps to fix) which thing of its kind x is. By “fixes” in this context is meant metaphysically determines. For instance, then, the identity of a set is fixed by the identities of its members, as was hinted already in §1. Likewise, the identity of an assassination is (at least partially) fixed by the identity of the person assassinated. These relationships of identity-dependence are direct consequences of the identity-criteria governing the kinds of which the items thus related are instances. (For further discussion on identity-criteria and identity-dependence, see Lowe 1989, 2009: Ch. 2, and 2012.)

One way to attempt to precisify the notion of essence is to note that we are here concerned with identity in the sense of individuality rather than the relation of identity. In other words, identity-dependence expresses the determination of the individuality of objects in terms of the individuality of other objects. Thus, the identity-dependence of a set upon its members could be regarded as a consequence of the fact that the Axiom of Extensionality functions as the criterion of identity for sets. The set’s members determine the individuality of the set—they individuate the set. Notice, here, that we allow that x may be said to depend for its identity upon y even in cases in which the identity of y alone does not suffice to fix the identity of x. So, for example, a set with two or more members depends for its identity upon each of them, although its identity is only completely fixed by the identities of all of them.

Another way to specify the notion of essence being used is to resort to Fine’s (1994b, 1995) distinction between constitutive and consequential essence:

A property belongs to the constitutive essence of an object if it is not had in virtue of being a logical consequence of some more basic essential properties; and a property might be said to belong to the consequential essence of an object if it is a logical consequence of properties that belong to the constitutive essence. (Fine 1994b: 276)

As Fine then goes on to note, the property of singleton Socrates, namely, containing Socrates as a sole member, will presumably be part of the constitutive essence of {Socrates}. In contrast, the property of containing some member or another is only part of its consequential essence. It is evident that in cases of essential and identity-dependence, we are typically interested in the constitutive notion of essence, because it is presumably also a part of the consequentialist essence of Socrates that 2 = 2. So, using the consequentialist notion of essence to define essential and identity-dependence would quickly lead to problems not unlike the ones faced by the modal-existential account. Accordingly, in what follows, the various definitions should in the first instance be understood to concern the constitutive essence. But the problem that remains is that the distinction between constitutive and consequential essence itself is not always easy to make and it is inevitable that there will be some controversial cases (for discussion, see Fine 1994b). The examples used to illustrate the various forms of essential dependence should thus be taken with a grain of salt, as it is often not entirely clear what should be included in the constitutive essence of an entity. In any case, provided that this distinction can be made, the friend of the essentialist analysis of dependence has a clear advantage, given that they are able to express a broader range of dependence claims with the help of this distinction.

Now, although we have not yet presented a formal definition of identity-dependence, it might well seem that a consequence of any such definition should be the following principle:

If x depends for its identity upon y, then there is a function f such that x is necessarily identical with f(y).

(Note: “f(y)” here may be pronounced “the f of y”.) For example: if we say that the identity of a marriage depends on the identities of the two people being married, if x is a marriage and y and z are the two people in question, (ID-NEC) is satisfied in respect of x and y in virtue of the fact that x is necessarily identical with the marriage of y with z—so that in this case the required function is the marriage with z function from persons to events. (We here ignore the complications created by the fact that, under some legal systems, the same two persons may be married to one another more than once.) However, (ID-NEC) turns out to be unsatisfactory as a definition, because it can be regarded as trivially true, given standard set theory, that any x and y that may be connected with a function will satisfy the consequent of (ID-NEC). So we better find a more satisfactory definition of identity-dependence.

Evidently, it would not do simply to replace the conditional connective in (ID-NEC) with a biconditional connective and thence attempt to turn it into a definition of identity-dependence, unless at the same time one could impose some suitable restriction on the kind of function involved. One possibility would be to exclude any function f which is not such that it is part of the essence of x that it is the f of y. But since it would appear strange to say that essences quite generally involve anything about functions, we might be better off with a definition using an appropriate yet to be specified place-holder relation that would do the same job instead, arriving at the following definition of identity-dependence:

x depends for its identity upon y =df There is a relation “R” such that it is part of the essence of x that x is related by R to y.

We can exemplify (ID) by letting x be {z} and y be z, in which case we have, as is intuitively correct, that {z} depends for its identity upon z, because there is a relation—namely, “being a member of the singleton set” (also known as the unit set function)—such that it is part of the essence of {z} that it is the singleton set of z. Accordingly, we may interpret the relation R more precisely on a case by case basis.

Building on this example, we can see that x is necessarily identical with the sole member of {x} and hence we can arrive at a principle not unlike (ID-NEC). However, even though x is necessarily identical with the sole member of {x}, it is, once again, plausibly not part of the essence of x that x is the sole member of {x} (cf. Fine 1994a: 4–5; see also Fine 1994b for a related discussion of the notion of essence and essential dependence).

But, of course, for the foregoing strategy to work and thus for (ID) to be fully vindicated, a perspicuous account of the notion of “essence” would be required—and that is a large task which cannot be undertaken here. However, various attempts to construct such an account have been made, for instance by Fine (1994a) and Lowe (2008). In this sense, a thing’s essence may be said to constitute its identity, when one uses the word “identity” in this distinctive manner to speak of a thing’s identity, rather than using it to speak of the identity relation. Seen in this light, identity-dependence as defined by (ID) is simply a species of essential dependence, that is, a way in which the essence of a certain thing is determined by a relation in which it stands to another thing.

Although the above account of identity-dependence is not entirely uncontroversial, there are some interesting applications of it in the literature. One of these applications concerns a version of Ontic Structural Realism (OSR, see Ladyman 1998), which claims that objects depend for their identities on the structures to which they belong (ID-OSR) (see French 2010 for one version, and see Lowe 2012 and O’Conaill 2014 for further discussion of OSR and dependence).

At this point, two principles concerning identity-dependence, as defined by (ID), may be proposed. First:

If x depends for its identity upon y, then, necessarily, x exists only if y exists.

And second:

If x is not identical with y and x depends for its identity upon y, then y does not depend for its identity upon x.

An immediate implication of (ID-EX) in conjunction with (EDR) is that if x depends for its identity upon y, then x is rigidly existentially dependent upon y (although not necessarily vice versa, of course). These two principles are, it seems, quite plausible. As for (ID-EX): surely, x cannot exist unless everything upon which x’s identity depends also exists. Thus an assassination cannot exist unless the person assassinated exists, and a set cannot exist unless its members exist. Indeed, it would seem that we can derive (ID-EX) with the aid of (ID). For suppose that x depends for its identity upon y. Then, by (ID), there is a relation R such that x is related by R to y. Given, however, that the relevant R cannot exist unless y exists—because a relation can obtain only between entities all of which exist—it follows that x likewise cannot exist unless y exists. As for (ID-NEX), this seems to follow from the requirement of non-circularity which is a condition on the adequacy of any criterion of identity. For example, given that unit sets are not to be identified with their members, we cannot say both that the identity of a unit set depends upon the identity of its member and that the identity of that member depends upon the identity of that unit set, for this would engender a vicious circle which would seem to deprive both unit sets and their members of well-defined identity-conditions.

Note that it may be urged, with some plausibility, that every object x trivially depends for its identity upon itself. And, certainly, (ID) would appear to have this implication, because for any object x, there is a relation—namely, identity—such that it is part of the essence of x that x is the object identical with x. But we must be very careful to distinguish between the claim that an object depends for its identity upon itself and the claim that an object depends for its identity solely upon itself. For even if the former claim is trivially true of all entities, the latter claim is certainly not. However, this result may be contested when we bear in mind the distinction between constitutive and consequential essence, because one might very well hold that it is no part of the constitutive essence of an entity, at least typically, that it should be identical with itself (we will omit a more detailed discussion here, but see Fine 1994b).

4.3 Essential Dependence

Having defined identity-dependence by (ID) as a species of essential dependence, we are now in a position to identify other species of essential dependence, the most obvious being what may aptly be called essential (existential) dependence, which can be defined as follows:

x dependsE for its existence upon y =df It is part of the essence of x that x exists only if y exists.

Note that, whereas—assuming the truth of (ID-NEX)—two distinct entities cannot be identity-dependent upon each other, it very plausibly is possible for each of two distinct entities to dependE for its existence on the other. For example, consider a solid sphere. Let us assume for the purposes of this example that the solid sphere is a substance, a kind of basic, ontologically independent entity (see §6.3 for further discussion). If we think of the top and bottom “halves” of a solid sphere as being geometrically defined entities whose boundaries are specified by reference to the whole sphere of which they are equal subdivisions, then it could be argued that it is part of the essence of each such hemisphere that it exists only if the other does. (These “halves”, it should be emphasized, must not be confused with the portions of matter “filling” them at any given time, and hence should not be thought of as “parts” of the sphere of which it is materially composed.) At the same time, each hemisphere depends for its identity upon the whole sphere—one being identified as the top half of that sphere and the other as the bottom half—whereas the sphere itself does not likewise depend for its identity upon either of these halves, given that we have assumed that it is a substance in its own right. This example is admittedly controversial: one could insist that the constitutive essence for each hemisphere involves the whole sphere, but not the other hemisphere. Moreover, one could also focus on the plural or collective essence of the halves, which might help us get around this circularity (on plural/collective essence, see Zylstra 2019). Note also that, very plausibly, if x dependsE for its existence upon y, then x also dependsR for its existence upon y: essential existential dependence entails rigid existential dependence—but not, of course, vice versa.

We have seen that (ID) and (EDE) correspond to rigid forms of modal-existential dependence, such as (EDR). But we can also formulate a generic notion of essential dependence, just like we did in the case of modal-existential dependence. Corresponding to generic existential dependence (EDG), we can formulate generic essential (existential) dependence as follows:

x dependsEG for its existence upon Fs =df It is part of the essence of x that x exists only if some F exists.

For instance, if x is a particular water molecule, we may say that it is a part of the essence of that water molecule that it exists only if some atoms of hydrogen and oxygen exist. In other words, water molecules essentially depend for their existence on there being atoms of the kind hydrogen and oxygen. It may be helpful to introduce a distinction between individual and general essences in this connection. (EDEG) as applied to the case of water certainly applies to each and every water molecule rather than just one of them. Accordingly, when we speak of the essence of water in this context, we are not referring to the individual essence of any particular water molecule, but to the general essence of the natural kind water. (EDEG) concerns what an entity depends upon for its general essence (e.g., what makes something count as a water molecule), whereas (EDE) concerns what an entity depends upon for its individual essence (e.g., what makes something the particular water molecule it is, as opposed to any other). (For further discussion of this distinction between individual and general essence, see Lowe 2008.)

We can find slightly different formulations of essential dependence in the literature. For instance, on Kathrin Koslicki’s (2012: 190) re-construal of Fine’s essentialist account, we get:

An entity x ontologically depends on an entity (or entities), y, just in case y is a constituent (or are constituents) in x’s essence.

This account relies on the notion of constitutive essence, which is developed in Fine’s work (1994b, 1995). We have already defined this notion above, but a recap may be useful. As Fine puts it:

we may take x to depend upon y if y is a constituent of a proposition that is true in virtue of the identity of x or, alternatively, if y is a constituent of an essential property of x. (Fine 1994b: 275)

It should also be noted that even though the notions of essential dependence defined above are no doubt more fine-grained than the modal-existential notions, there may be reasons to think that even they are not sufficiently fine-grained for all purposes (as argued in Koslicki 2012). To illustrate, consider Fine’s well-known discussion of Socrates and the singleton set that has Socrates as its sole member. To use Fine’s terminology, we could say that it is part of the constitutive essence of Socrates’s singleton set that it has Socrates as its sole member, whereas it is not part of the constitutive essence of Socrates to be the sole member of Socrates’s singleton set. But as Koslicki (2012: 195) points out, this is really just to say that Socrates’s singleton set ontologically depends on Socrates whereas Socrates does not ontologically depend on Socrates’s singleton set. The relevant notion of dependence appears to be built into Fine’s notion of essence and, similarly, the notion of essence assumed by Fine (and many other “neo-Aristotelians”) is already built into (EDC).

Before we conclude our discussion of essential dependence, a major issue in the literature concerning ontological dependence should be mentioned. For it appears that those who are willing to buy into a suitably fine-grained notion of essence, popular in the “neo-Aristotelian” tradition, will find the modal-existential account of ontological dependence far too coarse-grained. Yet, those who are not sympathetic to the “neo-Aristotelian” notion of essence but would rather analyze essence in terms of modality would insist that the modal-existential analysis is quite sufficient, and indeed that essential dependence collapses into modal-existential dependence. The recent literature has perhaps been dominated by the “neo-Aristotelian” line (although one does not, of course, need to be “neo-Aristotelian” to accept the notion of essential dependence or the “non-modalist” analysis of essence), but this is indeed only a relatively recent phenomenon. A further issue is that there is some disagreement about how the relevant notion of essence is to be constrained amongst those who think that a more fine-grained analysis than the modal-existential account is needed. For instance, Koslicki (2012: 196 ff.) regards Fine’s propositional notion of essence according to which there is little or no distinction between essence and real definition as overly restrictive. She identifies the source of this restrictive conception of essence, which is also present in Lowe’s work, to be the focus on essences as individuating—this is the type of view regarding essential dependence, namely identity-dependence, which we have here been focusing on. On Koslicki’s alternative picture, essences

must do more than individuate the entities whose essences they are; and real definitions must do more than state conditions which uniquely identify and delineate the entities under consideration at every time and in every world in which they exist. (Koslicki 2012: 200, fn. 13)

5. Ontological Dependence and Metaphysical Grounding

The notion of “ground” stormed into contemporary analytic metaphysics in the beginning of the twenty-first century, but the roots of the notion go back to Aristotle (for an overview, see Fine 2012). Sometimes grounding is understood as “metaphysical explanation”. To be more precise, when some x is grounded in some y, it is usually thought that y explains x, and grounding either is that explanatory relationship or ‘backs’ that explanation (there is a lot of debate on these issues, see the separate entry on metaphysical grounding). Moreover, the status of y is generally thought to be somehow prior to that of x—grounding is typically understood to express priority between things. For instance, we might say that the members of a set are prior to the set itself; the existence of the set is grounded in its members. Or to take a more concrete example, the existence of any given composite object is grounded in the existence of its parts. For instance, we might suggest that the existence of any given water molecule is grounded in the existence of hydrogen and oxygen atoms. Somewhat more controversially, we might also say that mental states are grounded in physical states. In each of the mentioned examples there appears to be an ontological dependence relation between the grounded entity and the grounding entity or entities. In fact, we have already discussed some of these examples in terms of ontological dependence above. This naturally leads one to question whether grounding just is (a variety of) ontological dependence—or whether ontological dependence is grounding. One motivation for finding a systematic link between ontological dependence and grounding is that it would be more parsimonious than having two primitive notions (for discussion, see Correia & Schnieder 2012b).

An initial reason to distinguish ontological dependence and metaphysical grounding is that the latter is a much stricter notion. Consider the idea that ontological dependence could be reflexive: there is nothing in theory that rules out a relation of ontological dependence obtaining in such a way that a given object is dependent on itself. It is of course controversial whether there actually are any such entities, but this is not enough to consider irreflexivity as a necessary requirement for ontological dependence. In contrast, metaphysical grounding is usually considered to be necessarily irreflexive (of course, there are those who think that this requirement could be dropped in the case of grounding just like it may in the case of ontological dependence; see, e.g., Jenkins 2011).

A more general issue concerns the modal implications of each notion. In particular, is there a form of ontological dependence that is both necessary and sufficient for grounding? This seems unlikely (as argued in Rydéhn forthcoming). While there are some instances of grounding which are clearly rigid in the same sense as rigid existential dependence, it is also clear that this connection is not necessary and sufficient. Take for instance the fact [f] and assume that it is fully grounded in [g]. This entails that [f] cannot be grounded except by [g]. An example would be the case of the set of singleton Socrates, whose existence is rigidly grounded in the fact that Socrates exists. In such cases, [f] rigidly existentially depends upon [g], and it is also plausible that [f] depends for its identity upon [g]. However, other instances of grounding do not require that the grounded fact rigidly depends upon its grounds. For example, suppose that [f] is the fact that a particular subject is feeling pain, and that [f] is fully grounded in a particular neural fact about this subject, [g]. It seems possible that this subject could have been in pain, so [f] could have obtained, even if [g] did not obtain. This would be the case if [f] had been grounded in a different neural fact, [h]. In this case, [f] cannot depend for its identity upon [g], since [f] is not rigidly dependent upon [g]. This rules out some simple options for linking grounding and rigid ontological dependence, but there are arguably also problems for linking it with generic varieties of ontological dependence (for a more detailed discussion, see Rydéhn forthcoming).

If grounding cannot be easily analyzed with the help of rigid or generic dependence, then we might instead suggest that if grounding were to be understood as a type of ontological dependence, it would be some sort of explanatory dependence. The idea that whatever does the grounding also somehow explains what is being grounded is a crucial part of the notion’s appeal. Relations of ontological dependence often seem to have a similar type of explanatory role, but the link to explanation may appear weaker: even though the existence of water depends on the existence of hydrogen and oxygen, it does not seem to be the case that the existence of hydrogen and oxygen explain the existence of water. Rather, what explains the existence of water is the ability of hydrogen and oxygen atoms to form molecules (even though this is rather simplified). So there are at least some difficulties in accounting for all relations of ontological dependence in terms of grounding relations.

We need something stricter than just “an explanatory role” to identify grounding—otherwise we would end up with a much too liberal notion, for we may regard a number of loosely connected things explanatory in some very loose sense. For instance, we might say that the fact that Smith murdered Jones is explained by certain events in Smith’s childhood, but a more direct explanation might be Smith’s desire to rob Jones. Certain events in Smith’s childhood may help us understand why Smith has murderous desires, but it’s not clear that they serve to ground the fact that Smith murdered Jones (unless we can establish transitivity between these).

One suggestion that may help to make grounding more precise would be to focus on priority. To reiterate an example used above, if the members of a set are prior to the set itself, then the existence of the set is grounded in its members. So the grounding entities are prior to—or more fundamental than—the grounded entities. Metaphors abound, but a typical way to express the idea is to say that x is fundamental or ontologically independent in this sense if and only if nothing grounds x (Schaffer 2009: 373). This is another sense in which grounding would seem to come apart from certain types of ontological dependence, as a purely modal-existential understanding of dependence in the lines of (EDR) (if one accepts them), without any claim to priority, is also possible. This is of course the sense which we defined above in terms of necessitation: even if x rigidly necessitates y that does not entail that y must be ontologically prior to x. At any rate, it would be odd to say that parents are more fundamental than their children, even if there is a (temporally relativized) rigid existential dependency between parents and their children.

All this would appear to suggest that it isn’t straightforward to define grounding simply as a variety of ontological dependence, or the other way around. In any case, even if we could define one notion in terms of the other, it seems that there are aspects of ontological dependence that are not captured by all accounts of grounding as well as aspects of grounding that are not captured by all accounts of ontological dependence. The situation may of course change depending on one’s preferred account of dependence and grounding. Accordingly, for the time being, it is advisable to keep the notions apart, especially since there are some further, formal differences that need to be taken into account. In particular, grounding is most commonly understood as a strict partial order (see Raven 2013), which entails irreflexivity, transitivity, and asymmetry. If this is correct, grounding could only capture a very specific variety of ontological dependence, as we have seen that there are varieties of ontological dependence that violate these formal features. Some have also argued that grounding itself violates all or some of these formal features, so it is not entirely uncontroversial that grounding truly is a strict partial ordering (for discussion, see Jenkins 2011, Schaffer 2012, and Tahko 2013). Given this, the exact link between grounding and ontological dependence remains open, subject to further specification of the formal features of ground.

6. Applications and Other Related Notions

In addition to the previous discussion regarding metaphysical grounding, there are numerous applications of ontological dependence as well as closely related notions that we could discuss. It will not be possible to do justice to all of them, but we will mention a few of the most important ones (many of these and further applications are discussed in Hoeltje, Schnieder, and Steinberg (eds.) 2013).

6.1 Supervenience

The notion of supervenience is covered in more detail in the separate entry on supervenience (see especially §3.5) but a brief mention is in order here, as supervenience has sometimes been conceived as a type of dependence. One reason for this is that when we assert that A supervenes on B, we might also say that A-properties ontologically depend upon B-properties. Take the typical example of the beauty of a work of art and the physical manifestation of that work of art. It would seem that if you wish to change the aesthetic properties of an artwork, you will also have to manipulate its physical manifestation. As a first pass, it looks as if the dependence at work here is generic existential dependence as defined by (EDG), so the aesthetic A-properties dependG for their existence upon some physical B-properties. However, supervenience in general is not so easily analyzed, as at least on one usual conception, supervenience is not irreflexive and hence not asymmetric (see Steinberg 2013). In other words, we can at least say that supervenience, as opposed to grounding, is not a strict partial order and hence not a relation of ontological priority. There are various ways to further specify the formal features of supervenience, and indeed to argue that it should not be considered as a form of dependence, but this is not a task that we can undertake here.

6.2 Truthmaking

The connection between ontological dependence and truthmaking is of a more general type. On many construals, the core of truthmaker theory is considered to be the idea that truth depends—or supervenes—on being (Bigelow 1988: 133; see also Armstrong 2004, Schaffer 2010a, and Liggins 2012). Recently, some have resisted this idea (e.g., Merricks 2007), but it does remain popular among truthmaker theorists (for discussion, see the separate entry on truthmakers). Moreover, the connection between truthmaking and ontological dependence has been a part of truthmaker theory from the very beginning; Mulligan, Simons, and Smith (1984: 294) rely on Husserl’s work on ontological dependence in their introduction of the idea of truthmaking (for further discussion of Husserl’s work regarding dependence, see Simons 1982 and Johansson 2004: Ch. 9). More precisely, it seems there must be some way in which the world is in virtue of which true propositions are true, but the world itself is not symmetrically dependent on truth; there is an asymmetric dependence relation between truth and being (accordingly, this dependence needs to be expressed with an asymmetric notion of dependence, see §3 above).

However, popular though it is, this view is not entirely uncontroversial. For instance, MacBride (2014) argues that there is no need to appeal to truthmaking to explain this type of asymmetric dependence between truth and being. In fact, there are reasons to think that truthmaking cannot explain the asymmetry, at least not on the basis of the idea that truth supervenes on being. Part of the confusion here seems to surround the relevant notion of supervenience. On Armstrong’s (2004: 8) construal, the relevant notion of supervenience is symmetric: truth supervenes on being, but being also supervenes on truth. So it appears that the required asymmetry cannot arise from supervenience itself (see also Rodriguez-Pereyra 2005). While these problems must be settled elsewhere, it suffices to say that some variety of ontological dependence is no doubt at work in truthmaker theory—there is an on-going debate as to how truthmaking should be specified. One recent suggestion that may have some mileage is that the relevant asymmetry could be recovered if truthmaking is understood as truth-grounding, that is, some entity x grounds the truth of some proposition p if p is true in virtue of the existence of x (see Tahko 2013 for discussion).

6.3 Substance

One important application of ontological dependence is the analysis of the notion of “substance”—a basic or fundamental entity which possesses at least some degree of ontological independence (for discussion on the various uses of “substance” in philosophy, see the separate entry on substance). If the idea of ontological independence is somehow associated with “substance”, then it seems that some account of what the relevant dependence amounts to will be required. In fact, those familiar with Lowe 2005 [2010] (an earlier version of the present entry), will recall that the discussion was entirely focused on finding the most plausible account of ontological dependence for the purposes of analyzing the notion of substance (this discussion originates from Lowe 1998: Ch. 6). This also ties in with a more general application of ontological dependence, namely, the study of formal ontological relations obtaining between ontological categories, of which substance is a prime example (see also Hoffman & Rosenkrantz 1994, Schaffer 2009, and Nolan 2011). So how should we define “substance” given the various notions of ontological dependence that we have at our disposal? It will be recalled that one particularly powerful notion of ontological dependence is the notion of identity-dependence, which we arrived at when looking for an asymmetrical—or, at least, an antisymmetrical—relationship of ontological dependence. It seems that if substances are considered as ontologically independent entities, then an asymmetric relation is required. One possibility for defining substance, which relies on (EDR) is the following:

x is a substance =df x is a particular and there is no particular y such that y is not identical with x and x dependsR for its existence upon y.

(SUB-1) could be seen to follow the precedent of Aristotle, who—in the Categories—admitted only particulars as “primary” substances, while allowing some universals (the species and genera of primary substances) the status of “secondary” substances (see Aristotle, Categories: Ch. 2). However, (SUB-1), because it relies on (EDR), will be unsatisfactory for those who are convinced that the modal-existential analysis of ontological dependence is not sufficiently fine-grained; it will face the type of problems that we have discussed above in §2.2. We know already that it won’t do to replace the notion of existential dependence employed in (SUB-1) by appealing instead to the relation of essential existential dependence, as defined by (EDE), because the latter is neither an asymmetrical nor an antisymmetrical relation. Indeed, this is one lesson of the example of the sphere’s two hemispheres discussed immediately after the definition for (EDE) was given. For, whereas the whole sphere might well be taken to qualify as a substance, neither of its “halves” plausibly can, because they lack the requisite kind of ontological independence. But, while (SUB-1) reinterpreted in terms of (EDE) does indeed have the implication that neither of the hemispheres is a substance—because each dependsE for its existence on the other and hence on a particular distinct from itself—it also has the unwanted implication that the whole sphere is not a substance for the same reason, because it is arguably a part of the essence of the sphere as a whole that it exists only if each of its hemispheres exists. However, an obvious remedy is at hand. We can simply replace the appeal to any species of existential dependence in a definition on the pattern of (SUB-1) by an appeal to the relation of identity-dependence, as defined by (ID), to give:

x is a substance =df x is a particular and there is no particular y such that y is not identical with x and x depends for its identity upon y.

Composite substances appear to comply with (SUB-2): for, plausibly, although they possess proper parts, they do not depend for their identity upon those parts, since which objects those parts are does not help to determine of which substances they are parts (the same objects being capable of becoming parts of many different substances). Moreover, substances quite generally do not depend for their identity upon their (accidental) particularized properties, if such exist, nor upon the events in which they participate, nor upon the places they occupy, nor upon other substances. The particularized properties (i.e., tropes or modes) of substances and the events in which substances participate—that is, items such as the particular redness of this apple and the assassination of Caesar—would appear to depend for their identity upon those substances, which precludes the reverse relationship from obtaining, on pain of circularity. (However, see Keinänen & Hakkarainen 2014 for discussion; in particular, they propose a strategy for identifying tropes that does not entail circularity in the individuation of tropes. See also Moltmann 2019, which discusses the problem of spatial location related to tropes and other entities.) As for places, although a physical substance must indeed occupy some place, which place it occupies does not determine which substance it is, since substances may exchange places.

One motivation for rejecting the appeal to (EDR) in the analysis of substance is that it permits two different entities to be existentially dependentR upon one another—entities such as Socrates and Socrates’s life. As we have seen, (ID) precludes any analogous symmetry where identity-dependence is concerned: indeed, it delivers the intuitively correct verdict that it is Socrates’s life that is, in this sense, ontologically dependent upon Socrates, rather than vice versa. For Socrates’s life is an extended event or process in which he participates—and which person Socrates is partially determines which event this is, but not vice versa. Or, to put it another way—one which should by now be familiar—it is part of the essence of Socrates’s life that it is the life of Socrates, but it is not part of the essence of Socrates that he is the person who lived that life. Of course, we can still acknowledge that the relation defined by (EDR) does hold mutually between Socrates and his life and we can still call this relationship a type of existential dependence—namely, “rigid” existential dependence. Similarly, we can recognize as other species of existential dependence the “generic” existential dependence defined by (EDG), the “asymmetrical” rigid existential dependence defined by (EDA) and the “essential” existential dependence defined by (EDE).

The key point is simply that, in the sense of “ontological dependence” which fits quite naturally with the “neo-Aristotelian” account of substances as ontologically independent objects, the relationships defined by (EDR), (EDG), (EDA), and (EDE) will not serve the purpose, whereas that defined by (ID) will. On this view, the sense in which a substance is an entity which does not depend “ontologically” upon anything other than itself is exactly the sense in which it does not depend for its identity upon anything else. This still leaves many interesting questions concerning ontological (in)dependence unanswered, notably the question of whether there is a fundamental level or layer of reality, consisting of one or more entities upon which all other existing entities depend ontologically in one way or another (for discussion, see Lowe 1998: 154–73; Schaffer 2003; Cameron 2008; and Paseau 2010).

6.4 Fundamentality

It seems plausible that at least in some cases where one entity is more fundamental than another one, it is because the less fundamental is ontologically dependent on the more fundamental. Much of the recent discussion involving ontological dependence has focused exactly on the question of fundamentality and especially the question mentioned above, namely whether there is something that is entirely fundamental, ontologically independent—is there an ontological “bottom level”? Hence, there are two senses in which a clearer understanding of ontological dependence may help: we can specify in what sense fundamental entities are ontologically independent as well as how other entities may be ontologically dependent on the fundamental entities, thus gaining further understanding of the supposed “hierarchy” that terminates in the bottom level.

The bottom level is usually thought to be at the smaller end of the spectrum: the atomistic view suggests that certain subatomic particles are fundamental. But this does not mean that the fundamental level must necessarily be at the bottom—the fundamental end could also be at the top, i.e., the universe as a whole could be considered fundamental—a substance in its own right (see Schaffer 2010b). Each of these views is a type of metaphysical foundationalism, which suggests that chains of ontological dependence must come to an end, at least at the dependent end. In other words, metaphysical foundationalism asserts that chains of asymmetric ontological dependence must terminate, they must be well-founded. The idea is typically formulated in mereological terms, as the reference to atomism suggests: there is an asymmetric ontological dependence relation from one end of the mereological scale to the other. These questions also have implications for the debate between pluralism and monism (one form of such monism is defended in Schaffer 2010b and Tallant 2015 discusses the notion of ontological dependence in connection to Schaffer’s monism; see also Trogdon 2009 and the separate entry on monism).

However, there have been some speculative suggestions according to which chains of ontological dependence could go on ad infinitum, and hence violate the requirement of well-foundedness (for discussion, see Bliss 2013, Morganti 2014, and Tahko 2014). The resulting view would appear to be some sort of metaphysical infinitism as opposed to metaphysical foundationalism. One version of such a view, if combined with the idea that the direction of dependence is towards the smaller, is a “gunky” ontology, whereby matter is infinitely divisible “gunk” and objects or matter have no smallest parts. But as interesting as these views and the discussion surrounding fundamentality are, discussing them in detail here would take us too far from our original topic (for further discussion, see the separate entry on fundamentality).


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Tuomas E. Tahko <tuomas.tahko@bristol.ac.uk>
E. Jonathan Lowe

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